First published Sat Feb 18, 2023

Dignity is a complex concept. In academic and legal contexts, it is typically used in the couplet “human dignity” to denote a kind of basic worth or status that purportedly belongs to all persons equally, and which grounds fundamental moral or political duties or rights. In this sense, many believe that dignity is a defining ideal of the contemporary world, especially in western society. However, the concept of dignity has long been associated with many more meanings, some of which cut in distinctly different directions: rank, station, honor, uniqueness, beauty, poise, gravitas, integrity, self-respect, self-esteem, a sacred place in the order of things, supreme worth, and even the apex of astrological significance. Some of these connotations have faded with time. But most have enduring influence.

So, what exactly is dignity? Do its different connotations hang together in any principled way? Does dignity understood as “universal human worth”, for example, have any meaningful connection to “social rank” or “personal integrity”? Is dignity primarily a moral concept or a political and legal one? Even assuming we can make sense of its different meanings, what does dignity demand of us? What does it mean to recognize or respect it? Does it ground rights? If so, which ones? And where does the idea of dignity come from? What, in other words, is its history?

This entry will take up these questions, but without any pretense of being exhaustive. The goal is to provide a general guide to existing theory and debate, with a focus on philosophical approaches to human dignity, and mostly as it figures into the western tradition. The vast literature makes anything more ambitious than this unrealistic, even for an encyclopedic survey.

1. A Historical Primer

In the opening sentence of its preamble, the 1948 Declaration of Human Rights affirms the “inherent dignity” and “equal and inalienable rights of all members of the human family” as the “foundation of freedom, justice and peace in the world” (UN 1948). This claim would surprise our modern ancestors. Until about 1830–1850, neither the English term “dignity,” nor its Latin root dignitas, nor the French counterpart dignité, had any stable currency as meaning “the unearned status or worth of all persons”, let alone the grounds of universal rights or equality. Instead, in everything from Hobbes’s Leviathan (1651) to Samuel Johnson’s Dictionary (1755) to Webster’s Compendious Dictionary (1806), “dignity” was primarily used with a conventional merit connotation—something like the “rank of elevation” that Johnson officially gave it.

How did this sea change in meaning come about? The UN Declaration makes clear that dignity’s moral-political meaning had become normalized by 1948. But what happened before 1948 that explains this transformation? These are not easy questions to answer. Although theorists often include historical remarks in their inquiries, they are just as often brief and subservient to some further, non-historical point. The result is a great many half-told stories about dignity’s past.

There are some notable exceptions. For some time, legal theorists have been etching out the details of dignity’s historical role in law and jurisprudence, especially in connection to rights. Second, theological inquiries into human dignity often engage an older history of ideas, especially the Renaissance thinker Pico della Mirandola or scholastic debates about the biblical doctrine of imago Dei. Third, there is a considerable body of literature on the Enlightenment luminaire, Immanuel Kant, and his famous claim that humans do not have a “price”, only a distinctive and incomparable worth or Würde—usually translated as “dignity” (see, e.g., Korsgaard 1986; Meyer 1987; Hill 1992; Kofman 1982 [1997]; Wood 1999; Kain 2009). Let us turn to these various exceptions, and their challenges.

1.1 The legal history of dignity

The connection between law and dignity strikes many as socially and morally urgent. It is thus unsurprising that some serious history of this connection already exists, especially in relation to rights theory (see, e.g., Eberle 2002 or Barak 2015). Nevertheless, the bulk of this history does not look back very far.

For example, Lewis (2007) gives a wonderful overview of the idea of dignity in international law, but his focus is on the writing of, and reaction to, the 1945 UN Charter and 1948 Declaration of Human Rights. Or consider McCrudden’s impressive 2013 edited volume, Understanding Human Dignity. The historical chapters of this volume make important contributions, but again the focus is largely the twentieth century. Scott’s chapter (2013), for example, begins by observing that the 1848 French decree to abolish slavery motivates itself from the consideration “that slavery is an assault upon human dignity (la dignité humaine)” (2013: 61). She then nicely explores the idea of dignity in the context of post-slavery Louisiana c.1862–96. However, the chapter then jumps forward to a comparison with Brazilian society c.1970–2012. Moyn’s chapter (2013) examines early and middle twentieth century constitutional debates to show that the concept of dignity labors under poorly appreciated debts to a specifically Christian conception of democracy, and for this reason, Moyn argues, we should be skeptical about the long-term utility of dignity for secular rights theory. And Goos’s chapter (2013) offers a close examination of the role of dignity in German thought, but the focus is on post-World War II interpretation of the German Grundgesetz (Basic Law).[1]

A longer legal history can be found in McCrudden (2008), whose concise review of dignity reaches back to classical Roman thought. McCrudden argues that we can trace the merit connotation of dignity as “elevated social rank” to the Roman idea of “dignitas homini” (2008: 656); but also, and crucially, he argues that we can trace our contemporary moral-political notion of the “basic worth or status of human persons” to this same period, when Cicero introduced the idea of “the dignity of the human race” (see also, Cancik 2002). This claim about Cicero is echoed in Michael Rosen’s 2012, Dignity: Its History and Meaning, which is another important entry into dedicated history that focuses on legal connections. Rosen’s history is mostly from a bird’s eye view, but, like McCrudden’s, Rosen’s history has the virtue of taking a long view that stretches back to antiquity. Moreover, Rosen offers some nuanced reflections on eighteenth and nineteenth century connections, including Kant’s influence on the writing of the German Grundgesetz.

Finally, when it comes to legal history, Darwall (2017) offers a sophisticated analysis of dignity’s connections to western Enlightenment conceptions of jurisprudence stretching back to the sixteenth century. Importantly, however, Darwall’s history challenges McCrudden’s and Rosen’s appeal to Cicero as a key source. We will return to this scholarly disagreement and Darwall’s competing proposal below (§1.2.2 and §1.2.4).

1.2 Four Origin Stories

Given the present popularity of studying dignity, we should not only expect the historical contours of dignity to become clearer in coming years, but also for them to be occasionally redrawn. A few important platitudes have already been challenged.

1.2.1 The revolutionary platitude

The western creed of human dignity stems from the wisdom of eighteenth-century revolutionary thinkers such as Thomas Jefferson, Alexander Hamilton, or Gilbert du Motier, the Marquis de Lafayette. At the founding of new liberal states like America, or the reformation of existing ones like England or France, political sages like these propounded the inviolable value of individual human beings.

In reality, one looks in vain for dignity in the founding documents of these new republics. The term appears a few times in the English Bill of Rights (1689), but not with our contemporary moral-political meaning. It appears once in the French Déclaration des Droits de l’Homme et du Citoyen (1789), but the connotation is of the privileges that attend public or political office. And for all its fiery rhetoric about equality and the “inalienable” rights of man, the US Declaration of Independence does not mention human dignity at all. Nor does the US Constitution. In fact, it is not until the Mexican Constitution of 1917 and the 1919 Weimer Constitution, that the term appears in a constitutional context possibly with its moral-political connotation (McCrudden 2008; Debes 2009 and 2017b). To this corrective evidence, we should add the testimony of an entirely different set of historical voices—from Sojourner Truth, David Walker, Anna Wheeler, and William Thompson, to Susan B. Anthony, Frederick Douglass, James Rapier, and Ida B. Wells—who remind us that the revolutionary platitude was contradicted by the lived reality within these new republics. These voices decried the systematic oppression and often bloody inhumanity that stained the supposedly egalitarian societies in which they lived.

1.2.2 The Kantian platitude

The early modern concept of dignity originates with Immanuel Kant, who in his 1785 Groundwork for the Metaphysics of Morals, argued that all persons have an inherent value, or dignity, in virtue of their rational autonomy. This value commands a distinct kind of moral respect, which we express by abiding by certain limits in our treatment of others. Thus, Kant argued that we have a categorical duty to treat persons always “as an end” and “never merely as a means” (Groundwork, 4:429).

This is the greatest dogma about dignity in philosophy. But there are good reasons to rethink it in favor of a more complicated history of ideas. First, although it is well known that Kant is indebted to Rousseau in various ways (see especially Beiser 1992), recent scholarship suggests that when it comes to his ideas about “humanity” and “dignity”, the debt runs deeper than is generally understood (James 2013; Hanley 2017; Sensen 2017). Sensen also argues that it is a longstanding interpretive mistake to think that Kant grounds the obligation to respect others on any “absolute inner value” that humans possess; and that “dignity” is not the name Kant gave to such a value anyway (Sensen 2011 & 2017; see also Meyer 1987). Relatedly, Debes (2021) argues that contemporary philosophers have greatly overestimated Kant’s influence on the historical development of our notion of moral respect for persons.

On top of these corrections, Darwall (2017) argues that the conceptual link between dignity and rights does not originate with Kant. According to Darwall, only certain conceptions of dignity will support the kind of inferences about respect that could justify using dignity to ground human rights. Namely, those conceptions that render dignity as a kind of authoritative standing to make “second-personal” claims—that is, claims by one person to another. However, the original insight for this crucial point, Darwall further argues, comes from the natural lawyer Samuel Pufendorf (see also Darwall 2012).

Writing a century before Kant, Pufendorf argued that human beings have perfect natural rights (rights owed to one another) in virtue of a certain moral “standing” that we assign to each other as a constitutive part of being sociable. Whenever we address another person directly—e.g., with a claim like “You must allow me to speak”—we implicitly treat them as an accountable, responsible being. Otherwise, why address them at all? And the same is true when they address us. In other words, according to Pufendorf, being sociable implicitly involves a reciprocal assumption of basic moral status—us of them, them of us—whenever we interact, and even if the address is one that offends the equal standing of the other. Indeed, this is precisely when “dignity” becomes most urgent. Thus, Pufendorf writes:

There seems to him to be somewhat of Dignity [dignatio] in the appellation of Man: so that the last and most efficacious Argument to curb the Arrogance of insulting Men, is usually, I am not a Dog but a Man as well as yourself. (1672: I.VII.I [2003]: 100)

1.2.3 The imago Dei platitude

The moralized concept of dignity does not originate in the early modern era. It was celebrated as early as the Renaissance, in Giovanni Pico della Mirandola’s 1486 Oration on the Dignity of Man. Moreover, Pico’s oration is drawn from the older, medieval Christian doctrine of imago Dei (based on Genesis 1:26 and Wisdom 2:23), which tells us that we are made in “in the image of God”, and that this likeness grounds our distinctive moral worth or status.

This story about dignity is to Christian theology what the Kantian dogma is to philosophy. However, these claims are usually misleading if not false. For example, Copenhaver (2017) flatly contradicts the claim that Pico was talking about human dignity in a sense akin to our contemporary moral-political notion. First, Copenhaver notes that the title of the work, which draws our attention, postdates Pico (who never published it). More substantively, Copenhaver argues that Pico’s speech was a public failure in large part because it was entangled with Kabbalah mysteries for how humans can escape the body to increase their status by becoming angels. Finally, Copenhaver points out that Pico uses the Latin dignitas only twice; and

In neither case does dignitas belong to humans, except aspirationally, and neither justifies “dignity” as a translation, with all the Kantian baggage of the modern English word. (2017: 134–5)

Adding to this reversal of fortunes, Kent (2017) marshals extensive evidence from the scholastic tradition against the imago Dei platitude more generally. Although she confirms that both dignity and the doctrine of imago Dei were widely discussed by medieval Christian scholars in the Latin West, she convincingly demonstrates that these discussions did not intersect in a way that supports an inference to our contemporary moral-political notion of the “basic worth or status of humans”. This said, not all interpretations of the Christian tradition, including the doctrine of imago Dei, are beholden to this historical platitude. And the imago Dei line of inquiry on dignity has a somewhat different life in the Jewish tradition.[2]

1.2.4 The Ciceronian platitude

“Dignity” derives from the Latin dignitas. And while most Romans used dignitas only in its merit sense, a few, and Cicero in particular, had a proleptic understanding of dignitas that anticipated today’s moral-political sense.

This historical view has attracted more attention lately, as evidenced by its earlier noted endorsement in McCrudden (2008) and Rosen (2012a) (see also, Englard 2000). However, it has been challenged on both philosophical and interpretive grounds. For example, Miriam Griffin (2017) carefully demonstrates that the textual support for this view is very thin. She argues that straightforward lexical analysis of Roman sources offers sparing evidence for connecting dignitas to our contemporary moral-political concept. Moreover, even if we branch out to other ancient Roman concepts to see if dignity might be hiding under different terminology, we run into a fundamental challenge: “Stoics and Roman moralists”, Griffin explains, “think in terms of officia, obligations or duties or functions that our nature, properly understood, imposes on us”. Correspondingly, “[t]he entitlements and rights of those at the receiving end of our actions is not a prominent aspect of their thinking” (2017: 49).

Admittedly, Griffin allows that in some cases these obligations or duties entail a kind of treatment of others that accords with our contemporary notion of human dignity. Still, this result does not depend on any right that persons have in virtue of “the worth of a human being per se” (2017: 64; see also Meyer 1987; and Lebech 2009, especially p. 46 n. 22.)

To these challenges, Darwall (2017) adds another problem for the Ciceronian platitude. Borrowing from the exact quotations that McCrudden and Rosen use to defend attributing a moral-political notion of human dignity to Cicero, Darwall argues:

Human dignity for Cicero is nothing that could be established by conventional patterns of deference. It is the idea, rooted in the ancient notion of a great chain of being, that distinctive capacities for self-development “by study and reflection” give human beings a “nature” “superior” to that of “cattle and other animals”. Other species are motivated only by sensory instincts, whereas human beings can “learn that sensual pleasure is wholly unworthy of the dignity of the human race”, and be guided by this understanding.

[Consequently] nothing in the Ciceronian notion of human dignity requires, or even leads naturally to, basic human rights. The proposition, for example, that “sensual pleasure” is “unworthy” of human dignity is less a thesis about what human beings are in a position to claim from one another by virtue of their dignity than it is an ethical standard to which we are to live up. (2017: 182–3; Cicero quotations cited in McCrudden 2008: 657, and Rosen 2012a: 12)

To be fair, Darwall’s critique hangs on two assumptions about the concept of dignity: (1) that a satisfactory account of dignity will involve a connection to, if not a grounding for, rights claims; and (2) that dignity is in no way an achievement. Both assumptions resonate strongly with contemporary moral-political talk of dignity. Nevertheless, identifying these assumptions should remind us that we have not yet clearly formulated a concept of dignity. So, let us turn to that task.[3]

2. Formulating Dignity

There is no single, incontestable meaning of dignity. In fact, there are so many possible meanings that it has become commonplace in the literature to worry about the expansive variety of conceptions, and in turn to worry whether dignity is or has become essentially ambiguous. And while its defenders find ways to mitigate or explain away this ambiguity, the concept of dignity has its share of detractors. But we will return to skeptical worries at the end of this entry. For now, and granting the prima facie force of the ambiguity worry, four broad categories of meaning stand out across context and history:

  1. Dignity as Gravitas: a poise or grace associated with behavioral comportment; e.g., the sophisticated manners or elegant speech of nobility, or outward composure in the face of insult or duress.
  2. Dignity as Integrity: the family of ideas associated with living up to personal or social standards of character and conduct, either in one’s own eyes or the eyes of others.
  3. Dignity as Status: noble or elevated social position or rank.
  4. Dignity as Human dignity: the unearned worth or status that all humans share equally (either inherent or constructed).

This “general schema” is rough and ready. Scholars divide the conceptual space in different ways, often advocating intersections between the foregoing four categories, making elaborations on them, or noting wrinkles within them.

For example, Kolnai (1976) argues that the primary function of the concept is descriptive, not evaluative. Dignity is a quality of persons, which is the fitting object of a set of pro-attitudes related to both moral appreciation and aesthetic appreciation. Thus, to be dignified is to comport oneself in a way that is not simply a reflection of authority, rank, moral uprightness, or a regimented or serious adherence to codes of conduct, but instead reflects something of “the beautiful”. As Kolnai puts it, our response to dignity is characterized, at least in part, by “our devoted and admiring appreciation for beauty” (1976: 252). Hence the distinction between (1) and (2) above (see also Brady 2007).

By contrast, although Rosen (2012a) notes that the Latin term dignitas was once part of a critical vocabulary of classical art and rhetoric, used “to characterize speech that was weighty and majestic, in contrast to discourse that was light and charming” (2012a: 13), Rosen largely blends categories (1) and (2) into a single strand of meaning, which he identifies as “dignity as behavior, character or bearing that is dignified” (2012a: 54). Rosen then accepts (3) and (4) but adds his own further category, which he calls “dignity as treatment”: “To treat someone with dignity is…to respect their dignity” (2012a: 58). As we will see more fully in a moment, this addition reflects a common observation by scholars about a tight connection between dignity and its recognition (although, it is not common to claim that the proper recognition of dignity is a separate category of dignity).

Meanwhile, Kateb (2011) stresses the need to distinguish between human dignity qua individual humans, and human dignity qua human species. According to Kateb, both have dignity. But whereas the dignity of individuals can be described as a special kind of “status”—as in category (4) above—the dignity of the human species requires a further concept, namely, of “stature”. He writes, “In comparison to other species, humanity has a stature beyond comparison” (2011: 6). To be clear, Kateb does not think that the human species has an existence above and beyond its members: it is not a natural kind. However, he argues that the interdependence of humans is,

so extensive, so deep, and so entangled…that for certain purposes we might just as well make the human species a unified entity or agency, even though we know it isn’t. (2011: 6)

Correspondingly, we can sensibly talk about the “dignity” of the species. This conclusion cuts against some positions that maintain dignity “proper” can only belong to individuals (Stern 1975; Gaylin 1984; Egonsson 1998).

A more recent schema is offered by Killmister (2020). Killmister proposes three “strands” of dignity: personal, social, and status. To have personal dignity, Killmister argues, is to take oneself to be subject to personal “dignitarian” norms. And to have social dignity is to be subject to social “dignitarian” norms. What are dignitarian norms? Dignitarian norms are norms that either the person themself, or society at large, take to be “ennobling” to uphold, or whose transgression the person or society consider to be “disgraceful or debasing” (2020: 25, 29). Like Rosen, then, Killmister effectively blends categories (1) and (2), while at the same time drawing attention to a different organizational distinction one might make, namely, between the personal and the social. As for “status dignity”, Killmister argues that explaining this category of dignity requires a distinctive concept of respect. And her argument is worth elaborating because it exemplifies and fleshes out two closely related points shared by many existing theories:

  1. that any satisfactory theory of dignity must explain what it means to recognize dignity; and
  2. that this recognition is best described as a kind of respect.

So, consider: Dignitarian norms, according to Killmister, can typically be redescribed as articulating the grounds of respect—either self-respect (in the case of personal dignity) or respect from others (in the case of social dignity). Moreover, the kind of respect relevant to personal and social dignity, she argues, is what Stephen Darwall (1977) influentially named “appraisal respect”. This kind of respect is a positive evaluative attitude or feeling, which we express towards ourselves or others, for some merit of character. In this sense, respect is akin to esteem. Killmister writes:

to be highly personally dignified is to be such that, by our own lights, we ought to hold ourselves in high esteem…to be highly socially dignified is to be such that, by the light of our community, they ought to hold us in high esteem. (2020: 23)

By contrast, Killmister connects status dignity to what Darwall called, “recognition respect”. Recognition respect is a way of thinking about oneself or others. To recognize-respect someone (at least as Darwall first explained it) is to give appropriate weight to some fact about them in our practical deliberations, and to restrict our choices or actions accordingly.

Killmister thus argues,

We come to have status dignity, when we fall within a particular [social] category, membership in which commands respectful treatment from others in our community. (2020: 22)

She elaborates,

status dignity does not call on others to esteem us, but rather to treat us in ways appropriate to the kind of thing we are. (2020: 23, emphasis added)

Correspondingly, human dignity ends up as “an especially important instance” of status dignity. And all humans deserve recognition respect in virtue of the “fact” of their membership in the category “human” (2020: 129–30).

This said, Killmister’s conclusion diverges from Darwall’s own account of human dignity, which is tied to a revision he made to his theory of recognition respect, which connected recognition respect to the reciprocal “authority” of second-personal address, as discussed in the earlier historical reflection on Pufendorf (see §1.2.3 above; and Darwall 2006, esp. p. 14). Note also that Killmister, like Kateb, eschews thinking of “human” as a natural kind, in favor of understanding it as a social kind.

2.1 Dignity’s defining properties vs. dignity’s grounds

The previous section offered examples of how the general schema of dignity’s meaning gets modified in existing theory, as well as how each category of meaning might be fleshed out. More examples could be given. But to decide between any of them, it seems crucial to ask, how should we formulate the concept of dignity? In other words, instead of simply cataloging first-order views about its meaning, we need to introduce some second-order criteria.

On the one hand, we need to determine the defining properties of dignity: the distinguishing characteristics or explanatory demands that are supposed to apply to any contentful account of dignity. Such criteria might include, for example, that dignity is “inherent”; that it is “incommensurable” with other values; that it has a “distinctive normative function”; that it has an essential connection to rights; and so on.

On the other hand, we need to determine what grounds dignity: we need to say what it is about humans, or any being with dignity, that satisfies the defining properties. In other words, we need to answer the question: In virtue of what do we have dignity? The most common answer to this question, historically speaking, especially when it comes to human dignity, involves a claim about autonomy. Or if not autonomy tout court, then the “capabilities” for such autonomy (see, e.g., Nussbaum 1995, 2006a, and 2006b). Thus, one finds many variations of the claim that humans have dignity in virtue of their capacity for (or exercise of) “choice” or “rational agency”—claims that are often tethered to the earlier discussed historical platitude about Kant. This said, alternatives to the grounding question about human dignity include brute species membership, sentience, the creative power of humanity, creation “in the image of God”, a politically conferred status as “rights bearer”, the capacity for empathy and caring relationships, the earlier mentioned “personality”, the concrete “particularity” of an individual person, and the possession of “perspective”.

Sorting these views is not easy for a few reasons. First, some of the operative concepts, such as “autonomy”, are themselves hotly disputed. Second, there is no pre-theoretical reason to deny multiple ways of satisfying any given definitional criteria. That is, any given proposal for the defining properties of dignity might be satisfied by more than one ground. For example, depending on the criteria, humans might “have” dignity in virtue of both autonomy and sentience, or both divine creation and our capacity for empathy, and so on. Third, twentieth century theorists rarely took a second-order view on their subject and methods. In turn, they often confused or at least failed to clarify which of the two foregoing challenges they were trying to tackle, articulating dignity’s defining properties or articulating dignity’s grounds.

Thankfully, twenty-first century formulations of dignity are marked by increasingly conscientious attempts to articulate the defining properties of dignity, and to do so in a way that might guide discussion about dignity’s grounds. For example, in “Bedrock Truths and the Dignity of the Individual”, Iglesias (2001) distinguishes between historically older, “restricted” meanings of dignity associated with general schema (1), (2), and (3); and, on the other hand, what she calls “universal” meanings associated with schema (4), “human dignity”. She further argues that any satisfactory universalist account must render human dignity as (4a) in some sense “inherent” or “intrinsic”; and (4b) the “grounds” of basic rights. Regarding the latter, Iglesias writes:

The connection is essential. It is rooted in the concept of the human person, in human self-understanding as constituted by the bedrock truths about what and who we are…The universal meaning of the concept of dignity, as inherent to every human being, expresses the intrinsic good that the human being is. The distinct human rights articulate those basic intrinsic goods proper to, and expressive of, each one’s dignity, individually and in community relationships—as dimensions of our very being. These basic goods—guaranteed as rights—must be recognized, respected, and promoted so that the intrinsic good that the human being is himself or herself, personally and as an individual, may be preserved and assured. Thus, the ground for advocacy and defense of human rights resides on what and who the human being is, as a human being, namely on his or her dignity. (2001: 130)

By comparison, Shultziner (2007) adopts a “philosophical-linguistic” method to distinguish moral-philosophical uses of dignity from political and legal “functions” of the concept, especially the use of dignity to ground specific rights and enforceable duties. Regarding the latter, Shultziner stresses that in real world contexts, the rights which the concept of dignity is used to ground vary considerably:

There is no fixed and universal content that spouts out of human dignity and, hence, its content and meanings are determined separately in each legal document in accordance with the political agreement achieved at the time. (2007: 78)

This might seem to express skepticism about the possibility of any general, stable concept of dignity. In fact, it underlines the point of Iglesias’s final criterion (4b); namely, that a defining property of dignity is the grounding connection to rights. In other words, strictly speaking, Shultziner agrees with Iglesias that at least one defining property of human dignity—in political contexts—is that dignity grounds rights, even though the content of these rights vary greatly because the grounds of dignity itself vary greatly. [4]

Another example of second-order thinking can be found in Debes (2009), who argues that any satisfactory “formal” account of human dignity—by which he means an account of its defining properties—must pick out a “distinctive” value or status belonging to humans. And it must be distinctive in the sense that it (a) is not merit based, but instead unearned; (b) is in some sense “incommensurable” with other values; and (c) makes sense of the basic “normative function” of the concept. Regarding (c), Debes argues that the concept of dignity does not purport to be only or even mainly descriptive. Instead, it has a normative purpose or role, namely, “to set off in our practical deliberations whatever ‘dignity’ is applied to—to guard or protect what has dignity” (2009: 61–2).

Or consider Waldron (2012), who tracks a confusion in legal discussions of dignity between (on the one hand) definitional claims about dignity’s defining properties and (on the other hand) claims about dignity’s practical conditions; that is, the conditions of its moral, social, or political recognition. Thus, Waldron notes the way that various human rights charters claim that dignity is “inherent” in the human person; but also “command us to make heroic efforts to establish everyone’s dignity” (2012: 16, emphasis added). Such claims, he writes, may look like an equivocation akin to claiming, as Rousseau once did, that “Man is born free but everywhere is in chains”—a claim that Jeremy Bentham later called “miserable nonsense”. However, Waldron argues that Bentham missed an easy explanation of Rousseau:

[A person] might be identified as a free man in a juridical sense—that is his legal status—even though he is found in conditions of slavery…So, similarly, one might say that every human person is free as a matter of status—the status accorded to him by his creator—even though it is the case that some humans are actually in chains and need to have their freedom represented as the content of a normative demand. (2012: 16–17)

To be clear, Waldron quickly adds that one might shy away from the specific premise of divine creation as a way of grounding human freedom. That metaphysical premise is only an example. His overarching point is that it is not incoherent to make this kind of claim. Because the operative claim about the status of human persons—namely, that they are free—is a claim about a defining property of the concept of “man” (in a juridical sense), it follows that we can distinguish this claim from any further claim about what grounds this “free” status, as well any claim about the worldly conditions that are required for this status to be expressed, realized, or recognized.

Keeping this in mind, we can now understand why Waldron thinks that we are not necessarily equivocating if we claim that dignity is inherent, but nevertheless enjoin others to establish it in practice. He writes,

On the one hand, the term [“dignity”] may be used to convey something about the inherent rank or status of human beings; on the other hand, it may be used concomitantly to convey the demand that rank or status should actually be recognized. (2012: 17)

Importantly Waldron further argues that dignity finds its proper conceptual home not in morality, but in the legal context of rights. He writes, “law is its natural habitat” (2012: 13). This is because, he argues, rights articulate, or flesh out, the kind of status that modern conceptions of dignity typically include or allude to; but also, which his own theory depends on. Thus, for Waldron, it is historically mistaken and theoretically confused to ground our contemporary concept of human dignity on thick metaphysical bases—some inviolable value that “inheres” in humans, whether by dint of divine creation or otherwise. Instead, on Waldron’s view, the contemporary notion of human dignity is essentially Samuel Johnson’s old idea of “elevated rank”, albeit refashioned in the modern consciousness to apply to all humans.

In other words, Waldron explains the historical revolution in our concept of dignity as turning on a leveling up of all people to the kind of social status once reserved only for the noble elite. We simply reappropriated the term “dignity” to describe this high status, ditching its original “sortal” connotation for a new egalitarian one (2012: 57–61). Furthermore, he claims that all this happened through (or mainly through) the paradigm of rights. Oversimplifying for sake of argument: Waldron thinks that people of lower social rank successfully annexed the rights reserved to those of higher ranks, by reinterpreting those rights as human rights. Hence why rights remain the critical apparatus for fleshing out the kind of status relevant to “dignity”, and why the proper home of dignity is law, not morality.

Waldron’s view on dignity has been influential, so a few more notes about it are fitting. First, in making these claims about dignity-as-elevated-rank, Waldron partly aligns himself with Appiah (2010), although Waldron does not seem to notice this. Second, Waldron’s claim about the “home” of dignity is contentious. It is prima facie hard to square with everyday claims about human dignity, which seem evenly spread over moral, political, and legal contexts. And it contradicts Shultziner (2007), discussed above. Moreover, Dimock (2012), Herzog (2012), and Rosen (2012b) challenge it directly, among others (see, e.g., Bird 2013).

Most important, however, in the greater context of discussing the defining prosperities of dignity, it is to register Waldron’s underlying suggestion about an “essential” connection between dignity and rights. As we have seen, this claim finds wide traction in the literature, even in accounts of dignity that are at odds with the Appiah-Waldron view of “dignity-as-elevated-rank”. For example, considering only accounts reviewed so far, Iglesias (2001) made the same claim; Darwall (2017) implies it; and both Kateb (2011) and Killmister (2020) endorse it in different ways. This raises an obvious question: What exactly is the connection between dignity and rights?

2.2 Is a connection to rights a defining property of dignity?

It is beyond the scope of this entry to answer this question in anything close to a comprehensive way. (Good starting points include Meyer and Parent 1992; Gewirth 1992, Carozza 2008 and 2013; and Tasioulas 2013). Instead, let us draw out a few points about the connection between dignity and rights as it bears specifically on attempts to make it a defining property of dignity itself. To get at these points, consider a final proposal about the definitional criteria of dignity, from Fitzpatrick (2013):

The primary notion of dignity is the idea of a certain moral status involving possession of an inherent, unearned form of worth or standing—a basic worth or standing that is neither dependent on one’s being of use or interest to others nor based on one’s merits, and which essentially calls for certain forms of respect. (2013: 5546)

Fitzpatrick presents this definition within the context of an encyclopedic effort to capture its meaning. As such, he is understandably aiming at something generic. However, in the light of our analysis so far, the tensions in his attempt are manifest, albeit instructive.

First, describing dignity as primarily a “status” instead of a “value” aligns with those like Waldron, who make a principled distinction between their accounts and all kinds of “worth” or “value” conceptions of human dignity (see, e.g., Killmister 2020, who emphasizes this distinction; and Dan-Cohen 2012, for analysis on its import to Waldron). However, Fitzpatrick immediately equivocates on this point, redefining status as, “worth or standing”. Similarly, consider that those like Appiah-Waldron who think human dignity depends on a refashioned idea of high social rank, must, strictly speaking, reject the property of “inherentness” that Fitzpatrick appeals to. But they might allow for the alternative description of “unearned”, especially if this is interpreted as historically indexed to the refashioned conception of status.

More important for the question about rights is to consider Fitzpatrick’s final remark that dignity, “calls for certain forms of respect”. At first blush, this appeal might seem to be merely a refinement of Debes’s (2009) claim that dignity has a distinctive “normative function”. If so, it would be a refinement that is common to many theorists, as we already noted in §2.1. However, Fitzpatrick immediately connects this generic claim about respect to two specific elaborations of dignity’s normative function. He writes:

It is in this sense [of an inherent worth or standing that calls for respect] that many hold that all persons possess a fundamental, inalienable dignity, which grounds [1] basic rights…or [2] the authority to make claims and demands of others. (2013: 5546)

Both claims merit elaboration.

The first claim [1] gives voice to the strongest, or at least the most direct way to make the connection to rights a defining property of dignity, by making dignity the normative basis of rights. Thus, suppose one asks of any given right x, what justifies the claim that “x is a human right”? The answer for those who take this line is, “dignity”. Or at least, “human dignity”.

Now, in one sense, claim [1] is unsurprising given that it has legal reality. For example, although the claim is only implicit in the Universal Declaration of Human Rights (1948) as well as the original Charter of the United Nations (1945), a 1966 amendment to the Charter made it explicit, declaring that rights “derived from the inherent dignity of persons”. Moreover, claims like this have become increasingly common in state constitutions, especially in the west, as well as other international charters and humanitarian declarations (see, e.g., Schachter 1983, Iglesias 2001, Shultziner 2007, and McCrudden 2008, for summaries and analysis).

And yet, it is important to note that such legal claims are almost always brute assertions. They are not conscientious attempts at theory. More exactly, they do not claim that any adequate theory of dignity (as a concept) must account for the grounding relationship between dignity and rights. This is important because, pace FitzPatrick, or those like James Griffin (2008) who adamantly stress dignity as the foundation of rights, some theorists challenge or avoid or even reject claim [1]. This includes skeptics who challenge the viability of any existing substantive accounts of dignity to ground rights (discussed later). But it also includes some theorists who defend dignity (in one form or other). For example, Waldron skirts around the kind of commitment at issue in claim [1]. He allows that dignity involves each person thinking of themselves, “as a self-originating source of legal and moral claims” (2012: 60), but the overarching implication of his argument is that rights articulate the nature of the “high” status humans have been elevated to. Dignity is thus not the normative basis of rights on his view. Instead, legal systems, and rights in particular, “constitute and vindicate human dignity, both in their explicit provisions and in their overall modus operandi” (2012: 67).

Killmister (2020) follows Waldron’s lead, but she is more explicit. “[H]uman rights”, she argues, “form part of our articulation of how members of the human kind ought to be treated” (2020: 143). And, like Shultziner (2007), she warns against attempts to derive the content of rights directly from dignity, a warning that further tells against making claim [1] part of the definitional criteria. Relatedly, Meyer (1989) concludes that insofar as we aim to explain rights, we can never successfully explain dignity: “While having and exercising certain rights is important to our dignity as human beings”, Meyer argues,

what we commonly regard as essential to human dignity would not be explained even if we were able to delineate all of the relevant rights and the particular ways in which each of them expresses or protects human dignity. (1989: 521)

Meyer’s point is enhanced (perhaps even preempted) by Donnelly’s (1982) sociological claim that in cultures where “rights” are or once were a relatively foreign concept, human dignity is not. If Donnelly is correct, then excepting motivational purposes, rights theory is arguably a non-starter for a proper account of dignity’s defining properties (see also, Howard 1992, who partly recapitulates Donnelly’s point).

Piling onto this, Schroeder (2012) and Moyn (2013) warn that the “normative basis” version of the connection claim between rights and dignity—i.e., claim [1]—leaves dignity vulnerable, because our contemporary concept of human dignity carries underappreciated debts to non-secular, theological traditions (see also Addis 2013). And Valentini (2017) argues that the plausibility of claim [1] depends on which other defining properties of dignity we want to defend. Specifically, if dignity is taken to be inherent, she argues, then claim [1] becomes not only “uninformative” because “the notion of inherent dignity is opaque”; it also becomes counterproductive to the aims of most rights theories. This is because, she continues, the inherentness claim pushes rights debates, “into deep metaphysical waters”, and distracts us from the main political function of rights (especially, human rights), namely, to constrain, “the conduct of powerful actors” (2017: 862–3).

Now consider connection claim [2]: dignity grounds the authority to make claims in general. Some have argued that the first connection claim [1], which makes dignity the normative basis of rights, is ultimately just a special case of the second claim [2], about authority. Perhaps most well-known in this respect is Feinberg (1970 [1980]), who, in the course of arguing that the act or practice of making interpersonal claims is what “gives rights their special moral significance”, adds this passing remark about dignity: “what is called ‘human dignity’ may simply be the recognizable capacity to assert claims” (1970 [1980: 151]). Admittedly, Feinberg does not unpack the point. And it is not perfectly clear if authority per se is part of his conception of this “capacity”. Still, the point seems to resonate with claim [2], especially if we pair Feinberg’s point with Darwall’s views about second-personal authority, considered earlier. Indeed, Meyer (1989) tries to unpack Feinberg in a way that seems to anticipate Darwall’s view. (See also, Forst 2011, who offers a similar line of argument to Darwall, which he credits partly to Ernst Bloch. But see Sangiovanni 2017, who objects to both Darwall and Forst, esp. pp. 50–60).

2.3 Are distinctiveness and fragility defining properties of dignity?

It is possible to take an even wider view on the defining criteria of dignity. For example, consider Etinson (2020), who represents another case of conscientious second-order theorizing. Etinson argues that a complete theory of dignity should explain not only what “grounds” dignity—“that is, how and why one comes to possess or lose it”—but also its “proper” method—that is, “how inquiry into all of this should proceed and be understood” (2020: 356). The latter demand is akin to calling for an articulation of the defining properties of dignity, in the sense that we have been discussing. However, Etinson adds an important substantive claim about this method: He agrees that dignity is partly distinguished by something like a distinctive “normative function”, but sharpens this claim by suggesting that to explain this function, we should focus specifically on the conditions of dignity’s violation. This refinement is important for two broad reasons.

First, over its long history, inquiry into human dignity has often been conjoined with considerations of what it means to harm dignity: What constitutes disrespect of dignity? Can we lose it? Can it be destroyed? And so on. Call this, the question of dignity’s “fragility”. Sometimes, this question is taken up within a direct examination of dignity (see, e.g., Kaplan 1999 or Dussel 2003). At other times, the motivation is pragmatic. For example, in his reflection on legal appeals to dignity, Schacter (1983) writes:

When [dignity] has been invoked in concrete situations, it has been generally assumed that a violation of human dignity can be recognized even if the abstract term cannot be defined. “I know it when I see it even if I cannot tell you what it is”. (1983: 849)

And in some cases, these reflections go the other way around; that is, from an analysis of a specific kind of dehumanizing harm (slavery, torture, rape, genocide; alienation, humiliation, embarrassment) to dignity, or one of its close cognates like “humanity” (see especially, Neuhäuser 2011; Morawa 2013; Haslam 2014; Frick 2021; Mikkola 2021).[5]

But whatever the context, it is crucial to distinguish between first-order encounters with dignity’s fragility, and second-order efforts that try to draw a connection between a negative methodology centered on the question of fragility and the positive effort to articulate the defining properties of dignity. It is the latter claim that Etinson makes, illustrated in the following incisive point:

Not all moral wrongs convincingly register as violations of human dignity…And this suggests that dignity is normatively special—that its violation represents a particular type of wrong. (2020: 357)

Essentially, Etinson is arguing that (1) we should add to the defining properties of dignity, that the value or status “dignity” picks out is in some sense “normatively distinctive”; and (2) in order to articulate (positively) what makes it distinctive, we must investigate (negatively) what it means to harm it. Thus, for Etinson, dignity does not simply have the normative function to “set off” the special status of humans in our practical deliberations; it sets off humans in a special way. And this “way” can only be understood through a consideration of dignity’s fragility.

The second reason for underlining this kind of negative methodology comes from Killmister (2020), who also makes second-order claims about the proper method for theorizing dignity. On her view, all the primary senses of dignity in the general schema can be harmed in some way or other. Each can be injured, lowered, embarrassed, humiliated, threatened, frustrated, even destroyed. Correspondingly, it is a criterion of any satisfactory theory, that it explains the nature and conditions of dignity’s fragility in all its primary senses (categories 1–4 in the general schema).

The emphasis on “all” is important. Killmister’s theory stands out for being an attempt to use the criterion of fragility to offer a unified theory of dignity. And this raises a question beyond whether fragility is a defining property of dignity. Namely, for any given theory of dignity, does it purport to theorize dignity in general, or human dignity in particular? Most literature bearing the term “dignity” in its title will say at some point that it is really or mostly about human dignity. But if so, then are such theories in some sense incomplete? Must a complete theory of human dignity (category 4 in the general schema) reconcile itself with the other primary senses of the term (categories 1–3), as Killmister implores?

The next section attempts to offer some footholds for answering these new questions. But there is one more point to make here, because it is pertinent to second-order questions about how to formulate dignity. Part of what motivates Killmister’s effort at a unified theory is an attending argument that theories of dignity should fit with everyday ways of speaking about dignity. And everyday talk of dignity, she argues, often refers to the other primary senses of dignity in the general schema. Moreover, she claims that all these ways of talking are connected by the fragility criterion, as well as some of the other defining criteria we have discussed, especially (A) the idea of a normative function and (B) an essential connection to respect. Finally, she treats this “fit” between her account of the defining properties of dignity and everyday talk about dignity as important evidence for the correctness of her own criteria. Nor is she alone in staking evidentiary value on fitness to everyday language. For example, Bird (2013) and Etinson (2020) make similar arguments.[6] Do we agree? Surely, a good theory of dignity will not run roughshod over everyday usage. Still, exactly how beholden should a theory be?

3. Human Dignity: Touchstones of Analysis

The conclusion of the last section raised the following question about the conceptual landscape of dignity research: Which of the many points being made are relevant to theorizing dignity in general, and which pertain specifically to human dignity? To answer this question, it will help to distill a few enduring themes that characterize the debate over specifically human dignity. These are hardly all the themes that could be identified. Also, because each theme has been introduced in one way or other already, the following is intentionally condensed, with the understanding that any of these leads could be followed into a forest of nuance.

3.1 Virtue, Value, Status, and the “distinctiveness” point reconsidered

One could take all the existing literature on human dignity and arrange it into three groups, depending on whether any given argument renders dignity as a kind of (i) virtue or quality of character; (ii) value or worth; or (iii) status or standing. Our analysis already laid out the most important aspects in deciding between these classifications. We also noted that the trend in secular accounts is to articulate dignity as a kind of status rather than as a virtue or value. To this it should be added that virtue accounts make up the minority of all modern positions, no doubt because most contemporary positions eschew the hierarchical drift that comes with tying dignity to virtue.

Perhaps less obvious in the literature, is the agreement to articulate what is distinctive about dignity, regardless of which way it is rendered: virtue, value, or status. This “distinctiveness” point is pressing, given Etinson’s (2020) argument that a negative analysis of dignity’s fragility is crucial to understanding what is “special” about dignity as a normative concept. On his view, a good theory of dignity will pick out a “meaningful distinct set of concerns” (2020: 354), if it is to justify using the term at all. The force of this point extends beyond the question of whether fragility is a defining property of dignity. But to appreciate fully why, we need to contextualize it. So, consider the following:

The idea that human beings are morally special or distinctive has found expression in the religion, philosophy, literature, and art of all societies, modern and ancient. And connected to that idea and those expressions is an enduring struggle to understand what this peculiar “value” is. Since antiquity many have leveraged this idea about human distinctiveness into the idea that humans are supremely valuable. The chorus in Sophocles’ Antigone (c. 441 BCE), for example, lauds man as the most “wondrous” of all things in the world, a prodigy who cuts through the natural world the way a sailor cuts through the “perilous” surging seas that threaten to engulf him (verses 332 ff., cited in Debes 2009 at p. 52). Similarly, the Judeo-Christian doctrine of imago Dei trumpets human dominion over the earth and the distinctive value of humanity. Excluding God and angels, the doctrine implies that humankind is preeminently valuable.

Admittedly, these are not references to theory, strictly speaking. However, the historical development of dignity has long been tangled up with this kind of widespread attempt to explain human distinctiveness, even if only implicitly or under cognate terms like “uniqueness” (e.g., Muray 2007 and Rolston 2008). Indeed, one might say that the most basic point of the concept of dignity, especially as it was molded into the category of “human dignity”, just is to describe the distinctive virtue, value, or status of humans. From Cicero’s ancient claim about the special worth of the “human race”; to Schacter’s (1983) anti-Waldron argument that dignity’s importance outside of legal contexts highlights the need “to treat it as a distinct subject” (1983: 854); to Iglesias’s (2001) attempt to explain our “distinctiveness” as human beings; to Kateb’s (2011) claim that human dignity involves the unique role humans have as “stewards” of the earth—in all these arguments the distinctiveness point is in play. Or consider Simone Weil, writing in the shadow of World War II, and who inspired Iglesias:

There is something sacred in every man, but it is not his person. Nor yet is it the human personality. It is this man; no more nor less… The whole of him. The arms, the eyes, the thoughts, everything. Not without infinite scruple would I touch anything of this. (first published 1957 [1986: 50–51])

Similarly, Malpas (2007) explicitly argues that insofar as we are investigating human dignity, it seems we are inquiring into what is distinctively valuable about “being” human, by which he means something like the experience of being human.

This said, we must understand Etinson as arguing that it is not enough to claim that what explains the moral distinctiveness of humans is their “dignity”. We have to say what about human dignity itself is distinctive. And we must do so in a way that would substantiate (in part or in whole) the more general claim of human distinctiveness. After all, Etinson argues, not all kinds of harms to humans count as harms to their human dignity. Not even all harms to their status are obviously harms to their human dignity. Slapping someone in the face is certainly an affront to their status in some sense, and perhaps even necessarily to their social-status dignity ((3) in the general schema), but not necessarily to their human dignity ((4) in the general schema). (See also, Valentini 2017.)

So, what is distinctive about human dignity itself? There is more than one way to answer this question. Etinson’s own suggestion, as we have seen, is to use a negative normative lens to articulate what kinds of harms to humans count distinctively as harms against their dignity. But rather than tracing out further particular answers to this question, let us note a few final general observations about the distinctiveness point.

First, most theorists of dignity do not explicitly parse out the need to explain the distinctiveness of dignity itself, as contrasted with human distinctiveness in general. However, I submit that explaining the distinctiveness of dignity (itself) is often part of what many theorists take themselves to be doing, however indirectly. In other words, explaining dignity’s “distinct set of concerns”, to use Etinson’s phrase, seems to be constitutive of many theories of dignity. There is no space to substantiate this contention here, but we risk losing valuable insights about dignity’s distinctiveness if we don’t take this charitable approach.

Second, it is important not to run together the normative upshot of any claim about the grounds of dignity, with a definitional point about dignity’s distinctiveness. For example, if one thinks humans have dignity in virtue of their rational agency, then in one sense, this will entail a kind of distinctiveness. For, it will necessarily inform the substance of whatever rights or duties we think dignity justifies. In other words, the content of such rights and duties will need to be “distinctively” tied to rational agency, and what it means to protect, harm, or nurture this agency. Likewise for any other candidate account of dignity’s grounds. Nevertheless, this is different than talking about distinctiveness as a defining property of human dignity. Scholars like Etinson and Killmister are trying to articulate the distinctive normative function that defines dignity, regardless of its grounds—indeed, which any satisfactory account of dignity’s grounds must be able to explain.

Finally, Debes (2009) adds the following qualification to the “distinctiveness” point:

A proper account of dignity must pick out a distinctive value belonging to humans. This is not equivalent to demanding a value that belongs distinctively to humans.

The latter demand (which some theorists do insist on), not only arbitrarily rules out a shared space of dignity between different entities but also risks ruling out the best options for dignity’s grounds:

For example, if rationality should after all turn out to be the most defensible basis for a theory of human dignity, we [humans] wouldn’t want to yield it simply because we discovered that chimps and whales were rational or that Martians really have been trying to communicate with us for millennia. (2009: 61).

3.2 Individuals vs. species

The conclusion of the last section brings to mind another theoretical dividing line in the literature, between those arguing for human dignity qua human individual, and those arguing for human dignity qua species. Which is it?

Some say, both. For example, Kateb (2011) argues that we must explain the uniqueness of persons and the species: “I am what no one else is, while not existentially superior to anyone else; we human beings belong to a species that is what no other species is” (2011: 17). According to Kateb (echoing Cicero), humans are partly divorced from the natural order both individually and collectively, in virtue of possessing unparalleled and morally special capacities for self-creation. Moreover, Kateb is clear that the distinctiveness of human dignity also grounds human normative supremacy. Indeed, on his view, human supremacy is one of the defining properties of dignity: “The core idea of human dignity is that on earth, humanity is the greatest type of being” (2011: 3–4); we are “the highest species on earth—so far” (2011: 17).

Of course, such claims are contentious. But if we want to engage them, it is important to be clear about whether we are doing so at the definitional level, or at the level of dignity’s grounds. For example, recall Cicero’s claim that it is in virtue of our distinctive capacities for self-development “by study and reflection”, that human beings have a “superior” “nature” to that of “cattle and other animals”. This Ciceronian idea about the grounds of dignity shares affinities with many other extant views, including Kant, Pico, and obviously Kateb. And we have considered reasons for rejecting this line of argument. But even if one accepts it, the present point is that one might not endorse Kateb’s claim about the “core idea” of dignity being essentially about the human species. That is, one could agree with Kateb about what grounds dignity but disagree that part of what defines dignity, is the property of species superiority. Stern (1975) and Gaylin (1984), for example, agree that the concept of dignity is most essentially about human worth or status, but argue that this does not imply that the human species possesses dignity. It only implies that each individual human has dignity.

Finally, any claim about the dignity of the species or collective humanity must confront worries about speciesism, and in turn all the objections of those who think that non-human animals have a purchase on the normative space of dignity (see, e.g., Rachels 1990; Pluhar 1995; LaFollette & Shanks 1996; Bekoff 1998; Meyer 2001; Rolston 2008; Singer 2009; and especially Gruen 2003 [2010], who explores the idea of “wild dignity”.)

3.3 Inherent vs. constructed

It is common to talk of human dignity as “inherent”. What this means, however, is often unclear. Sometimes it is redescribed to mean “intrinsic”, other times “inalienable”. It is also often conjoined with claims that dignity is “inviolable”—although this is dubious if inviolability is supposed to be entailed by inherentness. After all, one might agree that human dignity cannot be entirely destroyed because dignity is inherent, but nevertheless allow that human dignity can be harmed, insulted, frustrated, and humiliated.

This is not to suggest that all that is inherent is indestructible. Whether human dignity can really be destroyed depends entirely on why one thinks human dignity is inherent. If one thinks that human dignity is inherent because we have dignity in virtue of possessing a soul, then they probably do not think dignity can be truly destroyed (although they may think it can be degraded; or even, if they subscribe to Christian dogma, that it was in fact degraded by the “fall” from grace). On the other hand, if one thinks that human dignity is inherent because we have dignity in virtue of our capacities for rational agency, then they probably do think dignity can be lost or destroyed, whether by extreme psychological trauma or a sharp blow to the head.

It must also be reiterated that secular theorists of dignity have increasingly turned away from “inherentness” as a defining property of dignity (see, e.g., Darwall 2006; Debes 2009; Kateb 2011; Rosen 2012a; Waldron 2012; Valentini 2017; Killmister 2020). The reasons for doing so vary. Most reflect suspicion about the metaphysical baggage, especially of the theological kind, that historically has gone hand in hand with inherentness claims. But there are often other reasons. For example, for those that think human dignity is defined by the authority or standing to hold others responsible with second-personal claims, dignity only comes into existence within actual second-personal encounters (see, e.g., Meyer 1989, Darwall 2006, Forst 2011, and perhaps Feinberg 1970 [1980]). Or recall Valentini, who argues that the problem with the metaphysical claims needed to back up inherentness is not simply that they are “heavy”, but that they distract us from the core political function of rights. Meanwhile, for those committed to a negative methodology, like Killmister or Etinson, the starting assumption is that dignity can be destroyed. And while this does not entail that dignity is not inherent, Killmister persuasively argues that such fragility strongly tells against inherentness.

All this raises the question: If not inherent, then what? The simple answer is that on many theories dignity is socially constructed. Of course, there are many theories about what it means for something to be socially constructed, with many important differences between them. There is, for example, a chasm of difference between claiming that dignity is constructed as a constitutive part of second-personal relationships (à la Darwall or Forst) and claiming that it is constructed through the transformation of an old idea about “elevated rank” (à la Appiah or Waldron). So, the simple answer must be turned into a complicated one, which we cannot do here.

3.4 Respect: An alternative lens on dignity

A complete theory of human dignity must articulate the demands that dignity places on us, morally and politically. Some theories, as we have seen, build this expectation into the defining properties of dignity. But even when they do not, there is almost always some appeal, positive or negative, to some claim about what it means to recognize dignity, and most often to some claim about respect—which, furthermore, is usually claimed to be both what dignity demands and what it means to recognize dignity. The subject of respect, however, is its own labyrinth. It boasts an array of meanings, diverse applications, and extensive commentary. This said, two very general points about respect stand out in connection to human dignity.

First, the connection between dignity and respect has been made concrete in various political contexts. For example, Schachter (1983) notes that Article 10 of the International Covenant on Civil and Political Rights provides that,

all persons deprived of their liberty shall be treated with humanity and with respect for the inherent dignity of the human person. (1983: 848)

He marks a similar provision in Article 5 of the American Convention on Human Rights (Ibid). And this connection generates distinct challenges in the political context that reach beyond the human rights discourse. Schachter explains:

In the political context, respect for the dignity and worth of all persons, and for their individual choices, leads, broadly speaking, to a strong emphasis on the will and consent of the governed. It means that the coercive rule of one or the few over the many is incompatible with a due respect for the dignity of the person. (1983: 850)

However, Schachter further points out, many political theories contend,

that substantial equality is a necessary condition of respect for the intrinsic worth of the human person…In particular, relations of dominance and subordination would be viewed as antithetical to the basic ideal [of human dignity]. If this is so, great discrepancies in wealth and power need to be eliminated to avoid such relations. (ibid)

The question thus becomes, how can we achieve such egalitarian objectives, without the kind of “excessive curtailment of individual liberty and the use of coercion” that human dignity is also thought to eschew (1983: 850)? This question figures into some of history’s most influential political theories, from Hegel to Rawls. (For an inroad to understanding the Hegelian line, see Honneth 2007; for the Rawlsian line, see Bird 2021.)

Second, as already hinted, the introduction of respect raises its own distinctive challenge, namely, to explain what respect is. To do this, many theorists appeal, explicitly or implicitly, to what we earlier called “recognition respect”. When we make plans or choose to act, we recognize-respect others when we appropriately take account of some fact about them, by adapting, revising, or even foregoing our plans and choices in the light of that fact. So, which “fact”? Well, if we are talking about respecting persons as persons, in a moral sense, many theorists have answered that human dignity is the operative fact. Or, if they drill down further, then whatever they end up defending as the grounds of human dignity—whether rational autonomy, species membership, an immortal soul, etc.—is the relevant fact.[7]

However, the last few decades have witnessed a wave of new theorizing about respect. And this has consequences for theorizing about human dignity. The most notable consequence stems from the field of care ethics, where empathy, compassion, and caring have been conceived as distinct kinds of respect. Thus, although human dignity did not figure explicitly into early formulations of care ethics, as conceived by those like Noddings (1984) or Held (2006), care ethics has increasingly been developed in ways that does bring dignity to the fore, e.g., by those like Dillon (1992), Kittay (2005 and 2011), and Miller (2012). Dillon, in particular, gives voice to a profound alternative to rationalist paradigms of human dignity, noted frequently in this entry, and associated especially with Kant. She writes:

[Care respect] grounds respect for persons in something which, considered in the abstract, nearly all human beings have and can be said to have equally - the characteristic of being an individual human “me” - a characteristic which each of us values and thinks is both morally important and profoundly morally problematic not only in others but in ourselves as well, and which pulls our attention to the concrete particularities of each human individual. We are, on the care respect approach, to pay attention not only to the fact that someone is a “me” but also to which particular “me” she is. (Dillon 1992: 118)

The core idea Dillon expresses here about the grounds of dignity qua the concrete “particularity” of an individual person (as she puts it on 1992: 115), traces to Iris Murdoch (1970) and Elizabeth Spelman (1978). It also resonates with the thinking of Simon Weil, noted above in §3.2. More generally, Dillon’s argument illustrates how taking the concept of respect as our starting point might lead to very different views about human dignity.

4. Skeptical Worries

The conceptual complexity surrounding dignity has sparked a long history of disagreement about the utility of the concept, with some concluding that it is hopelessly messy or essentially ambiguous. One of the more cited versions comes from the Yale bioethicist Ruth Macklin, who made this complaint in a widely read 2003 editorial. “Dignity”, she asserted, “is a useless concept. It means no more than respect for persons or their autonomy” (2003: 1419).

Macklin’s claim was not backed by much argument. And judging by the literature, her complaint did nothing to slow down the application of dignity in bioethics, where it is now discussed in the context of everything from disability studies, elderly care, human research, cloning, “chimeras”, enhancement, transhumanism, and euthanasia (see the bibliography for leads to each of these). Still, one does not have to look hard to find Macklin’s allies.

For example, Rosen (2012a) claims that “animus against dignity is widely shared among philosophers, in my experience, and goes back a long way” (2012a: 143). He buttresses his claim by recounting the encouragement of a colleague to give the concept “a good kicking”, and by quoting his favorite historical challenges by Schopenhauer and Nietzsche, the former of whom called dignity, “the shibboleth of all the perplexed and empty-headed moralists” (1840 [1965: 100] cited in Rosen 2013: 143). Importantly, however, for Schopenhauer and Nietzsche, the problem wasn’t simply the ambiguity of the concept. They thought that the moralized notion of inherent or distinctive human worth garners widespread credence only because it flatters our pride and allows us to slip into self-deceptive moral complacency. This deflationary hypothesis strikes at the heart of our modern dignitarian ethos.

So, exactly how widespread is skepticism of dignity? There is no simple answer to this question because it depends greatly on what one takes dignity to be. Even defenders of one conception of dignity often express skepticism about other conceptions. For example, we already noted the trend away from thick metaphysical claims about dignity, which make dignity depend on anything like a divinely implanted “soul” or Kant’s “noumenal” idea of the self. Rosen calls such views, “internal kernel” theories, and further notes that reservations about these views are often both metaphysical (no such thing exists) and epistemological (we cannot justify our belief in such things). The present point, however, is that if one’s skepticism about human dignity in general turns on the specific reservation about internal kernel theories, then one should stay open minded. For, as we have seen, there are many alternatives for theorizing dignity that do not depend on such metaphysical commitments.

Still, because there is more than one way to interpret Schopenhauer’s claim that dignity is a “shibboleth”, it may prove helpful to trace out a little further a few possible skeptical lines of argument, albeit briefly. So, here are four ways skepticism tends to play out in the existing literature:

  1. Rosen suggests that Schopenhauer’s main complaint is that “dignity” is an impressive “façade” obscuring the harsh reality behind the idea, namely, that the concept lacks the substance to do the work we assign to it. More exactly, dignity cannot serve as a foundation for morality, including, serving as the normative basis of rights (Rosen 2012a: 143). We encountered this line of thinking already in the earlier discussion of the connection between dignity and rights. Essentially, the complaint is that no extant account of the grounds of dignity (e.g., Kantian rationalist arguments, Judeo-Christian imago Dei arguments, etc.) can satisfactorily explain and justify the kind of normative work dignity is supposed to do. See especially, Sangiovanni 2017, who rejects Aristotelian, Kantian, and imago Dei accounts of dignity as insufficient for the tasks dignity is typically set to, including grounding rights.

  2. A related but distinctively different way of taking Schopenhauer’s objection, is the worry that dignity has been politically manipulated to capitalize on its deceptive potential. As Rosen notes, the general point here is not new. “The idea that illusions are essential to the political order”, he writes, “runs through the Western tradition of political thought from Plato” (2012a: 144). However, Rosen suggests that Nietzsche gets the credit for understanding how powerful an illusion human dignity, specifically, can be, for such political purpose. “Such phantoms as the dignity of man”, Nietzsche writes,

    are the needy products of slavedom hiding itself from itself. Woeful time, in which the slave requires such conceptions, in which he is incited to think about and beyond himself! (from “The Greek State”, 1871; quoted in Rosen 2012a: 144)

    In fact, this skeptical line goes back further than Rosen seems to appreciate. Thus, in his 1714, Fable of the Bees, Bernard Mandeville essentially made the same argument. Speaking conjecturally about the origins of morality, Mandeville writes:

    Making use of this bewitching Engine [of flattery], [the Politicians] extoll’d the excellency of our Nature above other Animals…Which being done, they laid before them how unbecoming it was the Dignity of such sublime Creatures to be solicitous about gratifying those Appetites, which they had in common with Brutes, and at the same time unmindful of those higher Qualities that gave them the preeminence over all visible Beings. (1714 [1988: 43])

  3. Dignity is vacuous. Bracketing any worries about how any given political institution manipulates the idea of dignity to achieve its ends, or how human pride might capitalize on the idea of dignity to facilitate self-deception about our personal moral failings, perhaps the idea of dignity is simply unnecessary. For example, consider the first sentence of Article One of the Universal Declaration of Human Rights: “All human beings are born free and equal in dignity and rights”. What would be lost, Rosen asks, “if one were just to say, ‘All human beings are born free and equal in rights’?” (2012a: 149). A slightly different version of this complaint is that, because of its vacuousness, dignity has become mere dogma. For example, in the legal context, Theoder Heuss, called dignity a “non-interpreted thesis” in law. And Costas Douzinas argued dignity was an empty placeholder in a “hegemonic battle” of competing legal ideologies (see also, McCrudden 2013a for some analysis of both; also, Bargaric & Allan 2006).

  4. Dignity is ambiguous. The thrust of this frequent complaint is that dignity has become a useless concept, not so much because it is empty, but because it has too many meanings. (A few have even claimed that the concept is “essentially” ambiguous, though it is not clear what this is supposed to mean; see, e.g., Shultziner 2007 or Rotenstreich 1983.) When focused, this worry comes in three forms:

    1. the ambiguity of meaning makes “dignity” incomprehensible;
    2. the ambiguity of meaning makes “dignity” susceptible to abuse;
    3. the ambiguity of meaning conceals objectionable subjective opinion or substantive baggage in the concept of “dignity”.

Examples of all these positions can easily be found. But perhaps the best illustrations once again come from the legal context. Regarding (1): see, e.g., Bates (2005), who acknowledges the problem but then tries to defend dignity. Regarding (2): see, e.g., Gearty (2014) and Moyn (2013), who argue that the continuing ambiguity of dignity make it too easily abused in courtroom deliberation and democratic theories of rights. Regarding (3): see Pinker (2008), who argues that dignity is a subjective phenomenon, “relative, fungible, and often harmful”; also Rosen (2012a) and Moyn (2013), both of whom argue that our modern concept labors under underappreciated debts to Christian theology;

These are not all the possible reasons for skepticism about dignity, only the most prevalent. And each is usually sharpened in various ways that make the argument cut deeper than what this summary suggests. This said, the merits of these critiques are disputable. Indeed, much of the foregoing analysis in this entry suggests strategies of response to each.

But perhaps the most fitting way to conclude is with a different kind of question entirely. Namely, how ought we respond to such skeptical attacks, if at all? Thus, it is hard not to think of Frederick Douglass’s warning, delivered in his 1852 “Fourth of July” speech, about the dangers of demanding of anyone, that they argue for their equal and basic human worth or status—especially when so many people remain not simply oppressed, but exposed to vitriolic hate in a world that constantly proclaims its faith and commitment in the ideal of human dignity. “At a time like this”, Douglass said, “scorching irony, not convincing argument, is needed” (1852: 20).


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I am deeply grateful to my anonymous referees, who provided careful, generous, and thorough feedback on initial drafts of this entry. For research assistance on various elements of this article I am grateful to Zachary Neemah, Samuel Munroe, Reese Faust, and Alejandro Toledo. The history section draws on my own introduction to Dignity: A History (2017a), by permission of Oxford University Press.

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Remy Debes <rdebes@memphis.edu>

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