Supplement to Rudolf Carnap
B. Carnap versus Quine on the Analytic-Synthetic Distinction
In much of his writing, Carnap followed the philosophical tradition in speaking of (true) statements as being either analytic—true by convention or based on meaning alone—or synthetic, that is, not analytic. Of the “Two dogmas of empiricism” which Quine (1951) undertook to refute (in what must be one of most-cited papers in all philosophy during the past century), the first dogma concerned this analytic-synthetic distinction, and it is certainly the one that has stuck in people’s minds and in the collective memory of analytic philosophy:
for all its a priori reasonableness, a boundary between analytic and synthetic statement has not been drawn. That there is such a distinction to be drawn at all is an un-empirical dogma of empiricists. (Quine 1951: 34)
Even now, despite the growing consensus (see, e.g., Creath 1990, 2007) that Carnap and Quine were, to some extent, talking past each other, Quine’s critique is viewed as a turning point. The controversy over analyticity continues to generate a flood of commentary, and the literature is by now impossible to summarize completely. (For a discussion of Quine’s criticism of the second “reductionist” dogma of empiricism, see supplement on Aufbau (Section 4) and Reconstruction of Scientific Theories (Section 1).)
In order to assess Quine’s criticism of the analytic-synthetic distinction insofar as it applies to Carnap, it is useful to distinguish between:
- the analytic-synthetic distinction for existing natural or scientific languages,
- the analytic-synthetic distinction for arbitrary constructed (artificial) languages (Quine’s “‘analytic-for-L’ with variable ‘L’” (1951: 32)), and
- the analytic-synthetic distinction for specific constructed (artificial) languages (‘analytic-for-L’ with fixed ‘L’).
The difference is that in (A2) and (A3) the analytic-synthetic distinction may be determined in and by the construction of a framework, while in (A1) it ought to reflect a feature of an already existing language. In the special case in which a particular artificial language is put forward as a rational reconstruction of a particular fragment of a natural or scientific language, and where the analytic-synthetic distinction for the artificial language is also presented as rationally reconstructing the analytic-synthetic distinction for the given fragment, (A1) and (A3) are concerned simultaneously. As we will see, Quine’s criticism in “Two Dogmas” is about (A1) and (A2), while the thrust of Carnap’s own considerations on analyticity concerns specific artificial linguistic frameworks and hence (A3). We will now discuss (A1), (A2), and (A3) one by one.
With respect to (A1), Quine’s criticism does have bite, at least prima facie. As he argues in his “Two Dogmas”, many of the typical characterizations of analyticity for natural or scientific language in the relevant literature seem to presuppose concepts that are just as much in need of clarification as analyticity itself (e.g., synonymy or intension) or which are even explained in terms of analyticity itself and hence cannot deliver a non-circular definition of analyticity. He concludes that the whole distinction between analytic and synthetic statements is unclear. (Though Quine (1951: §2) accepts the relation of synonymy that is given by explicitly stated stipulative definitions within a concrete mathematical or scientific theory; see Ebbs 2017, Chapter 6 for a discussion.)
Of course, this criticism leaves open whether perhaps the whole network of “intensional notions” may be explained in one fell swoop. Indeed, quite a few modern philosophers who do use some of these notions in their work seem to think they are clear enough at least for their own purposes. Also, the analysis of analyticity as applied to natural languages has been refined in various ways since Quine: e.g., Boghossian (1996) distinguishes between epistemic and metaphysical analyticity—where a sentence is epistemically analytic just in case “the grasp of its meaning alone suffices for justified belief in its truth” (Boghossian 1996: 363)—and while he dismisses metaphysical analyticity, he regards epistemic analyticity as philosophically viable. (Carnap 1952a [1956b: 222], alluded to epistemic analyticity in that sense when he characterized analytic statements in natural language as those for which “it is sufficient to understand the statement in order to establish its truth”.) Gillian Russell (2008) presents a theory of a metaphysical notion of analyticity for natural language that does not seem to be affected by Quine’s or Boghossian’s worries: there are sentences, she argues, the meaning of which fully determines them to be true without making true what they say (much as \(x = 0\) fully determines the value of \(x \times y\), where x is analogous to the contribution of meaning and y to the contribution of the world to the truth value of a sentence). Moreover, intensional semantics, which originated with Carnap’s work (see the supplement on Semantics), and which offers a notion of synonymy (co-intensionality) and a semantics for intensional operators and contexts, has become highly influential not just in philosophy but also in linguistics and hence in scientific research (a fact that ought to be especially relevant to naturalists such as Quine). (But see, e.g., Pietroski 2018 for an account of natural language semantics that steers clear of extensional or intensional semantics.) Yet others drive a wedge between different intensional notions, agreeing to the general importance of some of them but denying the philosophical importance of others (e.g., T. Williamson 2007, who regards synonymy but not analyticity as philosophically important). In short: the status of (A1) is still a matter of ongoing philosophical dispute and research. In later work, Quine (1974) himself suggested an operationalization of analyticity along the lines of a sentence being analytic “if everybody learns that it is true by learning its words” (1974: 79), however he also argues that according to his criterion, e.g., mathematics would not count as analytic. Quine’s last monograph (Quine 1995) acknowledged the concept of analyticity if applied to “observation categoricals” in natural language (that is, simple compounds of observation sentences), though Quine continued to doubt “the significance of the analytic-synthetic distinction when applied to theoretical sentences across the board” (Quine 1995: 45), especially, the epistemological significance of the notion of analyticity.
Whatever its status, for our purposes it is much more relevant that (A1) is in fact not what Carnap himself was primarily interested in. His focus was on (A3) and, to much lesser extent, on (A2). It is true that Carnap does make the connection to the Kantian terminology of analytic versus synthetic judgments (see, e.g., §106 of the Aufbau), which of course did not concern formal languages; and he was equally impressed by Frege’s take on analyticity for ideal languages (see, e.g., LSS: §14) and by what seem to be conventional components of actual scientific theories (such as conventional aspects of geometry, as highlighted by Poincaré, or of Einstein’s relativity theory; see Part 1 of Friedman 1999 and Chapters 2 and 3 of Ben-Menahem 2006 for a summary and evaluation). But almost all of Carnap’s own work on analyticity pertains to analyticity in artificially constructed formal frameworks (compare the main entry (Section 1.2)). For Carnap, analyticity is not forced on us by anything, certainly not by “the facts”, let alone anything ineluctable about the nature of representation, along the lines of Wittgenstein’s Tractatus—it is a choice. Carnap’s attitude towards analyticity is much like that of mathematicians towards definitions: in one presentation of the calculus, functions on real numbers may be defined as continuous based on the so-called epsilon-delta condition, followed by a theorem which shows the equivalence of continuity in that sense with a condition specifying the preservation of limits of real number sequences. But in another presentation of analysis, the roles of the defining condition of continuity and its provably equivalent condition might be reversed, with continuity defined by the preservation of limits. In short: mathematical definitions are a matter of “theory construction”. Similarly, analyticity is a matter of framework construction for Carnap. For the same reason, when Quine and Putnam (see, e.g., Putnam 1975) hold that logical systems and definitions are revisable in the course of scientific development, Carnap would simply have agreed—merely adding that (once rationally reconstructed) such revisions should count as revisions of the underlying framework. Additionally, he also thought the choice between constructed languages with and without an analytic-synthetic distinction was normally a no-brainer, simply because the distinction was useful—so obviously useful, in fact, that he never really bothered to make an explicit case for it.
From the Logical Syntax, at the latest, Carnap distinguished very clearly and explicitly between theoretical questions regarding “given” languages and practical questions regarding “constructed” languages (see, e.g., “Testability and Meaning” [TM2: 3], “Meaning Postulates” [1952a: 66], and “Empiricism, Semantics and Ontology” [1950a]). In the only article in which he considers analyticity for non-constructed languages in more detail at all (“Meaning and Synonymy in Natural Languages” [1955b]), he contrasts analyticity for natural languages, which he calls a “pragmatic concept”, with analyticity for formal languages, which he regards as belonging to pure semantics and which, he says, constitutes the target of his logical work:
Nobody doubts that the pragmatical investigation of natural languages is of greatest importance for an understanding both of the behavior of individuals and of the character and development of whole cultures. On the other hand, I believe with the majority of logicians today that for the special purpose of the development of logic the construction and semantical investigation of language systems is more important. (Carnap 1955b: 34)
In the same article, Carnap acknowledges that what he calls the pragmatic notion of analyticity for natural language may serve as an explicandum which, if things go well, may be explicated through the semantic concept of analyticity for a formal language. (Similarly, in §2 of Meaning and Necessity , he presents L-truth, that is, the notion of logical truth which he defines explicitly—see the supplement on Semantics—as explicating the notion of analytic truth in the philosophical tradition.) Carnap takes Quine’s criticism in “Two Dogmas” as concerning just the pragmatic concept, that is, the explicandum of any such explication:
Quine’s criticism does not concern the formal correctness of the definitions in pure semantics; rather, he doubts whether there are any clear and fruitful corresponding pragmatical concepts which could serve as explicanda. That is the reason why he demands that these pragmatical concepts be shown to be scientifically legitimate by stating empirical, behavioristic criteria for them. If I understand him correctly, he believes that, without this pragmatical substructure, the semantical intension concepts, even if formally correct, are arbitrary and without purpose. I do not think that a semantical concept, in order to be fruitful, must necessarily possess a prior pragmatical counterpart. It is theoretically possible to demonstrate its fruitfulness through its application in the further development of language systems. But this is a slow process. If for a given semantical concept there is already a familiar, though somewhat vague, corresponding pragmatical concept and if we are able to clarify the latter by describing an operational procedure for its application, then this may indeed be a simpler way for refuting the objections and furnish a practical justification at once for both concepts. (Carnap 1955b: 35)
Carnap makes two points in this passage: first, the semantic concept of analyticity may well be fruitful for the development of artificial linguistic frameworks without being an explicatum of any prior explicandum (pragmatic concept of analyticity); we address this below when we consider (A2) and (A3). Secondly, if a pragmatic concept of analyticity (a natural-language explicandum) can be identified or operationalized in empirical terms, this will add to the overall fruitfulness of both concepts. In “Meaning and Synonymy in Natural Languages” (1955b), Carnap suggests such an operationalization of analyticity for natural languages which he thinks may be carried out by ascribing intensions to natural language sentences based on empirical hypotheses about linguistic behavior. These hypotheses could be tested empirically, e.g., by eliciting judgments of competent speakers regarding hypothetical (“possible”) situations as indicated by their responses to certain descriptions, stories, or pictures. Once intensions have been assigned by this procedure, two linguistic expressions can be defined as synonymous in language L for speaker X at time t just in case they have the same intension in L for X at t. Finally, a declarative sentence may be defined as analytic in L for X at t if and only if its intension in L for X at t includes all possible cases. (Carnap even wonders how the intension of a predicate might be determined for a robot, e.g., by studying the internal functional architecture of the robot.) For these reasons, Carnap does not regard the notion of analyticity for natural languages to be hopeless at all, even though it does not constitute the focus of his own research. (Recently, Chalmers 2012 proposed a refinement of Carnap’s method of determining intensions for sentences in natural language.)
We now turn to analyticity and syntheticity for constructed languages, that is, to (A2) and (A3) above. As already explained, Carnap used an analytic-synthetic distinction almost exclusively in the context of formal languages that he had constructed himself. In his “Truth by Convention” (1936), Quine had argued that one needs at least an implicit understanding of rules and rule application to be able to determine and apply the explicit rule systems of artificial languages and logics—which Carnap would not have denied. (For more on Carnap and Quine on truth by convention, see Creath 1987 and Ebbs 2017, Chapter 3. From different angles, both argue convincingly that (i) Carnap was not a conventionalist about logic in the metaphysical sense that accepting logical or semantic rules would somehow make certain statements true, and (ii) Quine’s “Truth by Convention” did not aim to discredit a truth-by-convention thesis to which Carnap himself was committed.) Carnap simply regarded the analytic-synthetic distinction as a conceptual tool whose purpose was to facilitate the investigation and application of constructed languages. In order for this tool to be useful, the concept of analyticity would not even have to explicate the prior explicandum of analyticity as applied to natural language (though this might add to its utility). From this point of view, it is hard to see what “problem of explicating analyticity” (Quine 1951: 34) might remain that could be relevant to (A2) and (A3). At worst, it seems, someone might put forward a formally incorrect definition of analyticity for some artificial language; or, while formally correct, a definition that would not turn out to be particularly useful for its intended purposes. Do such worries apply to Carnap’s conception of analyticity for constructed languages?
Here the difference between (A2) and (A3) becomes salient: (A2) requires a definition of “analytic-for-L” for variable L, that is, a definition that applies to a whole class of linguistic frameworks simultaneously. Although Carnap indicates in part IV of his Logical Syntax (on general syntax) that such a general definition of analyticity might eventually be possible (see the supplement on Logical Syntax of Language)—a promise reiterated in the Introduction to Semantics (Carnap 1942: 59–60)—by 1950 he came to realize that these suggestions had been rash. Carnap did not actually manage to supply any such general definition of analyticity for all, or even of a subclass of, formal languages, which confirms Quine’s worries about (A2) in his “Two Dogmas”. As Quine there maintains, Carnap did not “explain the idiom ‘S is analytic for L’ with variable ‘S’ and ‘L’, even though”, as Quine acknowledges, “we be content to limit the range of ‘L’ to the realm of artificial languages” (1951: 32).
On the other hand, it is not clear at all why failing to give a general definition of analyticity—as required by (A2) above—would impair any of the work that analyticity actually did for Carnap, which was essentially confined to (A3). Consider this analogy (due to David 1996): while Tarski (1933 ) also did not give us a definition of ‘true-in-L’ for variable ‘L’, he did construct a canonical example of such a definition for a non-trivial formalized language, and the truth-theoretic methods he developed still turned out to be extremely useful for the study and application of ‘true-in-L’ for a great variety of concrete languages L. Why should the standards for analyticity and analyticity-theoretic methods be higher?
Indeed, (A3) seems unaffected by any of Quine’s worries: Carnap did deliver precise and formally correct definitions of analyticity for pretty much every single linguistic framework he constructed in his work.
In the Aufbau, for instance, Carnap defines as analytic those formulas in the language of his phenomenalist constitution system that can be derived logically from the explicitly stated set of definitions in the system. (For example, the symmetry of Carnap’s binary similarity relation Ae is analytic in that sense, since it follows logically from the definition of ‘Ae’: see §114 in the Aufbau, and see supplements on Methodology (Section 3) and Aufbau (Section 2) for the background.)
How the analyticity of sentences in Languages I and II is defined in the Logical Syntax is explained in detail in the supplement on Logical Syntax of Language. A sentence is defined as synthetic if and only if it is neither analytic nor contradictory. For instance, based on these definitions, the principle of complete induction turns out to be analytic in Language II (LSS: §34h). (As Mac Lane [1938: 172] points out in his review of the Logical Syntax, this relies on assuming complete induction in the metalinguistic syntax theory—just as modern logic textbooks prove all formalized object language instances of the law of excluded middle to be logically true by assuming metalinguistic instances of the law of excluded middle in their mathematical background theory. In neither case is this circular in any vicious sense.) Carnap shows that every purely logical sentence is either analytic or contradictory; he defines the content (sense) of a sentence to be the set of synthetic sentences that are its consequences, and he proves the indefinability of analyticity-in-Language-I/II in Language I/II, respectively (LSS: §60c), on Gödelian grounds. In §25 he points out that, e.g., a syntactic sentence such as “an occurrence of zero is not an occurrence of an existential quantifier” is synthetic in “axiomatic syntax” (before arithmetization), while it is analytic after arithmetization (in “arithmetical syntax”). Once again, analyticity is language-relative. While the analyticity of a sentence only guarantees its consistency given the consistency of the underlying framework (as emphasized by Gödel, see the supplement on Tolerance, Metaphysics, and Meta-Ontology (Section 1)), this is unproblematic for Carnap’s purposes: for him, the “justification” of determining certain statements to be analytic in a linguistic framework is just as pragmatic as the “justification” of the construction of the framework to which they belong.
In later works, e.g., in Meaning and Necessity and Logical Foundations of Probability, Carnap defines analyticity-in-L as simply coinciding with logical truth. In Testability and Meaning, every sentence A is assigned a so-called representative sentence (expressing the factual content of A), such that A is defined as analytic just in case the derivability of its representative sentence in the framework is invariant under substitutions of descriptive terms. In Chapter 27 of Philosophical Foundations of Physics (Carnap 1966), analyticity for artificial observational languages is reconstructed as follows: a sentence is analytic in the observation language just in case it(s truth) is logically entailed by the semantic designation rules or by the meaning postulates (“A-postulates”, analyticity postulates) that are stated explicitly as axioms in a framework (such as, e.g., a formalization of “All birds are animals”) and which are supposed to constrain the interpretation of terms without telling us anything “about the actual world” (Carnap 1966: 263). (The method of defining analyticity from explicitly stated meaning postulates had been introduced in Carnap 1952a in a semantic framework similar to that of Meaning and Necessity. Richard Montague and Barbara Partee used variants of Carnapian meaning postulates later in intensional semantics for natural language; see Partee 1975.) Last but not least, in Chapter 28 of Philosophical Foundations of Physics, Carnap (1966) describes a uniform method by which the analytic part of a scientific theory can be reconstructed as a single higher-order meaning postulate (the Carnap sentence of the theory); we explain in detail how this works in the supplement on Reconstruction of Scientific Theories (Section 4). In that context, analytic sentences are the sentences logically implied by that analytic part of the theory (together perhaps with meaning postulates for observation terms).
The upshot is that the exact details of how analyticity is defined in any particular Carnapian framework very much depends on the purposes of the framework in question. What all these definitions have in common, however, is that analyticity is not just defined in clear and precise terms, and that the resulting concept is applied successfully in the exposition and application of their underlying frameworks, but also, given Carnap’s own aims (though not Quine’s!), the concept always seems to have more or less the same functional role to play—to keep track of those statements in a linguistic framework that “come with” the framework, that express the framework’s own resources, that are presupposed in the framework, and which do not have any empirical content on their own. That is why Friedman (2001) suggests that the Carnapian conception of analyticity in a framework may serve to explicate what Friedman (1999) (based on Reichenbach 1920) calls relative or constitutive aprioricity: the relational property of sentences being presupposed by, and enabling, the formulation, truth-conditionality and empirical justification of scientific hypotheses belonging to a joint scientific paradigm. For instance, in an example from physics, Friedman (2001) argues that the calculus of real numbers and Newton’s Laws of Motion is a priori relative to Newton’s law of gravitation since the law of gravitation could neither be formulated nor tested without presupposing the necessary mathematical resources or the laws of motion. Once equipped with a suitable logic, semantics, a confirmation function (or a class of such functions), and a set of analytic statements, a Carnapian linguistic framework may serve as a rational reconstruction of a Kuhnian paradigm or disciplinary matrix, such as the Newtonian paradigm in physics: the stable backdrop against which empirical hypotheses in the framework (such as, e.g., Newton’s gravitational law) can be expressed and tested. While these empirical hypotheses are reconstructed as synthetic statements in a framework, the analytic statements in a framework reconstruct those scientific statements that are presupposed by all empirical applications of the scientific paradigm whatsoever but which do not have empirical consequences on their own: such analytic statements include logical laws, purely mathematical laws, stipulative definitions, or the “holistically” determined analytic parts of scientific theories in Carnap (1966) which Carnap shows do not logically imply any statements in the observational sublanguage except for logically true ones (see supplement on Reconstruction of Scientific Theories (Section 4)).
Finally, normal science in Kuhn’s (1962) sense may be reconstructed as proceeding by the revision of the empirical hypotheses within a linguistic framework, while paradigm shifts at revolutionary stages of science can be reconstructed as transitions from one linguistic framework to another, such as from the Newtonian framework to a relativistic one. See Friedman (2001) for details. (There is in fact a slight mismatch between Friedman’s proposal to view the Newtonian laws of motion as constitutive of the Newtonian paradigm and his proposal to think of analytic statements in a suitable Carnapian framework as reconstructing such constitutive laws: for the conjunction of the Newtonian laws of motion, unlike analytic statements in Carnap’s sense, can be shown to have weak empirical consequences [Stein 1998]. This mismatch can be repaired, however, by replacing the Newtonian laws of motion in Friedman’s argument by the definitional clauses of what is called a “classical particle mechanics” by Sneed , which do not have any empirical consequences; see Sneed 1971: 118.) There are even places where Carnap appears to acknowledge incommensurability of exactly the kind Kuhn discusses; see, e.g., Carnap’s “Truth and Confirmation” (1936 [1949: 126]):
In translating one language into another the factual content of an empirical statement cannot always be preserved unchanged. Such changes are inevitable if the structures of the two languages differ in essential points. For example: while many statements of modern physics are completely translatable into statements of classical physics, this is not so or only incompletely so with other statements.
Differences between the sets of analytic statements of two frameworks can make such conceptual differences between frameworks visible.
It follows that if Kuhn’s paradigm-vs.-theory distinction in science make sense at all, and if Friedman is right about Carnapian frameworks being successful rational reconstructions of Kuhnian paradigms, then, at least concerning these uses of frameworks, the distinction between the analytic statements that are stipulated as part of a framework and the synthetic empirical hypotheses that presuppose a framework is not arbitrary and explicates an existing and useful distinction in the methodology of science. This would address Quine’s concern in “Carnap and Logical Truth” in which he worried that
Legislative acts occur again and again; on the other hand a dichotomy of the resulting truths themselves into analytic and synthetic, truth by meaning postulate and truths by force of nature, has been given no tolerably clear meaning even as a methodological ideal. (Quine 1960b: Section 10)
Summing up: Quine’s criticism of the analytic-synthetic distinction in his “Two Dogmas” casts some doubt on the analytic-synthetic distinction for existing natural languages and (to some extent) existing scientific languages as well as on Carnap’s occasional early speculations about generalizing the analytic-synthetic distinction across arbitrary artificial languages. However, Quine’s critique does not undermine Carnap’s definitions and usage of analyticity so far as the particular constructed linguistic frameworks are concerned that Carnap constructed and put to use in his own work, especially in his rational reconstruction of scientific theories—which was his main interest (see supplement on Reconstruction of Scientific Theories).
A remaining option for naturalists in the Quinean spirit would be to criticize Carnap’s philosophy by questioning the value of constructing artificial linguistic frameworks for the rational reconstruction of science and for the further development of science. (That is, e.g., Mark Wilson’s  criticism of Carnap, and also Penelope Maddy’s in her Second Philosophy [2007: Ch. 5].) Whether this kind of criticism is justified remains an open question, as Carnap himself pointed out in the discussion after a colloquium Quine gave at Chicago in 1951. Howard Stein, who was present, reports (1992: 279) that Carnap said approximately this:
Quine and I really differ, not concerning any matter of fact, nor any question with cognitive content, but rather in our respective estimates of the most fruitful course for science to follow. Quine is impressed by the continuity between scientific thought and that of daily life—between scientific language and the language of ordinary discourse—and sees no philosophical gain, no gain either in clarity or fruitfulness, in the construction of distinct formalized languages for science. I concede the continuity, but, on the contrary, believe that very important gains in clarity and fruitfulness are to be had from the introduction of such formally constructed languages. This is a difference of opinion which, despite the fact that it does not concern (in my own terms) a matter with cognitive content, is nonetheless in principle susceptible to a kind of rational resolution. In my view, both programs—mine of formalized languages, Quine’s of a more free-flowing and casual use of language—ought to be pursued; and I think that if Quine and I could live, say, for two hundred years, it would be possible by the end of that time for us to agree on which of the two programs had proved more successful. (Stein 1992: 279)
(For surveys and discussion of Quine’s attacks against Carnap’s views on logic and analyticity, see Bird 1995; George 2000; Isaacson 1992, 2004; Creath 1991, 2003, 2007; and Chapters 2 and 3 of Hylton 2007. For a general survey on the analytic-synthetic distinction, see entry on analytic/synthetic distinction.)