Portrait courtesy of the National Trust for Scotland
Thomas Reid (1710–1796) is a Scottish philosopher best known for his philosophical method, his theory of perception and its wide implications on epistemology, and as the developer and defender of an agent-causal theory of free will. In these and other areas he offers perceptive and important criticisms of the philosophy of Locke, Berkeley and especially Hume. He is also well known for his criticisms of Locke's view of personal identity and Hume's view of causation. Reid also made influential contributions to philosophical topics including ethics, aesthetics and the philosophy of mind. The legacy of Thomas Reid's philosophical work is found in contemporary theories of perception, free will, philosophy of religion, and widely in epistemology.
After studying at the University of Aberdeen, Reid entered the ministry in New Machar in 1737. In 1748 he published a short essay entitled “An Essay on Quantity” concerning Hutcheson's Inquiry into the Origin of Our Ideas of Beauty and Virtue. Although this was his only published work, he was given a professorship at King's College Aberdeen in 1752. There he published An Inquiry Into the Human Mind on the Principles of Common Sense (or ‘IHM’) in 1764. Later he received a prestigious professorship at the University of Glasgow. He resigned from this position in 1781 in order to give himself more time to write, and published Essays on the Intellectual Powers of Man (or ‘EIP’) in 1785 and Essays on the Active Powers of Man (or ‘EAP’) in 1788. These three books, along with four additional books composed of papers, essays and more, have been recently republished in the Edinburgh Edition of Thomas Reid.
In the Inquiry, a methodologically pioneering work due to its extensive and rigorous use of observational data to justify claims about perception, Reid examines each of the five senses and discusses the ways in which we achieve knowledge of the world by employing them. Intellectual Powers expands his system beyond the apprehension of the world through the senses to consideration of memory, imagination, knowledge, the nature of judgment, reasoning and taste. The Active Powers examines a collection of topics concerning ethics, the nature of agency generally, and the distinctive features of human agency.
- 1. Philosophical Method
- 2. Conception
- 3. Perception and Knowledge of the World
- 4. Causation and Free Will
- 5. Memory and Personal Identity
- 6. Moral Philosophy
- 7. Aesthetics
- 8. Philosophy of Religion
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
Reid often articulates his theoretical positions in terms defending common sense and the “opinions of the vulgar”. Indeed, he is often described as a “common sense philosopher”. This reputation owes less to the philosophical uses Reid makes of common sense than to fellow Scotsman James Beattie, who popularized common sense in his very widely read An Essay on The Nature and Immutability of Truth In Opposition to Sophistry and Scepticism (1770). Even today it is easy to overestimate and to misunderstand the role of common sense in Thomas Reid's philosophical system.
The most important use of the term “common sense” in Reid occurs in the context of his epistemology and his philosophical method. Here it refers to a select set of intuitive judgments. Reid calls these variously “first principles, principles of common sense, common notions, [or] self-evident truths” (Essays on the Intellectual Powers, abbreviated ‘EIP’, 6.4, 452). Common sense first principles are identifiable because they typically possess a suite of additional traits (traits, note, not necessary conditions) as follows. Denial of a common sense principle is not only false but absurd (EIP 6.4, 462). A common sense judgment is “necessary to all men for their being and preservation, and therefore it is unconditionally given to all men by the Author of Nature” (EIP 4.6, 412). Common sense intuitive judgments are “no sooner understood than they are believed. The judgment follows the apprehension of them necessarily, and both are equally the work of nature, and the result of our original powers” (EIP 6.4, 452).
Common sense principles possess “the consent of ages and nations, of the learned and unlearned, [which] ought to have great authority with regard to first principles, where every man is a competent judge” (EIP 6.4, 464). Common sense principles are common sense because, but not only because, they are common to humanity. Reid's account of common sense does not itself approach the status of a philosophical or psychological theory. Though his commitment to common sense forms a key component in his philosophical method, a deeper methodological principle clearly underlies his appeal to common sense. Reid attempts to build his fallibilist, foundationalist account of empirical knowledge while working under an empiricist constraint that prohibits speculative use of a priori reason. As a result, Reid's reference to beliefs held in common across time and place, across culture and religion, functions as an empirically justified generalization about species-typical features of human cognition.
Though this marks a point commonly neglected in the interpretation of Reid, one can often find, in his discussion of common sense, emphasis on empirical generalizations from observable data about what people believe and how they behave. For example, he writes, “The universality of these opinions, and of many such that might be named, is sufficiently evident, from the whole tenor of human conduct, as far as our acquaintance reaches, and from the history of all ages and nations of which we have any records” (EIP 6.4, 466). Laying stress upon his claim about the universality of certain beliefs across our species has opened Reid up to tiresome criticism that began in his lifetime and continues to the present of the following sort: Reid's appeals to common sense are little more than affirmations of majority opinion or appeals to the masses, but these are fallacious, so his inferences from such principles are defeated. Reid corrects this misunderstanding by emphasizing the fact that his first principles are psychological generalizations about belief formation applicable to most of our species (EIP 6.4, 464–5).
Reid often appeals to the structure of languages as evidence for generalizations about human cognition, belief, and descriptive metaphysics. Language, being something so widely shared, offers an abundance of data for observation. Reid finds many commonalities across languages. (The connection between ordinary language and common sense that Reid espouses was of great influence on such later philosophers as G. E. Moore and J. L. Austin.) Reid does not believe, however, that every feature of ordinary language is indicative of some important tenet of common sense (EIP 1.1, 26–27). Reid often suggests that the relevant features are those that can be found in “the structure of all languages”, suggesting that the linguistic features of relevance are features of syntactic structure shared among languages. Reid says there is some important difference between the active and the passive, since “all languages” have a passive and active voice. All languages distinguish between qualities of things and the things themselves (EIP 6.4, 466). This suggests that certain universal features of the syntactic structure of languages inform us of a common sense cognitive commitment, even if it is implicit.
Most of Reid's first principles of contingent truth take the form of Principle 5, which reads “That those things do really exist which we distinctly perceive by our senses, and are what we perceive them to be” (EIP 6.5, 476). Such common sense first principles are intended to be more than merely generalizations about how humans across cultures form beliefs. Reid intends these general principles to provide evidence for particular beliefs. Thus Principle 5 issues in the self-evident belief, for example, that I perceive a computer before me (Van Cleve 1999). As a result, Reid's philosophical method accords with common sense insofar as everyday perceptual beliefs are evident or self-evident.
An implication of Reid's application of his common sense method to first principles is that Reid is not concerned to answer questions of justification that appear pressing to contemporary epistemologists. He is not, for instance, interested in providing a refutation of skepticism about the external world by appeal to first principles. Reid believes he can refute skeptical hypotheses--such as Descartes's hypothesis of an evil demon who makes us believe that the world is the way we take it to be when it is really vastly different--simply by showing that such a hypothesis is no more likely to be true than the common-sensical belief that the world is much the way we perceive it to be. Since the belief in the external world is a dictate of common sense, it is, Reid thinks, as justified as it needs to be when it is shown to be on the same footing as any alternative. Justification, therefore, does not necessarily require providing positive reasons in favor of common-sensical beliefs; common sense beliefs could be adequately justified simply by undermining the force of the reasons in favor of alternatives to common sense. In fact, as we move through this entry, we will witness Reid's repeated deployment of this strategy in the form of burden-of-proof arguments against his major foil, the Way of Ideas. Common sense constrains, rather than dictates, acceptable philosophical positions.
A number of additional problems remain in accounting for Reid's appeal to common sense and in his treatment of first principles. For example, a number of comments Reid makes indicate that he appears to have a psychological conception of evidence whereby what is evident forces assent. He writes, “[The different kinds of evidence] seem to me to agree only in this, that they are fitted by nature to produce belief in the human mind” (EIP 2.20, 292). Just what he means, then, by terms “evident” and “self-evident” (terms he greatly prefers to the more contemporary “justification” and “knowledge”) is an issue meriting further research.
The relations between one's first principles, the perceived aims—and limits—of natural philosophy, and one's religious background came together in eighteenth-century Great Britain to issue in a number of different philosophical stances. Typically these stances are framed as various commitments to Newton and Newtonianism. Hume and MacLaurin believe the mind's operations are to be studied with broadly observational Newtonian methods, though this leads them to forms of local skepticism. Priestley and Hartley apply Newtonianism not only to the operations of the mind but to the mind's substance via materialist commitments. Reid's teacher George Turnbull adopted Newtonianism and was led to Berkeleyan idealism by many of Berkeley's own common-sense commitments. Wanting both the world and knowledge of it in his philosophical system, Reid was at pains to articulate his account of both common sense and Newtonianism. Unlike most British Empiricists, Reid read, understood, and taught Newton's writings. To understand Reid's philosophical method, not to mention his philosophy of science, one must understand core features of Reid's Newtonianism (Callergård, 2010) and, perhaps, how Reid altered Newton's own method (Ducheyne 2006).
First, Reid is committed to the positive role of mathematics in stating and testing theories. Only in that field do we “find no sects, no contrary systems, and hardly any disputes” (EIP 6.4, 457). Newton's greatness lies in part due to the fact that he places physics upon firm mathematical ground, in sharp contrast to Cartesian physics, its leading competitor of the time. Second, Reid says that issues about causation are not issues physics should attempt to resolve. This counterintuitive commitment is explained by the fact that Reid believes causes, when that term is used properly, are efficient causes (The Correspondence of Thomas Reid, abbreviated ‘Correspondence’ below, 2006, 158). Not only this, efficient causes are only ever agents (EAP 1.5, 30–32; for more about this, see 4. Causation and Free Will, below). Reid attributes this position to Newton. Reid mentions on many occasions, and with a certain pride, that Newtonian science does not permit knowledge of causes of phenomena, for example, the motion of the compass needle or the attraction of two bodies. Here and elsewhere Reid frequently speaks with the scientists and uses ‘cause’ in a colloquial way to refer to physical causes; in doing so, he explicitly follows David Hume's lead. More often, however, Reid urges readers to think of scientific explanation in terms of laws, as Newton had done. Laws are true general propositions used to explain appearances (Thomas Reid on the Animate Creation 1996, 187). Physics does not aim to find efficient causes. By dispensing with causes and amplifying the explanatory value and empirical justification of statements of laws, Reid's account is regarded as a forerunner to a deductive-nomological model of explanation.
Third, related, when one event produces another event, e.g. fertilizer enables better plant growth, Reid strongly resists describing that interaction as necessary (The Correspondence of Thomas Reid 2006, 234, 243). One event may be constantly conjoined to another event, but it is a mistake to believe that this forms any necessity. Fourth, unlike nearly all other Early Modern philosophers traditionally taught in the canon, Reid was an avowed experimentalist, made so by borrowing Newton's methods in Opticks, and conducted experiments to provide evidence for his claims about the nature of the mind, perception and agency. Reid was active in his community, bringing his penchant for knowledge through experimentation to meetings in Aberdeenshire in which experimental techniques in farming were debated. Fifth, Reid understands Newtonian physics to offer partial confirmation to some beliefs about God and God's relation to the world. Newtonian natural science's role in this connection is to provide evidence for belief that our solar system is orderly and well-governed. (See 8. Philosophy of Religion below).
Stating central features of Reid's commitment to Newtonianism goes a long way to understanding Reid's empiricism and science since Reid attributes most of his own views about these matters to Newton. Despite the fact that with a few notable exceptions Reid scholars have neglected issues in his philosophy of science, a few key controversies have emerged and merit brief mention. First, Reid was embroiled in clashes with other thinkers and correspondents about the scope of Newton's Regulae Philosophandi. Interpretations differed considerably, as did the translations and restatements of the rules themselves. Given that after Bacon's work, Newton's Regulae formed the most important statement on method in natural philosophy to be found in the Early Modern period, Reid was quick to defend his interpretation of these rules against alternate uses by Priestley and others.
Reid translates Newton's first rule from Latin as “No more causes, nor any other causes of natural effects ought to be admitted, but such as are both true, and are sufficient for explaining their appearances” and adds in his own voice, “This is a golden rule; it is the true and proper test, by which what is sound and solid in philosophy may be distinguished from what is hollow and vain” (EIP 1.3, 51). Reid expands the intended scope of this rule saying that it is a “fundamental principle in our enquiries into the structure of the mind, and its operations” (EIP 1.3, 51). Occurring in the introductory portion of his Essays on Intellectual Powers, he would go on to use and reuse it countless times in what followed. He also describes Newton's first rule as “a dictate of common sense” (EIP 2.6, 102). Proponents of the Way of Ideas fail to abide by Newton's first rule when they endorse the existence of ideas because the existence of ideas is an hypothesis and lacks evidence.
Another area of controversy in Reid's empiricism involves the grounding of his belief to the effect that ether does not exist. Ether appears to represent just the sort of posit (originally by Descartes in Principles of Philosophy) that Newtonians often enjoyed sweeping into the trash. Lacking any observational evidence for ether, Descartes posits ether as a medium through which forces can act on bodies that are not in direct contact. But does Reid reject ether theory on the grounds that it is unobservable and therefore does not belong in a Newtonian science, or does he reject ether theory because scientists as yet lack justificatory observations on its behalf? Reid's apparent hostility to “hypotheses” in philosophy and “efficient causes” in natural philosophy gives rise to the belief that Reid does not believe that forces should be allowed into philosophy. The answer to this question can resolve that issue and assist in locating Reid's philosophy of science on the positivist/realist spectrum.
The first rule does not entail that unobservables like ether, subtile fluids, or forces do not or cannot have explanatory force, let alone that unobservables do not exist. Reid is explicit that questions about the existence of ether were open questions that were not settled by a priori (EIP 2.3, 82). Physical forces and causes do exist and may yield their secrets to science in the form of purely physical forces of attraction (An Inquiry into the Human Mind on the Principles of Common Sense, abbreviated to ‘IHM’, 7, 211). This has two corollaries of considerable importance for understanding Reid's methods. First, the fact that Reid admits that these forces of attraction—unobservable, immaterial forces—may be physical implies that he is comfortable with a physical explanation of gravitation that does not entail the existence of God. Second, physical forces will not yield their secrets to an impoverished Cartesian science. This criticism is made on the grounds that Cartesians were attempting to understand gravitational attraction in terms of only extension, figure and motion—for Reid, a catastrophic mistake. In fact, Reid's criticism of the Cartesians has provided a clue for an account of Reidian forces as irreducible properties of matter (Callergård 2005, 2010).
Reid's theory of conception is at the heart of his philosophical system and his faculty psychology. The term ‘faculty psychology’ refers, at least for Reid, to both the distinction of certain belief-forming systems from others, and the explanatory utility purchased with such a set of distinctions. While faculty psychology appears to be an obvious way to scientifically study the senses, Reid's study of intellectual powers—memory, judgment, abstraction—under the umbrella of faculty psychology was not obvious. Reid would face pointed criticism for multiplying faculties, but this consequence was more than outweighed by the explanatory utility of separating mental powers—their inputs, their operations, and their outputs—from one another.
The most ubiquitous mental power is that of conception. Our suite of intellectual faculties supports a wide variety of mental events. Acts of conceiving are embedded in most of them. Whether judging that there is a tree before me, imagining there is a tree before me, or reasoning to a generalization that all trees have roots, these mental events employ the faculty of conception. It is in virtue of conception that the first of these mental states is about the proposition there is a tree before me; that the second mental state takes as its object a non-existent tree; and that the third uses a general conception of ‘tree’. The Way of Ideas teaches, wrongly, that acts of perception temporally begin with an act of simple apprehension “and that after we have got simple apprehensions, by comparing them together, we perceive agreements or disagreements between them,” but, Reid continues, “this appears to me to be all fiction, without any foundation in nature” (IHM 2.4, 29). Instead, simple apprehension—the basic form of conception—is bundled within typical acts of perception. The model of conception received from the Way of Ideas marks its first long step into two types of skepticism.
Note that the set of commitments that Reid refers to as “The Way of Ideas” and the “Ideal Theory” is drawn form the work of Locke, Berkeley, Hume and many others going back to Plato and Aristotle. Its principle commitment is to mental representations, called ‘ideas’ or ‘images’, that are believed to mediate all our experience of the world—from conception to memory and perception. Reid regards the Way of Ideas as unscientific and founded on a flawed, anti-Newtonian methodology. He also argues that it has highly undesirable consequences.
Conception lies at the heart of the operations of the intellectual faculties because conception provides the intentional content—the ‘aboutness’—to mental states. Reid distinguishes between several functions of conception. A rudimentary form of conceiving, which Reid often calls ‘simple apprehension,’ refers to “the bare conception of a thing without any judgment or belief about it” (EIP 4.1, 295). This “enters as an ingredient in every operation of the mind” (EIP 4.1, 296). In order to believe, or remember or perceive, I must perform an act of simple apprehension in order to get something in mind.
We explain Reidian conception by contrast with the Way of Ideas. First, Reid presupposes that the mind has an irreducible capacity for intentional conception in which our mental states are uniquely about specific objects. This faculty cannot be explained in terms of further non-intentional states. How intentional conception can be explained is mysterious—Reid is well aware of this. Yet if “we were unable to give any account how we first got the conception of power, this would be no good reason for denying that we have it” (Reid 2001, “Of Power,” 5). In a contrasting methodological move, Hume suggests that intentional content through ideas is built up from the operation of the laws of association—contiguity in time and space, resemblance and perceived causation—working upon impressions and images in the mind (see Treatise 184.108.40.206, 4; 220.127.116.11, 33; 18.104.22.168, 319; Enquiry 7.2.6, 74).
Conception takes as its intentional objects items with varied ontologies, including physical objects and propositions (EIP 1.1, 24–5) as well as fictional beings like Brienne of Tarth. The fact that conception takes physical objects as (direct) intentional objects marks a key contrast with the Way of Ideas since, on the Way of Ideas, conception, perception, judgment and belief are “only different ways of perceiving ideas in our own minds” (EIP 4.1, 298). (Note that, according to Reid, the Way of Ideas fails to adopt a proper faculty psychology since all mental powers—memory, perception, abstraction, etc.—only ever take ideas as intentional objects.) Considerable work in the secondary literature has been devoted to determine just what the content of conceptions are or can be.
The state of conception is not a ‘quantitative’ state for Reid, as are ideas according to Hume, who writes that some ideas are lively, others not, and others partially lively (Treatise 1.1.1). Hume uses these valences to determine which faculty is at work conceiving the idea. If I perceive an idea of a tree, my conception is lively and vivacious. If I remember the same idea of a tree, my conception is faint. Instead, Reid offers an account of a distinct faculty—conception—whose objects are embedded in other acts of the intellectual powers.
Reid's is an act-based theory of conception, in contrast to the Way of Ideas' object-based theory. Conceptions are ways of being aware of objects. To conceive of an object is to be aware of that object as the bearer of some particular property. So I can conceive that Brienne of Tarth is tall, or that Brienne of Tarth is female, or that Brienne of Tarth is a tall female. Being tall and being female are different properties, and their difference signals something important about Reidian conception. Being tall is a relational property since height is a trait that is assessed relative to some further thing or standard. To foreshadow, this subtle feature of conception will become important for Reid in his discussion of vision, especially his discussion of the relational property of visible figure.
Reid affirms human beings know what are the intentional contents of their thoughts. If I think about a tree, then I am (defeasibly) justified that I am thinking about a tree. But the Way of Ideas jeopardizes Reid's commitment to the obviousness of our introspective ability to identify what we are thinking about. Like the more familiar veil of perception created by the representational role of ideas (see 3.1 The Way of Ideas and Representational Theories of Perception ), there is also a veil of conception. The seeds of Reid's argument are in Hume's candid remark that, given the Way of Ideas, mental events “seem entirely loose and separate. One event follows another; but we never can observe any tie between them. They seem conjoined, but never connected. ... [T]he necessary conclusion seems to be that we have no idea of connexion or power at all, and that these words are absolutely without any meaning” (Enquiry 7.2.6, 74; see Treatise 22.214.171.124, 67). Hume's causal explanation of reverberating impacts on impressions in the mind does not explain the content of our thoughts. Hume describes his theory of thought as corpuscular because impressions are atomic and separable mental states without any determinate intentional link to anything else. Note that Hume appears to be led to this position by way of his attempt to repurpose Newtonian mechanics, as it applies to bodies, to formulate a science of the mind.
Troubled by the statement from Hume, Reid constructs a reductio argument against Hume's theory of thought that plays upon the implications just noted. Reid presents this argument about the intentionality of thought through an analogy about the meaning of language, specifically, about someone who is blind to the meaning of the language in a book. Suppose I see unfamiliar ink marks on paper. I neither know what they mean nor even that they are meaningful to anyone. The meanings of these words are not intrinsic to the representations of the words, whether those representations are on paper or are sound waves, just like the intentional content of ideas is not intrinsic to the ideas themselves. Reid writes:
Suppose that ideas represent things like symbols; in this way, words and writing are known to express everything. Let the intellect, therefore, be instructed by ideas ... like a written or printed book, teaching us many things that are external, that have passed away, and that will come to be. This view does not solve the problem; for who will interpret this book for us? If you show a book to a savage who has never heard of the use of letters, he will not know the letters are symbols, much less what they signify. If you address someone in a foreign language, perhaps your words are symbols as far as you are concerned, but they mean nothing to him. (Philosophical Orations, Reid 1937, 35 & Reid 1989, 62)
Uninterpreted impressions are syntactic and purportedly representational. But “Symbols without interpretation have no value” (Philosophical Orations, Reid 1937, 35 and Reid 1989, 62). The resulting veil of conception implies that my impressions risk having no meaning for me. As a result, I do not know the contents of my own thoughts. Since this is absurd, Reid rejects the Way of Ideas' premise that leads to it. This fascinating argument has been explored and its affinities with John Searle's Chinese Room argument have been noted (Haldane 1989, 1993 & Nichols 2007, ch. 2), but it merits further development.
Reid's reductio of the Way of Ideas' theory of thought is intended to buttress Reid's claims that conceiving is irreducibly intentional and that, because of this, we have knowledge of the contents of our thoughts. Hume refrains from this claim in part because he sees no plausible metaphysics to support it. That is, if intentionality is endemic to thought, then the mind must not be what we think it is—a part of nature whose ideas operate on impact principles familiar from Newtonian mechanics. Reid is aware of this problem and prepares to bite the bullet. He describes our ability to apprehend one thing and not another as being “a natural kind of magic” (IHM 5.3, 59–60). In an effort to explicate this mysterious conceptual ability, Reid examines theories of thought of Aristotle and medieval philosophers. These theories posit substantial forms that conjoin thoughts to their intentional objects (Philosophical Orations, Reid 1937, 38 and Reid 1989, 66). Yet Reid judges them harshly and finds their ontology “incomprehensible” (EIP 2.8, 114). He withholds further speculation about the metaphysics that must undergird the claim that intentionality is primitive. This move illustrates a feature of Reid's philosophical method: common sense and knowledge are conceptually and explanatorily prior to metaphysical commitments.
Reid is a nominalist about universals, which means that Reid does not believe that universals exist independently of the set of individual things that instantiate the shared property. (A universal is a property shared by many individuals, each of which instantiates the universal. In addition to opposing arguments for universals, he also opposes the form of nominalism advocated by Berkeley and Hume. Reid concludes that universals are general terms, not abstract or general ideas.
As usual, Reid builds his theory by learning from mistakes of earlier theories. Medieval philosophers argued, by Reid's account, that a universal exists independently of individual things. Some of these philosophers argued that the independent existence of a universal was existence as a form, a venerable philosophical term. Addressing this, Reid says it is impossible that “a triangle should really exist which has no precise proportion of sides and angles” and, generally, it is “impossible that any being should exist which is not an individual being” (EIP 5.6, 396). The principal philosophical error that led to the reification of universal properties as independent existents is the conflation of the objects of conception with the objects of perception (EIP 4.1, 302–3). The metaphysics required to undergird the existence of universals is anathema to Reid's commonsense commitments and his empirical method.
Next Reid considers a theory he associates with Locke, namely that universals do not exist as metaphysical forms but rather universals are abstract ideas. Abstract ideas arise through a process in which facts about time and space are stripped away from particular members of a class of thing leaving the abstract idea that represents common characteristics (EIP 3.2). Reid argues that there can be no such abstract ideas and that abstract ideas cannot represent members of a class of particulars (EIP 5.6, 391–3). Reid recognizes his great debt to Berkeley's criticisms of Lockean abstract ideas in these connections.
In effect, Reid arrives at his own theory by endorsing Berkeley's nominalism and attempting to remove from it reference to ideas. Reid replaces talk of abstract ideas with the term ‘general conception.’ As to the ontology of general conceptions, Reid says that human minds create them, not nature; this reconfirms Reid's nominalism about kind terms. General terms are the linguistic manifestation of general conceptions. General terms are general due to their referents, but they are particular token conceptions of individuals (EIP 5.2, 360). General terms refer to species or to attributes. When we conceive of general terms like ‘lion’ or ‘felony’ or ‘unicorn’, “the meaning of the word is the thing conceived” (EIP 5.2, 364). The term ‘lion’ does not resemble what it is about; it represents the class of lions by convention.
This leads to Reid's explanation of how general conceptions are formed. Reid says this typically happens via induction through testimony and not via definitions (EIP 5.2, 363). For Reid, forming general conceptions is typically a public process and a product of social practices, in contrast to Locke, Berkeley and Hume, for whom forming abstract ideas is typically a private process. (Though we do not enter into discussion of the role of testimony and social knowledge anywhere in this entry, it is especially prominent in Reid.) However, one may also form a general conception on one's own. In this case, in the first stage one analyses a subject into its attributes and names them, which Reid compares to a chemist analyzing a compound (EIP 5.3, 370). Next one observes that similar token attributes are possessed by many objects. Third is “combining into one hole a certain number of those attributes...and giving a name to that combination” (EIP 5.3, 365). The name that results may be the same as the name for a particular attribute, e.g. ‘whiteness,’ but used as a general term, ‘whiteness’ “implies no existence, but may be predicated of everything that is white, and in the same sense” (EIP 5.3, 367). This way of putting the point—that the general term whiteness may be predicated of everything that is white—has inspired a dispositional interpretation of Reidian general conceptions (Castagnetto 1992). Reid's writing on general conceptions and abstraction are areas—like the next topic, conception of non-existent objects—that have not been given much attention.
Reid believes that we can conceive of non-existent objects. This does not appear to comport with his alleged common-sense philosophy, creating an interesting conundrum for Reid interpreters. The best approach to understanding why Reid says we can conceive of non-existent objects is to put this in the context of Reid's opposition to skepticism. In the face of ‘veil of conception’ skepticism, Reid is intent on defending the transparency and self-knowledge of our thoughts. This leads him to argue that we can conceive of non-existent, fictional objects: “I conceive a centaur. This conception is an operation of the mind, of which I am conscious, and to which I can attend. The sole object of it is a centaur, an animal which, I believe, never existed” (EIP 4.2, 321; see EIP 2.12, 160). Suppose when I think I am conceiving of a centaur, I am conceiving of something else, like an image of a centaur. If so, then I do not know the contents of my thoughts. This yields skepticism about the contents of my thoughts, which Reid believes is false. So, by reductio he concludes that we are able to conceive of objects that do not exist.
The factual claim that I know what I am thinking appears to be obviously true insofar as anyone familiar with the meaning of ‘centaur’ conceives of centaurs when reading sentences that predicate properties of centaurs. Representational theories of thought like the Way of Ideas imply in this case that I do not conceive of centaurs but rather I conceive of mental representations of centaurs—images of them or words about them (EIP 4.2, 312). But Reid is asserting something different: I conceive of a centaur itself—not a mental representation of a centaur. Appreciating this point is necessary for understanding how strange Reid's theory appears to be.
Reid understands the Way of Ideas' error theory of the conception of a centaur: “The [proponent of the Way of Ideas] says, I cannot conceive a centaur without having an idea of it in my mind.... Perhaps he will say, that the idea is an image of the animal, and is the immediate object of my conception, and that the animal is the mediate or remote object.” Reid first responds that when he introspects he is aware of only one object of conception, not two. Second, the object of conception, he writes,
is not the image of an animal—it is an animal. I know what it is to conceive an image of an animal, and what it is to conceive an animal... The thing I conceive is a body of a certain figure and colour, having life and spontaneous motion. The philosopher says, that the idea is an image of the animal; but that it has neither body, nor colour, nor life, nor spontaneous motion. This I am not able to comprehend. (EIP 4.2, 321–2)
Even in difficult cases of thoughts about things like centaurs or circles (EIP 4.3, 323–4), their intentional contents are so transparent in a moment's reflection that we can identify them without mistake. Reid presses this epistemological point into heavy service in the context of the conception of non-existent objects. As with Reid's appeal to the irreducible intentionality of conception, Reid's position regarding the conception of non-existent objects has proven challenging to explain and to defend, but starts have been made (David 1985–6; Nichols 2002). Though his commitment to the importance of self-knowledge and the transparency of thought is obvious, Reid jeopardizes his allegiance to common sense by asserting we think of non-existent objects directly and without thinking of a mental intermediary.
When discussing Reidian conception, we contrasted Reid's analysis of this faculty with the Way of Ideas'. For Reid, conceptions or ‘simple apprehensions’ possess intentional content in virtue of which these mental states are about other things. Conceptions can be about a wide variety of thing: I can conceive of pain, a shooting pain Descartes' foot, penne, and fictional characters like Podrick Payne. However, according to the Way of Ideas, I can conceive only of one type of thing: Ideas. According to the Way of Ideas, this holds true not only for conception but for all other faculties. If I tactilely perceive a pillow, my perceptual mental state is not about the pillow but rather it is about my idea or mental representation of the pillow. The basic structure of the representational theory of perception (and conception, memory, etc.) is explicitly endorsed by Descartes, Locke, Berkeley, Hume and many other Early Modern philosophers, as well as many living philosophers. We doubt that there is any other philosophical commitment that more exercised Reid's mind than this one, which he thought to be a source of ruin for many reasons. Both Reid and Richard Rorty see the Way of Ideas' representationalism as the key player in the story of Early Modern Western philosophy (Rorty 1981), which would continue as the story of contemporary analytic philosophy.
To the basic structure of the representational theory of perception, one of many components can be added to explain how we are ‘aware’ of external, physical objects even though the immediate object of perception is an idea. Here are three possibilities: (1) we are aware of external objects directly by perceiving representations of them, ideas; (2) we infer the existence and nature of external objects by perceiving ideas of them; or (3) there is no distinction between external objects and ideas, and, thus, when we perceive ideas we are perceiving external objects.
On option (1), the representationalist would need to offer an explanation of what it is that is so special about ideas that makes it the case that whenever we are perceiving an idea, we are directly aware of that which it represents. If this burden can be discharged, then it is possible to say that we are aware of external objects and remain consistent with the representational theory. In the history of philosophy Reid documents a series of failed efforts to explain how it is that perception of something in the mind could amount to any direct perception or awareness of some external object. These attempts make the mistake, he thinks, of giving unexplained and unexplainable powers to ideas: how could they possibly, all by themselves, attach our minds to objects whenever they are perceived? This question cannot be answered, so he thinks.
As to (2), Reid thinks that nobody who has absorbed Hume's lessons regarding causation would think that we can avoid skepticism about the external world while insisting that we infer its nature from the features of directly perceived ideas. On the representational model, external objects are the causes of our ideas. But if Hume is right about causation then we can only infer the nature of a particular unobserved cause of a particular observed effect when we have had repeated experience of conjunction of similar causes with similar effects. But according to the Way of Ideas we have never in fact had any experience of the relevant causes, namely physical objects and their qualities; we have only experienced their effects on our minds, ideas. Therefore, we can infer nothing about external objects by examination of the ideas which they cause in us. Option (2) appears to give skepticism a foothold.
As to (3), Reid believes that it amounts to an endorsement of idealism. Reid finds this theory implausible on its own, and in violation of a host of common sense principles, despite the fact that he admires Berkeley's efforts to pursue its full implications. Reid's arguments against representationalist attempts to recover the awareness of the external world through perception via options (1), (2) and (3) are by no means all of his arguments against the representationalist theory of perception or the Way of Ideas. We now introduce a few additional considerations for which Reid rejects that theory.
First, note that proponents of the Way of Ideas commit themselves not only to the existence of ideas but to pressing ideas into a number of functional roles in the mental lives of human beings. But, according to Reid, the underlying rationale for these commitments is typically not even stated by proponents of the Way of Ideas; it is most often taken for granted, or supported with demonstrably weak arguments. As a result, the rationale for commitments to an ontology of ideas and to their functional roles in the mind does not confer upon that commitment much epistemic justification. In the context of a passage in which Reid imagines a dialogue between “the vulgar” or the common person on the one hand and “the philosopher” on the other, Reid develops this reasoning as follows:
When, therefore, in common language, we speak of having an idea of anything, we mean no more by that expression, but thinking of it. The vulgar allow that this expression implies a mind that thinks, an act of that mind which we call thinking, and an object about which we think. But, besides these three, the philosopher conceives that there is a fourth—to wit, the idea, which is the immediate object. The idea is in the mind itself, and can have no existence but in a mind that thinks; but the remote or mediate object may be something external, as the sun or moon; it may be something past or future; it may be something which never existed. This is the philosophical meaning of the word idea; and we may observe that this meaning of that word is built upon a philosophical opinion: for, if philosophers had not believed that there are such immediate objects of all our thoughts in the mind, they would never have used the word idea to express them. (EIP 1.1, 31)
The Way of Ideas philosopher must talk the man on the street out of the belief that “When I perceive an apple in front of me, the apple is the very thing I'm perceiving.” The philosopher's response—that this is a mistake, that the object of perception is an idea of the apple—is predicated upon a rejection of the vulgar's conception of everyday thoughts about objects. But this rejection appears to rest in the opinion of philosophers rather than in the entailment of some as yet unstated but decisive argument. As a result, the rationale for commitments to an ontology of ideas and to their functional roles in the mind appears to Reid to be as dubious, if not more, than the man on the street's original commitment to a direct form of perception. If Reid is correct, then this shifts the burden of proof back upon the advocate of ideas.
Second, in a structurally similar argument, Reid observes something important about the intended explanatory power of the representational theory of perception. That theory is intended to explain the fact that our mental states manage to connect to real objects, manage to be about real objects. However, this fact about beliefs is only explained by the model if the model is less obscure than the phenomena to be explained by it. But, Reid observes, if we notice that we do not understand how it is that we manage to connect our minds to objects in the world, then it cannot help to say that we do this by first connecting our minds to mental representations unless we understand how it is that we manage to connect our minds to those mental representations. This consideration gives the following question its force: Why is the perception of a mental intermediary like an idea supposed to be more intelligible than the direct perception of a physical object? If it is no more intelligible, then the representational theory is not serving to explain what it was intended to explain. (See EIP 2.14, 185.)
In addition to burden of proof arguments against the Way of Ideas and the representational theory of perception, Reid also deploys a number of detailed arguments against specific components of these theories and against commitments they presuppose to be true. Though these arguments are unsuitable for recapitulation in the format of an encyclopedia entry, we report one such argument in brief in an effort to offer a hint at the robust detail, nuanced reasoning, and attention to physiological facts in Reid's theory of perception.
In one of a small handful of arguments that David Hume explicitly offers for a representational theory of perception, he concludes that “nothing can ever be present to the mind but an image or perception” (Enquiry 12.9; see Treatise 126.96.36.199, 187) by reasoning from considerations having to do with what is known as ‘perceptual relativity’. Hume writes, “The table, which we see, seems to diminish, as we remove farther from it: but the real table, which exists independent of us, suffers no alteration: it was, therefore, nothing but its image, which was present to the mind. These are the obvious dictates of reason” (Enquiry 12.9). This is perhaps the most compelling argument for the representational theory of perception.
Reid responds to this argument with several objections. First, Reid's analysis of each of the senses in Inquiry convince him that some senses do not represent physical objects in the same way that all the others do. Touch (IHM ch. 6), for example, presents qualities of objects to the mind in ways more direct than does vision (IHM ch. 7), resulting in what has been referred to as Reid's hybrid theory of perception. A conclusion generalized to all the senses (“nothing can ever be present...”) but based solely on one sense is therefore invalid.
The next of Reid's objections is more involved, requiring introduction of a key distinction Reid makes on the basis of his attention to the phenomenology of visual experience. First, though, notice Hume's use of the term ‘table’ and ‘the real table’ in the argument above. Following Berkeley's New Theory of Vision, Reid distinguishes between visible figure from tangible figure (IHM 6.2, 81–2), or later, which is virtually the same distinction, between ‘apparent magnitude’ and ‘real magnitude’ (EIP 2.14, 181). The tangible or real figure of an object is measured by yards or inches, but the visible figure is not. Instead, the visible figure depends for its geometric properties—the surface area that the table occupies in the visual field—upon properties of the tangible figure, including its shape and its distance from the eyes. Reid recognizes the obvious phenomenon of perceptual relativity, for example, that when I see a table at 10 yards and at 100, its “visible appearance, in its length, breadth, and all its linear proportions, is ten times less in the last case than it is in the first” (IHM 6.2, 81–2). The tangible figure is measured by different means, sensed by a different faculty, and is extended in three dimensions. This leads Reid to argue that “The ingenious author has imposed upon himself by confounding real magnitude with apparent magnitude,” that is, Hume equivocates (EIP 2.14, 182).
A pressing question arises at this juncture: Hasn't Reid now adopted a position according to which there are perceptual intermediaries in the visual perception process? If so, doesn't this imply that Reid's theory will share many of the foibles with which he charges the Way of Ideas? Most answers to these two questions have proven to be contentious in part because Reid's interpreters often bring to this issue prefabricated, a priori definitions of ‘intermediary’, ‘representation’ and ‘directness’. While Reid's theory of visual perception implies that visible figures are seen, visible figures are radically unlike ideas. Visible figure is not merely a representational intermediary; it is a relational property between physical objects and eyes of perceivers. Only because ideas lack these characteristics is Hume able to reason from the claim that mind-independent tables are not immediate objects of awareness to his stated conclusion above that we immediately perceive only ideas or representations. That is the first of two important points in response to the first question.
The second enters into Reid's development of a consistent geometry for visible space, perhaps the most technically brilliant piece of writing by any major British empiricist. This work allows Reid a crucial reply to advocates of representational theories. Reid discovered and mathematically described a law-like variation in the visible figure of an external object with intrinsic (shape, size) and extrinsic (distance, angle of orientation) properties of the tangible figure. Reid summarizes his conclusion writing:
[T]he real table may be placed successively at a thousand different distances, and, in every distance, in a thousand different positions; and it can be determined demonstratively by the rules of geometry and perspective, what must be its apparent magnitude and apparent figure, in each of those distances and positions.” (EIP 2.14, 183)
Hume assumes that the relationship between a visible figure and a tangible figure is subjective and mind-dependent. Not only is that erroneous, but, given Reid's work, the systematic variation of the visible figure with the tangible figure is in fact evidence for the objectivity of its independence from one's mind.
Reid further argues that this objective relationship between, for example, seeing the visible figure of a coin and conceiving of the coin becomes automated over time through repeated experience. Perhaps the first time I saw a coin it was presented to me at an angle, its visible figure an ellipse. I might mistakenly form a perceptual belief about an elliptical object, even though the coin is circular. Over time, this process is habituated through a process that Reid describes with the help of a distinction between original and acquired perceptions. In short, my faculty of visual perception, if given experience, will successfully model the geometrically demonstrable relationship between visible figure and tangible figure.
This family of arguments has received considerable attention due to a number of its complexities. These involve attempts to answer questions including the following: As we have seen, through his science of perspectival shapes of objects Reid argues that they are geometrically equivalent to shapes projected onto surfaces of spheres. What is Reid's formal proof for this, and is it valid (Yaffe 2002)? Does Reid offer the first recorded non-Euclidean geometry in the history of mathematics (Daniels 1972)? What is the bearing of Reid's repeated attempts to derive Euclid's parallel postulate from the axioms of incidence on an interpretation of the geometry of visible space as non-Euclidean (Grandi 2005)? Where does Reid's theory of perception and geometry of visibles leave the ontology of visible figure (Nichols 2007, ch. 4)? In what ways is visible figure the object of visual perception, and in what ways not (Yaffe 2003; Falkenstein and Grandi 2003)? Does Reid's geometry of visible space jeopardize his theory's ability to avoid a representational theory of visual perception (Van Cleve 2002)? Does visible figure and awareness of it preclude non-inferential perceptual knowledge from vision, or rather, what is the relationship between original and acquired perceptions and visible figure (Nichols 2007, ch. 8)?
Now that we know how and why Reid argues against the Way of Ideas' representational theory of perception, we needn't address these questions in order to continue with a discussion of the components of Reid's own more direct theory of perception. Here we need to keep in mind the fact that, though contemporary philosophers write a priori about perception, sensation, and knowledge, Reid does not offer necessary and sufficient conditions for perception or for its component processes. Consistent with his Newtonian empiricism, Reid is aiming for something else altogether: observations and accurate experiments that reduce to general rules (EIP 1.3, 49–50; EIP 2.8, 120–1). Though operations of our intellectual powers are not definable or analyzable a priori, it is possible to describe the operations Reid has in mind.
According to Reid, the perceptual process operates as follows. Individuals with functioning sensory organs and a developed brain interact with physical objects in the world. These objects cause sensory experiences in individuals. These sensations function as natural signs for qualities of the objects. The experience of a sensation orients my cognition so as to form a conception of a quality of a mind-independent object. Sometimes, though rarely, an individual's perception of an object will not only cause a sensation but will also cause the person to become aware of the sensation—perhaps even at the exclusion of any further awareness of primary qualities of the object. For example, when I get hit by a baseball thrown 90 mph I focus on my pain sensations, not the qualities of the ball. To perceive an object is to be aware of the object or its quality in a particular way, as the possessor of a particular quality, and, at the same time, to be convinced that the object exists and is as it is conceived it to be. To defend a common sensical theory of perception that is supported by observation and experiment, and that is capable of delivering knowledge of real objects, Reid thinks he needs to show that we are directly aware of real objects, in contrast to key features of the Way of Ideas' representational theory of perception just discussed. While there is debate over the precise sense in which, for Reid, we are directly aware of objects, this much seems clear: whatever the sense of “direct” is in which the subscribers to the representational theory take us to be directly aware of ideas, it is in that sense that Reid takes us to be directly aware of real objects.
In addition to being a Newtonian empiricist, Reid is an expert phenomenologist, acutely aware to finely grained features of our experience, especially our sensory experience. When we touch a table, while we conceive of it and often form beliefs about it, we also sense it. (See 2.1 Conceiving) The immediate effect that objects have on us is to cause sensations. Sensations are always associated with a particular organ of sense; they are always distinctly of, for instance, touch or vision. Sensations are the feelings that are the immediate mental causal consequences of the influence of objects on us. We become aware of the qualities of objects following the sensations that those objects cause. However, for Reid, the conceptions of objects that follow from our sensations are not derived from our sensations since they do not bear any kind of resemblance to the qualities which cause them. Awareness of sensations are not, for Reid, essential intermediaries for formation of perceptual beliefs. So what is the precise relationship between sensory experiences and conceptual content? This is a delicate question for Reid since the directness of his theory of perception depends upon advocacy of a physiologically and phenomenally real theory that accounts for our experience while avoiding theoretical pitfalls that risk dragging his theory much closer to a representational theory than Reid would like.
As we have often in this entry, we begin with historical context since Reid's theory of the relation between sensations and qualities will appear stranger than it is without background. According to the Way of Ideas, ideas and images are mental representations in an individual's mind, and my perceptual awareness of a table depends upon my prior awareness of these ideas of sensation. This veil of perception is why advocates of the Way of Ideas struggled to provide epistemic justification for beliefs about external, mind-independent, qualities of physical objects, and avoid skepticism. But besides the epistemic problem, advocates of ideas faced a difficulty accounting for the origins of the contents of our very ideas of external objects. Though not easy to appreciate, this problem it is quite important.
Reid argues that advocates of the Way of Ideas do not have a plausible solution to this problem. Hume says bluntly that “[E]very simple idea has a simple impression, which resembles it” (Treatise 188.8.131.52, 3), which is a statement of what is known as the Copy Principle: ideas have the content that they do because they are copies, and resemblances, of impressions. Think of a table. For Hume, your thought of a table is derivative and copied from a sensory impression that you have had of that very table. The explanation of the content of the idea of that table thus concerns the contents of your simple impression of the corresponding physical table. The Copy Principle is an exceedingly powerful tool on behalf of the Way of Ideas for a variety of reasons, but Reid is unimpressed with the evidence on its behalf, especially as presented by Hume in Treatise. Reid's response to Hume leads to an argument, which we can call his ‘Sensory Deprivation Argument’.
Reid's Sensory Deprivation Argument proceeds as follows. First, Hume's stated justification for the Copy Principle is inductive: he challenges people to find an idea that is not derived from a sensory impression, after he says that it appears all his ideas are copied from sensory impressions. But that, says Reid, is an exceedingly weak justification (EAP 1.4, 23). Besides, Hume's claim that the principle is “certain” is mistaken because the argument he sets out for the principle is inductive (IHM 5.7, 69–70, 75–6). After those ground clearing moves, Reid begins the argument proper with a thought experiment. Exhibiting affinities with Condillac's remarkable Treatise on Sensations (1754), Reid asks his readers to imagine a blind adult subject. Not only has he lost his sight, but he has “lost all the experience, and habits, and notions he had got by touch; [he lacks] the least conception of the existence, figure, dimensions, or extension, either of his own body, or of any other; but to have all his knowledge of external things to acquire anew, by means of sensation, and the power of reason, which we suppose to remain entire” (IHM 5.6, 65). Reid imagines introducing this blind experimental subject to a number of tactile sensations, one by one, from the most simple to the most involved: a single pin prick in a split second of time; a blunt object pushed against a small surface area of skin; the same object pushed against skin over a period of time “with a force gradually increased till it bruises him”; an object covering a large surface area of skin, applied over a period of time, and so on. Reid's emphasis on tactile sensations is important to understand: he uses this running example because ideas of primary qualities are the most important for gaining knowledge of the world and are the ideas essential for any science.
Once a handful of skin cells are stimulated for the briefest of moments by a pin, the subject has received a sensory impression—or in Reid's language, he has had a sensation—but, Reid argues, this does not equip the individual to formulate an idea of extension or figure, space or motion, all primary qualities of the pin. He writes, “[The primary qualities] have no resemblance to any sensation, or to any operation of our minds; and, therefore, they cannot be ideas either of sensation or of reflection” (IHM 5.6, 67). For each subsequent iteration of tactile sensations, Reid argues that those sensations too are incapable of delivering to the subject ideas of extension, figure, space or motion. His conclusion has two parts. First, the Way of Ideas's story about the relation between sensations and the intentional contents of conceptions is mistaken. Second, with an eye toward developing his own theory of sensations, he writes,
[T]his connection between our sensations and the conception and belief of external existences cannot be produced by habit, experience, education, or any principle of human nature that hath been admitted by philosophers. At the same time, it is a fact that such sensations are invariably connected with the conception and belief of external existences. Hence, by all rules of just reasoning, we must conclude, that this connection is the effect of our constitution, and ought to be considered as an original principle of human nature, till we find some more general principle into which it may be resolved. (IHM 5.3, 61/122b)
The process by which sensations give rise to our conceptions of objects is something Reid calls ‘suggestion’. Sensations in this process he calls ‘signs’. The qualities of objects are ‘suggested’ by our sensations when they function as signs, so when we have sensations we come to be aware of those objects as possessing those qualities. But what is suggestion supposed to be? The first thing to notice is that the suggestion relation or the ‘sign-signified’ relation is contingent. Whereas philosophers prefer necessities, Reid does not believe the messiness of the actual perceptual process contains any necessity at this juncture. Second, suggestion is a pseudo-linguistic notion for Reid. Signs suggest conceptions of that which they signify. The word “dogs”, for instance, leads those who are familiar with the word to think of certain domesticated animals who are also man's best friends.
But for those who already know the term, this does not happen by hearing the word “dogs” then deriving or inferring some object that has some peculiar fitness to the word. The relation of signs to things they signify in spoken and written language is almost always arbitrary in the sense that there is no similarity between dogs and the word “dogs”. In this sense, “dogs” is an artificial or artifactual sign, for Reid, in contrast to natural signs. Blushing signifies one of a small number of mental states because blushing is caused by events of embarrassment, anger, or romantic stimulation. Blood rushing through the subcutaneous circulatory system in the face reliably occurs, across members of our species, in response to a small set of stimuli with apparent universality, making blushing a natural sign. We discover this relationship by observation and experience.
However, according to Reid, a subset of natural signs lead us to think of what they signify without any prior experience. Members of this category “which, though we never before had any notion or conception of the things signified, do suggest it, or conjure it up, as it were, by a natural kind of magic, and at once give us a conception, and create a belief of it” (IHM 5.3, 60). Put your hand on a table, pause and experience the sensation of hardness. This tactile sensation leads us immediately to conceive of that which caused it as being hard, as having a certain resistive construction. But we are aware of the table's hardness, which caused the sensation, automatically. We do not understand why it is that we think of this special kind of physical constitution after having this kind of tactile sensation. Nonetheless, we must “conclude, that this connection is the effect of our constitution, and ought to be considered as an original principle of human nature” (IHM 5.3, 61). This is the defining feature of the kind of natural signs of which the tactile sensation of hardness is an instance: these signs lead us to conceive of what they signify simply because we are built in such a way as to have such conceptions on encountering such signs. Reid's approach to this relationship contrasts sharply with that taken by most advocates of the Way of Ideas, who attempted to posit a strong relationship between ideas of sensation and qualities of physical objects.
Placing my hand on a table, my tactile sensation immediately leads my mind to a conception or apprehension that I am touching a hard object. When does one's conception of an object as having a particular quality amount to a perception, a conception accompanied by a conviction of its accuracy? The answer is: when one comes to have that conception because one has encountered a natural sign which leads one to the conception, and that natural sign leads one to the conception merely because of one's constitution. Conviction in the accuracy of a conception is bestowed on the conception, Reid thinks, just when the relevant conception comes about because of our nature or constitution. When we conceive of an object in a particular way merely because it is in our nature to conceive of the object that way, then the conception is non-optional, unavoidable, and is thus one that we cannot help but trust. Perceptions, then, are dictates of common sense: to be aware of an object in perception is to have a belief which you cannot give up given your constitution.
Reid believes that our minds come to be connected to the mind-independent world in something like the way that we come to grasp objects through a language designed for the purpose. However, when we come to be aware of objects through our senses, we do so by utilizing something like a language embedded in our constitutions: our sensations function like a language that nature has constructed. While it is in a sense only a metaphor to say that we know about the world because the world speaks to us, it is a metaphor that illuminates the facts as Reid sees them.
Intertwined with Reid's arguments that we can be immediately aware of objects through their relational properties—such as their apparent magnitudes—are Reid's arguments regarding the distinction between primary and secondary qualities. As we would expect, Reid approaches this distinction as a scientist of the mind rather than as a metaphysician, and, as we would also expect, Reid's entrance into this terrain is paved with references to earlier thinkers.
Locke thought that our ideas of “primary qualities”—shapes, sizes, motions, textures and physical construction—resemble the qualities which cause them. However, according to Locke, our ideas of a variety of other qualities—colors, sounds, tastes and smells—do not. Ideas of colors, sounds, tastes and smells, or “secondary qualities,” are caused by certain complex configurations of primary qualities that bear no resemblance to the ideas which they cause. Reid is deeply struck by Berkeley's attack on this distinction at Principles of Human Knowledge 1.9–15. He agrees with Berkeley that no mental state or object could possibly resemble anything that is not, itself, a mental state or object. In Berkeley's famous words, “An idea can be like nothing but an idea” (Principles of Human Knowledge 1.8). Mental states and objects have only mental properties, but only something that is, itself, a mental state or object can have a mental property. Hence, nothing can resemble—that is, share a property in common with—a mental state or object other than another mental state or object. Berkeley took this point to show that no non-mental cause of an idea could resemble it, whether the relevant idea were an idea of a shape or a color. Berkeley concludes that Locke's distinction between primary and secondary qualities is a grand mistake.
Reid accepts, for roughly Berkeley's reasons, that sensations cannot possibly resemble their causes—a fact that Reid deploys in his Sensory Deprivation Argument discussed above. Further, he accepts Berkeley's objections to Locke, and takes them to show that no mental events or states, whether sensations or the conceptions of objects that follow them, could possibly resemble any non-mental object. Another reason that Reid cannot draw the distinction between primary and secondary qualities in the way that Locke did is that he denies that conceptions of objects which we have following sensory experiences are to be analyzed as perceptions of ideas. Instead, these conceptions function to make us aware of qualities in objects that caused the sensations. All of this would make it seem that Reid would simply side with Berkeley and deny that there is any important difference between primary qualities and qualities like colors, sounds, tastes and smells. Instead, Reid defends the distinction between primary and secondary qualities on grounds quite different from Locke's, grounds that he takes to be immune to Berkeley's criticisms of the distinction.
Reid accepts that the qualities which we ordinarily conceive objects to have—whether shapes, sizes and motions, on the one hand, or colors, sounds, tastes and smells, on the other—are genuinely possessed by those objects (barring illusions and disorders of various sorts, which are, incidentally, difficult for any direct theory of perception like Reid's to explain). He thinks that shapes, sizes and motions are intrinsic properties of objects while colors, sounds, tastes and smells are relational properties of objects. But neither secondary nor primary qualities resemble the sensory experiences that they immediately cause in us. Colors, sounds, tastes and smells are powers to produce certain characteristic sensations in us in normal conditions. To believe that a rose has an agreeable smell or a red color is not to perceive any intrinsic qualities of the object, but is, rather, to perceive that the object bears a certain relation to something else—our minds. Reid writes,
The object of my perception, in this case, is that quality in the rose which I discern by the sense of smell. Observing that the agreeable sensation is raised when the rose is near, and ceases when it is removed, I am led, by my nature, to conclude some quality to be in the rose, which is the cause of this sensation. This quality in the rose is the object perceived; and that act of my mind by which I have the conviction and belief of this quality, is what in this case I call perception. (EIP 2.16, 194)
Physical structures of the rose in front of me—the anther in the rose's stamen—produce pollen, which has a certain molecular composition that results in my sensation of its odor. Other molecules in the petals of the rose reflect light at a certain wavelength which in turn causes in me a certain characteristic visual sensation of red. If I am speaking correctly when I say “That rose smells good”, I am reporting the fact that I conceive of the rose as possessing a particular relational property: I am aware that the rose has the property of being-such-as-to-cause-in-me-sensations-of-a-sweet-smelling-odor. Ultimately, the rose possesses this relational property because of facts about its molecular structure that account for its producing this odor in a certain way, and facts about me that account for the fact that these pollen molecules enter my nasal cavity, eventually reaching the olfactory bulb, and cause certain sensations in my mind. But when I am aware of the odor of the rose, I am aware of none of that; I am aware only of the fact that there is something about the rose that makes it cause in me certain sensations in normal conditions.
Our conceptions of qualities such as smells and colors are to be contrasted with our conceptions of primary qualities or configurations of primary qualities, such as hardness. Say I'm holding the rose's stem in my hand while I'm looking at it. I am having two importantly different sensations: a visual sensation of red, and a tactile sensation of hardness. For Reid, neither sensation resembles anything in the object; both give rise to conceptions of the object as possessing certain properties. The visual sensation gives rise to a conception of the object as possessing a particular relational property: its power to produce certain sensations in me in normal conditions. The tactile sensation gives rise to a conception of the rose's stem as possessing a particular intrinsic property: the complex configuration of primary qualities that is hardness.
For both Locke and Reid, we are aware of objects as they are intrinsically only when our awareness is caused by the primary qualities of objects. But for Reid, and not for Locke, we are genuinely aware of objects as they are when our awareness results from the secondary qualities of objects; but we are aware of those objects only as they are relative to us, and not as they are in themselves.
“When a primary quality is perceived, the sensation immediately leads our thought to the quality signified by it, and is itself forgot.” (EIP 2.17, 204)
“[T]here appears to be a real foundation for the distinction; and it is this—that our senses give us a direct and a distinct notion of the primary qualities, and inform us what they are in themselves. But of the secondary qualities, our senses give us only a relative and obscure notion. They inform us only, that they are qualities that affect us in a certain manner—that is, produce in us a certain sensation; but as to what they are in themselves, our senses leave us in the dark.” (EIP 2.17, 201)
“[T]he sensations belonging to secondary qualities are an object of our attention, while those which belong to the primary are not.” (EIP 2.17, 204)
Secondary and primary qualities are characterized by their relations to the mind perceiving them and to the physical qualities in objects that they signify. Primary qualities stand out as qualities of which we have “direct” and “distinct” notions. This is not so for secondary qualities. To return to Reid's rose, he writes of the smell of the rose that
I have a distinct notion of the sensation which it produces in my mind. ... The quality in the rose is something which occasions the sensation in me; but what that something is, I know not. My senses give me no information upon this point. The only notion, therefore, my senses give is this—that smell in the rose is an unknown quality or modification, which is the cause or occasion of a sensation which I know well. The relation which this unknown quality bears to the sensation with which nature hath connected it, is all I learn from the sense of smelling; but this is evidently a relative notion. The same reasoning will apply to every secondary quality. (EIP 2.17, 202/314b)
Reid does defend a primary/secondary quality distinction, but, unusually, Reid's distinction is drawn not in metaphysical terms but in epistemic terms premised upon discussion of the differing ways that secondary and primary qualities relate to our minds (Nichols 2007, ch. 6).
An important note at this juncture is that Reid very infrequently uses contemporary epistemological terms such as “knowledge”, “rational”, or “justified”, and even when he does, he does not offer necessary and sufficient conditions for their definition. Reid says above that sensations caused by primary qualities “inform us” of the qualities in the objects that caused them. One ought not look to Reid's epistemology for a detailed formal apparatus clearly identifying his externalism about justification, for example, even though he can be credited with bringing what we now call externalism about justification into Early Modern philosophy.
We are now in a position to understand the force of Reid's most important response to any argument purporting to show that the external world either might not exist, or might not be anything like the way we take it to be. In one canonical statement of his position, Reid says,
The sceptic asks me, Why do you believe the existence of the external object which you perceive? This belief, sir, is none of my manufacture; it came from the mint of Nature; it bears her image and superscription; and, if it is not right, the fault is not mine: I even took it upon trust, and without suspicion. Reason, says the sceptic, is the only judge of truth, and you ought to throw off every opinion and every belief that is not grounded on reason. Why, sir, should I believe the faculty of reason more than that of perception?—they came both out of the same shop, and were made by the same artist; and if he puts one piece of false ware into my hands, what should hinder him from putting another? (IHM 6.20, 168–169)
The mistake that the skeptic makes, according to Reid, is to deny the truth of something that is demanded by our constitutions. To perceive an object as possessing a particular property is to have a conception of the object delivered by one's constitution. What makes us convinced of the accuracy of the conceptions of objects involved in perception is that they arise from our constitutions. But, asks Reid here, why do we find skeptical arguments so compelling? Why would someone sincerely accept the radical skeptical conclusions following from Descartes's hypothesis of the evil demon?
Ultimately, we think that such arguments lead to their conclusions because we accept certain logical principles—such as the law of non-contradiction, or modus ponens—which appear to us to be self-evident. But to say that such principles are self-evident is just to say that we cannot help but accept them. It is not to offer any non-circular justification of those principles. But the irresistibility of a belief is a very good indicator, Reid thinks, that we hold that belief merely because of the way we are built, merely because of our constitution. But then the skeptic has merely placed the skeptical conclusion on the same footing as the common sense belief about the external world: both rest on something that we are compelled to believe by our constitutions. However, in order to overthrow common sense, the skeptic must place the skeptical conclusion, rather, on a firmer footing than the common sense conclusion. Thus, the skeptic gives us no reason to reject common sense beliefs about the external world. Reid has defended common sense through construction of a direct theory of perception that avoids the pitfalls of the Way of Ideas' representational theory. Rather than landing in the “coal pit” of skepticism, as Reid calls it, his theory purports to deliver knowledge of the external world.
Reid develops his account of causation in light of Hume's account. As Reid sees it, Hume starts with the assumption that if we are to learn what causation is, we must first determine from what aspect of our sensory experience the concept of causation is derived. Hume would put the point in terms of the Way of Ideas as follows: we must determine from what impression our idea of causation is copied. However, Hume believed he had discovered that there is nothing in our sensory experience corresponding to our ordinary notion of the causal relation. In an inversion of the empiricist method attributed to Reid above, Hume believed that causes necessitate their effects, then he followed this commitment by arguing that we lack sensory awareness of this necessitation. We see the first billiard ball hit the second. We see the second move. We do not see the movement of the first assure, or necessitate, the movement of the second. So Hume concludes that causation must be something different from what we take it to be ordinarily.
But what is it? To answer this question, we must determine from what sensory experiences we derive the idea of causation. It turns out, as Reid reads Hume, that the sensory experiences that give rise to our idea of causation are sensory experiences of what Hume calls constant conjunction. The heating of the water is regularly followed by the water's boiling. To say that the one event causes the other is just to say that the two events always co-occur, or that there is a brute law linking them. This is not to say that the first event necessitates the second. The necessitation that we ordinarily take to be involved in causation is not in the world; it is in our heads as an expectation arising due to previous experience.
Reid accepts much of the negative side of Hume's view of causation while rejecting Hume's assertions of the import of those negative discoveries. Reid agrees, that is, that we have no sensory experience of the necessitation of an effect by its cause. But this does not imply our ordinary concept of causation is mistaken. Instead, Reid thinks, the concept of causation is not an idea copied from a sensory impression in the first place. Reid's complex thoughts here are tied to perception and the role of sensations in perception. (See 3.2 Reid's Arguments Against Representationalism, above.) For him, sensations never bear resemblance to the qualities they help us to perceive. It is hardly a surprise, then, that the sensory experiences from which our thoughts about causation spring bear no resemblance to the causal relation. But this fact no more undermines our concept of causation than the lack of resemblance between our sensory experiences of ordinary physical objects and those objects themselves undermines our thoughts about such objects. Like our thoughts about objects, our thoughts about the causal relation are genuinely about the causal relation, despite the fact that the sensations from which those thoughts spring, i.e.the sensations of the relation of constant conjunction, bear no resemblance to the relation they lead us to think about. We have no sensations resembling necessitation, and, yet, causes necessitate their effects.
However, Reid also offers criticisms of Hume's view of causation that can be accepted independently of the Reidian view of perception and sensation. Two of his most influential criticisms are of Hume's view that our ordinary concept of causation is reducible to the relation of constant conjunction.
Of the first he writes, “[I]t would follow from [Hume's definition of causation], that whatever was singular in its nature, or the first thing of its kind, could have no cause” (EAP 4.9, 250). Reid's point is that if the relation of causation is really that of constant conjunction, then the first time that two types of event are conjoined, the first cannot be the cause of the second. If there is no history of conjunction, there is no causation. It would seem to follow from Hume's definition, for instance, that if an earthquake razes Mexico City, and no earthquake has ever done so before, then the earthquake is not, in fact, the cause of the city's fall, an absurd implication. This objection might not show Hume's theory is mistaken—we omit consideration of it further here—but it does pose a question with which any Humean must wrestle: Which constant conjunctions are the genuine ones on the basis of which the causal relation can be said to hold, and which are not? The more specifically any two events are described, the more likely that there will be no history of conjunction of the relevant sorts of events. But what degree of specificity or generality in description is the right degree?
The problem is made clearer by Reid's second objection to Hume's analysis of causation and constant conjunction. He writes, “It follows from [Hume's] definition of a cause, that night is the cause of day, and day the cause of night. For no two things have more constantly followed each other since the beginning of the world” (EAP 4.9, 249). Since we don't ordinarily think that day is the cause of night, or vice versa, Hume must deny that the two are actually constantly conjoined, or, rather, he must insist that the constant conjunction between the two of them is not of the right sort for the relation between them to be one of causation. Hume thinks that there is causation between two events just in case there is a law linking them and also thinks that there is a law linking two events just in case they are constantly conjoined. Reid's first objection shows that it is not the case that wherever there is no constant conjunction there is no law. His second objection shows that it is not the case that wherever there is constant conjunction there is a law. Constant conjunction is neither necessary nor sufficient for the presence of a genuine law. The hard problem that remains for the Humean, then, is to produce criteria for distinguishing genuine laws from regularities that are not laws at all.
These criticisms lead Reid to hold that there is a legitimate causal relation between two events whenever the two are conjoined by a law of nature, even if laws of nature do not simply amount to constant conjunctions. He uses the term physical causation to refer to the relation that holds between two events just in case they are conjoined by natural law. He takes the discovery of the physical causes of phenomena to be central both to the sciences and to ordinary life (see IHM 6.12, 122; EAP 1.5, 28–9; EAP 4.3, 211–2). But he also holds that genuine causation, what he calls efficient causation, is not reducible to physical causation. The reason is that, for him, a law of nature is not a brute conjunction between events. Rather, it is a regularity in the behavior of the efficient cause of observed phenomena. Consistent with remarks above (see 1.2 Newtonianism and Empiricism), Reid writes,
[S]upposing that all the phenomena that fall within the reach of our senses, were accounted for from the general laws of nature, justly deduced from experience; that is, supposing natural philosophy brought to its utmost perfection, it does not discover the efficient cause of any one phenomenon in nature. The laws of nature are the rules according to which the effects are produced; but there must be a cause which operates according to these rules. The rules of navigation never navigated a ship. The rules of architecture never built a house. (EAP 1.6, 38)
It is a law that unsupported objects close to the earth will fall. What this means, Reid thinks, is that the physical cause of the fall of an object regularly causes objects to fall when they are unsupported. Physical causation, for him, is parasitic upon the more basic kind of causation, namely efficient causation. But what is efficient causation? Reid writes, “In the strict and proper sense, I take an efficient cause to be a being who had power to produce the effect, and exerted that power for that purpose” (Letter to James Gregory, in Correspondence 174). Efficient causation is necessitation of the sort that Hume thought not to exist. To efficiently cause an event is to be capable of seeing to it that the event occurs, and to make an effort to see to it that it does. Thus, at the bottom of Reid's theory of causation are his notions of power and exertion.
Reid is clear that power is not the sort of thing that admits of a logical definition. We cannot reduce it to some set of simpler qualities. However, this doesn't mean that we can't say anything about what power is. On the contrary, Reid makes a variety of claims about power. Importantly, he claims that power is the quality that, when coupled with exertion, necessitates a particular effect. Taking a cue from ordinary language, he holds that it is a contradiction to say that an entity has the power to do something, and exerts that power, and yet the effect fails to come about. If the effect fails to come about when the entity exerts itself, we might say, what that shows is that the entity only seemed, but didn't actually, have the power to bring about the effect. Reid also claims that any agent who has the power to do something also has three other inter-related powers: the power not to do the thing, the power to try to do that thing (that is, the power to exert his power to do the thing), and the power not to try to do that thing. He claims further that any agent who has the power to do something must believe himself to have that power.
Any one of these claims can be questioned, even if Reid is right that they are embedded in our ordinary concept of power. Take, for instance, the claim that an agent who has the power to do something also has the power not to do it. Locke offers the following example, which seems to be a counterexample to this claim:
[S]uppose a Man be carried, whilst fast asleep, into a Room, where is a Person he longs to see and speak with; and be there locked fast in, beyond his Power to get out: he awakes, and is glad to find himself in so desirable Company, which he stays willingly in, i.e. prefers his stay to going away. I ask, Is not this stay voluntary? I think, no Body will doubt it: and yet being locked fast in, 'tis evident he is not at liberty not to stay, he has not freedom to be gone. (John Locke, Essay Concerning Human Understanding, 2.21.10)
The man in Locke's example seems to have the power to stay in the room, while lacking the power not to stay. Reid would probably deny that Locke's prisoner actually has the power to stay in the room, and there is some intuitive force to this view. The man, it seems, is in the hands of forces outside of his control. For Reid, what is in a person's power and what is ‘up to’ him or her are the same. Since it is not up to the man whether he stays (even if he thinks it is), it is not in his power to stay.
Reid endorses the idea that what is in our power is just what is up to us. He claims that the only entities that can have power are entities with minds. That is, sticks and stones are never invested with power, and are not, therefore, ever the efficient causes of any events. The earthquake might be the physical cause of the fall of the city, but it is not the efficient cause, Reid thinks, because it does not have a mind. Since it is not up to the earthquake whether or not the city falls, the earthquake lacks the power to raze the city. Reid offers various reasons for thinking that wherever there is power there is a mind. One of the most compelling is expressed in the following passage:
[I]f we had not will, and that degree of understanding which will necessarily implies, we could exert no active power, and consequently could have none: for power that cannot be exerted is no power. It follows also, that the active power, of which only we can have any distinct conception, can be only in beings that have understanding and will. (EAP 1.5, 29)
Reid's idea is that the only conception we can have of the exertion of power is of that distinctive sort of mental effort in which we engage when we will to do something. Since he holds that the power to act is always accompanied with the power to exert that power, it follows that the only entities that can have power are those who are capable of engaging in the peculiar sort of mental effort with which we are all familiar from our own case. But then it follows that the only entities that can have power are those with minds. When coupled with the claim, that Reid also makes, that every event is efficiently caused, it follows that every event in nature is directed towards an end; everything that happens is chosen to occur. In fact, Reid holds that all and only our free actions are those events of which we are the efficient causes. An agent who has the power to bring about a particular action is said, by Reid, to have ‘moral liberty’.
There is a puzzle that one encounters when trying to make sense of Reid's notion of power and which sheds some light on Reid's concept of moral liberty. The puzzle is this: Say that I have the power to do a cartwheel. According to Reid it follows that if I exert my power and thereby do a cartwheel, then I will be the efficient cause of my cartwheel. Imagine that I do this and imagine that every event is efficiently caused. Is my exertion of my power to do the cartwheel an event? If so, then it must have an efficient cause. Am I the efficient cause of the exertion? If not, then it doesn't seem that my cartwheel is a free action. After all, if I'm not the efficient cause of the exertion, then it wasn't up to me whether or not I tried to do the cartwheel, and it seems to follow that it wasn't up to me whether or not I did it. So, Reid seems forced to say that I am the efficient cause of the exertion to do the cartwheel. But then it follows from the definition of efficient causation that I exerted my power to exert myself to do the cartwheel. And, therefore, we can ask if I am the efficient cause of my exertion to exert myself to do the cartwheel. If not, then I didn't do the cartwheel freely; if so, then we will find ourselves having to ask about the efficient cause of the exertion to exert my power to exert. In short, Reid's views of power, efficient causation and moral liberty appear to be inconsistent with one another.
The way out of the puzzle is to see that the relation between an agent and the event he or she efficiently causes is not the same as the relation between the agent and her exertion of power. Trying, on this view, is not something that an agent does in order to do something else; it is not a separate action on the way to performing another act. If I am going to build a birdhouse, I first have to buy nails. Buying nails is a distinct act from building the birdhouse that must be done on the way to building the birdhouse. But trying to buy the nails is not distinct from buying them in the way that buying them is distinct from building the birdhouse. If I manage to buy the nails, I haven't done two things, buy them and try to, but only one. But if I manage to build the birdhouse, then I did do two things: buy the nails, and build the birdhouse. So, there is something wrongheaded about even asking whether the agent is the efficient cause of the exertion of power. The agent is the efficient cause of the act, and there is no separate act, the exertion, of which he or she needs to be the efficient cause in order to have acted freely.
It is on the basis of this, or some other closely related line of thought, that Reid is often described as having an ‘agent causal’ theory of freedom. Agent-causation is the kind of causation that occurs when an object or agent, rather than an event, causes a change. Many people believe that there is no agent-causation. They hold that there are only causal relations between events, and every case of apparent agent-causation is merely apparent; every such case is actually a veiled case of event-causation. Philosophers who hold that free human actions require that certain events be agent-caused, and also believe that some human actions are free, hold that there are some events that are caused by agents but not by any events; they hold that there is a basic causal relation between agents and events that is instantiated every time a person acts freely. Given that, for Reid, the relation between an agent and the action of which the agent is the efficient cause must be a basic causal relation—it does not consist, not even in part, in some further distinct relation between the agent and the exertion of power—it follows that Reid holds an agent-causal view of free action.
Why should we believe that human beings have moral liberty, i.e. why should we think that we are endowed with power to produce our actions? We have reason to think that we are not the efficient causes of our own behavior. Our actions seem to come about according to psychological laws linking them to prior motives for action. Jealous, generous, prideful and benevolent motives lead in apparently law-like ways to various characteristic behaviors. If it is a fact that our conduct comes about according to laws, then it seems that the author of the laws, if there is one, is the real author of our actions.
Reid denies that there are laws linking motives with behavior, or in his terms he denies that motives are the physical causes of action. He offers a variety of fascinating arguments for this claim. The most important of these arguments is summarized quite clearly in Reid's correspondence, and presented at greater length in Essays on the Active Powers 4.4. In the correspondence he writes:
It is a question of fact, whether the influence of motives be fixed by laws of nature, so that they shall always have the same effect in the same circumstances. Upon this, indeed, the question about liberty and necessity hangs. But I have never seen any proof that there are such laws of nature, far less any proof that the strongest motive always prevails. However much our late fatalists have boasted of this principle as of a law of nature, without ever telling us what they mean by the strongest motive, I am persuaded that, whenever they shall be pleased to give us any measure of the strength of motives distinct from their prevalence, it will appear, from experience, that the strongest motive does not always prevail. If no other test or measure of the strength of motives can be found but their prevailing, then this boasted principle will be only an identical proposition, and signify only that the strongest motive is the strongest motive, and the motive that prevails is the motive that prevails—which proves nothing. (Letter to James Gregory, in Correspondence 176)
Reid assumes that anybody who holds that there is a law linking motives and behaviors will thereby accept the claim that human beings always act on the strongest of their motives. However, Reid claims that there are various ways in which the notion of the strongest motive can be defined—there are various measures of strength of motive—and depending which definition is employed we find that it is either false or trivial and uninformative to say that people always act on the strongest motive.
Reid identifies three particularly important senses in which the strength of a motive can be measured: by, to use his terms, its ‘prevalence’, its ‘animal strength’, or its ‘rational strength’. According to the view that associates strength with prevalence, the strongest motive is just the motive on which the agent acts. Under this view, there is no way of assessing the strength of motives prior to seeing what the agent does. The animal strength of a motive is the degree to which it is felt, the degree to which the agent might be said to have an urge for its object. The rational strength of a motive is the degree to which the act it dictates is judged to be worthwhile by the agent.
As Reid puts the point in the above quotation, the claim that people always act on their strongest motive when strength is associated with prevalence is ‘an identical proposition.’ It is true but trivial, and it fails to show that people are not the efficient causes of their own behavior. After all, under the view of strength as prevalence, the term ‘strongest motive’ can be replaced with the term ‘the motive on which the agent acts’ and thus ‘People always act on their strongest motive’ becomes ‘People always act on the motive on which they act’. True, but hardly the sort of truth from which anything interesting follows.
On the other hand, under either the view that the strongest motive is the strongest animal motive, or the view that the strongest motive is the strongest rational motive, it is false that people always act on the strongest motive, thinks Reid. People sometimes do what they judge to be right, even though they have a much stronger urge to do something else. And people sometimes give in to their urges, contrary to their better judgment. Both of these claims can be questioned. We might say, for instance, that people who act as dictated by their judgment actually have an urge to do so, an urge that counterbalances their urge to do otherwise. And, we might say that people who act on their urges, and counter to their best judgment, don't actually judge the alternative to be better, but do so only in some watered-down sense. Notice, however, that anyone who objects to Reid on either of these two grounds seems to already accept that people always act on the strongest of their motives in one sense or another. It is that prior acceptance that motivates the objection. Reid, by contrast, takes the facts that we sometimes act as dictated by our urges, sometimes as dictated by our judgments, to be a prior fact that any theory must account for, rather than a consequence of a theory of motivation. Hence, he takes any theory that does not allow for these consequences to be flawed, and takes himself to have shown that there is no satisfactory sense in which people always act on the strongest of their motives.
Reid's argument does not decisively settle the question of whether or not human conduct comes about in accordance with laws linking it to prior motives. Rather, what he has shown is that we cannot accept the claim that human conduct is law governed through simple reflection from the armchair. We do need to do careful conceptual work in order to provide a non-trivial definition of strength that is different from either the animal or rational definitions; but we also need to do careful empirical work in behavioral psychology in order to determine if people do, indeed, always act on the strongest of motives in the sense of strength that we develop. His argument, then, makes a contribution to the question of whether or not people are the efficient causes of their own behavior by posing a further, and difficult problem for those, like Hume, who deny it on the grounds that our behavior is law-governed.
Reid does not rest content to defend the claim that human beings are the efficient causes of their own behavior by responding to the best objections to it; he also provides three positive arguments for the claim which he labels the ‘first’, ‘second’ and ‘third argument for moral liberty’. (The arguments appear in Essays on the Active Powers 4.6–8.)
The first argument for moral liberty parallels Reid's response to external world skepticism (see 3.5 Responding to Skepticism about the External World, above). Reid claims that the belief that we are endowed with power to produce our own actions is a first principle and then employs his general form of defense of first principles in order to argue that it must be so. We naturally and non-inferentially believe ourselves to be endowed with power since various activities in which we engage would make no sense if we did not believe ourselves to be endowed with power. For instance, he claims that the activity of deliberating, of weighing reasons for and against various possible actions, proceeds under the assumption that we have power; if we didn't believe that, he thinks, then we would not bother deliberating.
What gives Reid's claim appeal is the fact that when we deliberate we think that what we are deliberating about is up to us, and for Reid, what is up to us is identical to what is in our power. However, it's not clear that we have to think of actions as being in our power in order to be motivated to deliberate; the thought that our actions are ‘up to us’, a thought which is undeniably involved in deliberation, might be understood in some way which does not presuppose power. For instance, in thinking that what we do is ‘up to us’, we might just be thinking that if we're sufficiently motivated to do it, we will. By way of example, note that it's generally true that people who deliberate before they act do things that are more in their interests than those who simply act impulsively, without deliberation. Hence, if you are motivated to avoid impulsive action, that motive might lead you to deliberate, and your deliberation might, in turn, lead you to do something better than you would have done had you not deliberated. It is not clear that a person who was motivated to deliberate for this reason would be presuming himself or herself to be endowed with power in Reid's sense. Such a person might think merely that deliberation will produce motives that happen to give rise, for reasons entirely out of the agent's control, to better actions. In short, if we think of deliberation as motivated action, and if we can imagine a person being motivated to engage in it even in the absence of the belief that he or she is endowed with power, then Reid is wrong.
Still, it is quite possible that Reid is right. The question turns on whether or not it is possible to provide an adequate picture of the psychology of deliberation without appeal to the belief that we are endowed with power. What the first argument from moral liberty serves to do is not to silence the opposition, but instead to force the opposition not to oversimplify the phenomena. Those who deny that human beings are endowed with power in Reid's sense need to explain what we are thinking when we deliberate. That explanation must not gloss over the complexity of ordinary deliberation, but also must not show us to be thinking ourselves to be endowed with power in Reid's sense whenever we deliberate about what to do (see Yaffe 2004, ch. 1).
In the second argument for moral liberty, Reid claims that none of our moral practices—our practices of holding ourselves and others accountable for their behavior—would make any sense if we did not believe ourselves and others to be endowed with power over conduct. He claims, in short, that the very concept of a morally accountable being presupposes that that being has power over his conduct. Since we are, he thinks, morally accountable beings, it follows that we are endowed with power over our conduct.
The first argument for moral liberty depends upon the inadequacy of any account of deliberation that leaves out the belief that our conduct is in our power. So the second depends upon the inadequacy of any account of what makes a person morally accountable that does not include the power to control action. Someone who wished to deny that human beings have power over their conduct, but are still morally accountable, might note, for instance, that one of the primary purposes of certain forms of punishment, most notably imprisonment, is to prevent the offender from acting similarly in the future. However, such a purpose does not presuppose that the person has power over his or her conduct. If the thief is going to steal again, then that's reason enough to imprison him, we might say. This is so even if he is going to steal only because his desires will inevitably give rise to such behavior and not because he has power that he is resolved to exercise objectionably in the future. Reid's second argument for moral liberty fails if purposes of this sort exhaust the purposes of punishment. The second argument turns, that is, on a retributivist conception of punishment—a conception according to which a punishment is appropriate only if it is deserved—and a further claim to the effect that a punishment is never deserved in the retributivist's sense if the crime was not efficiently caused by the agent to whom the punishment is issued. It remains an open question whether or not a retributivist conception of punishment could be coherently married to a view that denies that human beings are endowed with power. Reid's second argument for moral liberty raises this question in a powerful form.
In the third argument for moral liberty, which is the most obscure of the three, Reid claims that a person could not engage in planned conduct if not endowed with power. Since it's obvious, he thinks, that we do engage in planned conduct, it follows that we must have power over our actions. Reid links the third argument for moral liberty with the argument from design for God's existence. According to the argument from design, God must exist since the world is so complex, and yet so orderly, that there must have been an all-powerful, all-knowing being who designed it and made it according to plan. Similarly, Reid argues, planned conduct is at once so complicated and so orderly that there must have been some author of it. He then claims that since it is obvious that we think up our own plans, we must also execute them. So, he thinks, we must be endowed with power (see Hatcher 2013).
There is room to object not just to the third argument, but also to the argument from design, by noting that ordered complexity can arise through mechanisms other than a guiding hand. Most of us think, for instance, that the mechanisms of natural selection result in the production of enormously complicated and yet ordered biological structures, like the human eye. If natural selection is causally responsible for the human eye, then there is no designer of these structures who efficiently caused them. We don't need power, in Reid's sense, in order to execute our plans; we just need to be the sorts of creatures whose minds are hooked up to their bodies in such a way that they do what they plan. It could be, that is, that by forming plans we engage powers that are not our own by engaging laws linking plans with execution, laws of which we are not the authors.
This is a powerful objection, but it is not the end of the debate. Notice that someone who rejects the argument from design is likely to think both that there is no efficient cause of the complex order which we encounter in nature, and that nobody planned the order that we find. But there is no doubt that when a person, say, builds a house that there was somebody who formed the plan to build the house. The question is whether or not that person must have had the power to build it in order to bring the plan to fruition. Reid's point is that our attribution of the wisdom to form the plan goes hand-in-hand with the attribution of the power to execute it. We might think that nobody was either wise enough or powerful enough to create the world; but if we do think someone was wise enough, then we must also think that person powerful enough. In the case of planned conduct, we know that there is a person wise enough—namely the person whose plan it was—so surely we must also think that person powerful enough. As he puts the point:
Every indication of wisdom, taken from the effect, is equally an indication of power to execute what wisdom planned. And, if we have any evidence that the wisdom which formed the plan is in the man, we have the very same evidence, that the power which executed it is in him also. (EAP 4.8, 241)
Even this point—that where there's wisdom there's power—can be questioned, but there is surely something right about it. Traits of character, of which wisdom is an example, are both cognitive and volitional: we think of a person who has one as both capable of understanding things, and of doing them. To be wise isn't just to know how to do something, but also to be able to do it. So, when we ascribe someone with the intelligence to think up a complex plan, and on those grounds take the person to be wise, we are also taking the person to have the power to execute the plan. This is the idea that drives Reid's third argument for moral liberty.
None of Reid's arguments for moral liberty are decisive. Each, however, lays bare a manner in which the notion of power is naturally construed to be implicated in our ordinary beliefs and our ordinary practices. While it remains possible that what is implicated is actually something less, something that can be described and explained without appeal to Reid's very strong notion of power, Reid's arguments nonetheless make clear what an account of human agency that does without power would need to account for if it is to be satisfactory. (For Reid on causation and free will, see Yaffe 2004.)
Reid constructs a theory of personal identity in opposition to Locke's account, which appeals to psychological continuity as a necessary condition for sameness of person over time. Reid argues that Locke has misunderstood the relationship between consciousness and memory. Reid develops a direct theory of memory according to which the objects of memory are events in the past, not mental representations. Reid attempts to provide sufficient continuity of the self through time to ground sameness of person without lapsing into Humean skepticism about the self.
Consistent with Reid's faculty psychology, memory is a faculty of its own and it takes a unique set of objects. Just as the faculty of perception takes as its objects mind-independent bodies, the faculty of memory takes as its objects events in the past. Reid develops this into a direct theory of memory akin to his direct theory of perception, and in contrast to the Ideal Theory and account of memory (Copenhaver 2006).
The objects of memory are events in the past. Just like perceptions, memories are accompanied by their own phenomenology and sensory experience. When one remembers hitting a game-winning serve in a volleyball match, one may experience memory-images of the court and feelings of triumph. However, the imagery and emotion accompanying the memory are not identical to the memory. To suggest that they are identical to the memory is to confuse the psychological means by which the memory occurs with the content of the memory belief. In Reid's day the theory of memory endorsed by proponents of the Theory of Ideas made a similar confusion, in his opinion, by claiming that memories are mental events in which a past idea is compared to a present idea. According to Reid, these philosophers confused the act of remembering with the thing remembered (see EIP 3.1).
The direct theory distinguishes personal memory from factual memory (Hamilton 2003). “I remember hitting the winning serve” is an example of personal memory, which does not take form as a propositional attitude. Those memories that do take form as propositional attitudes, e.g. “I remember that I hit the winning serve,” are not necessarily personal memories. This is because I may remember hitting the winning serve only because my best friend has reminded me of that over the years. In that case my memory is not known directly by virtue of the fact that I have not thought in the first-person of an event in my past; instead, this memory arises through inference from testimony.
Reid's advocacy of a direct theory of memory requires a commitment to the claim that memories take past events as their objects, which contrasts with Locke's theory. Reid explains this contrast with an example having to do with the fact that, yesterday, he has smelled a certain rose, and that, today, he remembers smelling the rose's fragrance:
Philosophers indeed tell me, that the immediate object of my memory and imagination in this case, is not the past sensation, but an idea of it, an image, phantasm, or species of the odour I smelled: that this idea now exists in my mind, or in my sensorium; and the mind contemplating this present idea, finds it a representation of what is past, or of what may exist; and accordingly calls it memory... This is the doctrine of the Ideal Philosophy. [But] memory appears to me to have things that are past, and not present ideas, for its object. ... I beg leave to think with the vulgar, that when I remember the smell of the tuberose, that very sensation which I had yesterday, and which has now no more any existence, is the immediate object of my memory. (IHM 2.3, 28)
Personal memories are present-tense mental states with first-person perspective that take past events as intentional objects.
To clarify the epistemology of memory, Reid distinguishes between distinct and indistinct memories. He says distinct memories are “real knowledge” and indistinct memories are not: “Memory is always accompanied with the belief of that which we remember, as perception is accompanied with the belief of that which we perceive,” which emphasizes the structural similarity between the two faculties. He adds, “in mature years, and in a sound state of mind, every man feels that he must believe what he distinctly remembers, though he can give no other reason of his belief, but that he remembers the thing distinctly” (EIP 3.1, 254). This final remark gestures at the unaccountability of memory.
Reid exemplifies his commitment to the unaccountability of memory experience by placing a first principle about memory in his set of first principles of contingent truths: “That those things did really happen which I distinctly remember” (EIP 6.5, 474). Reid illustrates the cogency of this first principle by describing a courtroom scene in which a defense attorney appeals to global skepticism about the reliability of memory in an effort to undermine the devastating testimony of eyewitness about the actions of his client. The argument “would have no other effect upon the judge or jury, than to convince them that he was disordered in his judgement” (EIP 6.5, 475). The canonization of memory in his set of first principles indicates that Reid does not believe that the reliability of the faculty of memory can be justified in a non-circular way since any attempt to demonstrate its reliability will presuppose its reliability (EIP 6.4, 481; IHM 2.3, 28).
Reid attempts to explain why memory is unaccountable:
The knowledge which I have of things past by my memory, seems to me as unaccountable as an immediate knowledge would be of things to come; and I can give no reason why I should have the one and not the other, but that such is the will of my Maker. (EIP 3.2, 255–6)
When I believe that I washed my hands and face this morning, there appears no necessity in the truth of this proposition. It might be, or it might not be. A man may distinctly conceive it without believing it at all. How then do I come to believe it? I remember it distinctly. This is all I can say. (EIP 3.2, 256)
When Reid says ‘memory is unaccountable’ he means that we don't know why distinct memory is always accompanied by belief; we don't know why it reliably produces true belief; and we can't established that memory beliefs are true in a non-circular fashion (van Woudenberg 2004). Further analysis of the epistemology of memory belief is prevented by virtue of this unaccountability. This insight about the epistemology of memory belief indicates subtlety about the limits of analysis, which has drawn favorable comparisons to Wittgenstein (Wolterstorff 2000, ch. 9).
Reid's theory of memory informs his theory of personal identity, as does his three criticisms of Locke's theory of personal identity. First, Reid argues that Locke's account is misleading due to confusion between the concepts of consciousness, memory and personal identity (IHM 1.3, 17; see John Locke, Essay Concerning Human Understanding 2.27.24, 345). Reid believes that using ‘consciousness’ to describe awareness of past events is a misnomer because we are only conscious, in such cases, of our remembrance of those events. Second, Reid offers his ‘Brave Officer’ thought experiment as a counterexample to Locke's account (EIP 3.6, 276). The point of the thought experiment is to show that Locke's theory does not adequately preserve the transitivity of the personal identity relation. Put in other words, Reid argues that ‘identity’ in Locke's theory of personal identity cannot refer to numerical identity. Third, Reid follows Bishop Butler in arguing that Locke's justification of his theory of personal identity is circular (EIP 3.6, 277). Reid's opposition to Locke (and to Hume's bundle theory) inform Reid's commonsense account of personal identity.
Reid affirms that humans have diachronic personal identity, and denies Hume's so-called ‘bundle theory’. Reid asserts the relation between memory and personal identity in the second of his first principles dealing with these issues: “Another first principle is our own personal identity and continued existence, as far back as we remember anything distinctly. This we know immediately, and not by reasoning. It seems, indeed, to be a part of the testimony of memory” (EIP 6.5, 476). (See 1.1 Common Sense and First Principles above for discussion of Reid's first principles.)
Despite Reid's certainty on this point, he gives few further details about the nature of personal identity and the self. Personal identity implies the “continued existence of that indivisible thing which I call myself. Whatever this self may be, it is something which thinks, and deliberates, and resolves, and acts, and suffers. I am not thought, I am not action, I am not feeling; I am something that thinks, and acts, and suffers. ...that self or I, to which they belong, is permanent... Such are the notions that I have of my personal identity” (EIP 3.4, 264). Here Reid echoes Descartes' operational definition of the self in Meditation 2. Reid also argues that persons are not identical to their bodies (EIP 3.4, 264). (For more on Reid's theories of memory and personal identity, see Reid on Memory and Personal Identity.)
Reid refuses to speculate on the substance of the enduring self, however. Despite the fact that Reid is a substance dualist who believes that selves are eternal souls, he does not defend that view in the work that he published. In manuscript lectures he describes souls as “beings of a quite different Nature” than material bodies and says that the death of the body does not imply the death of the soul (Animate Creation 617–618). As Reid spells out his metaphysics of the self and soul here, his arguments become theological and appeal to God's existence, love and justice. He offers a moral argument about the necessity of reward and punishment for the thesis that the self survives bodily death (Animate Creation 623). Though survival of the self after bodily death is “of the highest Importance to Mankind yet it must be acknowledged that [all] the Arguments that Philosophy suggests upon this head are not of such Strength but that they may leave some doubt even in the Minds of wise and thinking Men” (Animate Creation 629).
Whereas Reid wrote an entire book about perception, Inquiry into the Human Mind, his moral theory arrives to us piecemeal in the Active Powers, the Intellectual Powers and papers collected as Reid's Practical Ethics, alongside a number of other concerns about free will, agency, causation, etc. As a result, Reid's readers must do more work to structure his moral philosophy than other components of his system.
Reid's moral philosophy is composed of several core theses. These include: (i) that human beings have an active power that is not causally determined by prior causes, laws of nature, or the conjunction of the two, making Reid a libertarian about free will; (ii) that moral statements are to be interpreted as propositions with subject/object content, making Reid a cognitivist; (iii) that truth-makers for moral statements are non-natural and independent of the mental states of human beings, meaning that truths in ethics do not generally depend upon the beliefs of humans; and (iv) that moral knowledge is produced in a way structurally similar to knowledge of the external world through perception, making Reid a moral sense theorist. Reid's moral philosophy is influenced by his belief in a benevolent, just, Christian God, but Reid doesn't endorse divine command theory. Reid summarizes his ethics in the familiar terms of his philosophical method by saying that
by an original power of the mind, which we call conscience, or the moral faculty, we have the conceptions of right and wrong in human conduct, of merit and demerit, of duty and moral obligation, ...; and that by the same faculty, we perceive some things in human conduct to be right, and others to be wrong; that the first principles of morals are the dictates of this faculty; and that we have the same reason to rely upon those dictates, as upon the determinations of our senses, or of our other natural faculties. (EAP 3.3.6, 180)
Reid's theory faces common criticisms about the plausibility of moral sense theory. The internal structure of Reid's moral philosophy has led to criticisms about, for example, the relation between the moral sense and moral first principles. It is unclear how the moral faculty judges either the truth of universalized moral first principles or the truth of contingent and fallible statements about particular action tokens. Reid appears to use the term ‘axiom’ equivocally by referring both to general and particular moral principles (Haakonssen 1990). However, promising steps to a full understanding of the interpretive problems posed by the logical scope and status of particular and general forms of Reid's first principles have been made, even though they await application to Reid's moral theory.
Several issues in the historical and religious context of Reid's writing influence his moral philosophy. First, Reid adopts what, for his time, was a non-traditional approach to moral philosophy insofar as he is neither a rationalist, like Samuel Clarke or Richard Price, nor a sentimentalist like Hutcheson, Hume or Smith. Reid understood why it was that the unified front of cognitivists against Hobbesian egoism had deteriorated into inter-nicene disputes between sentimentalism and rationalism. Reid's position inhabits a middle ground because he rejected assumptions dividing these camps (Davis 2006, ch. 2). Reid denies that a single faculty generates moral motivation and moral judgment, and denies Locke's division of labor between sense and reason. Instead Reid argues on behalf of a moral sense capable of both motivation and judgment. He rejects rationalist goals to identify and systematize necessarily true and general moral principles. He repudiates the sentimentalist's wayward account of moral judgment, and its lapse into observer-dependent moral properties. Seen in its context in the history of Early Modern moral thought, Reid attempts to draw the best from both groups in order to avoid the errors of each.
The second relevant feature of Reid's context concerns the Scottish legal tradition. Reid routinely discusses the competence of witnesses; the ‘final court of appeal’ and first principles; inadmissible evidence for moral judgments; burdens of proof; etc. The Scottish legal tradition places an abiding presumption of charity in witnesses and places faith in an independent judiciary. This is balanced by a network of checks warranting credulity and securing impartiality. These factors, and the competency of judges, provide the context for Reid's moral first principles, for their use and for their epistemological status. For example, criticisms that the moral first principles do not seem to be universally believed or self-evident must be put in context of the fact that Reid's moral system presupposes, as did the Scottish legal system, that it administers subjects of sound minds and common sense (Davis 2006, ch. 3).
Reid uses a method in his development of a deontic normative ethics similar to the method he uses in his development of an epistemology and metaphysics. Reid states first principles that serve as foundational commitments. His ethics contain several types of first principles, and the principles do not take any single form. Amongst them are factual claims about moral reality, moral judgments about action types, claims about obligations, etc. Reid says that there are three types of moral principles, but the distinction between these types is not always clear.
The first type is about “virtue in general.” This set includes statements such as:
1. There are some things in human conduct that merit approbation and praise, others that merit blame and punishment; and different degrees either of approbation or of blame, are due to different actions. 2. What is in no degree voluntary, can neither deserve moral approbation nor blame. 4. Men may be highly culpable in omitting what they ought to have done, as well as in doing what they ought not. 6. It ought to be our most serious concern to do our duty as far as we know it, and to fortify our minds against every temptation to deviate from it. (EAP 5.1, 271)
Reid says that these and the other principles “must appear self-evident to every man who hath a conscience.”
The next set of Reid's moral first principles is about “more particular” aspects of virtue:
1. We ought to prefer a greater good, though more distant, to a less; and a less evil to a greater. 2. As far as the intention of nature appears in the constitution of man, we ought to comply with that intention, and to act agreeably to it. 3. No man is born for himself only. 5. To every man who believes the existence, the perfections, and the providence of God, the veneration and submission we owe to him is self-evident. (EAP 5.1, 272, 273, 274, 276)
Critics have found many of these principles questionable and their status as self-evident more questionable. Some critics have argued that they are poorly articulated since Reid does not state definitions of key terms like “intention of nature.” Others argue that they depend upon the truth of Christianity. For example, Reid's defense of his second Principle 2 includes discussion of the way in which God has “excellently fitted” our conscience, reason, natural instincts and bodily appetites to the benefit of the species.
Moral first principles, like other first principles God has placed in our natures, require experience in order to appreciate. In this very narrow way Reid compares moral first principles to mathematical axioms since those axioms are “not discerned till men come to a certain degree of maturity of understanding. ... In like manner, our Moral Judgment or Conscience, grows to maturity from an imperceptible seed, planted by our Creator” (EAP 5.1, 276–7). So, though moral principles are self-evident, they are only known to be true by those who have reached an age of maturity. This resonates with the lessons Reid derives from the requirements upon witnesses and judges in Scots law.
Despite the fact that he offers a rich set of moral first principles, as a moral sense theorist Reid does not intend to systematize a network of moral obligations through his first principles. He writes, “A system of morals is not like a system of geometry, where the subsequent parts derive their evidence from the preceding, and one chain of reasoning is carried on from the beginning;... [instead it] resembles more a system of botany, or mineralogy, where the subsequent parts depend not for their evidence upon the preceding, and the arrangement is made to facilitate apprehension and memory, and not give evidence” (EAP 5.2, 281). First principles are given in an attempt to classify and systematize our obligations, and are not given in an attempt to justify and defend them. The actions we are obligated to perform are, according to Reid, obvious and, perhaps, self-evident.
As with many of Reid's mature doctrines, his ethics is formed through careful reflection on the theories of his predecessors, which leads Reid to cognitivism: moral statements express propositions instead of expressing feelings. When I say ‘murder is wrong’ this statement predicates a moral property, wrongness, of an action type, murder. In contrast, sentimentalists say that when I say ‘murder is wrong’ I mean ‘murder makes me feel bad’ or something like that. The historical provenance of cognitivism in Western philosophy, a commonsense interpretation of moral language, and the existence of a God who has infallible knowledge of normative truths are some of the factors that lead Reid to cognitivism. Because Reid takes cognitivism as supported by these and other factors, he does not explicitly argue for cognitivism.
Reid takes pains to refute arguments from Hume (and to a lesser extent, Smith) for non-cognitivist forms of sentimentalism. The last chapter of Active Powers contains Reid's clearest statements of his arguments against Hume's sentimentalism. Reid glosses Hume and Smith's theory as being that “Moral Approbation or Disapprobation is not an Act of the Judgement, which, like all acts of judgment, must be true or false, it is only a certain Feeling, which, from the constitution of human nature, arises upon contemplating certain characters of qualities of mind cooly and impartially” (EAP 5.5, 301–2). According to Reid, moral statements are judgments, which are affirmations of the truth or falsity of a proposition. The target of Reid's attack denies that moral statements are judgments in this sense.
Reid's best argument against Humean non-cognitivism appears in this passage:
That every form of speech, which language affords to express our judgments, should, in all ages, and in all languages, be used to express what is no judgment; and that feelings, which are easily expressed in proper language, should as universally be expressed by language altogether improper and absurd, I cannot believe; and therefore must conclude, that if language be the expression of thought, men judge of...virtue and vice...by the moral faculty. (EAP 5.7, 351–2)
So when one says that “such a man did well and worthily, his conduct is highly approvable” (EAP 5.7, 673), one predicates of this man's action a virtuous quality. At the heart of this argument is a two-fold commitment to a commonsense understanding of thought and language, which we have foreshadowed in earlier remarks about Reid's philosophical method: sentences mean what they purport to mean, and persons possess self-knowledge about the meanings of the sentences they utter. Notice too that the evidence to which Reid appeals here is construed as data in support of an inductive conclusion about the meaning of language. When a sentence appears to render a moral judgment, as does “murder is wrong,” commonsense implies that, ceteris paribus, it does render a moral judgment. Language is used to express judgments about all manners of topics—about velocities of objects, about historical facts, about mathematical statements—and in these contexts statements that purport to express judgments are interpreted as statements that in fact express judgments. Hume's denial that statements purporting to express ethical judgments in fact express ethical judgments contradicts our assertoric use of statements that purport to express judgments.
Having argued that Reid's theory resembles that of cognitivists, unlike other cognitivists Reid crafts extensive and important roles for moral sentiments in his moral philosophy. Reid is not content with a moral theory that has room only for reasoning and judgment, as in Samuel Clarke's theory. Showing his sympathies for the sentimentalists, he introduces the concept of moral approbation (and disapprobation), which includes “not only a moral judgment of the action, but some affection, favourable or unfavorable, towards the agent, and some feeling in ourselves” (EAP 3.3.7, 180). For example, when I witness someone coming to the aid of a stranger who has fallen down, my moral approbation includes a praiseworthy judgment of the actor's character and action and is conjoined with feelings of approval and esteem for the actor. He says, “Our moral judgments are not like those we form in speculative matters, dry and unaffecting, but, from their nature, are necessarily accompanied with affections and feelings” (EAP 3.3.7, 180). This crystallizes Reid's disagreement with Hume in the previous paragraph. Though moral judgments cannot be analyzed merely as the expression of a sentiment, moral judgments take affective experiences as an ingredient.
The structure of a Reidian moral judgment resembles the structure of a Reidian perceptual judgment, which is one of several important points of contact between his moral philosophy and his theory of perception. Reid attests to the depth and importance of these connections (EAP 3.3.6). One fundamental implication of this structural similarity reconfirms the point of the section about moral judgment above, namely, moral judgment is assertoric and not merely affective. Consider one's judgment about the person who assists the stranger who has fallen down. I do not directly perceive the agent's character, though I do make a judgment about it. I directly perceive the agent's action, and this functions as a sign that informs me about the agent's character. Reid's theory of moral judgment shares so much structure with his theory of perception (see 3. Perception and Knowledge of the World) that many have written of Reid's ‘theory of moral perception’.
The moral sense operates in a fashion structurally similar to perception, but with an important difference. Moral feelings do not occupy a role parallel with sensations. Though sensations ‘suggest’ perceptual judgments, moral feelings do not suggest moral judgments. Moral judgments are the basis of moral feelings (Lehrer 1989, 225). Our moral conceptions, though, are based upon moral feelings. Reid says, “Our first moral conceptions are probably got by attending cooly to the conduct of others, and observing what moves our approbation, what our indignation. These sentiments spring from our moral faculty as naturally as the sensations of sweet and bitter from the faculty of taste” (EAP 5.2, 279).
Since moral perceptions operate in the way our visual perceptions operate, Reid is able to claim that we can morally perceive things like duty, even though duty, like visible figure, is a relational property. He says that “Duty, or Moral Obligation” is strictly speaking neither a quality of an action nor a quality of an agent “but a certain relation between the one and the other. ... So that, if we seek the place of a moral obligation among the categories, it belongs to the category of relation” (EAP 3.3.5, 173). Though the object of my tactile perceptions is a primary quality in a mind independent object, the object of my perception of a visible figure is a relation between the mind-independent object and my eyes. In this limited way, the perception of duty resembles the perception of visible figures. Importantly, though, visible figures are themselves mind-independent, in just the way that duty is also mind-independent. Were someone else's eyes placed in the same location as mine are, she too would visually perceive just the visible figure I perceived. This intersubjectivity is important for grounding Reid's claims about the perception of duty.
In his moral theory Reid attempts to draw from the rationalist tradition of Samuel Clarke and Richard Price and from the sentimentalist tradition of David Hume and Adam Smith. As a result, his conception of the relationship between moral motivation and moral action is complex and difficult to unify. Motives appear to Reid to be both the ends for which we act, and the mental states that prompt our active behavior (Cuneo 2011).
In the first of the two passages below, both drawn from Active Powers, Reid implies that moral judgments about an action are not necessarily connected to any moral motivation while in the second he asserts that moral judgments about an action are necessarily connected to moral motivation:
A judge, from a regard to justice, and to the duty of his office, dooms a criminal to die, while, from humanity or particular affection, he desires that he should live... The determination of the mind may be, not to do what we desire to do. (EAP 2.1, 49)
I am very apt to think, with Dr Price, that, in intelligent beings, the desire of what is good, and aversion to what is ill, is necessarily connected with the intelligent nature; and that it is a contradiction to suppose such a being to have the notion of good without the desire of it, or the notion of ill without aversion to it. (EAP 3.3.2, 156)
One means by which to interpret these passages is through the lens of a teleological and theistic account of moral perception (Cuneo 2002). On this model, when we are functioning properly in the environments for which God designed us, then moral judgments are accompanied by moral motivations to act. However, this connection will fail in those who are damaged or poorly designed. For example, psychopaths suffer impairment in emotional response. Psychopaths can know certain of their behaviors are outside standard morality and yet not be motivated to alter their behavior. This, and the ‘proper function’ interpretation of the relation between moral judgment and moral motivation, is suggested in Reid's remark about the depraved:
Nor can we conceive a greater depravity in the heart of man, than it would be to see and acknowledge worth without feeling any respect to it; or to see and acknowledge the highest worthlessness without any degree of dislike and indignation. (EAP 3.3.7, 181)
Reid's account of moral motivation exemplifies his philosophical style in general, which eschews a priori speculation, the crafting of universal generalizations, and necessary and sufficient conditions in favor of keeping close to his observations of others and his introspection about himself. In the present context, Reid's account of moral motivation does not endorse any universal generalizations about what does and does not motivate us to moral action. What this sacrifices in philosophical clarity it, perhaps, gains in its ability to respond to real life cases. (For more on Reid's moral philosophy, see Reid's Ethics.)
Reid's aesthetics is composed of two core theses: that a work, to be an artwork, must express the artist's sentiments, and that aesthetic properties, like beauty and sublimity, are strictly speaking properties of the mind of the artist and not properties of material objects. Reid's mature aesthetics exemplifies a remarkable degree of sophistication for its time period. First, he possesses a clear concept of the fine arts and offers his readers a taxonomy of them (Kivy 2004). Second, Reid discusses the formal or structural properties of artworks in virtue of which they can be appraised in aesthetic terms. Third, Reid has a theoretical framework that unifies his concept of the fine arts and his account of how formal properties of objects make those objects works of art: Reid advocates an expression theory of art, arguably the first Western philosopher to do so.
Before explaining Reid's two primary aesthetic theses, first a word about the sources of Reid's aesthetics. The principal sources of our knowledge of Reid's aesthetics are manuscripts that Reid used to teach his advanced course on ‘The culture of the mind’ at Glasgow. These manuscripts are narrow in scope and deal mostly with rhetoric. They have been subsequently collected, edited and published in the Edinburgh Edition of Thomas Reid as Thomas Reid on Logic, Rhetoric and The Fine Arts (Reid 2004). (Though precise dating of these manuscripts is impossible, we know they predate Intellectual Powers (1785) and Active Powers (1788).) In addition to this source, Reid's Glasgow lectures on fine arts were transcribed by a student, and were subsequently edited and published as Lectures on the Fine Arts (Reid 1973). These two sources overlap considerably, and we draw from both, with the caveat that Thomas Reid on Logic, Rhetoric and The Fine Arts is composed of manuscripts not in Reid's own hand. Lastly, Reid discusses art at various points in his major works.
In both Logic, Rhetoric and the Fine Arts and Fine Arts, Reid shows a commitment to the importance of emotion and of expression in understanding art and artworks. He writes, “Expression is the capital thing in all Compositions of Music” (Logic, Rhetoric and the Fine Arts 288) but textual evidence for an expression theory in those works is equivocal compared with Reid's remarks in EIP and in his correspondence. In lecture notes Reid appears partially to endorse expression theory and partially to endorse emotional arousal theory. Emotional arousal theories of art are closely related to expression theories since both appeal to emotion as an essential feature of an artwork's aesthetic quality, but they differ on a crucial point. Emotional arousal theories explain the aesthetic quality of an artwork in terms of the way an artwork causes the expression or experience of emotion in the viewer or listener, and not (as on expression theory) in terms of the way in which an artwork's aesthetic qualities are caused by the artist's representation of his or her emotion in qualities of the artwork. In Reid's discussion in Lectures on the Fine Arts he appears to combine both theories to suggest that the emotion expressed by the artist must also be the same emotion aroused in the viewer or listener. The playwright introduces “a sign or expression of the passions, & when this is accomplished, it affects us and causes the same passion in us...” (Lectures on the Fine Arts 51). In his mature, published work, advocacy of the emotional arousal theory diminishes.
In his taxonomy of the fine arts, Reid includes: literature, drama, painting, sculpture, architecture and wordless music. The inclusion of wordless music was a novelty for the time (EIP 7.4, 605). Beauty represented through the harmony and melody of music arises because of the emotion expressed by the harmony and melody. Often harmony and melody represent emotions by representing the nature of a conversation. Though obvious in some music with words and in vocal music, even the beauty of wordless music can be explained in part in this way:
When discord arises occasionally in conversation, but soon terminates in perfect amity, we receive more pleasure than from perfect unanimity. In like manner, in the harmony of music, discordant sounds are occasionally introduced, but it is always in order to give a relish to the most perfect concord that follows (EIP 7.4, 605).
Reid describes the way melody represents the human voice's expression of sentiment as a form of ‘imitation.’
Painting and sculpture follow the same pattern of analysis. In the Inquiry Reid says that painting is a representational art and that when a painting “happily expresses a passion by its proper signs, every one understands the meaning of these signs, without art, and without reflection” (IHM 6.8, 102). Dominant species of painting include portraiture and landscape both of which are well suited to express emotion through visual representations. Naturally Reid places importance on the depiction of the “passion & dispositions of men in the attitudes and countenances” (Lectures on the Fine Arts 50) in painting and sculpture. Reid holds that the “chief part” of the beauty of paintings is their representation of the expression of emotions. Reid's aesthetics of poetry closely resembles his aesthetics of music and painting (Lectures on the Fine Arts 51).
Several philosophical issues arise from the discussion thus far. First, if we interpret Reid's discussion of aesthetics developmentally and we therefore discount certain commitments in Lectures that are not repeated in Intellectual Powers, then Reid skirts some traditionally troublesome problems for expression theories of art. On this interpretation, Reid's mature theory does not include a commitment to the claim that it is essential for something to be a work of art that the artwork must be imbued with an emotion by the artist that the artwork also arouses in the viewer or listener. Second, oddly for an expressivist, Reid rarely describes the cognitive and non-cognitive process whereby an artist creates an artwork (Gallie 1998, 178). But if an artwork's aesthetic properties are those properties that have been imbued in it in part through the artist's experience of emotion, presumably the nature of the creative process bears heavily on expression theories of art.
Reid's account of what makes a work of art beautiful or sublime is widely regarded as the most distinctive feature of Reid's aesthetics. In his correspondence, he writes, “I am proud to think that I first, in clear and explicit terms, and in the cool blood of a philosopher, maintained that all the beauty and sublimity of objects of sense is derived from the expression they exhibit of things intellectual, which alone have original beauty” (Letter to Archibald Alison, in Correspondence 209). (In characteristic fashion, the next sentence reads: “But in this I may deceive myself, & cannot claim to be held an impartial judge” (Correspondence 209).) Material objects are not by nature beautiful or sublime, but are only made so by the infusion of mental states. The beauty in material objects derives from mental and intellectual qualities that “excite our esteem” (Lectures on the Fine Arts 41–2; see EIP 8.3, 590). To be clear, brushstrokes and melodies, clay forms and the use of poetic meter, and the (broadly) physical works of which they are a part are not beautiful. Rather, these are signs, to the admirer, of the beauty, depth, or grandeur of the mental states in the artist that they suggest. In the case of Homer's Illiad, Reid says, “its sublimity was really in the mind of HOMER. He conceived great characters, great actions, and great events, in a manner suitable to their nature, and with those emotions which they are naturally fitted to produce... The grandeur of his thoughts is reflected to our eye by his work, and therefore it is justly called a grand work” (EIP 8.3, 587).
This idea has been met with criticism by Reid's commentators. This seems absurd since it follows that Homer's Illiad is not itself beautiful or sublime (Gallie 1998). But there are resources within the expressive theory to address this criticism with some success. The best way to understand Reid's theory is that the beauty of the artwork rests in the manner of its expression and not in what it expresses (Kivy 2004, 284–5). Perhaps, though an expressivist theory can be absolved of the problem, Reid's own version of it cannot be. The Illiad remains distinct from its manner of expression, and it is counterintuitive to say that the Illiad itself is not beautiful.
Reid does not distinguish between the Illiad qua written text and qua oral poetry; doing so informs debate both about the manner of expression of the work and about the sublimity of the mental states that gave it rise. By switching from Reid's example of literature to music we can take account of something like this distinction and therefore better respond to the objection under discussion. In the case of musical performance, the manner of expression and the content of what is expressed are distinct: the manner of a performance of a symphony may differ substantially when led by two different conductors. In each case it is distinct from the symphony itself (so as long as the symphony is not identical to the set of its performances). We are inclined to say that the performance of a symphony is beautiful, and we are not inclined to say that ‘the symphony itself’ is beautiful. This comports well with Reid's theory. This suggestion requires assumptions about the ontology of artworks; Reid does not discuss these matters at any length.
This discussion leads to a final consideration of Reid's aesthetics—the ontology of aesthetic qualities. Reid says that beauty “is derived” from the expression of mental events, but Reid says little about the ontology of beauty. Commentators have gravitated to this particular issue, but the results of this research are mixed. Four views predominate, and each can be characterized in terms of the relations espoused between aesthetic qualities and Reid's finely grained distinction between primary and secondary qualities. (i) Aesthetic qualities are secondary qualities, and that Reid mistakenly compares aesthetic qualities to primary qualities (Kivy 1970). Beauty, on this interpretation, is in the mind. But it is not in the mind—or eye—of the beholder. Rather, beauty is in the mind of the artist, and the artwork provides a sign of the mental states of the artist. (ii) Aesthetic qualities are primary qualities and secondary qualities, which suggests that this feature of Reid's aesthetics is incoherent (Gracyk 1987). (iii) Aesthetic qualities are neither primary nor secondary qualities, which also poses serious problems for Reid's aesthetics (Nauckhoff 1994). (iv) Aesthetic qualities bear features of both secondary and primary qualities (Benbaji 2000). Aesthetic qualities are like secondary qualities because both are dispositional, while they are like primary qualities because our judgments about them are incorrigible.
Though (i)-(iv) are framed in terms of Reid's distinction between primary and secondary qualities, none of these four major positions begins from a considered account of Reid's views on the perceptual and epistemological status of qualities. Consider (ii). This characterization of aesthetic qualities is not itself reason to dismiss Reid's ontology of aesthetic qualities as incoherent. This is because one interesting feature of Reid's distinctions between primary and secondary qualities is that what is a primary quality for one person may be a secondary quality for another. Reid's aesthetics is an under-explored area ripe for further research.
Reid formed his philosophy of religion under the influence of his divinity degree received from Marischal College. Following this he was licensed to preach by the presbytery of Kincardine O'Neil in 1731, and became an ordained minister to New Machar, Aberdeenshire, in 1737. His intellectual influences included Samuel Clark, Joseph Butler, and his teachers and colleagues in Aberdeen, including George Turnbull. Reid, like Butler, crafted analogical arguments on behalf of the faith, and he states, without much novelty, a design argument and a cosmological argument for God's existence. Reid's arguments for God's existence are Newtonian in the sense that limitations of physics and Newtonian strictures about attributions of causes prevent Reid from advocating arguments for God's existence from physics (Callergård 2010). Reid's prescient, long-lasting contribution to the history of philosophy of religion concerns the way he shifts his emphasis as apologist from proving God's existence onto the task of showing that it is rational for one to believe in God's existence. On this point Reid is an innovator and has many contemporary followers. As a testament to this, leading defenders of Christian belief within the Anglo-American philosophical tradition do not merely pay homage to Reid's trailblazing effort to focus upon and articulate the conditions under which religious belief is made rational. They also make extensive use of and further develop a number of his arguments and maneuvers in the epistemology of religious belief.
Reid's abiding confidence in his religious belief meant that his published work on traditional issues in the philosophy of religion, such as God's nature and arguments for God's existence, is minimal. In his lectures and unpublished work, however, he vigorously attacks Hume, atheists and their arguments with surprising vitriol. The fact that Reid does not thoroughly address canonical issues in philosophy of religion in the context of his published work, despite the personal and professional importance of his religious commitments, is a conundrum. The principal source for Reid's philosophy of religion outside his published works are sets of student notes—now, a total of four transcripts—from Reid's lectures on natural theology at Glasgow in the years 1763–1780. One set has been published as Thomas Reid's ‘Lectures on Natural Theology’ (Reid 1981, abbreviated 'Natural Theology' below). This is not a definitive source of Reid's own views, but given pedagogical conventions of the time, and cross-references of materials in the Natural Theology with materials elsewhere in Reid's corpus, we can draw reliable inferences about Reid's philosophy of religion from them. In this subsection we first discuss the conundrum just mentioned, then treat Reid's novel epistemology of religious belief, and then briefly discuss traditional issues in philosophy of religion.
Reid confesses that his philosophy of mind and theory of perception are but a response to the theories of David Hume (Correspondence 210–1). Hume offers one of the most thorough and compelling philosophical indictments of religion penned in English. Yet Reid rarely isolates and discusses Hume's anti-religious arguments. Furthermore, Hume's Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion was published in 1779 while Reid was lecturing on natural theology and long before Reid would publish his two sets of Essays. (Note that the Baird notes—the set used to prepare Natural Theology—were taken from lectures dating between February 11, 1780 to March 3rd, 1780.) But this book had little discernible influence upon Reid's thinking. Why did Reid mostly ignore Hume's great challenges to rational belief in God?
There is no persuasive answer to this question, though several converging considerations present themselves. One response is that Hume's work in the philosophy of religion was not, in Reid's opinion, deserving of a response. A second is that Reid was aware that he lacked compelling arguments with which to rebut Hume's criticisms, whether because he modestly appraised his counter-arguments, or because counter-arguments circulating in the milieu were satisfactory. A third is that the severe social climate in the Scotland of Reid's day obviated the need for Reid's response to Hume. Fourth, since Reid's principal aims in philosophy of religion were to move the debate from metaphysics to epistemology, perhaps Reid's silence on many of Hume's criticisms is pointed.
Above we explained several features of Reid's epistemology and his foundationalism relevant for understanding his analysis of the rationality of belief in God. Reid's case on behalf of the rationality of belief in God follows from his critique of Cartesian and Humean foundationalism, which required foundational beliefs to be justified by reasoning. According to Reid, foundational beliefs do not require proof of their own through argumentation. He writes, “Their evidence is not demonstrative, but intuitive. They require not proof, but to be placed in the proper point of view” (EIP 1.2, 42). Reason is not the “only judge of truth” (IHM 6.20, 169). Besides, human reason itself is fallible (EIP 2.22, 244–5). Reason is not necessary for epistemic justification, a fact that situates Reid's theory of empirical knowledge in the externalist camp.
While this opens the way to a form of non-inferential, rational belief in God, no such claim appears among Reid's First Principles of contingent or necessary truths. Indeed, belief in God possesses few of the features associated with Reidian First Principles. Denying God's existence is not absurd, belief in God does not have “consent of ages and nations”, and it is not held independently of education and acculturation (see EIP 6.4, 463–467). Yet clearly Reid holds that belief in God appears to be rational (not a word that Reid deploys as a term of art) without inference. He bases his claim that belief in God is rational (again, not a term Reid uses) upon a model familiar from his theory of the formation of perceptual beliefs (see Nichols & Callergård 2011).
Reid's treatment of arguments for God's existence is for the most part unoriginal, and freely makes use of ideas of many previous Christian thinkers along this well-worn trail. Reid's cosmological argument stems from Samuel Clarke's and features a priori justification of the principle, “That whatever begins to exist, must have a cause which produced it” (EIP 6.6, 497). Reid defends this against a few attacks associated with Hume. For example, if Hume's skepticism about causation undermines this principle, Reid says that many everyday inferences would become unjustified (EIP 6.6, 497–8). Reid uses this principle in a cosmological argument, but only as recorded in his lecture notes (Natural Theology 66–7), which leaves much to be desired. Every being must be either contingent or necessary. “We call that contingent which either might or might not be and that necessary which must be. Whatever either might or might not be depends on the will of some agent with power to bring it to pass or not...” (Natural Theology 66). Reid is then recorded to argue that to suggest that the “Supreme Being” exists contingently “evidently would be absurd” (Natural Theology 66). He does not here discuss the unintelligibility of a one-directional infinite series of contingent causes or of a circular series of contingent causes.
Reid gives the design argument more discussion (EIP 6.6, 508–9). One first principle of necessary truth is “that design, and intelligence in the cause, may be inferred, with certainty, from marks or signs of it in the effect” (EIP 6.6, 503). This is an unusual principle to denominate as a necessary “metaphysical” truth because it is an epistemic thesis about what it is permissible for one to infer. He labors to show that this is a necessary first principle by saying, for example, that it is “too universal to be the effect of reasoning” (EIP 6.6, 504). The first necessary principle serves as an opening premise in the argument, to which Reid adds some empirical data. The second premise says, “That there are in fact the clearest marks of design and wisdom in the works of Nature” (EIP 6.6, 509). From these two premises Reid concludes “that the works of Nature are the effects of a wise and intelligent cause” (EIP 6.6, 510).
To the ‘single-case’ objection often credited to Hume, that the design argument is not cogent since this is the only universe of which we are aware, Reid replies that the objection “is build on the supposition, that our inferring design from the strongest marks of it, is entirely owing to our past experience of having always found these two things conjoined” (EIP 6.6, 511). But if Hume's criticism does pose a problem for the design inference, it also undermines our belief in other minds. This is because Reid also does not witness the intelligence of another person bringing about some effect (EIP 6.6, 511).
The first principle of necessary truth licensing inferences from signs of intelligence to intelligence pairs with another that states that the belief in other minds is also a first principle (EIP 6.5, 484). Reid knows well how these two work together (EIP 6.5, 511–12) and as a result he unambiguously foreshadows the epistemological parity argument to be found in Plantinga's God and Other Minds (1990).
As a parish minister, a philosopher, and someone with extensive theological training—as well as a father who had only one of six children survive him—Reid no doubt reflected long and hard about pain and suffering, and their relationship to God. But Reid writes little about the problem of evil. In Natural Theology, in what is labeled “Lect. 84th”, he treats the subject directly and in less than two thousand words.
Notes to Reid's lectures distinguish between three forms of evil: “1. the evils of imperfection, 2. Evil which they call natural Evil, 3. Moral evil” (Natural Theology 101). The first refers to the fact that creatures could have been given greater degrees of perfection. The second form is “suffering & pain which we see endured by beings in the Universe.” The third refers to the “violation of the laws of Virtue by moral & reasonable agents” (Natural Theology 101).
The traditional problem of evil focuses on the second definition of ‘evil’. To this Reid offers a soul-making theodicy, and couples it with an emphasis on human epistemic limits. First, “it is by natural evil that men are trained unto wisdom & prudence in their conduct.” Then he adds that “we are not competent judges & cannot possibly determine” whether these virtues could have been achieved in humankind without the natural evil (and the degree of natural evil) we witness in our world (Natural Theology 101). The addition of this second epistemic component gives rise to an internal tension. Reid juxtaposes this affirmation of ignorance with substantive epistemic claims, for example, that “from the present constitution of things we see they [natural evils] are necessary to our acquiring any prudence or wisdom...” (Natural Theology 101–102). Reid presents these comments as answering the problem, but the Baird notes do not Reid's caveats or Reid's attempt to justify the necessities to which he refers.
The cornerstone of Reid's reply to the third form of evil—moral evil—is human freedom. Lectures on Natural Theology does not revisit his theory of human freedom and agency, but these issues are discussed thoroughly in Active Powers. He applies this theory of freedom to moral evil in order to conclude that “all moral evil then is not properly the doing of God but of men, who by abusing their power are liable to misery & are then justly punished for their misconduct” (Natural Theology 103).
To conclude, Reid's two substantive contributions to the subsequent development of philosophy of religion are indirect. First, regarding God's existence, Reid changes the field of play from metaphysics and proofs to epistemology and rationality. Second, Reid's development of an agent-causal account of freedom offered a foundation for responding to the problem of moral evil.
The Edinburgh Edition of Thomas Reid's works, a joint venture between Edinburgh University Press and Pennsylvania State University Press, has released the majority of volumes in its projected ten volume set. These books are now the definitive editions of Reid's works. We refer to this book by essay, chapter and (where applicable) section number, as well as by page number in Hamilton's The Works of Thomas Reid. The following major works are all included in this edition:
-  An Essay on Quantity; Occasioned by Reading a Treatise in which Simple and Compound Ratios are Applied to Virtue and Merit
-  An Inquiry into the Human Mind on the Principles of Common Sense
-  A Brief Account of Aristotle's Logic
-  Essays on the Intellectual Powers of Man
-  Essays on the Active Powers of Man
-  A Statistical Account of the University of Glasgow
Other works by Reid include:
- Reid, Thomas, 1736–1796/2002, The Correspondence of Thomas Reid, Paul Wood (ed.), University Park: Pennsylvania State University Press. [Abbreviated ‘Correspondence’]
- –––, 1751–1796/1990. Practical Ethics, Being Lectures and Papers on Natural Religion, Self-Government, Natural Jurisprudence, and the Law of Nations, Knud Haakonssen (ed.), Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1990.
- –––, 1753–1762/1937, Philosophical Orations of Thomas Reid, [in Latin], W.R. Humphries (ed.), Aberdeen: Aberdeen University Press.
- –––, 1753–1762/1989, Philosophical Orations of Thomas Reid, delivered at Graduation Ceremonies in King's College, Aberdeen, 1753, 1756, 1759, 1762, D.D. Todd (ed.), S. Duncan (trans.), Carbondale: Southern Illinois University Press. [Abbreviated ‘Philosophical Orations’]
- –––, 1764/1997, An Inquiry into the Human Mind on the Principles of Common Sense, Derek R. Brookes (ed.), University Park: Pennsylvania State University Press. [Abbreviated ‘IHM’]
- –––*, 1780/1981, Lectures on Natural Theology, Elmer H. Duncan (ed.), Washington, D.C.: University Press of America.
- –––, 1785/2002, Essays on the Intellectual Powers of Man, Derek Brookes (ed.), University Park: Pennsylvania State University Press. [Abbreviated ‘EIP’]
- –––. 1788/2010, Essays on the Active Powers of Man, Knud Haakonssen and James A. Harris (eds.), University Park: Pennsylvania State University Press. [Abbreviated ‘EAP’]
- –––*, 1973, Lectures on the Fine Arts, Peter Kivy (ed.), The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff. [Abbreviated ‘Fine Arts’]
- –––. 1996, Thomas Reid on the Animate Creation: Papers Relating to the Life Sciences, Paul Wood (ed.), University Park: Pennsylvania State University Press. [Abbreviated ‘Animate Creation’]
- –––, 2001. “Of Power.” John Haldane (ed.), The Philosophical Quarterly, 51: 3–12.
- –––, 2004, Thomas Reid on Logic, Rhetoric and the Fine Arts, Alexander Broadie (ed.), University Park: Pennsylvania State University Press.
* These collections are composed of manuscript writings that are not in Thomas Reid's handwriting; they represent student transcriptions of his lectures at University of Glasgow.
Books and Collections
- Barker, Stephen and Thomas Beauchamp (eds.), 1976, Thomas Reid: Critical Interpretations, Philadelphia: Philosophical Monographs.
- Berkeley, George, 1948–1957, The Works of George Berkeley, Bishop of Cloyne. A.A. Luce and T.E. Jessop (eds.). London, Thomas Nelson and Sons. 9 vols.
- Callergård, Robert, 2006, An Essay on Thomas Reid's Philosophy of Science, Stockholm: Stockholm University Press.
- Cuneo, T. and R. Van Woudenberg, (eds.), 2004, The Cambridge Companion to Thomas Reid. New York: Cambridge.
- Dalgarno, Melvin and Eric Matthews (eds.), 1989, The Philosophy of Thomas Reid, Dordrecht: Kluwer.
- Daniels, Norman, 1974, Thomas Reid's Inquiry: The Geometry of Visibles and the Case for Realism, New York: Burt Franklin.
- Davis, William C., 2006, Thomas Reid's Ethics: Moral Epistemology on Legal Foundations, London: Continuum International.
- De Bary, Philip, 2002, Thomas Reid and Scepticism: His Reliabilist Response, London: Routledge.
- Fraser, A. Campbell, 1898, Thomas Reid, Edinburgh and London: Oliphant, Anderson and Ferrier.
- Gallie, Roger, 1989, Thomas Reid and ‘The Way of Ideas’, Dordrecht: Kluwer.
- Haldane, John and Stephen Read (eds.), 2003, The Philosophy of Thomas Reid, Oxford: Blackwell.
- Houston, Joseph, (ed.), 2004, Thomas Reid: Context, Influence, Significance. Edinburgh: Dunedin Academic.
- Hume, David, 2000, An Enquiry concerning Human Understanding, T.Beauchamp (ed.), New York: Oxford.
- –––, 2000b, A Treatise of Human Nature, D. F. Norton and M. Norton (eds.) New York: Oxford.
- Lehrer, Keith, 1989, Thomas Reid, London: Routledge.
- Locke, John, 1975, An Essay Concerning Human Understanding, P. Nidditch (ed.), Oxford: Clarendon Press.
- Nichols, Ryan, 2007, Thomas Reid's Theory of Perception, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Plantinga, Alvin, 1990, God and Other Minds: A Study of the Rational Justification of Belief in God, Ithaca: Cornell University Press
- Rorty, Richard, 1981, Philosophy and the Mirror of Nature, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
- Rowe, William, 1991, Thomas Reid on Freedom and Morality, Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
- Schneewind, J. B., 1998, The Invention of Autonomy: A History of Modern Moral Philosophy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. (esp. pp. 395–403)
- Smith, John C., 2000, Companion to the Works of Philosopher Thomas Reid, 1710–1796, Lewiston: E. Mellen Press.
- Wolterstorff, Nicholas, 2001, Thomas Reid and the Story of Epistemology, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press
- Yaffe, Gideon, 2004, Manifest Activity: Thomas Reid's Theory of Action, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Yolton, John W., 1984, Perceptual Acquaintance from Descartes to Reid, Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press.
- Alston, William P, 1985, “Thomas Reid On Epistemic Principles,” History of Philosophy Quarterly, 2: 435–452.
- Anstey, Peter, 1995, “Thomas Reid and the Justification of Induction,” History of Philosophy Quarterly, 12 (1): 77–93.
- Benbaji, Hagit, 2000, “Reid's View of Aesthetic and Secondary Qualities,” Reid Studies, 3: 31–46.
- Bourdillon, Philip, 1975, “Thomas Reid's Account of Sensation as a Natural Principle of Belief,” Philosophical Studies, 27: 19–36.
- Callergård, R, 2005, “Reid and the Newtonian Forces of Attraction,” Journal of Scottish Philosophy, 3: 139–155.
- Callergård, R, 2010, “Thomas Reid's Newtonian Theism: his differences with the classical arguments of Richard Bentley and William Whiston,” Studies in History and Philosophy of Science Part A, 41: 109–119.
- Castagnetto, Susan, 1992, “Reid's Answer to Abstract Ideas,” Journal of Philosophical Research, 17: 39–60.
- Chisholm, Roderick M, 1990, “Keith Lehrer and Thomas Reid,” Philosophical Studies, 60: 33–38.
- Copenhaver, Rebecca, 2006, “Thomas Reid's Theory of Memory,” History of Philosophy Quarterly, 23: 171–189.
- Cummins, Phillip D, 1974, “Reid's Realism,” Journal of the History of Philosophy, 12: 317–340.
- Cuneo, Terence, 2006, “Signs of Value: Reid on the Evidential Role of Feelings in Moral Judgement,” British Journal for the History of Philosophy, 14: 69–91.
- –––, 2003, “Reidian Moral Perception,” Canadian Journal of Philosophy, 33: 229–258.
- –––, 2011, “A Puzzle Regarding Reid's Theory of Motives,” British Journal for the History of Philosophy, 19: 963–981.
- Daniels, Norman, 1972, “Thomas Reid's Discovery of a Non-Euclidean Geometry,” Philosophy of Science, 3: 219–234.
- David, Marian, 1985–6, “Nonexistence and Reid's Conception of Conceiving,” Grazer Philosophische Studien, 25–6: 585–599.
- De Rose, Keith, 1989, “Reid's Anti-Sensationalism and His Realism,” Philosophical Review, 98: 313–348.
- Duggan, Timothy J., 1960, “Thomas Reid's Theory Of Sensation,” Philosophical Review, 69: 90–100.
- Falkenstein, Lorne, & Grandi, Giovanni B., 2003, “The Role of Material Impressions in Reid's Theory of Vision: A Critique of Gideon Yaffe's, “Reid on the Perception of the Visible Figure””, Journal of Scottish Philosophy, 1 (2): 117–133.
- Gallie, Roger, 1997, “Reid: Conception, Representation and Innate Ideas,” Hume Studies, 23 (2): 315–335.
- Gracyk, T., 1987, “The Failure of Thomas Reid's Aesthetics,” Monist, 70: 465–482.
- Grandi, Giovanni B., 2005, “Reid's Geometry of Visibles and the Parallel Postulate,” Studies in History and Philosophy of Science, 36: 79–103.
- Haakonssen, Knud, 1990, “Introduction to Reid's Practical Ethics,” In Reid's Practical Ethics. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1–99.
- Haldane, John, 1989, “Reid, Scholasticism and Contemporary Philosophy of Mind,” in Dalgarno 1989: 285–304.
- –––, 1993, “Whose theory? Which representations?,” Pacific Philosophical Quarterly, 74: 247–257.
- Hamilton, Andy, 2003, “‘Scottish Commonsense’ about Memory: A Defence of Thomas Reid's Direct Knowledge Account,” Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 81: 229–245.
- Hatcher, Michael, 2013, “Reid's Third Argument for Moral Liberty,” British Journal for the History of Philosophy, 21: 688–710.
- Hoffman, Paul, 2006, “Thomas Reid's Notion of Exertion,” Journal of the History of Philosophy, 44: 431–447.
- Kivy, Peter, 1970, “Lectures on the Fine Arts: an Unpublished Manuscript of Thomas Reid's,” Journal of the History of Ideas, 31: 17–32.
- Lopston, Peter, 2004, “Locke, Reid and Personal Identity”, The Philosophical Forum, 35: 51–63.
- Lehrer, Keith, 1989, “Conception Without Representation, Justification Without Inference: Reid's Theory,” Nous, 23: 145–154.
- McDermid, Douglas, 1999, “Thomas Reid on Moral Liberty and Common Sense,” British Journal for the History of Philosophy, 7 (2): 275–303.
- Madden, Edward H., 1982, “Commonsense and Agency, Theory” Review of Metaphysics, 36: 319–342.
- –––, 1986, “Was Reid a Natural Realist?” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 47: 255–276.
- Manns, James, 1988, “Beauty and Objectivity in Thomas Reid,” British Journal of Aesthetics, 28: 119–131.
- Nadler, Steven M., 1986, “Reid, Arnauld, and the Objects of Perception,” History of Philosophy Quarterly, 3: 165–174.
- Nauckhoff, Josefine C., 1994, “Objectivity and Expression in Thomas Reid's Aesthetics,” Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 52 (2): 183–191.
- Nichols, Ryan, 2002, “Reid on Fictional Objects and the Way of Ideas,” The Philosophical Quarterly, 52: 582–601.
- Nichols, Ryan, & Callergård, Robert, 2011, “Thomas Reid on Reidian Religious Belief Forming Faculties,” Modern Schoolman, 88: 317–335.
- O'Connor, Timothy, 1994, “Thomas Reid on Free Agency,” Journal of the History of Philosophy, 32 (4): 605–622.
- Pappas, George S., 1989, “Sensation and Perception in Reid,” Nous, 23: 155–167.
- –––, 1990, “Causation and Perception in Reid,” Philosophy, 50 (4): 763–766.
- Robbins, David O., 1942, “The Aesthetics of Thomas Reid,” Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 2: 30–41.
- Schumann, Karl, 1990, “Elements of Speech Act Theory in the Work of Thomas Reid,” History of Philosophy Quarterly, 7: 47–66.
- Van Cleve, James, 1999, “Reid on the First Principles of Contingent Truths,” Reid Studies, 3: 3–30.
- –––, 2002, “Thomas Reid's geometry of visibles,” Philosophical Review, 111 (3): 373–416.
- Van Woudenberg, Rene, 1999, “Thomas Reid on Memory,” Journal of the History of Philosophy, 37 (1): 117–133.
- Yaffe, Gideon, 2002, “Reconsidering Reid's geometry of visibles,” Philosophical Quarterly, 52 (209): 602–620.
- –––, 2003, “Reid on the Perception of Visible Figure,” The Journal of Scottish Philosophy, 1 (2): 103–115.
Special Journal Issues
|2008||Journal of Scottish Philosophy, v. 6|
|2002||Philosophical Quarterly, v. 52|
|2000||American Catholic Philosophical Quarterly, v. 74|
|1987||The Monist, v. 70|
|1978||The Monist, v. 61|
How to cite this entry. Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society. Look up topics and thinkers related to this entry at the Internet Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO). Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.
- The International Association for Scottish Philosophy.
- Center for the Study of Scottish Philosophy, at the Princeton Theological Seminary.