Influence of Arabic and Islamic Philosophy on the Latin West

First published Fri Sep 19, 2008; substantive revision Fri Jan 17, 2020

The Arabic-Latin translation movements in the Middle Ages, which paralleled that from Greek into Latin, led to the transformation of almost all philosophical disciplines in the medieval Latin world. The impact of Arabic philosophers such as al-Fārābī, Avicenna and Averroes on Western philosophy was particularly strong in natural philosophy, psychology and metaphysics, but also extended to logic and ethics.

Among the influential Arabic theories are: the logical distinction between first and second intentions; the intension and remission of elementary forms; the soul’s faculty of estimation and its object, the intentions; the conjunction between human intellect and separate active intellect; the unicity of the material intellect (Averroism); naturalistic theories of miracles and prophecy; the eternity of the world and the concept of eternal creation; the active intellect as giver of forms; the first cause as necessary being in itself; the emanation of intelligences from the first cause; the distinction between essence and existence; the theory of primary concepts; the concept of human happiness as resulting from perfect conjunction of the human intellect with the active intellect.

1. Transmission

Arabic Philosophy was known in the Latin West through translations, and, to a small degree, through personal contacts between Christians and Muslims, as in the case of Frederick II Hohenstaufen, who was directly acquainted with a number of Muslim scholars. A small number of Christian scholars, such as Ramón Martí and Ramón Llull, knew Arabic themselves and drew on Arabic sources when composing Latin works. Translations, however, were far more influential. The first Arabic-Latin translations to transport philosophical material into Latin Europe were the translations of texts on medicine and natural philosophy produced towards the end of the eleventh century in Italy, most of them by the translator Constantine the African, who, in contrast to later translators, tried to disguise the Arabic origin of his texts (Burnett 2006, 22–24). In Spain, in the first half of the twelfth century, several important astrological texts were translated, such as Albumasar’s Great Introduction to Astrology, which incorporated much material of the Aristotelian tradition (Lemay 1962).

The translations of philosophical texts proper, such as by al-Kindī, by the anonymous author of the Liber de causis, by al-Fārābī, Isaac Israeli, al-Ghazālī and Avicenna, but also of Greek works transmitted in Arabic, assumed full pace in Toledo in the second half of the twelfth century, where two very prolific translators worked: Gerard of Cremona and Dominicus Gundisalvi. It is likely that al-Fārābī’s treatise Enumeration of the Sciences, translated twice, by Gerard and Gundisalvi, served as a model for a coherent translation program. An indication of this is that later Toledan translators such as Alfred of Shareshill, Michael Scot and Hermannus Alemannus filled in gaps in al-Fārābī’s list of disciplines which the earlier translators had not covered (Burnett 2001). The translation movement was also influenced by the philosophical preferences of Jewish scholars. Gundisalvi worked together with the Jewish scholar Avendauth when translating Avicenna’s De anima, which Avendauth had recommended for translation, and Gundisalvi’s other translations may also go back to such recommendations. The impressive Spanish translation movement was motivated and fostered by several factors: the personal interest of individual translators; the demand for scientific texts by the French schools; the availability of Arabic manuscripts in cities newly conquered by the Christians; the patronage of the archbishop of Toledo; and by clerical interests in promoting Latin scientific culture in an Arabic-speaking Christian environment (Hasse 2006, 79–84).

The next important phase of the transmission were the translations made in Sicily and southern Italy by several translators associated with the Hohenstaufen or the papal court, the most productive of which were the Averroes translators Michael Scot and William of Luna. It was only about thirty years after Averroes’ death in 1198 that Latin Averroes translations became available in the newly developing universities (Gauthier 1982b). In 1255, the statutes of the Parisian arts faculty declared all known works of Aristotle mandatory reading for the students – a very influential move, which much contributed to the rise of Averroes’ commentaries as the principal secondary literature of Latin university culture.

After about 1300, Arabic-Latin translation activities ceased almost entirely, to resume again after 1480. The Renaissance translations were mostly produced by Italian Jews from Hebrew versions of Arabic texts, an exception being Andrea Alpago’s Avicenna translations from Arabic, which were produced in Damascus (Tamani 1992; Burnett 1999; Hasse 2016, ch. 3). The social context of these translations was the vibrant philosophical culture of Italian universities and especially of Padua, and the patronage of Italian scholars belonging to the Italian nobility, who had been educated in these universities. The impact of these Renaissance translations, which is weaker than that of the medieval translations, remains largely unexplored. It has aleady been shown that the new translations influenced the logical and zoological discussions of the sixteenth century (Perfetti 2000, 106–109; Perfetti 2004, XVII–XVIII; Burnett 2013). In the second half of the sixteenth century, interest in Arabic philosophy and sciences declined, and with it the Arabic-(Hebrew-)Latin translation movement. At the same time, the new academic study of Arabic culture developed, which was motivated primarily by historical and philological, but not by philosophical interests. From the seventeenth century onwards, translations into vernacular languages gradually replaced Latin translations from Arabic (Bobzin 1992).

The corpus of Arabic philosophical texts translated into Latin was substantial: A recent publication lists 131 textual items (Burnett 2005; see Kischlat 2000, 53–54, 196–198 for manuscript distribution; on Avicenna translations see Bertolacci 2011 and 2013b; on translator attribution see Hasse & Büttner 2018). The introduction of Arabic philosophy into Latin Europe led to the transformation of almost all philosophical disciplines. The influence is particularly dominant in natural philosophy, psychology and metaphysics, but is also felt in logic and ethics. The Arabic impact is particularly strong in the thirteenth century, but some Arabic traditions, such as Averroes’ intellect theory, reach the high point of their influence in Latin Europe as late as around 1500 (The influence of Jewish philosophers writing in Arabic, such as Ibn Gabirol and Maimonides, is not covered in this article).

2. Division of the Sciences

Arabic divisions of the sciences influenced the Latin West mainly through Dominicus Gundisalvi’ treatise Division of Philosophy (De divisione philosophiae). In this text, Gundisalvi reuses much material from his own abbreviating translation of al-Fārābī’s Enumeration of the Sciences (Iḥṣāʾ al-ʿulūm), of which a second, more literal translation was produced by Gerard of Cremona. But it was Gundisalvi’s own Arabicized treatise which was the main channel of al-Fārābī’s influence. The mostly anonymous introductory literature for artes students of the thirteenth century draws amply on Gundisalvi’s treatise, sometimes referring to Gundisalvi as “Alpharabius” (Lafleur 1988, 341n). The translator Michael Scot also writes his own Division of philosophy, in which he adopts substantial material from Gundisalvi, but arranges it according to his own scheme (Burnett 1997).

Gundisalvi adopts central principles for the division of the sciences from Avicenna: that the principal criterion of division between the sciences is their subject matter; that a science cannot demonstrate the existence of its own subject matter; and that there are two kinds of subordination of a science: either as a part (pars) of another science, when it studies a part of its subject matter, or as a species (species) of another science, when it studies the subject matter in a specific respect (Hugonnard-Roche 1984; Fidora & Werner 2007, 24–35).

Al-Fārābī’s influence is particularly obvious in the enumeration of the seven parts of grammar, the eight parts of natural science (covering the spectrum of Aristotle’s libri naturales), and the seven parts of mathematics: arithmetic, music, geometry, optics, astrology, astronomy, the science of weights, the science of technical devices (ingenia) (see the tables in Bouyges 1923, 65–69). As to the discipline of logic, Gundisalvi explicitly embraces al-Fārābī’s division into eight parts, following the tradition which makes Aristotle’s Rhetoric and Poetic parts of logic. The Farabian division of logic into eight parts reappears, for example, in Roger Bacon (Maierù 1987) and in Arnoul de Provence’s Division of the Sciences (ca. 1250); Arnoul remarks that neither Aristotle nor common usage includes Rhetoric and Poetic among the parts of logic (Lafleur 1988, 342). Gundisalvi further distinguishes with al-Fārābī between five kinds of syllogistic reasoning, of which demonstration is the highest. Al-Fārābī’s emphasis on demonstration as the pivotal means for the acquisition of certain knowledge is an important innovation of Arabic philosophy, which reached the Latin West via Gundisalvi (Fidora 2007).

The influence of al-Fārābī’s Enumeration of the Sciences extends also to specific areas such as music (Farmer 1934, 31–34). In general, al-Fārābī’s and Gundisalvi’s works were instrumental in disseminating a systematic division of the sciences which integrated the full range of Aristotle’s works and a broad spectrum of sciences, many of which were new to the Latin West (Burnett 2011).

3. Logic

The Arabic influence in logic is thinner than in other disciplines (apart from ethics), because only a few works of Arabic logic were translated into Latin. The most influential translations were the Isagoge part of Avicenna’s summa The Healing (al-Shifāʾ) and al-Ghazālī’s Intentions of the Philosophers, the first part of which is a reworking of Avicennian logic. Ramón Llull produced an Arabic compendium of al-Ghazālī’s text, which he himself translated into Latin (Lohr 1965). To these sources one may add al-Fārābī’s Enumeration of the Sciences, which transmitted much material on logical disciplines. Hermannus Alemannus’ translation of Averroes’ commentary on the Poetics was important because it remained the only source on Aristotelian poetics available in the Middle Ages and had a rich manuscript transmission (for its influence on Petrarch’s negative judgement about Arabic poetry see Burnett 1997). Other translated texts remained largely uninfluential, such as William of Luna’s translations of five commentaries by Averroes on Aristotle’s logical works, or the Averroes translations made from Hebrew in the Renaissance. In sum, this means that the Latin West was not aware of the more innovative parts of Arabic logic, such as in syllogistics and modal logic (Street 2005).

Several particular doctrines of Arabic logic, however, were very influential. Among them was Avicenna’s theory of the subject matter of logic, with its related doctrine of first and second intentions. Avicenna’s basic claim is that logic deals with second-order concepts. This is discussed in the logic part of The Healing, but spelled out in technical vocabulary in the metaphysics part (Metaphysics I,2): “The subject matter of logic is the secondary intelligible concepts (al-maʿānī al-maʿqūla al-thāniyya, intentiones intellectae secundo), which depend on the primary intelligible concepts with respect to the manner by which one arrives through them at the unknown from the known”. In this sentence, “concept” (maʿnan) is rendered in Latin with the term intentio.

A brief note on this term is at place: In Arabic-Latin translation literature, intentio is very often used to render ma´nan, with the consequence that the term intentio took on a similarly broad semantic range as its Arabic counterpart. In the writings of Avicenna, maʿnan may mean “concept”, but also “meaning” of a word, or something “intelligible” by the intellect, or “perceptible” by estimation but not by the external senses (on estimation see section 5.1). In Averroes’ epistemology, the term maʿnan has a specific meaning as the object of memory and a broader meaning as the abstracted content of sensory, imaginative or intelligible forms (Black 1996, 166).

In Avicenna’s theory of logic, second intentions are defined as the properties of concepts which these concepts acquire when used in attaining knowledge, for example: being a subject or being a predicate, being a premise or being a syllogism. Avicenna thus confirms that logic has a proper subject matter, and hence becomes a full-fledged part of philosophy, and not only a tool for the philosophical disciplines (Sabra 1980, 752–753). Avicenna’s definition of logic appears already in Dominicus Gundisalvi (De divisione philosophiae 150). Further Latin writers to adopt Avicenna’s thesis that the subject matter of logic is second intentions are Roger Bacon and Thomas Aquinas, followed by many subsequent authors such as Pseudo-Robert Kilwardby, Radulphus Brito, Hervaeus Natalis, Peter Aureoli, Duns Scotus and William of Ockham (Knudsen 1982; Maierù 1987; Perler 1994).

It was a matter of dispute how first and second intentions differ, what they refer to and what their ontological status is, a dispute bordering on epistemology and the philosophy of mind. Important participants in this discussion are Roger Bacon, who defines intentions as intelligible species, that is, mental likenesses of things, and Hervaeus Natalis and Peter Aureoli, who (apart from disagreeing on many issues) both hold that intentions are neither identical with extramental things nor with qualities of the intellect; they have their own “intentional being” (esse intentionale), which is the result of a cognitive act (Perler 1994). This position was criticized both by nominalists and realists: the nominalist William of Ockham objected against the reification of intentions and held that intentions are always natural signs in the mind; second intentions are natural signs which signify other natural signs (Summa logicae I.12); the realist author Walter Burley rejects the idea of a special being of intentions and argues that second intentions are part of extramental reality (Knudsen 1982). Logic as the science of second intentions continued to be a philosophical topic well into the sixteenth century, especially among Thomists and Scotist authors.

4. Natural Philosophy

Natural philosophy is the field with the greatest number of Arabic-Latin translations. In this discipline, Arabic philosophers had been particularly active, and Latin philosophers were particularly interested. Arabic natural philosophy reached the Latin West earlier than the other philosophical disciplines. The medical and astrological translations of the late eleventh and early twelfth century transported much philosophical material of the Graeco-Arabic tradition to the Latin world. Under the influence of these Arabic sources, Latin authors of the twelfth century explained natural phenomena by recourse to the four elements, the four qualities, the four humours, the three spiritus (natural, spiritual, animal) and their organs, the localization of the soul’s faculties in different cavities of the brain, the distinction between the sublunar and the heavenly universe, the circular movement of the heavenly spheres, and by using Aristotelian concepts such as matter and form, action and passion, cause and effect. While many Latin writers of the twelfth century continued to understand nature in terms of the Latin Christian tradition, others, in the context of the so-called “school of Chartres”, such as William of Conches, Adelard of Bath, Hermann of Carinthia and Bernardus Silvestris, drew amply on the new medical and astrological sources, often combining them with the doctrines of Plato’s Timaeus (Burnett 1982, introduction; cf. also Lemay 1962). Sometimes they did this by openly dividing their presentation into a section according to the church fathers and a section according to the philosophers and natural scientists (physici), which integrated material from the Latin and Arabic philosophical traditions (e.g. the treatises Philosophia by William of Conches and De natura corporis et animae by William of St.-Thierry).

The influence of Arabic in natural philosophy in the later Middle Ages, that is, after the translations of Avicenna and Averroes, is particularly strong in psychology (section 5 below). But other disciplines, such as physics, cosmology, meteorology, or zoology, are also influenced by Arabic sources (see Mandosio 2018 on meteorology), in particular by Averroes’ commentaries and by his criticisms of Avicenna (listed in Cerami 2018). Several theses from Averroes’ long commentaries on Physics and De caelo influenced the history of medieval Latin physics and cosmology: the explanation of projectile motion (e.g. of a thrown stone) as the successive motion of the medium; the thesis that motion and time differ in reality, but only with respect to the numbering soul; and the theory that the heavenly sphere is in a place only accidentally, insofar as it moves around the earth at its center (Maier 1951; Wood 2010; Trifogli 2000; Trifogli 2010).

One issue on which Avicenna and Averroes disagreed was the “form of bodiliness” (ṣūra jismiyya, forma corporeitatis), which, Avicenna argued, is the common form of prime matter that underlies all individual bodily forms, whereas Averroes denied that the “form of corporeality” is a form in the category of substance; it is only an accident, to be identified with indeterminate three-dimensionality (Hyman 1965). Thomas Aquinas rejected the idea that prior to the intellective soul there exists a substantial form in matter (Summa theol. Ia q. 76 a. 4, a. 6). The Avicennian concept was adopted by others, such as Henry of Ghent and Duns Scotus, and thus served the theory of the plurality of substantial forms. That prime matter has its own actuality became a principle identifying the Franciscan party in the doctrinal struggles with the Dominicans. The discussion of the concept of forma corporeitatis continued well into the sixteenth century (Des Chene 2000, 81–93).

Three prominent topics of natural philosophy are here singled out for closer treatment: the eternity of the world, the persistence of elements in a compound and spontaneous generation.

4.1 Eternity of the World

The Greek theory of the eternity of the world was a challenge to the Christian world view, a challenge increased by the fact that the theory was supported by Arabic sources: by Avicenna, who combined it with a metaphysical concept of God as the “necessary being in itself”, which is the eternal efficient cause of the existence of the heavenly and sublunar world (see section 6.4 on the first cause), and by Averroes, who combined it with a conception of God as the prime mover, whose existence is proved in natural philosophy. In Giles of Rome’ Errors of the Philosophers, Avicenna and Averroes are accused of many “errors”, but the eternity of the world figures most prominently. Averroes, in particular, is attacked for opposing “even more vehemently than did the Philosopher (Aristotle) those who held that the world had had a beginning” (Giles of Rome 1944, 15). The eternity of the world and related theses were condemned as heretical in 1270 and 1277 by the Parisian bishop Étienne Tempier (art. 87, 90, 99, 184) (Piché 1999).

In the thirteenth century and beyond, the issue was widely discussed by the scholastics, who arrived at a variety of positions, but unanimously held that the world was created in time by God, which means that they never fully shared Avicenna’s or Averroes’ position. Many arguments of the scholastic discussion were drawn from Arabic authorities, in particular from Averroes’ long commentaries on De caelo and Physics and from Avicenna’s Metaphysics. First traces of Arabic influence can be found in Philip the Chancellor’s Summa de bono (dating 1225–8). Thomas of York, for instance, takes over Averroes’ exposition of the four principal views on the issue (Comm. magnum De caelo I.102; Dales 1990, 81). Passages drawn from Arabic texts were not only employed to defend, but also to attack the eternity thesis. One particularly often quoted argument comes from al-Ghazālī’s Intentions of the Philosophers: If the world was eternal, an infinite number of (immortal) souls would now exist, which is impossible (Dales 1990, 44, 256). Another very influential source of the Latin debate was Maimonides’ Guide for the Perplexed (II.13–28); Maimonides argued that both eternity and non-eternity are possible philosophically.

Thomas Aquinas’ Commentary on the Sentences (II, d.1 q.1 a.5) is a good example of the impact of Arabic sources. Among the arguments cited from Averroes in favour of eternity are that there is always another moment in time before a moment in time; that only motion can be the cause of a change from rest to motion; that if the world had a beginning, a vacuum would precede the world (Comm. magnum De caelo III.29, Comm. magnum Phys. VIII.8,9,11,15). Avicenna is cited by Thomas as holding that God’s will is unchangeable and never starts anew (an argument advanced also by Averroes), and that it is impossible that God precedes the world in duration, because this implies that time existed before the world and before movement (Metaphysics IX.1). These arguments clearly influenced Thomas’ conclusion that the eternity thesis is the most probable in philosophical terms. However, just like creation, eternity escapes full demonstration. From the standpoint of faith, the eternity of the world is false and heretical. In his treatise On the Eternity of the World, Thomas Aquinas, in contrast to most of his contemporaries, defends the possibility of an eternal creation, thus approaching the position of Avicenna and other Neoplatonic thinkers.

Positions on the eternity of the world by some masters of arts were in some cases very provocative. In the eyes of Siger of Brabant, the natural philosopher cannot but conclude that the world is eternally created, whereas the metaphysician concedes that God’s will is inscrutable and that hence there is no certainty about eternity or non-eternity (De aeternitate mundi; Quaest. in tertium De anima q.2). For Boethius of Dacia, the natural philosopher has to infer the eternity of movement from the principles of natural philosophy, but the metaphysician, even though he can demonstrate the existence of a first cause, is unable to demonstrate whether the world is coeternal with the first cause or non-eternal, given the inscrutability of God’s will (De aeternitate mundi). Both authors share the conviction that the natural philosopher is forced to conclude that the world is eternal, thus provoking theological opposition. The arguments for this conclusion were largely furnished by Arabic sources.

4.2 The Elements in a Compound

In the Latin West, Avicenna and Averroes were known as the principal adversaries on a much-discussed question of element theory, especially in the fourteenth century. Given that all physical substances (apart from the elements themselves) are mixtures of elements, how do the elements exist in them? (Maier 1952; Grant 1974, §77, Eichner 2005, 139–145). Avicenna’s answer is that the substantial forms of the elements remain unaltered when a compound is formed; only the qualities of the elements are altered and unite to a mean quality (qualitas media), or complexion (complexio). The complexion disposes the matter to receive the substantial form of the compound from the active intellect, the giver of forms (dator formarum) (The Healing: Physics I.10, On generation 6). The problem with this position, as many scholastics saw, is that several bodies are combined in one, which do not form a true mixture. Averroes rejects Avicenna’s theory and argues that the substantial forms of the elements are diminished in the compound (Comm. magnum De caelo III.67). The form of the compound is “composed” of the elementary forms (Comm. magnum Metaph. XII.22). In order not to violate Aristotle’s principle that substantial forms cannot be diminished or augmented (a man is not more man than another), Averroes argued that elementary forms are not substantial forms in the full sense.

A third influential alternative was proposed by Thomas Aquinas. Thomas argued that the substantial forms of the elements are destroyed and that only the qualities contribute to the mixture. Thomas shares Avicenna’s conviction that every form presupposes a certain material disposition, which is the mean quality characteristic of the compound. But he deviates from Avicenna in that the forms of the elements are not preserved; they are only virtually present in the compound, in that their powers survive (De mixtione elementorum, cf. Summa theol. Ia q. 76 a. 4). Thomas’ position found many adherents. Its problem is that physical bodies cannot truly be called mixtures of elements.

Avicenna’s theory of the permanence of substantial forms was often mentioned, but rarely accepted in the Latin West. Averroes’ position, that the elementary forms can be diminished and augmented, found many supporters, among them Henry of Ghent, Petrus Johannes Olivi, Richard of Middleton, John of Jandun and several members of the Merton school of the fourteenth century (Maier 1952, 36–46). Many authors accept Averroes’ position with modifications, especially by reinterpreting the thesis of the intension and remission of elementary forms. Henry Bate and Dietrich of Freiberg argue that the diminished forms assume the character of potential forms and thus join the matter of the compound; the form of the compound is a form added to these diminished forms. For Averroes, in contrast, the combination of the diminished forms was identical with the new form of the compound. In the Renaissance, the issue continued to be discussed. There was disagreement even among the followers of Averroes. Some, as Marcantonio Zimara, held that the form of the compound was added to the other forms, others, as Jacopo Zabarella, argued against such addition (Maier 1952, 46–69).

4.3 Spontaneous Generation

Spontaneous generation, that is, the generation of life without their being any parents, as when worms grow in decay, is a much discussed issue of medieval physics and metaphysics. The conflicting explanations of the phenomenon by Avicenna and Averroes much determined the Latin discussion until the sixteenth century. While Avicenna holds that spontaneous generation depends upon ever more refined mixtures of elementary qualities which trigger the emanation of forms from the active intellect, the giver of forms (The Healing: Meteorology II.6: On Floods), Averroes explains it with the influence of certain celestial constellations which actualize potential forms in water or earth. Avicenna and Averroes also disagree about the special case of the spontaneous generation of human beings, which Avicenna finds possible, whereas Averroes does not. For Averroes, all spontaneously created animals are not true, but abnormal, monstrous animals (Comm. magnum Metaph. II.15, VII.31, XII.13,18) (Bertolacci 2013a).

In the Latin West, Averroes’ explanation dominated the discussion for several centuries (Hasse 2007a). Thomas Aquinas argues that there is no need to assume the existence of an Avicennian giver of forms to explain spontaneous generation, since the celestial power suffices for producing ordinary animals from matter. More complex beings, however, such as horses and human beings, cannot be produced by the celestial power alone without the formative power of the semen (Quaest. de potentia, qu. 3 a. 8,9,11). Thomas’ position was called the media via by later authors, that is, the middle way between Avicenna and Averroes, since Thomas rejected Avicenna’s theory, but also modified Averroes’ position in treating spontaneous generation as a natural, and not a miraculous phenomenon.

Averroes’ theory of celestial influence and Thomas Aquinas’ media via became mainstream in the Latin middle ages. A few authors, however, followed Avicenna in allowing for the spontaneous generation of human beings, among them Albertus Magnus, Blasius of Parma, and, in the Renaissance, Pietro Pomponazzi, Paolo Ricci and Tiberio Russiliano. Pomponazzi makes the spontaneous generation of human beings dependent upon the conjunction of the superior planets Jupiter and Saturn, and thus introduces another Arabic theory into the discussion: Albumasar’s astrological theory of the great conjunctions (Nardi 1965).

A modified version of Avicenna’s theory of the giver of forms appears in John Buridan, who deviates from the dominant position that the form of human beings comes from without, i.e. from God, whereas that of animals is educed from matter. In contrast, Buridan holds that all forms are given by a separate incorporeal substance, which he calls God. The phenomenon of spontaneous generation supports this view, since it cannot be explained with the influence of the stars, which is too weak and imperfect to generate animals (In Metaphysicen Aristotelis lib. 8 q. 9). What does not appear in Buridan, is Avicenna’s theory of the subsequent mixtures of elementary qualities.

5. Psychology

In Latin psychology, the influence of Arabic works is particularly strong and lasted well into the sixteenth century. Avicenna and Averroes, the most influential philosophers, presented the West with a faculty psychology in the tradition of Aristotle and enriched by Graeco-Arabic medical doctrines, such as about the cavities of the brain, the nerves, and the spirits which transport information in the body. From about 1220 onwards, the full range of Avicennian faculties (vegetative, external and internal senses, the motive faculties, practical and theoretical intellect) appears in Latin treatises by masters of arts and theologians. This system of faculties remains, by and large, standard for a long time in philosophical handbooks, from the anonymous Philosophy of the Simple (Philosophia pauperum) and Vincent of Beauvais’ Mirror of Nature (Speculum naturale) in the thirteenth century up to the Philosophic Pearl (Margarita philosophica) of the 1490s. Also influential was Avicenna’s definition of the soul as a separate substance (Hasse 2008) and his thought experiment of the “Flying Man” (Hasse 2000, 80–92).

Averroes disagreed with Avicenna on a number of topics concerning faculty psychology, for example: on the organ and medium of touch, on the material or immaterial transmission of odors, and on whether human beings have an estimative faculty or not. These controversies were continued in the Latin tradition. The most influential pieces of psychological doctrine imported from the Arabs probably were Avicenna’s theory of estimation (wahm), his theory of potential, acquired and active intellects, and Averroes’ thesis that there is one intellect for all human beings.

5.1 Estimation

Avicenna had argued in his On the Soul (the De anima part of The Healing I.5 and IV.3) that human beings and animals share an internal sense called estimation (wahm, aestimatio), which perceives so-called “intentions” (maʿānin, intentiones) in an object, such as hostility and friendliness: The sheep perceives hostility in the wolf and judges that the wolf is to be fled from. The basic ingredients of this theory were adopted by many scholastic writers. There was disagreement, however, over several issues: Firstly, Averroes and Thomas Aquinas (in contrast to Avicenna, Albertus Magnus and others) argued that estimation existed in animals only, but not in human beings. To explain instinctive reactions in human beings, it is not necessary, they argue, to assume the existence of a faculty besides the cogitative faculty, or ratio particularis, as Thomas calls it (Summa theologiae Ia 81.3c). Secondly, scholastic writers were divided over whether the intentions are perceived in the object, as Avicenna and Thomas Aquinas say (cf. also John Blund, Tractatus de anima, ch. 19), or abstracted from sensory forms, as for instance Albertus Magnus and John Buridan argue (Albertus, De anima II.4.7; Buridan, Quaestiones de anima II.22) (Black 2000; Hasse 2000, 141–153; cf. also Black 2011). Thirdly, there was disagreement about the notion of “animal judgement” propagated by Avicenna. Nominalists such as Adam Wodeham argue that judgements always involve the formation of a complex sentence, which presupposes linguistic capabilities; animals, therefore, never truly judge (Perler 2006).

5.2 Active Intellect

Typical for Arabic intellect theory is the distinction between several degrees or levels of intellect, from an entirely potential intellect up to a perpetually active intellect, and the assumption, taken over from later Greek philosophers, that the active intellect is an entity separate from the human being. Al-Fārābī, Avicenna and Averroes identify the active intellect with the lowest of the cosmological intelligences, and argue that the human intellect is able to conjoin with the active intellect. The great majority of scholastic writers teach that potential and active intellect are parts of the soul, but there also existed a current adopting the Arabic idea of a separate active intellect (e.g. Dominicus Gundisalvi and Petrus Hispanus). Several scholastic authors identify the active intellect with God on the authority of Avicenna and Augustine – a position which modern scholars have labeled “Augustinisme avicennisant” (Gilson 1926/27, 102). Among the earliest exponents of the doctrine is Jean de la Rochelle, whose psychological works were written in the 1230s. He teaches that the term “active intellect” refers either to God or to the angels’ intellect or to the internal light of human beings, depending upon which intellectual objects are grasped by the human intellect (Summa de anima 116). This doctrine reappears in the 1240s in the Summa fratris Alexandri, and in Vincent of Beauvais. Later adherents are Roger Bacon, John Pecham, Roger Marston, Vital du Four, and also Henry of Ghent (though only in parts of his work). But other scholastics disagree. Adam of Buckfield, Bonaventure and Thomas Aquinas criticize unnamed theologians for identifying the active intellect with God. As philological evidence shows, they refer to the above-mentioned current which begins with Jean de la Rochelle. Thomas rejects the thesis because he interprets it in illuminationist terms and finds it incompatible with his own epistemology of abstraction (Summa contra gentiles II.74). One should note, however, that Avicenna’s epistemology combines both abstractionist and emanationist aspects and that his theory of abstraction also attracted Latin readers (Hasse 2001, but cf. McGinnis 2007, and Black 2014).

5.3 The Four Intellects

Avicenna distinguishes four different states of the human intellect, which are not different faculties of the soul, but different phases of intellection: three potential intellects, called material, in habitu, in effectu, and one actually thinking intellect, the “acquired intellect” (al-ʿaql al-mustafād, intellectus adeptus). The first potential intellect is pure potentiality to know anything; the second potential intellect knows axioms such as “The whole is bigger than the part”; the third has already acquired conclusions through syllogistic reasoning and the intuition of middle terms, but does not consider them at the moment; the “acquired intellect” comes about when the human intellect connects with the active intellect (De anima I.5). This theory exerted a profound influence on scholastic intellect theory, especially in the period from Dominicus Gundisalvi to Albertus Magnus. The scholastics inherited from Avicenna the principal idea that the activity of the human intellect can be differentiated into different phases of gradual development and into different acts of syllogistic reasoning (Hasse 2000, ch. II.6).

An important step in the reception of the doctrine is the anonymous treatise De anima et de potentiis eius by a Parisian master of arts of ca. 1225 (Gauthier 1982a, 53). This author adopts from Avicenna the first three levels of intellect, the first being pure potentiality, the second knowing first propositions, the third conclusions, and combines it with teachings from Aristotle’s Posterior Analytics (I.3 and II.19) about the intellect knowing axioms and principles. Jean de la Rochelle continues this line and calls the second intellect intellectus principiorum, the third intellectus conclusionum, and uses a Boethian term for the axioms of the second intellect: “common notion of the mind” (communis animi conceptio), thus combining the Avicennian doctrine with Latin axiomatic theory (Tractatus de divisione multiplici potentiarum animae II.18).

In the writings of Albertus Magnus, the influence of Avicenna is combined with that of Averroes, who distinguishes two intellects apart from the separate active intellect: the material intellect, which is pure potentiality (and unique, see section 5.4 below) and the speculative intellect, which is the actuality of the grasped intelligible. Averroes and Avicenna both teach that the human and active intellect conjoin in the moment of intellection. Averroes, in particular, claims that a perfect conjunction with the active intellect results in God-like knowledge and that such a conjunction is possible in this life (Comm. magnum De anima III.5 and III.36).

Albertus Magnus, in his early De homine (qu. 56 a. 3), adopts the Avicennian doctrine of three potential intellects in his scholastic reformulation, but in his later works, under the influence of Averroes, transforms it into a theory of intellectual ascension. The highest level of the human intellect is called “acquired intellect” (intellectus adeptus) and results from the conjunction between the potential and the active intellect, both parts of the human soul. In this stage, the intellect is able to grasp all intellectual knowledge, and does not need to have recourse to the senses again. In virtue of this intellect, a human being becomes God-like (De anima 3.3.11) (de Libera 2005, 325–327). Thomas Aquinas sharply disagrees. The intellect can never dispense with the senses, since it needs the phantasms for conceiving an intellectual form. This is why perfect intellectual knowledge is not possible in this life (Summa theol. Ia q. 84 a. 7).

5.4 Averroes’ Unicity Thesis

Averroes’ best known philosophical doctrine holds that there is only one intellect for all human beings. The doctrine is sometimes labelled “monopsychism”, but this is a problematic term, since Averroes’ unicity thesis concerns the intellect, not the soul. Averroes’ theory has an epistemological and an ontological purpose. On the one hand, Averroes wants to explain how universal intelligibles can be known, on the other hand, he wants to account for Aristotle’s claim that the intellect is pure potentiality and unmixed with the body (Comm. magnum De anima III.5). Many scholastic readers were troubled by the problem of whether the material (or potential) intellect, if it is one, can be the form of the body. This problem was not directly addressed by Averroes himself, but by many of his Latin partisans.

Modern scholarship is still divided about the significance of the current of Averroism in the thirteenth century (for the more recent discussion see Imbach 1991; Hayoun/de Libera 1991; Bianchi 1993; Niewöhner/Sturlese 1994; Kuksewicz 1997; Brenet 2003, 21–22; Coccia 2005, 20–53; Hasse 2007b; Martin 2007; Calma 2010, 11–20, 367–373; Martin 2013; Akasoy & Giglioni 2013). It was argued, for instance, that the “radical Aristotelians” of the thirteenth century were not “Averroists” in a strict sense (Van Steenberghen 1974, 531–534). But that much is clear: there existed at least four groups of authors who explicitly adopted the unicity thesis in one of their writings: Siger of Brabant and possibly other masters of arts in later thirteenth-century Paris; a second Parisian group in the early fourteenth century around Thomas Wilton, John of Jandun and John Baconthorpe; several Italian masters of arts at Bologna university in the fourteenth century; and a larger group of authors in Renaissance Italy and especially in Padua.

When the medievals used the Latin term averroista, they referred to authors belonging to these groups. The term averroista came into use in the later thirteenth century, but on rare occasions. The first appearance, as we can see today, is in Thomas Aquinas’ treatise On the Unicity of the Intellect (De unitate intellectus). The additional title phrase contra averroistas appears only in the later manuscript tradition and is unlikely to be authentic. It was in the decades around 1500 that the term was used most frequently. Averroistae were associated mainly with the unicity thesis, but also with theories about the eternity of the world, God’s knowledge of the world, prime matter and happiness (Kuksewicz 1997, 93–96; Calma 2010). In the Renaissance, averroista was also used, with a positive connotation, to refer to experts on Averroes (Martin 2007; Martin 2013). A sensible historiographical usage of the term “Averroism” should be tied to the medieval and Renaissance usages. In particular, two senses of the term “Averroism” seem historically legitimate: as meaning a current of followers of Averroes who hold theologically controversional doctrines, or as meaning a current of experts on Averroes. The first sense has a longer tradition in the Middle Ages and in modern scholarship and is therefore to be preferred generally. Some modern historians use the term “Averroism” in a much broader sense for all influences of Averroes’ thought (e.g. Gauthier 1982, 334–335; Calma 2010, 368–369); so-called “Averroisms” would then be found, for instance, in almost all Latin Aristotle commentaries of the later Middle Ages. This usage, however, ignores the historical roots of the meaning of the term.

Siger of Brabant (d. 1284) and John of Jandun (d. 1328) were the best known and most influential Averroists. Siger, in his first and most explicitly Averroistic work on the soul, argues that the separate and eternal intellect is united to the body only in an operational union and that the true form of the body is the sensitive soul (Quaest. in tertium de anima, esp. q. 3 and 9). Under the influence of Thomas Aquinas and others, Siger later revised his position. For John of Jandun, the intellective soul, which in itself is one and separate, operates within the body. It is united to the body only through the assistance of the phantasmata (Brenet 2003). The Renaissance Averroists Agostino Nifo and Luca Prassicio argued that Siger and John of Jandun professed conflicting views: they interpreted Siger as holding that the unique intellect can be united to the body as form and John of Jandun that it cannot. Another influential Averroist was John Baconthorpe (d. 1345/48): He developed the theory of the so-called “double conjunction” (copulatio bifaria) between intellect and bodily phantasms: one epistemological, one ontological. The ontological conjunction presupposes a union of unique intellect and human being in a way that the intellect becomes a human faculty (Etzwiler 1971, 266–269). Among the most explicit and outspoken Averroists of the Renaissance were Nicoletto Vernia (d. 1499) and Luca Prassicio (d. 1533). The unicity thesis was successful among Latin authors not only because Averroes as the commentator had become an exceptional authority of university education, but also because it was attractive philosophically: it explained the possibility of the knowledge of universals and it ensured that the intellective soul, as demanded by Aristotle (De anima III.4, 429a22–25), was not mixed with the body.

The unicity thesis was included among the doctrines condemned in 1270 and 1277 in Paris (art. 32) and in 1489 in Padua by the local bishops. From a theological vantage point, its main drawback was its conflict with the doctrine of individual immortality. The principal philosophical counter-argument, first presented by Averroes himself (Comm. magnum De anima, 393) and powerfully formulated by Thomas Aquinas, was that the unicity thesis could not account for the fact that “this individual man thinks”, as Thomas puts it (“hic homo singularis intelligit”, De unitate intellectus III) (Black 2004). The standard reply by Averroes and his followers was that the intelligible form is joined to the individual human being through the actualized imaginative form, which is particular. This way, individual knowledge of universal forms is possible.

The decades around 1500 saw the high tide of the Averroist current, as far as we can discern today (Schmitt 1979; Akasoy & Giglioni 2013). This is indicated by several pieces of evidence: the frequent usage of the term averroista; the significant number of authors who adopt the unicity thesis in one of their works; the composition of super-commentaries on Averroes’ commentaries; and, finally, the fact that the correct interpretation of Averroes’ philosophical position became a matter of dispute among his partisans (e.g. between Nifo, Trombetta, Zimara, Pomponazzi and Prassicio). The unicity thesis lost its appeal as late as in the middle of the sixteenth century, with the advent of new trends of Aristotelianism that gave alternative explanations of universal intellection (e.g. by Melanchthon, Zabarella and Suarez) (Hasse 2016, ch. 5).

5.5 Naturalistic Theories of Prophecy

The philosophical interpretation of prophecy and miracles is a typical feature of Arabic philosophy. The Latin West was not acquainted with al-Fārābī’s concept of the philosopher-prophet, the leader of the excellent city, but with parts of al-Kindī’s and Avicenna’s theories. The general line of Avicenna’s naturalistic theory of prophecy, which describes prophecy as resulting from extraordinary faculties of the soul, was criticized by Thomas Aquinas. Thomas admits that there is also “natural prophecy” which results from the contact of human imagination and intellect with the celestial bodies and angels, but “divine prophecy” is entirely dependent upon God, and not upon the preparedness of the human soul (Quaest. de veritate, q. 12, a. 1 and 3).

Among the specifics of prophecy theory, the working of miracles received most attention in the Latin West. al-Kindī’s and Avicenna’s explanation of miracles is naturalistic in the sense that neither theory involves divine factors. al-Kindī argues in On Rays (De radiis, extant only in Latin) that if a person conceives a corporeal image in his imagination, the image assumes a material existence in the spiritus that belongs to the faculty. The spiritus in turn sends out rays, which alter objects in the external world (d’Alverny & Hudry 1975, 230–1). An alternative to this extramission theory is formulated by Avicenna, who claims that persons who have perfected their body and soul are able to affect directly the external matter of the world and may produce rain, fertile seasons, and the like – by sheer power of the will. Avicenna arrives at this conclusion by generalizing the principle that there are psychic causes for material effects (De anima IV.4).

Albertus Magnus rejects Avicenna’s long-distance theory because it breaks with the Aristotelian rule that there is no efficient causation without material contact (De sensu et sensato 1.10). Thomas Aquinas follows a third alternative: that psychic powers can move the intervening medium, and so indirectly act on external objects, which explains the damage caused by an evil eye. Thomas borrows from a passage in Aristotle’s On Dreams, in which air is moved and affected by the eyes of menstruating women (459b23–60a24). True miracles, however, are always produced by God (Summa theol. Ia q.117 a. 3). In the later Middle Ages, the Aristotelian theory of the movable medium proved more successful than the extramission and action-at-a-distance theories of al-Kindī and Avicenna. An exception is Roger Bacon, who teaches that some persons are able to send out “powers, forms, and heat” in order to alter bodies outside. Bacon employs al-Kindī’s theory of extramission in order to explain magic as a purely natural phenomenon (in De secretis operibus artis et naturae).

The high time for Arabic theories of miracles came in the Renaissance (Hasse 2007c, 121–125). Marsilio Ficino in his Platonic Theology (Theologia platonica XIII.4.8–9) explains long-distance effects such as the evil eye with an extramission model reminiscent of al-Kindī: The evil eye is explained with vapors being emitted from the sorcerer’s eyes which reach and afflict the victim. True miracles, however, cannot be achieved without God’s assistence. Andrea Cattani (d. 1506) explicitly adopts Avicenna’s theory that noble souls are able to influence the external world without mediation, but ties this extraordinary capacity to inspiration by the Holy Ghost. Such reservations do not appear in adoption of the theory by Pietro Bairo (d. 1558). Pietro Pomponazzi (d. 1525) discusses Avicenna’s position, but favours an extramission theory: He explains a contemporary miracle in the town of Aquila with the transmission of vapors which are issued from the eyes of the observers (in De naturalium effectuum causis sive de incantationibus, 237–8).

6. Metaphysics

The two most important Arabic sources of medieval Latin metaphysics are the metaphysics part (Ilāhiyyāt) of Avicenna’s philosophical summa The Healing (al-Shifāʾ), here referred to as his Metaphysics (Hasse & Bertolacci 2012) and Averroes’ Long Commentary on the Metaphysics (Bertolacci 2009). Avicenna’s treatise presented metaphysics as a fully systematic discipline and combined Aristotelian and Neoplatonic traditions. Averroes’ commentary proved an indispensable tool for understanding Aristotle’s text and offered an alternative to Avicenna’s position on several important issues. Al-Ghazālī’s Intentions of the Philosophers also contributed much to the dissemination of Avicennian metaphysics in the Latin West (Minnema 2014; Minnema 2017). Another very influential text was the Discourse on the Pure Good (Kalām fī maḥḍ al-khayr, Liber de pura bonitate), known in Latin also as The Book of Causes (Liber de causis). The anonymous Arabic author of the treatise rearranged passages from Proclus’ Elements of Theology from a monotheistic, creationist and Plotinian perspective, and combined them with doctrines from Plotinian and Aristotelian sources. In 1255, the Latin text became part of the required curriculum of study in the Faculty of Arts in Paris, together with the works of Aristotle, with the effect that the text received many commentaries and enjoyed an extraordinary transmission in more than 237 manuscripts (Taylor 1983). The Liber de causis was long considered to be an authentic text by Aristotle. When William of Moerbeke in 1268 translated Proclus’ Elements of Theology into Latin, Thomas Aquinas was able to identify Proclus as the main source of the text. The Liber de causis remained popular, however. At least 74 commentaries from the twelfth to fifteenth centuries testify to its great influence (d’Ancona Costa 1995, 195–258; Fidora/Niederberger 2001, 205–247; Calma 2016, I, 20–21).

6.1 The Subject of Metaphysics

It was well known among the scholastics that Avicenna and Averroes disagreed about the subject matter of metaphysics. In the two opening chapters of his Metaphysics, Avicenna argues that no science can demonstrate the existence of its proper subject, and that hence God, whose existence is proven in metaphysics, cannot be its proper subject. The subject (mawḍūʿ, subiectum) of metaphysics is being as being. What is sought after (maṭlūb, quaesitum) in metaphysics, is that which unconditionally accompanies being: such as the causes of being, among which God is the first. Averroes countered that the existence of the first principle cannot be demonstrated in metaphysics, since such a proof can only begin with God’s effects and with movement in particular. This is why the proof of God belongs to physics. The subject matter of metaphysics is separable beings, among which counts God, as Averroes argues in the Long Commentary on the Physics (ch. I.83, but in other works he assigns this function to being as being; see Bertolacci 2007).

Most scholastic authors favoured Avicenna’s position over Averroes’s, but within this mainstream position there was disagreement about the manner in which God relates to the subject of metaphysics, being as being. Albertus Magnus defends Avicenna against Averroes’ criticism. Being as being is the subject of metaphysics, whereas the divisions and accidents (passiones) of being are what is sought after, among them God and the separate divine beings (Metaph. I.2, Phys. I.3.18). Thomas Aquinas’ position is again much influenced by Avicenna: The subject of metaphysics is being as being (or ens commune), whereas God is that which is aimed at in this science, insofar as he is the cause of all being (In Metaph., prooem.). But, other than Avicenna, Thomas argues that God is the proper subject of a different science, the principles of which are given in revelation: theology (Summa theol. Ia q.1).

There were three principal positions on the issue in the Latin West (Zimmermann 1998): Albertus and Thomas make God a subject of metaphysics only as cause of the subject; a second group, among them Roger Bacon and Giles of Rome, holds that God is one of several subjects of metaphysics; a third group argues that God is part of the subject of metaphysics. The latter position was influentially formulated by Henry of Ghent (Pickavé 2007), and taken up by many other authors, among them Duns Scotus. Scotus develops his own standpoint against the authorities of Avicenna, Averroes and Henry of Ghent. He agrees with Avicenna that being as being is the subject and that the notion of being includes all being, be it material or immaterial. For Scotus, this notion of being explicitly includes God within the subject of metaphysics (Zimmermann 1998, 294–329).

6.2 Primary Concepts

In chapter I.5 of his Metaphysics, Avicenna argues that just as there are first and self-evident sentences, there are also fundamental, first known, self-evident concepts, which are common to all beings: “the existent”, “the thing”, “the necessary”. It was due to Avicenna that the primum cognitum, the first object of knowledge became a central topic of medieval Latin metaphysics. The question of the primum cognitum was variously answered. For Guibert of Tournai, Bonaventure and Henry of Ghent, God is the primum cognitum (Goris 1999), for Thomas Aquinas and Duns Scotus being (ens), for Berthold of Moosburg the good (bonum). An example of a primum cognitum theory influenced by Avicenna is Thomas Aquinas’. There cannot be an infinite regress, neither in the order of demonstration, nor in the order of definition, Thomas argues. This is why there is a first concept: “being”. It is what is first grasped by the mind, and it is unrestrictedly universal. It is specific for Thomas, however, that the order of definition and of demonstration are not on the same level. The principle of contradiction rests (fundatur) on a conceptual basis, since it can be reduced to the terms out of which it is composed, among which “being” is the first (In Metaph. IV.6; Aertsen 1996, 146–151).

Avicenna’s theory of primary concepts was an important source for the theory of transcendental concepts, which scholastic philosophers developed in the thirteenth century, taking their cue from Aristotle, Avicenna and the Dionysian tradition (Aertsen 2008; Aertsen 2012; Pini 2012). Avicenna bequeathed to the discussion of the transcendentals not only specific teachings about the notions “being”, “one” and “thing”, but also the general idea that, ontologically, the primary concepts are most common since they are true of everything, and that, epistemologically, they are first known since they are self-evident and not reducable to prior concepts.

6.3 Essence and Existence, Universals and Individuals

Among the most influential philosophical doctrines of Arabic origin is the distinction between essence (māhiyya, essentia) and existence (wujūd, ens), which the Latin West got to know from Avicenna’s Metaphysics, chapters I.5 and V.1–2. The distinction was very influential historically: it found adherents among philosophers and theologians of the Arabic, Hebrew and Latin cultures. The essence-existence distinction was used by Avicenna in several metaphysical contexts, i.e., in the discussion of primary concepts, of universals and of the first cause. The following presentation focuses on the context of universals. Avicenna’s core idea was to differentiate between two components of universals: essence and universality. The essence of “horseness”, to use Avicenna’s example (Metaphysics V.1), is in itself neither universal nor particular. Only existence, which in itself is distinct from essence, adds universality or particularity, depending upon whether “horseness” exists in the mind, that is, as a universal, or in the exernal world, that is, as a particular. In some of his writings, Avicenna emphasizes that there is universality only if the essence is found in several objects in the external world (Marmura 1979, 49).

Thomas Aquinas adopts Avicenna’s distinction already in his early On Being and Essence (De ente et essentia IV). Essence can be considered either in itself or with respect to its existence in the soul or in the particular things. Universality and particularity are accidents of essence, which in itself is neither universal nor particular. Thomas Aquins adopts the expression “accidents of essence” from Averroes (Comm. magnum Metaph. IV.3). The universal, according to Thomas, is a natura communis, which has existence only in the intellect. Individuals are essences individuated by matter with quantitative dimensions, but only at the time of their origin; later individuation is due to the form. In later writings, Thomas develops his concept of essence and existence so that existence is that which actualizes essence (Summa theol. Ia q. 3 a. 4) (Wippel 1990; Black 1999).

An influential defender of the real distinction between essence and existence was Giles of Rome. Since he uses the terminology of “thing” (res) for both concepts, he was criticized for turning “existence” into a thing, which itself exists only if another thing “existence” is added, and so on ad infinitum. This argument was voiced against the real distinction by Siger of Brabant and Godfrey of Fontaines (Wippel 1982), but it originally comes from Averroes, who flatly rejects Avicenna’s distinction in his Long Commentary on the Metaphysics (IV.3).

While some authors take the extreme position that there is only a mental distinction between essence and existence, Henry of Ghent develops a modified version of Avicenna’s theory. He distinguishes between essence in itself and as existing, that is, existing in the mind or in the external world. But he attributes a specific kind of existence to the essence in itself (Quodlibet I, 9 and III, 9): esse essentiae (“essential being”), which is the essence’s eternal relation to God as its cause. The esse existentiae, in contrast, is the essence’s actual existence. Henry thus develops a theory of how essences exist prior to their actual existence in the mind or in the world, enlarging on a brief and tentative reference in Avicenna’s Metaphysics I.5 to the “proper existence” (esse proprium) of the essences.

Duns Scotus is also inspired by the Avicennian idea that the common nature (natura communis), as Scotus calls it, is neither truly universal nor truly particular in itself and that it is universal only as an object of the intellect. But Scotus’ account of individuation differs: The common nature is particular only because of a second “reality” in the object, a principle of individuation or contracting difference, which by later authors was called haecceitas (“thisness”). The distinction between the two “realities” nature and thisness is not real, but formal in the sense that the two are different, but never exist apart from each other (Ordinatio II, d. 3, p. 1, q. 6).

The influence of Arabic metaphysics is much more extensive than these brief references to a few well-known thinkers suggest. The influence of Avicenna and Averroes, especially on the subject of metaphysics and on essence and existence, extends to many authors and over many centuries, up to sixteenth-century Jesuit authors such as Benedictus Pereira, Pedro da Fonseca and Francisco Suárez (Leinsle 1985, ch. 2)

6.4 The First Cause and the Emanation of the Intelligences

The influence of Avicenna’s concept of the first cause as the only necessary being in itself (wājib al-wujūd bi-ḏātihī, necesse esse per se) and of his theory of emanation is apparent already in the twelfth century. Dominicus Gundisalvi, the Avicenna translator, distinguishes in his Procession of the World (De processione mundi) between the first cause, which is the “necessary being” (necesse esse), and the created beings, which in themselves are only possible beings. The entire universe proceeds from the first cause. The principles first created, however, are not the intelligences, as in Avicenna’s metaphysics, but the material and formal principles of the things (Jolivet 1988, 138–140; Polloni 2017, 532–538).

The anonymous author of The Book of First and Second Causes (Liber de causis primis et secundis), which dates from the turn of the thirteenth century, does not adopt the distinction between necessary and possible beings, but describes the process of emanation in strongly Avicennian terms: From the first cause issues a first created being, an intellect. From this intellect, in turn, emanates a series of intelligences, the lowest of which is the active intellect. Emanation happens in triads: From an intelligence emanates, in virtue of its intellectual activity, the form of a celestial sphere, the body of a sphere, and another intelligence (ch. 4). The anonymous author also draws on the Book of Causes (see the beginning of section 6 above), for instance when describing the hierarchy of intelligences as a decrease in power and unity (ch. 6).

William of Auvergne (d. 1249) is much attracted by Arabic metaphysical and pyschological theories (which he often indiscriminately attributes to “Aristotle and his followers”) and discusses them at length, but often rejects them in the end as conflicting with Christian faith. In On the Universe (De universo II.1), William discusses and rejects the Avicennian emanation system: the necessity of causation through the first cause; the emanation of the intelligences from the first intelligence down to the active intellect; the active intellect as the efficient cause of human souls. He nevertheless tacitly adopts the metaphysical principle “From one arises only one” (de uno non nisi unum) from Avicenna (Teske 1993), in particular within the context of Trinitarian theology (Fischer 2015), and describes the first cause as the “being necessary through itself” (Teske 2002, Fischer 2018).

Thomas Aquinas adopts from Avicenna the description of God as the necessary being, whose essence is its own existence (Summa contra gentiles I.22). Avicenna’s influence is also apparent in a well-known passage: the “five ways” (quinque viae) of proving God’s existence in the Summa theologiae (Ia q. 2 a. 3). The third proof advances via “the possible and the necessary”: It establishes the existence of something necessary in virtue of itself. The proof is much coloured by Avicennian metaphysics, but its direct source is Maimonides’ Guide for the Perplexed (II.1), from which it deviates only in minor respects. A conspicuous element of Maimonides’ and Thomas’ proof is the premise, not explicitly formulated by Avicenna, that, in an eternal world, every possibility is eventually realized, which is a version of the so-called “principle of plenitude” (Davidson 1987, 378–388). Thomas, however, rejects the Avicennian theory of emanation. The creation of the world is not a necessary process, and it does not occur through intermediaries, that is, intelligences or angels. He also rejects Avicenna’s theory of a separate active intellect as the giver of the forms of the sublunar world and as the ontological place of the intelligibles, a theory against which Thomas advances epistemological arguments in the first place (Summa contra gentiles II.42 and II.76). Albertus Magnus, in contrast, tacitly adopts much of the dator formarum theory in several of his writings, even though he often voices his criticism of it (Hasse 2012).

The attraction of Avicenna’s position is evident in the work of Siger of Brabant. In some of his writings, Siger teaches that God as the first being creates only one being immediately, the first immaterial substance, from which emanate the other intelligences, the celestial spheres and finally the sublunar world, in an eternal and necessary process. The necessity is not universal, however, but finds its limits in the contingency and in the free will which exists in the sublunar world (De necessitate et contingentia causarum; Van Steenberghen 1991, 346). Duns Scotus, in contrast, is very critical of Avicenna’s theory of necessary causation through the first cause. He advances several reasons against it, the most important being that there can only be contingency in the world if the first cause does not act by necessity (Ordinatio I d. 8 p. 2 q. un).

Several theses on the first cause and the intelligences which are inspired by Avicenna are condemned by the Parisian bishop in 1277, among them: that God is the first necessary cause of the first intelligence and of the celestial movements (art. 58 and 59), that God does necessarily what is immediately produced by him (art. 53), that the active intellect is a substance separate from the human intellect (art. 123), that the rational souls are created by the intelligences (art. 30). Avicenna’s theory of the first cause nevertheless continued to influence the scholastic discussion. This is true, for instance, of the proof for the existence of God, which had been cited by Thomas Aquinas. Peter of Auvergne, Henry of Ghent and Duns Scotus too draw on Avicenna’s argument from the possible and necessary being (Druart 2002; Janssens 2003; Pickavé 2007, ch. 6).

The 1270 and 1277 condemnations were also directed against another theory based on Arabic sources: astrological determinism (art. 143, 161, 167, 195, 206, 207). The condemnations do not testify to the influence of Arabic philosophers proper: Avicenna was critical of astrology for epistemological reasons and Averroes embedded astrological doctrines in Peripatetic mainstream theories about the influence of the stars. Rather, the condemnations indicate that Arabic astrologers such as Albumasar and Alcabitius were very influential in the Latin West already in the thireenth century.

7. Ethics

The influence of Arabic ethical and political writings is thin, partly because Arabic philosophers were less productive in these fields, and partly because important works were not translated at all (such as al-Fārābī’s Principles of the Citizens of the Perfect State) or as late as in the sixteenth century (such as Averroes’ Commentary on Plato’s Republic). Nevertheless, Arabic philosophers, via their teaching on the intellect, exerted an important influence on the border area between ethics and psychology, and on the discussion of human happiness in particular.

Al-Fārābī, Avicenna and Averroes share the view that happiness is reached through the conjunction of the human intellect with the separate active intellect. They also share an epistemological optimism that for specifically gifted people, which they described as philosophers or philosopher-prophets, a perfect conjunction is possible in this life. Albertus Magnus’s theory of happiness is much influenced by these Arabic theories. As was mentioned above, he adopted from Avicenna and Averroes the concept of an “acquired intellect” (intellectus adeptus) as the highest level of conjunction between possible and active intellect. Only in this stage, a human being truly becomes a human being. Through the conjunction with the active intellect the human intellect contemplates the separate substances, and in this consists the “theoretical happiness” of man (felicitas contemplativa), a happiness which is possible in this life (De anima III.3.12) (Müller 2006; on Albertus’ influence see de Libera 2005, 329–361). Thomas Aquinas disagrees with the epistemological premisses and the ethical conclusion of this position: Since human knowledge is bound to the senses, knowledge of the immaterial substances is not possible in this life, and neither is perfect human happiness (Summa theol. Ia IIae q.3 a.2). But Thomas, when explaining beatific vision and human happiness in the afterlife, adopts from Averroes the idea that a separate substance is conjoined with the human intellect as its form (Comm. on the Sentences IV, d.49 q.2 a.1; see Taylor 2012)

In 1277, several philosophical theses concerning human happiness and the good life were condemned: that happiness is to be had in this life and not in another (art. 176), that there is no better state (of life) than studying philosophy (art. 40). These articles were apparently directed at masters of arts at the university of Paris, among them Siger of Brabant and Boethius of Dacia. As we know from fragments of Siger’s treatise On Happiness (De felicitate), he embraces Averroes’ thesis that all intellects are made blessed through the conjunction with the active intellect. In Siger’s interpretation, human beings in such a state think God by an intellection which is God himself. There are many indications that Siger was convinced that the knowledge of the separate substances and thus the attaining of human happiness is possible in this life (Steel 2001, 227–231). Boethius of Dacia is also convinced that human happiness can be reached in this life, which is a happiness proportioned to human capacities, whereas the highest kind of happiness as such is reserved to the afterlife (in his treatise De summo bono). Boethius appears to be inspired by Arabic theories of intellectual ascension, but does not endorse a theory of conjunction, as does Siger. His conviction that the philosopher’s life is the only true life echoes the very self-confident and elitist stance taken by the major Arabic philosophers.


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