Dante Alighieri

First published Mon Jan 29, 2001; substantive revision Mon Aug 15, 2022

Dante’s engagement with philosophy cannot be studied apart from his vocation as a poet, in which capacity he sought to raise the level of public discourse by educating his countrymen and inspiring them to pursue happiness in the contemplative life. He was one of the most learned Italian laymen of his day, intimately familiar with Aristotelian logic and natural philosophy, theology, and classical literature. He is, of course, most famous for having written the Divine Comedy, but in his poetry as well as his philosophical treatises and other writings, he freely mingles and synthesizes philosophical and theological language as well extensive references and allusions to scripture and classical and contemporary poetry. While his contributions to world literature and other artistic genres are universally acknowledged, his theological imagination has also remained influential from his own time to the present day. His philosophical legacy, by comparison, remains more difficult to assess, though his writings provide, at the very least, a powerful tool for the study of the landscape of late medieval and Renaissance philosophy.

1. Life

Because Dante’s poetic persona looms so large in his writings, very little can be said about his biography that does not, in some way, depend upon an interpretations of his continual re-crafting of that persona. It is generally accepted that Dante was born in 1265 in Florence. If it is true that he was born under the sign of Gemini—as reported in Paradiso 22.112–120—then his birthday would have been sometime in May or June of that year. According to the testimony of his own writings, at the age of nine he met for the first time the eight-year-old Beatrice Portinari, whom, subsequent to her death in 1290, Dante consistently invoked as the key inspiration for his poetic vision and personal salvation.

Also according to the testimony of his own writing, Dante believed himself to be—or at least wished for his readers to believe him to be—a descendant of the ancient Roman families who founded Florence. In Paradiso 15, for instance, he claims that his great-great-grandfather Cacciaguida had been knighted by emperor Conrad and died fighting as a crusader in the Holy Land—a claim that a recent biographer has noted “might be traced back to Dante’s desire, particularly apparent at the time of the Commedia, to give dignity to a family which, in reality, could boast no noble roots nor any knights among it, least of all of imperial investiture” [Santagata (2016), 20].

While it remains difficult to separate myth from fact in reconstructing Dante’s biography, it is nevertheless undoubtedly true that Dante’s philosophical perspective and poetic ambitions were powerfully shaped by the context of his upbringing in late thirteenth-century Florence. Between 1285, when he married and began a family, and 1302, when he was exiled from Florence, he was active in the cultural and civic life of Florence, served as a soldier, and held several political offices. Within this context, despite his own origins in a family possessing only modest wealth, Dante’s participation in Florentine politics played a crucial role in the development of his philosophical thinking as well as in advancing his poetic ambitions.

Since the early thirteenth century, two great factions, the Guelfs and the Ghibellines, had competed for control of Florence. The Guelfs, with whom Dante was allied, were identified with Florentine political autonomy, and with the interests of the Papacy in its long struggle against the centralizing ambitions of the Hohenstaufen emperors, who were supported by the Ghibellines. After Charles of Anjou, with the blessing of the Papacy and strong Guelf support, defeated Hohenstaufen armies at Benevento (1265/6) and Tagliacozzo (1268), the Guelfs became the dominant force in Florence. By the end of the century, the Guelfs were themselves riven by faction, grounded largely in family and economic interests, but also exhibiting differing degrees of loyalty to the papacy.

In 1301, when conflict erupted between the “Blacks,” the faction most strongly committed to aristocratic and papal interests, and the wealthier but less illustrious “Whites,” Pope Boniface VIII instigated a partisan settlement which allowed the Blacks to exile the White leadership, of whom Dante was a member. He never returned to Florence, and played no further role in public life, though he remained passionately interested in Italian politics, and became virtually the prophet of world empire in the years leading up to the coronation of Henry VII of Luxembourg as head of the Holy Roman Empire (1312). The development of Dante’s almost messianic sense of the imperial role is hard to trace, but it was doubtless affected by his bitterness over what he saw as the autocratic and treacherous conduct of Pope Boniface, and a growing conviction that only a strong, central authority could bring peace, stability, and order to Italy.

During the next twenty years Dante lived in several Italian cities, spending at least two long periods at the court of Can Grande della Scala, lord of Verona. In 1319 he moved from Verona to Ravenna, where he completed the Paradiso, and where he died in 1321.

As a poet, Dante’s major theme, from first to last, is the significance of his love for Beatrice, but he also clearly understood himself to be a public intellectual strongly committed to raising the level of vernacular discourse. After his banishment he addressed himself to Italians generally, and devoted much of his long exile to transmitting the riches of ancient thought and learning, as these informed contemporary scholastic culture, to an increasingly sophisticated lay readership in their own vernacular.

This project was Dante’s contribution to a long-standing Italian cultural tradition. His reading in philosophy began, he tells us, with Cicero and Boethius, whose writings are in large part the record of their dedication to the task of establishing a Latinate intellectual culture in Italy. The Convivio and the De vulgari eloquentia preserve also the somewhat idealized memory of the Neapolitan court of Frederick II of Sicily (1195–1250) and his son Manfred (1232–66), intellectuals in their own right as well as patrons of poets and philosophers, whom Dante viewed as having revived the ancient tradition of the statesman-philosopher [Van Cleve, 299–332]. Dante himself probably studied under Brunetto Latini (1220–94), whose encyclopedic Livres dou Tresor (1262–66), written while Brunetto was a political exile in France, provided vernacular readers with a compendium of the Liberal Arts and a digest of Aristotelian ethical and political thought [Meier; Imbach (1993), 37–47; Davis (1984), 166–97].

But the fullest embodiment of Dante’s contribution to the tradition of Italian vernacular writing is, above all, his Divine Comedy—a work in which we see for the first time a powerful thinker, solidly grounded in Aristotle, patristic theology, and thirteenth-century scholastic debate, synthesizing and bringing these resources to bear on educating his countrymen in their own vernacular with the intention of inspiring them to pursue the happiness that rewards the philosopher.

2. Early Poetry

Though he evidently did not begin serious study of philosophy until his mid-twenties, Dante had already been intellectually challenged by the work of a remarkable group of poets, practitioners of what he would later recall as the dolce stil novo, in whose hands a lyric poetry modelled on the canso of the Provençal troubadours became a vehicle for serious enquiry into the nature of love and human psychology. A generation earlier, Guido Guinizzelli (1230–76) had puzzled contemporaries with poems treating love in terms of the technicalities of medicine and the cosmology of the schools, while celebrating in quasi-mystical language his lady’s power to elevate the spirit of her poet-lover (Al cor gentil rempaira sempre amore, 41–44, 47–50):

Splende ’n la intelligenzïa del cielo
Deo Criator più che ’n nostr’ occhi ’l sole;
ella intende suo fattor oltra ’l cielo,
e ’l ciel volgiando, a Lui obedir tole;

così dar dovria, al vero,
la bella donna, poi che ’n gli occhi splende
del suo gentil, talento
che mai di lei obedir non si disprende.

[God the creator shines in the intelligence of heaven
more than the sun in our eyes,
and she understands her maker beyond the heaven
and, as she turns the heaven, obeys Him

So truly should the beautiful lady,
when she shines on the eyes
of her noble lover, impart the desire
that he will never fail in his obedience to her.]

The bella donna, exerting on her lover a power derived from the participation of her understanding in the divine, plays the role of the celestial intelligenzïa, who transmits the influence of the First Mover to the universe at large. The poet is thus caught up in a circular process through which his understanding, like theirs, is drawn toward the divine as manifested in the lady’s divinely inspired radiance. For Guinizelli this exploitation of the idea of celestial hierarchy is perhaps only a daring poetic conceit. For Dante it will become a means to the articulation of his deepest intuitions.

Among Dante’s contemporaries, however, the single strongest influence on his early poetry was Guido Cavalcanti, renowned not only as a poet, but also for his knowledge of natural philosophy. His great canzone, “Donna mi prega,” which became the subject of learned Latin commentaries, deals with ideas commonly associated with the “radical Aristotelianism” or “Averroism” of his day. The purpose of this astonishing poem is to describe in precise philosophical terms (“naturale dimostramento”) the experience of love.

For Guido there is an absolute cleavage between the sensory and intellectual aspects of the response to a loved object. Once the phantasma of the object becomes an abstracted form in the possible intellect, it is wholly insulated from the diletto of the anima sensitiva (21–28). This has seemed to modern commentators to imply an Averroist view of the intellect as a separate, universal entity [Corti (1983), 3–37], and the lines which follow (30–56), where the vertú of the sensitive soul displaces reason and “assumes its function,” presenting to the will an object whose desirability threatens a fatal disorientation, sustain this impression. Love is still the aristocratic vocation of the troubadours, and Guido acknowledges that noble spirits are aroused by it to prove their merit. But they work in darkness, for the force that moves them obscures the light of intellectual contemplation (57–68). The canzone is so exclusively an exercise in “natural philosophy,” so centered on biological necessity, that consciousness itself is wholly excluded from consideration. The ethical dimension of love consists in the challenge its blind urgency presents to reason. “Nobility” is a matter of self-control, and the precarious happiness that such love affords has no ideal dimension.

Guido’s influence on Dante was profound. But the Vita nuova, an anthology of Dante’s early poetry interspersed with a narrative combining commentary on his poetic development with the history of his devotion to Beatrice during her earthly life, reveals a growing realization that his own conception of poetry and love differ fundamentally from Guido’s [Ardizzone (2011); Barolini (1998), esp. pp. 60–63]. Like Guido, Dante accepted love as being, for better or worse, fundamental to the noble life, and his early lyrics express a sense like Guido’s of the internally divisive power of desire. But as the Vita nuova unfolds there is a gradual shift of focus: having failed to win his lady’s favor by dramatizing his own sufferings, Dante resolves to devote his poetry henceforth wholly to praise of her [VN, 18.9]. The result of this new resolve is a canzone, “Donne ch’avete intelletto d’amore” (“Ladies who have intelligence of love”), which returns to the source of his inspiration and Guido’s in the poetry of Guinizelli, but makes a wholly new departure. For Guido, the “heavenly” allure of the lady is a deception perpetrated by the senses, all the more dangerous as the lover’s gentilezza responds more fully to the attraction of her beauty and subjects itself to the “fierce accident” of passion. Dante, too, sees that the experience his early, tormented lyrics depict is “an accident occurring in a substance” [VN 25.1–2], but the “fiery spirits of love” which strike the eyes of those on whom his lady bestows her greeting are not just goads to desire (Donne ch’avete intelletto d’amore, VN 19.10.37–40):

E quando trova alcun che degno sia
di veder lei. quei prova sua vertute,
ché li avvien, ciò che li dona, in salute,
e sì l’umilia ch’ogni offesa oblia.
Ancor l’ha Dio per maggior grazia dato
che non pò mal finir chi l’ha parlato.

[And when she finds someone worthy
to behold her, he experiences her power,
for what she gives him turns into salvation,
and so humbles him that he forgets every offense.
God has given her an even greater grace:
that one cannot end in evil who has spoken to her.]

Pursuit of the lady’s favor has become a test, not just of nobility, but of virtue. Her beauty is perfect, the fullest possible example of nature’s power to reveal God’s creative love. The climax of the Vita nuova occurs when Dante encounters Guido’s lady, Giovanna, followed by his own Beatrice—“one marvel,” as he says, “following the other” [VN 24.8]. At once he realizes that Giovanna’s beauty, like the prophecy of the biblical Giovanni, is a precursor, heralding the “true light” of Beatrice, just as Guido’s poetry of earthly love is finally a foil to his own celebration of the transcendent love revealed to him in Beatrice.

3. Philosophical Influences

The philosophical content of the Vita nuova is minimal, a skeletal version of contemporary faculty psychology and a few brief references to metaphysics. But while finding his orientation as a poet, Dante was also engaged in the study of philosophy and, according to his own testimony in the Convivio, “started going to where she [philosophy] was truly revealed, in the schools of the religious orders and at the disputations of the philosophers” [Conv. 2.12.7]. Dante does not provide any additional details that reveal specifically where he studied philosophy, but in Florence in the early 1290s, there were three schools of religious orders at which he may have studied: that of the Dominicans at Santa Maria Novella; that of the Franciscans at Santa Croce; and that of the Augustinians at Santo Spirito. Unfortunately, there are no reliable historical records concerning the course of study that may have been available to Dante at Santo Spirito. However, there is reliable information about the resources that would have been available to a lay student at Santa Maria Novella and Santa Croce.

Although the Dominicans at Santa Maria Novella did not allow laymen to pursue studies of philosophy specifically, Dante would have been permitted to attend theology classes, and in these there would almost certainly have been at least indirect exposure to Aristotelian philosophy [Santagata (2016), 83]. Most intriguingly, Dante may have had the opportunity to attend lectures of Remigio dei Girolami (d. 1319), who had studied theology at the University of Paris during the tenure of Thomas Aquinas there [Panella; Davis (1984), 198–223]. Remigio, like Dante, was a White Guelf, and, also like Dante, Remigio read widely in classical literature and was fond of drawing lessons in political and ethical conduct from his reading. For both Remigio and Dante, moreover, Thomas was primarily the author of the Summa contra Gentiles and the commentary on the Ethics, concerned, like Aristotle himself, to demonstrate the capacities of human reason as a means to truth.

The most prestigious studia in Florence in the 1290s, however, was surely Santa Croce, which, as a Studium generale, ranked only behind the three Studia principalia of Paris, Oxford, and Cambridge in terms of importance [Santagata (2016), 83]. As Santagata notes in his recent biography of Dante,

Two great intellectuals who were readers at Santa Croce between 1287 and 1289—Pietro di Giovanni Olivi from Provence, and the younger Ubertino da Casale—played a major role in the history of the Franciscan movement and, more generally, in the Church. Dante could not have attended their lectures since both had left Florence before 1290, but it is always possible that he had heard some of Ubertino’s sermons. Dante never mentions Olivi, but in many respects his vision of the history of the Church seems to coincide with that of the Provencal theologian in its Franciscan and spiritual interpretation. As for Ubertino, a leading champion of the Franciscan “spiritual” movement, namely of those who advocated a return to the rigor of Francis’s rule against the permissive interpretation of the so-called “conventuals” led by the minister general, Matteo d’Acquasparta, Dante would have Bonaventura da Bagnoregio say in Paradiso [12.124–126] that they both betrayed the rule: Matteo because he “is too loose” through permissiveness, Ubertino because he “is too narrow” through excessive rigor. [Santagata (2016), 84]

Beyond these possibilities in Florence, Dante’s testimony in Convivio 2.12.7 that he had attended the “disputations of the philosophers” may hint at some degree of exposure to the study of philosophy in Bologna in this period of his life. Unfortunately, there is a gap of a little more than two years in the record of Dante’s life between September 1291 and March 1294, and it is only possible to speculate on whether Dante was able to avail himself of the possibilities of studying philosophical subjects that would not have been accessible to him in the more constrained landscape of the monastic libraries and studiae of Florence.

Wherever it may have been that Dante acquired his familiarity with philosophy and theology, his writings offer ample evidence of wide ranging interests, if not deep expertise about each and every subject that is touched on in them. In particular, Dante cites a dozen works of Aristotle, apparently at first hand, and displays a particularly intimate knowledge of the Ethics, largely derived, no doubt, from Thomas Aquinas. But his Aristotelianism was nourished by other sources as well. Bruno Nardi has argued persuasively that his attitude toward the study of philosophy also owes a great deal to the more eclectic Albert the Great [Nardi (1967); 63–72; (1992), 28–29; Vasoli (1995b); Gilson (2004)]. In Albert, in particular, Dante would have encountered a wide-ranging encyclopedism that included original work, experimental and theoretical, in natural science, and treated Aristotelian natural philosophy and psychology in the light of Islamic philosophers (notably Avicenna and Averroes) and Greco-Arab neo-Platonic sources such as the Liber de Causis, as well as the Christian neo-Platonist tradition of Pseudo-Dionysius. Albert aimed to discover Aristotle’s own meaning, with the help of Greek and Arab commentators who led him into disagreement with other Latini, including at certain points his pupil Thomas, and he asserts more than once that philosophy and theology are separate spheres of knowledge. It is tempting to imagine that this willingness to pursue philosophy on its own terms appealed to Dante, whose Convivio and Monarchia also sought to distinguish philosophical and religious knowledge without simply subordinating the former to the latter.

Albert’s view of the procession of the universe from the “substantial light” of the divine intellect through the operation of a hierarchy of lesser intelligences is also clearly perceptible in Dante’s treatment of the cosmic intelligenze or sostanze separate in the Convivio [Conv. 2.4–5; Nardi (1992), 47–62]. It shows up again in his treatment of the growth of the human embryo, which seems to imply, not a sequence of animations by nutritive, sensitive and intellective powers, as for Thomas, but the continuous operation of a single virtus formativa, whose operation Albert compares to that of the prima intelligentia in the soul [De intellectu & intelligibili 2.2], and which is responsible not only for the development of the human creature but for effecting its union with an essentially external anima intellectiva [Boyde (1981), 270–79; Nardi (1960), 9–68; (1967), 67–70].

Albert is thus a likely conduit for seemingly Averroist elements in Dante’s thought. He regards intellectual activity as the operation of the intellectus agens, through which the human soul is illumined by the divine Intelligence. Each soul possesses its own intellect, but this intellect is a “reflection” (resultatio) of the light of the primal mind, which thus, in effect, becomes itself the true agent intellect. Albert explicitly rejects the Averroist view of the active intellect as itself a celestial intelligence, a single, separate substance which actualizes in the passive intellect phantasms supplied by individual human minds. But he nevertheless also argues that only an intellect universal in nature can produce an understanding of universal forms. The intellect and the soul of which it is a function thus partake of the character of the separate intelligences. Soul is not the actualizing essence of the human creature, as in Thomas, but is related to body through the mediation of its organic faculties. In itself, through its agent intellect, the soul is drawn to contemplate the intelligences which order the universe at large, is informed by them with the transcendent knowledge they manifest, and finally “stands” in the divine intellect. In this way, certain men are enabled to fulfill the innate human desire for understanding and attain a natural beatitude, “substantiated and formed in the divine being” [Albert, De intellectu & intelligibili 2.2–12; Nardi (1960), 145–50].

That this fulfillment is attained through natural understanding, with no recourse to the theology of grace and revelation, marks a crucial difference between Albert and Thomas, who devotes several chapters of the Summa contra gentiles to a forceful refutation of the notion that final happiness as defined by Aristotle is possible in this life [SCG 3.37–48]. For Thomas the desire to know is one and the same at all levels, and philosophy, seeking the causes of things, is ultimately “ordered entirely to the knowing of God” [SCG 3.25.9] Dante’s own position on this question is difficult to define precisely. The poet of the Paradiso is at one with Thomas on the value of philosophy as consisting finally in its power to prepare the mind for faith [Par. 4.118–32; 29.13–45], but he shares Albert’s fascination with natural understanding, and in earlier writings his willingness to grant philosophy a “beatitude” of its own hints at a latent dualism in his thought [Foster (1965), 51–71; (1977), 193–208; de Libera (1991), 333–36]. How far this reflects his responsiveness to neo-Platonism as mediated by Albert or in such works as the Liber de causis is hard to determine. Nardi, who argued successfully for seeing Dante as an eclectic thinker [Diomedi (2005), 1–23], stressed the importance of the Liber de Causis. But the Platonizing strain in Dante’s thinking surely involves more than simply the influence of Albert or interest in the Liber de Causis, and other scholars have noted Dante’s likely indebtedness to the encyclopedism of twelfth-century thinkers like Bernardus Silvestris and Alan of Lille, poet-philosophers whose world view, inherited from late-antique Neoplatonism, was defined by the Liberal Arts and the cosmology of Plato’s Timaeus [Vasoli (1995a, 2008); Garin (1976), 64–70; Stabile (2007), 173–93]. In Bernardus’ Cosmographia and Alan’s Anticlaudianus, the unfolding of the secrets of nature by the enquiring mind generates an allegory of intellectual pilgrimage toward truth. Dante’s experience of philosophy, though defined in more dynamic and sophisticated terms, is a version of the same journey. The experience of love becomes a means to self-realization, and an awareness of the hierarchy of forces operative in the universe at large, which makes possible an ascensus mentis ad sapientiam, to that “amoroso uso della sapienza” that enables the human mind to participate in the divine.

On the other hand, recent studies have argued that Nardi, in his zeal to free Dante from the constraints of the orthodox Thomism that scholars like Pierre Mandonnet and Giovanni Busnelli claimed to find in him, exaggerates the neo-Platonist strain in his thinking [Maierù (2004), 128–35; Stabile (2007), 359–70; Iannucci (1997); Moevs (2005), 17–35]. Moreover, Dante was surely also aware of and influenced in some manner by a “radical” Aristotelianism centered in Bologna, where masters influenced by Siger of Brabant and Boethius of Dacia were affirming the autonomy of human reason and its capacity to attain happiness through its own powers [Corti (1981), 9–31; Vanni Rovighi]. Indeed, a number of textual and biographical clues have also been interpreted as pointing toward a more heterodox dimension in Dante’s thinking. In short, the question of the influence of Latin Averroism on Dante’s philosophical views has remained an active subject of debate among Dante scholars [see esp., Fortin (2002); Ardizzone (2014 and 2016); Ziolkowski (2014a); Stone (2006)]. Still, many of these thinkers were also following paths first taken by Albert, and it is possible that Albert’s influence, together with that of Thomas, is sufficient to account for many of the most distinctive features of Dante’s use of philosophy [Imbach (1996b), 399–413].

4. The Convivio

The fullest expository expression of Dante’s philosophical thought is the Convivio, in which commentary on a series of his own canzoni is the occasion for the expression of a range of ideas on ethics, politics, and metaphysics, as well as for extended discussion of philosophy itself. Originally, Dante conceived of the work as a “banquet” involving “fourteen courses”—that is, fourteen treatises commenting on canzoni on the “themes of love and virtue” (Conv. 1.1.14). However, the work, which was probably, written around 1304–1307, was abandoned with only four of its treatises completed. In these surviving treatises, Dante describes the genesis of his love of philosophy, and reflects on the ability of philosophical understanding to mediate religious truth, tracing the desire for knowledge from its origin as an inherent trait of human nature to the point at which the love of wisdom expresses itself directly as love of God.

Philosophy itself is the “love of wisdom,” and Dante’s central metaphor for representing it is the poetic celebration of a noble lady, a donna gentile, an act that, like Guinizelli, he sees as involving the influence of cosmic powers. His poetry, comes into being out of love and virtue [Conv. 1.1.14] because his nature is responsive to the influence of the “movers” of the universe, the intelligences, whose loving understanding determines “the most noble form of heaven” [2.5.19] as they in turn respond to “the love of the Holy Spirit” [2.5.14]. Their cosmic activity is a continual translation of understanding into love and natural process, and it is this which causes Dante to sing [Conv. 2, Canzone, 1–9]:

Voi che ’ntendendo il terzo ciel movete,
udite il ragionar ch’è nel mio core,
ch’io nol so dire altrui, sì mi par novo.
El ciel che segue lo vostro valore,
gentili creature che voi sete,
mi tragge ne lo stato ov’io mi trovo.
Onde ’l parlar de la vita ch’io provo,
par che si drizzi degnamente a vui:
però vi priego che lo mi ’ntendiate.

[All you who, knowing, make the Third Sphere move,
hear what is in my heart, this strange discourse
I can’t tell others for it feels so new.
The Sphere that follows on your virtue’s force—
noble, gracious creatures that you prove—
draws me in this state I have just come to;
Do words about what I am going through
seem not unworthily to you addressed:
and this I pray you, that you hear my part.]

The intellective power or intendimento of the intelligences moves Dante to an utterance which only these same powers can fully understand. Thus there is a continuum, a process of circulazione which begins in the mind of God and descends through the work of the intelligenze to draw Dante’s nature into that praise of the donna gentile which constitutes the fulfillment of his own nature, the highest expression of which his desire and intellect are capable [2.6.5; Diomedi (1999)].

Of the four books or trattati of the Convivio, the first is largely a defense of Dante’s decision to write his prose commentaries, as well as the poems they expound, in the Tuscan vernacular rather than in Latin. The second book provides a delineation of the Ptolemaic universe which the intelligenze govern, capped by a description of the Empyrean Heaven [2.3.8–12]:

…outside of all these spheres, Catholics posit the Empyrean heaven, that is to say, the heaven of flame or the luminous heaven; and they assert that it is motionless by having within itself, with respect to each of its parts, all that its matter wants. This is the reason for the extremely rapid movement of the Prime Mover: through the exceedingly fervent desire of each part of the ninth heaven (which is right next to that one) to be united with each part of that most divine and tranquil heaven, it revolves within it with so much desire that its speed is practically incomprehensible. And tranquil and peaceful is the place of that supreme Deity which alone completely sees itself. This is the place of the blessed spirits, according to the Holy Church, which cannot tell lies; and Aristotle also seems to hold this view, to anyone who follows what he is saying, in the first book of On Heaven and Earth. This heaven is the overarching edifice of the universe, in which all the universe is enclosed, and outside of which nothing exists; and it is not in any place but was formed alone in the First Mind, which the Greeks call Protonoe. This is the magnificence of which the Psalmist spoke, when he says to God: “Elevated above the heavens is your magnificence.”

The role of the Empyrean in thirteenth-century thought is equivocal. Some thinkers attempt to explain it scientifically, as a comprehensive cosmic principle, while for Thomas and Albert any such realm must be spiritual in nature and can bear no natural relation to the astronomical universe—though both at times seem to grant it a certain influence on the natural order [Nardi (1967), 196–214; Vasoli (1995a), 94–102]. Dante’s account reflects these uncertainties. He begins by citing “the Catholics,” or orthodox belief, as authority for his account of this “abode of the supreme deity,” but then goes on to treat the Empyrean as a created thing, “formed in the Primal Mind,” and as the motionless cause of motion in the physical universe. If God dwells in this place, the Empyrean resides equally in Him, and the universe at large is encompassed, causally and locally, by the Empyrean. Dante deploys the Aristotelian physics of desire to explain the relationship of the Empyrean to the lesser heavens, yet it is at the same time beyond space, a wholly spiritual realm where blessed spirits participate in the divine mind. Dante seems to emphasize this double status by mingling theological and philosophical language, and invoking Aristotle and the neo-Platonists side by side with the poet of the Psalms. In the Paradiso the problems raised here will be implicitly resolved by a brilliant recourse to the “metaphysics of light;” when Dante and Beatrice, emerging from the “greatest body,” the crystalline sphere or Primum Mobile, pass on “al ciel ch’è pura luce, / Luce intellettual piena d’amore” [Par. 30.39–40], we know that we are at the precise point at which the bonum diffusivum sui that is God’s love transforms itself to cosmic energy, “the love that moves the sun and the other stars.” But poetry is perhaps the only means of defining this threshold [Bonaventure, Sent. 2. d. 2, a. 2, q. 1, c. 4; Thomas, Quodl. 6, q. 11, a. unicus 19].

Similar ambiguities appear in Dante’s discussion of the intelligenze themselves. Since in governing the several heavens the intelligences engage in a kind of civil life, they must enjoy an active as well as a contemplative existence. But the latter is of a higher order than the former, and no single intelligence can partake of both. Influenced perhaps by Thomas’s commentary, Dante imputes to Aristotle in the Ethics the view that such divine beings must know only a contemplative life [2.4.13; cp. Aristotle, NE 10.8, 1178b; Thomas, Exp. Eth. 10, lect. 12, 2125]. Dante’s attempt to resolve the issue is oddly unpersuasive. He argues that the circular motion of the heavens, by which the world is governed, is really a function of the contemplative activity of the intelligences [2.4.13]. Here, as in the case of the Empyrean which they inhabit, we can see Aristotle’s celestial movers undergoing a neo-Platonizing transformation, but Dante ends this stage of his discussion by noting that the truth concerning the Intelligences cannot be fully grasped by our earthly understanding [2.4.16–17].

The second book concludes with an extended allegory in which the concentric “heavens” or planetary spheres are identified with the seven Liberal Arts, the “starry sphere” with physics and metaphysics, the Primum mobile with moral philosophy, and the Empyrean beyond with theology. This synthesis of the natural and the intellectual universe expresses an ideal of education which harks back to the late-antique sources of twelfth-century Platonism, but which Dante has imbued with new life. His emphasis on the ordering function of moral wisdom, and on the happiness attainable through intellectual contemplation, reflects an engagement with the philosophical tradition, and a commitment to philosophy as such, which belong to the later thirteenth century. The final chapter of Book Two affirms the beauty that consists in seeing the causes of those “wonders” that, as the opening of the Metaphysics declares, draw us to philosophy.

The third book is perhaps the most important for the student of Dante’s knowledge and use of philosophy. Its central theme is praise of philosophy’s power, as “l’amoroso uso della sapienza,” “the loving use of wisdom,” to impart the highest happiness to those who love her, perfecting their natures and drawing them close to God, of whose majesty and wisdom her beauty is the expression. It is largely a meditation on love, understood as Dante’s response, intellectual, poetic, and psychological, to his enlightenment at the hands of the beautiful lady whom he celebrates as Philosophy.

Early in the third book Dante cites the Liber de Causis: every “substantial form” proceeds from the first cause, God, and participates in His divine nature according to its nobility [3.2.4–8; LC 1.1]. The human soul, noblest of all created forms, loves all things to the degree that they manifest the divine goodness, but desires above all to be united with God. Philosophy is the expression of this desire in such a way that it, “apart from the soul and considered in itself, has for its subject understanding and for its form an almost divine love for what is understood” [3.11.13]. Thus it is through the love of philosophy—“the spiritual union of the soul with” [3.2.3] philosophy itself—that humanity perfects its “highest nature, in other words the truly human one—or better, the angelic or rational nature” [3.3.11]. For in this spiritual union, the soul discovers in itself “that fine and most precious part of the soul, which is deity” [3.2.19] and “participates in the divine nature in the manner of a sempiternal Intelligence” [3.2.14]. As such it mirrors the nobility, wisdom and love of the divine essence and its “loving use of wisdom” becomes unified with God “through eternal marriage” [3.12.11–14].

All of this may appear sheer fantasy, but we should remember that the aim of philosophy as the Convivio pursues it is to attain, through natural reason, the greatest happiness of which we are capable in our earthly state. Such felicity is of course circumscribed by our mortality, and the Dante who celebrates philosophical understanding as a quasi-mystical union with God also maintains that true union can be granted only through grace to a soul made receptive by the infusion of the theological virtues which transcend the workings of rational, natural virtue.

In this vein, it is not surprising that Dante speaks of the soul after death as enduring “perpetually in a nature that is more than human” [2.8.6], and asserts that to perceive God is not possible for our nature [3.15.10]. Aristotle, too, had argued that a life of pure contemplation is beyond our strictly human capacity—that we can live in this way only to the extent that we have in us “something divine” [NE 10.7, 1177b]. But for Dante, as for Thomas Aquinas, the modus essendi of the soul joined to the body differs from that of the soul in separation: though they are the same in nature, the separated soul understands, not by means of sensory images, but through species in which it participates by virtue of the divine light [cf. ST 1.89.1r]. In the temporal life, however, as Dante acknowledges, there are truths which we can apprehend only as if in a dream, “come sognando,” [Conv. 2.12.4; Nardi (1944), 81–90], and our desire for perfect understanding is necessarily limited. To desire what is beyond the capacity of our intellectual nature would be ethically and rationally incoherent, a desire for imperfection rather than perfection of understanding. Therefore, our love of wisdom is “proportioned in this life to the knowledge which we can have here, and does not go past that point except by an error which is outside the intention of nature” [3.15.8–10].

But the Convivio continually strains against these same limits that it claims are appropriate to the proper scope of human knowledge in our temporal condition. For Dante, first and foremost a poet of love, the experience of acquiring philosophical understanding has an important psychological component. By enabling us to analyze the processes of perception, philosophy brings us into contact with the true nature of things, and for Dante, as Kenelm Foster observes, the slightest such contact could have a metaphysical value:

It did not in one sense matter to Dante what the particular object of his knowing might be, since the joy of knowing it was already a foretaste of all conceivable knowledge and all joy; and this precisely because, in knowing, the mind seized truth…once intelligence, the truth-faculty, had tasted truth as such, that is, its own correspondence with reality, it could not help desiring truth whole and entire, that is, its correspondence with all reality. [Foster (1965), 59–60]

At this point, knowledge and the joy of possessing it combine to prepare the ground for faith. By explaining phenomena which without her guidance would merely astonish us, philosophy inspires us to believe “that every miracle can be perceived by a superior intellect to have a reasonable cause” [3.14.14]:

And here our good faith has its origin; from which comes hope, which is desire for what is foreseen; and through this arises the act of charity. Through these three virtues one ascends to philosophize in that celestial Athens, where the Stoics and Peripatetics and Epicureans, by the light of eternal truth, in a single will, concur in total concord one with the other.

Philosophy thus conceived can still be regarded as the handmaid of theology, but as Dante develops his philosophical ideal metaphorically in terms of the beauty of the donna gentile, it assumes a religious value of its own. Since the wisdom she embodies is the consummation of human self-realization, the donna gentile resides in the divine mind as “the intentional exemplar of the human essence” [3.6.6]. In desiring her we desire our own perfection, for she is “as supremely perfect as human essence can be” [3.6.8] When at this point Dante adds a reminder that nothing in our human experience can fully satisfy this desire, he seems to be acknowledging that what Thomas’ Ethics commentary refers to as the ultimate end of desire’s natural inclination is unattainable in this life, since it would require an understanding more complete than any human being can possess [Thomas, Exp. Eth. 1, lect. 9, 107; SCG 3.48.2].

But having provided this caution, Dante seems to ignore it, as if unable to resist the conviction that philosophy satisfies our desire in a manner proper to itself. Everything naturally desires its own perfection, and for human beings this is “the perfection of reason” [3.15.3–4; cf. Thomas, Exp. Eth. 9, lect. 9, 1872]. But philosophy, as embodied in the donna gentile, is not just the consummation of natural understanding. For Dante, as for Aristotle, the human intellect as such is somehow more than human, and he is at times similarly unclear on the question of whether human beings can attain happiness through the exercise of virtue, and to what extent it is a gift of the gods [Foster (1977), 198–201]. Repeatedly he draws a distinction between merely human happiness and that attainable through grace, only to seemingly disregard it in subsequent discussion. Thus in the final chapter of the third treatise he acknowledges the “strong misgivings” that one might have about the happiness attainable through philosophy. Since certain things—God, eternity, and primal matter are named—exceed the capacity of our intellect, our natural desire to know must remain unfulfilled in this life [3.15.7]. Dante answers this by affirming, as noted above, that the natural desire for perfection is always proportionate to our capacity to attain it; for to desire the unattainable would be to desire our imperfection [3.15.8–11]. Human happiness, then, consists in the attainment of Aristotle’s “human good,” through the exercise of the virtues. This is what Dante calls “l’umana operazione,” and its end is the highest that human beings can attain through their own powers.

Yet philosophy offers the promise of more. The same chapter is climaxed by the vision of Wisdom as “the mother of all things,” the origin of all motion and order in the created universe, guiding the quest of human wisdom by the light of the divine intellect. When the human mind is fully informed by philosophy, it would appear, it becomes virtually one of the intelligenze, who know both what is above them and what is below, God as cause and the created universe as effect [3.6.4–6]. Thus Dante can speak of our rational nature as, simultaneously our “truly human” and “our angelic nature” [Moevs (2005), 83–86].

The Liber de causis says that each cause infuses into its effect the goodness it receives from its own cause, or, in the case of the soul, from God [Conv. 3.6.11; LC 4.48]. When gazing on the body of the donna gentile, we are perceiving the effect of a cause which is ultimately God, and thus, Dante asserts [3.6.12–13]:

insofar as, with regard to her bodily aspect, marvelous things are seen in her… it is evident that her form, that is her soul, which directs it [her bodily aspect] as its proper cause, miraculously receives the beloved goodness of God. And so it is demonstrated by this appearance that, beyond the due of our nature (which is most perfect in her, as was stated above), this lady is favored by God and made a noble thing.

Thus in effect the donna gentile is the perfection we desire. Through her we experience the divine goodness, by an outflowing, a discorrimento, which Dante glosses with a further reference to the Liber de Causis [3.7.2; LC 20.157] in terms of the hierarchical emanation of the divine goodness. In the quasi-continuous series of gradations that descends from angel to brute animal, there is no intervening grade between man and angel, so that some human beings are so noble as to be nothing less than angels [Aristotle, NE 7.1, 1145a]. Such is the donna gentile; she receives divine virtue just as the angels do [3.7.7]. She is a thing visibilmente miraculosa, ordained from eternity by God in testimonio de la fede for us [3.7.16–17; Foster (1965), 56], and God, by instilling his radiance in her love of philosophy, “assimilates” her form “to his likeness insofar as it is possible to be like Him” [3.14.3; cf. Thomas, SCG 1.91].

Philosophy has clearly become far more than the means whereby human nature achieves self-realization, though this ideal continues to provide a framework for Dante’s praise of her. She has assumed the status of Wisdom, sapientia, the divine mind as expressed in the order and harmony of creation. Like the separate substances and God Himself, her beauty can only be described in terms of its effects. The true philosopher “loves every part of wisdom, and wisdom every part of the philosopher, since she draws him to herself in full measure” [3.11.12]. Moreover, because the object of every philosopher’s contemplation is the same angelic intelligence, philosophical activity also unites individual human beings to donna gentile in such a way that, as Ardizzone has put it, emphasizes a “principle of unity in which the cosmological order is the expression of a superior intellectual love and desire, one which human and superhuman beings may share” [Ardizzone (2016), 274].

Here we may recall Dante’s account of how the swift motion of the Primum Mobile expresses its desire for total participation in the divinity of the Empyrean [2.3.8]. And it is in such terms that Dante ends his account of philosophy-as-wisdom. In the final chapter of the third treatise, she is explicitly identified with the all-creating Wisdom of God as “the mother of all things and the origin of every motion” [3.15.15], and Dante concludes in prophetic exhortation [3.15.17]:

Oh, worse than dead are you who flee her friendship! Open your eyes and look; for, before you were, she loved you, preparing and ordering the process that created you; and once you were made, to show you the way she came to you in your likeness.

The fourth treatise of the Convivio seems to have been written later than the first three, and it is markedly different in orientation. The principal theme of its canzone is the true nature of nobility. Introducing his prose discussion, Dante gives a curious account of how an interruption in his philosophical studies, caused by what the canzone calls “disdainful and harsh” behavior on the part of the donna gentile, provided an occasion for taking up this topic:

So, since this lady of mine had slightly altered her sweet expressions toward me, above all where I investigated and researched whether the prime matter of the elements was comprehended by God—because of which I refrained for a while from being in the presence of her face—living more or less without her, I started to reflect on the human defect related to the above-mentioned error [i.e., a false perception of the bases of human nobility]. [4.1.8]

That God is the creator of prime matter was an article of faith, and Thomas had dealt decisively with the role of divine will and intellect in the creative act [SCG 2.20.7, 21–24]. That Dante should admit to having entertained doubts about such a question is perhaps a way hedging against or concealing the heterodox implications of his claims in book 3 [Ardizzone (2016)]. Alternatively, he may have sensed himself idolizing the secondary powers in whose hierarchical circulazione he felt himself, as poet, to be in a special sense participant, and allowing these preoccupations to cloud his awareness of God’s omnipotence. The anger of the donna gentile would then express his sense of a corresponding loss of focus, a failure to affirm her unique and transcendent role in the expression of the divine will. Or perhaps Dante had come to regard the metaphysical exposition of books 2 and 3 as incidental to what he regarded as a more significant philosophical theme that emerges in book 4.

Whatever the precise nature of the dilemma to which Dante alludes, the fourth treatise is marked by a noticeable shift away from metaphysics in the direction of ethics and rhetoric. Philosophical knowledge is redirected to the purposes of social and political life, and the treatise, while punctuated like the others by numerous digressions, pursues a single sustained argument. Dante begins by explaining that social order is a necessary condition for human happiness and that it requires a single governor whose authority embraces that of all particular governors and directs their several efforts to a single end [4.4]. After a long digression on the role of Rome in the providential design of human history, he turns from political to philosophical authority, citing Aristotle as in effect the governor of the mind, “master and guide of human reason insofar as it is occupied with its final end” [4.6.8]. From this, Dante derives the conclusion that even an emperor’s authority must be circumscribed insofar as the art of ruling and the laws it creates cannot overrule rational judgment based on the laws of nature [4.9].

On this basis Dante proceeds to refute the view that nobility consists in wealth and ancestry, a view which he here attributes to Frederick II, “the last emperor of the Romans,” and for which he will elsewhere cite Aristotle’s Politics [Mon. 2.3.4; Pol. 4.8, 1294a]. Perhaps as significant as the arguments he musters to show the treacherous nature of riches and the uncertain course of nobility from one generation to another is the assertion of Dante’s own authority, as philosopher and citizen, that is implied by his elaborate apology for speaking as he does [Ascoli (1989), 35–41]. The gesture nicely epitomizes the project of the Convivio, a vernacular discourse which defines for its lay audience the limits of political and scholastic authority and affirms the autonomy and potential dignity of individual human reason.

The later portions of the fourth treatise are grounded in an Aristotelian definition of nobility, as the perfection of a thing according to its nature [Conv. 4.16.7; Physics 7.3, 246a]. The human expression of this perfection is virtue, moral and intellectual. Electing to address the moral virtues, as more accessible to a lay understanding, Dante begins by describing how nobility is implanted in the nascent soul as the seed of virtue, from which spring the two branches of the active and the contemplative life. The final chapters of the Convivio show how the virtues that stem from nobility can direct the natural appetite of the mind, enabling it to evolve through love of them to the happiness which is the end of virtue [Conv. 4.17.8–9; NE 1.13, 1102a].

In the final stanza of the canzone analyzed in the fourth treatise, Dante addresses the poem itself as “Contra-li-erranti,” his “Contra-the-mistaken,” and the final chapter of the commentary explains this as an allusion to the Summa contra gentiles of Thomas, written “to confound all those who deviate from our Faith” [Conv. 4.30.3]. By thus declaring himself the follower of so fine a craftsman, Dante suggests, he hopes to “ennoble” his own undertaking.

The Contra gentiles may seem an odd choice of model. Bruno Nardi considers that Dante had at most a superficial knowledge of this work at the time when he wrote the Convivio, and it is certainly the case that he is fundamentally at odds with Thomas over such specific matters as the origin of the soul, the role of the celestial intelligences in creation, and, more important, in claiming for philosophy the power to fulfil the human desire for knowledge in this life [Nardi (1992), 28–29]. On all of these matters, Dante is closer to the position of Albert.

In any case, having dwelt at length on the insatiability of the base desire for riches, Dante addresses the question of whether our desire for knowledge, too, since it continues to grow as knowledge is acquired, is not similarly base. Dante begins his answer by asserting that “the supreme desire of each thing, the primal one given by its nature, is to return to its principle” or cause, and he illustrates this proposition by the images of a traveller on an unfamiliar road, who imagines each house he encounters to be the inn he seeks, and the desires of youth, which focus first on an apple or a pet bird, then evolve to encompass love and prosperity [Conv. 4.12.14–16]. But while this may seem to evoke Thomas’s view of a single desire which seeks to grow continuously toward union with God, Dante’s point is that the path to fulfillment involves multiple desires and the attainment of multiple perfections [Conv. 4.13.1–2]:

…the desire for knowledge cannot be said to grow in the proper sense, even if as was stated earlier it does expand in a certain way. This is because anything which grows in the proper sense is always one; the desire for knowledge is not always one but is many—when one is completed, another comes along—so that properly speaking, its expansion is not growth but a progression from something small to something large. For if I desire to know the principles of natural things, no sooner do I know them than this desire is satisfied and fulfilled. And if I subsequently desire to know the what and the how of each of these principles, this is another, new desire, the occurrence of which does nothing to take away the perfection to which the other desire led me; and this expansion is not a cause of imperfection, but of greater perfection or completeness.

Thomas can speak of the natural desire to know as a force like gravity, whose attraction intensifies as it approaches its object [SCG 3.25.13]. In contrast Dante’s insistence on types and stages of knowing may seem almost perverse, a matter of emphasizing the stages of the mind’s ascent rather than a single, unified desire that leads it forward from stage to stage. But what is at stake for Dante is the need to acknowledge human ends as having a definite value of their own, and this need will play an equally important role in Dante’s other major philosophical works.

5. The De vulgari eloquentia

During the same period in which Dante was writing the Convivio he was also composing the De vulgari eloquentia. Written in Latin, this treatise was, like the Convivio, abandoned sometime around 1307. In it, however, many of the lengthy discussions of ethics and politics from book 4 of Convivio are put in the service of a discussion of the capacity of poets possessing both scientia et ingenium—that is, those who possess both knowledge and genius [DVE 2.1.8]—to use an illustrious vernacular language to “melt the hearts of human beings, so as to make the unwilling willing and the willing unwilling” [1.17.4]. Underwriting this purpose, Dante offers a wholly unique treatment of the origins and development of language in book 1 before proceeding in book 2 to set down specific rules that ought to govern the proper poetic deployment of this illustrious vernacular.

There are nineteen chapter divisions to part one. Chapters 1–3 lay the groundwork by discussing the basic purposes of human language. Here, Dante quite rightly recognizes that, even were we to regard intellectual content as immaterial, human beings are nevertheless constituted in such a way as to derive intellectual content initially from sensation directly (as in the case of induction arriving at a first principle) or through the sensory communication of intellectual content from one human being to another (as in the case of dialectical or rhetorical engagement). Languages thus convey thinking but do so in a material medium (e.g., sound produced by one person’s vocal cords and vibrating another person’s receiving organ of the ear). Indeed, for Dante, this use of language is at the very core of what it means to be human since, unlike other animals and also unlike angels and demons, “in order to communicate their mental conceptions (conceptiones) to one another, men had to have some kind of rational and sensory sign…rational because it would both arise from and lead to reason…[and sensory] since nothing can be transferred from one reasoning mind to another except by sensory means.” [1.3.2].

Chapters 4–10 then proceed to offer an investigation of the origins of the diversity of vernaculars in the world. The view Dante offers in these chapters focuses on both the creation of Adam and Adam’s first speech as well as on the story of the tower of Babel. (Aspects of the account offered here are later revised in the Pilgrim’s discussion of this subject with Adam in Paradiso 26—see Aleksander [2016], 240–41). In chapters 11–15, Dante describes his supposed hunt among the existing Italian vernaculars of his day for an illustrious version of Italian. But rather than locating an illustrious vernacular among any of the existing modes of Italian, he mainly heaps scorn on most of the regional vernaculars, including his own native Tuscan vernacular. For instance, Dante writes that “the Tuscans, who, rendered senseless by some aberration of their own” [1.13.1] merely persist in drunken raving [in hac ebrietate baccantur, 1.13.2] about the excellence of their “foul jargon” [turpiloquio, 1.13.3].

There is one important exception to Dante’s scorn for the fourteen or so vernaculars that he reviews, and it is the vernacular of the Bolognese. Dante claims that the Bolognese seem to “speak a more beautiful language than most” [1.15.2] because their vernacular, unlike that of other regions of Italy, borrows from other vernaculars in such a way that it is “tempered by the combination of opposites” [1.15.5]. Unfortunately for them, however, Dante explains that his praise for their language is not absolute but is only relative to his disdain for the sad state of the other existing vernaculars. After all, he says, had the dialect of the Bolognese been absolutely the best of the existing Italian vernaculars, why would praiseworthy poets such as Guido Guinizelli, Guido Ghislieri, Fabruzzo, and Onesto have abandoned it?

In 1.16, Dante turns from his hunt for an illustrious vernacular among existing modes of Italian to his own definition of the mode of vernacular against which all other Italian vernaculars ought to be judged. Here Dante draws an implicit analogy between what is he is seeking in the case of the Italian vernaculars and the ways in which we are able to identify through intellectual insight a law or principle that provides a determination of what is good or bad with respect to some distinct capacity for action. Dante reasons that just as we are able to arrive at conceptions of “virtue” that ought to govern our conduct, so too we ought be able to arrive at an understanding of the mode of language that is best suited to our practical needs as language users. As he will eventually make clear in 2.1–2, this mode of language would be appropriate only for the best of uses by the best individuals. That is, this mode would only be appropriate for use by those who are equipped by their own perfection to generate virtues in others. Moreover, this mode would only express and produce the virtues that correspond to the tripartite aspects of a human soul: prowess in arms, which pertains to the vegetal part of the soul’s determination to seek that which is useful; love, which pertains to a rectitude of the appetitive or animal part of the soul; and rectitude of will, which pertains to the rational part of the soul [2.2].

For Dante there are four main features of any mode of expression appropriate for these tasks. Dante identifies these four features as a vernacular’s illustriousness, cardinality, courtliness, and curiality. That such a language can generate virtues in human beings is precisely what Dante means in 1.17 when he calls such a language “illustrious” since such a language is “sublime in both learning and power” [1.17.2]. And, in 1.18, Dante explains that such a language is “cardinal,” or “pivotal,” (cardinalis) because it “plants” (plantat) what is best and peculiar to specific local vernaculars and “removes” (exstirpat) what is disreputable [1.18.1]. It is “courtly” or “aulic” (aulicus) because “it is common to all and the property of none” [1.18.2]. And it is “curial” (curialis) because it has been weighed by the scales of justice in a court unified either under the rule of a singular monarch or—as is the case for Dante’s Italian contemporaries, who lack a unified court in this sense—according to a court unified by “the gracious light of reason” [1.18.5]. This last criterion thus suggests that such a vernacular also depends upon and expresses the principles of just rule since, according to Dante, “the essence of being curial is no more than providing a balanced assessment of whatever has to be dealt with” [1.18.4].

Dante’s style of argumentation in the De vulgari eloquentia is notably assertorial and seems to beg the question of the grounds for his own authority to offer the principles summarized above. To illustrate the significance of this style of argumentation, it is worth backing up for a moment to see that prior to defining the four main features of any illustrious vernacular, Dante had already hunted for an illustrious vernacular among roughly fourteen existing regional species of the Italian mode of the vernacular. During the course of this hunt, however, Dante offered judgments regarding the deficiencies of various aesthetic features of these existing modes of the Italian vernacular as if he had already established the very principles that he articulated only after having abandoned that hunt. For instance, after heaping scorn on the vernacular habits of his fellow Tuscans, Dante proceeds to the following evaluation of the Genoese:

If there is anyone who thinks that what I have just said about the Tuscans could not be applied to the Genoese, let him consider only that if, through forgetfulness, the people of Genoa lost the use of the letter z, they would either have to fall silent for ever or invent a new language for themselves. For z forms the greater part of their vernacular, and it is, of course a letter that cannot be pronounced without considerable harshness.

The claim that an illustrious vernacular would not include frequent uses of the phoneme z is puzzling on the surface and seems to call for a justification much more robust than the judgment that z is a harsh sound. Indeed, Dante seems somewhat aware of this problem, for in 1.6.2–3 he had already staked out his own authority in undertaking his investigation by explaining that:

whoever is so misguided as to think that the place of his birth is the most delightful spot under the sun may also believe that his own language—his mother tongue, that is—is pre-eminent among all others; and, as a result he may believe that his language was also Adam’s. To me, however, the whole world is a homeland, like the sea to fish—though I drank from the Arno before cutting my teeth, and love Florence so much that, because I loved her suffer exile unjustly—and I will weight the balance of my judgment more with reason than with [sensation].

Taken to an extreme, this comment suggests that the basis of his authority to evaluate the quality of diverse vernaculars is his “exile.” Read in this way, Dante’s unjust exile from the imperfect community of Florence perhaps suggests a reversal of Adam’s exile from Eden (or of the hubris that resulted in Nimrod’s linguistic isolation illustrated in Inferno 31)—an interpretation that is also justified by the very fact that in this same section Dante proceeds from this comment on his own suitability to judge Italian vernaculars immediately to a discussion of the forma locutionis of Adamic language.

However, these claims also permit a more modest interpretation of Dante’s self-justification. In the first place, Dante’s claim to authority by virtue of his exile from Florence suggests that the legitimacy of an illustrious vernacular is not simply rooted in a game of numbers—that is, the illustriousness of a vernacular is not simply a product of how many people use it in a given region of the world. Quite to the contrary, since the proper use of such a vernacular requires that a poet possesses both scientia et ingenium, those who are legitimate users of an illustrious vernacular are likely to be few in number, and the ways in which they ought to employ such a language are similarly constrained. Moreover, both Dante’s warnings about the problems of bias in our attitudes toward our own linguistic conventions as well as his point that the legitimacy of his own evaluation is rooted in his attention to reason rather than merely to the senses provides a hint that Dante regards the legitimacy of poetic employments of an illustrious vernacular as grounded in philosophy’s authoritativeness with respect to ethical and political matters.

To see how this hint bears out it will help to recall the points that Dante offered in the Convivio about the relationship between philosophical, theological, and secular political authority. As noted above, in Convivio 4 Dante argues that even an emperors authority must be circumscribed insofar as the art of ruling and the laws it creates cannot overrule rational judgment based on philosophical understanding of the laws of nature. But, in fact, Dante pursues this line of thinking even further in Convivio 4.6.16–18 by explaining the practical necessity of the unification of imperial and philosophical authority.

the authority of the supreme philosopher referred to here [Aristotle] is utterly valid [or, more literally “is invested with complete power”]. Philosophical authority is not opposed to imperial authority; but the latter without the former is dangerous, and the former without the latter is weak, as it were, not in itself but because of the disorder that results among the people; so that one combined with the other is highly useful and most valid. And so it is written in the Book of Wisdom: “Love the light of wisdom, all you who are before the people”; in other words, unite philosophical authority and imperial authority, for the sake of good and perfect rule.

Later in the text, Dante is even more explicit about the priority of philosophy’s authority to that of the emperor with respect to judgments concerning the political necessities dictated by human nature. In Convivio 4.9.14–16, for instance, Dante offers the following claim:

what we have discussed with regard to the various arts can be observed in the imperial art; for there are conventions in that art, too, which are pure arts, as for example laws on marriage, domestic servants, military service, or successors in public office: in these we are completely subject to the emperor, without doubt or hesitation. There are other laws which follow on nature, so to speak, as in establishing when a man is old enough to manage his own affairs, and where these are concerned we are not wholly subject. There are many others which appear to have some relation to the imperial art—and whoever believes that the emperor’s opinion in this area is authoritative is and was deluded—as in defining what constitutes early adulthood and nobility, over which no imperial judgment must be accepted merely because it is the emperor’s: thus, may that which is Caesar’s be rendered unto Caesar, and may that which is God’s be rendered unto God. Consequently, there is no obligation to believe or assent to the emperor Nero, who said that early adulthood was bodily beauty and strength, but [instead] to him, a philosopher [Aristotle], who said that early adulthood is the peak of natural life.

In other words, Dante’s argument in De vulgari eloquentia ultimately depends upon and reinforces the claims of the Convivio that just rule requires the unification of philosophical authority with that of the authority to establish and enforce laws. Philosophy qua philosophy is impotent in the task of guiding all but those who have already achieved both ethical and intellectual virtues. The emperor, on the other hand, can indeed either benefit or corrupt his subjects, but the emperor’s legitimacy depends on his recognition of the priority of philosophy’s claims to the knowledge of the principles of justice and the other human virtues since such matters are dictated more by human nature than by local conventions. What the De vulgari eloquentia adds to Dante’s emerging political philosophy in the Convivio, however, is explicit attention to the significance of poetic/rhetorical discourse as a tool to be used on behalf of the project of unifying people under the joint rule of philosophy and empire—a perspective that it is easy to imagine played a significant role in his choice to turn back to poetry as his primary vehicle for addressing his fellow Italians in their own vernacular in the Divine Comedy.

6. The Monarchia

Although there remains some dispute about the date of the Monarchia’s composition (probably after 1314), it is clear that, unlike the Convivio and the De vulgari eloquentia, the Monarchia was completed and disseminated in Dante’s own lifetime—though, evidently, it was not widely circulated until the late 1320’s, when it came to be deployed as propaganda supporting Louis IV’s claim to the title of Holy Roman Emperor [Cassell (2004), 33–49].

Regardless of the uses to which it was later put, the Monarchia is in its own way as idiosyncratic as the Convivio. Its purpose, foreshadowed in the discussion of empire in Convivio IV, is to demonstrate the necessity of a single ruling power, reverent toward but independent of the Church, capable of ordering the will of collective humanity in peace and concord. Under such a power the potential intellect of humanity can be fully actuated—the intellect, that is, of collective humanity, existent throughout the world, acting as one. For just as a multitude of species must continually be generated to actualize the full potentiality of prime matter, so the full intellectual capacity of humanity cannot be realized at one time nor in a single individual [Mon. 1.3.3–8]. Here Dante adds his own further particularization of this Aristotelian doctrine [De Anima 3.5, 430a10–15], asserting that no single household, community, or city can bring it to realization. The ordering of the collective human will to the goal of realizing its intellectual potential requires universal peace [1.4], and this in turn requires a single ordering power through whose authority humanity may achieve unity and so realize the intention and likeness of God [1.8].

The basis of this argument for empire is evidently the first sentence of the Prologue to Thomas’ commentary on the Metaphysics, where he declares that when several things are ordered to a single end, one of them must govern, “as the Philosopher teaches in his Politics” [Thomas, Exp. Metaph., Proemium; Aristotle, Politics 1.5, 1254a–55a]. For Thomas this is only an analogy, a way of introducing the theme of order as it applies to the soul and its pursuit of happiness. The passage he cites from the Politics is concerned only with the rudiments of hierarchy; the idea of “ordering of things to one end” is present only by implication, and Aristotle makes no attempt to develop its metaphysical implications. Dante, however, seems clearly to associate with Aristotle, or with Thomas’ reference to Aristotle, the idea of “a political organization which leads in its way to ‘beatitudo’ for the whole human race” [Minio-Paluello, 74–77]. One may wonder if Dante’s erroneous impression of the Aristotelian passage, which he cites directly with no reference to Thomas in both the Convivio and the Monarchia [Conv. 4.4.5; Mon. 1.5.2–3], is not a symptom of his intense need to draw the Philosopher into support of his view of world empire.

The second of the Monarchia’s three books deals with the great example of Rome, describing the city’s providential role in world history, largely by way of citations from Roman literature aimed at demonstrating the consistent dedication of Roman power to the public good, and the conformity of Roman imperium with the order of nature and the will of God.

The third book deals with the crucial issue of the relationship between political and ecclesiastical authority. Dante argues on various grounds that power in the temporal realm is neither derived from nor dependent on spiritual authority, though it benefits from the power of the Papacy to bless its activity. These arguments consist largely in refutations of traditional claims for the temporal authority of the Papacy, but the final chapter makes the argument on positive grounds and in terms that recall the arguments first laid down in the Convivio. Since the human being consists of soul and body, its nature partakes of both the corruptible and the incorruptible. Uniting two natures, human existence must necessarily be ordered to the goals of both these natures [Mon. 3.16.7–9]:

Ineffable providence has thus set before us two goals to aim at: i.e. happiness in this life, which consists in the exercise of our own powers and is figured in the earthly paradise; and happiness in the eternal life, which consists in the enjoyment of the vision of God (to which our own powers cannot raise us except with the help of God’s light) and which is signified by the heavenly paradise. Now these two kinds of happiness must be reached by different means, as representing different ends. For we attain the first through the teachings of philosophy, provided that we follow them putting into practice the moral and intellectual virtues; whereas we attain the second through spiritual teachings which transcend human reason, provided that we follow them putting into practice the theological virtues, i.e. faith, hope, and charity. These ends and the means to attain them have been shown to us on the one hand by human reason, which has been entirely revealed to us by the philosophers, and on the other by the Holy Spirit…

This is Dante’s most explicit, uncompromising claim for the autonomy of reason, reinforced by the entire world-historical argument of the Monarchia and constituting its final justification for world empire. Dante here goes well beyond Augustine’s sense of the stabilizing function of empire, and eliminates any hint of the anti-Roman emphasis in Augustine’s separation of the earthly and heavenly cities. In the final sentences of the Monarchia the temporal monarch becomes, like the aspiring intellect of the Convivio, the uniquely privileged beneficiary of a divine bounty which, “without any intermediary, descends into him from the Fountainhead of universal authority” [Mon. 3.16.15]. Like the Averroistic reasoning of his earlier claim that only under a world empire can humanity realize its intellectual destiny, this crowning claim shows Dante appropriating Aristotle to the service of a unique and almost desperate vision of empire as a redemptive force.

7. The Commedia (The Divine Comedy)

Few texts have generated such deep and abiding interest as has the Divine Comedy in its nearly centuries of transmission. In large part, this wealth of attention is a function of the way in which the Divine Comedy seems to gather, in what is often called an “encyclopedic” fashion, the entire edifice of classical poetry, medieval knowledge (including but not limited to its reflections on ethics, political theory, metaphysics, theology, biblical exegesis, literary history, rhetoric, and aesthetics) and to call out to its contemporary and future readers with the perennial demand that they make its encyclopedic interests meaningful in their own lives. In part because of this seemingly encyclopedic character, but also because so many of the poetic stratagems of the Divine Comedy involve irony and outright paradox, any attempt to summarize its philosophical content or significance is to a certain degree an act of folly. In fact all of the themes mentioned in the discussion of Dante’s three expository treatises above constitute significant themes in Dante’s magnum opus. For this reason, rather than attempt to summarize the Divine Comedy’s treatment of these themes, it may be more useful to offer a brief comment on what may be at stake in the question of the relationship between the philosophical content of the Divine Comedy and its poetic form.

At the outset, it is worth dispensing with the notion that the Divine Comedy rejects philosophy in favor of what appears to be a mystical undertaking. It is, of course, quite true that the Divine Comedy condemns even Aristotle, the “master of those who know,” to Hell [Inf. 4.131; all translations of the Divine Comedy in this entry are those of Robert Durling (1996–2011)]—specifically to the portion of Limbo in which souls of the noble pagans are punished only insofar as “without hope [they] live in desire” [Inf. 4.42]. However, even if philosophical perfection is, in itself, insufficient for salvation according to the Divine Comedy’s spiritual economy, this is not to say that salvation is possible without philosophy. In other words, the question of what philosophy means within the world described by the Divine Comedy probably should not rest upon a superficial identification of it exclusively with the fates it imagines even for those who are too easily taken to be its symbols.

Indeed, already in the Convivio, Dante presents a complicated understanding of the meaning and scope of philosophy. There, lady philosophy was depicted in books 2 and 3 as offering human beings the capacity for contemplative unity with God through their devotion to her. Hence, it is worth recalling a passage mentioned above in which Dante maintains that

it should be understood that the gaze of this woman was so liberally ordained for us, not only for seeing the countenance that she reveals to us, but for desiring to attain the things she keeps hidden. Thus, because through her many of those things are seen by means of reason, and consequently can be seen, while without her they seem inexplicable and miraculous, so we believe through her that every miracle may have its reason in a higher intellect and consequently is possible. And here our good faith has its origin; from which comes hope, which is desire for what is foreseen; and through this arises the act of charity. Through these three virtues one ascends to philosophize in that celestial Athens, where the Stoics and Peripatetics and Epicureans, by the light of eternal truth, in a single will, concur in total concord one with the other. [3.13–14]

In this light, it is also worth noting that Dante turns toward the authority of Aristotle in Convivio 4 only after having “refrained” from pursuing his desire for the donna gentile who embodies philosophy [4.1.8]. And it is noteworthy, too, that Dante appeals to Aristotle’s authority not about the spiritual and metaphysical matters that were the subjects of discussion in Convivio 2–3, but about those that concern the definition of nobility and the role of philosophy in ethical and political issues—issues that are pertinent only to the question of the pursuit of temporal rather than spiritual goods. In other words, the tension between the role of philosophy in the active life and its potential role for the contemplative life is broached in the Convivio in such a way that hints that the Divine Comedy, too, may be structured by the tension between its ambitions to make legitimate use of philosophy in these two related but fundamentally different manners—ways that may even be in tension with each other insofar as pursuit of one end may sometimes seem to preclude or require the abandonment of pursuit of the other.

There are, however, two major complications that hinder any direct assessment of the Divine Comedy’s treatment of the nature of philosophy. First, there is the question of the how to interpret the explicit doctrinal claims of the various speakers in the Divine Comedy. Purgatorio 16, for instance, introduces Marco the Lombard on the terrace of wrath. Marco’s speech to Dante’s pilgrim touches on a variety of philosophical subjects, including a refutation of astral determinism. But the culminating lines of his speech do little more than offer a brief summary of the political philosophy espoused in Convivio 4 and Monarchia. Specifically, Marco offers the following diagnosis of the cause of civil strife in the Italy of Dante’s day (Purg., 16.106–12):

Soleva Roma, che ’l buon mondo feo,
due soli aver, che l’una e l’altra strada
facean vedere, e del mondo e di Deo.
L’un l’altro ha spento, ed è giunta la spade
col pasturale, e l’un con l’altro insieme
per viva forza mal convien che vada
però che, giunti, l’un l’altro non teme.

[Rome, which made the good world,
used to have two suns that made visible
the two paths, of the world and of God.
One sun has extinguished the other,
and the sword is joined to the shepherd’s staff,
and it is ill for those two to be violently forced together,
for, joined, neither fears the other.]

Accordingly, read in light of the Convivio and the Monarchia, when Marco asserts in 16.91–96 that either a guide or reins are necessary to turn human appetite away from base pleasures so that the human being may be genuinely happy, we may understand Dante to be endorsing the view that the best case scenario for the cultivation of justice involves a unification of the political authority of the emperor, whose laws operate as “reins” on human desire, with the authority of the intrinsic “guidance” that philosophy provides in its concerns with matters of ethics.

Nevertheless, as straightforward as Marco’s speech seems to be at this juncture, the careful reader will keep in mind that the speaker may be undergoing penance because his own sense of devotion to justice fostered in him wrath towards others who did not share his values—and in an unjust world, this would mean that Marco’s love of valor [16.47] would have made charity difficult for him. In other words, even though it is true that Marco’s speech recapitulates key arguments of Convivio 4 and Monarchia, the dramatic context for the speech introduces some doubt as to whether we are meant to understand this speech as an unqualified endorsement for those positions. And, of course, this problem—the interpretive problem posed by the significance of the dramatic context for the various speeches in the Divine Comedy—is an inescapable feature of the hermeneutic framework within which philosophical (and theological) doctrines are offered for our consideration.

The second basic complication that hinders any straightforward assessment of the Divine Comedy’s treatment of the nature of philosophy is that Dante’s choice to deploy Beatrice as the ultimate and explicit guarantor of the veracity and salvific potential of the text invokes and transforms the meaning of his entire corpus of writings. That is, because Beatrice and donna gentile are simultaneously real women and yet also allegorical tropes as early as the Vita Nuova, the Divine Comedy’s reinvention of Beatrice calls upon the reader to return to Dante’s earlier texts while also hindering any clear sense of what those texts have to offer in terms of their claims on the reader’s interpretation of the Divine Comedy. Moreover, it must also be kept in mind that the Divine Comedy’s pilgrim is a fictionalized depiction of the same person who, relative to the setting of the Divine Comedy, had already written the Vita Nuova but had not yet begun writing the Convivio, the De vulgari eloquentia, and the Monarchia, and this also contributes to the strange relationship that the Divine Comedy constructs between itself and Dante’s prior writings. Indeed, a great deal of scholarly attention and debate has centered around a handful of passages in the Divine Comedy that may be considered palinodes to Vita Nuova and Convivio [see, for example, Freccero 1973; Hollander 1975, 1990; Jacoff, 1980; Pertile 1993; Scott 1990, 1991, 1995; Ascoli 1995; Dronke 1997; and Aleksander 2011a].

However, even if these two complications both hinder any straightforward assessment of the Divine Comedy’s understanding of the nature of philosophy, they permit a more modest conclusion about one of the fundamental features of the poem. That is, if it is safe to say that the dramatic context that unfolds in the relationship between Beatrice and the pilgrim troubles our attempts to understand the Divine Comedy’s treatment of philosophy, then it is nevertheless also safe to say that there is a philosophical lesson to be derived from the way in which the text troubles our attempts to understand it. In particular, even while the Divine Comedy explicitly defends the superiority of a contemplative path to salvation, nevertheless the poem also stimulates the will of the reader by confronting her with the unsettling realization that the doctrinal content defended in the poem’s explicitly philosophical register is to a certain extent illusory in its veracity and therefore of questionable value to the attempt to follow the intellectual path that is mapped out in that register. Fortunately, this illusory nature of the doctrinal content may be irrelevant to the way in which the reader’s engagement with the poem actually generates meaning through a process that does, in any case, always demand rigorous philosophical thinking. This is because the poem is structured by the conviction that there can be no hope of achieving any of our possible perfections without constantly exposing ourselves, especially in our shared activity of reading, to the anxious experience of wonder—an experience that is heightened and sustained by simultaneously striving for philosophical rigor and acknowledging it limitations.


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Other Internet Resources

Excellent resources for further study of Dante include the following:

  • The Dante Dartmouth Project offers a searchable full-text database containing more than seventy commentaries on the Divine Comedy.
  • The Dante Society of America’s Education and Outreach page includes examples of student writing, resources for secondary school teaching, bibliographies, and links to a variety of other resources.
  • Digital Dante hosted by Columbia University’s Department of Italian includes an online commentary by Teodolinda Barolini, a tool for visualizing intertextual references in the Divine Comedy, image and sound galleries, and a variety of primary sources, translations, and secondary sources.
  • The Princeton Dante Project offers searchable primary texts and translations of most of the texts of Dante’s corpus of writings as well as a multimedia gallery and a variety of secondary sources.

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