Joseph Albo

First published Thu Jul 20, 2006; substantive revision Sun Apr 14, 2024

Joseph Albo (c. 1380–1444) was a Jewish philosopher active in Christian Spain in the first half of the fifteenth century. His main philosophical work is Sefer ha-‘Ikkarim [Book of Principles], completed in 1425 in the town of Soria in the crown of Castile. In this work, Albo addresses a wide variety of interpretive, theological and philosophical issues, in a style integrating logical, methodical analyses with exegetical discussions. Albo’s composition reveals his exposure to the works of many Jewish philosophers that preceded him, particularly Maimonides, Hasdai Crescas (Albo’s teacher in his formative years), and his contemporary, Simeon ben Zemah Duran. The historical circumstances in which he lived, especially the Catholic Church’s persecution of the Jews in Christian Spain, led him to contribute to the anti-Christian polemic, and influenced his writings which reflect exposure to the thought of such Christian philosophers as Thomas Aquinas.

Albo’s central contribution to the history of Jewish philosophy is his theory of principles. He determines the fundamental, necessary beliefs that a person must uphold in order to belong to the system called “divine law.” This theory serves as an alternative to previous enumerations of principles, especially the thirteen principles of faith formulated by Maimonides. Albo’s list includes three fundamental beliefs: the existence of God, revelation, and reward and punishment. The following paragraphs will outline Albo’s theory and several of the prominent issues in his thought, such as the theory of law, the theory of divine attributes, the theory of human perfection and the theory of providence and reward.

1. Biographical Sketch

The known details of Albo’s life are sparse. He was born in Christian Spain in Monreal, a town in Aragon before 1380 and died in the crown of Castile around 1444. He was taught by Hasdai Crescas in Saragossa and later served as a rabbi and preacher. In 1413–1414, he played a dominant role in the Disputation at Tortosa, a major public polemic between the Jewish convert to Christianity Geronimo de Santa Fe (formerly Joshua Lorki), who represented the pope, and delegates from many Jewish communities in Christian Spain. In this debate, Albo represented the Jewish community of Daroca in Aragon (Graetz 1894, 179–220; Baer 1961, 170–232; Rauschenbach 2002, 11–47). After this community was decimated in 1415, he moved to the town of Soria in Castile (Gonzalo Maeso 1971, 131; Motis Dolader 1990, 148). But Albo is mainly known for his philosophical treatise, Sefer ha-‘Ikkarim[Book of Principles], which he finished around 1425. Albo seems to have had a command of Spanish and Latin in addition to Hebrew, the language of Sefer ha-‘Ikkarim (Husik 1928–30, 67), but his level of fluency in Arabic is unknown.

2. Historical Background

Albo’s philosophical theory reflects the historical reality in which he lived and worked. The distressed state of the Jewish community in Christian Spain motivated his composition of his philosophical work. In the fourteenth century, the Jews in Spain were subject to religious persecution by the Catholic Church and Christian society. Jewish thought also suffered from sharp ideological conflict between conservative thinkers and rationalists over both theological and social issues.

In an effort to pressure Jews to convert, the Christian authorities instituted extreme economic measures and passed discriminatory social legislation. They used coercive tactics in their exhortations and organized harsh pogroms, such as those of 1391. These repressive measures forced many Jews to die a martyr’s death or led to mass conversion of Jews to Christianity and to deterioration on the social, economic, and spiritual planes (Baer 1961, 95–243; Netanyahu 1966, cf. index [“Conversions”]; Ben-Sasson 1984, 208–220, 232–238; Gutwirth 1993).

Intellectually, this period witnessed the revival of the dispute between followers of Maimonides and his opponents. On one side of this conflict, rationalists espoused the study of philosophy and attempted to integrate it into their religious-spiritual world while resolving the contradictions that emerged between philosophy and the sources of revelation. On the other side, conservatives rejected the study of philosophy and instead adhered to the classic religious sources, the Bible and the Talmud, and viewed kabbalistic literature as a continuation of the chain of revelation. One of the focal points of the conflict between these two theological schools was the exchange of mutual accusations on the issue of responsibility for the dire situation of Jewish society under Christian persecution (Schwartz 1991).

Modern scholars have conducted comprehensive studies of the relationship between the characteristics of Jewish philosophy in Spain during the fifteenth century, including Albo’s thought, and the historical reality of that period (Baer 1961, 232–243; Davidson 1983, 112–113; Cohen 1993; Manekin 1997).

3. Introduction to Sefer ha-‘Ikkarim

Sefer ha-‘Ikkarim is Albo’s monumental philosophical treatise. This book offers an extensive description of the author’s theoretical doctrine. Forming the basis of this doctrine and the framework for the rest of his formulations are his principles of faith, which attempt to define the beliefs that are the necessary fundamentals of a system of laws whose source is the divine. Before we examine the various philosophical views incorporated within this book, we will offer a concise description of its structure, stylistic characteristics, and goals.

Sefer ha-‘Ikkarim is composed of a preface, which includes a highly detailed table of contents; an introduction; and four treatises divided into chapters. Although Albo completed writing the book around 1425, scholars have long agreed that before the book was published in its entirety, a preliminary version appeared, comprising the first of the four treatises (Back 1869, 8–10; Tänzer 1896, 19–22, 27; Schweid 1967, 25).

In the first treatise of Sefer ha-‘Ikkarim, Albo presents in detail his theory of principles and the various issues it includes. Albo points out several problems with the lists of principles of faith proposed by his predecessors, as he felt that no earlier Jewish philosophical work had adequately dealt with the principles of religion. In particular, he challenges Maimonides’ list of thirteen principles of faith, proposing in their place a concise list numbering only three basic beliefs. Albo sought to redefine the principles of Judaism in the universal context of divine law. Absent these beliefs, Albo believes that divine law has no existence or significance: 1) the existence of God, 2) the divine origin of the Torah, and 3) reward and punishment. This list determines the structure of the entire book, since the following three treatises address each one of the three principles, and their derivatives, in turn. The main topic of the second treatise is the existence of God, and it discusses the theory of divinity, especially the theory of divine attributes. The third treatise, whose main topic is the divine origin of the Torah, covers the issues of human perfection, general prophecy, and Mosaic prophecy and law. It concludes with a thorough discussion of the religious emotions of fear and love of God. The fourth and last treatise, whose main subject is reward and punishment, divides into two sections. The first section describes the theory of divine providence, the problem of evil and the significance of the precepts of prayer and repentance. The second section in the fourth treatise speaks of the theory of recompense, emphasizing that of the world to come. The criteria for a believer in divine law are not only the acceptance of the three principles, but the derivative principles which he calls “roots,” which follow from them. Albo also specifies six dogma of lesser status, “branches,” that are particular to Judaism. The language of Sefer ha-‘Ikkarim is straightforward, and its philosophical arguments are formulated in a relatively simple and clear manner. These characteristics mean that a broad audience of readers can approach this philosophical work on their own. Furthermore, the modern reader can rely on Albo’s clear formulations to gain a preliminary acquaintance with many of the philosophical viewpoints offered in the general framework of medieval Jewish philosophy, as Albo synthesized the opinions of his Jewish philosophical predecessors and contemporaries in an accessible style that led to the book’s popularity.

An additional stylistic aspect of Sefer ha-‘Ikkarim touches directly on the body of his theory. The book includes a number of internal contradictions on a wide variety of philosophical issues. This fact has led most scholars to the conclusion that this is an eclectic work, lacking philosophic originality or systematic consistency in his individual discussions of philosophical concepts (Guttmann 1955; Guttmann 1964, 247–251; Ravitzky 1988, 104–105; Harvey 2015). Yet some recent scholars have proposed a new angle of perception on the significance of these internal contradictions, identifying in Sefer ha-‘Ikkarim an esoteric writing style similar to that of Maimonides’ Guide of the Perplexed. According to this viewpoint, the internal contradictions are not the result of lack of attention on the part of an eclectic and average philosopher who combined various sources without regard to the differences between them. On the contrary, they believe these contradictions demonstrate meticulous attention on the part of the philosopher. The maverick position claims that Albo intentionally embedded in his book conflicting opinions in order to hide his true viewpoint on various theological issues from certain groups of readers. Among other evidence, this research position relies on Albo’s explicit statement in the introductory comment to the second treatise (Schwartz 2002, 183–196; Ehrlich 2009a).

Most scholars assume that we should understand Albo’s goal in writing Sefer ha-‘Ikkarim against the background of the historical reality in which he lived. As indicated, the book was written as an attempt to address the severe social and religious distress of the Jews of Christian Spain in the late fourteenth – early fifteenth centuries. In the framework of this approach, we may discern two different goals that the book intends to serve.

Social goal –to offer a uniform defense of Jewish dogma alongside a refutation of the doctrines of Christianity, with the aim of limiting the conversion and the spiritual decline of the Jews of Christian Spain at that time (Husik 1928–30, 62–65).

Theoretical goal – to redefine the principles of Judaism and discuss its theoretical relation to philosophy, in light of the intensification of internal arguments on these issues within Jewish thought during the period (Back 1869, 5–6; Lerner 2000, 90–95).

Sefer ha-‘Ikkarim was initially published in 1485 as one of the first works of Jewish philosophy to reach the printing press. The book made a considerable impact throughout the fifteenth century, with renowned Jewish philosophers including Isaac Arama, Abraham Bibago and Isaac Abravanel, citing it and contending with its ideas. From the sixteenth to the eighteenth centuries, Albo’s thought continued to engage Jewish and non-Jewish philosophers, including Baruch Spinoza, Moses Mendelssohn, and several Christian theologians, such as Grotius, Simon, De Voisin, and de Rossi (Sirat 1990, 381). During this period, two authors wrote commentaries on Sefer ha-‘Ikkarim: Jacob Koppelman (Ohel Ya‘akov, Freiburg 1584) and Gedaliah Lipschitz (Etz Shatul, Venice 1618). In addition, the book was translated into Latin, German, English and Russian, and its first treatise was translated into Italian. In 1929, Isaac Husik published a critical edition of Sefer ha-‘Ikkarim, including his translation of the book into English, an introduction, and detailed notes and indices (Albo 1929).

The scholarly consensus in the literature on Albo is that he was not an original philosopher, and that much of his book merely summarizes and synthesizes the various approaches he knew from the works of the Jewish philosophers that preceded him. This theory, in its extreme version, argues that even the theory of principles, the main reason for his book’s renown, is not Albo’s unique creation. In contrast, a more recent trend in research on Albo’s work identifies clear characteristics of esoteric writing in his book. This theory interprets the conflicting opinions on the issues in the book as belonging to two separate layers of writing – the external, exoteric layer, and the inner, esoteric layer. In many cases, these two research approaches lead to differing opinions regarding the question of Albo’s independent philosophical positions (Ehrlich 2009). Additionally, philosophic originality can also be found in his homiletical interpretations integrated within his work on dogma (Weiss 2017).

The overview below will present the central issues addressed in Sefer ha-‘Ikkarim with a faithful reflection of the state of present research on Albo’s philosophy. At the same time, we will refrain from categorizing his various philosophical views. This essay will discuss Albo’s theories of: (1) law, (2) principles, (3) divinity, (4) humanity, and (5) providence and recompense.

4. The Theory of Law

Albo formulates a list of the fundamental beliefs of religion from within his theory of principles (which we will explain in the next section), since he considers similar lists composed by his predecessors to be insufficient. Instead of naming the principles of Mosaic law (“the Torah of Moses”) as, for example, Maimonides did in his well-known list of thirteen principles, Albo widens his target and lists the principles of “divine law,” in an effort to understand the principles of Judaism within a universal context. By this term he refers to the entire system of laws whose source is in the revelation of God to humanity. This change leads Albo to dedicate a particularly long discussion (treatise I, chapters 5–8) to the topic of the various types of law. Albo distinguishes three such types. The first of these is divine law, a law whose origin is in divine revelation, such as Judaism. The second type is conventional law, a system of laws that human beings establish by mutual agreement in numerous political and social frameworks. Its purpose is to maintain the moral order of society and ensure the ongoing function of its systems. The third form of law according to Albo is natural law, or the basic laws of morality that aim to prevent injustice and promote honest behavior. Academic literature discusses two main aspects of Albo’s theory of law that the academic literature covers: the concept of natural law, its origins, meaning and influence; and the method of verification of divine law.

4.1 Natural Law

Albo was one of the first Jewish philosophers to address specifically the concept of natural law along with his contemporary Zerahia Halevi Saladin. Apparently, this was due to the influence of the Christian theologian Thomas Aquinas, who classified laws in his book Summa Theologica. Albo’s view of natural law has attracted the attention of many scholars, in comparison to other topics in his philosophy, but the popular view among these scholars is that Albo did not attach great importance to this concept (Guttmann 1955, 176–184; Lerner 1964; Novak 1983, 319–350; Melamed 1989; Ehrlich 2006; Ackerman 2013).

4.2 Verification of Divine Law

One of the formative factors in Albo’s philosophy was the anti-Christian polemic. For this reason, one of the questions that engages him is the method of distinguishing between the true divine law, meaning the Torah of Moses, and false religions that also claims to be of divine origin. Albo proposes two criteria for distinguishing between the two. Firstly, the true divine law is the one whose beliefs do not contradict any one of the necessary principles of divine law. Secondly, the true divine law provides incontrovertible proof of the credibility of its messenger, who informs the world of the law’s existence and divine origin (treatise I, chapter 18). An important study on this issue argued that the first point is problematic, because it assumes that philosophy defines the basic beliefs of divine law and thus determines which law is truly divine. This is in opposition to the Averroistic approach, which disallows the use of philosophy for verifying religious matters. The solution for this problem lies in an alternate understanding of the role of philosophy in inter-religious debate. Philosophy does not serve as an affirming mechanism to validate certain beliefs, but only as a negating tool for identifying beliefs that stand in direct conflict with the basic rules of logic. In other words, Albo does not use philosophy to prove the validity of the beliefs of Judaism, but rather to reject Christianity as a false religion in light of its beliefs that stand in contradiction to philosophy (Lasker 1980).

5. The Theory of Principles

Albo’s theory of principles is the focal point of his book, the framework upon which its sections are built, and the element that grants the book its name. The academic debate on the theory of principles is quite extensive. Below we will relate to two aspects of the theory. First we will present the conceptual structure of the theory of principles as detailed in the first treatise of Sefer ha-‘Ikkarim, and then we will survey the various approaches of the scholarship on this theory.

Albo presents his theory of principles as an alternative to previous theories of principles, especially that of Maimonides. Additionally, Albo openly criticizes his predecessors’ lists of principles. In their stead, he proposes a system of fundamental beliefs divided into three levels, which he calls “principles,” “roots,” and “branches.” The principles are those beliefs that are derived necessarily from the term “divine law.” They are: (1) the existence of the divine entity (“existence of God”); (2) the divine origin of the system of laws (“revelation of the Torah”); and (3) the existence of divine providence, expressed in compensatory retribution for humanity (“reward and punishment”). From these principles stem eight “roots,” which are beliefs that instill clear and detailed content into the general concept of the principle. The first principle, the existence of God, develops into four roots: (1) the unity of God, (2) the incorporeality of God, (3) God’s independence of time, (4) God’s lack of defects. The second principle, revelation of the Torah, leads to three roots: (5) God’s knowledge, (6) prophecy, and (7) the authenticity of the divine messenger. The third principle, reward and punishment, branches into a single root: (8) divine providence. Denial of any of the principles or roots represents a heresy of the divine law.

The third category, “branches,” comprises beliefs that Albo argues are true and that every follower of divine law must accept. But in contrast to the first two categories, Albo does not define refusal to accept the branches as heresy of the divine law, but rather only as a sin requiring atonement. Albo lists six beliefs in this category: (1) creation ex nihilo; (2) the supremacy of Moses’ prophecy; (3) the immutability of the Torah; (4) the possibility of obtaining human perfection through the performance of a single commandment; (5) the resurrection of the dead; (6) the coming of the Messiah.

Albo argues that an individual who is accidentally misled by speculation to a misinterpretation of a principle is not considered a heretic, but rather included among the pious, since such sin is due to error and requires atonement (treatise I, chapter 2).

Early scholars of Albo’s work in the late nineteenth and early twentieth centuries argued that Albo’s contribution to the history of Jewish thought was limited to his theory of principles and the first treatise of his book (Schlesinger 1844, xi–xiv; Back 1869, 3–5, 8–9; Tänzer 1896, 23–30). Later scholars called his theory unoriginal, and identified the philosophical sources that influenced it, especially Maimonides, Ibn Rushd, Nissim of Gerona, Hasdai Crescas and Simeon ben Zemah Duran (Guttmann 1955, 170–176; Waxman 1956, 158–161; Schweid 1963; Klein-Braslavi 1980, 194–197). A subsequent, third scholarly trend attempted to clarify the nature of the internal relationship between the categories of Albo’s theory of principles (principles, roots, and branches), and examined Albo’s position regarding the concept of heresy (Kellner 1986, 140–156).

6. The Theory of Divinity

The central discussion in the theory of divinity in Sefer ha-‘Ikkarim is located in the second treatise, which is dedicated to the principle of the existence of God and its derivative roots. The philosophical issue at the focal point of this discussion is the theory of divine attributes. Scholars of Albo’s theory of attributes have discerned an internal contradiction between rationalist and conservative positions in his discussion of this topic. On the one hand, in a number of locations he purports to support Maimonides’ negative theology and interprets the various attributes of God as negative attributes. On the other hand, elsewhere he relates positive attributes to God, in accordance with the method of his teacher, Crescas. Some scholars have ascribed this contradiction to the eclectic character of Albo’s work (Wolfson 1916–17, 213–216; Guttmann 1955, 184–191), while others have related it to the esoteric style of writing of Sefer ha-‘Ikkarim. Possibly, they suggest, his goal here was to conceal his conservative position on this issue from the circles of rationalist thinkers he frequented (Schwartz 2002, 187–196; Ehrlich 2009a, 88–93).

The second treatise of the book raises another important philosophical problem, the significance of the concept of time. One of the roots of the principle of the existence of God is God’s independence of time. In Albo’s discussion of this root, he distinguishes between two different concepts of time, Aristotelian-physical and Neoplatonic-ontological. Two central trends appear in the academic literature on this topic. The first places the concept of time at the focus of the discussion, attempting to clarify the relationship between the two different concepts of time that appear in Albo’s discussion (Harvey 1979–80). Those scholars who take the second position discuss Albo’s concept of time as part of their attempt to identify his cosmogonic view, in other words, which theory of the origin of the world he upholds (Klein-Braslavi 1976, 118–120, 126; Rudavsky 1997, 470–473). In this context, we should point out that comprehensive study of Albo’s writing on this issue reveals a certain difficulty in categorizing his exact position. Together with explicit dogmatic statements supporting the theory of creation ex nihilo appearing in the first treatise, we find other statements, although less overt, some of which argue for the eternal existence of matter, and some of which even support the eternal existence of the world (Ehrlich 2009a, 94–112).

7. The Theory of Humanity

The central discussion on the theory of humanity in Sefer ha-‘Ikkarim is located in the third treatise, which covers the principle of the revelation of the Torah and its roots. The philosophical issue present throughout the sections of this treatise is that of the nature of human perfection. Albo’s discussion on this topic has not merited intensive treatment in the academic literature. Aside from this concept, the treatise addresses in depth the idea of prophecy and several aspects of the Torah of Moses and its commandments. In one section of his discussion on the last topic, Albo responds to the attacks of a Christian scholar on the Torah of Moses, including both apologetic and polemic elements in his rejoinders.

In the introductory chapters of the third treatise, Albo criticizes the position of the rationalist Jewish philosophers, who associated human perfection with the level of individual intellectual achievement. In contrast to this approach, Albo proposes a conservative theory, arguing that human perfection depends on the fulfillment of the Torah’s commandments, in other words, the practical worship of God (treatise III, chapters 1–7). Yet on this subject as well, we note considerable internal contradictions, which we will illustrate with several examples. Firstly, in the first treatise of his book, Albo clearly demonstrates that human perfection depends on faith in God and in the principles of divine law (treatise I, chapters 21–22). Secondly, in several places in the book he diminishes the value of the practical element of fulfilling the commandments of the Torah, and emphasizes in its stead the element of awareness, or intent (treatise III, chapters 28–29). A third contradiction is found in the final chapters of the third treatise, which analyze the concepts of reverence and love for God. Albo considers these to be the highest levels of divine worship. He defines love of God as an intellectual phenomenon whose level depends on the intellectual status of the person (treatise III, chapters 35–36; Ehrlich 2004a). According to the two main theories found in the academic literature, these contradictions may characterize either eclectic or esoteric writing.

To Albo, prophecy is not a natural characteristic of the human soul, but rather depends on divine will. God, should He so will, grants divine inspiration to the prophet. His primary purpose in so doing is to inform humanity of the commandments so that through them they may achieve human perfection (treatise III, chapter 8). Scholars who have studied Albo’s theory of prophecy have pointed out that it integrates both rationalist elements from Maimonides’ parallel discussion and spiritual, supra-intellectual elements from the writings of Rabbi Judah Halevi and Crescas on this subject. Some have seen in this integration a demonstration of Albo’s purpose in remaining faithful to the Aristotelian tradition of Maimonides, while attempting (not always successfully) to bend it as far as possible in the conservative direction (Schweid 1965). Others have considered this integration an expression of the general problematic character of Albo’s thought that does not contend with the problems it produces. These scholars also argue that Albo’s basic approach is that prophecy transcends the natural, and that this concept is grounded in the deep-seated tradition of Jewish thought (Kreisel 2001, 540–543). Here as well, we should not ignore the possibility that the internal contradictions in Albo’s discussion reflect an esoteric writing style.

Albo distinguishes between various levels of prophecy, with the central goal of establishing the supremacy of Mosaic prophecy as the starting point for validating Mosaic law as the divine law. According to Albo, Moses is the most exalted prophet, for only in his case did divine inspiration directly reach the intellectual power of his soul, without the mediation of the imagination. The significance of this proclamation is that only for Moses’ prophecy is there no doubt regarding the validity of its content (treatise III, chapters 8–10). Albo also claims that at the giving of the Torah on Mt. Sinai, the Israelites all received prophetic inspiration; however, they were not on the prophetic level, and this is in support of Moses’ advanced status (treatise III, chapter 11).

After discussing the prophecy of Moses, Albo takes up the topic of the divine Torah that Moses gave to the people of Israel. He treats a number of aspects of this issue, such as the classification of the mitzvot (commandments), the status of the Ten Commandments, and the importance of the Oral Law. Yet apparently, the thrust of his efforts is directed toward establishing the idea of the eternity of the Torah, apparently in response to the Jewish-Christian polemic on this topic. Remaining faithful to his dogmatic method, Albo argues that in Mosaic law, and in divine law in general, changes in the details of the commandments may take place, but their fundamental principles cannot change (treatise III, chapters 13–22).

Within his discussion on Mosaic law, Albo includes a chapter describing its condemnation by an anonymous Christian scholar (treatise III, chapter 25). The Christian contends that in every possible parameter, the religion of Jesus supersedes Mosaic law, and Albo replies to this assault in detail. The present forum is too limited to specify the content of this polemic, but suffice it to say that this chapter in particular reflects Albo’s quite extensive knowledge of the Christian religion. He demonstrates proficiency in Christian writings, and in addition, he recognizes the internal tension within Christianity between the papacy and the Roman Empire. He reveals knowledge of Church history, and finally, he challenges the central Christian doctrines (the Trinity, transubstantiation, and the virgin birth) while describing them in detail. Due to censorship, the entire discussion has been omitted from several early editions. It should be noted that Albo’s polemic against Christianity is not limited to this chapter, but runs throughout the book, both explicitly and implicitly (Schweid 1968; Lasker 1977, cf. index [“Albo, Joseph”]; Rauschenbach 2002, 142–156).

8. The Theory of Providence and Recompense

The fourth and last treatise of Sefer ha-‘Ikkarim is primarily concerned with the principle of reward and punishment and its roots. The first part of this treatise (chapters 1–28) contains Albo’s central discussion on the theory of providence, while the second part (chapters 29–51) incorporates his main discussion on the theory of recompense. Below we will discuss these two theories in their order of appearance in the book.

Albo begins this treatise with the statement that humanity has basic free will, for this is the necessary condition of the concept of recompense. Additionally, he argues that this human freedom does not conflict with God’s omniscience, nor with the existence of an astrological-deterministic system in the universe (treatise IV, chapters 1–6; Sadik 2012; Weiss 2017). His direct discussion of the concept of divine providence divides into three main parts. First, he discusses the proofs of the veracity of providence from natural and human reality, and from intellectual investigation (treatise IV, chapters 8–10). Then he treats the principal theological challenge to the concept of providence, namely, the problem of evil, or the suffering of the righteous and prosperity of the wicked (treatise IV, chapters 12–15). Finally, he examines the specific religious consequences of providence, paying special attention to the theoretical infrastructure of the precepts of prayer (treatise IV, chapters 16–24) and repentance (treatise IV, chapters 25–28; Ehrlich 2008; Harvey 2015). These last two discussions are of exceptional scope within medieval Jewish philosophy.

Albo’s discussions of free will, of proofs for divine providence, and of the problem of evil include almost no original ideas, and he relies on the writings of the Jewish philosophers who preceded him. In contrast, his treatment of prayer and repentance seem to reveal a certain level of innovation. Regarding free will, Albo apparently adopts Maimonides’ opinion that divine knowledge differs significantly from human knowledge, and that God’s absolute knowledge does not necessarily abrogate free will for human beings. The academic literature considers several of Albo’s discussions on providence to be nothing more than comprehensive summaries of the work of his precursors, synthesized in an accessible manner. This category includes his methods of proving the existence of divine providence over humanity, as well as his attempts to defend the concept of God’s absolute good, despite what seems to be injustice in the world (Bleich 1997, 340–358). Still, in the rest of the treatise Albo presents broad, methodical discussions on the various philosophical aspects of the issues of prayer and repentance, for which his predecessors addressed mainly the halakhic features.

Albo’s central argument on the topic of prayer is that it influences a person’s status by causing an internal change within that person. This change raises the person to a level where he receives constant divine inspiration through God’s benevolence. The basic assumption of this concept is that prayer cannot cause any change in God, since such an assumption would detract from divine (immutable) perfection. Thus we should conceive of prayer as the internal act of a person upon the self, raising the self to a higher spiritual level (treatise IV, chapters 16–18). This model stands in opposition to the traditional conception of prayer as a channel of communication between the praying person and the listening God.

Albo understands the significance of repentance in two directions. The first is based on his concept of prayer and defines repentance as an act in which a person uplifts himself to a higher level than at the time of the sin. In this way, he changes his identity, and is no longer deserving of punishment for the act he performed in his previous identity (treatise IV, chapter 18). The second conception of repentance focuses not on the person but on the sinful act he has committed. Under this rubric, repentance retroactively expropriates the conscious foundations of this act. In other words, repentance redefines the sinful act as unintentional, and thus undeserving of punishment (treatise IV, chapter 27). Albo differentiates between repentance out of love and repentance out of fear and further subdivides the latter to distinguish ‘repentance out of fear of God’ which conveys a general awe of God as the source of both reward and punishment, from ‘repentance out of fear of punishment’ in which the fear of affliction coerces the sinner to submit in repentance. Albo concludes that repentance requires freedom and one who is coerced by fear of punishment does not achieve atonement (treatise IV, chapter 25).

The second half of the fourth treatise of Sefer ha-‘Ikkarim presents Albo’s theory of recompense. The main issue Albo raises here is the character of the reward and punishment destined for a person in the world to come. Throughout his wide-ranging discussion on the question of recompense in the next world, Albo confronts two conflicting points of view. Maimonides views recompense as applying to the soul alone, while Nahmanides opines that it affects the body as well (treatise IV, chapters 29–41). Albo’s own opinion on this subject is unclear. At the beginning of the discussion, he seems to support Maimonides’ viewpoint, but he continues the discussion with the assumption that he cannot definitely rule out Nahmanides’ approach, which is supported by sources from kabbalistic literature. Scholars who have discerned the unique character of this section have described Albo’s position in almost every possible way. Some say he avoids commitment (Sarachek 1932, 224), while others think he adopts a synthetic middle position (Schwartz 1997, 202–208); still others believe he accepts Maimonides’ approach (Husik 1966, 426), and their opponents argue that he accepts Nahmanides’ view (Agus 1959, 238–239). Apparently, therefore, this issue in Albo’s philosophical-religious theory is especially obscure (Ehrlich 2009b).


Primary Literature

  • Albo, Joseph, 1929, Sefer ha-‘Ikkarim [Book of Principles], I. Husik (trans. and ed.), Philadelphia: The Jewish Publication Society of America.

Secondary Literature

  • Ackerman, A., 2013, “Zerahia Halevi Saladin and Joseph Albo on Natural, Conventional and Divine Law”, Jewish Studies Quarterly, 20: 315–339.
  • Agus, J. B., 1959, The Evolution of Jewish Thought from Biblical Times to the Opening of the Modern Era, London: Abelard-Schuman.
  • Back, S., 1869, Joseph Albo’s Bedeutung in der Geschichte der jüdischen Religionsphilosophie: Ein Beitrag zur genauern Kenntniss der Tendenz des Buches “IKKARIM”, Breslau: B. Heidenfeld.
  • Baer, Y., 1961, A History of the Jews in Christian Spain (Volume 2), Philadelphia: The Jewish Publication Society of America.
  • Ben-Sasson, H. H., 1984, Retzef u-tmurah [Continuity and Variety], J. R. Hacker (ed.), Tel Aviv: Am Oved Publishers.
  • Bleich, J. D., 1997, “Providence in the Philosophy of Hasdai Crescas and Joseph Albo”, in Hazon Nahum: Studies in Jewish Law, Thought, and History Presented to Dr. Norman Lamm, Y. Elman & J. S. Gurock (eds.), New York: Yeshiva University Press, pp. 311–358.
  • Cohen, J., 1993, “Profiat Duran’s The Reproach of the Gentiles and the Development of Jewish Anti-Christian Polemic”, in Shlomo Simonsohn Jubilee Volume: Studies on the History of the Jews in the Middle Ages and Renaissance Period, D. Carpi et al. (eds.), Tel Aviv: Tel Aviv University, pp. 71–84 (English section).
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  • Harvey, W. Z., 1979–80, “Albo’s Discussion of Time”, Jewish Quarterly Review, 70: 210–238.
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  • Schweid, E., 1963, “Bein mishnat ha-‘ikkarim shel R. Yosef Albo le-mishnat ha-‘ikkarim shel ha-Rambam” [Joseph Albo’s system of dogmas as distinct from that of Maimonides], Tarbiz, 33: 74–84.
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Other Internet Resources

  • Joseph Albo, entry by Kaufmann Kohler and Emil Hirsch at

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