Social Ontology

First published Wed Mar 21, 2018; substantive revision Mon Mar 4, 2024

Social ontology is the study of the nature and properties of the social world. It is concerned with analyzing things in the world that arise from social interaction, and with explaining what makes them the things they are—that is, how the social world is “constructed.”

The field brings together a wide range of social entities and phenomena. For instance:

  • Money: There is a lot of interest today in new forms of money, like cryptocurrencies. But what is money in the first place? Are cryptocurrencies money, and can they be?
  • Sex and gender: What is the nature of sex? What is the nature of gender? Is there a gender binary, or is that a mistake? Is gender biological, or is it socially constructed, or is it an illusion? What does it mean to say that gender is socially constructed?
  • Social groups and group cognition: what are groups, and can they do things in the world? Does it make sense to speak of a social group having a thought, or taking action, or intending to do something? Can groups have beliefs? Can they have feelings, or emotions? Do they bear responsibility for things they do?

Still more entities investigated in social ontology also include language, norms, family and marriage, disability, law, corporations, art, and artifacts. Sections 5.1–5.8 of this entry discuss work in social ontology in many of these specific domains. It is difficult to delineate a precise scope for the field (see section 2.1). In general, though, the entities explored in social ontology largely overlap with those that social scientists work on, and a good deal of work in social ontology takes place within the social sciences.

Social ontology, as a field, is built on the idea that these questions are not just interesting on their own, but may inform one another. Perhaps we can learn about the nature of race by investigating the nature of gender, or vice versa; perhaps we can learn about the nature of money by investigating the nature of law, or by investigating the nature of tools and artifacts we invent. Social ontology brings together inquiries like these, to address more general questions about the nature of the social world as well.

In considering both particular and general topics in social ontology, it is helpful to break the inquiry up into two parts. Consider gender, for instance. One inquiry involves the “construction” or “set-up” of gender-categories: are they socially constructed, and if so, what does the work of constructing them? Is it social practices, attitudes we have, biological regularities, or something else, that set up or anchor gender-categories to be what they are? A related but somewhat separate inquiry involves the “products” of the construction, i.e., the characteristics or constituents of the gender-category, constructed as it is. To belong to a given gender-category, is it a matter of having certain physical characteristics, or of being treated in a certain way, or of having certain beliefs, or of others’ having certain beliefs? We can ask similar questions about many (if not all) social entities. One might inquire about what sets up or constructs a legal category, and also inquire about the “real definition” of the category that has been constructed. Similarly for race, money, and even social groups. A close (though imperfect) analogy is with the inquiry into the semantics of a word (i.e., its meaning or definition) versus the inquiry into its meta-semantics (i.e., what makes it have the meaning it does). Inquiring into the construction of social entities is like meta-semantics, i.e., what sets it up to have the real definition it does. And inquiring into the “product” or “constituents of a social entity” is like semantics, i.e., what the entity’s resulting real definition is.

This entry discusses theories and approaches to each of these divisions separately:

  1. Theories of the constituents, or membership conditions, of social things in general. For instance, some theories argue that social entities are built out of the psychological states of individual people, while others argue that they are built out of actions, and yet others that they are built out of practices. Still other theories deny that a distinction can even be made between the social and the non-social. This is the topic of section 3.
  2. Theories of how social categories are constructed or set up (or “anchored”) in general. Are social categories and kinds produced by our attitudes? By our language? Are they produced by causal patterns? And is there just one way social categories are set up, or are there many varieties of social construction? This is the topic of section 4.

The term ‘social ontology’ has only come into wide currency in recent years, but the nature of the social has been a topic of inquiry since ancient Greece. As a whole, the field can be understood as a branch of metaphysics, the general inquiry into the nature of entities.

1. History

The following brief overview mentions some key themes and innovations in the history of social ontology. For a more detailed discussion of historical developments in social ontology as well as references, see the supplementary document: Social ontology: History. For a historical treatment from the perspective of language, see Aarsleff 1982; from the perspective of psychology, see Lock and Strong 2010.

1.1 Ancient and Early Modern Debates on the Sources of Social Entities

Ancient inquiries into the nature of social phenomena introduced questions that remain active today: Which features of the world are products of humans or society, and which are products of nature? What does it mean to say that something is a social creation? A central concern of Sophism, a school of Greek philosophy in the fifth century BCE, was the contrast between nature (phusis) and custom, law, habit, or convention (nomos). In particular, they debated the sources of justice, law, and language: are these rooted in phusis or in nomos?

Ancient philosophers explored the mix between natural and human contributions in the construction of familiar features of the world. They did not, however, theorize much about exactly what people do in order to create the social world. Instead, they wrote of agreements, compacts, conventions, habits, laws, customs, and so on, without paying particular notice to separating these from one another. In the early modern period, theories of these sources broadened considerably, as did the variety of social phenomena being investigated. Approaches developed in the seventeenth and eighteenth centuries include:

  • Social entities as products of covenants: Hobbes, in Leviathan (1651), argues that a stable commonwealth is generated by covenants among all the people in a society. Hobbes’s analysis is reflexive: the people who institute the commonwealth are those who are members of the commonwealth. Hobbes analyzes covenants in terms of agreements, and also provides an analysis of agreement, a crucial part of which is to explain what makes agreements binding.

  • Social entities as products of convention: As an alternative to ‘compact’ or ‘agreement,’ the legal theorist Samuel Pufendorf, in De Officio Hominis et Civis (1673), uses the term ‘convention’ as the basis for law and language. He argues that conventions do not need to be explicitly formed or agreed to. Instead, we can have tacit conventions—i.e., conventions that we may not even be aware we have. Hume greatly advances the analysis of convention and of social phenomena in terms of it (Hume 1740). He expands the scope of convention to include a wide variety of social entities—not only law, property, and language, but also money, government, justice, and promises.

  • Social entities as products of God and Nature: Other early modern philosophers root the social world in the natural—both in divine commandment and in human nature. Robert Filmer, a seventeenth century monarchist, argues in Patriarcha (1680) that the state is a family. This implies, according to Filmer, that state authority is no different from the authority of a father over his family. Locke’s Two Treatises on Government (1689) sharply criticize Filmer and provide a competing analysis, though Locke, too, sees God and nature as the sources of the state and of property. Locke rejects Filmer’s comparison of the state with a family, arguing instead that political authority has its source in the natural rights of each individual created equally.

  • Social entities as products of the individual mind: Locke’s theory of “nominal essence” is important for a number of contemporary approaches to social ontology, even though Locke does not himself associate nominal essences with the social world in particular. A nominal essence is a definition of a species or sort of thing, which people assemble in their minds out of ideas. Individuals generate these definitions when they observe things in the world and classify them according to their apparent similarities. Nominal essences, in Locke’s approach, are generated mentalistically: they are formed from the association of ideas in the mind. Moreover, they are generated individualistically: a nominal essence defined by any given person is fully defined by that person’s own mental states.

Much of the ancient and early modern work on social entities can be understood as an inquiry into the “sources” or “construction” of the social. Do they have their sources in nature, in custom, in convention, in God? But we also see the foundations for a new inquiry that blossomed in the eighteenth century—not into the sources of social phenomena, but into their constituents or building blocks. (See also sections 2.2, 3, and 4 for contemporary theories of constituents vs. sources of social entities.)

1.2 Individuals, Aggregates, and Wholes

Advances in science and interest in political governance led theorists to draw analogies between the traditional domains of science—such as heavenly bodies, chemicals, and organisms—and the newly salient domains of economies and societies. The push to develop a science of society motivates a different emphasis in social ontology, as compared to earlier theories. Whereas ancient and early modern theorists largely investigated the sources or generators of social entities, these theorists devoted more attention to analyzing social entities into their constituent parts.

Philosophers in the Scottish Enlightenment argue that social order arises from aggregates of individuals interacting with one another, even if the individuals did not plan the order. “Nations stumble on establishments”, Ferguson 1767 writes, “which are indeed the result of human action, but not the execution of any human design”. Later attempts to develop a rigorous science of the social world also employ a similar picture of the components of society. J.S. Mill builds on Comte 1830–1842 to argue that social science is a branch of psychology. Society, according to Mill, is the aggregate of human minds, and the topic of the social sciences is to derive laws governing such aggregates. (Mill 1843) Altogether, his approach to social phenomena is “psychologistic”: he takes social phenomena to be built exclusively out of psychological states of individual people. (The interpretation and expansion of psychologism becomes an important topic in twentieth century individualism; see sections 3.1, 3.2, and 3.3.)

The historicist tradition in eighteenth and nineteenth century German philosophy inverts the relation between individuals and societies. Rather than seeing individuals as primary, these philosophers stress the primacy of societies, with individuals a product of the societies in which they are brought up. Hegel argues that even self-consciousness is not something that an individual can possess independently of others. Instead, it depends on our having a sense of ourselves as individuals as distinct from others, which in turn depends on mutual interactions (Hegel 1807). Hegel also develops the idea, following Hölderlin, of a “World-Soul” or universal human spirit, of which individual actions are a manifestation. Hegel’s universal spirit is sometimes used as an example of “ontological holism”—i.e., the claim that social entities are fundamental, independent, or autonomous entities, as opposed to being derived from individuals or non-social entities.

Nineteenth century criminologists, including Taine 1887, Ferri 1884, Sighele 1891, and Le Bon 1895 investigated mental properties of crowds, such as impetuousness and irrationality. Tarde 1890 postulated mechanisms by which crowds acquire these characteristics, by way of the psychology of individuals and interactions among people. Durkheim 1894 challenged these explanations, arguing that such individualistic laws cannot be adequate to explain crowd psychology or other social phenomena. Durkheim argues that “social facts” are autonomous of individuals and have the power to constrain and affect their actions. In social ontology, Tarde is often seen as a representative of “individualism” and Durkheim of “holism” regarding the social world, and their positions remain a touchstone for contemporary debates (see section 3).

1.3 The Construction of Social Categories

Nineteenth-century social criticism reopened the question of the sources of social categories. Philosophers scrutinized commonplace categories—often ones that we employ in our daily practices—revealing that they have darker (or at least richer) underpinnings than we realize. Their approaches raise questions about the motivations for using these categories, as well as their nature and metaphysical sources.

In a section of Capital titled “The Fetishism of Commodities and the Secret Thereof”, Karl Marx argues that certain social categories that might appear natural are in fact the products of social and economic relations among people (Marx 1867). Subsequent philosophers put claims of the constructedness of social entities at the center of social critique. Lukács 1923 argues that capitalism extensively “reifies” social entities—that is, it turns phenomena that arise from an oppressive economic system into features of the world that we regard as natural (see also Lukács 1964–68 [1986]). The term ‘social ontology’ arises in this tradition: Gittler 1951 draws from Mannheim, who was a colleague of Lukács (see Mannheim 1929), and Gould 1978, discussing Marx’s theory of the social world, defines ‘social ontology’ as “a metaphysical theory of the nature of social reality.”

Friedrich Nietzsche employs a historical or “genealogical” method in On the Genealogy of Morals (1887) to critique the basic categories of Christian morality. Challenging the idea that this morality is basic to human nature, he argues that prevailing moral categories were tools intentionally wielded in a struggle for power. Ideals of humility and self-denial, for instance, were introduced by leaders of a resentful population to undermine the aristocratic values of Greco-Roman society. In Nietzsche’s account, the sources of such categories are largely cognitive and intentional, as opposed to arising from material relations, as they do in Marx’s account.

Members of the Frankfurt School, especially Theodor Adorno and Max Horkheimer, draw on Marx and Nietzsche to argue not just that the social world becomes “second nature” to us, but that our current social order is maintained, at least in part, by the causal effects of our treating social entities and categories as if they were natural (Adorno & Horkheimer 1947, Adorno 1966). Uncovering social categories becomes a centerpiece of subsequent social criticism. If oppressive structures are to be dismantled, the social nature of the everyday world first needs to be revealed. The work of the Frankfurt School in particular is influential in contemporary feminist and race theory (see section 5.4).

2. The Problem of Demarcating Social Ontology

2.1 Social Versus Non-Social

Social ontology is the study of social entities and properties. But which things are social? How are they distinguished from those that are not social? Not every theory in social ontology needs to make this distinction—but many rely on it. Michael Bratman, for instance, analyzes “shared intentions” of a group in terms of the knowledge and intentions of individual members of the group (Bratman 1993, 2014). His project is designed to remove the mystery behind shared intention by analyzing it in terms of non-social mental states of individual people. More generally, “psychologistic” theories of the social world sharply distinguish the social from the non-social. These theories—descendants of Mill 1843—hold that all social facts are determined by the psychological states of individual people.

Demarcating the social may be useful for understanding the domain or topic of social ontology in general. It also may be pertinent to specific problems. Guala 2022, for instance, argues for a particular demarcation of the social in defending a version of individualism about the social. Guala argues that the social sciences are concerned with a particular class of social properties—namely, the “projectible” ones—and that for these, the thesis of “ontological individualism” holds (see sections 3.1, 3.2, and 3.3 for debates over individualism).

The “level of the social” is often divided from other “lower levels” in arrangements of the sciences into hierarchies (Comte 1830–1842, Oppenheim and Putnam 1958, List 2019). This arrangement of the sciences into levels is sometimes challenged altogether (e.g., Wimsatt 1976, Potochnik and McGill 2012, Thalos 2013, Eronen 2015, Zahle 2021). But even if certain domains of science can be arranged into levels, the level of the social has difficulties unique to it. One is the problem of identifying just which entities are the social ones. Even cases that would seem straightforward can be contentious. A crowd, for instance, was regarded by many in the late nineteenth century as the paradigmatic social object. But in recent years it has become less obvious that this is so. Margaret Gilbert, for instance, hesitates to attribute “sociality” to crowds: sociality, she argues, arises from norms and commitments, which many crowds lack. According to Gilbert, it is with joint commitment that a group is genuinely social (Gilbert 1989). Other philosophers and sociologists make alternative claims about the “mark of the social”, while still others deny that there is any criterion for distinguishing the social from the non-social (see Greenwood 1997).

In the last few years, there has been renewed effort to distinguish social from non-social kinds. Mason 2021 argues that social kinds can be understood in terms of their essential dependence on certain mental states. Khalidi 2016 argues that social kinds require mental sustenance of a particular sort, where non-social kinds do not. Other recent work proposes criteria for entities and categories to be “socially constructed.” Schaffer 2017 and Griffith 2018 (both responding in part to skepticism about grounding in social ontology voiced by Barnes 2014 and Mikkola 2016), propose grounding-theoretic accounts, according to which entities are socially constructed just in case they are at least partly grounded in social features or patterns. Epstein 2016 argues that inasmuch as the social can be distinguished from the non-social, we need to distinguish two dimensions: some entities are socially “grounded” but not socially constructed (e.g., crowds), some socially constructed but not socially grounded (e.g., phenotypic racial categories, certain commodity money) and some both (e.g., socio-historical racial categories, fiat money) (cf. Haslanger 2016a). Many theorists (e.g., Mallon 2016, Ásta 2018) do not have a clear stake in distinguishing the social from the non-social, but do have a rough or implicit distinction between social and non-social entities in their theories of social construction.

A second problem is to identify which categories of social entities are the best focus for analysis of the social world. Social theorists have treated a variety of different categories of social entities as basic, including social laws (Mill 1843, Spencer 1895); social facts (Durkheim 1894, Mandelbaum 1955); social groups (Oppenheim & Putnam 1958, Gilbert 1989, Tuomela 2013); human kinds (Boyd 1991, 1999b; Millikan 1999, Mallon 2016); institutional facts (Searle 1995); social objects and social properties (Macdonald & Pettit 1981, Ruben 1985); social predicates (Kincaid 1986); social practices (Bourdieu 1977, Giddens 1984, Schatzki 1996); and social processes (Whitehead 1929, Rescher 2000, Livet & Nef 2009). Some theories focus on a category because it is significant, but do not claim that it comprehensively covers the social world. Others choose a category of social entities in order to be comprehensive. In doing this, a theory may aim to set up an exhaustive determination claim: for instance, it may claim that all social objects are composed of individual people interacting with one another, or that all social properties supervene on individualistic properties, or that all social facts are grounded by physical facts. As these examples illustrate, the category of social entities a theory focuses on is tied to how the theory interprets “determination” (for more on this, see section 2.2).

Even more contentious is which objects are not social. To many theorists, individual people are paradigmatically non-social. Many philosophers, however, argue that individuals are socially constituted (see sections 1.2, 3.4.1, and the sections A.3.2, and A.4.2 of the supplement on the history of social ontology). Thus some projects in social ontology look for a middle ground. They intend to accommodate the social nature of individuals, and yet to account fully for the social in terms of individuals (see section 3.2.2).

One option for interpreting the “non-social entities” is that they include only the objects of physics, chemistry, biology, and other “hard sciences”. According to some theorists, even these are socially constructed and therefore fall on the social side of the division (Pickering 1984, Woolgar 1988). But even presuming that objects of the “hard sciences” are non-social, they may be inadequate for practical purposes as a characterization of the set of non-social things. After all, social theory aims to say more than merely that the social world is somehow built out of physical entities (see section 3.2.2). A variety of approaches to the building blocks of the social are discussed in section 3.

2.2 What is Meant by the “Building” of the Social World

As seen in section 1 (and the supplement on history), it is useful to break social ontology down into two broadly different inquiries. One inquiry asks what social entities are and how they are determined—what, for instance, are the conditions for a person to be a woman, or for something to be a group belief? A second inquiry investigates the sources or generators of social kinds or entities—that is, what socially constructs or “anchors” social entities. It is a matter of some controversy whether this is a sharp distinction, but it is useful to separate them at least as a matter of clarifying questions.

To illustrate the distinction, consider a category such as animal sacrifice. This is a kind of ritual act performed in both historical and contemporary cultures. The boundaries of this category are not simple. Animal sacrifice is not the same as ritual slaughter, though the two acts have many properties in common: the animals killed in both may be eaten, both acts may be performed by specially qualified individuals, and both may be subject to specific rules and performed in specific contexts. The first inquiry into the nature of animal sacrifice, then, is to clarify the conditions for something to be in the category: what ontologically determines something is an animal sacrifice, or what are the constituents of an animal sacrifice?

Once this is settled, however, there is a second set of ontological questions regarding the sources of the category animal sacrifice. What features of the world—social, intellectual, practical or otherwise—puts this category in place? What socially constructs the category animal sacrifice to have the boundaries or essential properties it does (as analyzed in the first inquiry)?

A task for each inquiry is to clarify the respective notion of “determination” or “construction.”

2.2.1 The inquiry into the ontological determination of the social

What is being claimed by a theorist who argues, as Bratman does, that group intentions are determined by the attitudes of group members? Or, as Dretske does, that footprints are partly determined by foot-strikes? In these claims, a social entity (a group intention or a footprint) is held to stand in some relation to other entities (member attitudes or a past foot-strike). What is this relation—and is there just one such relation, or are there many ways that social entities are “built out of” or “ontologically determined by” other entities?

This part of social ontology is the most pertinent to modeling the social. A scientist working on models of cells makes use of the fact that cells are “built of” nuclei, cytoplasm, organelles, and so on. Similarly, models in social science are often based on views of the constituents of—or more generally, the things that ontologically determine—social entities.

Until recently, the most precise discussions of the determination of social entities made use of various forms of the supervenience relation (see the entry on supervenience). A virtue of the supervenience relation is that it makes it easy to articulate important distinctions in precise ways. For instance, maybe the social properties of the U.S. Senate are exhaustively determined by the properties of U.S. Senators. Or maybe the social properties of the U.S. Senate are exhaustively determined by properties of the population of the entire U.S., or even of the entire world, not just by properties of Senators. This distinction can be clarified using the notion of “global supervenience” (see Macdonald & Pettit 1981, Currie 1984, Kincaid 1986). There are, however, well-known shortcomings to the supervenience relation as well (see Fine 2001, Shagrir 2002, K. Bennett 2004a, Correia 2005), as well as recent critiques of supervenience as relying on an unacceptable division of the world into “levels” (see Ylikoski 2014, Zahle 2021).

People interested in the building blocks of the social world often discuss different “ontological determination” relations apart from supervenience, including identity, parthood, fusion, aggregation, set membership, and constitution (see Copp 1984, Ruben 1985, Baker 2004, Sheehy 2006, Effingham 2010, List & Pettit 2011, Hawley 2017, Harris 2019).

In the last few years, much attention has shifted to metaphysical grounding as a way to treat ontological determination in general, and by extension, to the determination of the social. Epstein 2015 proposes a ground-theoretic treatment of social determination (he further argues that social construction or “anchoring” should be treated differently). Schaffer 2017, 2021 proposes a unified ground-theoretic treatment, with all factors in social construction and determination treated as grounds. Mikkola 2015, 2019 argues against ground-theoretic approaches to the social in particular; see Passinsky 2021 for a counter-argument.

If we want to make sense of claims of the form XYZs ontologically determine Ss, where Ss are social facts or objects or other entities, the above approaches are interpretations of what is meant by “ontologically determines” in the claim. An even bigger question in this inquiry is what kinds of things the XYZs are—that is, theorizing about the factors that build or determine the social. For instance, is the social world built out of mental states, or bodies, or human practices, or irreducibly social stuff? These different theories are the topic of section 3 of this entry.

2.2.2 The inquiry into how the social is constructed

A similar set of questions arises in connection with social construction. What is being claimed by a theorist, as Hume does, that property is a product of social convention? Or as Searle does, that money is set up by collectively accepted rules? Or as Marx does, that commodities are social constructions of relations of production?

Again there are two aspects of these questions: if we want to make sense of claims of the form S is socially constructed by ABC, one issue is to clarify “socially constructed by,” and the other is to theorize about the ABCs—that is, about the things that do the social construction work. Are the ABCs individual attitudes, or collective attitudes, or practices, or structures, or material conditions, etc.? These latter theories are the topic of section 4 of this entry.

It still remains, however, to clarify what sort of relation or operation “social construction” is. There is much less general theorizing of this topic than of “ontological determination.” There seem to be two reasons for this: theorizing about the nature of social construction tends to go hand-in-hand with theories of the ABCs—i.e., the things that do the construction work. If one argues that such-and-such attitudes are the things that construct social categories, then one implicitly also argues that social construction is to be understood as the kind of thing that the possession of those attitudes produces. Another reason is that many theorists who aim to give general accounts of the “social construction relation” regard it to be an aspect of (or equivalent to) ontological determination. So a theorist who understands ontological determination in terms of grounding will then interpret social construction in terms of grounding as well.

Epstein 2019b (and elsewhere) argues that these inquiries ought to be sharply distinguished from one another. He introduces the term ‘anchoring’ to denote the “social construction” operation, and argues that anchoring cannot be understood as grounding (or as meta-grounding), but is a distinct relation. Haslanger 2016a, Hawley 2019, and Schaffer 2019 agree that there is a practical distinction between the two, but argue against the sharp distinction. Haslanger proposes that anchoring be understood as a kind of epistemic “scaffolding” instead, and Hawley and Schaffer argue that anchoring should be understood in terms of grounding. Schaffer proposes that the distinction should be understood much like Dretske’s distinction between structuring and triggering causes (Dretske 1988).

2.3 Ontology Versus Causation

Another difficulty in analyzing social entities is in distinguishing ontological from merely causal relations. In both of the two inquiries described in the previous subsection—the inquiry into the determination or definition of social entities and the inquiry into the social construction or anchoring of social entities—we can distinguish causal determination from ontological determination.

In connection with social construction, for instance, Kukla 2000, Haslanger 2003, and Kõiv 2019, for instance, distinguish “causal construction” from “constitutive construction,” the former involving social factors in causing or producing facts about the world, and the latter involving social factors in the constitution or ontology of facts about the world.

Likewise, grounding is often characterized as “non-causal determination,” in contrast to causal determination. There is some controversy about the distinction altogether: Bennett 2017, for instance, argues that causation is a “building relation,” more similar to relations like grounding and composition than is commonly acknowledged. But most metaphysicians endorse the distinction (more on this at the end of this subsection).

In many cases, the distinction between the ontological and the causal is fairly straightforward. The Battle of the Somme, for instance, is part of World War I. That battle is not a cause of the war. It is a constituent of it: the Battle of the Somme is ontologically rather than causally related to World War I. The 1881 formation of the Triple Alliance, on the other hand, is causally related to the war, not ontologically.

Other cases, however, are more challenging, and it is not always easy to distinguish when entities stand in ontological rather than causal relations. We could argue that the formation of the Triple Alliance is only causally related to the war because it took place long before the war began. But temporal remoteness is not always good evidence. Even if causes must always precede their effects, identifying causally related events is complicated by the fact that events extend over long periods of time. (The weather in January 1916 is causally and not ontologically related to World War I, although the war stretched on before and after that month.) Furthermore, there might be instantaneous or even backward causation (see entry on backward causation).

The more significant complication, however, is that (arguably) ontological relations need not be synchronic. For a mental state to be a memory, for instance, it must be caused by the event of which it is a memory. Likewise, a mark’s being a footprint partly depends on historical events: it requires that the mark was made by the strike of a foot (Dretske 1988, Stalnaker 1989). And for a person to be President of the United States, an election must have taken place beforehand. Some theories of the social world insist that a social entity can only ontologically depend on synchronic facts about the world. Classical structuralism, influenced by Saussure 1916, regards social structures as synchronic, with the social structure at time t being a product of the mental states of individuals at time t (see section 4.1). John Searle’s theory of institutional facts (Searle 1995, 2010) also regards social entities as being synchronically dependent: the institutional facts at time t are a product of attitudes in the community at time t together with a synchronic residue of historical events that Searle calls the “background”. Work in a variety of domains, however, argues for an ontological role of historical factors. Among these are theories of semantic content (Kripke 1972, Putnam 1975, Davidson 1987), biological and social kinds (Millikan 1984), artworks (Levinson 1980), and artifacts (Bloom 1996, Thomasson 2003). Diachronic ontological determination is a matter of controversy: in favor see Epstein 2015, Schaffer 2019; opposed see Bernstein 2016; for an intermediate position see Baron et al. 2020.

Distinguishing causation from ontology does not imply that causal relations are ontologically irrelevant. Having causal effects may be a criterion for an entity to be real (Gellner 1956, Bhaskar 1975, Elder-Vass 2010). Causal structure is also often regarded as central to the nature of various entities. Several theorists argue that kinds are individuated by their causal roles (Fodor 1974, Khalidi 2018). Some theorists of biological and artifactual kinds regard patterns of reproduction to be part of what individuates these kinds. And some theorists of human kinds regard certain causal feedback loops to be characteristic of human kinds (see section 4.3.3). The burden of such accounts is to distinguish the causal factors that are part of an account of ontology from those that are “merely” causally connected.

Much of the recent discussion of the relation between causal and ontological relations can be found in the literature on “grounding” and “ontological dependence”, including Rosen 2010, Audi 2012, Correia & Schnieder 2012, Fine 2012, Raven 2015, the entry on metaphysical grounding, and the entry on ontological dependence. Many philosophers who sharply distinguish causal and ontological determination nonetheless argue for important similarities between the two (cf. Fine 2012, Schaffer 2016). Others stress the structural differences (cf. Bernstein 2016, Koslicki 2016). There is also recent work to treat grounding and causation as species of a common genus (cf. Wilson 2018, Wilhelm 2021). Some philosophers also challenge the practical import of the distinction. Marques 2017, for instance, argues that constitutive construction is less significant for political and practical purposes than is causal construction.

2.4 Realism and Anti-realism Regarding the Social

Given that the subject matter of social ontology is entities that are—in one way or another—products of the social, they are generally taken to depend in some way on minds or human cognition. From its beginnings, theories of the social have been concerned with the fact that apparently natural features of the world are in fact products of society (this is evident in Marx and Lukacs, but arguably is present even in ancient debates; see Social ontology: History.) The extent to which the social is “real” is thus a continuing theme in theories of the social.

Work on social construction in the 1980s and early 1990s tended to regard claims of social construction as being at odds with realism, where a stark contrast was made between the social as mind-dependent and the real as mind-independent (see Gergen 1999, 2001). In the 1990s, philosophers began to attempt to develop moderate positions, according to which mind-dependence can be to some extent compatible with realism. One tradition developing this point is “Critical Realism,” taking off from the work of Bhaskar (1975a, 1993). Critical realists, including Archer 1995, Lawson 1997, and Elder-Vass 2010, 2012, argue that events in the world—social as well as natural—arise from the interactions between the causal powers of things. Social entities are mind-dependent inasmuch as they are generated from interactions among people as well as things. But social entities are nonetheless real, themselves having emergent causal powers.

Searle 1995 argues at length about realism, but largely focuses on social constructionist critiques of realism about the external world. In contrast to “brute” entities, which are independent of our representations, Searle argues that social entities “are only what they are, because we believe that is what they are.” (Searle 1997). According to Searle, the central paradox of the social is making sense of the fact that claims about them are objective, yet they depend on subjective experience. Searle aims to reconcile these two, arguing that social reality is ontologically subjective, yet that claims about it are epistemically objective (Searle 2010). Baker 2019 and Mason 2020 argue that Searle’s position ought to be understood as anti-realist.

Some philosophers have closely identified mind-dependence with anti-realism. Others dispute this (e.g., Jansen 2017, Baker 2019, Passinsky 2020, Mason 2020) arguing that it is a mistake to deny the reality of social entities on the basis that they are mind-dependent. Instead they contend that social entities are both real and mind-dependent.

Much of the debate about realism is tied to how realism and anti-realism are to be understood. See entries on Challenges to Metaphysical Realism, on Realism, and on Scientific Realism. The literature on the metaphysics of ordinary objects also bears on questions of realism and social entities. Eliminativists about ordinary objects argue that a large swath of ordinary objects (such as cars, tables, and mountains) do not exist. Many of the considerations bearing on the existence of ordinary objects would apply equally to social objects. See entry on Ordinary Objects.

3. Constituents of Social Entities

The first general category of questions social ontology investigates involves the constituents, or building blocks, or grounds of social entities. One way of thinking about this is to grant that our social categories have been constructed as they are. (How they get constructed is a separate inquiry, discussed in section 4.) Grant, for instance, that we have the legal and economic systems we do. What, then, are the constituents of a corporation? What are the necessary and sufficient conditions for someone to be American, or to have a particular gender? What is it for an event to be a performance of Beethoven’s Eroica?

Some theories strive to give very general answers to questions like these. They aim to fill in for X in the formula: All social entities are exhaustively determined by (or are constituted by, or supervene on, or are grounded by, etc.) entities of type X. That is, they argue for a particular “determination base” for the social entities. A large class of theories fill in ‘X’ with strictly non-social entities. Others argue that this asks too much: they agree that we can analyze constituents of social entities, but deny that social entities decompose into non-social parts. Still others reject the question altogether. And within all these views a variety of positions are taken on what the “determination” or building relation is (see section 2.2.1).

Other theories make less ambitious claims. Instead of searching for an exhaustive determination base for all social entities, they focus on a particular subset of social entities. Or even more modestly, they aim to analyze certain social entities in terms of other social parts—such as a battalion in terms of platoons, or an industry in terms of corporations.

Many positions on these matters descend from the debates between individualism versus holism that took place in the early part of the twentieth century (cf. O’Neill 1973, Udehn 2001, Zahle & Collin 2014a). Individualism is the somewhat vague thesis that the social is built exclusively out of individual people. Holism is the even vaguer thesis that social entities are “sui generis”, or ontologically fundamental in some sense. Some recent work aims to clarify these (cf. List & Spiekermann 2013, Epstein 2014b, entry on methodological holism in the social sciences), while some rejects the terms of that debate (e.g., Zahle 2021).

3.1 Ontological Individualism

Many theories aim to remove the mystery from the social world by characterizing a non-social “determination base.” That is, a domain of strictly non-social entities that exhaustively determines the social. Among these, the bulk of theories are varieties of “ontological individualism”: that is, that the social is exhaustively determined by facts about individual people.

Even within ontological individualism, there are various theories: some theorists hold that psychological facts about people exhaustively determine the social, while others hold that more than psychological facts are required. Many theorists assume that some version of ontological individualism is correct, but that has recently been challenged and debated (see section 3.2).

3.1.1 Psychologism

Psychologism is the view that social facts are composed exclusively out of the psychological states of individual people. This is the view advanced by Mill 1843 (see section 1.2 and also section A.3.1 of the supplement on the history of social ontology) and endorsed by subsequent theorists of the “social mind” such as Tarde 1898, 1901. Economists in the late nineteenth and early twentieth centuries also advocated psychologism (Jevons 1871, Wicksteed 1910, Pareto 1916), as did mid-century social theorists (Popper 1945, Watkins 1952). The term ‘psychologism’ is a little confusing. Karl Popper, for instance, uses this word as a pejorative regarding a particular kind of methodology in social science. But when it comes to ontology, he endorses Mill’s view (Popper 1945).

Most historical versions of psychologism are “internalist” in that they regard the contents of mental states as depending only on what is inside a person’s head. (“Externalist” psychologism is discussed in section 3.3.1. For discussion of internalism versus externalism, see entry on externalism about mental content.)

Psychologism is a claim about ontology; it is compatible with taking psychological states to be caused by non-psychological factors. Jane’s belief that the wind is blowing is caused in part by the blowing of the wind. But her psychological state, according to internalists, is a matter of her brain or other internal states, and does not include the wind. According to psychologism, the social world is determined exclusively by these internal psychological states.

Versions of psychologism differ when it comes to whose psychological states a given social entity or fact is determined by or depends on. Some theories are “globally dependent”: they take a fact like Gallius and Tiberius are slaves to depend on the psychological states of a larger population, not just those of Gallius and Tiberius (Currie 1984). Other theories are “locally dependent”. Many theories of group attitudes argue that the beliefs, intentions, and other attitudes of a given group depend only on the attitudes of the members of that group (Gilbert 1987, 1994, Wray 2001, Tuomela & Miller 1988, Tuomela 1992, Bratman 1993, Wray 2001, Lackey 2021). Some theorists have challenged local dependence even for group attitudes (Bird 2010; Epstein 2022).

“Conferralism,” put forward by Ásta 2008, 2010, 2013, 2018, argues that social properties like gender and race are determined by the attitudes of people toward individuals in particular contexts. A social property is “conferred” on an object, according to Ásta, if the object has the property because of some attitudes of people. A baseball umpire, for instance, confers the property of being a strike on certain pitches. Gender and racial categories are conferred by communities of individuals, but they can shift in different contexts. So a person might have one gender conferred by their family at home and a different one when they are among their peers. Conferrals, Ásta argues, need not be a matter of actual beliefs or acceptances of community members, but rather may be a product of community dispositions. That is, how members of the community are disposed to use concepts in counterfactual situations.

Theories also differ when it comes to which psychological states determine social entities or facts. The theories of group attitudes just mentioned hold that group attitudes are determined not just by psychological states in general, but by particular attitudes on the part of members. Broader versions of psychologism (e.g., Mill’s) are less specific about which psychological states are involved.

Finally, theories differ when it comes to which social entities are determined by psychological states. Theories of group attitudes, for instance, limit their claims to the group attitudes alone. Other views, such as those of Mill and Popper, propose that psychological states exhaustively determine social facts in general.

3.1.2 Atomism

Social atomism (or atomistic individualism) holds that the social world is built out of individual people understood as isolated “atoms”. As Taylor 1985 points out, the term ‘atomism’ is mostly used by its enemies, so its characterization often depends on what it is used to be a foil for. But, typically, atomism is a combination of two claims: the view that society is exclusively built out of individual people, and that individual people are somehow isolated from one another, as opposed to being mutually interdependent.

Some theories are accused of being atomistic in the sense that they treat individuals as isolated and non-interacting. Neoclassical economic theory is sometimes challenged on this basis; others point out that even in basic neoclassical models relations among individuals are incorporated in markets, prices, and other features (see Samuelson 1966, Arrow 1994).

The term ‘atomism’ is also used to indicate theories that neglect the causal or historical influences of society on individuals. A model may neglect social conditioning altogether, for instance by treating individual preferences as exogenous or given parts of a social model. Or, instead, people at a historical starting point may be regarded as isolated or non-social. ‘Atomism’ in this sense is applied to Hobbesian or “state or nature” views that give an account of the development of society starting with non-social individuals encountering one another (see Pettit 1993).

3.1.3 Bodies, actions, and relations

Theorists in several fields have turned away from mentalistic treatments of the building blocks of the social. Psychologism presupposed that the social sciences are sciences of the “mind” or “psyche” of society. However, the social sciences study not just social thoughts, but actions. This suggests a different and larger determination-base for the social—that is, a larger set of blocks out of which the social world is built. After all, actions are not the same as thoughts or behaviors, but involve the world.

Even behaviorism (Skinner 1953) rejects the idea that the social is built out of internal psychological states. Instead, it argues that only externally observable human behaviors can be the basis of a scientific inquiry into the psychological and social sciences. Still, behaviorism resembles psychologism more than it departs from it: it replaces the internal states of minds with the “outputs” of the mind in behavior, and takes the social to be exhaustively determined by those outputs or behaviors (see entry on behaviorism).

More recent theories depart from psychologism by introducing additional entities into the determination base of social entities. While List and Pettit 2002 argue that group attitudes supervene on individual attitudes, in List and Pettit 2011 they expand the base to include actions and dispositions. Kincaid 1986 claims that the social supervenes on individualistic properties and relations and actions. Hodgson 2007 argues that this distinction is crucial: theories that neglect relations are mistaken, while theories that include relations are plausible. This is disputable, however: most of the relations Hodgson discusses supervene on intrinsic properties of individuals, and arguing that the ontological individualist needs to be clearer about which properties (and relations) should get included in the “determination base.”

3.2 Material Building Blocks, In Addition to Individuals

Though ontological individualism is widely assumed, it has recently come under criticism (see Epstein 2009, Hindriks 2013, Ylikoski 2014, Elder-Vass 2017, Haslanger 2022). These critics argue that ontological individualism—even if construed generously—is false. In part, these arguments draw on work from a variety of disciplines on the role of material factors in the building blocks of the social.

3.2.1 Resources

Other theories argue that among the constituents of the social are also resources and other features of the world. For instance, many microeconomic models include variables not only for attributes of individual people, but also for bundles of resources possessed by those people, or for such things as capital goods or geographic locations. Another example is Edith Penrose’s “resource theory” of the firm (Penrose 1959). Penrose proposes that firms (corporations, partnerships, etc.) be understood as collections of distinctive resources, including real estate, capital goods, and material processes.

Despite such examples, it is often unclear whether such theories genuinely take goods and resources to be ontologically related to social entities. Or instead, whether they regard resources to interact causally with social entities, but not to constitute them. Moreover, even in models that include resources, often only individual choices are modeled as having causal powers: resources have no causal import except as mediated by the attitudes and actions of individuals. Even Penrose’s theory of the firm focuses most of its attention on “capabilities”, understood as knowledge and skills of human actors, and subsequent literature derived from Penrose focuses even more on capabilities as the exemplar of resources (e.g., Teece et al. 1997).

A more unequivocal turn away from mentalism and toward the external world in constituting social entities occurred in the 1980s in sociology and anthropology. Theorists in these fields began to pay a great deal of attention to how bodies cope in the practical world.

3.2.2 Physicalism

The most prominent theories arguing for non-social building blocks of the social are individualistic in either a narrow or broad sense. Either the social is exhaustively determined by the psychological states of individual people, or by these plus behaviors, bodies, and actions, or by these plus resource bundles allocated to individuals. An alternative is to reject individualism altogether, and instead regard the determination base of the social to include (at least potentially) any physical entities whatever. Physicalism is often understood to be the view that all facts—the social ones included—are ontologically determined by physical facts. (This “determination” is often understood in terms of supervenience or grounding; see entry on physicalism).

Physicalism—on this and related understandings—has difficulties as well. It is difficult to define physicalism, and in particular to ensure that it is not trivial. Clarifying the thesis of physicalism involves circumscribing what counts as “physical”, just as individualism involves clarifying what counts as “individualistic”. If the physical entities are to be a non-social “base” that exhaustively determines the social, then it is required that the social not be included in that base. (See sections 3.4 and 3.5 for challenges to the separation of the social from the nonsocial.)

Moreover, it is unclear if physicalism is true. In fact, certain social entities seem to be good candidates for counterexamples to at least some versions of physicalism. One widely discussed problem with a supervenience interpretation of physicalism, for instance, is the “grounding” problem regarding the modal properties of coinciding objects (K. Bennett 2004b). The classic example used to discuss coinciding objects is an artwork—a statue—and the clay that constitutes it (Gibbard 1975). Other social entities work equally well for the same point, such as cases of distinct social groups with the same members (see section 5.1). On the relation of constitution to physicalism, see Baker 2019.

3.3 Partial or Mixed Theories

Some theorists who favor individualism but also recognize its flaws have proposed qualified or mixed theories. Philip Pettit 1993 has argued for a version of individualism in which social entities are exhaustively determined by the mental states of individuals, but those mental states, in turn, can be determined in part by social entities. And “institutional individualists” argue that any particular social phenomenon can be understood in individualistic terms, but only within a social or institutional context.

3.3.1 Externalist psychologism

A variant of psychologism takes an externalist approach to mental states. Externalism is the view that mental states ontologically depend on facts about the external world. It holds that, for instance, the content of a person’s concept of water partly depends on the actual structure of samples of water in the person’s environment; and likewise that the content of a person’s concept of the U.S. Government partly depends on the external entity that is the U.S. Government (see the entry on externalism about mental content).

This version of psychologism regards the social to be exhaustively determined by externalist mental states. Mid-century opponents of standard psychologism (Mandelbaum 1955, Gellner 1956, Goldstein 1958) had raised the problem of attitudes toward social entities, but it is not clear in those views whether the external world was causally or constitutively related to the mental states. Following Kripke 1972 and Putnam 1975, the explicitly externalist view was developed by Bhargava 1992 and Pettit 1993. Pettit argues for externalist psychologism as a qualified version of individualism. Like more standard psychologism, he takes social phenomena to be exhaustively determined by mental states. The mental states in question, however, are partly constituted by external stuff.

Externalist psychologism, if correct, would pare down the determination base of the social world to one kind of (partly social) entity. It faces hurdles, however. First, it must explain how it avoids circularity—that is, social entities depend on attitudes toward those entities that depend on the social entities themselves. Second and more seriously, it needs to explain why this is a plausible determination base for the social. According to this view, the external world figures profoundly into the determination of the social—but only when it is a constituent of attitudes. Strangely, when the external world is not a constituent of attitudes, it plays no role in the determination of the social.

3.3.2 Institutional individualism

To be useful, it is not necessary to provide a complete account of the social world, nor to analyze social entities “all the way down” to some fundamental level. Many social scientists aim to give partial accounts of social phenomena in terms of individuals, situated within a social context.

A certain type of hate-crime, for instance, might be usefully analyzed as constituted in part by a speech act. That may be useful for social science or law, whether or not we can say much about the nature of speech acts. In economics, general equilibrium models are often designed to represent sets of households (as opposed to individuals), endowments of resources, sets of firms, goods, and other entities such as bonds and governments (Mas-Colell et al. 1995: Ch. 19). In models like these, some ontological work is implicitly done, in their partial analysis of economic systems into components. It is also common in sociological theory to analyze social entities into other social parts (see section 5.3).

Popper and his students put forward a hybrid methodology for social science, which favors individualistic explanations in a local context or “situation”, but takes institutions as background conditions that are treated as exogenous. This methodology is often known as “institutional individualism” (Agassi 1975, J.S. Coleman 1990, Jarvie 1998, Udehn 2001). This, however, is an approach to methodology, not a claim about the nature of the social. These models do not generally commit themselves to ontological claims either about the nature of these entities or about which social entities the various components constitute. Popper, for one, argues for the indispensability of institutions in social explanation, but has a psychologistic ontology of institutions (and all social entities).

3.4 Socially Constituted Building Blocks

Some hold that it is fruitless to search for non-social building blocks of the social world. That does not mean, however, that they renounce analysis of the social altogether. Instead, they try to shed light on the determination of the social in terms of other social components.

Some of these projects make similar claims to the ones in the last section. That is, they propose sets of entities that exhaustively determine the social world—but they propose sets consisting of social entities. Other projects are more modest. They aim at partial accounts, rather than exhaustive ones. Just as one might break a car down into chassis, engine, transmission, etc., one might break social entities into mid-sized parts even if that breakdown is not fully exhaustive, and even if those parts are not themselves analyzed.

For those projects that do attempt to give an exhaustive analysis of the social in terms of other social building blocks, a recurring worry is whether they can avoid being circular. If we were trying to explain the nature of water, it would hardly do to say that it is built out of watery parts. Likewise, it is unclear what we have accomplished if we argue that social entity x is ontologically determined by social entity y, and then that y in turn is partly ontologically determined by x.

3.4.1 Socially constituted individuals

Other theorists argue that people or selves are socially constituted. Husserl argues that even the content of an individual’s sensory perception is conditioned by the community of other conscious individuals. A person’s subjectivity thus depends on intersubjectivity (Husserl 1936: Sec. 71, 1950: Secs. 55–60).

A view like this—much like the externalist psychologism discussed above—can be seen as individualistic in some sense. Though it does not argue that the social world is determined by non-social or pre-social individuals, it still holds that the social is determined by individuals. Husserl, for one, argues that the social world is the community of intersubjectively constituted individuals.

Many views of the self as socially constituted implicitly equate the self with the individual mind, consciousness, or mental states. Among many others, Hegel argues that self-consciousness—and hence the existence of the self—depends on recognition from others (see section 1.2, Laitinen 2002, Ikäheimo and Laitinen 2011, and also section A.3.2 of the supplement); Scheler 1913 that the fundamental kind of experience is experience-with-one-another; Mead 1913, 1934 that individual experience and self-consciousness emerge from a social matrix of communication processes; and Berger and Luckmann 1966 that individuals are constituted by the social roles with which they identify. MacIntyre 1984 argues that selves are constituted by social narratives; Gould 1988 that individuals are ontologically primary and yet essentially stand in social relations; Taylor 1989 that the self is constituted through the participation in moral frameworks; and Davis 2003 develops a social narrative theory of the individual in economics.

Other views focus on the social constitution of the body. Foucault 1976, 1977a and Butler 1988, 1990, 1993, among others, hold that an adequate theory of the self involves the construction of bodies as much as it does the construction of mental states. And they argue that human bodies are largely products of discourse and the exercise of social power. However, in interpreting these views it is important to distinguish claims about the constituents of selves and bodies from claims about how kinds and categories are set up. At least to some extent, these are theories of how narratives and practices set up categories for classifying bodies (see sections 4.4 and 5.4).

3.4.2 Practices and embodied agency

Theories of practice, developed in anthropology in the 1970s and 1980s, turn their attention to actions, routines, and the engagement of people with the world. A range of theories are now classified under the broad rubric of “theories of practice”: Bourdieu 1977 and Giddens 1984 are the most prominent, but theorists as diverse as Foucault, Garfinkel, Butler, Latour, Taylor, Ortner, and Schatzki are also counted among the practice theorists.

A practice is a “way of doing” some activity, involving how people in a culture not only think, but also behave, speak, feel, and interact with objects in the environment. Consider, for instance, a way of cooking in a given culture. Cooking involves bodily movements that individuals reproduce, objects in the environment that individuals handle in routine ways, explicit and background knowledge, and people’s intentions and choices. Individuals, according to practice theory, are always involved in the performance of practices, but those performances are not limited to the bodies and minds of the performing individuals. Bourdieu 1990 takes practices to be exhaustively determined by sets of objectively observable behaviors. But other theories argue for the primacy of the “type” over the “token”: it does not make sense to say that a practice supervenes on its performances, since the performances are individuated by reference to the practice.

Some theories of practice are, to a certain extent, individualistic. Practice theory is largely concerned with bodily activity—the ways people move, carry themselves, and act skillfully—as it is reproduced in a culture. Individual agents are the “carriers” of practices (Reckwitz 2002, Rouse 2007). Still, practices involve not only attitudes and mental representations, but also objects in the world: pans, stoves, vegetables, and sauces are among the constituents of cooking practices (Sewell 1992, 2005; Kukla and Lance 2014). Moreover, individual activities themselves depend on the social: they are partly constituted by the cultural practices of which they are instances (Haslanger 2018).

3.5 Top-Down and Flat Approaches

Although it is common to distinguish individualism and holism as the two poles in debates over social ontology, the range of views discussed in the preceding sections show that individualism is not the only alternative to holism. Even among views discussed in sections 3.1 and 3.2—ones that take the social to be built out of non-social components—there are both individualistic and non-individualistic alternatives to holism.

Holism also might be understood in various ways. In principle, some versions of holism may be dualist: i.e., proposing separate spheres of the individualistic and the social, akin to the Cartesian distinction between bodies and mind. While dualism has seen a resurgence in the philosophy of mind, it is not clear how it could be plausible at all for the social. So most holists about the social are “monist” in one way or another: they take the social to be fundamental or to have ontological priority. Or else they put forward a “flat” ontology, according to which entities of all kinds exist and yet stand in no ontological priority with respect to one another.

3.5.1 Ontological priority of the social

One version of social holism regards social entities to be ontologically prior or fundamental, and individual people (and other entities) to be ontologically derivative on the social. This sort of monism is often associated with Hegel (see section A.3.2 of the supplement) and the British idealists, such as Green 1866 and Bradley 1893.

Some mid-century social theories also seem to take this position. Classical structuralism emphasizes the priority of structure over the individual, following Saussure’s arguments for the ontological priority of the linguistic system over the individual sign (1916). In its initial applications to anthropology, roles in a cultural system were analyzed in terms of the system as a whole. By the 1960s, however, the point was applied not just to roles but to individuals themselves. Althusser 1965 and Balibar 1965, for instance, argue for a “theoretical anti-humanism” in which causal explanation is predominantly structural:

Men only appear in the theory as supports for the relationships implied in the structure, and the forms of their individuality only appear as the determined effects of the structure. (Balibar 1965)

The functionalist sociology of Talcott Parsons 1951 also prioritizes social structure over individual agency. Parsons is often understood as arguing that individual action is little more than a manifestation of social functions, and is severely criticized (notably by Garfinkel 1967) on the grounds that he inappropriately discounts individual agency. Much work has been done in recent years to reconcile structural and individual explanations of action (e.g., Garfinkel 1981, Risjord 2000, Martin 2009, Haslanger 2016b).

It is not always clear, however, whether the explanatory priority of the social over the individual entails a claim about ontological priority. Functional systems, even ones that strip individuals of their freedom to act independently, may nonetheless be exhaustively grounded in “low-level” entities.

3.5.2 Flat ontologies

Other approaches reject any ordering or hierarchy of entities altogether. Some views deny that the sciences can be divided into hierarchies, but allow that certain entities are composed of others. A more radical view is that there is no building at all among entities. A prominent example is Actor-Network Theory (Latour 2005, Callon 1999, Law 2009). All entities, in this approach, are potentially on a par with one another. Even identifying an entity or a class of things as “social” is a mistake, according to Latour. Latour distinguishes certain roles that objects can play: they can act as “mediators”, transforming meaning, and they can act as “intermediaries”, transmitting meaning without transforming it. An atom, a person, a machine, a mountain, or a bank, have equal potential to play these roles. All the scientist—social or natural—can do is to write narratives that trace associations. Other approaches to flat ontology include “assemblage theory” (DeLanda 2006), “object-oriented ontology” (Harman 2005), and “scale-free metaphysics” (Thalos 2013).

4. How Social Categories and Kinds Are Constructed

Inquiry into the constituents or “stuff” of the social world, discussed in the last section, is a huge field. But there is another field of inquiry with an array of approaches in social ontology: the inquiry into how social categories or kinds are set up, constructed, or anchored. Consider, for instance, the fact Fred and Ginger are dancing the foxtrot. The “stuff” of the dance is the two people moving around in some pattern. But, we might ask, what sets up the category foxtrot? Why do the moves determine what dance it is, rather than the material of floor they are dancing on or the brand of shoes they are wearing? What makes it the case that dances are categorized into foxtrots versus sambas versus salsas; or, for that matter, certain sequences of movement into dances versus strolls versus marches?

Here are a few options one might start with:

  1. A crude mentalistic theory: the fact that the dance is a foxtrot is a product of the fact that I believe it is a foxtrot.
  2. A crude naturalistic theory: social categories are natural features of reality, with the physical structure of the world breaking reality down into categories, one of which is the foxtrot.
  3. A crude linguistic theory: we define the word ‘foxtrot’, and that definition specifies the conditions for an entity to be a foxtrot.

The following sections discuss more developed views taking off from these ideas. Section 4.1 discusses theories that are both mentalistic and individualistic: i.e., those holding that the metaphysical source of a person’s social categories is that person’s own mental states. Section 4.2 discusses mentalistic theories that involve many or all the mental states of people in a community, rather than each person for herself. Section 4.3 discusses theories that regard social categories to be set up by patterns of properties and causes. Section 4.4 discusses theories that include practices in setting up social categories, and section 4.5 discusses pluralistic and heterogeneous theories. Section 4.6 discusses the potential roles for language in setting up social categories.

Importantly, any given theory of the source of social categories can take different positions on the topics discussed in section 3—i.e., on what the constituents or building blocks of social entities are. A set of theorists might disagree about how foxtrots (or other social entities, or entities in general) are constituted—e.g., by people, or patterns, or physical configurations of atoms, or sensible particulars, or impressions, etc. And yet all might agree that a person’s categories are set up by that person’s own mental states (compare, for instance, Berkeley 1710, Russell 1929, and Dennett 1991). Conversely, a set of theorists might all agree on how foxtrots are constituted, yet disagree on what metaphysically sets up that category.

4.1 Social Categories as a Product of Each Person’s Own Mental States

Many philosophical traditions investigate how individuals mentally construct, organize, categorize, or represent social objects—and objects more generally. Some views regard social categories to be concepts that individual minds assemble in order to organize subjective impressions. An example is a Lockean “nominal essence” theory of social categories (see section A.2.4 of the supplement). In this theory, a given person’s social category foxtrot is an idea in that person’s mind, formed out of combinations of impressions or other ideas internal to that person’s mind.

A staggering variety of theorists approach social construction along these lines. Indeed, until the middle of the twentieth century, it was tacitly assumed in many philosophical traditions that the social world, or social categories, are set up by the mental states of individuals. These theories range from Quine’s view that categorization arises from the “web of belief” that each individual possesses (Quine 1951) to the approach of classical structuralism that takes each person to have a “mental structure” that determines their own social categories (Lévi-Strauss 1945, 1963) to theories in psychology that understand social categories as concepts that individuals mentally impose on the world (Piaget 1926, Cohen & Lefebvre 2005).

The range of critiques of such approaches is just as varied, but especially serious difficulties are how to make sense of intersubjectivity and objectivity (Husserl 1950, Wittgenstein 1953), challenges to the idea that our minds impose “schemes” on perceptual content (Sellars 1956, Davidson 1963), and challenges to the “internalism” of these approaches, i.e., taking the labor of construction to be entirely borne by the mental (Putnam 1975).

4.2 Social Categories as a Product of Community-Wide Mental States

Instead of taking social categories to be products of individual minds, another class of theories holds that they are the products of the minds in a community taken together. Hume 1740 argues that promises are a product of a social convention. We have a convention, according to Hume, of the following form: words uttered according to a certain formula incur an obligation. When someone utters a phrase of the form ‘I promise to S’, the speaker is obligated to perform S. According to this theory, the conditions for an utterance to be a promise are set up by beliefs and expectations of the members of the community at large.

Theories in this broad class take different approaches to how community mental states set up social categories.

4.2.1 Social categories set up by agreement

Agreement, according to some historical theories, is the source of law, language, and the state (see section 1.1, and also sections A.1 and A.2.1 of the supplement). Agreement still plays a role in contemporary theories of some social phenomena, but that role is typically to ground the obligations associated with phenomena. For instance, according to the “will theory of contract”, contractual obligations are grounded by the intentional choices of each party to be bound to a commitment (see Fried 1981, Barnett 1985). When it comes to setting up social categories, it seems less likely that actual agreements are available to be their metaphysical sources. Instead, even theories that are putatively agreement-based tend to place agreement in a different role. Gauthier 1986, for instance, advances an agreement-based theory of morality. By his account, however, the justification for moral claims is based on what people rationally would agree to: idealized agreements, rather than actual ones, serve as the basis for moral categories.

Another difficulty—even if a given social category is the product of agreement—is identifying which feature of an agreement does the “metaphysical labor” in setting up the category. Suppose we employ a social category at time t′ which was a product of an agreement at time t. It may be that the features of that category are a product of the mental states of participants at t, or of the utterances or acts of participants at t. Or perhaps what matters is the mental states of community members at t′: that is, it is the synchronic trace of the agreement that sets up the social categories in a community at t, not the agreement itself.

4.2.2 Social convention

Convention-based theories are widely proposed for many social phenomena, including traffic rules, etiquette, laws, language, norms, institutions, morality, gender, codes of dress, and religion—as well as geometry, logic, truth, and necessity (see, among many others, Quine 1936, Lewis 1969, Schiffer 1972, Carter & Patterson 1982, Gilbert 1983, Kekes 1985, Sugden 1986, Sidelle 1989, Friedman 1995, Lagerspetz 1995, Young 1996, Bicchieri 2005, Bickhard 2008, Schotter 2008, Marmor 2009, Azzouni 2014, Guala 2016).

To say that a social phenomenon is “conventional” sometimes means little more than that it is social, or that something about the phenomenon is arbitrary, or a matter of choice. In social ontology, however, conventionalist theories are understood more precisely, following variants of David Lewis’s 1969 analysis of convention, or else following analyses of convention that challenge Lewis’s approach.

Lewis argues that conventions are solutions to coordination problems. In interactive situations that have more than one equilibrium—for instance, where it is rational for us all to drive on the left or for us all to drive on the right—conventions resolve the question of which actions to choose. In his analysis, convention does not require explicit or tacit agreement, but instead involves the possession of various attitudes by members of the community, including beliefs, knowledge, expectations, and preferences (see the entry on convention).

Among the critiques of Lewis-style conventionalist theories are: that many social phenomena do not appear to be solutions to coordination problems; that they are excessively mentalistic, involving a complex structure of beliefs, knowledge, expectations, and preferences of the population; and that they regard conventions as regularities in behavior having certain characteristics, so the analysis rules out as conventions anything that is not exemplified in behavioral regularity (see Burge 1975, Millikan 2005). The critiques, however, are complicated by the malleability of the notion of convention: it is not clear whether these should be regarded as difficulties for conventionalism or for Lewis’ analysis.

4.2.3 Collective attitudes and dispositions

Another prominent set of approaches is closely related to conventionalism, but instead of appealing to structures of individual attitudes, these approaches take the social world to be set up by collective attitudes and dispositions. (Some, though not all, of these accounts go on to analyze collective attitudes in terms of individual attitudes. See section 5.2.)

Hart 1961 proposes a sociological basis for certain kinds of rules—in particular, the rule regarding how valid laws are made in a society. A rule R, for Hart, is a rule in a society if two requirements hold: that members of the society behave in conformance to R, and that members of the society accept R as a standard of behavior in the society.

Searle 1995, 2010 proposes a theory of those social facts he calls “institutional facts.” At the center of Searle’s theory is what he calls a “status function.” Humans, argues Searle, have the capacity to impose functions onto things in the world, even if the things do not naturally perform that function. Things acquire the “status” of performing a function. To certain pieces of paper, for instance, we impose the status function of serving as a medium of exchange. What imposes these statuses is collective attitudes: our collective acceptance or recognition that they have those statuses. And without exception, argues Searle, status functions involve the imposition of “deontic powers”—i.e., rights, permissions, entitlements, duties, obligations, etc.—to things.

The status functions we impose on objects, and the deontic powers associated with them, can be expressed in a certain kind of rule—a “constitutive rule”—and these rules generally take the form “X counts as Y in C.” (For example: a line of stones (X) counts as having the status of functioning as a border wall (Y) in a village (C). Another example: a piece of paper issued by the Bureau of Engraving and Printing (X) counts as having the status of functioning as money (Y) in the United States (C).) So the way status functions get assigned, more specifically, is by the collective acceptance (or recognition) of a constitutive rule. And the process for putting the rule in place involves a particular kind of speech act—a declaration. Searle summarizes the picture as follows: “all of human institutional reality is created and maintained in existence by (representations that have the same logical form as) Status Function Declarations, including the cases that are not speech acts in the explicit form of Declarations.” (Searle 2010, p. 13)

Searle’s approach to the set-up of social facts can be understood as modifying a Hart-style approach in three ways. First, he augments Hart’s account of what it takes for members of a society to accept a rule: it requires collective attitudes, rather than the individual attitudes proposed by Hart (see 5.2 on collective attitudes). Second, he does not require that rules be implemented in behavior: institutional facts depend only on mental states in a society, not on practices. Third, he argues that the “constitutive rules” for institutional facts all share a common form and are all put in place by linguistic declarations. Tuomela (2002) advances a related collective acceptance theory of social entities.

4.2.4 Other mental states

Other approaches also see social categories as being set up by the distributed mental states of members of a society. Many of these theories are less specific about the particular states that individuals must be in. Husserl 1936, 1950 argues that how an individual represents an object depends, in part, on the presupposition that others are representing it as well. Individual empathy for the representations of others plays a part in how the individual herself constructs representations. The representations of objects in a society, therefore, are a product of harmonized mental states among its members. But these mental states are not required to be attitudes or dispositions. Other theorists associate different mental characteristics with structuring social categories. Berger and Luckmann 1966, for instance, regard the identification of people in a society with social roles as central to the characteristics of those roles.

4.3 Pattern Theories

Mentalistic theories of social categories, whether individualistic or social, are sometimes criticized for overly fictionalizing the social world. Some philosophers emphasize that social categories are routinely used in the social sciences: the categories support inductive inferences, can be assessed statistically, and have causal effects. Such theorists argue that social categories are “real kinds” in the world, much like water and gold are “natural kinds”. Some deny the distinction between social kinds and natural kinds altogether, even while seeking to retain a role for people in setting up social categories. Instead of regarding social kinds to be generated principally by mental states that we overlay on the world, they treat social kinds as products of patterns—often patterns of causes and effects—in the world.

4.3.1 Functional roles and realizers

Functionalism in social theory is predominantly an approach to social explanation, providing causal accounts for the existence and maintenance of social entities in terms of the functions they serve for society. Some functionalist theories also make ontological claims, arguing that the nature of social entities involves their functions.

A common theme in functionalism is that people are often unaware of the functions that their own activities perform. Merton 1957 distinguishes the “latent” functions of an activity from its “manifest” functions. In many contemporary societies, for instance, people choose whom to marry on the basis of strong romantic attachments. One function of this practice is the manifest function of promoting happy long-term relationships. This motivates individuals to marry for love. But, Merton argues, the practice also has an underlying goal (the latent function): to minimize the role of family in the selection of a mate, thus leading to a kinship structure with many marriages that join individuals from different communities. Functionalists, then, often disagree with theories that treat social phenomena as cognitively transparent to members of a society.

A function may figure into the ontology of a social kind K in any of several ways. The simplest is for K to be defined by a causal role R that its instances perform. In that case, K is a “causal role kind”. Take, for instance, the role serving to minimize the role of family in selecting a mate. Alternatively, certain social categories may better be understood as realizers of functional roles. A realizer-kind is often defined in terms of process or physical characteristics, where things that have those characteristics normally perform a role (see Block 1980, McLaughlin 2006).

As analyses of social functional kinds, both role-kinds and realizer-kinds have shortcomings. In particular, they miss out on the normative character of functions. Cummins 1975 analyzes functions in terms of the capacities of the components of a system to contribute to a capacity of a larger system. On his account, the function that an entity plays is sensitive to the context of the larger system in which it is embedded. Social kinds, then, may arise from components of social systems having particular Cummins-functions.

4.3.2 Teleofunctions and tokens

Millikan 1984 proposes a different approach to functional kinds, arguing that they arise from the successive copying or reproduction of new objects from older ones. A population of objects copied in the right way, and copied because they perform a function, form a “reproductively established family”. Millikan 1999, 2005 applies this account to linguistic and social kinds as well as biological ones. Millikan also analyzes social convention in terms of reproductively established families, and other theorists have recently applied her theory to artifacts (see section 5.5).

A significant contribution of Millikan’s approach is the constitutive role of particular tokens in the world in setting up the kinds of which they are members. In her approach, the kind marriage is partly set up by millions of particular marriages copied one from another in a reproductively established family. Particular marriages—the actual members of the kind—figure into setting up the kind marriage to have the membership conditions it does. Contrast this with a mentalistic account of the kind marriage. According to that sort of theory, particular marriages are members of the kind, and may play a causal role in triggering people to have certain attitudes. But it is the attitudes that define the kind; the tokens do not play an ontological role. Thus Millikan proposes a more “world-involving” and less mentalistic theory of how kinds are set up. Also see Burge 1986 for a similar insight.

4.3.3 Causal loops

Systems theorists in the 1940s and 1950s began to investigate feedback mechanisms of regulation and control, such as electronic circuits that loop their outputs back into their inputs in order to arrive at a stable equilibrium. Wiener 1948, 1950 applies this “cybernetics” to social systems, as do Mead et al. 1950–1956, Parsons 1951, Ashby 1956. Bateson 1972 elaborates these applications, describing social systems as involving homeostasis, i.e., mechanisms that self-correct to stabilize their properties.

Boyd 1999a applies homeostasis to the analysis of kinds, both natural and social. According to Boyd, kinds are clusters of entities that stably have similar properties, with these similarities sustained by a causal homeostatic mechanism. Marriage, for instance, is a kind because there are many particular entities with similar properties (such as being formed by ceremonies, involving couples paired up, and so on), and because there are mechanisms causing entities to have and keep these properties. Like Millikan, Boyd argues that kinds are a product of actual tokens in the world and the causal processes in which those tokens are involved. Since his account involves actual causal patterns over time, kinds are historical, but they do not need to involve functional roles or evolution. (See Bach 2022 on similarities between the approaches of Boyd and Millikan regarding social kinds.)

Hacking 1995 employs feedback mechanisms in a different way: rather than emphasizing stability, he regards causal change to be characteristic of “human kinds”. Hacking argues that human kinds are generated through histories of causal loops, in which objects having a cluster of properties are named as being members of a kind. That label then affects the property cluster that they have, which changes the classification, and so on repeatedly, with human interests changing the properties that get classified into the category. Hacking discusses the example of the kind refugee, in which categorizing people as refugees changes how they are treated, which then loops back to affect how we categorize refugees. In Hacking’s account, each loop includes a mentalistic aspect—the classification—and an instantiated aspect—the causal effects on the properties. Butler 1993 and Hayles 1999 develop accounts of the looping effects of classification systems on human bodies (see also Schilling 2001). Mallon 2003, 2016 combines the looping theories with homeostatic property clusters, and applies them to social kinds, races in particular; see also Tsou 2020.

4.4 Theories of Practice

A different large class of theories hold that practical engagement with the environment is the basis for the setup of social categories. Many of these theories are influenced by Heidegger 1927, Merleau-Ponty 1945, and Wittgenstein 1953. And still other theories are pluralistic and heterogeneous: they hold that social categories are not just set up in one uniform way, but in a variety of distinct ways.

Theories of practice were discussed in section 3.4.2, as theories of the constituents or parts of social phenomena. Dances, for instance, involve physical and mental routines: among the constituents of a foxtrot are people’s thoughts and actions on the dance floor. However, theories of practice are not so easily categorized. Particular tokens of dance routines might be understood as playing a dual role: not only are they the constituents of foxtrots, but they also are among the sources of the category foxtrot. In this respect, theories of practice share an insight with certain “pattern” theories (see sections 4.3.2 and 4.3.3): the tokens of the practices themselves do some of the work in structuring the social categories into which the practices fall. Giddens 1984 gives an account of what he calls “structuration”, the process by which social structures are dynamically generated by practices and also condition them. Sahlins 1981, 1985 describes the formation of cultural categories through collisions between cultures and the actions of individuals. Other theories as well, such as Foucault 1976, 1977a and Geertz 1973 can also be understood as giving accounts of how practices set up social categories.

Because practices are so general and play so many roles in these theories, it is a challenge to interpret them from the perspective of social ontology. It is hard to tease apart different kinds of ontological claims they make, and also hard even to know when these theories are making an ontological claim, as opposed merely to telling a narrative of causal influence. Some theories of practice insist on the importance of material routines in the world, and yet return to mentalistic-sounding accounts of the conceptual creation of the social world. The centerpiece of Bourdieu 1972 [1977], for instance, is the claim that social practice is generated by a “habitus”—a mentally internalized system of discrimination and perception, embodied as dispositions. (See also Ortner 1984, Haslanger 2016b).

4.5 Pluralistic and Heterogeneous Theories

As seen in the “pattern theories” discussed in section 4.3, approaches to biological and other scientific kinds are sometimes extended to social categories. Some participants in these debates, including Dupré 1995 and Hacking 2007, argue for a sweeping pluralism about scientific kinds: they contend that there are myriad kinds of kinds, and that it is an error to regard some kinds as more “natural” than others. Others argue for a more modest form of pluralism. Ereshefsky and Reydon 2015 argue that there are several distinct kinds of scientific kinds, including non-causal kinds, functional kinds, and heterostatic kinds. Along similar lines, many theorists of race argue for pluralism with respect to racial kinds: though contemporary race theorists deny “biological essentialism”, they argue that there are many ways racial kinds are constructed and used in contemporary societies (see section 5.4).

Epstein 2014a argues for modest pluralism about the ways social categories are set up. He introduces the term ‘anchoring’ to denote the setting up or putting in place of social categories or kinds. He proposes that all the theories discussed in section 4 are theories of anchoring, but denies that social categories are all anchored in the same way. Instead, there are various “anchoring schemas”. He cautions that we sometimes classify kinds according to how they are anchored, but not in all cases.

In addition to pluralism about anchoring schemas, he also argues that anchors are heterogeneous: even for a single anchoring schema, the anchors that feed into that schema—i.e., the facts that metaphysically set up a social category—are often diverse. Legal categories in the U.S., for instance, are anchored by facts such as jury instructions, trial results, legislative enactments, judicial interpretation, and environmental regularities. Even theories of practice, he argues, do not have the resources to accommodate this heterogeneity.

4.6 The Roles of Language

Many theories in social ontology assign a central role to language. In considering the relation between language and sociality, we should separate the following questions:

  1. Regarding the social nature of language: Is language private or public, mental or social or environmental? This is discussed in section 5.7.
  2. Regarding linguistic entities as constituents of social facts: Do certain social facts have linguistic components or building blocks? For instance, a speech act may be a component of an instance of a hate-crime. This is discussed in section 3.3.2.
  3. Regarding roles for language in setting up social categories: Is our language part of the metaphysical explanation for why we have the social categories we do, such as dollar, woman, or professor? This is the topic of the present section.

Answers to this third question can, in turn, be divided into two broad kinds of role for language: (a) social categories correspond to semantic values, or meanings, of words; (b) social categories are set up by speech acts, discourse, or other features of a community’s language.

4.6.1 Social ontology as a matter of semantics

‘Foxtrot’ is a word in the English language. In some semantic theories, the meaning of that word just is the social kind foxtrot: the semantic value of the word is identical with the social category. This may or may not imply that language plays a key role in social ontology. On a direct-reference theory of meaning (see Soames 1987, Kaplan 1989, Recanati 1993), it does not. That theory argues that we encounter the kind foxtrot in the world—a kind that is presumably socially constructed—and then connect the word ‘foxtrot’ to that kind. The inclusion of that word in our language does not have any metaphysical bearing on the category.

The same may apply even if the name has causal influence on the category foxtrot. Hacking 1995 argues that the term we apply to a category has an influence on our practices, which in turn changes the category. Even in this account, it is not clear that language has a metaphysical bearing on the category: the practices ontologically determine the contours of the category, and the uses of the word are merely one among many causal influences on those practices.

A number of philosophers argue that many debates in social metaphysics are “verbal disputes”, i.e., debates over terminology. And they further argue that verbal disputes are not substantive, in the sense that how they are resolved does not really have to do with the way things are in the world, but rather just with the linguistic labels we use for social categories (McGrath 2008, Chalmers 2011, Jenkins 2014, Barnes 2014, Ludwig 2015). Díaz-León 2022 argues against this distinction, holding that merely because a debate is verbal does not exclude it from being metaphysically substantive.

Whether or not some questions in social metaphysics really are semantic ones, there are grounds for thinking that at least some debates are not semantic. In particular, sociologists often discover social categories that have not been previously named, spoken of, or even conceptualized. This suggests that at least some of the metaphysics of the social world is not about linguistic labels.

4.6.2 Social categories set up by speech acts, discourse, features of language

Austin 1961, 1962 points out that language is not only reserved for describing states of affairs in the world. Certain utterances are “performative”: merely in uttering them, we establish facts in the world. A minister, for instance, marries a couple with an invocation. Searle 1995, 2010 argues that all “institutional facts” are generated in this way. Every constitutive rule, he argues, is a product of a declarative speech act, although he qualifies this by holding that some declarations may be replaced with attitudes that have the same function (Searle 2010). He expresses skepticism that, in such acts, we genuinely create new entities in the world, rather than merely taking attitudes towards “brute reality” (cf. Sider 2001, Effingham 2010). Thomasson 2003 argues on the contrary for the reality of entities generated with speech acts (cf. Wiggins 1980, Schiffer 2003).

Several theorists argue not just that particular social entities are produced by speech acts, but that the social world is the product of discourse more generally. This view has many historical antecedents in the enlightenment and post-enlightenment (Aarsleff 1982, Ricken 1994, and Forster 2010), as well as in the early twentieth century, such as Cassirer 1925 and Whorf 1944. But Wittgenstein 1953 is generally credited with crystallizing this “linguistic turn”. Winch 1958 draws on Wittgenstein to argue that “our language and our social relations are just two different sides of the same coin”. Social phenomena and their meanings, according to Winch, are manifestations of the “form of life” in which a society’s language-games are a part. This perspective has been influential in post-structuralism in particular, with a wide range of theories advocating the linguistic construction of social reality. Included among these are Foucault’s discourse analysis (Foucault 1984, 2001) and Butler (1988)’s treatment of the performativity of gender, with the speech acts that would appear to express gender actually being constitutive of gender identities. See Tannen, Hamilton et al. 2015.

Recent theories in post-structuralism have begun to de-emphasize language, partly as a result of critiques that such theories focus too little on human bodies and physical experience. The notion of “discourse” is also often expanded to include practical activities in the world (such as the “architectural discourse” of constructed spaces). Theories of discourse, construed in this way, are difficult to distinguish from more general theories of practice and heterogeneous theories.

5. Key Domains Addressed by Social Ontology

The preceding sections discuss general theories of social ontology. Informing these—and informed by them—is work on specific applications. The following sections briefly discuss prominent domains in social ontology to give a sense of the variety of these applications, to introduce some key topics, and to point to resources for further reading. Corresponding to each these sections is an entire subfield of philosophy and/or social science.

5.1 Social Groups

What are social groups? One debate in the literature concerns the kind of entities that social groups are: collections, classes, sets, fusions, structures, or some other kind of entity. It may seem natural to think of a group as a set of people in the mathematical sense. However, groups can persist through changes in membership, while sets are generally understood as having their members essentially (see Sharvy 1968, Ruben 1985, Uzquiano 2004, Sheehy 2006). Effingham 2010 proposes an account that identifies groups with complex sets, so that they can have different members at different times and at different worlds. Others (including Macdonald & Pettit 1981, Copp 1984, Sheehy 2006) argue that groups are mereological fusions of people. A problem with this is the transitivity of parthood: since Alice’s finger is a part of Alice, it follows from the fusion view that if Alice is a part of a group, then so is Alice’s finger. That is a problem, because while Alice is a member of the group her finger is not. These views also need to meet the challenge that there can distinct “coinciding” groups, i.e., groups that have the same members. (Gilbert 1989, 1996 and Uzquiano 2004 argue that there can be distinct groups whose members coincide for their entire duration; Epstein 2019a argues that there can be distinct groups whose members necessarily coincide for their entire duration.) Hawley 2017 defends the mereological view against these and other criticisms, and Strohmaier 2018 adds a condition to account for which parts are group members. López de Sa 2007, Korman 2015, and Horden and López de Sa 2021 argue that groups are simply pluralities of individuals, and Wilhelm 2020, 2022 argues that groups are fusions of pluralities. Richardson 2022 argues for a different response to the coincidence objection.

Another view is that groups are distinct from their material. Ritchie (2013, 2015, 2018, 2020) argues that groups are realizations of structures (see also Schmitt 2003a). Others argue that groups are distinct from their members but are constituted by them (Uzquiano 2004, Jansen 2009, Harris 2020). Fine 2020 builds on his theory of “embodiments” to develop a hylomorphic theory of groups, and Uzquiano 2020 develops a separate theory according to which groups are “plural embodiments.”

Different approaches to groups make different commitments with regard to the entities that should be included among the social groups—e.g., committees, teams, corporations, universities, nations, races, genders, red-haired people. Some theorists also propose that social groups must have certain distinctive characteristics, such as the members being in certain cognitive states or being subject to certain norms. Related to this is the question of whether there are distinct types of groups. Ritchie 2015 argues that there are two prominent types—organized groups, which are realizations of structured sets of nodes that stand in a functional relation to one another, and feature groups, which are collections of people who have a property or feature in common with one another. Thomasson 2019 argues that an important way of characterizing groups is in terms of the norms they bear. Epstein 2019a challenges simple typologies of groups and proposes a framework for the metaphysics of groups involving multiple dimensions.

5.2 Group Minds, Collective Intentionality, and Group Agency

Can groups take actions? Can they have intentions or beliefs? Can they bear responsibility? If so, how are these to be understood? Through much of the twentieth century ascriptions of intentions and actions to groups were widely regarded as either erroneous or else merely “summative”: that is, for a group to have an intention or take an action is merely for all the members of the group to have that intention or take that action (see Tollefsen 2015).

Schweikard and Schmid (see entry on collective intentionality) find more nuanced approaches in Scheler 1913 and Walther 1923. Scheler identifies various kinds of social entities, some of which involve people acting in solidarity, and Walther proposes an account of structured attitudes in terms of empathy. In the recent literature, Gilbert 1989, 1990 introduces new reasons for denying summative approaches: members of social groups are subject to norms that do not apply merely to individuals who have matching attitudes. If a couple is walking together to the store, one person violates a norm if she suddenly takes off in a different direction without excusing herself. But this would not violate any norms if collective intentions were merely summative. Gilbert argues that social groups, as opposed to mere collections of individuals, are formed by the members making joint commitments. She describes the formation of such commitments, and analyzes group attitudes in terms of them.

Bratman 1993, 2014 is more concerned with demystifying shared intentions by explaining how they can arise from individual attitudes. Instead of searching for a general analysis, he proposes sufficient conditions for the formation of shared intention, as applied to the case of “modestly social” groups. These are small, unstructured groups of people, in which all members participate knowledgably in coordination with one another. Bratman analyzes shared intention in terms of the common knowledge of group members, together with “meshing” intentions by group members to perform an action by way of the actions and plans of the other members. Bratman argues that the norms Gilbert observes can be derived from these interpersonal intentions together with standard moral obligations.

Tuomela and Miller 1988 and Searle 1990 account for group intention differently. Following Sellars (1968, 1980), they propose that there is an overlooked class of attitudes that individual people possess: in addition to “I-attitudes”, individuals also have “we-attitudes”. According to Searle, these are distinct primitive mental states. For a group to collectively intend J, according to Searle, is for all the members of the group to we-intend J. His view is somewhat similar to a “summative” view of group attitudes, except that collective attitudes are sums of we-attitudes rather than I-attitudes. Tuomela and Miller also distinguish attitudes in the “we-mode” from attitudes in the “I-mode”. The most unified form of group attitude, in their view, is made up of the members having we-mode attitudes. But for Tuomela and Miller, we-mode attitudes are not primitive, but are built out of more standard attitudes. They also admit different species of group attitudes, some of which are built of I-mode attitudes of group members, much like Bratman does. In recent years, psychologists and cognitive scientists have begun to investigate whether there are distinctively social attitudes (see Knoblich, Butterfill et al. 2011, Gallotti & Frith 2013, Tomasello 2014). Schmid 2023 argues that we-attitudes are attitudes of plural intentional subjects: just as there are individual subjects, there are plural subjects, and just as individuals have intentional attitudes, so do plural subjects.

In addition to collective intentions, other philosophers have worked on the analysis of many other attitudes, features, and activities of groups. (Analyses of “collective” and “shared” attitudes tend to stress collaboration and sharedness, while at least certain analyses of “group” attitudes include heterogeneous groups with members that are at odds with one another. And analyses of “joint” attitudes tend to focus on psychological interactions of pairs of individuals. But these distinctions are loose, and often elided in the literature.)

The literature on group belief addresses whether it is the sum of beliefs of group members, or else a matter of acceptance by group members, or if more is required, such as commitment or integration with other group attitudes. It also examines what it takes for group belief to be justified. (See Gilbert 1987, Wray 2001, Tollefsen 2002, McMahon 2003, Hakli 2006, List 2014, Lackey 2020, 2021, Backes 2021, de Ridder 2022.) Group knowledge is largely discussed in the literature on collective epistemology, see Lackey 2014, Brady and Fricker 2016. There is also increasing discussion of whether groups or collective agents can have emotions and/or reactive attitudes (see, for instance, von Scheve and Salmela 2014, Björnsson and Hess 2017, Thonhauser 2022).

Collective judgment and reasoning are by now large fields of inquiry; see entry on social choice theory and entry on belief merging and judgment aggregation. Similarly, there are many literatures on joint action and collective action. (Again, the terms “group,” “collective,” and “joint” are sometimes used interchangeably, sometimes not. Joint action, for instance, tends to be discussed in connection with cognitive psychology and the psychological states of pairs or small groups of individuals engaged in interactive activities, while collective action is often understood as larger in scale.)

Collective responsibility is also the topic of a burgeoning literature. Questions of whether groups can bear responsibility for their actions are closely tied to accounts of what it is for a group to take an action, as well as whether and how groups possess attitudes. See Jaspers 1961; Held 1970; French 1984, 1998; Arendt 1987; May 1992; Smiley 1992; Moody-Adams 1994; Gilbert 2000; Schwenkenbecher 2013; Collins 2019, 2023; entry on collective responsibility.

The analysis of collective attitudes raises questions about the nature of group minds more generally, and whether or not they are to be understood as extensions of individual properties applied to groups. A number of theorists take a functionalist approach to group minds and agency. On this approach, group agents or group cognitive systems are understood to function in a similar way as individuals do, at a certain level of description. A widely accepted theory of individual agency is that people have a modular system that we use to navigate the world. We have beliefs, knowledge, form intentions, plan, reason, and take action. All of these components can be described in terms of their functional contributions to the system, and they integrate with one another to perform unified functions. They compose, in other words, a “system of practical activity”. Group agency is understood on this model: for group agents, the same functional system is realized, but by groups or distributed systems rather than by individuals. (See Bratman 1987, 1993, 2014; List & Pettit 2011; Theiner & O’Connor 2010; Theiner 2014; Epstein 2022). List and Pettit argue that such realizers constitute new “loci of agency”, or “groups with minds of their own” (see also Ludwig 2016, 2017; Townsend 2020).

Others challenge group minds by arguing against functional treatments of mind altogether. Rupert 2014, for instance, argues that having phenomenal states is a requirement for intentionality, but that groups cannot have such states (see also Schwitzgebel 2015, List 2018). Other theorists object to the typical focus of this literature on small unstructured collectives of adults interacting with one another. They instead work on the attitudes of complex groups, corporations, and large-scale systems (Hutchins 1995, Huebner 2013). Questions of moral agency and corporate responsibility may also bear on how to analyze group agency and group minds (see French 1979, Tollefsen 2002, Pettit 2007, Hess 2010, List & Pettit 2011, Baddorf 2017).

5.3 Institutions, Organizations, and Firms

The nature of institutions, organizations, and firms is treated more extensively in sociology and economics than in philosophy. Coase 1937, 1960 pioneered the literature on firms in economics. In “The Nature of the Firm”, Coase examines the question of why firms exist at all: he argues that the function of firms is to lower transaction costs that would otherwise have to be incurred in forming contracts among individuals. Coase does not distinguish the question of the function of firms from the question of what firms are. But subsequent work engages more directly with ontological questions, including eliminativism about firms (Alchian & Demsetz 1972), the “nexus of contracts” view (Jensen & Meckling 1976), the “property rights” view (Grossman & Hart 1986, Hart & Moore 1990), and the “resource view” (Penrose 1959, Barney 1991, Conner & Prahalad 1996). It is generally seen as a requirement on theories of the firm that they explain not only why firms exist, but also that they account for the boundaries of firms and their internal organization, as well as explaining why they are better at “rent creation” than markets (Kraaijenbrink et al. 2010).

Work on firms is also tied to theories of in institutions in economics, spearheaded by Oliver Williamson, Douglas North, and Elinor Ostrom. Williamson 1979, 1981, 1996 popularized a Coase-style approach with theories of how institutional structures such as markets, hierarchies, multidivisional corporations, and alliances solve problems of transaction costs. Ostrom’s influential work on common pool resources treats institutions as sets of rules that communities put in place in order to change incentives and to induce socially beneficial choices. The “new institutional economics” program develops this largely game-theoretic understanding of institutions, tying them to analyses of the nature of conventions and norms (see Shepsle 1986; Sugden 1986; North 1990; Ostrom 1990, 1995; Binmore 1998; Schotter 2008; Guala 2016; Guala and Hindriks 2020; Jupille and Caporaso 2022).

Recent work in organizational sociology also focuses on systems of rules, with organizations analyzed in terms of their “institutionalized” features. Rather than the explicitly chosen rules discussed by economists, however, here systems of rules are regarded as tacit and non-intentionally followed (Powell & DiMaggio 2012). Sociological approaches have been developed for interpreting organizations, largely focused on causal explanations for their structure, power, and influence. Work on the nature of organizations in sociology often involves analyzing them in terms of social components or properties (see Clegg, Hardy et al. 1996, Scott 2014).

5.4 Race, Gender, and Disability

Much recent interest in social ontology has been sparked by new approaches to race, gender, disability, and related social categories. Historically, erroneous ontological claims have contributed to and been used to justify social oppression. Claims about the genetic nature of race, for instance, are historically tied to claims about intellectual, character, and cultural differences between racial groups. Likewise, claims about the nature of gender differences are historically tied to claims about how members of certain groups (e.g., women, men) ought to behave.

Early critical work on race and gender was largely focused on criticizing “biological essentialism” about these categories—e.g., the view that races have simple, natural, and heritable biological properties, such that every member of a racial group has that biological property. This should not be confused with a metaphysical claim that might be made by a social constructivist proposing a “social essence” of race or gender: for instance, a claim that membership in a racial group essentially involves identifying with other people for reasons of solidarity, or that it involves being descended from a historically and geographically situated population. Such a theorist would flatly deny “essentialism” in the old sense, which still analyzing the (social and/or socially set up) essential properties of the social category (see Phillips 2010 on senses of essentialism regarding social kinds).

In recent decades, a large variety of approaches to the ontology of race have been developed (see entry on race, section 2). Among the views are skepticism about race, varieties of social constructivism about race, and new versions of biological naturalism. Skeptics argue that biological essentialism in the old sense is inseparable from our racial categories, so debunking racist views implies that racial categories are an illusion: there are no races (Appiah 1985, 1994; Zack 1994, 1995). Constructivists maintain that races are social kinds without having simple biological essences. Among these are historico-geographic theories, genetic-bundle theories, identity theories, politico-cultural theories, etc. (see Taylor 2000, Bernasconi & Lott 2000, Zack 2002, Glasgow 2009, Jeffers 2013, 2019; Haslanger 2019). Naturalists hold that although simple biological theories are false, racial differences can be identified using the methods of population biology (Andreasen 1998, Kitcher 2007, Hardimon 2012; see also Kaplan & Winther 2014, Spencer 2019). In the face of competing conceptions of race, some theorists propose pluralism about race-like kinds (Hochman 2013, McPherson 2015). In many theories of race, bi-racialism and multi-racialism have been treated as boundary or marginal cases. Others argue, on the contrary, that multiracialism is central to the construction of racial categories (see Alcoff, Sundstrom et al. 2016).

These theories raise interesting questions for social ontology more generally. In what cases is it warranted to be skeptical about the existence of kinds? What are the implications of a discovery that historical assumptions about kinds are mistaken, or are morally wrong? To what extent can we make sense of, or defend, pluralism about the nature of kinds, and to what extent is pluralism to be resisted? Especially with regard to politically important kinds, is it possible to give a purely descriptive account of their nature, or does a correct account of the ontology of kinds necessarily involve normative considerations? And another challenging question is whether theories ought to more sharply distinguish the constituents or building blocks of racial kinds from the sources or construction of those kinds (that is, corresponding to section 3 and section 4 above).

In some ways, questions pertaining to the metaphysics of sex and gender resemble those pertaining to race: historically, descriptive and normative categories were conflated in simplistic biological theories (Gould 1973–4). An important difference between sex/gender and race, however, concerns the distinction between sex and gender (Beauvoir 1949, West & Zimmerman 1987). Many theorists propose that sexes are biological categories and that genders are categories of social norms and behaviors that are traditionally attached to sexes. However, other theorists argue that it is incorrect to regard sex as biological (Fausto-Sterling 2000, Butler 2004). Thus in the case of sex/gender, there are arguably multiple socially constructed categories that interact with one another; and some theorists reject the distinction between sex and gender (see entry on feminist perspectives on sex and gender, entry on feminist metaphysics, and entry on feminist perspectives on trans issues).

A question pertaining to racial and gender categories alike is whether these are descriptively adequate categories in the first place. Many of the political phenomena associated with differential treatment of groups and oppression cut across lines of race, gender, and class. Some theorists of intersectionality argue that it is misleading to regard standard gender and racial groups as if they were unified (see Crenshaw 1991, McCall 2005, Jones 2014, Bernstein 2020).

A central problem in the ontology of race, gender, and other categories is that how we categorize not only has ethical implications, but is affected by ethically-laden facts. Some theorists challenge the idea of a purely descriptive analysis of such groups. Others propose that there can be descriptive analyses, but that such analyses are a stepping stone to ethically preferable categories. Haslanger 2000, 2012, Jenkins 2016, 2023 and Dembroff 2016 argue for the “ameliorative” analysis of gender categories. Part of the role of social ontology, on these views, is to analyze the concepts and categories that are “operative” in a social system, but an equally important aim is to explore how we might otherwise construct social categories with the aim of social improvement (see entry on feminist philosophy of language, section 2.3). Barnes 2016 argues for an ameliorative account of disability (see entry on disability: definitions, models, experience).

5.5 Artifacts and Artworks

The term ‘artifact’ denotes a broad class of objects that are products of human activity. The paradigmatic examples are tools, such as wheels, knives, and cups, but the category of artifacts includes more complex objects as well, such as cars, houses, and computers. Some theorists conceive of artifacts broadly enough that the category includes nearly all social entities, from hammers to Hamlet.

The standard rough characterization of an artifact is that it is an object created for some purpose, or to perform some function (see Hilpinen 1992a, Dipert 1993; entry on artifact). The simplest version is that something is an artifact just in case it is made by an individual having the intention that it perform some particular function. To be an artifact, on this characterization, does not require that it actually perform the function: something can be a chair, for instance, even if it is no good for sitting on. Similarly, just because something performs a function does not mean that it is an artifact, on this account: a rock might function as a hammer, or as a paperweight, without its being an artifact.

Every aspect of this characterization is contested in the literature. Are intentions necessary? Are they sufficient? Do they need to be intentions regarding functions, or can they be other kinds of intentions? Will other mental states do, and can there even be artifacts that do not involve mental states? Do artifacts depend on the intentions (or other mental states) of individuals, or can their mind-dependence be social? Do they need to be made, or can they be found? Do they need to perform functions? Do these requirements—whatever they turn out to be—apply to tokens of artifactual kinds, or are they somehow characteristic of artifactual kinds without being requirements on the tokens?

Koslicki 2018, Ch. 8 provides a useful overview of recent alternatives to these questions and their challenges. She divides them into views that formulate artifact-essences in terms of (i) maker’s intentions (e.g., Thomasson 2003, 2007), (ii) creative acts (e.g., Evnine 2016), and (iii) primary intended functions (e.g., Baker 2004, 2007; Millikan 1984; Elder 2007); and then contrasts these with anti-essentialist approaches (e.g., Sidelle 2009, Sullivan 2017, Waters 2017). We might also add theories that regard the intentions of the user, rather than of the maker, as central (e.g., Keil, Greif et al. 2007; Preston 2009, 2013). A good deal of recent literature continues inquiry into intentional and functional essences of artifacts, including the articles in Franssen, Kroes et al. 2014, Bahr et al. 2019, as well as Eaton 2020, Irmak 2021, and Juvshik 2021.

In sorting through these alternatives, it is useful to distinguish what is claimed about the “building” relations in question (see section 2.2), especially claims of ontological dependence versus ontological determination of artifact-kinds and artifact-instances. An under-explored topic is the sources or social construction of artifact-kinds (along the lines of Section 4 of this entry), though see Goehr 1992 on historicism and musical kinds.

Theories of artifacts draw from the literature on the ontology of art (see, for instance, Bloom 1996, Levinson 2007, Mag Uidhir 2013), and from the literature on technology and tools (see Arthur 2009, Kroes 2012). Many theories of artworks regard them to be kinds of artifacts (see Eaton 1969, Iseminger 1973, Hilpinen 1992b, Thomasson 1999). Problems in the ontology of art include the ontological categories into which artworks fall, the unity or diversity of kinds of entities within artistic domains and across domains (e.g., in painting, sculpture, music, dance), the individuation of particular artworks, the definition of art in general, and the dynamic changes in artistic categories. See entries on the definition of art, history of the ontology of art, the philosophy of music, the philosophy of dance, conceptual art, and the philosophy of digital art, and the philosophy of technology.

Theories of artifacts are also being applied to a number of other domains in social ontology. There are growing literatures, for example, on laws and legal systems as artifacts (see section 5.7 below), and software and programming languages as artifacts (Irmak 2012, Turner 2014).

5.6 Money

Menger 1892 tells a story of the emergence of money from trading practices. For a society to come to have money, Menger argues, it is not required that anyone in the society made a choice to adopt a medium as money. Instead, in the course of transactions in the marketplace, the marketability of certain goods will tend to increase, and as a result, these goods acquire a degree of “money-character”. Money, in Menger’s view, is simply a good that is highly marketable in transactions, and therefore highly liquid.

The centerpiece of Menger’s account is the non-intentional emergence of money (see Aydinonat 2008, Tieffenbach 2010). But his account also gives an implicit theory of the nature of money. Money is a simple causal-role kind, with any good that is highly liquid and marketable being money. Introductory economics textbooks tend to define money as a slightly more complicated role-kind: money is a store of value, a medium of exchange, and a unit of account (Arnold 2008, Mankiw 2016). Recent work in economics suggests a different set of functions for money. A striking feature of standard economic models is that money seems superfluous. In idealized neo-classical economies, there is no need for a medium of exchange, nor is it clear why price levels should affect the “real economy” of production and consumption. Thus economists have recently investigated the economic “frictions” that make money useful, and find that money contributes to efficiency in a market that has imperfect enforceability of contracts and limited record-keeping. In such an economy, money helps perform operations such as the search for trading partners. The overcoming of such economic “frictions” seems to be an alternative and perhaps underlying function of money. (See Diamond 1984, Kiyotaki & Wright 1989, Kocherlakota 1998, Wright 2010, Smit, Buekens et al. 2016.)

These discussions imply that money is a causal-role kind of some sort. This is questionable, however: such a definition fails to accommodate tokens of money that fail to perform those roles (such as a coin buried in the ground). Instead, money may be better understood as a different sort of functional kind, or perhaps as an artifactual kind (see section 5.5). Alternatively, the nature of money may not involve its functions at all. Aristotle (Politics 1.8–10) notes that there are several distinct functions performed by money, each of which would naturally have its own essence; but he points out that we use the same medium for all of these. The money in any given society, he argues, is a product of agreement in that society.

A story is sometimes told of a historical progression from barter to the use of “commodity money” (such as gold, cowrie shells, or beads) to the use of “fiat money” (such as government-issued paper currency) (see Searle 1995, McEachern 2011). Searle argues that all kinds of money are “institutional kinds”, which he analyzes in terms of the collective assignment of a function to a substrate. Commodity money, in his view, involves assignment to a good with some intrinsic value, while fiat money involves assignment to a piece of paper printed by the government. A number of recent discussions of the metaphysics of money debate the centrality of collective belief or acceptance to money (for challenges, see Maki 2020, Guala 2020; for defenses, see Papadapoulos 2015, Vooys and Dick 2019. See also Brynjarsdottir 2018, Sandberg and Hindriks 2020, entry on philosophy of money and finance).

Historians of money and monetary theorists divide kinds of money along more nuanced dimensions. A few historical cases may qualify as fiat money, such as in Ming dynasty China, revolutionary France, and the American Confederacy, but these were fragile and subject to collapse (Yang 1952, Ferguson 2008, Spang 2015). But many contemporary approaches emphasize the role of private interactions in the creation of money, and importantly, reserve banking as well as credit and debt markets (see Desan 2014). Other theories emphasize the role of the state, and in particular the central roles of interest-rate-setting institutions, government debt, and the collection of taxes (see Friedman & Schwartz 1963, Kaldor 1985, Moore 1988, Deleplace & Nell 1996). In these approaches, questions about the “substance” of money become rather peripheral.

Some controversies persist on the substance of money. It was part of historical debates over the gold standard and “bimetallism”, and more recently there has been philosophical discussion of electronic money (Smith & Searle 2003) and “cryptocurrencies” such as bitcoin (see Passinsky 2021; Bailey et al., 2021).

5.7 The Law

Many important questions in social ontology are connected to jurisprudence, or the study of the nature of law itself. Consider a given legal obligation or prohibition in a locality, such as a U.S. federal law on reporting requirements for public corporations, or a state law governing medical reimbursements. Lawyers and judges mainly work on specific applications of such laws, such as whether a particular corporation satisfying a particular reporting requirement. In certain circumstances lawyers and judges investigate and interpret the content of the law, such as whether some provision is incompatible with the Constitution.

The study of the nature of law is distinct from these. It can be divided into two principal inquiries, corresponding to the division between the “constituents” and “sources” discussed in sections 3 and 4. The first inquiry examines what determines or grounds the content of laws in general, within a legal system. For instance, is the content of a law exhaustively determined by the statutes recorded in the legal code? Or is that only a part of what determines the content of a law? Other candidate contributors to the content of a law are historical judicial interpretations, jury decisions, patterns of practices, legislative actions and intentions, executive statements, general legal principles, and moral principles. Hart (1961) casts this question as the inquiry into the “rule of recognition” in a legal system: that is, what conditions a proposition needs to satisfy in order for it to be a law (see also Dworkin 1967, 1978, 1986; Greenawalt 1986; Shapiro 2007, 2009).

A second question is: What are the sources of these contributors to the content of the law? In virtue of what do texts or enactments or interpretations or moral considerations figure into grounding the content of a nation’s laws? Positivist theories hold that social practices and other sociological facts are the sources of legality; anti-positivist theories argue instead that legality is rooted, at least in part, in morality, and that legal standards are independent of human decision and practice. A central problem for any theory of the sources of law is the authority, or bindingness, which law carries (if it does carry these). See the articles in J.L. Coleman, Shapiro, & Himma 2002, as well as entries on the nature of law, natural law theories, legal positivism, and the economic analysis of law.

In the last few years, a number of theorists have begun to approach these problems as inquiries into the “grounding” or “ontological determination” of law. These theories aim to develop a better understanding of the making of law, as well as the nature of legal normativity, and to clarify the debates over positivism and anti-positivism. See Greenberg 2014; Epstein 2015 Ch. 7, Plunkett 2012; Chilovi and Pavlakos 2019, 2022; Chilovi 2020.

Others in the last few years have worked to understand law in terms of other social ontological categories. Shapiro 2011 draws on Bratman’s work on shared intention and on planning theories of intention to develop a theory of legal systems as plans. Others are applying theories of function and of artifacts to the nature of law (e.g., Ehrenberg 2015, 2016; Mihal 2017; Burazin et al. 2018; Burazin et al. 2022).

Other issues in the ontology of law pertain to the nature of entities that pervade the law, such as contracts (Fried 1981, Barnett 1985, Hart & Holmstrom 1986), promises (Scanlon 1990, Kolodny & Wallace 2003, Owens 2006, Shiffrin 2008), and torts (J.L. Coleman 1982, 1983, Postema 2001). The law also plays a central role in setting up certain social categories, such as marriage and corporations. Marriage is tightly regulated by the law in many cultures. Does the law define what marriage is, or is marriage set up wholly or in part by social practices? Likewise for corporations: does the law have a privileged role in determining what types of corporations exist in a modern society, or are corporations products of social and economic systems? (See section 5.3.)

Social ontology also has implications for the practice of lawmaking and adjudication. Theorists of corporate liability, for instance, investigate the nature of corporate agency and responsibility, and the relation between these and the agency and responsibility of individual people connected to the corporation (French 1984, Fisse & Braithwaite 1993, Erskine 2003, Gobert & Punch 2003, Pettit 2007). The law is also often called on to adjudicate ontological questions, such as whether goods of a certain kind fall under a clause of a trade agreement, or whether a particular act is an instance of a criminalized activity.

5.8 Language and Linguistic Objects

Whether or not language is social in nature was one of the earliest topics in social ontology (see section 1.1 and the history supplement section A.1). Much work in linguistics and the philosophy of language involves claims and assumptions about the nature of linguistic entities, such as linguistic rules, components of the language faculty, and semantic content. Theories of the nature of language and meaning are also influential models for the metaphysics of other social entities (such as artifacts, institutions, and laws).

The most conspicuous debate about the “nature of language”—namely, the debate over innateness—does not have much to do with the metaphysics of language. But Chomsky 1986 does take an explicit position on the nature of language and its ontological building blocks. He argues that linguistics is the science of “I-languages”—i.e., internalized languages, the mental rules of grammar, phonology, and so on, that individuals use in expressing themselves or understanding the utterances of others. He rejects “E-languages”—externalized or public languages like English, Chinese, and Khosa—as unscientific fictions. Others disagree on various grounds. Katz and Postal 1991 share Chomsky’s view that each person has his or her own language, but argue that languages are abstract or mathematical entities rather than psychological ones (see also Higginbotham 1991). Wittgenstein 1953 and his successors have a more substantive disagreement: Wittgenstein denies the possibility of a “private language” altogether, arguing that language is a matter of engagement of people with one another and with the world. Other philosophers have argued for the publicity and externality of language on a variety of grounds, including the communicative basis of language, the nature of rules, and theories of semantic content (see Kripke 1972, 1982; Schiffer 1972; Lewis 1975; Putnam 1975; Burge 1979; Brandom 1994; Dummett 1989; and entries on theories of meaning, externalism about mental content, names, and the normativity of meaning and content).

Theories of words, phonemes, and other linguistic entities are tied to the metaphysics of language more generally, but also are subjects of separate inquiries. The extent to which these are questions for social ontology, rather than, say, the metaphysics of psychological states, depends in part on whether and how language is public. Kaplan 1990, for instance, argues that words are entities extended over time and across a population: “utterances and inscriptions are stages of words, which are the continuants made up of these interpersonal stages”. This approach is in contrast to type-token theories, some of which regard word-types to be socially individuated, and others individualistically individuated (see Hugly & Sayward 1981, Bromberger 1989, McCulloch 1991, Cappelen 1999, Wetzel 2009, Hawthorne & Lepore 2011). In recent years, a number of other proposals have been put forward, regarding the ontological category into which words fit. Szabo 1999 argues that they are representations (which he in turn understands as a sort of artifact), Irmak 2019 that they are abstract artifacts, Nefdt 2019 that they are positions in linguistic structures, and Miller 2021b that they are homeostatic property cluster kinds.

Speech acts make up another domain in which social factors are plausibly constitutive. Austin 1962 and Searle 1969 argue that the force of any speech act is a product of a social convention pertaining to speech acts of that type. Others use an “intentionalist” approach, in which the force of a speech act is a product only of the intentions of the speaker. Yet others argue that this force is a product of the uptake by hearers in addition to speaker intentions (see Strawson 1964, Bach & Harnish 1979, Clark & Carlson 1982, García-Carpintero 2004a, and entries on speech acts, assertion).


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