Natural Language Ontology

First published Wed Aug 17, 2022

Natural language ontology is the study of the ontology (ontological categories, structures, and notions) implicit in natural language. Natural language ontology is part of “descriptive metaphysics” to use Strawson’s term (1959), as opposed to what Fine (2017a) calls “foundational metaphysics”, metaphysics whose interest is in what there ultimately is. Natural language ontology is a sub-discipline of both philosophy and linguistics, more specifically, of metaphysics and natural language semantics. It was recognized as a separate field of study relatively recently, through the development of natural language semantics over the last decades. At the same time, natural language ontology can be considered a practice that philosophers have engaged in throughout the history of philosophy when drawing on language in support of a metaphysical argument or notion. The ontology of natural language is to be distinguished from the ontology a speaker accepts on the basis of philosophical or naïve reflection or reasoning using language, as well as from the ontology that is reflected in cognition in general. The ontology of a natural language is thus best characterized as the ontology competent speakers implicitly accept by way of using the language.

1. Natural Language Ontology as an Emerging Discipline and Practice

1.1 Natural Language Ontology as a Discipline

The subject matter of natural language ontology is the ontology implicit in natural language, which is to be distinguished from the ontologies of the various metaphysical theories or naïve philosophical views formulated by using natural language. Natural language ontology has as its task to uncover the ontology that is reflected in relevant sorts of linguistic intuitions, setting aside the question whether that ontology is real or merely apparent.

This entry uses “natural language ontology” as the term for the discipline and “the ontology of natural language” as a term for its subject matter. The more accurate term for the subject matter of natural language ontology would actually be “the ontologies of natural languages”, since natural languages may, in principle, reflect different ontologies and even the same language (or idiolect) might reflect different ontologies. For most of the entry, this is simplified by talking about the ontology of natural language, addressing the issue of different ontologies only in Section 4. This is justified by the fact that philosophers practicing natural language ontology generally presuppose that there is a single ontology shared by natural languages, as do, to a great extent at least, semanticists.

Natural language ontology had been suggested as a discipline first by Bach (1986), who uses the term “natural language metaphysics”. That term is in a sense more adequate than “natural language ontology”: ontology is often taken to be narrower than metaphysics, dealing just with what there is (the inventory of things) rather than, as metaphysics does, with the nature of things (Quine 1948). However, “ontology” is increasingly used in the broader sense of metaphysics as well, especially when it has an empirical or applied dimension (e.g., “applied ontology”, a field of study that involves the practical application of ontological notions and theories to specific domains, such as management, biomedicine, or geography), a usage this entry will adopt as well. Also the count noun “ontology” is better usable than “metaphysics” to denote the subject matter of a branch of metaphysics since it comes with a plural, allowing talk about “the ontologies of natural languages” and “different ontologies” being the subject matter of different branches of metaphysics.

The ontology (or metaphysics) of natural language needs to be distinguished from the ontology of linguistic entities, words, meanings, phonemes, etc. Sometimes the term “metaphysics of natural language” is used for the study of the latter (Postal 2018).

Bach (1986) conceives of natural language metaphysics somewhat differently than the present entry in that for him it is just part of linguistics, not of philosophy. For Bach, whereas proper metaphysics is concerned with the question “what sort of things are there?”, natural language metaphysics is concerned with the question “what sort of things do people talk as if there were?” Bach goes on saying

Is there Natural Language Metaphysics? How could there not? […] Do the overt and covert distinctions that correspond to natural language categories correspond to the structure of the world? How could they not? But this is where linguistics stops. (1986: 593)

Bach then adopts agnosticism as to the ontological and cognitive status of the entities that are posited as semantic values. The view that natural language metaphysics is part only of linguistics has also been adopted by Fiorin & Delfitto (2020: chap. 14), who characterize it as

the practice of identifying and studying the qualitative differences between the objects in the model that are relevant to the interpretation of natural languages, (2020: 117)

whereby a model is strictly motivated by linguistic data.

1.2 Natural Language Ontology as a Practice Throughout the History of Philosophy

Natural language ontology as a discipline whose subject matter is the ontology implicit in natural language is a developing discipline that, on the view adopted in this entry, is part of both metaphysics and natural language semantics. But in a way it has also been a practice throughout the history of philosophy. Throughout the history of philosophy, at times more often than others, natural language has been used as method for clarifying intuitions, that is, states of intellectual seeming that contrast, very roughly, with inferential belief, reasoning or reflection and that have been considered the primary evidence in philosophy (see entry on intuition). In particular, natural language has played an important role in clarifying intuitions that bear on metaphysical issues.

Natural language has been used, for example, by Fine (2003) to elucidate the intuitive distinction between an object and the material constituting it While the statue may seem a distinct entity from the alloy that constitutes it, the distinction becomes particularly convincing when paying attention to ranges of predicates that are or aren’t meaningfully applicable to the statue and the alloy. The statue can be said to be “defective”, “well made”, “valuable”, “ugly”, “Romanesque”, “insured”, or “admired”, even though the alloy which makes it up is not. Some predicates may not hold of the alloy; others cannot even be applied meaningfully to it, e.g., Romanesque. A philosopher that denies an ontological distinction between an object and the matter constituting it faces the considerable challenge of explaining those differences in the applicability of predicates.

Another ontological distinction that has been elucidated significantly using natural language is the distinction between objects and events. While some philosophers take objects and events to be of the same category and identify both with the material content of space-time regions, others distinguish them in the way they persist through time (endurance and perdurance, see entry on identity over time). Natural language gives significant support for the view that objects and events relate to time and space differently. The difference is reflected in the choice of existence predicates: exist applies to objects, but occur, take place, happen to events (* The palace existed / ??? happened, The murder happened / ??? existed)); it also reflected in the applicability of spatial modifiers to the respective existence predicates (The party took place in the garden, ??? The flowers existed in the garden) (Hacker 1982; Cresswell 1986; Fine 2006; Moltmann 2020b).

Philosophers when making use of natural language in such ways to clarify metaphysical intuitions practice natural language ontology (even if no distinction is made yet between what is reflected in such intuitions and what there really is, which is discussed in the next section). They thereby generally presuppose that metaphysical intuitions do not show interpersonal inconsistencies (see entry on intuitions) and in their linguistic manifestation, cross-linguistic differences (§4.2).

Appeals to natural language of this kind can be found within different approaches to metaphysics, as long as the philosophers in questions take metaphysical intuitions to be a basis for developing philosophical views. They can be found, for example, in Aristotle and very explicitly in medieval metaphysics (Aquinas, Buridan, Ockham), where the use of natural language examples was a common practice. It can be found in the phenomenological tradition (Bolzano, Brentano, Husserl, Meinong), and, again quite explicitly, in early analytic philosophy (Frege, Twardowski, Strawson, Austin, Vendler, Ryle). Drawing on natural language as a method of clarifying metaphysical intuitions is also common among many contemporary philosophers that do not explicitly engage in natural language ontology as an emerging discipline, but just take a descriptive approach to metaphysics (§1.6).

1.3 The Ontology of Natural Language and Its Relation to Reality

There are various ways in which philosophers have used natural language to clarify metaphysical intuitions. One of the most common ways in which philosophers draw on language concerns the denotations of particular types of referential noun phrases (NPs). It is a standard assumption in both philosophy and linguistics that referential NPs stand for entities and predicates express properties of entities. The types of predicates acceptable with a particular type of referential NP are thus indicative of the ontological category of the entities that that type of NP denotes. The types of NPs philosophers make use of include bare adjective nominalizations like wisdom when arguing for qualities or properties, deverbal nominalizations like laughter when arguing for events, modified adjective nominalizations like Socrates’ wisdom when arguing for tropes or particularized properties (see entry on tropes), NPs with a relational use of number such as the number of planets when arguing for numbers as objects, and fact-referring terms like the fact that it is raining or the facts when discussing the nature and role of facts (Austin 1950; Strawson 1950). Other ways in which natural language appears to reflect ontology and which have played a role in philosophy will be discussed later (§2.2).

The appeal to natural language in the history of philosophy was generally based on the assumption that natural language just reflects reality and that natural language thus provides a particularly manifest indication for the way reality should be understood. While the view is still present in some of the ways in which contemporary metaphysicians draw on natural language, there is another view that has gained prominence, and that is that natural language does not in fact reflect the ontology of what there really is, or at least not fundamental reality. Rather, natural language comes with an ontology that may be quite different from what many philosophers consider the ontology of the real.

For example, a lot of referential NPs in natural language seem to stand for entities that many philosophers would not consider real, let alone fundamental. These include ontologically dependent, minor, and derivative objects such as holes, shadows, smiles, homes, problems, reasons, advantages, and mistakes, as well as construction-driven objects such as pluralities like “the stones in the garden” (§3.1.1), functional, variable, or intensional objects like “the increasing temperature” or “the book John needs to write” (§3.1.1), and intentional objects of the sort “the house John was dreaming about” (§3.2).

There are also predicates of natural language that reflect notions that diverge from corresponding “philosophical” notions, such as the verb exist, which cannot convey the univocal notion that can be conveyed by philosophical uses of the noun existence (as in the existence of everything there is) (§1.2).

Also categorial distinctions such as the mass-count distinction, which includes a distinction between “the water” and “the quantity of water”, “the rice” and “the rice grains”, as well as “the clothes” and “the clothing”, are nowadays not generally taken to reflect a real ontological distinction, but, at best, a distinction at a level of “grammaticized individuation” (§3.3).

Such discrepancies motivate distinguishing two ways of pursuing metaphysics:

  1. metaphysics whose aim is to uncover the ontology reflected in natural language or intuitions more generally, that is, descriptive metaphysics
  2. metaphysics whose aim is to uncover what there really is, that is, foundational metaphysics.

This distinction raises important questions itself, though.

First of all, how should reality itself be understood? Does reality just consist in what is fundamental, and if so what entities or ontological category would be fundamental (e.g., certain sorts of objects, properties or facts), and in what sense of fundamentality? (see entries on fundamentality and metaphysical realism). Or does reality also include ordinary objects (which are generally not considered fundamental), and perhaps entities ontologically dependent on them (such as tropes and events, or even entities like shadows and holes), and in what sense of ontological dependence (see entry on ontological dependence)? Or does reality consist of a much greater range of entities, even perhaps a plenitude of just anything x that is conceivable that meets the conditions for x’s existence (Eklund 2008; Schaffer 2009; entry on existence)? Does reality consist of a single level of being or different levels ordered by relations of grounding or fundamentality, and would there be a single such relation or a plurality of relations? (see entries on metaphysical grounding and fundamentality). Does reality come with a structure at all or is it an “amorphous lump”, to be carved out in one way or another by language? Finally, should reality include a realm of mere possibilia and perhaps nonexistent, merely intentional objects (see entries on possible objects and nonexistent objects)? Depending on how reality itself is conceived, the ontology of natural language may or may not be viewed as an ontology of the real (see also §2.2.5).

A second question is whether the two metaphysical projects can be pursued independently of each other. While many contemporary metaphysicians aim to pursue [ii] without engaging in [i], Fine (2017a) argues that the two branches of metaphysics cannot be pursued independently, but that [ii] presupposes [i]: metaphysics that aims to figure out what there really is has to take descriptive metaphysics or what Fine calls “naïve metaphysics” or “the metaphysics of appearances” as its starting point, that is, the metaphysics whose aim is to uncover the ontology reflected in our intuitions or ordinary judgments. That is because naïve (or descriptive) metaphysics provides the clarification of the metaphysical notions that foundational metaphysics aims to explain in more fundamental terms.

A third issue is whether metaphysics that aims to uncover what there really is can even be pursued in the first place. There have been various movements in metaphysics that deny that, including Kantian and phenomenological approaches (§2.1). In fact, natural language ontology might very well be pursued while taking a skeptical stance toward the metaphysics of the real.

1.4 The Ontology of Natural Language and Truth Conditions

Some central issues in natural language ontology bear on the question of how reality and existence are to be understood.

One of them concerns natural language ontology itself, when its subject matter is an ontology that may diverge from the ontology of what is considered real. How is natural language ontology compatible with what is widely regarded as a fundamental requirement on semantic theory, namely that of giving truth conditions? For a sentence S about an entity d to be true or false, what makes S true or false, it seems, needs to be a part of reality that includes d itself, and thus d needs to be a real entity, rather than part of an ontology of “appearances”. There are various options to pursue, each of which may be adopted for just some part of the ontology reflected in natural language. One option is that natural language displays ontological notions or items that simply fail to be real, and thus speakers making use of them in their utterances are in error. Second, entities in the ontology of natural language may have the status of fictional entities, which means that a sentence about such entities may not be able to be “really” be true (unless it predicates a property of the fictional entity as a fictional entity, with predicates such as is a fictional character) (see entry on nonexistent objects, section nuclear and extranuclear properties). Third, entities in the ontology of natural language, even if not considered fundamental, may be considered derivative, yet real, which would allow sentences involving reference to them to be true. As was mentioned in Section 1.1, some proponents of natural language ontology remain agnostic regarding the metaphysical status of the items that natural language ontology posits, as long as they are motivated by empirical generalizations and theoretical linguistic considerations.

Another general issue, skeptically addressed in particular by Chomsky, is whether referential NPs even have as their semantic function to be used to refer to entities and thus whether referentialist semantics is even possible (§2.2.5). Not all approaches to natural language semantics in fact have as their aim giving truth conditions (whether such an aim is set aside or abandoned) and thus rely on referentialist semantics. Chomsky (2000) himself takes the view that the semantics of natural language can involve only our cognitive representation of the world and thus only another level of syntax, not entities and their properties themselves.

1.5 Ontology Reflected in Natural Language, in Cognition, and in Reasoning

It is tempting to take the ontology of natural language to just be the ontology implicit in cognition, including perception. In fact, often researchers pursuing natural language ontology take research in cognitive science into account or pursue interdisciplinary research in both areas at once (e.g., Wellwood et al. 2012; Wisniewski et al. 1996). While there are without doubt important connections and a significant overlap, the two ontologies need to be kept distinct. To give an example, it is generally agreed that the ontology implicit in cognition in general, that is, the ontology of ordinary objects, is not closed under sum formation, but rather subject to constraints of gestalt (integrity) as well as function (Schaffer & Rose 2017). Thus, the sum of the stuff in my room does not form an entity that belongs to the ontology of ordinary objects and neither does the sum of the Eiffel Tower and the Dalai Lama. But natural language appears to allow for unrestricted sum formation with definite mass and plural NPs and conjunctions of definite singular NPs (the stuff in my room, the Eiffel Tower and the Dalai Lama), at least on the dominant view on which definite plural and mass NPs stand for sums (§3.1.1). Another example of a divergence between the ontology implicit in cognition and in natural language is the mass-count distinction, with choices such as the English mass noun pasta and the French plural count noun pâtes hardly reflecting a cognitive distinction (§3.3).

Given the divergence of the ontology of natural language from that reflected in cognition, how does the ontology of natural language relate to cognitive agents? What sort of ontological commitment does it involve? One option may be that the ontology of natural language is the ontology a speaker accepts just when using the language. This cannot be right, though: a speaker may just accept the ontology by coincidence when using the language. Rather the acceptance of the ontology of natural language has to be strictly tied to the use of language; it has to be acceptance that necessarily goes along with the use of language, that is, ontological acceptance by way of using the language.

There is another cognitive dimension that matters for distinguishing the ontology of natural language, namely that of intuition as opposed to inferential belief, reasoning, or reflection (see entry on Intuition). Natural language can be used for making and denying various ontological claims and for introducing revisionary ontological theories. This may consist both in making ontological assertions and in introducing expressions for the purpose of conveying a particular ontological notion (see §4.1).

The practice of natural language ontology, as it has been pursued by philosophers and linguistics, makes a clear distinction between the sorts of linguistic data indicative of the ontology implicit in natural language and those indicative of an ontology based on reasoning. Explicit metaphysical assertions are not indicative of the ontology implicit in natural language, for example assertions of the following sentences (whether they are widely believed or not):

There are artifacts.
Objects are not events.
There are things that don’t exist

No philosopher or linguist would appeal to sentences such as (1a, b, c) when arguing for an ontology of artifacts, of states distinct from events, or of nonexistent entities. Otherwise, another philosopher or linguists might just as well appeal to the negations of (1a, b, c), which are equally acceptable, to argue for just the opposite. Such uses of language do not display the ontology implicit in natural language, but rather ontological views based on reasoning, that is, ontologies that philosophers accept when thinking about there is or ontologies that non-philosophers (“the folk”) naively accept when thinking about what there is. The latter are the subject matter of folk metaphysics (Schaffer 2019), the analogue of folk physics and folk biology.

The ontology of natural language is instead displayed in other ways. One way in which it has been taken to manifest itself is in presuppositions of ontological categories carried by certain predicates: stop and happen require events, and move and exist (enduring) objects, on pain of resulting in a category mistake (but see Magidor 2013 for a critical discussion). A particularly important way in which the ontology of natural language manifests itself is restrictions of particular types of NPs to ontological categories of entities they may stand for. 'Perfect nominals' like John’s buying of the house can only stand for events, 'imperfect nominals' like John’s buying the house can only stand for facts (Vendler 1967). Bare adjective nominalizations like wisdom can only stand for qualities, and adjective nominalizations with a specifier (Socrates’ wisdom) for tropes; deverbal nominalizations like laughter are generally restricted to events (§1.3). Quantificational NPs like every time can range only over times or situations, quantifiers like somewhere only over places, and quantifiers like somehow only over qualities. Other ways in which the ontology of natural language manifests itself will be elaborated in Section 2.2.

The distinction between ontological assertions and presuppositions goes along with two ways of accepting an ontology: acceptance though reasoning or reflection and implicit acceptance by way of using the language. The latter should be part of the definition of the ontology implicit in natural language (Moltmann 2019):

The ontology of a natural language is the ontology speakers implicitly accept by way of using the language.

Note that it may very well turn out that the ontology arrived at through reasoning is the very same as the ontology implicit in natural language. What matters thus is the relation of agents to the ontology, rather than the nature of the ontology itself.

The ontology of natural language is reflected not only in presuppositions, but also in certain kinds of linguistic data that are generally inaccessible to linguistically uninformed philosophical or naive reflection. These are syntactic analyses of sentences that would be unavailable to non-linguists and involve particular ontological commitments. One example is syntactic analyses that posit silent syntactic elements with ontological content. Thus, Kayne (2005: chap. 8) argues that the sentence John has few books contains a silent (antecedent-less) occurrence of the noun number, which suggests that the actual structure of the sentence, John has few number books, involves reference to a number. Another example is syntactic analyses that make use of lexical decomposition with ontological relevance. Thus, Harves & Kayne (2012) argue that the underlying form of the English verb need is have need, which involves an ontological commitment to things like needs that is not evident from the simple verb need alone. Underlying syntactic structures of this sort are posited in generative linguistics on the background assumption that knowledge of grammar is implicit and to an extent innate. If ontological notions go along with such structures, then they should be just as much part of implicit knowledge as the syntactic structures themselves, which means that they will be unavailable to rejection or revision through reasoning.

Taking ontology to be part of the implicit knowledge of grammar may also solve the puzzle of how it is possible for a speaker to reject upon reflection (part of) the ontology that is implicit in natural language while still committing herself to it through the continued use of the language. On such a view, the implicit acceptance of the ontology of natural language would not be a form of belief, but rather a form of tacit knowledge on a par with that of grammar (Moltmann 2020a). This would explain the robustness of such a form of implicit acceptance, which resists rejection upon reflection as long as the agent uses the same language, unlike the implicit acceptance or bias in ethics, for example, which does permit rejection upon reflection (see entry on implicit bias).

Distinguishing implicit acceptance of an ontology through the use of language from metaphysical reflection does of course not prevent the latter to come into play when building a theory of the ontology reflected in natural language. Natural language data may provide only a partial specification of a particular ontological notion so that metaphysical reasoning would fill in the rest—at least on a view on which natural language ontology is also part of metaphysics and not just linguistics (cf. §1.1), and metaphysical reasoning may give independent support for ontological notions reflected in natural language.

1.6 The Relevance of Natural Language Ontology for Philosophy

There are two general questions that arise regarding natural language ontology as an emerging discipline.

  1. Why should natural language ontology be pursued in the first place?
  2. Why is its pursuit relevant to philosophy?

As regards [i], at least given certain general assumptions about semantic values, truth conditions, and compositionality (§2.2), natural language ontology is an integral part of theoretical linguistics and thus as important to pursue as theoretical linguistics itself. Theoretical linguistics has grown enormously over the last 70 years providing a wealth of semantic and syntactic generalizations and theories, which permits a more systematic and accurate use of natural language for metaphysical purposes. When pursued within the context of theoretical linguistics, natural language ontology will also set its own ambitions regarding universals, the alignment of ontology with syntax, the relation of ontology to lexical semantics, and the connections of the ontology reflected in natural language to that reflected in cognition.

As regards [ii], there are specific reasons for a philosopher to pursue natural language ontology. First of all, natural language ontology has an important contribution to make to descriptive metaphysics (§2.1), as it deals with linguistic manifestations of intuitions bearing on metaphysical issues. In fact, natural language ontology can be regarded a linguistically informed development of descriptive metaphysics.

Second, various topics in metaphysics have evolved historically around linguistic facts, generally used as manifestations of shared intuitions or of reality itself (§1.2). By making full use of empirical and theoretical research in linguistics, natural language ontology can shed a significant light on those topics. For example, linguistic facts have played an important role in the debate surrounding universals since the middle ages, where questions were pursued such as whether wisdom is a term that picks out an abstract universal or just its various instances. Natural language examples play a significant role also in contemporary discussions of abstract objects (Zalta 1983; Boolos 1998), properties (Chierchia & Turner 1988; Bealer 1993), and types (Wetzel 2009). Those discussions generally presuppose the view that natural language allows reference to a wide range of abstract objects, though that view has been challenged on the basis of other linguistic generalizations and analyses (§4.1).

Linguistic facts, at least since Frege (1918/9), have also played a central role in motivating abstract propositions as truth bearers: that-clauses appear to act as singular terms standing for abstract propositions, truth bearers that are both meanings of sentences and objects or contents of thought. Using a different range of linguistic data from Polish, German, and French (in three versions of the same article), Twardowski (1911) argued for non-enduring products of acts (“claims”, “judgments”, “assumptions”) being truth bearers rather than propositions, proposing a novel cognitively realistic yet not psychologistic account of the content of attitudes as well as the subject matter of logic.

Finally, linguistic facts play an important role in the debate about the existence and nature of numbers. Frege’s (1884) theory of numbers as abstract objects was motivated by sentences such as the number of planets is eight, an apparent identity statement containing two apparent number-referring terms. More recent linguistically oriented research has put into question whether eight in that sentence really refers to a number rather than keeping its “adjectival” meaning (as a quantifier or plural property) and moreover whether the number of planets in that sentence is really a number-referring term rather than acting as a “concealed question”, standing for the question about how many planets there are (Romero 2005; Hofweber 2016).

Such philosophical debates show that when metaphysical arguments rely on linguistic data, those data need to be subject to serious linguistic examination, in the recognition that natural language ontology is also part of linguistics.

2. Natural Language Ontology as a Subdiscipline of Both Linguistics and Philosophy

Natural language ontology as a subdiscipline of both linguistics and philosophy raises a number of general questions. First, how does natural language ontology situate itself within metaphysics and how is it to be understood as a part of metaphysics? Second, how exactly does the semantics of natural language involve ontology and thus in what sense is natural language ontology part of linguistics? Third, what sorts of linguistic data reflect the ontology implicit in language, and how is that ontology itself to be characterized? In what follows, these questions will be addressed in turn.

2.1 Natural Language Ontology as Part of Descriptive Metaphysics

A dominant contemporary view of metaphysics is that its subject matter is that of fundamental reality, the task of metaphysics being, in Plato’s words, to “carve nature at its joints”. If the subject matter of metaphysics is fundamental reality, then natural language ontology will have no place in it. There is another view of metaphysics, however, on which metaphysics, at least in part, has as its subject matter the general nature of things as reflected in a particular range of “data”. Those data may consist in intuitions, experiences (as in phenomenology), or in linguistic intuitions about the acceptability, truth conditions, and inferential relations of natural language sentences (natural language ontology). On such an approach to metaphysics, it is left open what such data may reflect, whether it is reality in one sense or another, a realm of actual but derivative entities, entities constituted by the experience itself, or a realm of conceived reality. Older traditions of metaphysics that fall under the approach include the Kantian tradition, which deals, for example, with ontological categories, but as preconditions of accessing the world, rather than as categories of how things really are, as well as the phenomenological tradition (Brentano, Husserl, Ingarden), where ontology was also pursued, but based on how things appear (or are constituted by appearance), rather than assumptions about a mind-independent reality.

In contemporary analytic philosophy, Strawson’s (1959) notion of descriptive metaphysics most clearly focuses on what is reflected in data. The subject matter of descriptive metaphysics is what Strawson calls our “shared conceptual scheme”, a term indicative of a Kantian background (see entry on Strawson). Nowadays descriptive metaphysics is more commonly taken to have as its subject matter the ontology reflected in our shared intuitions or ordinary judgments (since metaphysics is generally taken not to be about representations or concepts, but things and their nature). Strawson contrasts descriptive metaphysics with what he calls “revisionary metaphysics”, which aims to produce a better structure of our thought (or a better ontology, as one may rather say). Strawson does not elaborate how “better” is to be understood; it may be meant to be metaphysics that better carves nature at its joints, provides a better foundation of the natural sciences, or is better able to meet whatever the standard a given revisionary metaphysician may have in mind.

Given the Strawsonian distinction, natural language ontology clearly belongs to descriptive metaphysics, in the sense that its subject matter is the ontology reflected in linguistic intuitions regarding the truth conditions or acceptability of natural language sentences.

A distinction somewhat similar to the Strawsonian distinction between descriptive and revisionary metaphysics is Fine’s (2017a) already mentioned distinction between “naïve metaphysics” and “foundational metaphysics”. Naïve metaphysics is interested in the general nature of things, without regard for whether they are real, with our ordinary judgments being an important guide. As it does not distinguish between appearance and reality, Fine also calls it the “metaphysics of appearances”. The subject matter of foundational metaphysics, by contrast, is the ontology of what there really is, fundamental reality. Foundational metaphysics is defined in terms of its subject matter, not in terms of its deviation from naïve metaphysics. What is novel in Fine’s distinction is how the relation between naïve and foundational metaphysics is understood: foundational metaphysics must take naïve metaphysics as its starting point (as mentioned in §1.3); naive metaphysics, by contrast, should be pursued without regard of foundational considerations

Given the Finean distinction, natural language ontology will be part of naïve metaphysics. The term “naïve metaphysics” is potentially misleading, though, when applied to natural language ontology. The ontology implicit in natural language needs to be distinguished from the ontology of what non-philosophers naively think there is or accept upon (naive) reflection (the subject matter of folk metaphysics). The ontology of natural language, by contrast, is the ontology that competent speakers of the language implicitly accept, whether philosophers or non-philosophers and whether they would naively or not so naively agree with it upon reflection. For that reason, this entry stays with the better established and less misleading Strawsonian term “descriptive metaphysics”, suitably understood.

The view that descriptive metaphysics is to be pursued without foundational considerations also defines a methodological principle for natural language ontology, which is not always adhered to in natural language semantics, namely that the decision whether to posit entities of particular ontological categories as semantic values should not be made based on assumptions about what is fundamental or what really exists, but rather on the grounds of the semantic behavior of expressions.

It is not clear that natural language ontology can be pursued just as a form of “metaphysics of appearances” without foundationalist considerations. Considerations as to what is relatively fundamental certainly enter decisions as to how to understand derivative entities as semantic values. More importantly, considerations regarding truth play a central role in semantics as well as natural language ontology. The guiding principle for natural language ontology may better be that of giving priority to linguistic intuitions over foundationalist considerations when linguistic intuitions are available.

One might think that involving metaphysical considerations in natural language ontology means mistakenly imposing a sophisticated metaphysics on the “folk” (competent speakers that are non-philosophers). Clearly, however, what matters is whether the ontology posited is the correct one, as the ontology speakers implicitly accept by way of using language, not whether it has been posited through reflection by the ontologist.

2.2 How Does Natural Language Reflect Ontology?

It is a guiding assumption of natural language ontology that natural language reflects ontology. That is, the semantics of natural languages involves entities of various ontological categories, ontological structures, and ontological notions on the basis of syntactic roles of expressions, syntactic categories and features, and lexical words. The following will elaborate some of the ways in which natural language reflects ontology.

2.2.1 Entities in different semantic roles

First of all, entities may play various roles in the semantic structure of natural language sentences. To an extent, it depends on particular semantic theories about relevant constructions or expressions, though, what entities play what sorts of roles (§2.2.2). Semantic values of referential NPs and variables

Most importantly, entities play a role as the semantic values of referential noun phrases (NPs), as the things that quantificational NPs range over, and as arguments of predicates. Referential NPs are occurrences of NPs in sentences in which they have the function of standing for entities. Natural language comes with a wealth of expressions referring to or quantifying over entities, as well as a wealth of expressions that express properties of entities (or relations among them). The standard view is that with the utterance of a simple sentence like the apple is red, the property expressed by red is attributed to the entity the speaker refers to with the apple.

The notion of a referential NP has played a central role in philosophical discussions about ontological commitment; it is an important notion in semantics and also plays a role in syntactic theory. Names and definite NPs can serve as referential NPs, as can specific indefinites and certain determinerless (bare) plurals and mass nouns. Only certain syntactic positions are reserved for referential NPs, such as the subject or the object position of extensional predicates, as opposed to intensional predicates like look for, intentional predicates like imagine, and existence predicates like exist and occur. There are various syntactic and semantic criteria for referential NPs. For philosophers, since Frege, they include the ability of an NP to support anaphora, to be replaceable by quantificational NPs, and to serve as an argument of ordinary (i.e., extensional) predicates (Frege 1892; Hale 1987). For syntacticians, referential NPs also must satisfy certain syntactic conditions: they are generally taken to have the more complex structure of a determiner phrase (DP) rather than just that of what syntacticians take to be an NP, NPs being able to be used only predicatively (Abney 1987; Borer 2005).

The notion of a referential NP (or Eigenname ‘name’ as it was called at the time) already plays a central role in Frege’s (1892) philosophy of language, where it provides a syntactic criterion for being an entity. For Frege, an entity is what can be the semantic value of a referential NP, since standing for an entity is the role of a referential NP in the context of a sentence.

Entities also play a role as semantic values of quantificational NPs, more precisely, the variables that serve to formalize them. Ontological commitment has been tied to the role of semantic values of variables by Quine (1948), who put forward the dictum “to be is to be the value of a variable”. This was meant to apply not so much to natural language, though, but to regimentations of it in formal theories of science. Yet being the semantic value of a variable or being in the domain of a quantificational NP has become a well-established criterion for being an entity in the practice of natural language ontology.

Some caution needs to be applied to both the Fregean and the Quinean criterion of objecthood. There are apparently referential NPs whose function is not that of standing for an actual entity, for example the subjects of negative existentials (Santa Claus does not exist) and the arguments of intentional verbs (John is thinking about Santa Claus). Furthermore, there are Meinongian views according to which reference and quantification are not actually existence-entailing but only lexical predicates are (§3.2; Priest 2005). Moreover, there are views according to which referential and quantificational NPs do not always range over entities, but may just have an inferential role (Hofweber 2016). Finally, not all quantificational NPs have the same semantic role, ranging over entities that will also act as arguments of the embedding predicate. Quantificational NPs of the sort something, everything, and several things in English, which can take the place of predicative complements as well as other nonreferential positions, have been argued to have a nominalizing function, introducing “new” entities into the semantic structure of a sentence (Moltmann 2013: Chap. 3) or to be non-nominal quantifiers, ranging over the same higher-order entities as are the semantic values of the expressions they may replace (Rosefeldt 2008).

The notion of a referential NP also plays a central role in the tradition of Montague Grammar, where referential NPs are taken to be of type e, the type of entities (Montague 1974). Montague himself, though, also proposed type-lifting referential NPs to the type of individual concepts (of type \(\langle\langle e, t\rangle, t\rangle\)). This was meant to allow for semantic uniformity with respect to NPs that for Montague must stand for individual concepts, such as the rising temperature, the golden mountain, and the mathematician John claims to be (but see §3.1.1). The move no longer maintains a straightforward notion of a referential NP and thus a criterion for entities being part of the ontology of natural language. Implicit arguments

Another role entities may play in the semantic structure of sentences is that of implicit arguments, that is, arguments of predicates that are not also the semantic values of referential NPs. For example, on Davidson‘s (1967) influential analysis of adverbial modification, the sentence John walked slowly states that there is an event which, together with John, is an argument of walk and of which slowly (now treated as a predicate of events) is true

\[\exists e(\textrm{walk}(e, \textrm{John}) \amp \textrm{slowly}(e)).\]

The very same considerations that lead Davidson to posit events as implicit arguments apply to adjectives and motivate tropes as arguments of adjectives. John is profoundly happy will then state that there is a happiness trope that, together with John, is an argument of happy and of which profoundly is true

\[\exists t(\textrm{happy}(t, \textrm{John}) \amp \textrm{profoundly}(t)).\]

Instead of tropes, degrees have been used widely as implicit arguments of adjectives (Kennedy 2007; Wellwood 2015). Other implicit arguments proposed in the literature are implicit location arguments for weather predicates (it is raining) (Perry 1986) and implicit taste parameters for predicates of personal taste (Stephenson 2007). Implicit arguments are posited when expressions appear to act as predicates targeting entities for which there are no overt NPs in the syntactic context.

The semantic role of implicit arguments raises the question whether there is a difference in ontological status between entities that are implicit arguments and entities that are semantic values of referential NPs. Davidson’s arguments for events are generally treated as stronger arguments for events being part of the ontology of natural language than the fact that there are event-referring NPs, which may have to do with the distinction between core and periphery of language (§4.1). There are alternatives to Davidson’s semantics of adverbials, though, which do not posit such implicit arguments (Kim 1976; Copley & Harley 2015). Parameters of evaluation and truthmakers

Yet another important role of entities in the semantic structure of natural language is that of a parameter of evaluation for the truth of sentences. The standard semantic view takes a sentence to be true or false not absolutely, but relative to a time and a (possible) world. This first of all gives justice to the intuition that sentences can be true or false in actual as well as counterfactual circumstances. Moreover, there are natural language expressions that have been considered operators shifting a parameter of evaluation. Tenses and temporal adverbials are standardly taken to act as operators shifting the time of evaluation and modals as operators shifting the world of evaluation. Also conditionals are generally treated as potentially shifting the world of evaluation for antecedent and consequent.

There is generally taken to be a difference in ontological commitment between parameters of evaluation on the one hand and semantic values of referential terms and implicit arguments of predicates on the other. It is generally understood that parameters of evaluation do not involve an ontological commitment on the part of the language user, but are mere posits in the semantic theory, which means they have a status as entities only in the semantic metalanguage. Parameters of evaluation involve an ontological commitment on the part of the language users only if there are referential expression in the object language making reference to them, or so the general view appears to be. For example, there are referential expressions in English referring to times (today, that day, that moment, etc), but not those referring to worlds, at least not from the core of language (§4.1). Frege’s criterion of objecthood of course does not apply to parameters of evaluation (and, in fact, it did not even apply to implicit arguments). Other semantic roles for situations

Situations have been considered parameters of evaluation, but they play yet other semantic roles within particular approaches to natural language semantics (see entry on situations in natural language semantics). Thus, in Austin’s (1950) theory of sentence meaning, a speaker, when uttering a sentence, refers to a situation that provides semantic values for context-dependent expressions. Does this mean an ontological commitment to situations? The answer to that question bears on another criterion for ontological commitment, that of an entity being part of the intended meaning of a sentence. Certainly, an ontological commitment to situations is in place if situations must form part of the intention of speakers when correctly using a sentence, as is the case on that theory. This is also the case for various roles of situations in semantic analyses of definite and quantificational NPs, as well as E-type pronouns (Elbourne 2005). By contrast, situations play a role strictly outside the (intended) meaning of a sentence in Récanati’s (2010) theory of pragmatic enrichment.

In the more recent development of truthmaker semantics (Fine 2017b), situations play somewhat similar roles to worlds as parameters of evaluation for the truth of sentences, though truthmakers are based on a more restricted relation of exact truthmaking between situations and sentences. Situations in their role as truthmakers, it has been argued, also act as semantic values of referential and quantificational NPs, namely NPs with case as head noun (Moltmann 2021a), which would amount to an explicit ontological commitment, in both the Fregean and the Quinean sense.

2.2.2 The connection between ontology and compositionality

The ontology of natural language is intimately linked to compositionality, the chief tenet of natural language semantics. Which entities play a role in the semantic structure of natural language depends very much on what the semantic contribution of occurrences of expressions to the composition of the meaning of the sentence is taken to be. Different compositional semantic analyses of the language may thus go along with different ontologies. This means that the choice of an ontology may depend on the choice of a compositional semantic theory, which in turn may depend on the choice of a syntactic theory. Generally, the contribution of referential NPs is taken to be that of standing for entities and the role of predicates that of expressing properties that are applied to entities. There is a formal alternative, though, on which referential NPs denote higher-level functions (individual concepts) that apply to predicate denotations (§ What is most important is that for the purpose of compositionality the contributions of referential NPs and of predicates are the same in different types of sentences. Sometimes, different syntactic analyses may have significant consequences for ontological issues, such as the analysis of the number of planets is eight as an identity statement about numbers (Frege) as opposed to an analysis of the sentence as a so-called specificational sentence, conveying a question-answer relation (§1.6).

There is also a view according to which the semantic role of expressions reflects ontology. Specifically this view has been held by Frege, for whom predicates stand for concepts, that is, unsaturated entities that need to apply to an object to yield a truth value (entry on Frege, see also Liebesman 2015, who takes a critical stance).

2.2.3 Ontological categories and syntactic categories, positions, and structures

Natural language may manifest ontology also in its syntactic categories, which often appear to reflect ontological categories. Thus, verbs are generally taken to reflect the category of events (Szabó 2015), and adjectives the category of tropes or particularized properties (Williams 1953; Strawson 1959). Syntactic categories do not strictly correlate with ontological categories, though. Be in a hurry, be hurried, and hurry all are predicates seemingly standing for the same property, but based on the lexical content of a noun, an adjective, and a verb, respectively. Another, mere tendency of a correlation is that of the syntactic mass-count distinction with the distinction between stuff and individuals (§3.3).

There is no agreement, at this point, as to the ontological content of syntactic category distinctions. This is a difficult issue also because there is a lot of cross-linguistic variation as to what syntactic categories natural languages display (Gil 2000). Moreover, there are theoretical developments in syntax that put familiar syntactic category distinctions into question and require at least a recasting of the issue. For example, in distributive morphology (Halle & Marantz 1993; Borer 2005), lexical elements (roots) are not associated with syntactic categories in the lexicon. Only when they are inserted in a syntactic structure will they be associated with syntactic categories, which means that they cannot owe any ontologically relevant lexical content to a syntactic category. Another example is the theory of radical lexical decomposition (Hale & Kayser 2002), according to which a range of full verbs are derived from combinations of a light verb and a noun, e.g., walk from take a walk (take being the light verb and walk the noun). This view gives up a close connection between events and the category of verbs, but posits a much greater range of nouns instead that underlie full verbs.

Ontological categories in natural language may be reflected in other ways in syntax than in syntactic categories, for example in syntactic positions. On the recent cartographic theory of syntax (Cinque & Rizzi 2010), syntactic positions in a sentence or an NP are associated with a semantic content, which often amounts to an ontological category. For example different positions for adjectival modifiers in an NP are distinguished for modifiers of number, size, shape, and color.

Another correlation of syntactic structure with ontology may concern the different types of situations that serve as truthmakers for different types of modal auxiliaries (Ramchand 2018).

2.2.4 Metaphysically relevant specific expressions and constructions

Besides syntactic categories, natural language displays particular types of expressions and constructions that appear to express metaphysical notions. Examples are of course the copula be, which conveys identity, predication, existence, and perhaps other related notions, modals that convey metaphysical modality (may, must, essential, the nature of), existence predicates that convey existence or ways of being (exist, occur, obtain) (§1.2), ontological dependence (which may be conveyed by have or the possessor construction), part-whole-related expressions (Vieu 2006), expressions of causation (make, cause) (Swanson 2012), and truth (Hinzen & Wiltschko forthcoming, Moltmann 2021b). In addition, there are various nominal constructions that serve to denote entities of particular categories, perhaps introduced in particular construction-specific ways (§3.1)

With metaphysically relevant expressions, there is a general issue whether they may be used as technical terms pertaining to a particular philosophical view, in which case the expressions may be regarded as part of the periphery of language, not displaying an ontological notion that is part of the ontology of natural language (§4.1). Nouns such as existence, property, being, event, and number may be candidates since they can be used with particular philosophical notions in mind, unlike the verb exist (§1.3) and copula and modal verbs, which do not permit non-ordinary, “philosophical” uses.

2.2.5 Chomskyan skepticism about reference to objects in the semantics of natural language

As mentioned in Section 1.3, the view that referential NPs stand for objects is not uncontroversial. It has been the target of critique particularly by Chomsky (1986; 1995; 2013), who put forward various challenges to the traditional notion of reference as a relation to “real” objects in a mind-independent reality. These are for the most part cases of inconsistent property ascriptions that objects on standard views would not be able to bear. For example, what we refer to as a “door” could be painted, replaced, and walked through, properties that could not be attributed jointly to material objects as standardly understood. Another example Chomsky gives is a home, which unlike a house may have peculiar combinations of properties: one can own or sell a home, but not, for example paint a home. Other examples are cities, which can be destroyed and rebuilt at a different location, artifacts, which can undergo complete replacement of their parts, and persons with their relative independence of the bodies. Even terms like water, Chomsky (1995) argues, do not stand for an external substance, but are individuated in part by their roles in people’s lives. For example, water can be polluted but not H2O. Moreover, Sprite has the same percentage of H2O as tap water, but one would not call it water, water being individuated by function, not just chemical composition.

Against the background of traditional assumptions of how reality and the individuation of objects is to be conceived (§1.3), Chomsky’s conclusion is that natural language does not involve the reference relation, as a relation to “real” objects. The semantics of referential noun phrases rather involves lexical/conceptual structures deployed by speakers in particular contexts to refer to particular aspects of reality. Instead of a semantics with the (traditional) notion of external reference as its central notion, referential terms should have an internalist semantics, involving another level of syntactic representation, that of lexical-conceptual structure. This view will then require a different conception of compositionality than the standard one. Rather than being based on objects and properties, compositional semantics will have to do with concepts only or concepts together with mental instructions (Pietroski 2018).

Chomsky’s position, which denies that speakers using referential NPs refer to objects (on a particular standard understanding), appears to imply a rejection of natural language ontology as such. There are different kinds of ontological responses to the various Chomskyan challenges. First, one may adopt a different conception of reality. Reality need not be conceived as a mind-independent realm of material objects, subject to particular constraints on their spatio-temporal location. Instead it may be taken to consist in a plenitude of entities, including entities that are individuated by function and purposes. Second, one may adopt non-standard notions of an object that allow for apparently contradictory property attributions, such as “complex objects” that obtain properties from distinct entities of which they are composed (Arapinis & Vieu 2015) or “variable embodiments” that inherit properties from different manifestations (Fine 1999). A third type of response is to revise standard views of predication by having predicates apply to underspecified conceptual units (“dot objects”), which are then mapped them onto real objects (Pustejovsky 1995) or to have predication be based on particular ways of property inheritance from parts or constituting matter (Liebesman & Magidor 2017).

3. Distinctive Features of the Ontology of Natural Language

3.1 Complex NPs and Constructional Ontology

The pursuit of natural language ontology appears to go along with a view of ontological pluralism according to which there is not a single ontology, but several ontologies associated with different cognitive or representational functions, in addition to the ontology of what there ultimately is. The following sections will discuss cases that appear to show a discrepancy between the ontology of natural language and the reflective ontology of ordinary speakers, that is, the ontology speakers naively accept when thinking about what there is, an ontology that includes the ontology of ordinary objects. They are just some of examples of the wealth of “derivative” or “minor” entities that referential NPs may stand for and that are likely to be rejected by speakers of the language when thinking about there is. Referential NPs standing for such controversial entities satisfy the very same criteria of referentiality as NPs standing for less controversial entities, by accepting the same sorts of predicates as ordinary referential NPs, supporting anaphoric pronouns, and being replaceable by quantifiers.

3.1.1 Reference to unrestricted sums and kinds

The first case involves definite plurals and mass nouns as well as conjunctions of definite NPs. The dominant view in natural language semantics is that the semantics of such NPs involves an ontology of unrestricted sums of individuals (in the case of plurals) and of quantities (in the case of mass NPs). That is, the things in my garden stands for the sum of the things in my garden, the definite mass NP the sand in the Sahara stands for the sum of the sand quantities in the Sahara, and the Eiffel Tower and the Dalai Lama stands for the sum of the Eiffel Tower and the Dalai Lama (Link 1983; Champollion & Krifka 2017; Ojeda 1993). Motivations for that view are that definite plurals and mass NPs exhibit standard criteria of referentiality and share predicates with singular NPs with the same readings. Thus, heavy displays readings applying to the entire referent of the definite NPs below:

The stone is heavy
The stones are heavy.
The sand is heavy.

A sum of individuals is generally understood on the basis of a part relation specific to plurals and distinct from the part relation applying to individuals (Link 1979; Ojeda 1993).

If definite plural and mass NPs and conjunctions of definite NPs stand for sums, they do not impose any restrictions on sum formation, which means that the ontology of natural language displays mereological universalism (see entry on mereology). Mereological universalism is generally not taken to obtain for the ontology of ordinary objects, where sum formation appears subject to conditions of integrity (such as having a form or boundary) that the potential sum must fulfill (Simons 1987) or by teleological conditions of purpose (Rose & Schaffer 2017) (§1.5). Such restrictions need not obtain for sum formation in the ontology of the real or fundamental, where mereological universalism is a plausible view.

A similar issue arises with the denotation of bare (determinerless) plurals and mass nouns such as dinosaurs or water. Bare plurals and mass nouns in English are generally taken to be able to act as terms referring to kinds (Carlson 1977):

Pigeons are widespread
Water is transparent

Predicates of kinds include those conveying properties of the kind as a whole, as in (4a), and those conveying properties characteristic of the instances of the kind, as in (4b). The kind-referential status of the bare nouns in (4a, b) is supported by the usual criteria for referentiality. Pigeons will thus stand for a kind whose instances are particular pigeons, and water will stand for a kind (substance) whose instances are particular water quantities.

The semantics of bare plurals and mass nouns involves a particular notion of kind: kind formation for the purpose of the semantics of bare plural and mass nouns is unrestricted. Bare plurals like typographical mistakes, old pink buttons or cheap red wine are semantically entirely on a par with pigeons, displaying the same semantic characteristic readings of predicates. Those would hardly be considered kinds in folk metaphysics or the ontology of the real, where not just any instantiated (non-natural) property corresponds to a kind.

Such a divergence also holds for qualities. In the tradition of Aristotle’s Categories (see entry on Aristotle’s Categories), bare adjective nominalizations such as wisdom in (5) can be regarded terms for qualities, universals whose instances have been taken to be tropes (modes or Aristotelian accidents) (Lowe 2006):

Wisdom is better than cleverness.

As a universal, “wisdom” will have as its instances tropes such as Socrates’ wisdom or the wisdom of that remark. With bare plurals and adjective nominalizations, English appears to reflect the Aristotelian four-category ontology of individuals (primary substances), kinds of individuals (secondary substances), tropes (accidents/modes), and kinds of tropes (qualities). Like Aristotelian secondary substances, the kinds that bare plurals stand for generally inherit their properties from their instances (Pigeons can fly) and exist only if instantiated (Pigeons exists implies the existence of an individual pigeon). However, qualities as denotations of bare adjectives are unrestricted. Irregularity, dirtiness, and underserved wealth will likewise stand for qualities, but not in any sense of naturalness that would put them on a par with natural kinds.

The view that definite plurals and mass NPs and bare plurals and mass nouns stand for unrestricted sums or kinds is not uncontroversial. An alternative view that has been pursued for definite plurals is that of plural reference, the view according to which the definite plural the stones refers to each stone at once, rather than referring to a single plurality (Yi 2005; 2006; McKay 2006; Oliver & Smiley 2013; entry on plural quantification). There are various motivations for plural reference. One of them is the intuition that a sentence such as (3b) is about the stones, not a distinct object that is the sum of stones. Another motivation is the applicability of many and numerals like ten to plurals (the stones are many / ten), but not sums (?? the group / sum of the stones is many / ten). Plural reference is also motivated by the way the predicates are some of and is one of are understood. If Genie is the name for the sum of Russell and Whitehead, only (6a) will be true, not (6b) (Yi 2005: 472):

Genie is one of Frege and Genie.
Genie is one of Frege and Russell and Whitehead.

Similarly, quantities as denotations of definite mass NPs (the sand) appear to behave neither as one nor as many and may ultimately require a different account (Laycock 2006; McKay 2016).

Similar considerations shed doubt on bare plural and mass nouns referring to kinds as single entities. For example, just as (7a), unlike (7b), cannot express the existence of a sum as an entity distinct from the individuals, (8a) could not be used to make a claim about the existence of an entity that is a possibly uninstantiated kind or property (Strawson 1959; Wolterstorff 1970: Chap. 7), as opposed to (8b), which can be used that way:

The books exist.
The sum of the books exists.
Wisdom exists.
The property of being wise exists.

There are two alternatives one might pursue for the semantics of kind terms of the sort of bare plurals and mass nouns: first, posit entities that fail to have properties themselves but have properties strictly on the basis of inheritance from their instances; second, extend plural reference to bare plurals and mass nouns, by taking them to plurally refer to all the possible instances (Moltmann 2013: chap. 2).

3.1.2 Intensional definite NPs

NPs such as the increasing air in the balloon, the rising temperature, the people that can fit into the car, or the book John needs to write appear to behave like referential NPs and have been analyzed as standing for particular sorts of entities, variable embodiments or variable objects (Fine 1999; Moltmann 2013: chap. 4), entities that are hardly part of the ontology speakers in general accept when thinking about what there is. There are alternatives to the ontological analysis, though, such as that of Montague (Montague 1974), who took the temperature to stand for a functional concept, and of Grosu & Krifka (2007), who took the related NP the gifted mathematician you claim to be to stand for an individual concept.

3.1.3. Introduction of entities by abstraction

An important way of introducing abstract objects that has been discussed in the philosophical literature is that of abstraction from concepts (Frege 1884; Wright 1983; Hale 1987). A related view is that of pleonastic entities introduced by “something-from-nothing transformations” on the basis of nonreferential expressions (Schiffer 1996). Are these strategies part of the (constructional) ontology of natural language? On the Fregean view, abstraction is part of the semantics of functional number terms like the number of planets, which, on that view, introduce a number on the basis of a concept (the concept planet) and the relation of equinumerosity. The pleonastic account was originally applied to that-clauses and nominals like the property of being wise (Schiffer 1996). The method of introducing objects on the basis of nonreferential expressions has been argued to be associated with the compositional semantics of close appositions of the sort the number eight and the truth value true, as well as other “reifying terms” of the sort the property of being wise and the fact that S (Moltmann 2013: chap. 6). The use of the abstraction strategy may serve the purpose of enlarging the domain of the ontology of natural language by choice, if reifying terms are part of the “periphery”, not the “core” of language (§4.1). The introduction of entities by abstraction, though, also appears to underlie the Kimian notion of events, as opposed to the Davidsonian one of events as primitives (Kim 1976; Davidson 1967; Maienborn 2007).

3.2 Intentional or Nonexistent Objects

The view that there are nonexistent or intentional objects, Meinongianism, is a highly controversial philosophical view (van Inwagen 2003; entries on existence, nonexistent objects, fictional entities). But it is a view that is often motivated or defended by appeal to natural language (Fine 1982; van Inwagen 1977; Kripke 2013; McGinn 2000; Parsons 1980; Priest 2005; Salmon 1987, 1998; Thomasson 1999), namely sentences with existence predicates or intentional verbs such as look for or think about:

Pegasus does not exist.
John thought about / was looking for Pegasus.

The Meinongian takes Pegasus in (9a) and (9b) to stand for a nonexistent object. There is an alternative view, though, on which it is an exceptional, empty occurrence of a name (Sainsbury 2005). Linguistic support for the Meinongian view comes from the fact that Pegasus in (8a) and (8b) fulfills standard criteria for referential terms, such as supporting anaphora and allowing for replacement by quantifiers (something), as well as from the compositional semantics of constructions with relative clauses as below (Moltmann 2016):

The building John thought about does not exist.
John thought about a building that does not exist.

A compositional semantics of the relative clause constructions in (10a, b) can hardly be achieved without positing intentional objects as arguments of both think about and exist. The task for natural language ontology then is to develop a theory of intentional objects that is both coherent and does justice to their restricted occurrences in the semantic structure of sentences.

If descriptive metaphysics is conceived as the “metaphysics of appearances”, this might suggest that non-existent objects would have to be posited as semantic values of referential NPs even with extensional predicates. Referential NPs should reflect entities of a certain sort whether or not they exist. However, non-intentional predicates are existence-entailing (Priest 2005), which means that in extensional contexts only actual entities as semantic values of referential NPs contribute to truth conditions. Thus, the building is tall is true only if the building being referred to is an actual building that is tall. In extensional contexts, referential NPs that turn out not to refer to actual entities better fail to have a semantic value rather than standing for nonexistent objects.

In intensional contexts, intentional objects have been posited also as semantic values of anaphora, both within the context of an attitude of a single agent and across attitudinal contexts involving different agents (Edelberg 1986). In those contexts, intentional objects serve as discourse referents (Karttunen 1976) and thus interact with dynamic semantics, being individuated not just by what properties agents attribute to them, but also by the flow of information in the discourse (Edelberg 1986). Discourse referents in fact have sometimes been conceived ontologically even in extensional contexts (Landman 1986), though this is not the dominant view in dynamic semantics (see entry on dynamic semantics).

3.3 The Mass-Count Distinction

The mass-count distinction displays, in a particularly striking way, a discrepancy between the ontology displayed by natural language and the ontology tied to cognition or what is generally taken to be the ontology of the real. Various criteria distinguish count nouns from mass nouns in English. Most important is the availability of the plural and the applicability of cardinal and ordinal numerals with count nouns, but not mass nouns (Pelletier & Schubert 1989/ 2003; Doetjes 2012). The mass-count distinction, it is generally agreed, has semantic content, but there is much less agreement as to what that content amounts to (see entry on metaphysics of mass expressions). The mass-count distinction has often been taken to reflect the ontological distinction between individuals (chair, door) and matter or stuff (metal, wood), a distinction that has been cast either in terms of the notion of having a boundary or integrity or being an atom (with respect to some concept). However, more recently linguists have drawn attention to a number of generalizations that indicate that the distinction between singular count, mass, and plural nouns does not strictly go along with an ontological distinction between different types of beings (Pelletier & Schubert 1989/2003; Chierchia 1998; Moltmann 1997; Rothstein 2017). First, singular count NPs seem to be able to stand for the very same things as definite plural or mass NPs (the (loose) collection of stuff on this desk—the stuff on this desk, the quantity of liquid in the container—the liquid in the container). Second, languages may make a choice of mass as opposed to count without apparent perceptual differences (rice—oats, corn—peas, cattle—cows). Also cross-linguistically, the choice of mass versus count for particular entities appears to an extent arbitrary (English hair—Italian capelli, English pasta—French pâtes). Third, there is an important class of so-called object mass nouns, mass nouns that appear to stand for pluralities of well-individuated objects, such as hardware, jewelry, luggage, staff, police force, often competing with apparent co-extensional plural nouns in the same language (clothes—clothing, policemen—police force, cows—cattle, carpets—carpeting). Yet like other mass nouns, object mass nouns resist numerals (* the three police force) as well as a range of other predicates applicable to plurals (John listed the clothes / ??? the clothing, The policemen / ?? the police force are / is numerous). Whether a language chooses a singular count, plural, or mass noun appears to an extent arbitrary; yet the choice between mass and count plays a role for the applicability of number-related predicates and quantifiers. The mass-count distinction thus displays a form of “grammaticized individuation” (Rothstein 2017), involving a language-driven notion of unity that may diverge from the notion of unity that pertains to cognition or what is taken to be the real structure of things.

4. The Issue of Ontologies

4.1 The Ontology of Natural Language and the Core-Periphery Distinction

Not only metaphysical assertions are generally set aside when pursuing natural language ontology. Philosophers when clarifying metaphysical intuitions make use only of certain sorts of expressions (or uses of expressions) and not others, and so for a linguist interested in the ontology of natural language. Certainly, they will not appeal to technical philosophical expressions or uses of expressions, that is, (uses of) expressions meant to convey philosophical notions arrived at by reflection, whether by philosophers or non-philosophers (the “folk”). It is a characteristic feature of natural language to allow for expansion, permitting at least certain types of expressions to be used with a particular intended meaning and to allow conveying new concepts through the formation of new expressions, by means of morphological processes or syntactic composition. These are entirely legitimate ways of using language, but they are generally set aside when philosophers appeal to language as a way of clarifying metaphysical intuitions. For example, Heidegger introduced the nominalization das Nichts “the nothing” as well as the verb nichten “to nothing”. While this is not an illegitimate use of language, no philosopher or linguist would take the existence of the nominalization or the verb to be evidence for there to be an entity that is a nothing or a corresponding process or state. Likewise, the possibility of forming, legitimately, the term the truth value true is certainly never taken as evidence for truth values being entities. Another example is the various meanings philosophers associate with the noun existence. The fact that there are different notions of existence that different philosophers endorse and associate as the meaning of the noun existence does not mean that the ontology of natural language reflects those notions all at once. As was mentioned in Section 2.2.4, not all expressions allow for “non-ordinary” or “philosophical” uses in that way. Expressions that belong to the functional part of grammar generally do not, such as auxiliaries (have, be, can, may), determiners, and quantifiers, and neither does the verb exist (§1.3).

Philosophers and non-philosophers when engaging in ontological reflection may use or introduce expressions specifically meant to convey their own ontological views. But such (uses of) expressions are never considered indicative of the ontology implicit in natural language. Yet they should come with a semantics as well, and may have to be assigned as semantic values entities or properties, even if fictional, in order to be integrated within a single compositional semantics of the language. Still a distinction needs to be maintained, in some way, between what is implicitly accepted as part of our linguistically manifest intuitions (non-technical expressions with their ordinary meaning) and what is added on through reflection.

The different ways in which the two sorts of linguistic data are treated, by both philosophers and by linguists, motivate a distinction between the (ontological) core of natural language (or the use of it) and its (ontological) periphery (Moltmann 2020c): only the core, not the periphery, reflects our metaphysical intuitions and thus the ontology of natural language. Clearly, without a core-periphery distinction, any ontological view or notion, as reflected in particular technical (uses) of terms, would be part of the ontology of natural language. This would mean that the ontology of natural language would no longer reflect metaphysical intuitions and would comprise an unrestricted range of not generally mutually compatible ontologies.

Though the core-periphery distinction appears to have been tacitly made throughout the history of philosophy as well as in the practice of contemporary semanticists, the task of making it precise faces considerable challenges. One challenge is to elaborate the distinction content-wise, say in terms of cognitive relations on the part of agents, distinguishing, in some way, between intuition or implicit acceptance and inferential or reflective acceptance (of part of the ontology). A second challenge is to investigate whether the distinction is grounded in the grammar of language. A plausible hypothesis to pursue is that it goes along with the divide between the functional part of language (which includes syncategorematic expressions, syntactic categories and features, and auxiliary verbs) and the lexicon. The example of the contrast between existence and exist suggests, though, that this may be too simplified: the noun existence should belong to the periphery (since it is able to convey just any notion of existence a particular metaphysician has in mind), whereas the verb exist belongs to the core, not permitting a non-ordinary use.

The question also arises whether and how the distinction relates to the core-periphery distinction that Chomsky (1981, 1986) introduced for syntax, where, very roughly, the core of the syntactic system of a language represents universal grammar and the periphery exceptions and outside influences.

Note that “periphery” is not meant to mean “marginal” in the sense of statistically less used. Moreover, it does not concern the kind of ontology itself: the periphery may contain a technical use of a term which ends up denoting the very same category or entity as a term from the core. What matters, rather, is language-users’ cognitive relation to semantic values, whether it involves some form of reflection or derivative acceptance rather than implicit acceptance.

Given the core-periphery distinction, (2) will need to be revised as follows:

The ontology of a natural language is the ontology a speaker implicitly accepts by way of making use of the core of the language.

The periphery by itself imposes challenges for natural language semantics and natural language ontology. The periphery, from a linguistic point of view at least, is a legitimate part of natural language (or a legitimate extension of it): technical (uses) of terms certainly have a semantics and will reflect an ontology, even if it is not the ontology of natural language, but one that goes beyond it. It is part of the task of natural language semantics to in principle allow for the semantic composition of the meaning of sentences containing philosophical (uses) of terms.

It has been argued that there is one kind of complex expression that generally belongs to the periphery, and that is reifying NPs of the sort the number eight, the property of being happy, the proposition that it is raining, or the truth value true (Moltmann 2020c). It is a general observation that philosophers usually stay away from reifying NPs when drawing on natural language for motivating an ontological category. For example, Frege (1884) did not motivate numbers as objects by appealing to the construction the number eight in natural language, and he did not motivate truth values as objects by appealing to the truth value true. Rather he used expressions from the core like the number of planets and eight when arguing for numbers being objects, and his motivations for considering truth values to be objects did not come from particular natural language sentences at all. Likewise, Hale (1987) argued for properties being objects not on the basis of terms like the property of mercy, but rather simple terms like mercy from the core of language. Finally, Link (1979) motivated mereological sums being part of the ontology of language not on the basis of terms like the sum of the students from the periphery of language, but rather simple definite plurals like the students. The semantics of reifying terms itself appears to be associated with abstraction involving the introduction of an entity on the basis of a nonreferential (use of) an expression (Moltmann 2013, chap. 6). If such an operation of object introduction (a form of derivative acceptance) defines the content of reifying terms (§3.1.3), their classification as part of the periphery may become plausible.

The core-periphery distinction in natural language ontology would be important also for the quest for universals of natural language ontology. Only the core reflects metaphysical intuitions, which are generally held to not display interpersonal inconsistency (see entry on intuition). This means that only the core, not the periphery can represent a form of universal language-related ontology. Of course, the general presupposition that intuitions show no interpersonal inconsistency may be in error, and so may be the assumption that the ontology of the core is universal rather than showing language-particular differences.

While philosophers and linguists generally appear to adopt a core-periphery distinction implicitly, the distinction appears explicitly in a general hypothesis about reference to abstract objects in natural language that has been pursued in Moltmann (2013):


The Abstract-Objects Hypothesis
Natural language does not involve reference to abstract objects in its core, but only in its periphery.

The Abstract-Object Hypothesis is a particular thesis within natural language ontology; it is not a methodological principle of natural language ontology as such. This means that natural language ontology, with (or even without) its core-periphery distinction, may be pursued while not subscribing to the Abstract-Objects Hypothesis.

The Abstract-Objects Hypothesis goes against the widely held belief that reference to abstract objects in natural language is rampant (§1.6). Based on a range of semantic and syntactic generalizations, Moltmann (2013) argues that this view is mistaken: what appear to be expressions in the core of natural language, referring to abstract objects (numbers, properties, propositions, degrees, expression types) are in fact expressions referring to particulars, pluralities of (actual or possible) particulars, or variable objects, or else they are expressions that fail to have a referential function in the first place (numerals, clausal complements, predicative complements, complements of intensional transitive verbs). The particulars comprise tropes, including quantitative tropes (John’s height) and number tropes (the number of planets) (see entry on tropes). Only in the periphery, so the view, is reference to abstract objects possible, for example through the use of reifying terms such as the number eight, the property of being happy, the word “happy”, or the proposition that it is raining. Thus, the view is that in its core, the ontology of natural language displays a form of trope nominalism (see entry on nominalism in metaphysics).

4.2 The Question of Ontologies

Distinguishing different branches of metaphysics goes hand in hand with the view according to which there is not a single ontology, but several, at least apparent, ontologies, ontologies pertaining to language, to cognition, and to fundamental reality. But there is also the question whether there is in fact a single ontology of natural language. When natural language has been used to clarify metaphysical intuitions, the presupposition was that metaphysical intuitions do not show interpersonal inconsistencies, which means that there is a unique ontology reflected in the relevant ways in natural language. There are reasons to be skeptical of that presupposition. It is not necessarily the case that there is a single ontology implicit in all natural languages, just as there may in fact be interpersonal differences among intuitions, which have now become the subject of experimental philosophy (see entry on experimental philosophy). The proper subject matter of natural language ontology should thus be the ontologies of natural languages. The possibility of interlinguistic ontological differences touches touches upon the Sapir-Whorf hypothesis and the controversy surrounding it (Pinker 1994; Hespos & Spelke 2004; Pelletier 2011). Of course, it may turn out that the ontologies of natural languages are in fact the same or at least that there are constraints on how the they may differ from each other and what linguistic phenomena (of the lexical or functional part of grammar) such differences may pertain to. Assuming a distinction between core and periphery, clearly, if there is a universal ontology shared by human languages, it should pertain to the core only. Generative linguists may furthermore be interested in such constraints, or a universal ontology, as a way of explaining how the grammar of a language with the ontology that goes along with it can be learned.

5. Outlook

Natural language ontology is just at the initial stage of developing as a discipline of its own. The methodological issues surrounding it still await a serious discussion, such as the relation of the ontology reflected in language to different conceptions of reality and to ontologies tied to other representational or cognitive functions, the particular notion of implicit acceptance that the ontology of natural language involves, the core-periphery distinction, the ontological status associated with different semantic roles, the way ontological categories are reflected in natural language given recent theoretical syntactic and cross-linguistic research, and the different connections of the ontology of natural language to the functional and the lexical part of grammar.


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