Luitzen Egbertus Jan Brouwer

First published Wed Mar 26, 2003; substantive revision Wed Feb 26, 2020

Dutch mathematician and philosopher who lived from 1881 to 1966. He is traditionally referred to as “L.E.J. Brouwer”, with full initials, but was called “Bertus” by his friends.

In classical mathematics, he founded modern topology by establishing, for example, the topological invariance of dimension and the fixpoint theorem. He also gave the first correct definition of dimension.

In philosophy, his brainchild is intuitionism, a revisionist foundation of mathematics. Intuitionism views mathematics as a free activity of the mind, independent of any language or Platonic realm of objects, and therefore bases mathematics on a philosophy of mind. The implications are twofold. First, it leads to a form of constructive mathematics, in which large parts of classical mathematics are rejected. Second, the reliance on a philosophy of mind introduces features that are absent from classical mathematics as well as from other forms of constructive mathematics: unlike those, intuitionistic mathematics is not a proper part of classical mathematics.

1. The Person

Brouwer studied at the (municipal) University of Amsterdam where his most important teachers were Diederik Korteweg and Gerrit Mannoury.

Korteweg (1848–1941) was professor of mathematics, mechanics and astronomy at the University of Amsterdam from 1881–1918; the last five years as extraordinarius, so as to make place for Brouwer. Around 1900, Korteweg was the most important and influential mathematician in the Netherlands, and he contributed much to the internationalisation of Dutch mathematics. A mathematical physicist trained by van der Waals, he had a particular interest in mechanics and thermodynamics. Among his many results, the best-known is probably the Korteweg-de Vries equation, describing the behaviour of waves in a shallow channel. Korteweg also had a strong historical interest, and was chief editor of vols. XI–XV of Christiaan Huygens’ collected works (1908–1925). Part of the correspondence with his PhD student Brouwer concerned the unification of physical theories (see van Stigt, 1990, pp. 490–498).

Mannoury (1867–1956) was a philosopher, mathematician, psychoanalyst, accountant, and political activist (Kirkels, 2019). Largely an autodidact, it was he who introduced in the Netherlands both topology (in a series of papers of 1897–1900) and Peano’s symbolic logic (in a lecture in 1903). In 1903 he was appointed privaatdocent (unpaid lecturer) in the logical foundations of mathematics at the University of Amsterdam, where Brouwer was among his first and most enthusiastic students. His lectures have been published, in shortened and revised form, as Mannoury, 1909. But it was Mannoury’s earlier, topological papers that influenced the young Brouwer decisively: the “undertone” of that work, Brouwer said in a speech in 1946, had changed his view of mathematics from a collection of “truths fascinating by their immovability, but horrifying by their lifelessness, like stones from barren mountains of disconsolate infinity” to a concern with what is “built ... out of the structural elements of our thinking” (Brouwer, 1946B, pp. 192–193). Brouwer was also very interested in Mannoury’s reflections on the uses and misuses of language in mathematics and philosophy. In 1917 Mannoury became professor extraordinarius, in 1918 ordinarius at the University of Amsterdam, succeeding Korteweg at the chair of analytic and descriptive geometry, mechanics and philosophy of mathematics, until 1937. A large part of his career was devoted to furthering the development of significs, an analysis of communicative acts starting from the ideas laid down by Victoria, Lady Welby in her paper “Sense, Meaning and Interpretation” (Welby, 1896). Brouwer was also involved in that project.

Brouwer’s principal (intuitionistic) students were Maurits Belinfante, Arend Heyting, and Johan de Iongh; Heyting, in turn, was the teacher of Anne Troelstra and Dirk van Dalen, and de Iongh of Wim Veldman. Brouwer’s classes were also attended by Max Euwe, later to become world chess champion, who published a game-theoretical paper on chess from the intuitionistic point of view (Euwe, 1929), and who would much later deliver Brouwer’s funeral speech. Among Brouwer’s assistants were Heyting, Hans Freudenthal, Karl Menger, and Witold Hurewicz, the latter two of whom were not intuitionistically inclined. The most influential supporter of Brouwer’s intuitionism outside the Netherlands at the time was, for a number of years, Hermann Weyl (whose adaptation of intuitionistic analysis was not wholly coherent); also Husserl’s student Oskar Becker should be mentioned.

Brouwer seems to have been an independent and brilliant man of high moral standards, but with an exaggerated sense of justice, making him at times pugnacious. As a consequence, in his life he energetically fought many battles. To Mannoury’s daughter, Brouwer once said: “Indeed, your father is one of the few people with whom I have never had a quarrel. But he brought out the good in people, and I the bad” (Schmitz, 1990, p. 383).

From 1914 to 1928, Brouwer was member of the editiorial board of the Mathematische Annalen, and he was the founding editor of Compositio Mathematica, which first appeared in 1934.

He was a member of, among others, the Royal Dutch Academy of Sciences, the Royal Society in London, the Preußische Akademie der Wissenschaften in Berlin, and the Akademie der Wissenschaften in Göttingen.

Brouwer received honorary doctorates from the universities of Oslo (1929) and Cambridge (1954), and was made Knight in the Order of the Dutch Lion in 1932.

2. Chronology

1881 February 27, born in Overschie (since 1941 part of Rotterdam), The Netherlands.

1897 Enters the University of Amsterdam to study mathematics and physics.

1904 Obtains doctorandus title (MSc degree) in mathematics; first publication (on rotations in four dimensional space); marries Lize de Holl (born 1870). They would have no children, but Lize had a daughter from an earlier marriage. They move to Blaricum, near Amsterdam, where they would live for the rest of their lives, although they also had houses in other places.

1904–1907 Doctoral studies. His mathematical and philosophical notebooks towards his dissertation show strong influence from notably Cantor, Hilbert, Russell, Poincaré, and Couturat. He is aware of the Frege–Hilbert debate, and in that matter sides with Frege. Some remarks betray a form of anti-semitism that, unfortunately, often appeared in language at the time, as codification of a common prejudice; an occasional remark goes further and contrasts Jewish people unfavourably to Germanic ones. No such utterances are known from other periods in his life; compare also the entries for 1934–1935 and 1940–1945 below. There is no meaningful connection between this fleeting anti-semitism and the philosophical views on mathematics, language, and society he set out in his dissertation and developed over the rest of his life.

1907 Obtains doctor title with dissertation On the Foundations of Mathematics, under supervision of Korteweg at the University of Amsterdam. (The original Dutch title of the dissertation was ‘Over de Grondslagen der Wiskunde’. The present entry will for the most part refer to works cited by using the titles of English translations, with the bibliography providing information about the original publications.) It marks the beginning of his intuitionistic reconstruction of mathematics. Later that year, Brouwer’s wife graduates and becomes a pharmacist. All his life, Brouwer did the bookkeeping for her and filled out the tax forms, and sometimes he assisted behind the counter.

1908 First publication of his argument against the general validity of the Principle of the Excluded Middle in “The unreliability of the logical principles”. First participation in an international conference, the Fourth International Conference of Mathematicians in Rome.

1909–1913 In a very productive four years, Brouwer founds modern topology, as a chapter of classical mathematics. Highlights: invariance of dimension, fixed point theorem, mapping degree, definition of dimension. As van Dalen (2005, p. 450) observes, Brouwer’s definition of dimension seems to be the first reformulation of an inductive definition as a game. A pause in his intuitionistic program.

1909 Becomes privaatdocent (unpaid lecturer) at the University of Amsterdam. Inaugural lecture “The Nature of Geometry”.

1909 Meets Hilbert in the Dutch seaside resort of Scheveningen. Brouwer much admires Hilbert and describes their meeting in a letter to a friend as “a beautiful new ray of light through my life” (Brouwer & Adama van Scheltema, 1984, p. 100). Twenty years later, Brouwer’s relation with Hilbert would turn sour.

1911 First appearance of the names “formalism” and “intuitionism” in Brouwer’s writings, in a review of Mannoury’s Methodological and philosophical remarks on elementary mathematics (1909).

1912 Elected member of the Royal Academy of Sciences (during World War II “Dutch Academy of Sciences”, afterward “Royal Dutch Academy of Sciences”).

1912 Appointed full professor extraordinarius in the field of set theory, function theory, and axiomatics. His philosophical inaugural lecture “Intuïtionisme en Formalisme” is translated into English as “Intuitionism and Formalism” and thus becomes, in 1913, the first publication on intuitionism in that language.

1913 Appointed full professor ordinarius, succeeding Korteweg, who had generously offered to vacate his chair for the purpose.

1914 Invited to join the editorial board of the Mathematische Annalen; accepts the honour.

1918 Brouwer begins the systematic intuitionistic reconstruction of mathematics with his paper “Founding Set Theory Independently of the Principle of the Excluded Middle. Part One, General Set Theory”.

1919 Receives offers for professorships in Göttingen and in Berlin; declines both.

1919 “Intuitionistic Set Theory” is the first piece of intuitionistic mathematics in a widely read international journal, the Jahresbericht der Deutschen Mathematiker Vereinigung.

1920 Start of the “Grundlagenstreit” (Foundational Debate) with Brouwer’s lecture at the “Naturforscherversammlung” in Bad Nauheim, published in 1921, “Does Every Real Number Have a Decimal Expansion?”; the debate was amplified by Weyl’s defence of intuitionism in 1921, “On the New Foundational Crisis of Mathematics”; Hilbert responds in 1922, “The New Grounding of Mathematics”.

1922 Co-founds, with Gerrit Mannoury, the man of letters Frederik van Eeden, and others, the “Signific Circle”, aiming at spiritual and political progress through language reform. The Circle ends its meetings in 1926, but Mannoury continues its work.

1926 Lecture in Göttingen; as a result of a group dinner at Emmy Noether’s house, Hilbert and Brouwer are (for a brief period) on good terms again.

1927 Lecture series in Berlin; Hans Reichenbach and André Weil are in the audience, as is Brouwer’s later assistant Hans Freudenthal. The newspaper Berliner Tageblatt proposes a public debate between Brouwer and Hilbert, to be held in its pages, but for some reason this is not realised. Neither does Brouwer complete the book he is invited to write by the German publisher Walter de Gruyter. The lectures and an incomplete book are published posthumously (Brouwer, 1992).

1928 March 10 and 14: two lectures in Vienna. Gödel is in the audience, as is Wittgenstein. It is said that the first lecture made Wittgenstein return to philosophy. Brouwer spends a day with Wittgenstein.

1928 April: conversations with Husserl, who is in Amsterdam to lecture.

1928 Conflict over the Bologna conference. The German mathematicians are, for the first time since the ending of World War I, admitted to an international conference again, but not quite as equals. Brouwer insists that this is not fair, and that the conference should therefore be boycotted. Hilbert, who does not share this view, is much chagrined by Brouwer’s action and attends the conference as the leader of the German delegation, the largest present.

1928–1929 “Mathematische Annalenstreit”, the conflict in the editorial board of Mathematische Annalen. Hilbert, thinking he is about to die, feels a need to make sure that after his death Brouwer will not become too influential, and expels him from the board in an unlawful way. (Hilbert’s motivation as described here is documented in letters from people close to him: Carathéodory to Einstein, October 20, 1928; Blumenthal to the publisher and editors of the Mathematische Annalen, November 16, 1928; Born to Einstein, November 20, 1928. Copies of these letters are in the Brouwer Papers at the Noord-Hollands Archief in Haarlem. Relevant quotations from these can be found in van Dalen, 2005, p. 604 and p. 613.) Einstein, also member of the board, refuses to support Hilbert’s action and does not want to have anything to do with the whole affair; most other board members do not want to irritate Hilbert by opposing him. Brouwer vehemently protests. In the end, the whole board is dissolved and immediately reassembled without Brouwer, in a strongly reduced size (in particular, Einstein and Carathéodory decline). The conflict leaves Brouwer mentally broken and isolated, and puts an end to a very creative decade in his work. Now that the two main contestants are no longer able to carry it on, the “Grundlagenstreit” is over.

1928–1930 Conflict with Karl Menger over the priority for the first correct definition of the notion of dimension.

1929 August: theft of Brouwer’s briefcase on the tram in Brussels, and with it of his mathematical notebook. When neither the police nor a private detective hired for the purpose is able to find it again, he despairs of ever being able to reconstruct its contents. Brouwer later said that this loss was instrumental in the shift of his main interest from mathematics to philosophy.

1929 Begins preparations for the foundation of a new mathematical journal.

1934 Appearance of the first issue of Brouwer’s own international journal, entitled Compositio Mathematica.

1934 Lecture series in Geneva, on invitation of Ferdinand Gonseth. Plans for a course on intuitionistic mathematics in Göttingen come very far, but are, in the end, not realised.

1934–1935 Ludwig Bieberbach, a German member of the editorial board of Compositio Mathematica who in 1933 had joined the National Socialist movement by entering the SA, asks Brouwer to remove the Jewish members from that board. Brouwer refuses; Bieberbach resigns.

1935–1941 Member of the municipal council of Blaricum for the local Neutral Party (in 1939 he wins the elections by receiving 310 of the 1601 votes).

1940–1945 During the German Occupation of the Netherlands in World War II, Brouwer assists the resistance by letting them use storage space in the Mathematical Institute, of which he was the director. He offers hiding places to Jews and other persecuted persons in small houses on his premises (as testified by a neighbour’s daughter, herself involved in these operations, in van Dalen 2005, vol. 2, p. 772–773). In 1943, he advises the students to sign the declaration of loyalty demanded by the Germans; when some students refuse and go into hiding, Brouwer and Heyting visit them to continue their education. Part of Brouwer’s explanation, after the war, for the advice to sign is that signing would provide the students with the relative peace needed to build up and carry out resistance activities. He is met with skepticism (but is supported by Mannoury). Because of this and some similar perhaps unfortunate attempts at shrewdness during the occupation, after the liberation he is suspended for a few months. Deeply offended, Brouwer considers emigration to South Africa or the USA.

1941 and 1944 Fires in Brouwer’s house destroy significant parts of his archives and library.

1942 Publishes three short notes again on intuitionistic foundations, the first since 1933.

1945–1950 Conflict over Compositio Mathematica. The journal had not appeared during the war, and an effort is made to bring it back to life. Difficulties in assembling a new board of editors arise because of Brouwer’s damaged reputation. In the end, Brouwer’s name remains on the title page, but in effect he is removed from the board of the journal he had founded.

1947–1951 Annual lecture series in Cambridge, England. Brouwer plans to turn them into a book, but this does not happen. However, he completes five of the planned six chapters, and these are published poshumously (Brouwer, 1981).

1948 Resumes his foundational program with a paper that exploits the notion of the creating subject. Beginning of another creative period.

1949 Opposes a plan to have his collected papers published, on the ground that he has no time to write annotations that reflect his original as well as his present views on them, which he considers would be the scientifically responsible thing to do.

1951 Retires from the University of Amsterdam. Cooling off of his relationship with Arend Heyting, his successor at the post of director of the Mathematical Institute, as a result of disagreement over the exact role the retired Brouwer could still play there.

1952 Lectures in London and in Cape Town.

1953 Lectures in Helsinki, where he stays with Von Wright. Lecture tour through the USA (among others MIT, Princeton, University of Wisconsin-Madison, Berkeley, Chicago) and Canada (Canadian Mathematical Congress in Kingston, Ontario). In Princeton, he visits Gödel.

1955 Publishes his last new paper (based on his lecture at the Boole conference in Dublin the year before).

1959 Death of Mrs Brouwer, 89 years old. Brouwer declines an offer for a 1-year position at the University of British Columbia in Vancouver.

1962 Brouwer is offered a position in Montana.

1966 December 2: dies in Blaricum, The Netherlands, 85 years old, when he is hit by a car in front of his house. His library and archives are dispersed. Beginning in the 1970s, Walter van Stigt and Dirk van Dalen reconstitute the archives as much as possible; the Brouwer Papers are now kept at the Noord-Hollands Archief in Haarlem.

3. Brief Characterisation of Brouwer’s Intuitionism

Based on his philosophy of mind, on which Kant and Schopenhauer were the main influences, Brouwer characterised mathematics primarily as the free activity of exact thinking, an activity which is founded on the pure intuition of (inner) time. No independent realm of objects and no language play a fundamental role. He thus strived to avoid the Scylla of platonism (with its epistemological problems) and the Charybdis of formalism (with its poverty of content). As, on Brouwer’s view, there is no determinant of mathematical truth outside the activity of thinking, a proposition only becomes true when the subject has experienced its truth (by having carried out an appropriate mental construction); similarly, a proposition only becomes false when the subject has experienced its falsehood (by realizing that an appropriate mental construction is not possible). Hence Brouwer can claim that “there are no non-experienced truths” (Brouwer, 1975, p.488).

Brouwer was prepared to follow his philosophy of mind to its ultimate conclusions; whether the reconstructed mathematics was compatible or incompatible with classical mathematics was a secondary question, and never decisive. In thus granting philosophy priority over traditional mathematics, he showed himself a revisionist. And indeed, whereas intuitionistic arithmetic is a subsystem of classical arithmetic, in analysis the situation is different: not all of classical analysis is intuitionistically acceptable, but neither is all of intuitionistic analysis classically acceptable. Brouwer accepted this consequence wholeheartedly.

4. Brouwer’s Development of Intuitionism

The following is a brief history of Brouwer’s ideas in philosophy, mathematics, and logic. There is also a more detailed separate article on The Development of Intuitionistic Logic.

Brouwer’s little book Life, Art and Mysticism of 1905, while not developing his foundations of mathematics as such, is a key to those foundations as developed in his dissertation on which he was working at the same time and which was finished two years later. Among a variety of other things, such as his views on society and women in particular, the book contains his basic ideas on mind, language, ontology and epistemology.

These ideas are applied to mathematics in his dissertation On the Foundations of Mathematics, defended in 1907; it is the general philosophy and not the paradoxes that initiates the development of intuitionism (once this had begun, solutions to the paradoxes emerged). As did Kant, Brouwer founds mathematics on a pure intuition of time (but Brouwer rejects pure intuition of space).

Brouwer holds that mathematics is an essentially languageless activity, and that language can only give descriptions of mathematical activity after the fact. This leads him to deny axiomatic approaches any foundational role in mathematics. Also, he construes logic as the study of patterns in linguistic renditions of mathematical activity, and therefore logic is dependent on mathematics (as the study of patterns) and not vice versa. It is these considerations that motivate him to introduce the distinction between mathematics and metamathematics (for which he used the term “second order mathematics”), which he would explain to Hilbert in conversations in 1909 (Brouwer, 1928A2, p. 375n.2).

With this view in place, Brouwer sets out to reconstruct Cantorian set theory. When an attempt (in a draft of the dissertation) at making constructive sense out of Cantor’s second number class (the class of all denumerably infinite ordinals) and higher classes of even greater ordinals fails, he realises that this cannot be done and rejects the higher number classes, leaving only all finite ordinals and an unfinished or open-ended collection of denumerably infinite ordinals. Thus, as a consequence of his philosophical views, he consciously puts aside part of generally accepted mathematics. Soon he would do the same with a principle of logic, the principle of the excluded middle (PEM), but in the dissertation he still thinks of it as correct but useless, interpreting \(p \vee \neg p\) as \(\neg p \rightarrow \neg p\).

In “The Unreliability of the Logical Principles” of 1908, Brouwer formulates, in general terms, his criticism of PEM: although in the simple form of \(p \vee \neg p\), the principle will never lead to a contradiction, there are instances of it for which one has, constructively speaking, no positive grounds. Brouwer names some. Because they do not in the strict sense refute PEM, they are known as “weak counterexamples”. See the supplement on Weak Counterexamples.

The innovation that gives intuitionism a much wider range than other varieties of constructive mathematics (including the one in Brouwer’s dissertation) are the choice sequences. These are potentially infinite sequences of numbers (or other mathematical objects) chosen one after the other by the subject. Choice sequences made their first appearance as intuitionistically acceptable objects in a book review in 1914; the principle that makes them mathematically tractable, the continuity principle, was formulated in Brouwer’s lectures notes of 1916. The main use of choice sequences is the reconstruction of analysis; points on the continuum (real numbers) are identified with choice sequences satisfying certain conditions. Choice sequences are collected together using a device called “spread”, which performs a function similar to that of the Cantorian set in classical analysis, and initially, Brouwer even uses the word “Menge” (“set”) for it. Brouwer develops a theory of spreads, and a theory of point sets based on it, in the two-part paper “Founding Set Theory Independently of the Principle of the Excluded Middle” (1918/1919).

The answer to the question in the title of Brouwer’s paper “Does Every Real Number Have a Decimal Expansion?” (1921A) turns out to be no. Brouwer demonstrates that one can construct choice sequences satisfying the Cauchy condition that in their exact development depend on an as yet open problem. No decimal expansion can be constructed until the open problem is solved; on Brouwer’s strict constructivist view, this means that no decimal expansion exists until the open problem is solved. In this sense, one can construct real numbers (i.e., converging choice sequences) that do not yet have a decimal expansion.

In a lecture in 1923, again using choice sequences and open problems, Brouwer devises a general technique, now known as “Brouwerian counterexamples”, to generate weak counterexamples to classical principles: “On the Significance of the Principle of the Excluded Middle in Mathematics” (Brouwer 1924N).

The basic theorems of intuitionistic analysis — the bar theorem, fan theorem, and continuity theorem — are in “On the Domains of Definition of Functions” of 1927. The first two are structural theorems on spreads; the third (not to be confused with the continuity principle for choice sequences) states that every total function \([0,1] \rightarrow \mathbb{R}\) is continuous and even uniformly continuous. The fan theorem is, in fact, a corollary of the bar theorem; combined with the continuity principle, which is not classically valid, it yields the continuity theorem, which is not classically valid either. The bar and fan theorems on the other hand are classically valid, although the classical and intuitionistic proofs for them are not exchangeable. The classical proofs are intuitionistically not acceptable because of the way they depend on PEM; the intuitionistic proofs are classically not acceptable because they depend on reflection on the structure of mental proofs. In this reflection, Brouwer introduced the notion of the “fully analysed” or “canonical” form of a proof, which would be adopted much later by Martin-Löf and by Dummett. In a footnote, Brouwer mentions that such proofs, which he identifies with mental objects in the subject’s mind, are often infinite.

“Intuitionist Reflections on Formalism” of 1928 identifies and discusses four key differences between formalism and intuitionism, all having to do either with the role of PEM or with the relation between mathematics and language. Brouwer emphasises, as he had done in his dissertation, that formalism presupposes contentual mathematics at the metalevel. He also here presents his first strong counterexample, a refutation of PEM in the form \(\forall x\in \mathbb{R}(Px \vee \neg Px)\), by showing that it is false that every real number is either rational or irrational. See the supplement on Strong Counterexamples.

Of the two lectures held in Vienna in 1928 — “Mathematics, Science and Language” (1929A) and “The Structure of the Continuum” (1930A) — the first is for the most part of a philosophical nature while the second is more mathematical. In “Mathematics, Science and Language”, Brouwer states his general views on the relations between the three subjects mentioned in the title, following a genetic approach, and stressing the role of the will. A longer version of this lecture was published as “Will, Knowledge and Speech” (1933A2); it contains the first explicit remarks about a notion that had been present from the start, now known as that of the “ideal(ised) mathematician” or “creating subject”.

“Consciousness, Philosophy and Mathematics” (1949C) once again goes through Brouwer’s philosophy of mind and some of its consequences for mathematics. Comparison with Life, Art, and Mysticism, “Mathematics, Science and Language”, and “Volition, Knowledge, Language” reveals that Brouwer’s general philosophy over the years developed considerably, but mainly in depth.

In 1949, Brouwer (1949A) publishes the first of a new class of strong counterexamples, a class that differs from Brouwer’s earlier strong counterexample (1928, see above) in that the type of argument, which now goes by the name of “creating subject argument”, involves essential reference to the temporal structure of the creating subject’s mathematical activity (Heyting, 1956, chs. III and VIII; van Atten, 2003, chs.4 and 5; van Atten, 2018).

Brouwer’s example shows that there is a case where the double negation principle in the form of \(\forall x\in \mathbb{R}(\neg \neg Px \rightarrow Px)\), leads to a contradiction (“The Non-equivalence of the Constructive and the Negative Order Relation on the Continuum”, in Dutch). The first publication of a strong counterexample in English had to wait till 1954, in “An Example of Contradictority in Classical Theory of Functions” (1954F). This polemical title should be understood as follows: if one keeps to the letter of the classical theory but in its interpretation substitutes intuitionistic notions for their classical counterparts, one arrives at a contradiction. So it is not a counterexample in the strict sense of the word, but rather a non-interpretability result. As intuitionistic logic is, formally speaking, part of classical logic, and intuitionistic arithmetic is part of classical arithmetic, the existence of strong counterexamples must depend on an essentially non-classical ingredient, and this is of course the choice sequences.

The creating subject argument is, after the earlier introduction of choice sequences and the proof of the bar theorem, a new step in the exploitation of the subjective aspects of intuitionism. There is no principled reason why it should be the last.


A full bibliography of Brouwer’s writings can be found in

  • van Dalen, D., 1997, “A bibliography of L.E.J. Brouwer”, Utrecht Logic Group Preprint Series, no. 175 [Available online]. Updated version in van Atten, M., Boldini, P., Bourdeau, M., and Heinzmann, G. (eds.), 2008, One Hundred Years of Intuitionism (1907–2007). The Cerisy Conference, Basel: Birkhäuser, pp. 343–390.

The Brouwer Papers are kept at Noord-Hollands Archief in Haarlem, the Netherlands.

Availability of Brouwer’s writings

Facsimiles of almost all of Brouwer’s published papers can be found in

  • Brouwer, L.E.J., 1975, Collected Works 1. Philosophy and Foundations of Mathematics, A. Heyting (ed.), Amsterdam: North-Holland.
  • Brouwer, L.E.J., 1976, Collected Works 2. Geometry, Analysis, Topology and Mechanics, H. Freudenthal (ed.), Amsterdam: North-Holland.

Full scans and transcriptions of Brouwer’s student notebooks (in Dutch) are available online.

In the Collected Works, papers in Dutch have been translated into English (without naming the translator(s)), but papers in French or German have not. English translations of several of them can be found in

  • van Heijenoort, J., ed., 1967, From Frege to Gödel. A Sourcebook in Mathematical Logic, 1879–1931, Cambridge (MA): Harvard University Press.
  • Mancosu, P., ed., 1998, From Hilbert to Brouwer. The Debate on the Foundations of Mathematics in the 1920s, Oxford: Oxford University Press.

An English translation of Brouwer’s little book Leven, Kunst en Mystiek of 1905, of which the Collected Works contain only excerpts, is

  • Brouwer, L.E.J., 1996, “Life, Art and Mysticism”, Notre Dame Journal of Formal Logic, 37(3):389–429. Translated by Walter van Stigt, who provides an introduction on pp.381–387.

The Berlin lectures of 1927 have been published in

  • Brouwer, L.E.J., 1992, Intuitionismus, D. van Dalen (ed.), Mannheim: BI-Wissenschaftsverlag.

The Cambridge lectures of 1946–1951, which are recommended as Brouwer’s own introduction to intuitionism, have been published as

  • Brouwer, L.E.J., 1981, Brouwer’s Cambridge Lectures on Intuitionism, D. van Dalen (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

A selection of Brouwer’s correspondence has been published as

  • van Dalen, D., ed., 2011, The Selected Correspondence of L.E.J. Brouwer, London: Springer. An online supplement (link and password on the copyright page of the book) presents most of the extant correspondence, but without English translations.

Of particular biographical interest is the correspondence between Brouwer and his friend, the socialist poet C.S. Adama van Scheltema, which covers the years 1898–1924. The Selected Correspondence presents a number of these letters in English. The full correspondence has been published in Dutch, with notes, an introduction, and an appendix on Brouwer, as

  • Brouwer, L.E.J., & Adama van Scheltema, C.S., 1984, Droeve Snaar, Vriend van Mij. Brieven, D. van Dalen (ed.), Amsterdam: De Arbeiderspers.

Cited texts by Brouwer

Brouwer’s writings are referred to according to the scheme in the bibliography van Dalen, 1997.

  • 1905, Leven, Kunst en Mystiek. Partial English translation in Brouwer, 1975, pp. 1–9. Full English translation (by W. van Stigt) in Notre Dame Journal of Formal Logic, 37(3):389–429.
  • 1907, Over de Grondslagen der Wiskunde, Ph.D. thesis, Universiteit van Amsterdam. English translation in Brouwer, 1975, pp. 11–101.
  • 1908, “De onbetrouwbaarheid der logische principes”, Tijdschrift voor Wijsbegeerte, 2: 152–158. English translation in Brouwer, 1975, pp. 107–111.
  • 1914, “A. Schoenflies und H. Hahn. Die Entwickelung der Mengenlehre und ihrer Anwendungen, Leipzig und Berlin 1913”, Jahresb. D.M.V., 23: 78–83.
  • 1918B, “Begründung der Mengenlehre unabhängig vom logischen Satz vom ausgeschlossenen Dritten. Erster Teil, Allgemeine Mengenlehre”, KNAW Verhandelingen, 5: 1–43.
  • 1919A, “Begründung der Mengenlehre unabhängig vom logischen Satz vom ausgeschlossenen Dritten. Zweiter Teil, Theorie der Punktmengen”, KNAW Verhandelingen, 7: 1–33.
  • 1919D, “ Intuitionistische Mengenlehre ”, Jahresb. D.M.V., 28: 203–208. English translation in Mancosu 1998 pp. 23–27.
  • 1921A, “Besitzt jede reelle Zahl eine Dezimalbruchentwicklung?”, Mathematische Annalen, 83: 201–210. English translation in Mancosu 1998 pp. 28–35.
  • 1924N, “Über die Bedeutung des Satzes vom ausgeschlossenen Dritten in der Mathematik, insbesondere in der Funktionentheorie”, Journal für die reine und angewandte Mathematik, 154: 1–7. English translation in van Heijenoort 1967, pp. 335–341.
  • 1927B, “Über Definitionsbereiche von Funktionen”, Mathematische Annalen, 97: 60–75. English translation of sections 1–3 in van Heijenoort 1967, pp. 457–463.
  • 1928A2, “Intuitionistische Betrachtungen über den Formalismus”, KNAW Proceedings, 31: 374–379. English translation in Mancosu 1998, pp. 40–44.
  • 1929A, “Mathematik, Wissenschaft und Sprache”, Monatshefte für Mathematik und Physik, 36: 153–164. English translation in Mancosu 1998, pp.45–53.
  • 1930A, Die Struktur des Kontinuums, Wien: Komitee zur Veranstaltung von Gastvorträgen ausländischer Gelehrter der exakten Wissenschaften. English translation in Mancosu 1998, pp. 54–63.
  • 1933A2, “Willen, weten, spreken”, in De Uitdrukkingswijze der Wetenschap, L.E.J. Brouwer et al., Groningen: Noordhoff, 45–63. English translation in van Stigt 1990, pp. 418–431.
  • 1946B, “Toespraak van Prof.Dr. L.E.J. Brouwer en antwoord van Prof.Dr. G. Mannoury”, Jaarboek der Universiteit van Amsterdam 1946–1947, II. English translation of Brouwer’s part in Brouwer, 1975, pp. 472–476. English translation of Mannoury’s reply: Synthese, 5: 514–515.
  • 1948A, “Essentieel negatieve eigenschappen”, Indagationes Mathematicae, 10: 322–323. English translation in Brouwer, 1975, pp. 478–479.
  • 1949A, “De non-aequivalentie van de constructieve en de negatieve orderelatie in het continuum”, Indagationes Mathematicae, 11: 37–39. English translation in Brouwer, 1975, pp. 495–496.
  • 1949B, “Contradictoriteit der elementaire meetkunde”, KNAW Proc., 52: 315–316. English translation in Brouwer, 1975, pp. 497–498.
  • 1949C, “Consciousness, philosophy and mathematics”, Proceedings of the 10th International Congress of Philosophy, Amsterdam 1948, 3: 1235–1249.
  • 1954F, “An example of contradictority in classical theory of functions”, Indag. Math., 16: 204–205.
  • 1955, “The effect of intuitionism on classical algebra of logic”, Proceedings of the Royal Irish Academy, 57: 113–116.

Cited primary texts by others

  • Euwe, M., 1929, “Mengentheoretische Betrachtungen über das Schachspiel”, Ned. Akad. Wetensch. Proc., 32:633–644.
  • Hilbert, D., 1922, “Neubegründung der Mathematik. Erste Mitteilung”, Hamburger Math. Seminarabhandlungen, 1:157–177. English translation “The New Grounding of Mathematics: first report” in (Mancosu 1998).
  • Mannoury, G., 1909, Methodologisches und Philosophisches zur Elementar-Mathematik, Haarlem: Visser.
  • Welby, V., 1896, “Sense, Meaning and Interpretation”, Mind, N.S., 5(17):24–37; (18):186–202.
  • Weyl, H., 1921, “Über die neue Grundlagenkrise der Mathematik”, Mathematische Zeitschrift, 10:39–79. English translation “On the New Foundational Crisis of Mathematics” in (Mancosu 1998).

Secondary Literature

  • Dubucs, J.-P., 1988, “L.E.J. Brouwer : Topologie et constructivisme”, Revue d’histoire des sciences, 41(2): 133–155.
    • An analysis of the relation between Brouwer’s topological work and his constructivist foundations.
  • Dummett, M., 1977, Elements of Intuitionism, Oxford: Oxford University Press. 2nd, revised edition, 2000, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
    • An overview of intuitionism. Philosophically, it seems closer to Wittgenstein than to Brouwer.
  • Franchella, M., 2015, “Brouwer and Nietzsche: Views about Life, Views about Logic”, History and Philosophy of Logic, 36(4): 367–391.
    • A comparison of Nietschze’s and Brouwer’s critical views on the role of logic.
  • Hesseling, D.E., 2003, Gnomes in the Fog. The Reception of Brouwer’s Intuitionism in the 1920s, Basel: Birkhauser.
    • A detailed historical discussion of the reactions to Brouwer’s mature intuitionism during the foundational debate.
  • Heyting, A., 1956, Intuitionism. An introduction, Amsterdam: North-Holland. 2nd, revised edition, 1966. 3rd, revised edition, 1971.
    • Probably the most influential book on the subject ever written. In a style that is more down-to-earth and oecumenical than Brouwer’s, Heyting presents the intuitionistic versions of various basic subjects in everyday mathematics. Brouwer and Heyting have some philosophical disagreements that make a difference in their appreciation of some aspects of intuitionistic mathematics. No comments of Brouwer on this book are known.
  • Kirkels, M., 2019, Gerrit Mannoury (1867–1956). Een Relativistisch Denker, Rotterdam: Erasmus Universiteit.
    • A thorough biography of the remarkable man who was Brouwer’s teacher and then lifelong close friend; in Dutch.
  • Largeault, J., 1993, Intuition et Intuitionisme, Paris: Vrin.
    • An overview of intuitionism, staying close to Brouwer, and showing a good sense of the historical background of Brouwer’s notion of intuition.
  • Placek, T., 1999, Mathematical Intuitionism and Intersubjectivity, Dordrecht: Kluwer.
    • A comparison of the arguments for intuitionism advanced by, respectively, Brouwer, Heyting, and Dummett, in particular with respect to the possibility of intersubjective validity of intuitionistic mathematics.
  • Schmitz, H.W., 1990, De Hollandse Significa. Een Reconstructie van de Geschiedenis van 1892 tot 1926, Assen: van Gorcum.
    • A detailed monograph on the development of the Signific Movement in the Netherlands, in Dutch (translated from the author’s German Habilitationsschrift).
  • Schmitz, H.W., ed., 1990, Essays on Significs: Papers Presented on the Occasion of the 150th Anniversary of the Birth of Victoria Lady Welby, 1837–1912, Amsterdam: John Benjamins.
    • Historical and systematical essays on Lady Welby, the relations between significs and semiotics, and the Signific Movement in the Netherlands.
  • Troelstra, A., 1969, Principles of Intuitionism, Heidelberg: Springer.
    • The first exposition of intuitionism after those by Brouwer and Heyting. While strongly mathematically oriented, it shows a strong appreciation of philosophical aspects. Written as lectures notes for the conference on Intuitionism and Proof Theory, Buffalo, 1968, after the author spent the academic year 1966–1967 with Kreisel.
  • van Atten, M., 2004, On Brouwer, Belmont (CA): Wadsworth.
    • A philosophical introduction to intuitionism as conceived by Brouwer, with extensive treatments of the proof of the bar theorem, the creating subject, and intersubjectivity.
  • van Atten, M., 2018, “The Creating Subject, the Brouwer-Kripke Schema, and infinite proofs”, Indagationes Mathematicae, 29(6): 1565–1636.
    • A discussion of philosophical, mathematical, and historical aspects of Brouwer’s Creating Subject arguments. Issues 29(1) and 29(6) of Indagationes make up a voluminous virtual special issue in commemoration of the 50th anniversary of Brouwer’s death.
  • van Atten, M., Boldini, P., Bourdeau, M., and Heinzmann, G., eds., 2008, One Hundred Years of Intuitionism (1907–2007). The Cerisy Conference, Basel: Birkhäuser.
    • Part I consists of a number of historical and systematical papers on Brouwer and Brouwerian intuitionism. Part II contains, among others, two papers on Brouwer in relation to French recursors of intuitionism. Part III includes a paper on the Hilbert-Brouwer controversy from a historical-mathematical perspective.
  • van Atten, M. and Tragesser, R., “Mysticism and Mathematics: Brouwer, Gödel and the Common Core Thesis”, in Klarheit in Religionsdingen, Deppert, W. & Rahnfeld, M., eds., Leipzig: Leipziger Universitatsverlag, 145–160.
    • A comparison of Brouwer’s and Gödel’s interest in mysticism and of their views on its relation to mathematics.
  • van Dalen, D., 1999/2005, Mystic, Geometer, and Intuitionist, 2 volumes, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
    • The standard biography of Brouwer. Volume 1, The Dawning Revolution, covers the years 1881–1928, volume 2, Hope and Disillusion, covers 1929–1966.
  • van Dalen, D., 2001, L.E.J. Brouwer 1881–1966. Een Biografie. Het Heldere Licht van de Wiskunde, Amsterdam: Bert Bakker.
    • A popular biography in 1 volume, in Dutch.
  • van Dalen, D., 2013, L.E.J. Brouwer—Topologist, Intuitionist, Philosopher. How Mathematics Is Rooted in Life, London: Springer.
    • A somewhat revised version in 1 volume of the biography (van Dalen 1999/2005).
  • van Stigt, W., 1990, Brouwer’s Intuitionism, Amsterdam: North-Holland.
    • Contains interesting philosophical discussions and gives English translations of material from the Brouwer archive. The biographical sketch has now been superseded by (van Dalen, 1999/2005) and (van Dalen, 2001). Van Stigt also contributed to the introductions to the papers on intuitionism in Mancosu 1998 (see above).


I thank Dirk van Dalen and the editors for their comments on earlier versions.

Copyright © 2020 by
Mark van Atten <>

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