Judah Halevi

First published Wed May 21, 2008; substantive revision Wed Sep 10, 2014

Judah ben Samuel Halevi (c. 1075–1141) was the premier Hebrew poet of his generation in medieval Spain. Over the course of some fifty years, from the end of the 11th century to the middle of the 12th, he wrote nearly 800 poems, both secular and religious. However, because this was a time of intensifying religious conflict characterized by physical, social, and political upheaval, Halevi also sought to develop a reasoned defense of the Jewish religion, which was then under attack on all fronts. Christians and Muslims dismissed Judaism as a superseded religion and reviled its adherents as guilty of both blindness and faithlessness. Those more inclined to philosophy, inside as well as outside the Jewish faith, found many more points to contest. For some, these included even the most fundamental teachings of Judaism, such as God's creation of the world and his involvement in the affairs of mere flesh and blood, which they regarded as perplexing, at best, or incredible altogether.

As a young man, Halevi had studied philosophy, and he continued to follow its evolution in Spain as newer Aristotelian ideas began to circulate among the courtier classes. However, his reactions to what he learned were decidedly mixed. As a trained physician, he certainly appreciated the high premium that the philosophers placed on careful observation and clear thinking. Lives were saved thanks to such skills or lost when they were lacking. He also admired the philosophers' achievements in the formal disciplines of logic and mathematics, inasmuch as they came as close to generating certainty as anyone could have hoped. Yet this achievement was also part of a larger problem. Halevi knew that since its inception philosophy had made the pursuit of truth in every domain its highest goal. It persistently sought to distinguish between opinion and knowledge in order to replace opinions about all things with knowledge of all things. To the extent that this project could succeed, those able to acquire such knowledge, whether theoretical or practical, would presumably be of one mind about the truth they came to know and also live their lives in accordance with it. However, Halevi also came to realize that well before the goal is ever reached, opinions, conventions, and traditions of all kinds as well as the practices associated with them, would be rendered questionable or otherwise suspect, because they were not known philosophically to be true or right. A consequence of this demotion in status of everything unproved was that those best equipped intellectually to examine and judge such matters could, and often did, believe, or allow others to believe, that they had the requisite knowledge of exactly what others lacked by virtue of their mastery of logic, theory, and other intellectual skills. Whether, in fact, lovers of wisdom were also as wise as many of them or their proponents claimed seemed far from obvious to Halevi. But how could he even discuss such abstract issues in a work intended to vindicate the Jewish faith in a time of crisis? How, indeed, was he to give a reasoned account and defense of Judaism to his increasingly dispirited or doubting co-religionists, when the challenges came from so many different directions? Their detractors had the prestige of power, numbers, worldly success, and specialized new knowledge to support their claims, while the Jews had only their history, traditions, and what remained of their faith to fall back upon.

Ultimately, Halevi opted for a novel, yet entirely appropriate, solution. He let a widely-attested fact of recent history make the case for him—the conversion of the Khazar kingdom to Judaism almost four centuries earlier. The story was well known, even if less stirring than it was when it first circulated in Spain. Obviously, the Khazar king and his people had other, more influential, religious alternatives to choose from, but they chose Judaism nonetheless because of a truth that they saw as unique to it. Surely, the king must have discussed all this; and if he did, so could Halevi—within the framework of a dialogue. Indeed, such an approach would allow him to examine all of the relevant issues in the course of an on-going series of conversations, just as they are so often encountered and discussed in real life. What is more, the real experiences of the past, now presented with the help of all his poetic gifts, could be drawn upon to refute the calumnies and answer the objections raised in the present. Through this connection with an event in history, Halevi's Book of Refutation and Proof on Behalf of the Despised Religion came to be known more simply as the Kuzari. Under that title, his book would also become the emblematic expression of the lived truths of his people and their faith as these were experienced throughout their history, and, not surprisingly, one of the most beloved works of the Jewish intellectual heritage.

1. Life

Judah Halevi (c. 1075–1141) was one of the most gifted Hebrew poets and talented philosophical theologians of medieval Spain. He was born to an enlightened family of means living in Tudela, a town in northeastern Spain under Muslim rule. He received a comprehensive education in both Hebrew and Arabic sources, encompassing the Bible, rabbinic literature, grammar, Arabic and Hebrew poetry, philosophy, theology, and medicine. As a youth, he traveled to southern Spain (al-Andalus) and was quickly recognized for his poetic ability after winning a contest in Cordova in which entrants were asked to write a poem matching the complex style of a composition by the famed Moses ibn Ezra. The renowned poet befriended the young man and brought him to Granada where he was welcomed into courtier circles, enjoyed ibn Ezra's patronage, and composed numerous poems on mainly secular themes over several years.

This period of stability, discovery, and high culture was disrupted by the invasion of the Almoravids, a fanatical Islamic sect from North Africa, in 1090. After taking control of the petty kingdoms of al-Andalus, in response to the fall of Toledo to the Christian armies of Alphonso VI, Jewish life in Granada and beyond began to deteriorate rapidly. Halevi left Granada in search of a more secure situation and eventually settled in Toledo, where his reputation as both a poet and physician preceded him. He was again received with honor and admiration by the courtier Jews of the city, but he now supported himself as a court physician. Nevertheless, clashes been Muslims and Christians, and distrust of Jews on both sides of the divide, caused Halevi increasing dismay over how fragile Jewish life in Spain had become. His secular poetry reflects these developments in its numerous references to loss, grief, and dislocation. As he puts it in one of his poems,

Between the armies of Seir [the Christians] and Kedar [the Muslims]
My army perishes and is lost …
When they fight their wars
We fall with their fall …

Not long after 1108, the year his patron in Toledo, Solomon ibn Ferruziel, was murdered, Halevi began to move from city to city. He traveled in the company of his close friend and younger colleague, Abraham ibn Ezra, the grammarian, biblical exegete, and Neo-Platonic philosopher. As his fame spread, Halevi enlarged his circle of friendships and contacts as far as North Africa and Egypt. One of these, Abu Said Halfon Ha-Levi of Damietta, a distinguished Jewish merchant with whom Halevi corresponded and finally met in person in 1127, became an especially trusted friend and partner in efforts to ransom Jewish captives. He would later become Halevi's host in Egypt.

By this time, Halevi was at the height of his career in Spain. He had by then married and had a daughter, who would be married to Isaac ibn Ezra, the son of his friend Abraham. His secular and religious poetry made him a celebrated figure throughout Spain and beyond. He had also written the first drafts of what he called the “Khazari book,” which was undertaken in response to questions raised by an unnamed heretical thinker, possibly a Karaite. It would eventually be reworked to become his most famous religio-philosophical work, the Kuzari or Book of Refutation and Proof on Behalf of the Despised Religion. However, he had gradually become convinced that a secure Jewish life in Spain was no longer viable and certainly not for him. His religious poetry increasingly attested to an intense longing for communion with God and also for a return to Zion. As the Christian policy of reconquering territories lost to the Muslims proceeded apace, and in the wake of the First Crusade, messianic expectations grew. He even records in one of his poems a prophetic dream that forecast the downfall of the oppressive Islamic regimes in the year 1130.

It is likely that the failure of the redemption to come as predicted only strengthened his resolve to perform a redeeming act of his own, namely, to emigrate to the Land of Israel and devote himself entirely to the religious life he describes in his writings. In the late summer of 1140, he departed for Egypt, accompanied by his son-in-law, Isaac. His correspondence and poetry attest that he remained there until mid-May of 1141, despite attempts to set sail for the Holy Land earlier. It is possible that he arrived in Ashkalon by the end of May, and many scholars support this view. However, no documentary evidence confirms this. A letter from his friend Halfon confirms only that Judah Halevi died in July of 1141.

2. The Frame Story of the Kuzari and Its Setting

Halevi introduces the dialogue by assuming the voice of an anonymous narrator. This figure identifies the overall concern of the ensuing discussions by indicating that he had been asked about whatever argumentation he had against those who differ or take issue with the Jews, naming as examples the philosophers generally, the adherents of the other major religions of the time (Christianity and Islam), and those who have seceded from the great majority of Jews because of their differences with them. Among the latter, it is likely that the Karaites were foremost in his mind. The narrator then establishes the context of the dialogue by recalling what he had heard of the arguments used by a Jewish sage approximately four hundred years earlier that persuaded the king of the Khazars to adopt the Jewish religion based on testimony recorded in historical chronicles of the time. This recollection leads directly to the frame story on which all that follows is predicated.

According to this story, the king repeatedly dreams the same dream, in which an angel appears to address him saying, “Your intention is pleasing to God, but your actions are not pleasing” (K 1:1). Notwithstanding the king's efforts to respond to its message through diligence in presiding over the established forms of Khazar worship and his sincere intent in doing so, the dream continued to come with the same disturbing message. This unexpected result eventually prompted him to examine the various religions and sects; after doing so, both he and the majority of the Khazars converted to Judaism. At this point, the narrator observes that some of the arguments of the unnamed Jewish scholar that prompted the king to convert were also persuasive to him and in accord with his own belief. Indeed, he thought he should record this argumentation “just as it took place,” adding, “The intelligent will understand,” a biblical citation from Daniel 12:10 (K 1:1).

This remark, “The intelligent will understand,” can be interpreted in various ways. According to some, it indicates that the argumentation presented in the dialogue must have been taken from the Book of Histories, which the narrator also mentioned. Others, however, maintain that it hints at the entire dialogue being a literary fiction. Still, others have suggested that it points to the fact that the dialogue may have been intended for very different kinds of readers and thus written on at least two levels. According to this last interpretation, the Kuzari is addressed on one level to the multitude of Jews in order to reinforce both their traditional opinions and their adherence to the forms of religious observance established by the Talmudic sages. However, on a second level, it is addressed to those more inclined towards exercising independent judgment in the conduct of life, such as members of the courtier class, philosophers, and their protégés, with a view to providing instruction on how to live responsibly within their own community. These interpretations are by no means exhaustive, but collectively they suggest that Halevi's intentions should not be taken as transparently obvious either in the dialogue as a whole or even in specific exchanges between its interlocutors. Not even the narrator, who comes closest to speaking for Halevi himself, admits to being persuaded by all of the Jewish sage's arguments. Accordingly, the intelligent reader is expected to follow the arguments and actions of the dialogue with a view to analyzing and identifying the spoken and unspoken assumptions of each speaker, the function of metaphors, analogies, and even oaths, the types and relative cogency of the arguments presented, and the significance of reformulations of earlier statements by the same speaker, if he or she is to understand what is recorded and how it might ultimately change one's life.

With this in mind, it is helpful to consider briefly what Halevi discloses about the Khazar king himself as the “original” addressee of the arguments presented. As a reigning monarch, he is, above all, a man of action who is naturally concerned with correct actions in all of the many areas in which such judgments are made. His principal responsibility is to govern his people so that they will survive and surmount any threats to their existence—internal or external—and ultimately prosper in the long run. Insofar as he also has priestly responsibilities, he is also concerned with pious actions. Yet as a pious pagan, he stands outside and apart from the three revealed religions. This might qualify him as a detached and impartial judge of what they have to teach, but it also suggests that he is disposed to be skeptical about their claims to possess a revelation from God. Beyond this, he is inclined to disdain Jews because of their despised condition and lowly estate. In general, he places a high premium on what can be learned from experience and proves himself ready to act upon what he learns. However, to the extent that his openness to experience also includes religious experience, he emerges as a divided man whose natural piety is at odds with his skeptical inclinations.

3. The Introductory Exchanges

The dialogue proper begins to unfold only after the king, upon realizing in his dream that he must try to find out what actions are truly pleasing to God, turns to a philosopher and asks him about his beliefs. Why he seeks out the philosopher first and focuses specifically on his beliefs as opposed to his knowledge or his actions is not explained, although it is plausible to suppose that the nature of the king's invitation to his various interlocutors indicates in advance what he expects to hear from each one and perhaps also what he does not expect to hear. In any case, the unnamed philosopher provides what is generally acknowledged to be both a masterful and concise exposition of the Neoplatonic-Aristotelian world-view that dominated so much of medieval intellectual life from the 10th century on. While most of the claims put forward were common to all medieval Aristotelians, three ideas in particular suggest the influence of Halevi's contemporary, Ibn Bajjah (d. 1138), the foremost Aristotelian of his generation in Spain. These ideas are that union with the Active Intellect is possible during one's lifetime, that such union implies cognitive identity with other thinkers who know the truth, and that a philosopher's life is essentially a solitary regimen.

The philosopher opens his presentation with a sharply negative appraisal of the presuppositions underlying the king's dream and offers a brief critical analysis to explain why he rejects each one. Specifically, he denies that God is the kind of being who is either pleased or displeased about anything, has knowledge of particular persons, actions, or events, or even can be regarded as the “Creator” of human beings, unless one understands this in purely metaphorical terms. What warrants these confident denials is the philosopher's conception of a perfect being and how this shapes his understanding of divinity. Thus, a God who is capable of being pleased and displeased must have various aims and desires, all of which signify privation of that which is aimed at or desired, until it is provided. However, any being who is subject to privation and lack could hardly be considered perfect or divine. It would constantly be in a deficient state and also dependent on others to provide whatever is desired. Thus, Divinity as a perfect being is simply incompatible with having or experiencing privation. Accordingly, God, in contrast to all that is non-divine, is entirely beyond having desires and aims because he lacks no perfection worthy of the name.

Similarly, God could hardly be the kind of being who knows particular people, actions, intentions, or events, since these things change with the passage of time. Were God to have knowledge of mutable things, he, too, would be ever changing and always in need of being informed of each new development. Far from being the exemplar of perfect being and knowledge, lacking nothing worth knowing, the God of the Khazar king's dream turns out to be at all times the most epistemically needful and mutable of beings. This outcome also explains why God cannot be conceived in any literal sense as the Creator of the universe or humankind through some act of will meant to realize a divine intention. For even if one were to assume that God's intention had always been to create the world at a particular time, t, and that this remained as true at t + 1 as it was at t – 1, God would have had to will the appropriate change at time t or to have performed some act resulting in the world's creation at that time, lest there be no grounds whatsoever for claiming that God actually caused the world to exist. However, once God is understood to be capable of changing in accordance with an intention, volition, action, or relation, so as to become the Creator of the universe, it becomes problematic to think of God as a perfect being. Once again, the suggestion that God changes by exercising his will in different ways at different times also suggests that there is privation or potentiality within God, both before the act of creation, when God's intention was as yet unrealized, and even more so afterwards, because of all the new and variable relationships established with the creation of the world. For these and similar reasons, the philosopher concludes that God is better conceived of as the cause of all causes involved in the creation of every created thing, not through any intention or aim, but rather through an eternal and essentially changeless process of emanation.

At this point, the philosopher turns his attention away from an analysis and critique of the king's theological assumptions to a systematic, topical exposition of his own largely Neoplatonic-Aristotelian views on cosmology and the prerequisites for human flourishing in the world as it is. Thus, he confidently maintains that God did not create man at all because the world is eternal, and human beings have never ceased coming into being from those who preceded them. The universe itself turns out to be a complex system of interacting causes and effects, which are necessarily connected to one another on various levels. Human beings, naturally enough, are constituted by and within this complex whole and combine within themselves diverse forms, dispositions, character traits, and qualities that reflect essentially three kinds of influences. These are, first, influences associated with one's parents and relatives, although we are not told whether these are primarily biological or psychological in nature; second, those associated with environmental conditions, both proximate and remote, such as air, climate, geographic location, types of food and water, as well as the movements of celestial bodies; third and finally, those associated with education and training, which realize and perfect each person's particular potentialities as fully as possible in order to complete an individual's development. Inevitably, these influences give rise to a wide array of individuals, with diverse aptitudes, perfections, and deficiencies in various combinations and proportions. Together, they constitute the entire human species, ranging from the most perfect and least deficient to the exact opposite.

The philosopher, it turns out, is the one human type provided with all of the dispositions needed to actualize the natural, moral, intellectual, and practical virtues that bring about human flourishing in the fullest sense. Thus, he alone is said to lack nothing pertaining to perfection. What human perfection and flourishing ultimately consist of is a state of intellectual illumination by the Active Intellect, in which the passive or material intellect of the perfect individual perceives itself as reaching the level of attachment to, and, indeed, union with its light. The Active Intellect belongs to the divine hierarchy. More specifically, it is the tenth and lowest of the incorporeal Intelligences in the philosopher's cosmology, which presides over the sub-lunar sphere and all it contains. Insofar as this Intellect comprehends the forms of everything that exists or occurs within our world, it is also capable of communicating what it knows, either partially or completely, in the form of intellectual illuminations (the aforementioned “light”) to any individual whose material intellect is suitably prepared to receive it. Here, knowing follows the Aristotelian paradigm of becoming one with the thing known, albeit in an immaterial way. Attachment to or union with the Active Intellect thereby contributes to human perfection and flourishing by first providing the individual with the pleasures of discovery and genuine intellectual understanding and, second, influencing the subsequent activities of the individual in practical matters so completely that his limbs perform only the most perfect actions, at the most appropriate times, in accordance with the best conditions, “as if they were the organs of the Active Intellect itself.” Broadly speaking, the attainment of intellectual union is presented as culminating in a life of rational self-sufficiency in which one always recognizes what the most rational course of action is and acts accordingly.

The philosopher comes closest to addressing the Khazar king's specific concern with actions pleasing to God or pleasing in themselves, when he outlines what is required in order to reach this level. Thus, the soul must be purified of doubts and acquire knowledge of the universals belonging to the sciences as they really are. It must also keep to the way of justice regarding both character traits and actions, for these activities help the soul in conceiving of what is true and persevering in its inquiries. When these prerequisites are fulfilled, it will come to be like an angel, presumably, in the sense of actively and continuously contemplating the true realities of what it understands. Among the other consequences associated with this way of life, the philosopher indicates that the soul ceases to fear bodily extinction, but delights in life instead. It does this, in part, because it joins and becomes one with great thinkers ranging from the semi-divine Hermes Trismegistus and Aesculapius to Socrates, Plato, and Aristotle, suggesting, at the very least, that those who genuinely know the truth are of one mind regarding it. Consequently, if anything symbolizes “God's being pleased,” it is just such union with the Active Intellect. Furthermore, the shift from passivity to activity in conceiving the true realities also generates contentment, modesty, and submissiveness along with every other desirable character trait, including reverence for the First Cause. However, this reverence has nothing to do with hoping for its favor or being spared its wrath; the philosopher lives beyond such hopes and fears. Rather, philosophic reverence arises because it prompts one to imitate the Active Intellect by preferring truth to falsehood with the result that one always accepts the truth and describes it in a fitting way. In effect, one reveres the First Cause because it is useful.

The question of identifying specific acts through which one's reverence might be expressed is ultimately a matter of indifference to the philosopher. Thus, he advises the king not to be concerned about which “divine Law” to follow and what language, speech, or actions to employ in worship. If something is nevertheless deemed necessary in order to cultivate the appropriate character traits or, beyond that, to govern oneself and others, then the king should simply create his own religion or adopt one of the intellectual nomoi already composed by the philosophers to serve as his religion. Still, all of this is peripheral to the principal task, that of purifying one's soul of doubts, errors, misunderstandings, and other defects after acquiring genuine knowledge of the universals belonging to the sciences, for this alone facilitates attachment to the Active Intellect. Once this occurs, if indeed it does, the philosopher allows that perhaps the Active Intellect will provide the king, at some future time, with knowledge of hidden matters and even commands conveyed through veridical dreams and apposite imagery. Notwithstanding this tentatively encouraging observation, the philosopher seems to conclude his exposition very much as he began it, by casting doubt upon the credibility of the king's dream, inasmuch as the king has obviously not reached this level, even while outlining with utmost brevity what a philosophic theory of prophetic dreams might look like.

In subsequent exchanges between the Khazar king and his interlocutors, Halevi goes on to furnish important additional information about both the speakers themselves and also about the principles, themes, and criteria of judgment that will be invoked to advance the dialogue and to evaluate the views and justifications offered to support them. This applies especially to his depiction of the king. Accordingly, the king responds to the philosopher's speech by acknowledging that he found it persuasive, but then immediately qualifies this by adding that it was nonetheless unresponsive to his request for practical guidance. This divided response confirms from the outset that the king is himself a divided man, someone open to and impressed by philosophy, but at the same time open and plainly responsive to the claims of religion and particularly claims regarding the importance of correct action. As the dialogue unfolds, therefore, he will often draw upon the philosopher's skeptical stance or the various ideas introduced by him in responding to other speakers in different contexts. However, the importance he accords to his own experience and that of others possessing genuine empirical knowledge will play a decisive role in how he seeks to have his particular concerns addressed and in the decisions he ultimately makes regarding his own beliefs and actions.

To illustrate, he denies the need to purify his soul because he already knows from his dream experience that his soul is pure. After all, his intentions were described as pleasing to God, but his actions were not. Surely, then, pure intention is not enough; certain actions must be pleasing in themselves. Moreover, if this consideration is not sufficiently probative, the collective experience of both Christians and Muslims is offered to establish the point. Together, they divide the entire inhabited world among themselves and sincerely direct their intentions towards pleasing God, even to the point of killing each other and readily sacrificing themselves in their wars. Yet, however similar they may be in the purity of their intentions, their forms of religious praxis are at odds. Even more to the point, it is rationally impossible for both Muslims and Christians to be right. Whether Halevi's point, here, is to emphasize the importance of collective experience through time in deciding matters of correct behavior or to point out instead that the philosopher's general indifference to praxis beyond recommending prudent behavior as an aid to philosophical understanding borders on relativism is not clear; his purpose may be either or both. What is clear is that the king's rejoinder represents the beginning of a critical appraisal of the philosopher's position that continues long after the philosopher has left the scene.

This becomes clearer still after the philosopher replies that the religion of the philosophers does not allow for killing either of the contending parties—surely, a humane consideration that no victim of religious discrimination or persecution, and especially no Jew, could fail to appreciate. Yet, even though the king evidently shares the philosopher's doubts about the religious doctrine of creation in six days and goes on to highlight his own skepticism about the possibility of divine-human contact in connection with it, he nevertheless points out a glaring discrepancy between the philosopher's theoretical account of prophecy and its prerequisites and actual experience. He notes that given the philosopher's exemplary standards for virtuous behavior, knowledge of the sciences, and personal effort, prophecy should have been well known and widespread among them. They should also have had a reputation for performing wondrous feats. However, the facts show that this is not the case. On the contrary, veridical or prophetic dreams do come at times to people who are unconcerned with the sciences and purifying their souls, and they do not come to those who have deliberately sought such things. From this, the king concludes that the divine order of things (al-’amr al-’ilâhî ) and the souls of certain human beings have a secret character that differs from what the philosopher described. This reference to the divine order and to the mysterious character of the souls of those who have prophetic experiences associated with it introduces one of the central themes of the Kuzari. While it will ultimately be a Jewish scholar who explicates and illustrates these notions for the king, it is nonetheless significant that the king is the one who first mentions them. His doing so raises, at the very least, the possibility that a pious pagan who acknowledges what is hidden or mysterious may perceive reality more completely and accurately than an overconfident philosopher who immediately dismisses such things. The king's statement also calls attention to the fact that whatever the divine order may signify in subsequent discussions, a pious pagan and presumably any others who come to speak of it are familiar with its meaning and general use. In other words, the basic concept is not unique to any particular religion.

After the philosopher departs, the king decides to speak with the Christians and the Muslims on the assumption that one of their forms of practice must be pleasing to God, but he declines to speak with the Jews owing to their paltry numbers, despicable condition, and the universal contempt in which they are held. Accordingly, he asks a Christian scholar and then a Muslim scholar about his “knowledge and actions” (‘ilm wa-l-‘amal), and each replies, in turn, with an affirmation of his faith, a brief history of his religion, and at least an adumbration of its practice. In their attempt to address the king's practical concerns, each one also presents his religion as the culmination of a prophetic tradition going back to the experiences of biblical Israel. Nevertheless, the king rejects both presentations, in the former case, because its principal claims are judged to be at odds with reason, and in the latter, because it fails to provide adequate empirical evidence that a revelation actually occurred and that its alleged content is itself miraculous. Despite these negative appraisals, both exchanges (K 1:4–9) have the positive effect of making clear that what the king seeks is a statement of praxis supported by incontrovertible evidence that grips the heart completely. Building upon the paradigm of how natural scientists explain extraordinary phenomena, the king maintains that if direct experience, however unlikely or unexpected, is well founded and grips the heart, it must be accepted. This is because experience is primary and foundational, while the task of theory is to show rationally how what initially seemed unlikely is actually plausible. Ultimately, he proposes four criteria for evaluating claims of divine contact with flesh and blood. The evidence in favor of a convincing claim must be: (1) genuinely miraculous in the sense of describing effects that are clearly transformative and beyond human powers to produce; (2) witnessed by multitudes; (3) seen with their own eyes; and (4) capable of being studied and examined repeatedly.

Because both his Christian and Muslim interlocutors had grounded their beliefs on God's widely attested revelation to ancient Israel, the king concludes that he has no alternative but to speak with a Jewish sage and ask about his belief. The sage replies with an affirmation of his faith in the God of Abraham, Isaac, and Israel, who is described as having miraculously rescued all of the children of Israel from Egyptian bondage, provided for them in the wilderness, given them the Holy Land, and sent Moses with the divine Law. To this, he adds that God subsequently sent thousands of prophets to support this Law through their promises and warnings. In addition to the statement's remarkable brevity, it is significant in several ways. While asked to state his belief (i’tiqad) in the sense of opinion or reasoned conviction, the Jewish sage replies instead with a profession of faith (iman), signifying trust or steadfast reliance, which is typically the result of lived experiences that culminate in special relationships and understandings. The statement is also notable for not basing faith on one momentous experience within a single individual's lifetime, but rather for linking it with a long series of memorable experiences over the lifetime of an entire people. Beyond this, the narrative alludes directly and indirectly to divine contacts with human beings that were supported by public, empirical, and miraculous evidence that could be studied, re-examined, and, in some sense, tested repeatedly. Indeed, the dispatch of thousands of prophets in support of the Law over the centuries suggests that there was a recurrent need for re-studying the evidence and testing its import with the passage of time. Finally, the statement is programmatic insofar as it identifies many topics and themes to be addressed later, such as evidence for believing in the existence of God, the relationship between familial ties and experience of the divine, prophets and prophecy, revelation and divine Law, the Holy Land and its significance, and divine providence, among others. This is probably why the sage concludes his statement by noting that the Jewish faith embraces everything taught in the Torah, “but the story is long.” (K 1:11)

In the discussion that immediately follows, Halevi puts forward the first of a series of distinctions and rejoinders that collectively amount to a broad-ranging critique of the philosopher's statement and even of philosophy as such. Still, as will become clear, his critique is not so comprehensive that it precludes selective appropriation and adaptation of certain philosophical ideas for his own purposes. Thus, the king expresses surprise that the sage said nothing about God's being the Creator of the world, who orders and governs it in such a way that people strive to imitate God's wisdom and justice in their own actions. To this, the sage replies that the king is referring to the kind of syllogistic, governmental religion to which speculation leads. In contemporary terms, this would now be called a civil religion designed to govern and educate human passions based on practical reason. The sage continues by saying that the king is overlooking the fact that such religions contain many doubtful claims. What is more, he adds, the king will find that the philosophers do not agree on any single action or belief, and this is contrary to the idealized picture of union and unanimity among the great thinkers that is mentioned in the philosopher's speech. To be sure, they make many claims, but only some of these are strictly demonstrable. Others are, at best, merely probable or persuasive, and still others do not even reach that level. Here, then, one finds the sage using basic philosophical distinctions about the varying degrees of validity and soundness by which premises and syllogisms are classified as either demonstrative, dialectical, rhetorical, poetic, or sophistical, to call into question the presumed soundness and certainty of whatever the philosophers have to say. By contrast, however, the sage contends that matters of direct observation, such as those he had described in his opening statement, require neither proof nor demonstration. They are and ought to be accepted as foundational. The king quickly indicates that he regards the sage's critical observations as more likely to be persuasive than his opening statement was, but he requests additional proof. When told that the sage's opening statement was the proof, he is plainly at a loss to understand how that is possible. It is with this expression of puzzlement (K 1:16) that the introductory exchanges between the king and his successive interlocutors comes to an end. Clearly, the Jewish sage has not taken the king very far from his skeptical moorings, but he has nevertheless succeeded where his predecessors did not. He has caused the king to wonder just how a person as critical and astute as the sage seems to be could regard his extraordinary claims as constituting proof for their own veracity. His success, simply stated, was to engage the king's latent interest in his reply and, by doing so, to keep their conversation going.

4. Grounds for Belief in the Existence of God

The sage proposes to resolve the king's puzzlement by means of a thought experiment comprised of two hypothetical situations. While this experiment is ultimately about what counts as sufficient grounds to persuade him of the existence of God as the sage has described him, this is neither announced in advance nor immediately obvious from what is said. Accordingly, the sage asks the king whether, upon being told that the ruler of India was a virtuous man and that the people of India also had excellent character traits and behaved justly towards one another in all their dealings, he would be compelled to revere their ruler and recount his exploits with praise. The Khazar king replies that there could hardly be any compelling obligation, if there is doubt about whether the justice of India's people was entirely of their own making, and they have no king at all, or whether it really was due to their king, after all, or, finally, whether it was attributable to both. His unstated but nonetheless crucial assumption is that, of course, there is doubt, because no compelling evidence or argument has been provided to establish any of the three alternatives just mentioned.

The second hypothetical case immediately follows. Now the king is asked whether he would be obligated to obey the ruler of India, if he were to be visited by his messenger, who brought with him gifts typical of India and specifically of its royal palaces, a message signed by the king himself, as well as medicines to cure his illnesses and preserve his health, and poisons by which to prevail over his enemies. The king's reply is unqualifiedly affirmative, and he immediately explains why. His previous doubt about whether India really had a king would have been dispelled, and he would believe that both his dominion and his order extend to include him. When the sage then asks the king how he would then describe the Indian king he has never met, he responds in a way that clearly recalls his earlier remarks about natural scientists confronted by unexplained phenomena. He says that he would describe him, first, in terms of attributes based on direct observation, and then in terms of other attributes that are both generally accepted and plainly applicable because of those based on observation.

It is only after the king has expressed himself in this way that the sage begins to suggest that the entire thought experiment is parabolical and that the king has, in effect, endorsed the rationality and appropriateness of the sage's opening remarks. The endorsement was in his having responded to the unanticipated diplomatic mission to his court with all its concomitant benefits just as the biblical Israelites responded to the unanticipated mission and extraordinary benefits that came their way, which by their very nature laid the foundation for a special relationship. By providing additional examples about how God is known to be real only from experience or from uninterrupted tradition which is deemed equivalent to it, rather than from the tenuous and inconclusive arguments associated with syllogistic, governmental religions, both the king and the reader are left to work out the specific correspondences between the two hypothetical cases and the claims of philosophy on the one hand, and revealed religion on the other. Even a cursory reading, however, establishes that in both parts of the thought experiment, the king of India represents God, and India, the divine realm. In the first hypothetical case, the justice of India's people seems to represent either a pervasive, intelligible aspect of the cosmos (e.g., motion, causation) which serves as the starting point of cosmological arguments generally, or, more specifically, evidence of intelligent ordering, on which design arguments are typically based. The possible explanations for the justice that prevails would presumably correspond to various philosophical and theological positions that remain to be identified. The key point is that the Khazar king recognizes that there is no compelling evidence or argument to establish that the justice of India's people is due to their king or that they even have a king. Hence, he suspends judgment. In the second hypothetical case, it is clear that the messenger of the king of India is either an angel or a prophet, that the signed letter is most likely the revealed Law, which repeatedly presents God, using his proper name, as its author, and that the medicinal gifts are the divine commandments. However the other elements of the parable might be understood, the key point is that, based on the empirical evidence presented to him, the king is not only prepared to acknowledge the existence of the king of India, but also to recognize the authority of his dominion and obey his order. In effect, the diplomatic mission which the second hypothetical case describes creates a sense of indebtedness and obligation on the part of the recipient which lays the groundwork for a special relationship, such as that of a suzerain and vassal or patron and client. As the dialogue proceeds, it will be helpful to keep in mind both this brief reference to the Indian king's dominion and order as well as the apparently insignificant fact that the king's representative comes from India.

5. The Hierarchy of Being

The Khazar king is soon reminded that while he may have been the beneficiary of the Indian king's largesse in the parable, the sage's point was to show that the children of Israel were the actual beneficiaries of divine largesse in reality. What is more, he himself senses that their legacy seems to be confined to themselves. Even though the sage explains that all who join them will share in their good fortune, he also qualifies this by noting that they will nevertheless not be equal to lineal descendants of Israel, since the latter are “the choicest of the descendants of Adam.” (K 1:26–27) Despite the king's obvious dismay, he is nonetheless sufficiently curious about what lies behind this puzzling claim that he agrees to the sage's request to be allowed to broaden his explanation of it.

Halevi's task at this juncture is not only to explain how God could have entered into contact with mere flesh and blood to provide instruction about what is pleasing and displeasing to him, but also to explain how only Israel could have received this instruction. His strategy for explaining both successfully is to build upon the king's skepticism regarding claims of direct divine-human contact in order to strengthen his case by raising such contacts to a higher level. Accordingly, the sage calls the king's attention to the familiar hierarchical structure of the empirical world, namely, the ascending orders of living beings that can be perceived by the senses—plants, animals, and human beings endowed with intellect. He also wins the king's basic assent to his classification of each order (amr) or level (rutbah) by reference to the various abilities and/or activities that distinguish the creatures that belong to it. When the king is then asked what level might be above the intellectual order, which distinguishes human beings as rational animals from all other animals by virtue of their concern with improving character traits, the household, and the city through man-made laws and political institutions, he maintains that there is none higher than that of great savants. To this, the sage counters that they, too, belong to the intellectual order, since they differ from other human beings only in degree, not in kind. So he asks about what appears to be yet another hypothetical case: If he were to find someone with an utterly extraordinary capacity for surviving amidst life-threatening circumstances as well as amazing self-mastery and knowledge of hidden things pertaining to both the past and the future, would this not represent an essentially different level? The king responds that it amounts to even more than that; it would be the divine level characteristic of God's own kingdom, if it exists. In addition, the person described would come under the dominion of the divine order (al-amr al-ilahi). After the king's qualified revision of the hierarchy's true extent, it remains only for the sage to explain that what he described were, in fact, the attributes of the undisputed prophet through whom multitudes of Israelites became aware of God's attachment to them and also of the fact that God governs them in accordance with both his will and their own obedience and disobedience, as recorded in the Bible's historical and genealogical narratives. (K 1: 31–43)

In effect, then, the sage makes use of the king's doubts about God's communicating with ordinary human beings to persuade him that God might plausibly do so with super-human beings. It is not that the prophets, who exemplify the latter category, are not flesh and blood, but rather that the qualities which distinguish their souls (recalling the Khazar's concluding remarks to the philosopher in K 1:4) raise them far above that level so as to belong, quite literally, to one that is essentially different from and higher than all the others, namely, “the divine order.” Once this is granted, there is no longer any insurmountable barrier between God, angels, and human beings of a certain kind that would preclude, in principle, contact or communication between them, even though their respective powers and ranks within the same order differ greatly. In this sense, prophets belong to the divine order and speak on its behalf, just as the messenger in the sage's parable comes from India with the king's letter and appropriate gifts because he belongs to that kingdom and was duly commissioned by its ruler. By the same token, however, the king's appointed messengers might also be dispatched to other members of the kingdom with announcements, instructions, reproaches, or other communications for their benefit. Indeed, all of these would be evidence of the king's attachment to them. They, in turn, as subjects of the king, could be expected to have access to him, and if they also had all of the requisite qualifications, they might also become messengers, i.e., prophets, themselves. By extrapolating thus from the sage's parable, it becomes clear why Israel alone is designated as the choicest of Adam's descendents and the recipient of God's instructions. Israel, too, belongs to the divine order or kingdom and comes under God's own dominion.

It should be noted, however, that interpretations of exactly what Halevi meant by the very significant term al-amr al-ilahi vary greatly. While there is a general consensus that it signifies experienced aspects of divinity in nature and especially in history, explanations and descriptions range from the very abstract (e.g., “the divine matter,” “the divine thing,” “the divine,” “an aura enveloping the people and land of Israel”) to a wide array of specific instances or manifestations (e.g., “God as such,” “God's will,” “a super-rational faculty in man for prophecy,” “divine light”). In order to clarify and organize the basic connotations of the term in a way that enables us to make sense of all of Halevi's specific usages, it is helpful to distinguish between three distinct yet related connotations originally suggested by Shlomo Pines. He based them on his study of Shiite and Ismaili terminology used in the Kuzari, but they are introduced here because of their direct correlation with Halevi's clearest uses of the term in the first parts of the dialogue.

The first and most basic connotation of al-amr al-ilahi signifies an arrangement, dispensation or ordering of things which governs the affairs of all who belong to and participate in it, such as angels, prophets, and pious friends of God, among others. (K 1: 4, 41–43; 3: 5) Thus, “the divine order,” one of several literal renderings of the Arabic term, corresponds to the supreme level in the hierarchy of things, which God, its supreme member, has willed to be as it is. The second connotation of “the divine order,” which is derived from the first, signifies the gift or influx of prophecy, both as an experience of the divine and as the power, capacity, or faculty within the soul that enables one to apprehend it. (K 1: 4, 25, 43, 95, 97, 109) It is typically bestowed on those belonging to the divine dispensation as a sign of favor or recognition of noble rank in a special audience with God or a divine appointee that typically confers recondite information, specific instructions, and special powers to speak or act on his behalf, along with the possibility of future access. In this sense, bestowal of the divine order quaprophetic gift is comparable to what a patron does in awarding an order of merit or a commission to his client or what a monarch does when conferring the Order of the Empire upon a worthy subject. The third and final connotation of “the divine order” signifies orders or commands in the conventional sense of directives that mandate what pleases God and prohibit what displeases him. However, even this very specific sense of the term sometimes allows for a broader usage that signifies the power or authority that lies behind such commands. (K 1: 87, 98; 2: 4, 6, 50; 3:23, 53) References to the divine order in this third sense clearly presuppose the prior reception of prophecy itself and whatever knowledge or instruction it provides, plus the transmission of such knowledge over time through reliable tradition from parent to child and teacher to student. Without these, one can only speculate about divine things in general terms and largely out of ignorance.

6. Qualifications for the Attainment of Prophecy and Prophetic Knowledge

It remains, then, to identify what prerequisites must be satisfied if a member of the divine order, understood as dispensation, is to attain prophecy and with it receive knowledge of hidden things. Notwithstanding Halevi's generally critical stance towards philosophy and the philosopher's opening statement, he does not refrain from appropriating from the philosopher's presentation those elements that he believes to be correct and which might serve, when fully explained, to advance his general argument on behalf of the Jews and Judaism. Accordingly, he, too, highlights the influence of (1) parents and relatives, (2) geographic environment, as well as (3) education and training as indispensable for realizing as fully as possible whatever capacity members of the divine order possess to become prophets or, at the very least, pious friends of God, just as the philosopher identifies these same factors in the formation of the perfect individual who allegedly attains union with the Active Intellect.

Regarding the first prerequisite, superior lineage, Halevi does not state explicitly whether the influence of parents and relatives should be construed in biological or psychological terms, or perhaps both. Interpreters have tended to understand it as being biological or at least quasi-biological, insofar as it is the means by which qualified individuals are endowed with or inherit a divine faculty that comes after the intellect and facilitates contact with God as well as knowledge of truths with only the slightest reflection. (K 1: 95) According to the sage, Adam, who was God's own creation and perfectly made, was endowed with it. However, he did not succeed in transmitting this faculty to all or even most of his offspring. On the contrary, for generations it manifested itself only in unique individuals like Abel, Seth, Enosh, Noah and others on through Abraham, Isaac, and Jacob, each of whom was the choicest offspring of his father. Sometimes it even skipped over a generation. Ultimately, however, all of Jacob's sons proved fit for the divine order, and eventually all of their offspring, both male and female, came to be endowed with it. It is noteworthy that the presence or absence of this faculty is not attributed to a divine choice, but rather to the fitness or unfitness of the potential recipients. Still, this unusual pattern of transmission does not make a strictly biological explanation particularly compelling. Further, when it is recalled that the Khazar king originally spoke of the secret character of the divine order in conjunction with the secret character of certain souls, (K 1:4) a psychological or even cultural mode of transmission becomes more plausible. This is especially so when the sage later speaks of the divine faculty or capacity as “the eye of prophecy,” (K 2:24) and later still as the “inner eye” which is “almost” the same as “the imaginative faculty as long as it serves the intellectual faculty.” (K 4:3) All of these remarks all suggest that he is probably referring to either an exceptionally powerful internal sense or to a distinctive way of seeing or interpreting what is seen, which might help to explain the link between familial ties and experiencing prophecy. Yet even here, Halevi's language is sufficiently equivocal to allow for a wide range of interpretations.

The second prerequisite stipulates that one must dwell within the geographic environment that uniquely fosters the attainment of prophecy or for the sake of which it occurs. That turns out to be the region variously identified as Syro-Palestine or the Land of Israel. Halevi explains the region's special standing in terms of its ideal configuration of temperate climate, its placement at the center of the inhabited world (as then known), and its location on the axis mundi that historically links heaven and earth through prophecy, as depicted in Jacob's dream. For all these reasons, it represents the optimal location not only for the attainment of prophecy by qualified members of the divine order, but also for living out the “way of life characteristic of God's kingdom” (K 5: 20, 4th premise) mandated by the revealed Law and intended for all who participate in that order, whether by birth or by choice. Indeed, God is portrayed as transplanting “his people” to “his land,” in order to realize his purpose for the land itself—to guide the entire inhabited world in the right path. (K 1: 95; 2: 9–24; 5: 22–28)

The third and final prerequisite identifies exactly what the instruction and training mentioned in the philosopher's speech consists in, if it is to culminate in the experience of prophecy. Here, abstract principles, general guidelines, and ad hoc judgments, no matter how intelligent or astute, do not suffice to produce the desired result. Only adherence to the specific commandments and prohibitions embodied in the Written and Oral Law from God can do so. That is because the specifics in their totality and due proportion constitute a regimen that imparts to human souls both the conduct and the disposition of the angels. Indeed, Halevi claims that perseverance in performing acts mandated by the Law raises one to the level of revelation, which is the human level closest to the divine. (K 1: 87, 98; 2:48, 50; 3: 7, 11, 53; 4:19; 5:20, 4th premise)

What ties together these three prerequisites is Halevi's attempt to give both actual and specific content to what the philosopher sketched out only in broad outline. His emphasis on specific ancestry and lineage was surely intended to call attention to actual people whose lives were characterized by special relationships that could affect the course of history and, as a result, to reconnect one's own life with theirs. His emphasis on a particular geographical environment was plainly intended to renew and strengthen his people's sense of connection to and love for their ancestral home and, given both the dialogue's ending and Halevi's own choice, a willingness to return it. His emphasis, finally, on the commandments as the clearest embodiments of what is pleasing to God was clearly meant to nourish not only respect for the nobility of Israel's ancestral way of life, but also to encourage renewed commitment to that life as defined by worthy deeds and self-mastery over and above pleasing intentions and intellectually respectable opinions. By the same token, his elaboration of these prerequisites over the course of the dialogue may also be intended as a critique of philosophy in the sense that it is by its very nature unable to provide more than general principles and guidelines in the realm of action. Its preoccupation with the search for universals inevitably finds claims about special qualities, places, relationships and actions to be, more often than not, problematic or naïve, and what Halevi would regard as appropriate concern with matters of detail, outside its purview.

7. The Problem of Creation vs. the Eternity of the World

While the sage fully appreciates that the Khazar king's principal concern is to learn what actions are pleasing and displeasing, he also recognizes that the king has been perplexed and preoccupied from the beginning with the claim that God created the world out of nothing in six days. The discussion of the divine order and of what the attributes of the undisputed prophet are made it clear that knowledge of hidden things in both the past and future was one such attribute. So it is that in the course of responding to a query about the reliability of the Bible's chronology, the sage addresses himself to several of the reasons for the king's perplexity about creation, and he does so in unexpected ways. First, he flatly dismisses claims about the great antiquity of certain monuments in India that allegedly refute the Bible's chronology and of certain records that name people who lived before Adam. He argues that these claims are unconfirmed and that the uneducated multitude which accepts such things is wayward and unreliable. It is precisely because the multitude lacks both well established beliefs and an agreed-upon chronology, such as the Jews possess, that they succumb so easily to credulousness.

When the sage is reminded, however, that the philosophers believe in the past-eternity of the world and support their claims by scrupulous investigation, the sage rejects the philosopher's view of the past-eternity of the world as well. However, he also excuses the philosophers for being mistaken because their lineage and geographical environment have left them poorly equipped to receive or acquire, not to mention preserve and transmit, reliable information on the matter. As Greeks, they were descendents of Yaphet rather than Shem, which means that they lacked knowledge confirmed by a divine order (i.e., a prophetic experience apprehended by the divine faculty that sees things as they really are). Accordingly, they could only speculate about the matter. In addition, the variability and instability of the northern climates contributed to the destruction or loss of what knowledge they did have. The opposite holds true for the descendents of Shem and the region that was their home. Having no special claim to credibility, Aristotle's view should not be accepted. In fact, the arguments for the two positions turn out to be evenly balanced against each other and are therefore inconclusive. In the end, Aristotle preferred the idea of the world's past-eternity because of an essentially cultural predilection for the abstract argumentation supporting it and, of course, because he lacked a reliable tradition supporting the contrary view. Having no such tradition of his own, he never even thought to ask others about theirs. Had he lived within a nation that possessed such a tradition, like Israel's own, Halevi contends that he would certainly have argued for the possibility of creation, for, as the sage points out most emphatically in an oath, the Torah teaches nothing that directly contradicts the clear evidence of sense experience or the conclusion of a genuine demonstration. Halevi does not spell out why he thinks Aristotle would have decided to argue for the opposing view, but it seems to have some connection with the status and function of oaths, which calls for further reflection. In any event, even if it were eventually proven that matter is eternal into the past and many worlds preceded this one, an adherent of the Law would still be able to maintain that traditions about the temporal origin of this world and its earliest inhabitants remain intact and his faith unimpaired.

8. The Origin of the Jewish Religion and the Theophany at Sinai

Halevi's treatment of the theophany at Sinai presents a remarkably rich, nuanced, yet compact summary of familiar themes in the biblical accounts of this axial event, set within the context of the liberation from bondage. At the same time, it links up with other significant themes already discussed or elaborated on later in the dialogue. Following a brief discussion of what we can know about nature, causation, and divine agency, (K 1:68–79) the king asks the sage to tell him how his religion developed and spread beyond its point of origin, how it overcame internal dissension to achieve unity, and how it eventually became well established. From the question itself, it is obvious that the king conceives of Judaism's emergence in purely naturalistic terms, akin to what the sage had previously identified as a syllogistic, governmental religion. Much to his surprise, however, the sage asserts that only man-made nomoi (laws) arise in this way, while a nomos that has its origin in God arises suddenly. On being told to be, it obediently came into being, just like the creation of the world. The king confesses to being awestruck by this unexpected declaration, although it is unclear whether he is more impressed by the miraculous suddenness of what is claimed or the element of obedience associated with it.

Halevi builds upon this ambiguity as the sage proceeds to describe the remarkable loyalty, courage, cohesiveness, and sheer endurance of the Hebrew slaves. He traces their path out of the humiliation and misery of Egyptian slavery to their ultimate deliverance under the leadership of Moses and Aaron, amidst miraculous plagues announced in advance. He goes on to recount their subsequent rescue at the sea and, finally, the beginning of their journey into the wilderness of Sinai. Although the sage matter-of-factly characterizes the story as lengthy and well-known, the king's response registers its intended effect. He says that this is truly the divine order at work, since no doubt about these events having come about through magic, subterfuge or imagination grips the heart. While his informal survey of possible explanations is by no means exhaustive, it does underscore the people's belief that their God can indeed do whatever he wishes whenever he wishes—at least within the parameters of the story as told thus far. However, it does not dispel either their doubt or the king's own doubt as to whether God enters into contact with flesh and blood. Halevi makes it clear that the theophany at Sinai was intended to resolve that doubt once and for all. (K 1:80–87)

In the first of the discussion's three phases, the nature of this persistent doubt is explained. The people are convinced that speaking is a corporeal phenomenon, presumably because physical organs are needed both to produce and to apprehend the sounds and a physical medium such as air is needed to carry or convey them. But if that is so, speech without a flesh and blood speaker seems highly unlikely. Yet, the people had also come to believe that God was well above the characteristics and accoutrements of flesh and blood. To remove both the doubt itself and the concomitant supposition that any allegedly divine Law actually had to be the result of human thought and opinion, the people were instructed first to prepare inwardly and outwardly over three days of great terror for the theophany to come. Significantly, however, when Halevi undertakes to describe the momentous revelation, he carefully distinguishes between the events that the people witnessed, on the one hand, and how they reported and transmitted what they apprehended, on the other. What they actually witnessed was (1) lightning, thunder, earthquakes, and fires that surrounded the mountain; (2) Moses entering and emerging from the fire, alive; (3) the presentation of the Ten Commandments; and (4) the stone tablets inscribed with divine writing. The description is uncharacteristically bare of any reference to God having said or done anything and likewise bereft of any biblical citations to fill in the lacunae.

Immediately afterwards, the sage indicates that the multitude did not transmit the Ten Commandments as something declared by individuals among them or by a prophet, but by God. Later, when Moses had been asked to serve as their intermediary with God, they believed that he was addressed by speech that had its origin in God, but without prior thought on his part. To make the point of God's involvement clearer still, we are told that when Moses came down from the mountain with the inscribed tablets in hand, all conjectures about his having formulated the Ten Commandments on his own or with the help of the Active Intellect, or as a figment of his imagination while dreaming were refuted by the theophany itself—a clear invitation to re-examine what they witnessed—and by the fact that the people “saw them asdivine writing, just as they heard them as divine speech.” (K1:87; italics added) Given the fact that Halevi was an accomplished poet and sensitive to the nuances of language, there is every reason to suppose that he knew that “seeing” and “seeing as” do not signify the same kind of activity. The relational and interpretive character of “seeing as” and “hearing as” raises the possibility that the imagination may have had at least some role in how the people understood the events they witnessed, even though the only explicit reference to it thus far denies it any role in what Moses experienced. By the end of this phase of Halevi's discussion, (K 1:87) it is clear that the skeptical Israelites have at last been persuaded that God does enter into contact with flesh and blood. They are plainly unanimous about what they experienced and unanimous about accepting the Law as divine and authoritative. From the standpoint of the king's four criteria for resolving his own skepticism, the sage's account would seem to have addressed them all with the added prospect that political benefits like stability and cohesiveness might likewise result from his following the Israelites example. (cf. K 1: 21–22)

In the second phase of the discussion, (K 1: 88–90) the king offers two responses to what he has heard, but neither one explicitly states his own view. The first suggests that “someone” who hears all that the sage described would surely be excused for supposing that Jews believe that God is corporeal. In saying this, he calls attention to a common misunderstanding many people have upon first encountering biblical and rabbinic narratives relating to God. The second response addresses the sage, and through him the Jews generally, by allowing that they, too, may be excused for rejecting reason and speculation because of the undeniable and plainly visible sights just related. By excusing his interlocutor and those he represents, however, the king indicates, albeit indirectly, his own acceptance of the evidence presented and, with it, the implication that experience trumps both reason and speculation, (cf. K 1:4, 5) apparently without qualification. This plainly ignores several of the more qualified observations offered by the sage (e.g., the “seeing”/ “seeing as” distinction), but it also shows that the king has reached one of several turning points that culminate in his conversion to Judaism (K 2:1) and his continuing education through the end of the dialogue.

Unlike the king, the sage is by no means prepared to jettison reason and speculation altogether, even and perhaps especially in defense of his faith. Thus, he invokes God's name in an informal oath, once again, to forbid the acceptance of anything that the intellect regards as absurd or impossible, which in the case at hand would clearly apply to construing God as corporeal. While his oath is surely no syllogistic argument, it is a performative utterance to be taken with the utmost seriousness, especially when the strictures against taking God's name in vain are recalled. By speaking in this manner, the sage acknowledges the supremacy of the divine order in all of its senses, but he does this now in defense of reason and rationality. Since oaths are taken, in part, to establish truth in an inquiry, his purpose in taking this oath is evidently to base all inquiries in pursuit of the truth on the authority of the Law and respect for its foundations. He illustrates the point by noting that the first of the Ten Commandments mandates the acceptance of God's sovereignty, and his oath assuredly does this. The second Commandment, in turn, forbids representing God corporeally in any form. If so, it would be utterly absurd for the Law to presuppose what it prohibits (i.e., that God must be corporeal), given what the Bible relates about the great theophany.

Once the religious and legal basis for reason's denial of divine corporeality is established, the sage does not hesitate to offer a speculative argument of his own. He presents it in the a fortioriform often used to interpret the Law and argues that if we maintain that many of God's creations are above corporeality, “like the rational soul, which is what man is in reality,” how shall we not maintain that God is also above corporeality? Using Moses as an example, he notes that the part of Moses that speaks to, understands, and governs his people is not his tongue, brain, or heart, which are merely organs and instruments belonging to him, but rather his rational soul, which is what he really is. On the basis of this clearly Platonic conception of the soul, he goes on to argue that, owing to the soul's incorporeality, no place is too narrow for it to enter, nor is it too narrow for the forms of all created things to find a place in it. The restriction of what the soul may eventually understand to created things is entirely consistent with the sage's account of the hierarchy of being. What is unexpected and ultimately more important is that Halevi gives enormous latitude to what the soul, or, more concretely stated, philosophers and natural scientists, may inquire into and understand within the created world itself. Whatever the limits of our capacity to understand divine things rationally, he is certainly not an irrationalist or even an anti-rationalist if that is understood to mean someone who completely rejects inquiry and theorizing. The second phase ends with the sage reminding the king that we must not reject what has been transmitted about the theophany, but say instead that we do not understand how these events and the miraculous deliverances that accompanied them took place. As noted above, “what has been transmitted” includes not only Moses’ reports but also the multitude's understanding and interpretation of what took place, and, insofar as this, too, is preserved in the Written and Oral Law, rejecting it would be tantamount to rejecting the Law itself and with it the social contract that it embodies. Thus, it is not surprising that the king accepts all that has been said as persuasive for the purposes of argument.

In the third and concluding part of the discussion, (K 1:90) the sage acknowledges that he is not saying categorically that the matter took place just as he described. He allows that it may have taken place in an even more profound way than he can imagine. Here, the sage's admission would seem to create some difficulty for his earlier claim that uninterrupted tradition is as valid as direct observation. (K 1: 25; 5: 14) However, it also invites his interlocutor and the reader to fulfill the last of the king's four requirements or criteria for overcoming his skepticism about revelation, namely to study and test the evidence repeatedly, but now it is in order to arrive at a more profound understanding of it.

Perhaps most unexpected of all is the sage's explicit reference to role of imagination in relating events of the past. Despite his efforts to dismiss philosophical accounts of the imagination's role in dream prophecy and its mimetic function in intellectual prophecy, he now accords it a role in representing decisive events from the past. By the time imagination reappears in Halevi's discussion of the “inner eye” of prophecy, (K 4:3) it also has a role in understanding and interpreting events, states of affairs, and the natures of created things in the present. The question that remains to be answered is whether the inner eye had the same function and also performed that function in connection with the events associated with the theophany at Sinai. Halevi does not address the issue. The most that he is prepared to say is that those who witnessed those events, noting especially the events' unprecedented character, were convinced that they came from the Creator without intermediary, as did the creation of the world itself. That is why faith in the divine Law is thereafter associated by the faithful with a matching faith that the world, too, is God's entirely originated creation.


Primary Sources

Editions and Translations of the Kuzari (cited as K)

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Other Internet Resources

  • Judah Halevi, article from the Jewish Encyclopedia
  • Khazaria, a resource for Turkic and Jewish History in Russia and Ukraine

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Barry Kogan <bskogan@aol.com>

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