Critical Philosophy of Race
The field that has come to be known as the Critical Philosophy of Race is an amalgamation of philosophical work on race that largely emerged in the late 20th century, though it draws from earlier work. It departs from previous approaches to the question of race that dominated the modern period up until the era of civil rights. Rather than focusing on the legitimacy of the concept of race as a way to characterize human differences, Critical Philosophy of Race approaches the concept with a historical consciousness about its function in legitimating domination and colonialism, engendering a critical approach to race and hence the name of the sub-field. Critical Philosophy of Race has also departed from broadly liberal approaches that have narrowed racism to individual and intentional forms.
Thus, the Critical Philosophy of Race offers a critical analysis of the concept as well as of certain philosophical problematics regarding race. In this approach, it takes inspiration from Critical Legal Studies and the interdisciplinary scholarship in Critical Race Theory, both of which explore the ways in which social ideologies operate covertly in the mainstream formulations of apparently neutral concepts, such as merit or freedom. While borrowing from these approaches, the Critical Philosophy of Race has a distinctive philosophical methodology primarily drawing from critical theory, Marxism, pragmatism, phenomenology, post-structuralism, psychoanalysis, and hermeneutics, even while subjecting these traditions to critique for their omissions in regard to specifically racial forms of domination and the resultant inadequacy of their conceptual frameworks (Outlaw 1996; Allen 2016; Weheliye 2014; Alcoff 2006).
The main problems addressed by the Critical Philosophy of Race concern the social and historical construction of races, the structural and systemic nature of racist cultures, the relevance of race to formations of selfhood, the mutual constitution of race and class as well as other categories of identity, and the question of how to assess the existing canon of modern philosophy.
- 1. Introduction:
- 2. Phenomenologies of Race and Racism
- 3. The Construction of Racial Identities
- 4. The Question of Causes: Capitalism or Culture
- 5. Reconstituting the History of Philosophy
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
Modern European philosophers played a key role in the development of the concept of race as a way to characterize, and rank, differences among human groups (Bernasconi 2018; Valls 2005; Ward and Lott 2002; Bernasconi and Lott 2000). Philosophers in the modern era (roughly from 1600 to 1900) often disagreed on the nature of race, the source of racial differences, and the correlations between race and non-physical characteristics. Kant, Rousseau and Mill, for example, disagreed over the critical issue of whether racial differences were mutable (Kant 2012; Elden and Mendieta 2011; Boxill 2005). Defining race in terms of underlying biological features emerged well after the language of race had become familiar. The biology of race continues to elicit controversy over whether it has explanatory value (Kitcher 2007; Spencer 2015, ; Glasgow et al. 2019).
The Critical Philosophy of Race (CPR) developed in large part as a critique of modern ideas and approaches to both race and proffered solutions to racism. In this, CPR was influenced by the late 20th century developments of Critical Legal Studies (CLS) and Critical Race Theory (CRT) (Unger 2015; Delgado 1995; Delgado and Stefancic 1997; Essed and Goldberg 2002). CLS and CRT were motivated to go beyond questions of formal equality and de jure discrimination to consider the subtle and broad reach of racist ideas and practices throughout social life and institutions, arguing, for example, that norms of neutrality in legal interpretation or reasoning often concealed structural racism.
While borrowing from CLS and CRT, CPR’s distinctive philosophical interests concern the role racialization plays in embodiment, subjectivity, identity formation as well as formations of power and the establishment of meaning. In order to reach beyond Eurocentric philosophical resources CPR has drawn from anti-colonial writings as well as critical work in sociology, history, psychology and other fields that have addressed the topic of race and racism more thoroughly than philosophy (e.g. Mallon and Kelly 2012; Steele 2011; Feagin 2013; Horne 2020).
1.1 Critical Legal Studies
The influential field of Critical Legal Studies, or CLS, that emerged in the 1970s played an important role in developing new approaches to the study of how the law affects and is affected by social domination. Influenced by some strands in continental philosophy, CLS scholars showed how legal arguments and concepts could covertly support existing power relations (Douzinas 2000). Early CLS scholars such as Duncan Kennedy (2008) and Roberto Magabeira Unger (2015) argued that the pattern of social effects produced by legal decisions indicates that the law is not an impartial arbiter but largely an arm of existing hierarchies.
To see this required new methods of legal analysis that could discern patterns of implicit assumptions operating across the major paradigms of legal reasoning, whether intentionalist, textualist, or originalist. One such assumption is the centrality and legitimacy of stare decisis or judicial precedent. CLS argued for setting precedent aside in order to judge decisions in relation to their often disparate impact on different groups. They argued that these differential impacts were often the result of unexamined assumptions structuring legal argumentation, such as the assumption that responsibility must track conscious intent, or that male power over women is natural, or that equality claims must be based on sameness.
CLS scholars argued that conventions of legal analysis promulgated mystifying ideologies that obscured the law’s social embeddedness and political function. They argued that we need to take a new look at the concepts of liberalism such as rights, neutrality, and freedom to see whether these concepts were as universally applicable as some claimed. Laws and policies based on liberal ideas, such as meritocracy, exacerbated class and racial inequality and injustice. Liberal approaches led to these outcomes because they downplayed differences of history and embodiment and assumed the fungibility of roles such as citizen or rights-holder (Mills 2017).
The emergence of classical liberalism coincided with the development of brutal forms of capitalism, a decrease in women’s property rights, and race-based slavery, colonization, and genocide. Was liberalism simply negligent, or did its central concepts play a role in sanctioning social oppression? Progressives like John Stuart Mill tied the right of self-determination to cultural advance, thus justifying colonial administrations. John Locke’s labor theory of value helped to legitimate the expropriation of indigenous lands on the grounds that many groups relied more on hunting than labor-intensive agriculture. Reading the central arguments of liberalism in light of their diverse impact on different groups raised new questions about liberalism’s relationship to domination.
The work of legal theorist Derrick Bell was key in bringing a CLS approach to the topic of race. Bell developed a series of interpretive arguments focused on the reforms won by civil rights cases to show that the successes were generally contained to those that did not threaten white entitlement (Bell 1987). Corporate elites used the mandate for diversity, for example, as a means to create a diverse managerial class more effective at controlling the broad multi-racial low-paid workforce. When establishing racism required evidence of intentional attitudes or conscious conspiracies, it was all but impossible to redress cross generational wealth disparities based on race or the structural forms of anti-black racism so deeply embedded in such institutions as education, the justice system, health care, housing, and the local, state and national organizations intended to serve democratic representation. Thus, civil rights reforms left racism “firmly entrenched,” as Bell put it (1987, 4). Forced to work with liberal concepts, progressive civil rights legislation ended up providing cover for the continuation of racial divides in housing, wage scales, and education while the criminal justice system has become even more lethal to Black and Brown populations.
1.2 Critical Race Theory
CPR also draws from Critical Race Theory, or CRT. Like CLS, CRT scholars have been concerned to critique liberalism as the hegemonic ideology of the West, but they pursue a more interdisciplinary approach. CRT scholars argued that solutions that stay within the bounds of liberalism are insufficient because “racialized power” is embedded “in practices and values which have been shorn of any explicit, formal manifestations of racism” (Delgado 1995, xxix). Moreover, liberals often argue that any form of “race consciousness” is racist, with the result that anti-racist reforms, such as affirmative action or housing subsidies, must prove allegiance to the doctrines of abstract individualism and present race-conscious reforms as temporary deviations from the normative ideals of neutrality. Liberal ideals that imagine individuals abstractly outside of their historical and social context thwart efforts to address the effects of historical legacies on current social relations, property distributions, group welfare and security, and the determination of merit.
In an influential article, CRT scholar Richard Delgado shows that the academic scholarship that pursues anti-racist ends is hobbled by an incapacity in effective self-reflection. In 1984 Delgado set out to find the top twenty law review articles on civil rights—those most often cited, those published in the most well-established journals—and found that all were written by white men. There was an “elaborate minuet” of exclusively internal engagement within this grouping over the best means to move forward on racial justice (1995, 47). Their arguments were strong, but how could it be, Delgado wondered, that even an idea such as having a “withered self-concept” would be best represented in the work of white authors citing other white authors rather than the important work by people of color on the phenomenal effect of racist societies? When he asked the author of one article on this topic why theorists such as W. E. B. Du Bois, Kenneth Clark, Frantz Fanon or others were not cited, the author explained that he preferred the source he cited because it was “so elegant.” Criticism directed at the origin of intellectual work continues to be considered a suspect species of ad hominem argument, making concerns about the politics of citation appear illegitimate. Yet can white writing achieve sufficiency in a matter such as self-esteem that involves first person experience? The problem here, from Delgado’s perspective, was that ruling out considerations of social identity in the development of intellectual work diminished the quality of that intellectual work, but in a way that liberal premises could never reveal.
Connected to this has been the ongoing problem of the conceptualization of “merit.” If normal hiring or publications decisions are viewed as generic, without considerations of the social identity of the candidate, then preferential hiring is a deviation from the norm and must meet a high bar to establish even temporary legitimacy. But both CLS and CRT have endeavored to show that merit-based decisions often promulgate implicit racism. Judging which are the top articles by the number of their citations may look to be a neutral standard, but it in fact perpetuates injustice while concealing that injustice.
1.3 Philosophical Influences on CPR
Critical Philosophy of Race, then, has followed in this critical tradition of considering the varied and subtle forms in which race operates in the development, debate, and assessment of philosophical ideas and arguments. Although many make use of Anglo-American and analytic philosophical approaches, what distinguishes the work in CPR from the general work in philosophy of race is its use of figures and traditions of philosophy in what is sometimes called the “continental” sphere. For example, as will be discussed below, David Theo Goldberg (1993) and Cornel West (1982) have both made productive and creative use of Michel Foucault’s analysis of power and power/knowledge; Lewis Gordon (1995a; 1995b, 2000) and George Yancy (2008) developed new phenomenological approaches to the study of racism by drawing from and building upon the work of Jean-Paul Sartre and Frantz Fanon; and others have found resources in Jacques Derrida, Maurice Merleau-Ponty, Simone de Beauvoir, Friedrich Nietzsche, Herbert Marcuse, Jurgen Habermas, Martin Heidegger, and Sigmund Freud. To be sure, each of these European continental philosophers exhibited some of the same patterns of racial ignorance rife in the general canon of Western philosophy and have come under critical debate themselves within CPR. Yet the continental tradition paid productive attention to embodiment, socially variable rather than universal modes of perception, the link between power and concept formation, and thus contributed new ways to think about the covert background structures that affect democracy.
Continental philosophy has also begun to critique its own artificially narrow canon and to include more prominently the writings of Frantz Fanon, Edouard Glissant, W. E. B. Du Bois, Edward Said, Kwame Nkrumah, Gayatri Spivak, and others who were more centrally concerned with, and acutely perceptive about, issues of race.
In a recent innovative move to approach the history of philosophy differently, some CPR scholars are “creolizing” canonical figures to foreground their reception in the colonized world (Gordon and Roberts 2015; Monahan 2017). Rousseau for example had a major influence on Caribbean thought, and reading Rousseau through Fanon, C.L.R. James, and others has produced new interpretive insights as well as new critical dialogues. These “illicit blendings” can bring questions of slavery, colonialism and race into the forefront of discussions that continue to engage the European modern tradition but in new ways (Bernabé et al. 1990). By expanding the sphere of interlocutors in debates over freedom or human dignity, we can also come to engage a wider plurality of philosophical concepts and, in effect, creolize the canon.
To suggest that CPR has a singular methodology would be a mistake: discourse analysis, psychoanalysis, and phenomenology have conducted a famous war against one another, and do not share a methodology. And yet what one finds on this side of the ledger of philosophical discussions of race are a notable body of differences in the topics of analysis; for example, unlike in analytic philosophy of race, there is little attention to the question of whether the category of race is scientifically viable, whether we should eliminate the racial terms, and perhaps regrettably, there is little attention to the debates over concrete policies to redress racism, such as affirmative action or reparations.
In general, Critical Philosophers of Race focus on how race operates in societies, the effects of race at both the structural and phenomenological levels, and the ways in which some forms of resistance to racial systems can be recuperated into sustaining the status quo. Race as a category is subject not so much to biological debate as genealogical analysis, which makes it possible to see how, as Falguni Sheth argues, the central issue is not the fact of the division of human beings into diverse groups, but the identification of racialized peoples as unruly or a priori threats to the body politic (Sheth 2009, 35). Just as Muslims are assumed to be terrorists until proven otherwise, so all non-white groups must prove their right to inclusion, their right to have rights. This suggests a different problematic than a decontextualized approach to the reference of racial concepts.
2. Phenomenologies of Race and Racism
Phenomenology was one of the first philosophical resources that CPR began to use to explore racial effects on experience, subjectivity, and social relations. Although Existentialism and Phenomenology are philosophical approaches founded by European philosophers who tended to ignore race, the questions that these traditions focused on from the beginning, concerning anguish and responsibility, freedom, temporality, and a prefigured social imaginary, have been of profound concern to the development of the Critical Philosophy of Race (Gordon 1995a, 1997; Lee 2014, 2019; Yancy 2008; Ngo 2017).
Edmund Husserl initially developed the phenomenological method as a way to foreground and critique what he called “the natural attitude”: the unexamined background that helps constitute how we experience the world (Husserl 1939 ). The phenomenological method as Husserl imagined it would put this natural attitude in brackets, allowing for the possibility of a greater self-awareness through a transformed mode of interacting with the world. Contemporary phenomenologists are increasingly concerned with the social structures that produce and reinforce natural attitudes as well as with habits of understanding that can render our worlds comforting and predictable (see e.g. Weiss, Murphy, and Salamon 2019). There is also an increased focus on working through the specificity of differently embodied perspectives, or natural attitudes that are correlated to specific group identities. For example, recent work in the phenomenology of race has developed an analysis of the formation of specific first-person experiences within racist societies, such as an experience of fear that feels natural but is caused by racist projections.
In the mid-20th century, Jean-Paul Sartre, Simone de Beauvoir, Frantz Fanon, and Richard Wright began to consider the ways in which perception, embodiment, relations with others, experiences of one’s temporal existence, as well as the way one conceptualizes the natural and social worlds could all be substantively affected by racial identities, even if this was latent and unarticulated (Sartre 1946 ; Beauvoir 1954 ; Fanon 1952; Wright 1940). Fanon took up the question of black embodiment in anti-black societies, in which one’s actions would be interpreted by others against the backdrop of racist cultural images, curtailing agency and foreclosing individualism as well as the recognition of one as a meaning-making subject. An anticipation of anti-black responses suffuses one’s everyday life. Sartre considered the ways in which colonization had created a situation in which the structural violence of colonizers was obscured and the resistance of the colonized was perceived as irrational. Beauvoir reflected on how her white identity restricted the possibilities of relations with others, reframing the meanings of her intended actions in ways that would reinforce racism. And throughout his novels Wright explored the changed possibilities for self-making that were beginning to emerge for black people with the demise of legal segregation.
Inspired by this work, new existential categories were developed by Lewis Gordon (1995a, 1997), Paget Henry (2000), Robert Birt (1997), Jonathan Judaken (2008), Gertrude James Gonzalez (1997) and others to provide more precise accounts of Black existence in anti-black worlds. For example, there is both invisibility and hyper-visibility: the invisibility of black pain and suffering, now documented in medical research, against the hyper-visibility of black bodies in spaces assumed to be rightfully dominated by whites, which include higher education, government, and institutional leadership of all sorts, now documented by sociologists and social psychologists (Gallagher 1994; Gordon 1995a; Williams 1997). Gordon developed an account of the invisibility of black subjectivity, in which black people become mirrors or empty hulls, mere projections of white needs and desires. White affection for black people is similar to their affection for their pets, he argued, based on the fact that pets do not judge their masters. Black people who go against these expectations to assert their subjectivity and capacity to judge are subject to violence and erasure. Gordon used a phenomenological approach not only to reveal white supremacist attitudes, but also to analyze various black responses to anti-black racism, such as the use of the n-word as a means to deflate its power and divert its original meaning.
2.1 Multiple Racisms
Phenomenological approaches to race also helped to disaggregate the experiences of diverse racial identities as well as expose the diverse forms of racism. Liberalism generally defines racism as the result of an illegitimate racial consciousness or racial awareness, in which the race of an individual is noted and taken to be significant, setting aside the question of who is noting who or how the significance is understood. By decontextualizing racism in this way it is rendered a uniform practice that could be philosophically treated in the abstract, with generic solutions. By contrast, phenomenological approaches have suggested that white practices of racial consciousness, among others, need a distinct analysis (Sullivan 2006). White racial consciousness often involves self-attributions of innocence, wilful ignorance about race-related social realities, and a sense of spatial entitlement that Sullivan names “ontological expansiveness.”
While there are some similarities in racist habits—such as forms of group-based antipathy, denigration, and essentialism—there are also differences important in understanding our experiences. The very term “anti-black racism” Gordon developed indicated that his analysis was not meant to be generic but specific, attending to the manifestations of racism that emerge from the specific histories of slavery, Jim Crow, and the ongoing colonization of Africa. Emily Lee and David Haekwon Kim have used phenomenonological approaches to explore the particularities of anti-Asian racism, Asian American assimilation and the idea of Asian-Americans as “model minorities,” in which the natural attitude of whites directs a different set of expectations and normative judgements toward Asians but ones that continue to curtail both individual and collective agency (Kim 2014; Lee 2020).
Even when racism involves a negative projection, there is also always a positive ideal against which the negative projection is identifiable. The criminal black person is contrasted with the compliant black, the lazy Mexican is contrasted with the hard-working Mexican, and so on. For Asian Americans, Kim argues, the natural attitude of whites expects passivity, with the result that nonpassive Asians appear to be seeking dominance, even if their non-passivity is merely sticking “to an unpopular proposal in a committee meeting” (Kim 2020, 297). Asian assertiveness disrupts some people’s comfort and reveals their commitment to the idea that Asians are “socially passive” (ibid). Such attitudes are not caused exclusively by cognitive commitments but operate as affective states that play a formative role in desire as well as understanding, such as the desirability of Asian passivity.
Martin Heidegger’s concept of Dasein, or “being there,” understands temporal and spatial location to be constitutive of subjectivity. This has provided a helpful elucidation of immigrant, bilingual, multilingual, and transnational experiences of identity, such as many Latinx people experience, among others. Dasein’s experience of being at home in the world and being with others in a comfortably collective “we” state is disrupted by angst when the ease of this connectedness is broken by migration and racism. Mariana Ortega makes use of Heidegger’s approach to develop a phenomenology of migrant life, a life in which the experience of at-homeness is never more than fleeting. This experience disrupts the solidity of the natural attitude and can lead to a critical consciousness. European male existentialists sometimes portrayed the self as normally unreflective, with the secure ease of practical functionality within their worlds, until a crisis, such as the Nazi occupation of France, forces reflexivity and a new awareness of what had been taken for granted. Ortega argues that the mestiza and the migrant live in an everyday world of ambiguities, uncertainties of meaning, and contradictory norms of practice, resulting in a discontinuous and multiplicitous self that requires a new phenomenological analysis (Ortega 2016, 50; see also Schutte 2000).
2.2 Revisions of Phenomenology
CPR scholars have thus effectively used phenomenology to displace the concept of the normative subject. But to do this, they have also had to critique the early phenomenologists attachment to universalizing human experience. For example, they have shown how particular social conditions, rather than universal ones, create and sustain the possibility of an unreflective consciousness that phenomenologists once took to be the universal default. Non-dominant identities rarely have the privilege of a relaxed absence of self-consciousness. In contrast, dominant groups have not needed to thematize their identity as, for example, white or male (Ngo 2017).
As early as 1944, Sartre began to apply his concept of “bad faith” to anti-Semitism (Sartre 1946 ; Vogt 2003). “Bad faith” is the term Sartre used to describe how one lies to oneself about the constitutive elements of the human condition—most notably, the inevitability of death and the responsibility we must bear for our choices, even those choices constrained by social conditions—as a way to avoid the existential angst this condition produces. “We have here a basic fear of oneself and truth” (Sartre 1946 [1948, 18]). Anti-Semitism works similarly, Sartre argued, by attempting to avoid the necessity of self-creation. The status of the Gentile as constitutionally superior is rendered solid and impermeable no matter what one does because of its contrast with the Jew: every decision the Gentile makes is legitimate, while every decision the Jew makes is corrupt. Anti-Semites are intentionally antagonistic to facts or reasoning that would challenge their view; hence Sartre calls it a form of faith. Gordon took up this idea as the basis for understanding anti-black racism, which is motivated by the desire to maintain the moral goodness and intellectual superiority of whiteness despite any contrary evidence.
The use of the concept of bad faith in this way challenges Husserl’s hopeful view about our ability to critique the natural attitude, given the power of bad faith’s temptations and its intransigence to reason. But in this way, the phenomenological approach to race and racism has helped to reveal racism’s persistence.
The phenomenological approach has also taken up the way in which racial identities and racisms refigure the temporal dimensions of human existence. In line with Ortega, both Edouard Glissant (1989) and Octavio Paz (1950 ) argued that in colonized spaces there can be a plural sense of temporality that takes a distinct form: an experience of the temporality of progress and development put forward by the dominant mainstream alongside a sensation of the static, petrified conditions of the marginalized periphery, creating a fractured sense of one’s temporal context that can lead to ennui. Alia Al-Saji has argued that understanding these diverse temporalities is key to seeing how self-other relations can be short-circuited when the dominant perceive the marginal as existing in a distinct time-space that is “behind” (2013, 2014). This justifies replacing dialogue with pedagogy: explaining to the other how they can advance. The diverse temporalities instituted by colonization, and the subsequent politics of memory they engender and sometimes enforce, is a central theme of decolonial philosophy today, making use of phenomenological work from Fanon, Emmanuel Levinas, and other victims of racism and anti-Semitism to assess the aspects of our natural attitudes still hidden to ourselves. Further, despite the permanence of existential temptations toward rendering oneself as solid and thus secure, in truth, we are always in a state of becoming, with possibilities of playfulness and imaginative self-creation that can lend hope for the battle against racism.
3. The Construction of Racial Identities
In general, Critical Race Philosophers have started with the view, following Alain Locke, that race, even though it is signified by physical attributes, is basically a social kind rather than a natural kind (Harris 1989). Locke wrote: “The best consensus of opinion then seems to be that race is a fact in the social or ethnic sense, that it has been very erroneously associated with race in the physical sense…that it has a vital and significant relation to social culture, and that it must be explained in terms of social and historical causes…” (Locke 1916 [1992, 192]). Locke also alluded to a contradiction still very much relevant to the debate over eliminativism, which is how racial consciousness can be both desirable and dangerous: desirable in that it recognizes social and historical realities, but dangerous in its potential to sanction prejudice and overplay division (Harris 1989, 203).
3.1 Race and the Self
A central issue in the work of the Critical Philosophy of Race has been how socially instituted categories of race are related to the self. As Charles W. Mills has put it, the assignment of racial identity “influences the socialization one receives, the life-world in which one moves, the experiences one has, the worldview one develops—in short…one’s being and consciousness.” (1998, xv; emphasis in original) Given this, abstract notions of the self that pare away particularities of our identities such as race risk producing theories and norms that tacitly assume whiteness, especially given the white predominance in the philosophical profession.
How, then, should we understand the interaction between social identities and the self? Is it deterministic from the top or more dialectical? In truth, the meanings of race have been influenced by those victimized by racism who collectively organize for resistance and survival in racist regimes. Both individuals and social movements have articulated new ways to think about what it means to have a racial identity (Marcano 2003; Gooding-Williams 1998; Omi and Winant 1986; Taylor 2004, 2016). Any theory of social construction, then, needs to understand this as a complex process with multiple players.
3.2 The Social Construction of Race
Race itself is a historically and culturally specific aspect of human experience (Gossett 1965; Hannaford 1996; Augstein 1996). Although there are precursors in earlier periods, most believe that the main way the concept of race has been defined in the modern era—as signifying inherited, stable dispositions and capacities linked to physical characteristics—emerged within Europe during its era of global empire. The idea of ranked, permanent human differences motivated or rationalized state policies governing a variety of social protections, inclusions and exclusions, from suffrage to immigration to property rights.
This history may make race appear to be something imposed on the self. The idea that race has been socially constructed is sometimes presented in this way: that external forces have constructed social identities as a way to divide and rank and ultimately exploit and oppress. On this view, while the individual has been categorized and grouped by political systems, with a subsequently curtailed (or magnified) agency, we are still essentially individuals free to engage in self-making.
On this version of social construction, two important ideas follow. The first is that philosophical treatments of the self, moral agency, personal identity, linguistic capacity, normative practices of cognition and so on can be pursued separately from, or prior to, an engagement with questions of social categories of identity such as race. And this accords with standard philosophical practices currently in place. The second implication is that the most liberating approach to race will be to deflate its significance and eliminate it from social life. If it is only contingently related to our identity, and has been used to legitimate discrimination, we should strive to reduce the power of race (Haslanger 2011; Glasgow et al. 2019). Some states, such as France, use such arguments to disallow the gathering of statistics that involve racial as well as ethnic and religious identity.
Theories that take a social constructionist approach to race often understandably focus on the nefarious ways race has been constructed. Yet, by unseating the biological determinist view of race, social constructionist approaches can also instigate reflection on the varied functions of racial terms--to signal collectivity, for example--as well as their open-ended future. Philosophers of race as well as other theorists have put a lot of work into showing how the concept was built on the colonizing ideologies and practices that served economic as well as other ends (Harris 1999; Mills 1997, 2017). But eliminativists about race have to do more than reveal the problematic genealogy of the concept: they also must show that the meaning of race is uniform and eliminating the concept is both possible and desirable.
Critical Philosophers of Race have generally argued that the elimination of race terms will encroach on our ability to retain an effective historical consciousness, which hermeneuticists such as Hans-Georg Gadamer described as central to the capacity to reason well (Gadamer 1975 ). On the hermeneutic view, individuals engage in the work of judgment and interpretation while embedded within particular traditions, but eliminativism could disable the self-reflection this calls for. And for phenomenologists such as Sartre, at least in his later works, the self is the product of a dialectical interaction between the particulars of one’s social situation and the choices one makes as an individual. As Donna-Dale Marcano explains, Sartre’s approach “enables us to explain how and why members of an oppressed group positively assume and create an identity for ourselves” grounded in that group experience: in order to acknowledge the importance of this shared history as well as the forms of resistance that have had a hand in shaping our current social identities (Marcano 2003, 25). The desirability of forgetting this history may vary across groups, since some might wish to forget atrocities that played a role in their family enrichment, while others wish the world to remember the lessons of the past as well as the history of group resistance and survival. If our selves are indeed the product of dialectical engagement, a philosophical treatment of identity and the self will need to incorporate the situated and relational elements that play a significant role in constituting us, and this will include our racialized identities. This approach is not antithetical to a social constructionist theory but one form it can take.
The history of race reveals its fundamentally social origin and many nefarious uses, but not the reach of its dynamism. Although race is an important element in our histories, this does not mean there are no similarities across racial groups, no significant differences within groups, or that racial meanings will remain stable. Yet, still, as Mills emphasizes, race has such a significant impact on our lives it cannot but affect what we know, how we know, and how we understand ourselves in relation to our worlds (Mills 1998).
3.3 The Historical Construction of Race
The social constructionist approach can sometimes lend itself to the idea that societies can bring races into existence simply by the formal use of the category in, for example, official legal documents. This view in turn can give rise to the belief that races can be deconstructed by reversing this process. The historical approach to racial identities offers a different, though not entirely distinct approach. Racial groups exist within history and are formed by historical forces, but these include not only top-down machinations of states but also the collective agency of those so designated. It is not just state policies that construct identities, but social movements, both progressive and reactionary. Through historical periods and collective group action, the meanings of race can change as well as their political valence (Glasgow et al. 2019; Omi and Winant 1986; Alcoff 2015).
W.E.B. Du Bois took a Hegelian approach that understood African peoples in the post-slavery diaspora as engaged in a dialectic process of self-formation in light of their racialized treatment. Slaves had been violently dispossessed of their languages, ethnic cultures and religions as a means of domination and control. Yet, rather than simply assimilating to the Anglo-European culture of North America, black people even under slavery were creatively producing new forms of cultural expression and communal forms of life that gave voice to the sensibilities of their unique and shared historical experience (Du Bois 1903 ). Historical forces had shaped the conditions in which blackness became a feature of the self, albeit a dynamic and variable one.
Similarly, in the southern part of the Western hemisphere, theorists such as José Vasconcelos and José Carlos Mariátegui were articulating specifically racialized forms of social identity with political implications (Vasconcelos 1925 ; Mariátegui 1928 ; Von Vacano 2011). For Vasconcelos, racial identities are the product of both biological and social forces, but racial rankings are simply tools of “imperialistic policy” to generate self-justification (Vasconcelos 1925 [1997, 33]). Vasconcelos was concerned to defend racial mixing, which was a practice widespread in Latin America and also the target of criticism by European intellectuals who justified their own superior ranking on the basis of claims to purity and unified cultural essences. Vasconcelos held that such claims ignore the fact that all races are in a constant process of interaction and mutual influence. Diversification improves humanity, he believed, and will eventually produce a more unified or cosmic race stronger than any “pure” race. Yet, while advocating in this way for mestizahe, or the mixing of races and cultures, Vasconcelos reproduced a new form of racial ranking in which “pure” blacks and Indians were ranked lower than mixed race peoples, or mestizos.
In contrast, Mariátegui criticized the way in which mestizo and criollo elites defined the “problem of the Indian” as a problem of resistance to assimilation. As a forerunner of societies that define themselves today as “plurinational,” Mariátegui argued that political systems needed to recognize the legitimacy of Indian identities and land claims. Indigenous groups in Peru had distinct ideas and practices about how to communally navigate land stewardship, how to practice religion, and how to express aesthetic values, and these practices had produced flourishing communities prior to the Conquest. Indian survival was not predicated on assimilation but on land.
In Latin America and the Caribbean, theorists tended to hold that the Conquest and transatlantic slavery altered and realigned but did not erase prior values, practices, or beliefs (Henry 2000). New group identities carried vestiges of earlier practices and cultural ideas. Liberation from colonialism and emancipation from slavery created new political constituencies who had shared aspirations for new forms of society in which they could chart their own futures. These new constituencies manifested some continuities with the pre-Conquest, pre-slavery past but were also dynamic responses to new conditions and possibilities. For example, while diverse indigenous groups were forcibly realigned by territorial annexations, they responded by developing new group identities that included pan-indigenous identity while maintaining a historical consciousness of their distinct lineage (Jimeno 2014; de la Cadena 2015).
The contrast between political philosophy in Latin American versus Europe is instructive here. The project of Latin American political philosophers such José Martí, Simon Bolivar and Mariátegui was never to create ideal political institutions for any given collection of abstract individuals, but to create workable institutions that could overcome the devastations wrought by colonialism, cultural imperialism, and slavery. This required addressing group differences and group histories. For Mariátegui, the Indians of Peru deserved land rights not as individuals but as specific historical peoples whose land had been stolen. The political philosophy of a nation such as Peru could not then follow liberal theoretical traditions that treated individual citizens as essentially fungible with uniform rights and duties.
This is what fueled Martí’s concern that the Eurocentric universities of Latin America offered no “analysis of elements peculiar to the peoples of America” (Martí 1999, 114). As a result of their European or U.S. based curriculum, “the young go out into the world wearing Yankee or French spectacles, hoping to govern a people they do not know” (ibid). Marti despised the concept of race, held that racism was a sin against humanity, and sought to undo the racism that the Spaniards institutionalized in the colonial era (Schutte 2011). But he also held that new societies must come to understand and address the fact that different groups had distinct histories with their own “vital and individual characteristics of thought and habit…” (Martí, 119) Eurocentric curricula are not universal, but particular, and may have only partial relevance outside Europe. Writing some decades later, the philosopher Leopoldo Zea echoed Martí’s warning and argued that philosophical approaches need to address human and cultural specificity (Zea 1986).
In many post-liberation, post-slavery writings, racial identity began to signify differently than it had for the colonizers: it came to mean group identities and forms of life that had been forged by historical processes involving not only colonialism but also the forms of resistance devised by the colonized. Generic terms like “Black” would change their meanings to signify new group formations whose content or unifying elements referred both to the enforced diaspora as well as new forms of collectivity and resistance. The generic term “Indian” itself denoted a widely diverse set of communities, initially united only in that it was used by settler societies to project negative attributes on all indigenous peoples. In this sense the term had elements very similar to other racial terms. Yet it began to signify something more substantive as well as more positive: a difference of historical experience, values, and practices that cut across many particular differences between indigenous groups. There is ongoing debate today about the validity of such a broad term, but there is agreement that the term “Indian” signifies not only what was done to the peoples it signifies, but broadly shared forms of religiosity, community, and relationality (Teuton 2008; Pratt 2002; Burkhart 2019).
3.4 The Cultural Construction of Race
How should we understand the connection between racialized identities and the production of cultures? “Civilizations and peoples are not…coterminous with races,” as Leonard Harris reminds us (Harris 1999, 445). Yet there are links. For Alain Locke, as Harris explains, socially created races can be defined in relation to “beliefs, habits, customs, and informal institutional regulations,” but these are the products of group agency rather than innate: it is civilizations and peoples that decide what traits to encourage given particular historical circumstances (Harris 1999, 444–5). While it is a mistake to see races as causes of cultural formations, it is also a mistake to assume that racialized group histories play no role in the “beliefs, habits, customs” that play a role in surviving adversity, or, on the other hand, in conquering.
Perhaps the most philosophically rich discussion and debate over race and culture came out of the anti-colonial movement that put forward the concept of Negritude in the midst of anti-colonial struggles in Africa and the French Caribbean. Negritude was the name given for the concept of “black culture.” For some theorists, such as Léopold Sédor Senghor, biologically caused racial identities have cultural products that, because of their biological origin, have limited transformational potential. But for other theorists, the production of black culture is essentially to be understood within the history of colonialism (Mosley 1999, 75).
For both Aimé and Suzanne Césaire, Negritude was the cultural fruit of the historical process of intellectual cross-fertilization known as métissage. Within this dynamic history, new cultural forms developed that could offer intellectual nourishment to the developing social movements striving for self-determination (Denean Sharpley-Whiting 2003, 117). “For us, the problem is not to make a utopian and sterile attempt to repeat the past, but to go beyond…It is a new society that we must create, with the help of all our brother slaves, a society rich with all the productive power of modern times, with all the fraternity of olden days” (Césaire 1955 [1972, 31]). Thus, Negritude articulated a new set of norms and values that aimed to depart from Europe’s barbarism. Rejecting colonialism involved turning toward rather than away from the historical tie to indigenous African cultures. This would prove to be a productive relation, since these cultures were neither modern nor liberal by Europe’s lights but communal, cooperative, and anti-capitalist, with their own forms of democracy (Césaire 1955 [1972, 23]). Decolonization required not simply nation-building but a reassessment and realignment of cultural forms and related social ideas about human possibilities (Getachew 2019). Negritude was the name given to this endeavor.
To be sure, Negritude has sustained decades of critical debate concerning the dangers of cultural homogenization (Sealey 2018; Appiah 1992; Wilder 2015; Mosley 1999). Another line of debate concerned the championing of emotion, intuition and myth in indigenous cultures, and whether this only played into the hands of white supremacists. Senghor responded that the point is to redefine the sphere of emotion and the importance of myth as a feature of every society. Du Bois (1903 ) also expressed and affirmed the idea of a specific form of spirituality, inspired in part by Hegel. Eventually these ideas would find resonance in the idea of “soul” as the cultural form of a people, another conception with an indelible racial connotation.
Negritude was motivated by the project Aime Césaire called “disalienation”: to overcome the denigration of Africa and the forced assimilation into the culture of the colonizer (Táíwò 1999). Yet to be clear, disalienation for Césaire did not require a denial of métissage. His own writings were influenced by the French poetry and literature he had imbibed as a student, but Césaire insisted that his project was to “create a new language, one capable of communicating the African heritage” (Césaire 1955 [1972, 67]). In the colonial context of Martinique, the use of French did not need to stop but what was most important was to develop “a new means of expression” that would be “Antillean French, a black French that, while still being French, had a black character” (ibid.). Negritude aimed to allow the expression of a full range of memory, affect, orientation, and sensibilities across the domain of many diverse ethnic, religious, and language communities from which the slaves were kidnapped.
The emphasis on the historical construction of cultural differences and social identities led to diverse conclusions by different theorists. Sartre came to defend the concept of Negritude against its detractors, but his defense portrayed it as a transitional stage in a Hegelian dialectical moment that would lead to a future without racial differences. (Sartre 1948 ; Bernasconi 1995, 2006) Such a future may be one that many anti-racists, people of color among them, aspire to (Williams 1997). But the problem, as Fanon put it, was that Sartre was wielding a universal historical teleology in which sacrifices of collective identification and historical memory were disproportionately distributed (Fanon 1959 ). It is the Black man who must “renounce the pride of his color…[accept] the twilight of his negritude…in order to find the dawn of the universal” (Sartre 1948 [1988, 329]). This formulation maintained the conception of universal humanism held by the French colonizers. Fanon rejected the idea that negritude was simply a stage, and retorted that “It is the white man who creates the Negro. But it is the Negro who creates negritude” (Fanon 1959 [1967, 47]).
Edouard Glissant took the concept of metissage and applied it to the way in which we approach historical understanding to argue that the danger with historical approaches lies with the assumption of a singular history that unifies us all (Sealey 2020). “One of the most disturbing consequences of colonization could well be this notion of a single History…The struggle against a single History for the cross-fertilization of histories means repossessing both a true sense of one’s time and identity…” (Glissant 1989, 93).
As Kris Sealey argues, homogenized teleologies such as Sartre presumes puts a stranglehold on the political imagination. Yet Fanon and Amilcar Cabral both worried that in some forms Negritude itself downplayed dynamism, internal conflicts, and the heterogeneity of the diasporic experience. Both suggested that the imaginary projections of homogeneous cultural identities based on shared racialization were the product of alienated middle classes seeking an authenticity they had lost. While recognizing that the group specificity of cultural formations and ideas remained vital, they, together with Kwame Nkrumah, held that we need to retain a capacity to develop historically informed critiques of anti-racist philosophies (Nkrumah 1964; Cabral 1973).
3.5 Racial Identities and Whiteness
If social identities are contextual in relation to social, historical and cultural elements, this extends to what it means to be white. Whiteness across the Americas and Europe varies, since not all began as settler states, and yet the unconscious habits and frameworks inculcated by white or light-skinned persons positioned as superior to all other groups can have some commonalities. No matter one’s individual political and moral commitments, a person from the dominant group will have common experiences across most of their contexts in light of this feature of their social identity.
In his essay, “The Souls of White Folks,” Du Bois considered the effects of a perpetually reinforced idea of natural superiority and dominance on white subjectivity (Du Bois 1940 [1986c]). His concern was the “conditioned reflexes” and “long followed habits” built into customs and folkways (Du Bois 1940 [1986c], 679). The fact that the white poor and white workers were promised well more than they ever received had a profound effect on their resentments as well as their illusions. Du Bois was also interested in how a generic self-regard could be attached to such an insignificant fact as white skin color: what does it do to a man, he asks, to believe that his skin entitles him to ownership of the world? Du Bois claimed an epistemic advantage as a non-white person who can discern the pathological identity complex that afflicts whites. He describes himself as a non-foreigner who lives among them and can view them from an “unusual vantage” so that, as he put it, “I see in and through them.” (Du Bois 1910 [1986b, 923]). This knowledge is terrifying for white people and animates their antipathy: no Emperor wants to share table with those who know he is naked. The habitual practices that ensure white self-regard are largely unconscious, Du Bois suggested, and whites often vigorously resist being made conscious of them.
More recently Charles W. Mills used the concept of the “epistemology of ignorance” to describe habits of knowing that the dominant consciously pursue in order to ensure that they can retain moral self-regard (Mills 1997). Ignorance of the reality of racial domination, and of its illegitimacy, certainly requires more concerted effort in the recent period. One must consciously avoid certain books, courses, films, television shows, newspaper articles, and so on, but one must also attach oneself to certain ideas about objectivity, the irrelevance of genealogy in assessing a claim, and the absoluteness of truth claims that obviate the need for self-reflection. José Medina (2012) has developed this idea further to explore how self-knowledge has been curiously circumscribed in mainstream traditions of epistemology to exclude knowledge of others or knowledge of one’s society. If we are what we are always in relation to others, he argues, then knowledge of others, and of the social conditions we must all inhabit, is a necessary condition of self-knowledge.
Shannon Sullivan (2006) has explored the idea of unconscious habits of whiteness more broadly. Her work has developed some aspects of psychoanalytic theory and pragmatism to explore the common elements of white racial identity formation. This proves a fruitful way to consider how racism can be effectively passed down across generations without conscious intent. Bodily posture toward a person of color who comes to one’s door can convey a whole array of ideas to children without needing to be stated. Sullivan elaborates a host of sometimes unconscious assumptions in white ways of being, involving entitlement, fear, guilt, and other affective states. Sullivan has looked particularly at “lived spatiality”: the way in which diverse groups live their spatiality and understand themselves in relation to specific spaces. Given the “ownership” idea attached to whiteness, and the historical practices of forming settlements in foreign lands, a phenomenological approach to the racialization of lived spatiality can reveal sediments of assumed white privilege that can affect such current issues as gentrification and the reemergence of white nationalism. Some of these habitual practices common to white subjectivity may be formulated as epistemically praiseworthy (for example, aspiring to colorblindness, ignoring history, or the motivation to “discover” unknown lands and make one’s mark upon the world).
3.6 Future Directions
The analysis of race and the self, then, includes unconscious habits as well as subjective features produced by collective experience. Yet an important theme of CPR has been an attentiveness to métissage, as well as a defense of mestizahe and the productive creolizations of cultures that have been too little acknowledged. Although clearly marked cultural borders and pure lines of racial descent are praised and pursued by racist social systems, they have never been achieved in reality. Our plural lineages and influences mean that, to some extent, we all operate within what are called pluritopic hermeneutic frameworks, rather than monotopic, homogenous, or coherent hermeneutic frameworks (Mignolo 2012). This fact does not imply that we can go back to taking a universal “we” as a starting point, or some form of abstract individualism. Perhaps we are all pluritopic today, but racialized subjectivity is formed differently vis-à-vis power.
Alain Locke insisted on the fact that “most cultures” have been found to be “highly composite”: “the resultant of the meeting and reciprocal influence of several culture strains, several ethnic contributions. Such facts nullify two of the most prevalent popular and scientific fallacies, the ascription of a total culture to any one ethnic strain, and the interpretation of culture in terms of intrinsic rather than the fusion values of its various constituent elements” (Locke 1924 [1989, 195]). Locke took this feature of cultures to provide a definitive rejoinder to supremacist claims, since the cultural achievements of societies marked by white supremacy bear the influences of subordinated groups.
It remains true, however, that as we saw with Vasconcelos, ideas of mixing can and have co-existed alongside and even supported racism (Bernasconi 2010). The slipperiness of racial meanings and the flexibility of racism requires philosophers to continually assess the contextual conditions within which any given philosophical claim is operating.
4. The Question of Causes: Capitalism or Culture
A central issue of debate in the Critical Philosophy of Race has been how to understand the causes of racism in relation to economic motivations and the system of capitalism as well as cultural forces and social ideology. Orthodox Marxists often sidelined issues of racism, diminishing the struggle against racism as a struggle for bourgeois rights within a legal system that would remain structurally unjust under capitalism. Some thought the focus on racism would divide the working class and weaken solidarity. Despite the weakness of these arguments, it remains true that some anti-racist agendas sideline economic issues and focus on representational equity at the top of the pyramid. This has led to an ongoing debate about how to relate the issue of race with the issue of class (Grosfoguel 2016).
4.1 Race and Class
Racism is very profitable. It can work to reduce compensation for jobs designated “unskilled” or “low skilled” because the articulation of “skill” values mental over manual labor and often misrepresents the complex demands of the latter. Racist prejudices incline some to accept the idea without examination that the labor done by racialized groups is unskilled. All manual workers are disrespected and shut out of decision making, but the racial organization of the labor market makes this sector more non-white than other sectors, and in some locations, such as Latin America or South Africa, almost entirely non-white. Racial divisions among workers are regularly exploited by capitalists to diminish solidarity. Neo-colonialism in the global south continues to facilitate the exploitation of labor in countries too desperately poor to negotiate terms very effectively. In truth, then, both national and transnational markets in labor and goods have been racially organized since the Conquest of the Americas for the benefit of elites. Even when the elite class is multi-racial, they benefit from the racist system of organizing and remunerating labor. This is the meaning of the term “racial capitalism” (Robinson 1983; Mills 1997).
Clearly, emerging capitalism made use of the racist ideologies initiated in the early days of colonialism, such as the idea that Native peoples and African peoples exist in an earlier stage of human development and are thus legitimately subject to governance and control by more advanced or developed human cultures (Grosfoguel and Cervantes-Rodríguez 2002; Quijano 2008). Capitalism also profits from the denigration of the value of indigenous cultures around the world, especially when these thwart mining, logging, or other types of resource extraction and the transformation of environments upon which groups depend for their subsistence. On the other hand, some argue that because capitalism has no intrinsic need to respect cultural traditions, it often upends traditions involving racism and sexism when these conflict with its labor needs: for example, the profit motive encourages hiring the best from any group for its professional/managerial and creative teams. One of the prime features of capital markets is their tendency to disrupt existing social conventions. These points have raised debate over whether capitalism is necessarily committed to the maintenance of racism. And further debate has arisen over whether racist ideologies are intrinsic to cultures or to economies, or both.
Most critical theorists of race and ethnicity argue for an expansion beyond economic analyses. Ella Shohat and Robert Stam hold that “While political economy is absolutely essential to any substantive left critique, it is also important to articulate culture and economy together, to conceive of them as existing in and through each other” (2016, 421). In this vein, the cultural theorist Stuart Hall developed what he called a heterodox Marxist approach to race, emphasizing the role of culture in producing the hegemony required to maintain the racial organization of labor (Mills 2010, 186). Yet Hall rejected the idea that culture operates as a sufficient cause or is separable from material conditions (Hall 1980 , 1997a, 1997; Morley and Chen 1996). Hall’s approach to the importance of culture in regard to racism was inspired by 20th century Marxist theorists such as Antonio Gramsci, Louis Althusser and those associated with the Frankfurt School, although these theorists avoided addressing race. Some did address anti-Semitism and the links between the rise of authoritarian societies and the forms of group hatred the Nazi’s promoted, but they wrote little about racism or colonialism (Allen 2016; Farr 2018). Hall suggests however that Gramsci’s origins in southern Italy informed his understanding of how regional ethnic identities could animate prejudice and play a formative role in the crafting of hegemony.
Gramsci’s concept of hegemony focused on the ways in which broad majorities come to accept significant income inequality and diminished democracy, reducing the need for capitalist states to use brute force. Gramsci suggested we must reach beyond economic motives to explain the success of hegemony. To avoid a mono-causal approach to racial domination, Hall adapted three concepts from Gramsci and Althusser: hegemony (the production of cross-class acceptance of social injustice), relative autonomy (for cultural forces that sometimes operate autonomously from profit maximization), and overdetermination (the necessity “to grasp the multiplicity of social determinations in play – and the fact that they work in combination, as an articulation of different forces” [Hall 2017, 90]). For Hall, the significance of this overall approach is to alert us to potential misalignments between causative elements, so that the power of social determinism is understood to have some instability. Further, we can see how non-economic motives can drive the choices of both workers and capitalists. One may be motivated to maintain one’s social position in a racial hierarchy, for example, and to ensure that racial groups considered lesser are not gaining social and economic advantages, even if this compromises one’s ability to fight capital.
However, if we assume that racial identities are epiphenomenal illusions or imaginary in some sense, such motives will fall under the category of false consciousness, in which case race-based motivations will not challenge economic determinism. One’s “real” interests as a worker will continue to lay in opposing racial divisions. As discussed earlier in this entry, the idea that racial concepts are illusory may seem to have good evidentiary grounds. Yet racial categories that operated within the emerging settler states, such as the United States and Australia, distributed significant privileges and protections by race. These included both economic and political rights, including homestead rights, voting rights, and labor rights. In this way, socially created kinds such as racial identities had a powerful social reality: even if some of the ideas about such identities are false, real historical events produced shared experiences and shared sets of interests (Beltrán 2020).
The fact that racial groups are led to compete with one another for economic advantages is itself socially engineered rather than natural, but it may have heterogeneous causes. The concept of overdetermination allows us to expand the concept of what is in one’s rational “interest” to include pride and self-regard, group self-affirmation, relational advantage over other groups, the desire to enact domination and to protect longstanding special entitlements. Is the imbrication of this complex array of motives such that we should see the economic as the main determinant, operating behind what look to be identity-protections? In other words, are racist motives ultimately caused by a choice structure crafted by capitalists?
4.2 Racist Cultures
Some argue that the structural racism of modern European societies (and European-based societies such as the United States) is deeply embedded in their cultures and languages in ways that are concealed by their espousal of classical liberalism’s dominant concepts of individualism, equality, and freedom (Goldberg 1993, pp. 6–7; see also Mills 2017). It is liberalism that espouses neutrality and color-blindness as ideal norms for social interaction, leading to an unwillingness to engage with racial realities in social institutions and economic outcomes. David Theo Goldberg argues that liberal cultures are racist in taking difference to be a problem requiring assimilation, integration, and “normalization” in Foucault’s sense of a comparative ranking that justifies forcible conformity. People of color and non-European immigrants who reject the color-blind ideal are seen as not yet assimilated into advanced, modern ways of life, and thus incapable of self-governance. Every articulation of anti-racist rage and rebellion can then be cast aside as based in ignorance. If these groups knew how to work within liberal democratic institutions and educational systems, some believe, they would be faring better with no need to rebel. In a sense, then, the suffering of nonwhites is viewed as self-caused by their inferior cultures, leading to a hegemonic acceptance of social inequality. The liberal view, as opposed to the conservative view, is distinguished only in that it sees this deficiency as remediable with assimilation.
A key element of Goldberg’s approach is to highlight the malleability of racial and racist discourses: just as liberalism has morphed into neo-liberalism, with its emphasis on self-maximizing strategies, individual responsibility, and punitive attitudes toward those who cannot effectively monetize their talents, so old-school biological racism morphs into cultural racism: the problem is not nonwhite genes but nonwhite cultures. Against those who take race to simply mean biology, Goldberg holds that the language of race can continue its noxious effects without any recourse to “biological reference” (1993, 11). Goldberg proposes that the West is made up of racist cultures so deeply committed to racism that new forms emerge as soon as old ones lose their power. Cultures are inherently dynamic, counseling against a metaphysically inclined pessimism, but the dynamism and plasticity of racism requires permanent vigilance.
Goldberg and Cornel West have independently made use of the Foucauldian concepts such as “fields of discourse” and “epistemes” to suggest that racial ideas are reinforced by loose coherence relations without logical entailments or causal determinism (West 1982). Familiar ways of organizing and achieving knowledge—such as classification tables—resonate across quite different disciplines and projects and help to guide, and control, the formulation of intelligible objects and problematics. Human differences, West suggests, were mapped in the 18th and 19th centuries via small visual variations to resonate with the ways in which botanists organized typologies of flora and fauna, as if such mapping constituted knowledge.
Despite their variety, racist cultures tend to portray racial identities and racism as natural in a way that obscures their historical construction. Although the 19th century theories and practices in regard to race have been discredited and largely rejected, the ways in which race is approached today in both the social and natural sciences retain some continuity with these problematic histories, with disturbing effects: “The scientific cloak of racial knowledge, its formal character and seeming universality, imparts authority and legitimation to it” (Goldberg 1993, 149).
Foucault’s focus was on the ways in which knowledge projects are framed, confining those so defined “within the constraints of the representational limits” (Goldberg 1993, 152). Such projects have typically assumed that the most important goals are uplift, assimilation, and integration with whites rather than extending democracy or reformulating justice (Shelby 2018). Knowledge projects are themselves conducted in ways that can exacerbate epistemic injustice: “The Other, as object of study, may be employed but only as informant, as representative translator of culture” (Goldberg 1993, 150; see also Narayan 1997 and Bayruns Garcia 2019). Concepts in use today such as “ghettos,” “ganglands,” “inner cities,” “underclass,” and “puppet governments” operate in a similar manner as older concepts like “savages,” “primitives,” and “barbarians” to reify and naturalize peoples, neighborhoods, and cultures (Goldberg 1993, 152–155).
Resonating effects between the new language and the old does more than support their plausibility, as Goldberg points out: “noncontroversial meanings [of terms such as ‘inner city’ or ‘underclass’] offer to their racialized ones the aura of respectability, just as their racial connotations spill over silently, unself-consciously, and so unproblematically into their racialized ones” (1993, 155). New meanings for old terms can emerge as needed by new contexts and new social projects, but with persistently problematic connotations. The concept of the “primitive” was originally intended to refer to ancient social groups from which contemporary human societies are descended; only later did it become a synonym for the racially other and the culturally “backward”. In this case the meaning remained stable while the referent group shifted. Ancient social groups that were nomadic, polygamous, and communal rather than individualist were then tagged onto nonwhite groups that exist today, such as indigenous groups in Africa and Latin America.
4.3 Racist Social Sciences
Both CPR and CRT scholars have shown how a significant amount of social science research has been functional for the state, with dubious results: providing information, data, statistical regularities that are used to formulate state policies; assuming frameworks that overlook agency and divert attention from considerations of justice (Murakawa 2014; Shelby 2018; Bauman 2003; Darby and Rury 2018). Statistics gathering on recidivism rates correlated to race are still used in parole decisions, as if recidivism is a natural fact or caused by bad individual choices rather than inadequate social services and prejudicial labor markets. In this way social science continues to participate in the construction of social ontologies, such as “likely repeat offender,” through feedback loops between representation and reality. Social sciences can then represent racial Others in an ostensibly neutral way while protecting white dominance (Goldberg 1993, 174).
To believe that we simply need to find more politically correct alternatives for terms like “underclass” or “primitive” is to assume that the object of reference can be defined and demarcated within racist cultures outside of a racist linguistic system. If we understand racism to be infecting the delimitation of fields of knowledge and the formation of objects as well as associated meanings, then the task must be to critically assess cultures, discourses, and institutions at every level. The project of inquiry then becomes one of understanding how racial domination has been reproduced across generations, encompassing political sensibilities from conservatism to liberalism.
Goldberg’s approach may be interpreted by some as a postmodern approach that has gone too far in conferring sufficient causality to language or discourse (see e.g. Mills’ critique of Hall, 2010, on this same point). Yet both Goldberg and Hall continually emphasize material structures alongside linguistic and discursive ones. There remains the question of how to understand the relation between these various aspects of racist cultures. The question of whether there are ultimate or sufficient causes, however, does not animate Goldberg’s work. His goal is to unearth the cultural and discursive elements involved in the constitution, perpetuation, and fluid transformations of racist concepts and racist societies. We need to understand the constitutive discourses operating in the social sciences to grasp how it can be the case that they “have done much to create, authorize, legitimate, and extend both the figures of the racial Otherness and the exclusion of various racisms” (Goldberg 1993, 175).
Other philosophers who analyze the social sciences have also offered a strong critique of existing frameworks and policy approaches (esp. Darby and Rury 2018 meant; Shelby 2018). Tommie Shelby critiques mainstream work on racial poverty in the social sciences for downplaying the agency of the poor as well as the rationality and moral reasoning that can motivate decisions to self-segregate, for example, or, at times, to resist certain kinds of wage labor. Ghetto poverty is caused by macro structural forces, but the collection of individuals forced into these spaces are actively endeavoring to survive, to occasionally flourish, and also to foment resistance of one sort or another. We cannot explain their choices by their culture (as in the “culture of poverty” thesis) but by their choice situation. We also need frameworks that allow theorists to see the creative and assertive responses devised by collective effort (the assertiveness of rap, for example, that re-describes social worlds against dominant misrepresentations). Shelby no less than Goldberg takes apart the linguistic apparatus that produces a large body of social science functional for racial capitalism. And his use of what is a usually denigrating term – “ghetto” – may be seen as an instance of what Goldberg calls “standing inside the terms” as a means to transform and redirect their political effects (1993, 174).
Critical philosophers of race, even those influenced by postmodernism, tend to set limits on the plasticity of linguistic transformation. Goldberg suggests that those designated by the term “primitive,” such as indigenous groups, “are rarely in a position of power, politically and technologically, to take on the category as a form of self-reference, even should they choose to” (1993, 174). Speech, however constitutive its reach, exists in a material world.
4.4 Racist Constructions of Women of Color
Critical race feminist philosophers have developed a critical analysis of the ways in which categories such as “Black women” as well as “women of the global south” have been constituted as an academic object of study and analysis (Narayan 1997; Khader 2011, 2018; duCille 1997). Uma Narayan argued that representations of women in India reproduce naturalistic frames and global hierarchies that devised a version of the culture of poverty thesis on an international scale. Notably, violence against women in the global north is not generally given cultural explanations but portrayed as a problem of individual pathology or an undifferentiated misogyny that operates outside of specific histories and contexts. By contrast, women of the global south are portrayed as oppressed by their cultures and religions.
Serene Khader expands on this analysis to show how culturalist explanations result in underestimating the agency of women in the global south, creating the view that their agency is only possible when they completely reject their religion or culture. This is a problem not only in the social sciences but also in postmodern feminist theory, and it occludes possibilities of universalist feminism because the oppressed Third World woman constructed in this way requires uplift, not dialogic engagements in which there might develop a larger understanding of the complex nature of sexism as well as the multiple possibilities of liberation from sexism. In some writings, the Third World woman is reified to such a degree that no serious political engagement about how to formulate shared feminist aims is possible.
Khader develops an approach to adaptive preferences that allows for non-ideal and historically attuned assessments of choices in any given context. All gendered individuals in reality make choices within structured environments. Outsiders to these environments tend to misdiagnose women’s choices, viewing them as accepting of oppression when in truth they may be efforts at self-protection. Mistaken analyses can also occur when cultures are reified as static; if we drop this idea Khader suggests we can judge choices based on their potential for transitions. For example, covering can enable women to venture out of the home without risk, and lead to changed public spheres. She argues for an approach that attends to contextual conditions of all sorts – material and cultural – for understanding oppression and gauging effective resistance. Contextualization will yield pluralist rather than uniform notions of liberation from gender-based oppression, and Western feminists need to be open to a multiplicity of liberatory forms even including certain kinds of gender-based divisions of labor.
Ann duCille takes a critical look at how the category “Black women” has been constructed within postmodernism, as well as other radical theoretical platforms. It is problematic to take Black women as the quintessential Other or the paradigm of difference (duCille 1997; Davidson 2010). Black women can be epistemically privileged in a way that does not reify their otherness, concealing its contextualization and internal variability. Maria del Guadalupe Davidson takes up duCille’s challenge to rethink the category by drawing from Gilles Deleuze’s concept of “the fold” as an alternative approach to identity and subjectivity. This presents an approach to subjectivity as constitutively relational. If theorists will focus on activity and relationality, rather than being, we may be able to specify unique conditions of Black women without reification (Davidson, 2010, 128–130).
Debates continue about how to formulate racial identities as well as whether identity-based movements have overshadowed class-based movements. Shohat and Stam explain that the focus on identity should be seen against the backdrop of a larger project of global decolonization, rather than assumed to be forever complicit with neo-liberalism (2016). The point is not to replace the frame of class struggle, but to complicate it, bringing ongoing forms of cultural imperialism to the center of analysis, so that we can begin to discern the “multiaxial forms of resistance and struggle” that face down “multiaxial forms of oppression…shaping new social actors, new vocabularies, and new strategies.” (2016, 421)
5. Reconstituting the History of Philosophy
The racist beliefs of major figures in the traditional canon of modern philosophy went unexplored until the second half of the 20th century. Most historians of philosophy assumed that canonical figures were simply men of their time, and that their racism was devoid of philosophical interest and significance. Critical race philosophers have opened up debate on these issues, such as how the racism of important philosophers such as Locke and Kant may require us to reassess standardly generous interpretations of their political and ethical views (Zack 2017; Taylor et al. 2018; Mills 2017; Bernasconi and Mann 2005). They have also argued that bringing racism to the fore will require changing the standard ways of doing the history of philosophy.
5.1. Doing Philosophy Differently
First, a change in interpretive methods is in order, to change the way in which we read canonical texts. Before we assume that the racism of a given philosopher was typical of their day, we need to explore the historical context and consider the written views of his or her contemporaries so that we can reasonably assess what any given philosopher “could or should have known” about, for example, slavery (Bernasconi 2018, 3). In fact, as recent work has shown, throughout the modern period, slavery and colonialism were subject to vigorous debates both by those inside and outside of imperial nations (Jeffers 2018; Valls 2005; Mehta 1999; Pitts 2006; Dussel 2018, 2013; Mosley 2017). A thorough examination of the intellectual scene in which canonical philosophers were ensconced raises new questions about their views and assumptions (Bernasconi and Mann 2005; Ward and Lott 2002). But such an examination requires that we contextualize philosophical texts historically and socially before we can justify our interpretations.
Second, the existing canon has too many omissions on crucial issues, especially in regard to moral and political debate, to be taken as sufficient unto itself, given that such topics as slavery were extensively discussed and debated by other theorists in the same time period. The question of how to expand, if not reconstitute, the canon of modern philosophy has generated debate over what constitutes “philosophical” writings as opposed to other sorts. It is important to remember that the canon of modern European philosophers does not include only professional philosophers working within universities: such professionals did not even appear until the beginning of the 19th century. And the issue of what makes a text count as a philosophical argument is of course subject to further debate. Many of the already accepted canonical European texts come in the form of letters, memoirs, fiction, dialogues, interpretations of sacred writings, and journalistic essays. Think of Augustine’s Confessions, Thomas More’s Utopia, Hume’s Dialogues on Natural Religion, Pascal’s Pensees, The Federalist Papers, Nietzsche’s Thus Spake Zarathustra, or Edmund Burke’s Reflections on the Revolution in France. Philosophers read texts in a philosophical manner even when the text itself is not written in the form of a logically ordered argument.
There is original philosophical work in Africana, Latin American, indigenous and other traditions on metaphysics, morality, aesthetics and a whole host of philosophical issues that should become part of a revised canon (Jeffers 2018; Henry 2000; Dussel 2013, 2018; Wiredu 2004; Maffie 2013). The existence of original philosophical work in ancient China and India is not as contested, yet these sources are also absent representation in many so-called “top” graduate programs. Hence, there is an unjustificable Eurocentrism in the existing canon’s formation. The question of whether a given work counts as philosophy cannot be decided upon by a priori criteria created by a foreshortened canon. Therefore, we need to engage in both critical and reconstructive work on the question of canonicity itself.
The third point follows from the last. The traditional canon is not only insufficient but problematic in ways that require new analyses and interpretations. Without doing this critical work, taking concepts developed within modern Western political philosophy as the foundation from which to build further theories of social justice may result in extending the life of racist ideas and failing in our anti-racist aims (Mills 1998; Gines 2014; Basevich 2020; Zack 2017; Taylor et al. 2018). Concepts that look to be neutral on issues of race may have racist effects even without racist motivations, such as the labor theory of value that excuses the appropriation of lands from indigenous groups, or concepts of equality that may be formulated in a way that assumes sameness, or ontologies of the self that obscure relationality and dependence on hierarchical social infrastructures. Thus, it is not merely that the traditional canon needs to be augmented: it needs a thorough critical analysis that puts ideas and concepts in their historical context, explores their real-world applications, and then considers the reasons for their influence and popularity vis-à-vis other possible positions available at the time or, frankly, even now.
5.2 The Revelations of Contextualization
To reiterate, a historical and cultural contextualization of philosophical ideas is perhaps the most crucial methodological reform needed to change the way we understand the history of philosophy, and contextualization is just as important in regard to present day work as for philosophy written in the distant past. Contemporary approaches to philosophical historiography have sometimes assumed that contextualization is unnecessary, but this assumption, left unchallenged, can constrain critical analysis. When traditional historians of philosophy have begun to engage with questions of race, the problematics have sometimes been foreshortened by decontextualized methods of analysis. In this vein, Robert Bernasconi argues that naturalistic tendencies in analytic philosophy have overemphasized the question of whether a given philosopher believed in race as a natural kind, resulting in a limited interpretive exploration (2012, 552–553).
Take, for example, Du Bois’s rich 1899 [1986a] text “The Conservation of Races” where he elaborates an account of African Americans as a distinct historical people. Du Bois’s account was reduced in a number of contemporary critical essays to the question of whether he meant “black” to refer to biology, in which biological concepts themselves were understood as free of culture. But from phenomenology’s point of view, the philosophical conceptualization of nature, and the current political uses made of naturalist claims, are themselves cultural artifacts, historically and culturally contingent. Thus, when we read the history of modern European philosophy, we need to be alive to the ways in which “nature” is being socially constructed and conscripted for philosophical projects.
CPR has worked to advance new interpretations of canonical philosophers but has also, at the meta-level, contested standard approaches to interpretation. The interpretation of Kant, for example, has had to contend with his extensive writings on anthropology and geography in which he espoused unambiguously racist claims (Elden and Mendieta 2011; Kant 1798 ). Until recently this large body of writings was considered irrelevant to the understanding of Kant’s ethics or his cosmopolitanism on the grounds of disciplinary distinctions between philosophical work and other writings. But why ignore Kant’s writings about the nature of human difference if we are trying to understand his actual views about the way peoples should interact? Like feminist philosophers who developed an analysis of the subtle ways in which some moral theories assumed a male embodiment, Critical Philosophers of Race have shown that doctrines of self-determination and universal reciprocity developed by modern European philosophers were never intended to apply to all groups: the right to autonomy was based on certain capacities that legitimated the exclusion of children, the disabled, and usually women, but, also, non-Europeans who were viewed as developmentally “behind”. Taking some aspect of a philosophers’ view and giving it the most generous reading possible distorts our understanding of modern philosophy and its conceptual offerings (Basevich 2020; Shorter-Bourhanou forthcoming; Kirkland 2018).
Mills argues that the only way to make sense of the evident contradictions in modern European philosophy is to understand this body of work as distinguishing types of selves among the human race (Mills 1998). Because of these type-differences, anti-authoritarian reforms and demands for democracy were never meant to be extended to the colonies. Sub-persons (women, slaves, the members of inferior cultures) did not merit suffrage, freedom, consultation, or self-determination. There was debate over whether these groups would remain forever inferior, less than human, or whether they might advance (Boxill 2005). But even those, like Rousseau, who believed in the possibility of uplift, assumed that “persons” would be the ones showing “sub-persons” the way forward, and judging their progress.
5.3 Questioning ‘modernity’ itself
Lucius Outlaw characterizes modern European philosophers as sharing a commitment to a “project of modernity” that aimed to put all human activity “under the aegis of ‘reason’” (1996, 147; see also Kirkland 2018; Yancy 2020; Dussel 1995, 2013, 2018; McCarthy 2009; Mehta 1999). Despite a diversity of approaches and disagreements, the modern Europeans shared a distinctive philosophy of history that defined progress as the expansion of freedom and rationality. Social institutions and cultures could then be compared and ranked in regard to this singular metric of universal development. It was useful for Empire, as Outlaw argues, to reframe the wide expanse of alterity among human beings and cultures as developmental differences. The possibilities of a true pluralism was then foreclosed by norms of modernity. The unfortunate result still with us is that the impetus to study current social and cultural differences in thought, or the variety of philosophical writings, is diminished on the grounds that these constitute inessential and accidental aspects of the human condition, irrelevant to the formulation or discernment of freedom and reason. Eurocentrism in philosophical curricula is then no accident, Outlaw concludes, nor is it viewed as a deficiency since the modern European canon is assumed to provide sufficient elaboration and debate over the universal principles of freedom and reason.
Thus, this project of modernity gave birth to a “false universalism that blocks the appreciation of racial and ethnic differences…and contributed to deceptions that masked various forms of domination that were rationalized…” (Outlaw 1996, 150). Critical social theory worthy of the name needs to embrace a pluralism of philosophical projects, concepts, and frameworks that have arisen from differently situated thinkers from diverse regions or group experiences who are addressing, at least in some cases, dissimilar puzzles and challenges. A pluralist approach to philosophical projects can then engage in critical dialogue across these differences. The point of noting real philosophical alterities for Outlaw is not to counsel empty tolerance but to avoid presumptive judgments based on putative universals crafted by only one side.
Questioning European projects of modernity has been productively disruptive of the staid problematics that have dominated numerous sub-fields, from political philosophy to aesthetics to epistemology (Narayan and Harding 2000; Dotson 2012, 2014; Taylor 2016). Previously, the focal points that dominated these sub-fields, such as skepticism, ideal forms of justice, the universal nature of aesthetic value, and so on, came exclusively from modern European or ancient Greek philosophers. The recent critical work is challenging the hegemony of the traditional canon in setting out the agenda for philosophy. To be sure, previous movements in philosophy have also made progress in expanding the problematics, such as pragmatism, post-structuralism, social epistemology, feminist philosophy, and others. New questions have made it to the table, and old questions have had new formulations.
Particularly important has been the transformation of political problematics, reaching well beyond the debates over liberalism, conservatism, and Marxism (McGary 1999; Cohen 1999, Gooding-Williams 2009; Shelby 2018; Lugones 2003; Corlett 2003 and 2010; Darby and Rury 2018; Hanchard 2018). The move from ideal to non-ideal approaches has played a particularly productive role in opening up the field of political philosophy to engage with racial injustice and inequality (Mills 2005). Non-ideal approaches have cast new light on ideal conceptions of normative, optimally functional behavior. Shelby, Gooding-Williams, and Cathy Cohen have all, in different ways, turned to the project of investigating “how [so-called] deviant practices can be transformed into political challenges to the power that the state exercises over the ghetto poor through the promotion and enforcement of [illegitimate] norms” (Gooding-Williams 2009, 251). Gooding-Williams indicts Du Bois’s adoption of mainstream norms of respectability in his account of the Philadelphia ghettos and suggests that we look instead to Frederick Douglas as the better political philosopher for emancipation (see also James 1997). The project of civilizing Black people was a strategy that would only ensure their subjection. Douglas envisioned a subaltern black counterpublic that might have its own distinct ideas about the optimal norms of communal life and what constituted civilized behavior (see Dawson 2011).
These new problematics in political philosophy often draw from neglected historical sources, including Douglass and Du Bois as well as Martin Delaney, Anna Julia Cooper, Simon Bolivar, Kwame Nkrumah, Amilcar Cabral, Walter Rodney, Haya de la Torre, Jose Martí, Aimé and Suzanne Cesaire, Edouard Glissant, and many others. Related to these new non-European sources has been an altered map of the European sources of greatest interest, to include more of Montaigne, Las Casas, Condorcet, Rousseau, Gramsci, Marcuse, and others.
To be sure, many Critical Philosophers of Race decline to follow Outlaw in believing that there is a ‘black counterpublic’ that represents a racially cohesive formation. To the extent there is cohesion, it is based more on opposition to white supremacy, some argue, than an expression of shared sensibilities and orientations. And so the debate ensues. As this entry has shown, strong differences abound among CPR scholars over the history of Negritude and metissage, the implications of intersectionality, the meaning and future of racial concepts, and the weighty role of capitalism as a causal factor. A newly interpreted, reorganized and expanded history of philosophy is reformulating our central questions in many sub-fields, invigorating new lines of argumentation, more relevant for current challenges.
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Other Important Works
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