Causation in Arabic and Islamic Thought

First published Mon Oct 26, 2015

In the classical period of Arabic and Islamic thought (9th–12th centuries), original and influential accounts of causation emerged from debate within two intellectual traditions: speculative theology (kalām) and Greek philosophy (falsafah). Among the theologians (mutakallimūn), dispute about the distribution of agency and causal power played a role in the interpretation of revealed accounts of God and his relationship to the world. By contrast, the philosophers (falāsifah) saw themselves as developing a rationalist science begun by Aristotle. In this tradition, to know a thing is to know its causes. Discovery of the nature of causation is regarded as fundamental to science.

In the classical period, at least, theology and philosophy developed separately. Indeed, philosophy’s independence from theology in this period is striking as compared to its subordinate status as the handmaid of theology in the Medieval Latin West. Nevertheless, debate across theology and philosophy contributed to the development of both traditions. Especially fruitful for the philosophy of causation were attacks on Aristotelian natural philosophy by Ashʿarite theologians. These attacks employed arguments that reappear in Early Modern causality debates.

1. Kalām debates

1.1 Divine justice and human freedom in Muʿtazilite theology

With some exceptions, Islamic theologians see the created world as composed of atoms, which differ from one another through their possession of accidents (Dhanani 1994; Frank 1999). Generally speaking, they also hold that God recreates the world composed of atoms and their accidents at every moment. So, they consider God the immediate cause of every change. According to this view, God creates the atoms that comprise my skin and the paleness that belongs to them at the initial moment of their existence and at all subsequent moments in which they exist. If my skin retains its paleness over time, this is due to God’s sustaining its paleness. Likewise, if my skin reddens when exposed to sunlight, this is due to God’s creating in it a series of accidents, each a deeper shade of red than its predecessor.

Eighth-century Muʿtazilite theologians make an important exception to this general account: they consider humanity to have the power to produce its own actions, whether these are thoughts, volitions or bodily movements. They see this position as required by divine justice (Wolfson 1976; Frank 1982, 1983, 1985; Vasalou 2008). Suppose, for example, that I intentionally strike you and, as a result, you fall into a coma. In accordance with the ontology discussed above, the Muʿtazilites consider this event to involve the coming into existence of certain accidents, which include my choice (ikhtiyār) to strike you, the bodily motion of striking and your falling into a coma. The Muʿtazilites hold that I am the source of these accidents by appeal to divine justice: otherwise, divine reward or punishment of me on the basis of my actions would be unjust.

According to Muʿtazilite theologians, then, the circle of agents includes God and humanity: God creates and conserves atoms and accidents. Human agency produces certain accidents. Some of these are directly produced by human agents; for example, my choice to strike you and the bodily motion of striking. Others are produced by generation (tawallud); for example, your falling into a coma. An accident is said to be generated by a human agent when she directly produces the cause (sabab) of the accident rather than the accident itself. Where a human agent directly produces the cause of an accident, the accident will come into being unless impeded. This account does not involve cooperation between God and human beings in the direct production of accidents. Moreover, it does not involve shared responsibility between God and human beings in the generation of accidents. In cases where a human agent directly produces the cause of an accident, rather than the accident itself, the responsibility for the occurrence of the accident lies with the human agent alone. Indeed, the point of identifying a human being as the source of certain accidents is to release God of responsibility for the existence of those accidents. This approach engendered debate among Muʿtazilites about the scope of human agency and responsibility. Topics of concern included the relationship between motivation and action. Given that motivation is determined by antecedent causes, were an agent’s motivation the sufficient cause of her action, responsibility for the action would lie with the source of the motivation, which may be external to the agent. According to ʿAbd al-Jabbār (935–1025), motivation is not the sufficient cause of action, which requires choice as well (Frank 1982). This response links agency and responsibility to choice.

1.2 Divine omnipotence and occasionalism in Ashʿarī and his followers

In the ninth century, many mutakallimūn were persuaded by al-Ashʿarī (874–936) that Muʿtazilite accounts of human action incorrectly limit divine power. According to al-Ashʿarī, the doctrine of divine power requires that God be in complete control of the production of all atoms and accidents. For this reason, he argues, we must reject the Muʿtazilite view that human agents create their own actions and generate their effects. Al-Ashʿarī develops a rival position on human action, whose core doctrine is divine creation of the power by which a human being performs each of its actions (Frank 1966). Suppose, again, that I intentionally strike you and, as a result, you fall into a coma. As al-Ashʿarī sees it, this occurs by God creating in me a power through which I generate your falling into a coma. This power is a power for a specific action, namely, my striking you in a particular way at this particular time. It is an accident that belongs to me only temporarily. Though the power is in me, God is in complete control of what happens, since he elects to create the power. Al-Ashʿarī and his followers use the term kasb (acquisition) to designate this type of power. In his treatise On Power, al-Ghazālī (1056–1111) explains the doctrine of acquisition as a middle position between that of the determinists, who deny that created things have power, and that of the Muʿtazilites, who hold that humanity produces its own actions. He rejects the determinist position on the ground that it cannot account for the difference between a deliberate human action and an involuntary one, such as a bodily tremor. He rejects the Muʿtazilite position for a few different reasons; central to his argument is an appeal to the pervasiveness of divine power. On the basis of his analysis of these rival positions, al-Ghazālī draws two conclusions. First, it must be possible for two possessors of power, a human being and God, to be related to the same object of power. Second, the power possessed by the human being cannot be causally related to the object of power because this would conflict with the pervasiveness of divine power. He links these conclusions to the doctrine of acquisition. As he sees it, this doctrine attributes created power to humanity, but also maintains that the relationship between this created power and its object is non-causal (al-Ghazālī AIFI; McGinnis and Reisman 2007: 254–265; Marmura 1994). On this account of the doctrine of acquisition, it holds that God alone has causal power.

In sum, whereas Muʿtazilite theologians appeal to divine justice to show that the circle of agents includes God and humanity, al-Ashʿarī and his followers appeal to divine omnipotence to limit agency to God alone. Generally speaking, Ashʿarīte theologians seem to endorse occasionalism, the view that God is the only true cause. Some interpreters, however, consider al-Ashʿarī’s claim that human beings are the subjects of temporary powers for specific actions to indicate that his position falls short of full-blown occasionalism (Frank 1966).

Ashʿarite attacks on Aristotelian natural philosophy also seem to advocate occasionalism. They target the Aristotelian tenet that bodies have causal power in virtue of their specific natures. They suggest instead that God alone has causal power. Some of these attacks, especially those of al-Ghazālī, contributed to the development of occasionalism in the West (Nadler 1996; Perler and Rudolph 2000). Ashʿarite attacks on Aristotelian natural philosophy also contributed to the development of accounts of causation by Arabic falāsifah insofar as the latter attempted to rebut these attacks.

2. Aristotelian causality

2.1 Aristotle’s four causes in Arabic falsafa

The Arabic word falsafah is taken from the Greek philosophia. Falsafah is understood by our authors as an intellectual practice developed in Ancient Greece, which emphasizes the use of rational understanding and demonstration in the pursuit of knowledge (ʿilm). For them, the most important and influential of the Ancient Greek philosophers is Aristotle, whom they deem “the First Teacher”. Other influences include Neoplatonic thinkers, especially Proclus and Plotinus, as well as Ancient Greek commentators on Aristotle, such as Alexander of Aphrodisias. See the entry on Greek sources in Arabic and Islamic philosophy.

Just as Aristotle is “the First Teacher” for the philosophers, so his doctrine of the four causes is the starting point for their accounts of causation. In Physics, Aristotle introduces this doctrine as ancillary to the study of natural change: We must proceed to consider the character and number of causes, he says, because to know a thing is to grasp the “why” of it, and this is to grasp its primary cause. He then posits four types of causes to explain natural change (whether substantial, i.e., coming to be and passing away, or accidental, i.e., change of quantity, quality or place). In works of natural philosophy and metaphysics, Arabic authors defend Aristotle’s view that we must posit four (and only four) types of causes: material, formal, efficient and final. Generally speaking, they maintain that each type of cause contributes to the goal of explanation and that the four causes together are sufficient for explanation.

Material and formal causes are considered as intrinsic to or immanent in their effects, efficient and final causes as extrinsic to their effects (Wisnovsky 2003b). While the philosophers examine each type of cause, they appear to devote greater attention to the latter pair, the efficient and final causes. Their accounts of these have therefore received more scholarly notice. Still, certain aspects of their accounts of Aristotle’s material and formal causes have been studied (Bertolacci 2002). Perhaps the most important of these is the doctrine of corporeal form (ṣūrah jismiyyah), which was developed to explain a defining feature of body: its receptivity to the three dimensions of length, breadth and depth (Hyman 1965; Stone 2001; Shihadeh 2014). Their discussions of corporeal form contribute primarily to their accounts of substance, not to their accounts of causation. Their contributions to the philosophy of causation emerge more from their discussions of the efficient and final causes.

2.2 Efficient causality

In Physics 2.3, Aristotle says that the causes include the primary principle of motion and coming to rest. In Arabic philosophical works, the terms “agent” (al-fāʿil), “active” (al-faʿʿāl) and “efficient” (al-fāʿilah) refer to this type of cause. Generally speaking, the philosophers consider the circle of agents to encompass natural bodies, created intellects and God. They regard God as a creative agent in the sense that his activity presupposes nothing outside of him, not even matter. Most of the philosophers see creation as an eternal act, not a temporal one. Al-Kindī (800–870) is exceptional in defending creation in time. Ibn Rushd (1126–1198), known to English speakers by his Latinized name, Averroes, is also exceptional: in his mature works, he rejects creation as incompatible with Aristotelian texts and principles. In his Long Commentary on Aristotle’s Metaphysics, Book Lam, for example, he interprets Aristotle’s God as an ultimate final cause of motion, not a creative agent (Genequand 1984). Arabic philosophical accounts of God as a creative agent are partly derived from Neoplatonic texts (Wisnovsky 2002; Kukkonen 2010). No doubt these accounts are also influenced by a cultural context in which the term “agent” is associated with God and with the divine power to create. Still, it is important to note that the philosophers attempt to demonstrate their accounts of God as a creative agent, often in novel ways. So, they cannot be said merely to follow tradition or culture on this issue.

The philosophers’ expansive view of the scope of agency presents a challenge with respect to defining the efficient cause: it demands an overarching account, which encompasses natural and creative agents.

2.2.1 Al-Kindī

Early attempts to provide an overarching account of the efficient cause are found in writings by al-Kindī. These include The Explanation of the Proximate Efficient Cause for Generation and Corruption (al-Kindī RAKAF: 214–37; McGinnis and Reisman 2007: 1–16). In this text, al-Kindī illustrates the efficient cause by means of an example drawn from the realm of art: the making of a golden coin. In this example, the efficient cause is the craftsman who makes the form of “coin” become one with some gold. Divine efficient causality is also construed in terms of art, though its art is said to be very superior to ours: the craftsmanship in a bed or chair is as nothing in comparison to the harmonious product of God’s most perfect command.

In this text, al-Kindī also employs a distinction between proximate and remote efficient causes to show how created efficient causality depends on divine causality:

The remote efficient cause is like someone who shoots an arrow at an animal and kills it. The one who shoots the arrow is the remote cause of killing the animal, whereas the arrow is the proximate cause of its being killed; for the one who shoots with the intention of killing the animal produces the piercing action of the arrow, but the arrow produces the killing of the living thing by wounding it (McGinnis and Reisman 2007: 4).

The example emphasizes the instrumental nature of the causality of a proximate efficient cause. That the arrow acquires the force needed for its piercing action and that it pierces an animal, rather than a tree, depends on the hunter’s shooting it with the intention to kill the animal.

Al-Kindī applies his distinction between proximate and remote efficient causes to explain generation and corruption as follows. Created things are the proximate efficient causes of generation and corruption, but God is their remote efficient cause. God’s contribution to generation and corruption has to do with the harmonious order of his creation. This order is seen in the relationships between created things, especially their causal relationships.

In sum, al-Kindī suggests in this text that both created and divine efficient causes can be understood in terms of craftsmanship. The craftsman model serves as the overarching account of the efficient cause. On the other hand, al-Kindī identifies two major differences between created and divine agency. First, divine craftsmanship is far superior to that of created things. Second, the efficient causality of created things depends on divine efficient causality. The actions of the former depend on the harmonious order of God’s creation.

In a second text, The One True and Complete Agent and the Incomplete Metaphorical Agent, al-Kindī may seem to attribute genuine agency to God alone (al-Kindī OPK: 169–171; McGinnis and Reisman 2007: 22–23). In this text, al-Kindī defines a true agent as one that acts without being acted upon in any way. God is said to be the sole true agent. He likewise defines a metaphorical agent as one who acts as a result of having been acted upon, i.e., one that is both an agent and a patient. Every created agent is said to be a metaphorical agent. Al-Kindī then argues that God is truly the First Cause of everything acted upon because he is an agent not acted upon in any way. As he sees its, God is the immediate cause of a first thing acted upon and a cause through mediation of the effects of the first thing acted upon and so on. (Adamson 2007: 57–62). Al-Kindī’s account of “true” agency is rather different from that of an occasionalist. While the occasionalist holds that causal efficacy belongs to God alone, al-Kindī attributes causal efficacy to God and to created things. The latter differ from God in that they are both agents and patients. Generally speaking, the doctrine of occasionalism is rejected by the philosophers.

2.2.2 Avicenna

The most extensive treatment of Aristotelian efficient causation, and the most influential, is given by Ibn Sīnā (987–1037), known to English speakers by his Latinized name, Avicenna. Avicenna’s most developed accounts of the efficient cause appear in the Physics and Metaphysics of his magnum opus, Kitāb al-Shifāʾ (Book of Healing).

In the Physics of the Book of Healing, Avicenna defines the efficient cause or agent as follows:

In natural things, agent is often said of the principle of another’s motion insofar as it is other. By motion, we mean here whatever passes from potency to act in a given matter. (Avicenna PH: 64)

He considers his “physical” definition of the efficient cause or agent as a principle of another’s motion to be sufficient for the purposes of doing natural philosophy. But this definition is provisional:

when the efficient principle is considered not with respect to natural things, but rather with respect to existence itself, there will be a more general concept. (Avicenna PH: 65)

The task of developing this more general conception of the efficient cause falls to the metaphysician, whose investigations transcend the concerns of any of the particular sciences, e.g., natural philosophy.

In the Metaphysics of the Book of Healing, Avicenna defines each of the four causes in relation to the subject studied in metaphysics, the existent qua existent. He defines the efficient cause or agent as that which bestows existence to another (Avicenna MH: 194). He distinguishes his metaphysical definition of the efficient cause from that of the natural philosopher as follows:

Metaphysical philosophers do not mean by “agent” only the principle of motion, as the natural philosophers mean, but the principle and giver of existence, as in the case of God with respect to the world. As for the natural efficient cause, it does not bestow any existence other than motion in one of the forms of motion. Thus, in the natural sciences, that which bestows existence is a principle of motion. (Avicenna MH: 195, trans. modified)

In this passage, Avicenna states that natural efficient causes do not “bestow any existence other than motion in one of the forms of motion” and that “in the natural sciences, that which bestows existence is a principle of motion”. These statements suggest that natural efficient causes do bestow existence, albeit in an inferior way. So, Avicenna considers his definition of the efficient cause as a giver of being to another to encompass both natural agents and creative agents.

Avicenna proceeds to elaborate his “metaphysical” conception of the efficient cause in a series of arguments, which aim to correct common errors about this type of cause. One is the belief that every agent is first inactive and then active, which arises from consideration of ordinary events and processes, such as my rising upon hearing the doorbell. Avicenna objects that this implies that every agent is also a recipient of action (Avicenna MH: 200). For where an agent is first inactive and then active, her action is due to her being affected in some way: my rising is partly due to my being affected by the ringing of the doorbell. Avicenna contends that while some agents are first inactive and then active and so act as a result of their being affected in some way, neither of these features is required for agency. Indeed, because inactivity and being affected are opposed to activity and action, he reasons, the former do not belong to the account of agency, strictly speaking. Now, in correcting this error about the efficient cause, Avicenna aims to make conceptual room for divine agency. One feature of divine agency, which we have already seen in al-Kindī, is that God acts without his being affected in any way. Still, it is important to note that Avicenna does not appeal to accepted features of divine agency to make his case. Rather, he attempts to show by conceptual analysis that the ordinary view, on which every agent is first inactive and then active, is too narrow.

As we have seen (in §2.2.1), al-Kindī, in one text, draws a distinction between a “true” agent, one that acts without being acted upon, and a “metaphorical” agent, one that is both an agent and a patient. Avicenna likewise distinguishes the agent that acts without being acted upon from the agent that is both an agent and a patient. While he does not deem the latter a “metaphorical” agent, he does elaborate a hierarchical conception of agency.

Avicenna explains the superiority of a highest type of efficient cause as follows: Where something is such that, whenever it exists, it produces the existence of something else by virtue of its own essence, and where its effect exists after absolute nonexistence and is permanent, then that thing has a higher claim to causality than other things. For such an efficient cause entirely prevents the nonexistence of its effect; it gives complete existence to the effect (Avicenna MH: 203; Marmura 1984).

Avicenna explains the inferiority of the lowest type of efficient cause as follows: This type gives being to an effect that does not exist after absolute nonexistence but after a specific privation in matter. Of this type of agent, he says that its power to give being to another is weak, of short duration, and intermittent (Avicenna MH: 204). Sublunary substances such as plants and animals are efficient causes of this lowest type.

Avicenna also recognizes an intermediate type of efficient cause: This third type gives being to an effect that does not exist after absolute nonexistence or after a specific privation in matter; rather the existence of this effect is preceded by the existence of something else, which is non-material. Avicenna mentions that there is dispute about whether an agent of this third type should be called a “creator”. He says that while some wish to reserve that term for the efficient causality of the first cause (God), he favors the opposite view: “creation” is properly said of every agent which gives being to an effect whose existence is not preceded by privation in matter. This intermediate type of efficient cause plays a role in Avicenna’s emanationist account of creation. On this account, creation occurs in a stepwise way beginning with the original creative act of God, whose immediate effect is an intellect. The first created intellect then creates three things: (i) the body of the outermost sphere, (ii) the soul which moves the outermost sphere and (iii) a second intellect. The second intellect likewise creates three things and so on. The lowest of the created intellects—namely, the Agent Intellect—creates the form and matter of the sublunar world, as well as the rational souls of individual human beings. Avicenna adapts his account of emanation from al-Fārābī (870–950), known among the philosophers as the “Second Teacher”, though his version of emanation differs from that of al-Fārābī in several ways (Davidson 1992).

Avicenna’s hierarchical account of agency acknowledges the superiority of divine causation and identifies the differences between creative and non-creative efficient causes. Still, it supports his earlier suggestion that he means to offer a unified account of the efficient cause, which encompasses both natural and creative agents. For each member of the hierarchy is construed as that which gives being to another. So, in his Metaphysics, Avicenna provides an overarching account of the efficient cause as that which gives being to another.

This unified account may seem to be comprised by Avicenna’s use of a distinction between “true” and “auxiliary” efficient causes. On his account of this distinction, however, the term “auxiliary” merely describes a true efficient cause insofar as its action aids that of another true efficient cause (Richardson 2013). This account emerges from his defense of the view that the efficient cause is simultaneous with its effect. He sees the opposite view—that the efficient cause is temporally prior to its effect—as a common error, which arises from consideration of ordinary events and processes, such as construction and reproduction: the builder building is temporally prior to the existence of the house; the father inseminating is temporally prior to the existence of the child. Avicenna argues that this account misreports the proper effects of ordinary efficient causes. The proper effect of the builder is building, not the existence of the house, and the proper effect of the father is insemination, not the existence of the child. Builders and fathers are true efficient causes of building and insemination, but they are only auxiliary efficient causes of the existence of buildings and children. So, builders and fathers are simultaneous with, not temporally prior to, their proper effects. Still, their actions make some contribution to the existence of buildings and children. This contribution is acknowledged through their designation as auxiliary efficient causes of the existence of buildings and children. The claim that builders and fathers are only auxiliary efficient causes of the existence of buildings and children invites us to investigate the true causes of their existence. According to Avicenna, the proximate efficient cause of the existence of sublunary substance is the Agent Intellect, while its ultimate efficient cause is God.

2.2.3 After Avicenna

Avicenna’s account of the efficient cause was influential in the Medieval Latin West in part because it offers an explanation of divine agency within an Aristotelian philosophical framework (Gilson 1958, 1962). It appears to have influenced discussion of divine agency by Scholastic theologians, including Thomas Aquinas and Duns Scotus (Druart 2002; Acar 2005). While Avicenna also had many adherents within his own culture, his positions on numerous issues, including the scope of efficient causation, were criticized not only by Islamic theologians but also by his fellow philosophers.

As mentioned earlier (in §1.2), Ashʿarite theologians tend to hold that God alone has causal power. They primarily support this view by appeal to the doctrine of divine omnipotence. Still, discussion of the nature of agency also plays a role in some of their arguments. For example, in The Incoherence of the Philosophers, al-Ghazālī maintains that “agent” (al-fāʿil)

refers to that from whom the act proceeds; this is one who acts by will and choice and has knowledge (al-ʿilm) of what is willed. (al-Ghazālī IP: 57).

This argument suggests that we should restrict the scope of agency to intelligent beings on conceptual grounds. Al-Ghazālī makes a similar argument in his treatise On Power (al-Ghazālī AIFI; McGinnis and Reisman 2007: 254–265; Marmura 1994). The conclusion of the conceptual argument allows for agency in any intelligent being and so allows for human agency. Whether al-Ghazālī accepts this implication of his conceptual argument is unclear (Druart 2006).

Averroes undertakes to defend positions closer to Aristotle against “innovations” by later Aristotelians. These innovations include al-Fārābī’s and Avicenna’s emanationist accounts of creation. While Averroes accepts emanation in his early writings, he denounces it with vigor in his mature works (Averroes MTE; Genequand 1984; Davidson 1992). He argues that God’s existence can be satisfactorily shown only via a proof from motion (Davidson 1987: 311–335; Twetten 1995; Kukkonen 2002). He also argues that, strictly speaking, God is not a creator: his causality is that of an ultimate final cause of motion. This is suggested in the Incoherence of the Incoherence, where he claims that God is an agent by way of final causality (Averroes ITI: 138). It is perhaps mostly plainly stated in his Long Commentary on Aristotle’s Metaphysics, Book Lam (Genequand 1984). From this position, it follows that certain aspects of Avicenna’s accounts of the efficient cause are otiose: there is no need to revise Aristotle’s account of the efficient cause to encompass creative agents.

Averroes’ account of divine causality reflects his position that truth is to be found through correct interpretation of Aristotle, together with correct application of the principles and methods of philosophy. According to Averroes, the methods of philosophy are uniquely suited to establish truth (Taylor 2000). The role of religion is to transmit that truth to the masses via narrative and metaphor. Generally speaking, this position on the relationship between philosophy and religion is shared by other Aristotelians in the Arabic tradition, including al-Fārābī and Avicenna. The latter differ from Averroes in that they are less concerned than he is to interpret Aristotle correctly. Rather, they adopt Aristotle’s philosophical framework, but feel free to modify it in light of their own discoveries.

2.3 Final causality

In Physics 2.3, Aristotle says that the things called causes also include “the end or that for the sake of which the thing is done”. In Arabic philosophical works, the terms “final cause” (al-ʿillah al-ghāʾiyyah) and “end” (al-ghāyah) designate this type of cause. The philosophers consider both natural motion and divine action to occur for the sake of an end, though they consider the latter to differ from the former in an important way. Natural bodies are said to act for the sake of something distinct from themselves, which they lack. For example, an animal builds for the sake of shelter. By contrast, God’s end is not distinct from God itself. God acts for the sake of itself. This idea is implicit in al-Kindī’s account of the final cause in The Explanation of the Proximate Efficient Cause for Generation and Corruption, which states that the end is either something external to the efficient cause, which compels it to act, or it is not something external to the efficient cause; in the latter case, the efficient cause acts “only because of itself” (McGinnis and Reisman 2007: 4). Presumably, the latter case describes divine action. Avicenna attempts to explain the idea that God cannot act for the sake of something distinct from itself as follows. He argues that an agent’s desire for an end distinct from itself implies the agent’s imperfection, since the object of the agent’s desire must be superior to the agent. In support of the latter claim, he reasons that the object of an agent’s desire must be something that perfects or benefits the agent (Avicenna MH: 321). So, an absolutely perfect agent as is God cannot act from desire for an end distinct from itself. Avicenna also argues that an agent’s intending something distinct from itself implies the agent’s multiplicity, since it involves multiple acts of knowledge, e.g., knowledge of the intention, of the reason for the intention and of the benefit to the agent to be derived from the intention (Avicenna MH: 326; McGinnis 2010: 206–208). So, an absolutely simple agent as is God cannot act by intending for the sake of something other than itself.

Another aim of Arabic philosophical discussions of final causality is to meet various objections to Aristotelian teleology. Avicenna takes up this challenge with great energy. Again, the most developed arguments are found in the Physics and Metaphysics of the Book of Healing. In Physics I 13–14, Avicenna attempts to meet to objections derived from Aristotle’s discussion of Ancient materialists, such as Democritus and Empedocles. In Metaphysics VI 5, he treats additional objections. Perhaps these are of greatest interest.

One objection asserts as obvious that certain human actions are trivial or purposeless (ʿabath); the example given is playing with one’s beard (Avicenna MH: 220–225). This objection challenges the idea that every natural motion has an end or goal. The objection is probably derived from Alexander of Aphrodisias, who claims in On Fate that twiddling with toothpicks and touching and pulling one’s hair do not have a cause in the sense of an end (Sharples 1983: 44). Against this objection, Avicenna maintains that apparently trivial human actions are motivated by unconscious desire for pleasure, the good of the animal soul (Richardson 2015). This argument derives support from Avicenna’s original and influential account of the internal senses, which explains the cognitive bases of such actions (Avicenna ASAN: 43–45, 58–61, 163–69; Black 2000, 2013a).

Avicenna also devotes considerable attention to this objection: “Why is the end considered a prior cause when in fact it is an effect of the other causes?”(Avicenna MH: 220, trans. modified). This objection asserts that it is inappropriate to include the end among the types of causes on the ground that causes are ontologically prior to effects. Avicenna’s reply involves a distinction between (i) the “thingness” (shayʾiyyah) or essence (māhiyyah) of the end and (ii) the existence of the end: while the existence of the end in concrete particulars is posterior to and, thus, an effect of the other causes, the thingness (or essence) of the end exists prior to action and causes the causality of the other causes (Avicenna MH: 228; Wisnovsky 2000, 2003a). He also makes a further point, which is historically significant: the thingness (or essence) of the end “is not a cause unless it occurs as an image in the soul, or as something analogous to that” (Avicenna MH: 228, trans. modified).

Avicenna’s account of the priority of the final cause was influential in the Latin West, where it was taken by some to support the view that the scope of final causation be restricted to agents with cognitive powers (Maier 1955). This interpretation also appears in the Arabic tradition. Roughly speaking, Avicenna was taken to have shown that (i) the claim that the end is a cause of motion depends on the claim that it is prior to and a cause of the causality of the other causes and (ii) the claim that the end is prior to and a cause of the causality of the other causes is true only in cases where it exists in the mind or soul of the efficient cause.

With respect to this interpretation of Avicenna, it is important to emphasize that, in his account of the priority of the final cause, he mentions that the thingness (or essence) of the end may exist prior to motion as an image in the soul “or as something analogous to that” (Avicenna MH: 228, trans. modified). In this passage, he suggests that the thingness or essence of the end may exist prior to motion either as an object of cognition, or in another way, which is different from, but analogous to, existing as an object of cognition. Furthermore, Avicenna’s various discussions of the final cause give every indication that he considers the motion of natural bodies without cognitive powers to occur for the sake of an end, which is prior to and a cause of that motion. Still, it seems especially difficult to prove that that the end of natural motion is prior to and a cause of that motion.

This issue was widely discussed by Arabic philosophers and theologians. In his commentary on Avicenna’s Pointers and Reminders, al-Ṭūsī attempts to resolve this problem by suggesting that we can attribute a sort of prior awareness (shuʿūr) to the nature of a body (Avicenna and Ṭūsī PR: part IV, 7, 18). Ṭūsī makes these remarks in reply to Fakhr al-Dīn al-Rāzī’s complaint that Avicenna’s conception of the final cause applies only to cognitive agents. By contrast, al-Ghazālī maintains that the inanimate is called “a seeker and a willer” only figuratively:

For it is said the stone falls because it wills [to move to] the center and seeks it, when seeking and willing in reality are only conceivable in conjunction with the knowledge (al-ʿilm) of what is willed and sought after and are [thus] conceivable only of animals. (al-Ghazālī IP: 57)

Avicenna may be able to meet this objection by appeal to his account of natural inclination (Richardson 2015).

3. Modality and the causal relation

3.1 Avicenna’s necessitation thesis

One striking feature of Arabic and Islamic accounts of causation is the use of the modal terms “necessary” and “possible” to analyze the causal relation. This practice is especially prominent in Avicenna’s discussions of causality, which emphasize his necessitation thesis: “with the existence of its cause, the existence an effect is necessary”. Although Avicenna does not employ this thesis to restrict the scope of causal power to God, his necessitation thesis appears to have played a role in the history of occasionalism insofar as it is a target of al-Ghazālī’s “no necessary connection” argument, which is discussed below (in §3.2).

In the Metaphysics of the Book of Healing, Avicenna defends the necessitation thesis in order to support his coexistence thesis, which states that cause and effect coexist in time. In other words, Avicenna considers the necessitation thesis to entail that the priority of cause to effect is ontological, not temporal (Marmura 1981a).

In the central part of the argument for the necessitation thesis, Avicenna attempts to show that the causal relation cannot be fully understood in terms of possibility:

[What happens] has the possibility of happening and the possibility of not happening. It is not insofar as its happening is possible that it exists. And it is not only insofar as something else has the possibility of making it happen that it exists from another. Having the possibility of making a thing happen is not sufficient for making it happen. Given the mere possibility of making a thing happen, which is not sufficient, the thing would sometimes exist when it exists and sometimes not exist when it exists. […] But something that has the very same relationship to a thing’s existing from it as to its not existing from it has no greater claim to be the thing’s cause than not to be its cause. Indeed, sound reason demands that there be a state that differentiates between the thing’s existing from it and its not existing from it. (Avicenna MH: 126–7, trans. modified)

In this argument, Avicenna analyzes an event as follows: considered in itself, the event may exist or not exist; and, considered in relation to what has the mere possibility of making it happen, the event may exist or not exist. So, considered in either of these ways, the event may or may not exist: its existence or nonexistence hangs in the balance. He then asserts that the existence or nonexistence of one thing from another requires a difference-maker, which destroys this equilibrium. To support this conclusion, he appeals to a version of the Principle of Sufficient Reason, which states that, for everything that exists from another, there is a sufficient reason why it exists from that other rather than does not exist from that other. He then links the Principle of Sufficient Reason to the notion of “cause”: by “cause” we mean not what has the mere possibility of making something happen, but rather what is sufficient to make it happen (Richardson 2014). On the basis of this argument, Avicenna ultimately concludes that, with the existence of its cause, the existence of the effect is not merely possible, it is necessary.

Avicenna considers this account of “cause” to apply to all instances of the causal relation. Still, he recognizes important differences across the various things which function as causes. Most important are the differences between God and sublunary substance. According to Avicenna, with God’s existence, the existence of his sole immediate effect, the first intelligence, is necessary. His reasoning involves the following ideas. First, God needs nothing outside himself to produce the first intelligence. Second, God is immutable. Avicenna considers God’s immutability to entail that his knowledge and volition are also immutable. God’s knowledge and volition are the principles by which he acts. So, whenever God exists, he possesses the knowledge and volition by which he produces the first intelligence. So, with God’s existence, the existence of the first intelligence is necessary.

By contrast, with the existence of a sublunary substance, the existence of its effect is typically not necessary, but merely possible. A sublunary substance is a subject of causality (mawḍūʿ al-ʿillīyah). Whenever a subject of causality is in a state that differentiates between a thing’s existing from it and its not existing from it,

[t]he effect would then proceed from it necessarily, regardless of whether [the differentiating state] is an act of will, appetite, or anger, or something originated, natural or otherwise, or some external thing. (Avicenna MH: 127, trans. modified)

Thus, a subject of causality is a substance that functions as a cause when it is in a certain state. For example, fire functions as a cause for the burning of cotton when its power to burn is actualized in the cotton. This state occurs only when contact between agent (fire) and patient (cotton) is unimpeded and when the patient (cotton) is itself in a suitable state, e.g., the cotton is not wet.

3.2 Al-Ghazālī’s “no necessary connection” argument

In the Incoherence of the Philosophers, al-Ghazālī provides the most celebrated critique of Arabic Aristotelian accounts of causation. Al-Ghazālī’s first and most influential argument against his philosopher opponents appears to target Avicenna’s necessitation thesis. He writes,

The connection between what is habitually believed to be a cause and what is habitually believed to be an effect is not necessary, according to us. But [with] any two things, where “this” is not “that” and “that” is not “this” and where neither the affirmation of the one entails the affirmation of the other nor the negation of the one entails negation of the other, it is not a necessity of the existence of the one that the other should exist, and it is not a necessity of the nonexistence of the one that the other should not exist—for example, the quenching of thirst and drinking, satiety and eating, burning and contact with fire, light and the appearance of the sun, death and decapitation […] and so on to [include] all [that is] observable among connected things in medicine, astronomy, arts, and crafts. Their connection is due to the prior decree of God, who creates them side by side, not to its being necessary in itself, incapable of separation. (al-Ghazālī IP: 166)

Al-Ghazālī denies that natural phenomena involve necessary connections, using as his main example the burning of cotton when in contact with fire:

For we allow the possibility of the occurrence of the contact without the burning, and we allow as possible the occurrence of the cotton’s transformation into burnt ashes without contact with the fire. [The philosophers], however, deny the possibility of this. (al-Ghazālī 2000: 166–7)

Al-Ghazālī appears to attribute to his Aristotelian opponents two main claims:

  • (i) natural substances, such as fire, are causes, and
  • (ii) causal connections are necessary connections.

He also contends that (i) and (ii) imply a third claim:

  • (iii) the affirmation of contact between fire and cotton entails the affirmation of the burning of the cotton.

Al-Ghazālī suggests that, because (iii) is false, his opponents’ account of causation in nature is mistaken. One question raised by the argument is whether his opponents really accept (ii); another is whether they consider (i) and (ii) to imply (iii).

3.3 Averroes on causal necessity in nature

In the Incoherence of the Incoherence, Averroes challenges Ghazālī’s portrayal of the philosophers’ account of causal necessity as follows:

[A]re the acts which proceed from all things absolutely necessary for those in whose nature it lies to perform them, or are they only performed in most cases or in half the cases? This is a question which must be investigated, since one single action-and-passivity between two existent things occurs only through one relation out of an infinite number, and it happens often that one relation hinders another. Therefore it is not absolutely certain that fire acts when it is brought near a sensitive body, for surely it is not improbable that there should be something which stands in such a relation to the sensitive thing as to hinder the action of the fire, as is asserted of talc and other things. But one need not therefore deny fire its burning power so long as fire keeps its name and definition. (Averroes ITI: 318–19)

Averroes affirms that natural substances, such as fire, are causes. Yet, he claims that, given fire’s nearness to cotton, it is not “absolutely necessary”, nor “absolutely certain” that the cotton burns. In this sentence, he seems to deny that causal connections are necessary connections. On the other hand, the reason he denies that fire’s nearness to cotton necessitates the burning of the cotton is that there may be an impediment: the cotton could be covered in talc, which hinders the action of the fire. And he suggests that, absent this impediment, the burning would certainly take place. So, while he initially seems to deny that causal connections are necessary connections, his overall argument suggests that he affirms this claim. Furthermore, his account of causal necessity involves a more nuanced version of al-Ghazālī’s claim (iii) above (that the affirmation of contact between fire and cotton entails the affirmation of the burning of the cotton). According to Averroes’ account of causal necessity, the affirmation of contact between fire and cotton, and the affirmation that there are no impediments, together entail the affirmation of the burning of the cotton.

In sum, Averroes responds to al-Ghazālī’s “no necessary connection” argument as follows. He claims that al-Ghazālī misreports the philosophers’ account of causal necessity in nature. Furthermore, he suggests that his revised version of their account is true. So, the philosophers’ account of causal necessity in nature, properly understood, is not mistaken.

It is worth noting that Averroes’ own account of causal necessity in nature is roughly in accord with Avicenna’s. As discussed above (in §3.1), Avicenna holds that “with the existence of its cause, the existence of the effect is necessary”. He also holds, however, that the existence of a sublunary substance, which functions as a cause, is, typically, not sufficient for the exercise of its causality and, thus, typically, not sufficient for the existence of the effect of its causality. For example, fire functions as a cause of the burning of cotton only when its power to burn is actualized in the cotton. This not only requires that contact between agent (fire) and patient (cotton) be unimpeded but also that the patient (cotton) is itself in a suitable state, e.g., the cotton is not wet.

3.4 Disputed principles

According to Averroes, al-Ghazālī misreports the philosophers’ account of causal necessity in nature. Averroes also suggests that his own revised version of their account is true. While al-Ghazālī might accept the former claim, he would not accept the latter. This has to do with his understanding of the modalities. On his account of “necessary”, a connection between two things is not necessary if it is conceivable that it be severed (Kukkonen 2000; Dutton 2001). So, if it is conceivable that the cotton not burn, even though its contact with fire is unimpeded and it is dry, then it is not necessary that it burn, even when these conditions obtain. As we have seen, al-Ghazālī considers it conceivable that the cotton not burn, even when these conditions obtain. For he says that the connection between burning and contact with fire

is due to the prior decree of God, who creates them side by side, not to its being necessary in itself, incapable of separation. (al-Ghazālī IP: 166)

So, according to al-Ghazālī, it is conceivable that the cotton not burn, even though its contact with fire is unimpeded and it is dry, so it is not necessary that it burn, even when these conditions obtain. On this view, even Averroes’ revised version of the philosophers’ account of causal necessity in nature is mistaken. On the other hand, the philosophers do not accept al-Ghazālī’s account of “necessary”. More generally, they do not characterize the modalities in terms of conceivability. This suggests that the disagreement between al-Ghazālī and the philosophers about causal necessity in nature has partly to do with their differing accounts of the modalities (Kukkonen 2000; Dutton 2001). Still, it seems a more fundamental source of disagreement is their differing accounts of God.

Al-Ghazālī attacks the philosophers’ view of causal necessity in nature in order to safeguard Muslim belief in miracles and divine omnipotence (al-Ghazālī IP: 165). These tenets of faith are incompatible with Avicenna’s account of God. As mentioned earlier (in §3.1), Avicenna considers God’s immutability to entail that his knowledge, volition and action are also immutable. He also denies that God knows particular things, except in a universal way (Avicenna MH: 288; Marmura 1962; Adamson 2005). So, according to Avicenna, God cannot act otherwise than he does; furthermore, he cannot plan or execute any particular event. So, God cannot cause a miracle by altering his action so as to interrupt the course of nature. Furthermore, God cannot cause a miracle by planning and executing a grand series of particular events, which includes a deviation from the course of nature. On the contrary, God serves as the ultimate explanation of order and stability in the universe, including in the realm of nature. Against the backdrop of Avicenna’s account of God, it is not even conceivable that the cotton fail to burn when its contact with fire is unimpeded and it is dry. So, were Avicenna to accept al-Ghazālī’s account of “necessary”, as outlined above, he would still maintain that it is necessary that the cotton burn when its contact with fire is unimpeded and it is dry. The same conclusion can be derived from Averroes’ mature account of God, which describes God as the ultimate final cause of motion. Although Averroes’ account of God differs from Avicenna’s in important ways, the two accounts agree on the points that God cannot act otherwise than he does and cannot plan or execute particular events.

Of course, Avicenna and Averroes do not always state in plain terms that their accounts of God are incompatible with Muslim doctrine. They often take a conciliatory approach to religious tenets that are in tension with truths established by philosophy. This approach is related to their view that the role of religion is to transmit truth to the masses via narrative and metaphor, as discussed above (in §2.2.3).

4. Knowledge of causal powers

4.1 Avicenna on induction and experience

Aristotelian natural philosophy relies in part on sensory observation in its attribution of causal powers to natural bodies. So, it is not surprising that Arabic and Islamic thinkers raise objections to Aristotelian science, which anticipate later philosophical accounts of the problem of induction. Some of these emerge from within Aristotelianism. Avicenna provides a sustained critique of induction (istiqrāʾ) in his treatise On Demonstration (al-Burhān), the logical part of the Book of Healing. As he sees it, part of the problem is that induction may be supposed to lead to absolute, universal, and certain premises, while in reality it leads to merely probable belief. On the other hand, he holds that sensory observation together with a “hidden syllogism” gives rise to certitude. Avicenna elaborates this cognitive process under the heading of “experience” (tajribah). Tajribah is the Arabic translation of the Greek empeiria. Avicenna’s account of experience is derived in part from remarks by Aristotle and al-Fārābī on empeiria/tajribah, though it goes beyond these sources (al-Fārābī AMIF: 24–25; McGinnis and Reisman 2007: 66–67; McGinnis 2003; Janssens 2004; Black 2006).

As Avicenna describes it, experience involves repeated sensation of some phenomenon that is preserved in memory, e.g., that purging of bile follows ingestion of scammony. It also involves a “hidden” or implicit process of reasoning. We infer that the repeated connection involves an essential relation between two things: e.g., it is not accidental that the purging of bile follows the ingestion of scammony, for regularities cannot be due to chance. This implicit process of reasoning removes doubt. So, experience gives rise to certitude. Avicenna defines certitude in terms of second-order belief: one is certain when one knows that what one has assented to cannot be otherwise (Black 2013b: 122). Certitude is not wholly subjective, since knowledge of a proposition requires its truth (Black 2013b: 125). On the other hand, though experience gives rise to certitude, it does not yield knowledge in the strict sense. For knowledge in the strict sense is both necessary and explanatory. From experience we derive our certitude that members of a certain species cause something; but experience does not show why (McGinnis 2003: 320–1).

Avicenna also addresses the objection that experience may lead to false generalizations. He uses the following example. Suppose we had seen only black humans and had observed without exception that procreation issues in black children. By experience, we would conclude that all humans are black, i.e., that blackness is essential to humanity. In response to this objection, Avicenna says that knowledge derived from experience is conditional,

which is to say that the character of this thing that is repeatedly perceived is necessarily joined to something that holds always in the domain in which the thing is repeatedly perceived, unless there is an obstacle. (McGinnis and Reisman 2007: 150)

This point is applied to the example of the Sudanese as follows:

when procreation is taken to be procreation by black people, or people of one such country, then experience will be valid. If procreation is taken to be that of any given people, then experience will not end with the aforementioned particular instances; for that experience concerned a black people, but people absolutely speaking are not limited to black people. (McGinnis and Reisman 2007: 150; McGinnis 2003: 322–325)

So, in response to the objection that experience could lead to false generalizations, Avicenna advises that proper use of experience would include careful attention to the domain of a species, which was subject to repeated observation.

4.2 Al-Ghazālī’s skeptical argument

The problem of induction also plays a role in Ashʿarite attacks on Aristotelian accounts of causation in nature. As we have seen, Aristotelian natural philosophy relies in part on repeated observation in its attribution of causal powers to natural bodies. Ashʿarite theologians attack this aspect of Aristotelian natural philosophy on the ground that repeated observation of concomitance is not evidence of causation. A version of this argument appears in al-Ghazālī’s Incoherence of the Philosophers.

Al-Ghazālī distinguishes a few different positions held by his philosopher opponents. One position considers changes in nature to be brought about by natural bodies alone, without any contribution by God. Applied to the example of the burning of the cotton, this position holds that

the agent of the burning is the fire alone, it being an agent by nature [and] not by choice—hence, incapable of refraining from [acting according to] what is in its nature after contacting a substratum receptive of it. (al-Ghazālī IP: 167)

Against this position, al-Ghazālī maintains that

[t]he one who enacts the burning by creating blackness in the cotton, [causing] separation in its parts, and making it cinder or ashes is God, either through the mediation of His angels or without mediation. (al-Ghazālī IP: 167)

In support of this view, he argues as follows:

As for fire, which is inanimate, it has no action. For what proof is there that it is the agent [of the burning of cotton]? They have no proof other than observing the occurrence of the burning at the [juncture of] contact with the fire. (al-Ghazālī IP: 167)

Al-Ghazālī appeals to a point also made by his Ashʿarite predecessors: we observe not that fire burns cotton but rather that cotton burns when in contact with fire. So, the evidence of repeated observation, even when unvarying, does not show that fire is the agent of the change. Furthermore, this evidence is consistent with God’s being the agent of the change.

4.3 Averroes’ argument from natural science

In response to the skeptical argument, Averroes appeals to the fact of natural science: We do have (some) knowledge of the natural world. Furthermore, knowledge of the natural world just is knowledge of the natural causes of change (Averroes ITI: 318–19). Such knowledge must be derived, at least in part, from repeated observation of bodies. He also suggests that none of us sincerely doubts that this is so: he claims that his occasionalist opponent “denies with his tongue what is present in his mind” (Averroes ITI: 318). So, as Averroes sees it, the fact of natural science is sufficient reason to reject the skeptical argument. Still, he acknowledges that we lack complete knowledge of nature, that much remains to be investigated and that this endeavor faces various obstacles.

While Averroes’ argument from natural science may succeed against some versions of the skeptical argument, it is not clear that it succeeds against its immediate target, al-Ghazālī’s skeptical argument. The latter argument may leave open the possibility that natural bodies, such as fire, are causes (McGinnis 2006). For al-Ghazālī does not conclude his skeptical argument by denying that fire is a cause of the burning tout court; rather, he denies that it has action on the ground that it is inanimate and he denies that the fire alone is the agent of burning. So, al-Ghazālī may hold that the fire is a (non-active) cause of the burning, while God is its active cause.

On this interpretation, al-Ghazālī’s skeptical argument merely denies that the evidence of repeated observation shows that natural bodies are the sole causes of change. So, that argument is compatible with the claim that the evidence of repeated observation indicates that natural bodies are among the causes of change. Averroes, however, suggests that al-Ghazālī denies the latter claim. So, his argument from natural science does not succeed against al-Ghazālī’s skeptical argument. On the other hand, to allow that natural bodies are among the causes of change may not be sufficient to avoid a problem raised by Averroes’ argument from natural science. Averroes’ argument involves the idea that repeated observation of bodies gives us insight into their natures. By “nature” is meant an intrinsic principle of motion and coming to rest. So, the argument demands more than the concession that natural bodies make some causal contribution to change. It demands that the causality of natural bodies is rooted in and explained by their natures.

Al-Ghazālī’s Ash’arite predecessors tend to deny the existence of Aristotelian natures because these would impose restrictions on God’s action. If a body has an Aristotelian nature, it has an internal principle, which restricts the sorts of changes it can undergo from one moment to the next. For example, the dead cannot be raised and a staff cannot become a snake. According to Islamic theology, however, God can raise the dead and turn a staff into a snake. Thus, bodies do not have Aristotelian natures, since the existence of such natures would conflict with the doctrine of divine omnipotence.

Al-Ghazālī appears to reject this more traditional Ash’arite view when he argues that the existence of bodily natures is compatible with the occurrence of miracles. This argument may reflect a concern to reconcile theology with natural science. It proposes that, even if we suppose that bodies have natures as construed by the philosophers, God could still cause miracles in two main ways. On the one hand, he could impede the operation of natural causal powers. For example, God could prevent the burning of Abraham in the fiery furnace by causing the fire’s heat to be contained within the fire or by causing Abraham to be covered in talc. On the other hand, God could cause a miracle by causing a series of natural changes to occur with astonishing speed. For example, God could change the staff in a serpent by causing matter to take on successive forms at an accelerated rate:

Thus, earth and the rest of the elements change into plants, plants-when eaten by animals-into blood, blood then changing into sperm. Sperm is then poured into the womb and develops in stages as an animal; this, in accordance with habit, takes place in a lengthy period of time. Why, then, should the opponent deem it impossible that it lies within God’s power to cycle matter through these stages in a time shorter than has been known? (al-Ghazālī IP: 172)

So, the affirmation of bodily natures is compatible with the belief miracles.

Whether this argument shows al-Ghazālī to hold that it is possible that bodies have natures is a matter or dispute (Marmura 1981b; Frank 1992; Griffel 2009). Averroes takes the argument to concede the philosophers’ view that bodies have natures by which they function as causes of change (Averroes ITI: 330). Still, there remains a crucial difference between al-Ghazālī’s view and that of the philosophers. Even if al-Ghazālī allows that bodies may have natures, he also considers divine choice and action to govern particular events in the sublunary world. God can plan and execute particular events, which deviate from or accelerate the course of nature. The latter aspect of his view is incompatible with the philosophers’ accounts of God, as discussed above in §3.3.

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