The Grounds of Moral Status

First published Thu Mar 14, 2013; substantive revision Wed Jan 10, 2018

An entity has moral status if and only if it or its interests morally matter to some degree for the entity’s own sake. For instance, an animal may be said to have moral status if its suffering is at least somewhat morally bad, on account of this animal itself and regardless of the consequences for other beings.

At the most general level, there are two ways of understanding moral status, or what others sometimes call “moral standing” or “moral considerability.” On the utilitarian approach (see the entry on the history of utilitarianism), moral considerability (their preferred term) is a matter of having one’s interests (e.g., the intensity, duration, etc. of one’s pleasure or pain) factored into the calculus that determines which action brings about the greatest utility. On the non-utilitarian approach, to have moral status is for there to be reasons to act for the sake of the entity or its interest, reasons which are prior to, and may clash with, what the calculation of the overall best consequences would dictate. The non-utilitarian approach is necessarily coupled with two further ideas: acting unjustifiably against such reasons as well as failing to give these reasons their proper weight in deliberation is not only wrong but wrongs the entity and one owes it to the entity to avoid acting in this way. Note that utilitarians could incorporate these two ideas by claiming that it is owed to entities with moral status to properly incorporate their interests into the utilitarian calculus, and that one wrongs an entity when this is not done. But these two ideas are inessential to the utilitarian approach.

Some non-utilitarian philosophers allow for the possibility that moral status comes in degrees, and introduce the notion of a highest degree of status: full moral status (FMS). After reviewing which entities have been thought to have moral status and what is involved in having FMS, as opposed to a lesser degree of moral status, this article will survey different views of the grounds of moral status, focusing especially on FMS, as well as the justification for treating these as grounds of moral status.

1. For Which Entities Does the Question of Moral Status Arise?

A variety of applied ethics debates regarding how certain beings – human beings, non-human animals, and even ecosystems – should be treated hinge on theoretical questions about their moral status and the grounds of that moral status. It is these theoretical questions that are the focus of this entry, but a quick survey of the applied ethics debates helpfully allows us to identify which entities have been thought to have moral status.

It is usually taken for granted that all adult cognitively unimpaired human beings have FMS. Of course, historically the moral status of people falling into a group perceived as “other,” such as foreigners, racial minorities, women, the physically disabled, etc. has been routinely denied. Either they were not seen as having any moral status, or if they were granted some status, it was not FMS. However, accounting for their status does not pose much of a theoretical challenge (see section 5.1) and nowadays their status is rarely explicitly and directly denied on principled moral grounds.

By contrast, constructing plausible theories that account for the moral status of other human beings – not only the degree of their status, but in some cases also whether they have it at all – is more challenging (see section 5). Debates about disability rights and the permissibility of eugenics rest in part on theoretical disagreements about the moral status of cognitively impaired humans. These issues include controversies regarding the treatment of cognitively disabled infants, such as the past U.S. practice of allowing infants with Down syndrome to die. Debates concerning abortion, stem cell research (see the entry on the ethics of stem cell research), and the question of what to do with unused frozen embryos from in vitro fertilization also rest on the theoretical question of the moral status of extremely underdeveloped human beings at various stages of development: zygote, embryo, and fetus (see section 5.2). The moral status of both underdeveloped and cognitively impaired human beings is often taken to be at issue when it comes to the use of pre-implantation genetic diagnosis and amniocentesis. In addition, medical advances that prolong life, as well as debates about euthanasia, have led people to question the moral status of humans incapable of consciousness, such as those in a persistent vegetative state and anencephalic babies (born without the higher brain).

Humans are not the only beings about whom we might ask if they have moral status, and if so, to what degree. The moral status of animals is also of concern. Debates regarding the treatment of livestock (e.g., raising calves for veal, burning off the beaks of chickens, etc.), management of wild animals (e.g., killing wolves to protect livestock, killing deer in response to their overpopulation, etc.), and the creation and design of zoos rest, in part, on the moral status of domesticated and wild animals. In some cases the ethical question of an animal’s treatment arises because of the discovery of their cognitive sophistication (e.g., dolphins, elephants, and great apes), which is taken to have a bearing on the theoretical issue of their moral status.

We have already noted that, while there are disagreements from one culture to another, and even within a single culture, both historically and at any given time, there is also significant agreement, at least among non-philosophers, that all cognitively unimpaired human adults have the highest degree of moral status. But, in addition, non-philosophers in principle, if not always in practice, accept the same view regarding all cognitively unimpaired human infants as well as human infants and adults with mild to severe cognitive impairments (as we use the term, “severe cognitive impairment” excludes those incapable of consciousness). That is, they hold that infants and the cognitively impaired, whether their impairment is intellectual or emotional, have not merely higher moral status than most animals, but also have FMS. We will call this the commonsense view. By contrast, there is no such consensus about the moral status of human fetuses, humans incapable of consciousness, and even sophisticated animals like great apes.

Nonetheless, providing an adequate theory to account for the FMS of unimpaired infants and cognitively impaired human beings (whether infants or adults) without attributing the same status to most animals has proven very difficult. In fact, our survey in section 5 suggests that this challenge has not been fully met by any of the existing accounts of the grounds of moral status. Some philosophers have, as a result, questioned or even abandoned this seemingly commonsense view, including the aspect that holds that all adult cognitively unimpaired human beings have FMS (see the end of section 4).

It is important to note that questions of moral status – having it at all as well as the degree to which it is had – arise not only for humans and non-human animals, but also for any living being/entity (such as a tree), as well as for entire species, ecosystems, and non-living entities, such as mountains or a natural landscape (see the entry on environmental ethics).

In section 5 we will discuss how a range of humans (developed, and in various stages of underdevelopment, unimpaired and impaired), non-human animals, species, and ecosystems fare with respect to various accounts of the grounds of moral status.

2. What Is Full Moral Status (FMS)?

In this section, we will discuss what having FMS amounts to – a notion key to many non-utilitarian accounts of moral status. With respect to this highest degree of moral status, the literature is the most developed and detailed. Those with FMS are often called “moral persons.” Standardly, FMS is understood to involve (i) a very stringent moral presumption against interfering with the being in various ways – destroying the being, experimenting upon it, directly causing its suffering, etc. While the strong presumption against interfering is the main aspect of FMS, some philosophers include as part of FMS (ii) a strong, but not necessarily stringent, reason to aid and (iii) a strong reason to treat fairly. Since there is no higher moral status, all beings with FMS are owed the same protections and entitlements. That is, all beings with FMS have equal moral status (see the entry on egalitarianism).

Note that while the label “FMS” comes from views that allow degrees of moral status, some non-utilitarian philosophers (Kant [GMM], Regan 2004) see the same protections as comprising the one and only possible moral status.

2.1 Stringent Presumption against Interference

All who employ the concept of FMS agree that, under most circumstances, we are morally prohibited from interfering in various ways with a being with FMS even for the sake of another valued creature and its interests, or for the sake of any other value, such as art, justice, or world peace. For instance, we are prohibited from killing a being with FMS for the sake of saving one or several other such beings. Some philosophers discuss this stringent presumption using the terminology of duties and rights and focus mainly on the right not to be killed (e.g., Feinberg 1980, pp. 98–104).

Note that FMS is not typically considered to preclude paternalistic interference. A seven-year-old human being is typically granted FMS (as we will see below) but it is nevertheless permissible to treat her paternalistically in some respects (see the entry on paternalism).

The stringent moral presumption against interfering with a being with FMS, as it is typically understood, has at least these features:

  1. It is an extremely strong moral reason against interfering, regardless of whether this interference results in harm. This extremely strong reason can be overridden only in a narrow set of special circumstances and might altogether silence many types of conflicting reasons. For example, while pleasure is a legitimate reason for action in numerous circumstances (e.g., when choosing a leisure activity), the fact that someone might receive pleasure from killing a being with FMS is altogether removed from consideration as a reason for this action.
  2. Despite its strength, the presumption not to interfere with beings with FMS may be overridden, perhaps, for example, when the lives of a very large number of others are at stake. But, crucially, even when the presumption is legitimately overridden in such special circumstances a moral residue remains, so that, for example, there is still reason to strongly regret the circumstances that called for such action.
  3. The reason not to interfere with beings with FMS is stronger than the reason not to similarly interfere with beings that have some, but not full, moral status. For example, the reason not to kill a being with FMS in medical experiments is much stronger than the reason (if there is one) not to kill a similarly situated rabbit, which some consider to have lesser moral status. (See section 3 below for further discussion.)

As noted earlier, those with FMS have equal moral status. This entails that when two beings both have FMS, the reason not to interfere with them is equally strong, all relevant factors held equal, and so one equally wrongs them when acting against these reasons, all relevant factors held equal. This idea has been dubbed the “equal wrongness thesis” and it is open to various interpretations. McMahan (2002, p. 235) focuses on the equal wrongness of killing (rather than the more general idea of the equal wrongness of acting against all the stringent protections that two beings with FMS merit). According to McMahan, a variety of factors are thought not to affect the wrongness of killing of beings with FMS (and hence it does not matter whether they are held equal), in cases when killing is wrong: the being’s age, level of intelligence, temperament, social circumstances, etc. For example, for a young and an old person who both have FMS, the reasons not to kill them are claimed to be equally strong despite the fact that the young person stands to lose much more in dying than the old. This is consistent with holding (1) that other factors, unrelated to the level of harm to the being, such as the mode of agency, defeaters, the number of people affected, and special relationships, do make a difference to the degree of wrongness of killing; and (2) that when killing is not wrong, as well as in the context of saving, factors related to harm (e.g., age, etc.) do make a difference to what’s best to do (McMahan 2002, pp. 236–7). McMahan (2008) acknowledges that there are many challenges to the equal wrongness thesis. While the equal moral status of beings with FMS entails the equal wrongness of killing such beings when all relevant factors are held equal, one can disagree about how best to interpret it, i.e., which factors are or are not relevant to the degree of wrongness of killing beings with FMS.

2.2 Strong Reason to Aid

While this is less commonly associated with FMS, some philosophers believe that there is a strong reason to provide aid to beings with FMS (e.g., Jaworska 2007 and Quinn 1984). This reason is not as strong as the stringent presumption discussed above. For example, the set of circumstances which can override the reason to aid a being with FMS is much broader compared to the stringent presumption against killing. Also, the reason not to aid might not silence many (or any) other conflicting considerations. As for which reasons override or are on a par with this strong reason to aid, there are many differing accounts (e.g., Greenspan 2010 and the entry on moral reasoning, section 2.5).

The strength of this reason to aid can also be understood in comparison with the reason to aid beings with lesser moral status, since beings with FMS merit the strongest reason to aid (see McMahan 2002, pp. 223–224, for a contrary interpretation of ordinary moral intuitions). Imagine a context in which one is saving individuals from a certain level of harm, such as pain, discomfort, or death. When faced with a choice of saving either a being with FMS or one without FMS, barring further reasons that may complicate the moral picture (e.g., indirect consequences of saving the being without FMS for other beings with FMS), there is a stronger reason to pick the being with FMS. Further, even in cases where aiding is not in fact possible or the reason to aid is overridden, it is a graver moral misfortune, ceteris paribus, to leave a being with FMS unaided, as compared to a being without FMS. Of course, what aid is appropriate for a being depends on the context and on the being’s stage of development. FMS is about the strength of the reason to aid and not about what type of aid to give.

Note that even if FMS entails strong reasons to aid, the reverse is not necessarily the case. Stronger reason to aid one being rather than another does not necessarily entail that the aided being has a higher moral status. See more general methodological cautions along these lines in section 2.4.

2.3 Strong Reason to Treat Fairly

While this is even less commonly explicitly associated with FMS, some views emphasize that comparable interests of beings with FMS matter equally in moral decisions, giving rise to strong reasons to treat such beings fairly (Broome 1990–1991 and Jaworska 2007). For example, when distrib­uting goods among such beings, in circumstances when they can all benefit similarly, barring special purposes, relationships, or independent claims on the goods, we have strong reason to distribute the goods equally (or in another way that’s fair, depending on the account of fairness). In some cases one will be distributing goods that meet needs and in other cases the goods being distributed are not needed, but will nevertheless be useful or appreciated. In either case, there is a strong reason to distribute the goods fairly among beings with FMS. This reason does not necessarily apply to beings that lack FMS; for example, a farmer need not worry about being fair in distributing food to his cows and chickens.

2.4 Distinguishing Reasons Constitutive of Moral Status from Other Reasons

It is helpful to bring out two points about FMS, the second of which is not discussed in the literature, but both of which, once made explicit, would likely be accepted by those who work on FMS.

First, the reasons mentioned in sections 2.1–2.3 ought to be understood as independent of special relationships and contracts. They are impartial reasons, that is, every moral agent (human, intelligent Martian, etc.) has reason to act or forebear acting in the ways thus far discussed (McMahan 2005). So, for instance, a parent has at least two reasons not to kill his own child: a reason in virtue of the child’s FMS, and a reason in virtue of the parental relationship, which generates a special obligation for this particular agent not to kill this particular child. In addition, these reasons are independent of other facts about the action, for example, the action’s possible bad long-term effects. Instead, they are reasons to treat the being this way for the being’s own sake.

Second, it is important, methodologically speaking, not to infer moral status (full or otherwise) simply from the degree of wrongness or badness of an act, from the existence of rights, or from the strength of reasons in favor of the act (including omissions). For example, it might be worse for a parent to kill his own child than a stranger’s child, but that does not mean that the children have different moral status. The child has a right that her parent not kill her, in virtue of the special relationships between parents and their children, but this is in addition to, and separate from, the right not to be killed that the child has in virtue of her moral status. Or, to take another example, there may be a large difference in the strength of reasons to save each of two beings from death, but this difference may have little to do with the moral status of the beings. Both McMahan (2002) and Singer (1993) hold, on quite different grounds, that death is not very bad for most animals, while it is very bad for ordinary adult human beings. Accordingly, on their views, the reason to save an ordinary adult human being from death is much stronger than the reason to save, say, a rabbit from death. But this is not itself evidence of a higher moral status of the human being. The vast difference in the benefits of aid in the two cases could, on its own, lead to a difference in the strength of reasons, which would be fully compatible with the claim that the human and the rabbit have the same moral status. (Of course, one can hold, on other grounds, that they in fact have different status, as McMahan himself does.)

Certain views might acknowledge that some humans lack FMS and yet emphasize that we ought, nevertheless, to treat them as though they have FMS due to the bad effects that would otherwise follow. One bad effect would be the mistreatment of those who really do have FMS. For example, someone might think that, for practical purposes, we need a very straightforward, stable, and difficult to misinterpret criterion of moral status (such as treating being human as a sufficient condition for FMS). If we don’t treat all human beings as if they have FMS, unclarity and moral confusion would ensue. It would open the floodgates for different people to set the threshold capacity required for FMS differently, and thereby lead to mistaken underinclusion and consequent mistreatment of vulnerable humans (such as drug convicts) who do in fact have FMS. Kant’s remarks about the treatment of animals can be interpreted along these lines. He argued that we have reasons to avoid cruelty to animals, and thus to treat animals better than their (lack of) moral status implies, since otherwise we might develop psychological propensities that could lead us analogously to mistreat humans who have FMS (Kant [LE], pp. 212–13). Similarly, one might think that if we do not treat those humans without FMS as having FMS, we might develop psychological propensities that could lead us to mistreat humans who have FMS. Another bad consequence that can arise, at least were we to fail to treat neonates as having FMS by permitting infanticide, is depriving would-be adoptive parents of the opportunity to adopt (Warren 1996, Postscript).

There are also more self-interested possible bad consequences to consider. Failure to treat infants as having FMS might lead to a lack of tenderness toward them, and thereby contribute to their turning into people who will mistreat us when they are older (Feinberg 1980, p. 198). Moreover, a rule of treating cognitively impaired human beings as having FMS would ensure that we will be treated well should we ever suffer from cognitive impairment (considered without endorsement by McMahan 2002, pp. 227–8).

Regardless of the details, on all such proposals, the requirement of treating a being as if it had FMS, or some other degree of moral status, to avoid bad consequences is not equivalent to that being’s having this moral status: while the reasons adduced might indeed be good reasons to treat the being as if it had the requisite moral status, these reasons are not for the sake of that being, but rather for the sake of other beings.

Other types of reasons for treating beings as if they had a certain degree of moral status have also been offered. Some virtue ethicists claim that we ought to avoid harming animals because harming them is incompatible with displaying the virtuous character traits we ought to display (see the entry on the moral status of animals for details). Several contractualists (see section 6 below and the entry on contractualism) have argued that one may reasonably opt out of any agreement that does not afford sufficient moral status to one’s children and others one cares about, including those who are severely cognitively impaired (Morris 2011, pp. 265–267 and Carruthers 2011, pp. 387–394). Critics and proponents disagree whether these considerations can establish reasons (e.g., reasons not to interfere) that are for these beings’ sake; hence, it is unclear whether they can establish the moral status of the beings in question.

3. Degrees of Moral Status

Those who accept that moral status comes in degrees have not developed fine-grained accounts of what each degree of status would involve. Their emphasis has been on the difference in status between creatures or entities that have some moral status (dogs, rabbits, etc.), and those who deserve the highest degree of moral status (FMS). However, with the above account of FMS made explicit, one can delineate different paradigms for capturing degrees of moral status, which we will list here simply in the spirit of marking out possible positions, and thus without addressing the pros, cons, and implications of each position.

One way to capture degrees of moral status is to vary the strength of the reasons outlined in section 2 (and hence also the degree of wrongness involved in acting against these reasons – see DeGrazia 2008). For example, while there is a very stringent moral presumption against killing an unimpaired adult human being, there might be only strong but non-stringent reasons not to kill a dog, and very weak reasons not to kill a fish. The weaker the reason not to kill is, the broader the set of circumstances are that can override this reason. In addition, it will silence fewer, if any, conflicting considerations. The other categories of reasons would be handled similarly: when the benefit to be received, the cost of providing that benefit, and other similar factors are on a par, there is a strong reason to aid an unimpaired adult human being, but only some reason to aid a dog, and very little reason to aid a fish, and so on.

Alternatively, one could treat FMS as involving a stringent reason not to be killed of the type that, in cases of conflict, would override what maximizes the overall good, whereas, for a being with lesser moral status, what maximizes the overall good – with this being’s good included in the calculus – does settle how this being should be treated (McMahan 2002, pp. 245–247).

Another way to capture degrees of moral status is to vary not the strength of the reasons but which reasons apply. Instead of the three categories of reasons discussed above, lesser moral status might involve two kinds of reasons (a stringent moral presumption against interference and a strong reason to aid, but no reason to treat fairly) or only one (a stringent moral presumption against interference, but no reason to aid or treat fairly). This, of course, is compatible with other reasons, in a given context, to aid or treat fairly that do not derive from the being’s moral status (see section 2.4).

Alternatively, lesser moral status might involve fewer presumptions against different types of interference. For example, there might be only a presumption against causing a chicken pain but not a presumption against killing it.

Of course, one could combine these approaches. For example, to have the highest degree of moral status is for there to be very strong reasons of all three types, an intermediate level of moral status (e.g., the status of a dog) might involve some reason not to kill the being but no reason to aid it or treat it fairly, while the lowest degree of moral status would involve a very weak reason of just one type. Although having the lowest degree of moral status would not afford much protection, it nevertheless is different from having no moral status at all. A fingernail has no moral status and so no reasons of any kind need be given for cutting it up and discarding it. But sufficient justification must be provided for doing this to a being with even very low moral status.

4. Scalar versus Threshold Conceptions of Moral Status

One could hold either a threshold or scalar conception of moral status, although FMS is a threshold conception. Suppose, for example, that the capacity to value (which we will use as shorthand for the capacity to make an evaluative judgment) were a sufficient ground for having a high degree of moral status. According to the threshold conception, if the capacity to value grounds a high degree of moral status, then any being that has this capacity, regardless of how often or how well it can exhibit this capacity, has the same moral status as any other being with this capacity. A being that could recognize only one value among many, and could only value it on rare occasions, would have the same moral status as a being that could recognize many valuable things and value them on every relevant occasion. If the capacity to value is not only sufficient but necessary for a high degree of moral status, then all beings lacking this capacity would not have this high degree of moral status. However, the threshold conception would nevertheless leave it open whether having some other feature, such as the mere capacity to have preferences, might be grounds for a lesser degree of moral status. (Having preferences is different from making an evaluative judgment; only the latter involves thinking of something as good, worthy, and requiring defense [Watson 1975]. As Watson notes, the strength of one’s preference needn’t at all reflect that one values it or the degree to which one values it.)

The threshold conception is not tied to any particular account of the grounds for moral status. Different grounds, discussed in section 5, might involve membership in a group, the capacity for sentience, and so on. To put the threshold conception more broadly, so as to cover any ground for moral status, and any degree of moral status, whether high or low, one could state it thus: for any X that is a sufficient ground for having n-degree of moral status, this status is not altered by factors such as how much of X a being has, how well it displays X, or the number of other features sufficient for n or lower degrees of moral status the being possesses. The threshold conception leaves it open whether having some other feature (e.g., parts of X or something lesser but akin to X) might be grounds for a lesser degree of moral status and whether yet other features (e.g., more complex capacities) might be grounds for higher degrees of moral status. FMS is a central example of this approach: all beings that meet the threshold qualifications for FMS have the same status and this status is full.

In contrast, the scalar conception highlights the importance of, for example, how often and how well one can exhibit or exercise a capacity to value. Put alternatively, if the possession of a generic capacity to value makes a difference to moral status, then the possession of different specific levels of this capacity (e.g., being able to value a greater number valuable things or to value them more fully) confers differential status. As Arneson (1999) would put it, a higher degree of the capacity entails a higher status. And so, two beings with the same (generic) capacity might not have equal moral status; only two beings with the same (specific) capacity level would have equal moral status. Arneson also thinks that if two beings have the specific capacity, but only one of them ever exercises it, then that being will have a higher moral status.

Keep in mind that, as with the threshold conception, the scalar conception of moral status is not tied to any particular account of what grounds moral status – it applies to any X that is proposed to ground moral status. Moreover, a scalar conception might not only pay attention to (i) how much of X a being has or displays, as described in the case above with the capacity to value. It also might attend to (ii) how many morally relevant features a being has. One version of (ii) focuses on features that on their own give rise to the same degree of moral status (Arneson [1999] alludes to such a view). Suppose, for example, that the capacity to value and being a member of the human species each on their own grounded n-degree of moral status. A scalar approach might hold that if a being has both these features, it has a higher moral status than a being that has only one. Another version of (ii) would allow for cases like this: suppose the capacity for preferences grounds a certain degree of moral status, while the capacity for consciousness grounds a lesser moral status. Yet, someone of a scalar frame of mind might think that the two together give a slightly higher degree of status than the capacity for preferences alone.

Lastly, the scalar conception might consider that a being’s moral status might be greater, not because it has additional less sophisticated morally relevant features, as in the previous example, but (iii) because the being has additional more advanced morally relevant features. (iii) works this way. Suppose the capacity to employ means-ends reasoning combined with being a member of the human species grounded n-degree status. The capacity to value is more sophisticated than the capacity to employ means-ends reasoning. Then, according to (iii), a human being with the capacity to value has an even higher moral status.

While both threshold and scalar conceptions of moral status allow for degrees of moral status, each faces its own set of difficulties. For example, it is not enough for those who hold the threshold view to stipulate that, for example, the capacity to do an activity well does not affect one’s status. Once the importance of some feature, such as the capacity to value, is highlighted, it seems that not only the possession of the capacity but also how well one can exercise it is morally relevant to one’s status. This is especially compelling when we compare, for example, an ordinary human adult’s capacity to set many ends (i.e, to value and pursue many objects and states of affairs) with the capacity of an impoverished being who, in its lifetime, “can set just a few ends and make just a few choices based on considering two or three simple alternatives” (Arneson 1999, pp. 119–120). The problems is essentially the same regardless of whether the capacity is actual, potential, or incompletely realized (e.g., when we compare an unimpaired baby’s potential – ability to have an ability – to set many ends with an impaired baby whose potential is far more limited).

Analogous problems also arise for accounts on which the status conferring feature is species membership or being in a special relationship. Possession of the features that qualify one for species membership may be incomplete and a matter of degree (consider Turner Syndrome where one is missing or partially missing the X chromosome) and relationships can be stronger or weaker. The strength of a relationship might depend, for example, on how robustly one instantiates the features defining the relationship (e.g., how robustly one qualifies as a member of a community) or on how well one actively relates (e.g., a child is a more active participant in a relationship than a fetus).

Furthermore, on views that allow for multiple threshold qualifications for the same degree of status (e.g., the capacity to value and being a member of the human species), whether an individual meets only one or both qualifications seems morally relevant to the degree of their status. Also, some individuals possess features more advanced than the threshold qualification. Threshold views need to provide an explanation for why such differences do not matter.

Additionally, the threshold conception allows for the possibility of discontinuities in degrees of moral status that might seem arbitrary. The difference, for example, between a being with a capacity, but who can only exercise it very poorly (e.g., a being that can recognize only one value among many and can only recognize this value on very rare occasions), and a being without this capacity (who cannot value but can only form preferences) might not seem to be very great. And yet, if the capacity to value grounds FMS, then the former being will have FMS while the latter will have considerably lesser or perhaps no moral status. The advocate of the threshold view could respond that if this capacity is important, then a being with a capacity to do it poorly has achieved something important compared to a being without this capacity. In addition, if there are multiple grounds for lesser degrees of moral status (e.g., the capacity to feel pain, the capacity to have preferences, the capacity to feel emotions, etc.), which threshold views could allow, then this might remove any large gap in status between beings with that capacity and those who lack it but who have other capacities conferring only somewhat lesser status. See McMahan (2008) for related discussion.

Scalar conceptions, on the other hand, can easily account for continuous lesser degrees of moral status, but may defy commonsense intuitions. For example, if intelligence grounded FMS, then the scalar conception would claim that those who are more intelligent have a stronger right not to be killed than those who are not quite as intelligent. But this is highly at odds with the commonsense intuition that all such beings have an equally strong right not to be killed (see Wikler 2009 for a discussion of whether degrees of intelligence are relevant to civil rights). Distinguishing and elevating the moral status of cognitively unimpaired adult humans compared to other animals thus comes at the price of denying that all cognitively unimpaired adult humans have equal moral status.

5. Grounds of Moral Status

Accounts differ on what it is about the individual that grounds or confers moral status and to what degree. This section will focus primarily on the grounds of FMS. We begin with the Sophisticated Cognitive Capacities accounts and their main strengths and shortcomings, especially when it comes to capturing the “commonsense view” discussed in section 1. We then show that alternative accounts also face troubles. So, the challenge remains to provide a plausible unified account of the grounds of FMS, especially for those who wish to defend the commonsense view. The order of presentation is, roughly, dialectical, not historical.

5.1 Sophisticated Cognitive Capacities

According to this type of account, a being has FMS if and only if the being has very sophisticated cognitive capacities. These capacities might be intellectual or emotional. Historically, the most famous sophisticated intellectual capacities account was given by Kant, according to whom autonomy, the capacity to set ends via practical reasoning, must be respected (see the entry on respect) and grounds the dignity of all rational beings ([GMM], pp. 434, 436, Prussian Academy pagination). Beings without autonomy may be treated as a mere means (p. 428). For a contemporary version, see Quinn (1984, pp. 49–52) who claims that the capacity to will (his term for autonomy) is sufficient for rights of respect. Other intellectual capacities that have been suggested, even if not always embraced, as grounding what we call FMS include the following: self-awareness (McMahan 2002, pp. 45 and 242) or awareness of oneself as a continuing subject of mental states (Tooley 1972, p. 44); being future-oriented in one’s desires and plans (one could draw on Singer 1993, pp. 95 and 100, though insofar as his own view is utilitarian it does not fall into section 5.1); capacity to value, to bargain, and to assume duties and responsibilities (all part of a longer list in Feinberg 1980, p. 197). On the emotional side, one sophisticated capacity that has been proposed is the capacity to care, as distinguished from the mere capacity to desire. (Jaworska (2007) posits this as sufficient but perhaps not necessary for FMS.) There are also combination views that appeal to both intellectual and emotional sophisticated cognitive capacities as necessary and sufficient for FMS (Feinberg 1980, p. 197).

According to Sophisticated Cognitive Capacities accounts, the feature grounding FMS is not relational: the source of moral status is neither a relation the individual stands in (e.g., membership in a species) nor a capacity whose exercise requires active participation of another (e.g., the capacity to relate to others in certain mutually responsive ways). In some versions, the exercise of the relevant capacities does not even require the existence of anyone else, while in others (as in the case of caring about someone) it, at most, involves the presence of another being but not necessarily that being’s active participation. Individuals have FMS solely because they can engage in certain cognitively sophisticated acts or responses on their own.

A being of any type that has these sophisticated cognitive capacities has FMS, and so the accounts avoid anthropocentrism. However, since most (but not necessarily all) animals lack sophisticated cognitive capacities, they are not accorded the same moral status as an unimpaired adult human. Similarly, in the case of a living organism such as a redwood tree or a fetus, as well as non-individual entities, such as species and ecosystems, they would not have FMS on these views.

Some of these views (e.g., Kant’s) do not allow for any moral status other than FMS, and so would hold that beings who don’t meet the threshold for FMS have no moral status at all. Other views are silent on this question and compatible with lower degrees of moral status for beings or entities that are not cognitively sophisticated. Yet others (e.g., McMahan 2002) explicitly insist that all sentient beings have some degree of moral status.

A stock objection to Sophisticated Cognitive Capacities accounts is their underinclusiveness. Not only will some environmentalists and animal activists find the view underinclusive, but so too will those who subscribe to the “commonsense view” articulated in section 1. For example, infants lack sophisticated cognitive capacities, and so fail to meet this necessary condition for FMS. The versions that offer only a sufficient condition for FMS seem more plausible since they leave open alternative routes to FMS. But such accounts still leave the moral status of infants unaccounted for, and possibly on a par with that of dogs and rabbits. Of course, these views nevertheless allow that there are very strong reasons not to kill human infants: it would be disrespectful and harmful to the infant’s parents, it would likely cause psychological harm to the killers, etc. But these reasons, as explained in section 2.4, have nothing to do with the moral status of infants, since they are not reasons for the infants’ own sake (Feinberg 1980, p. 198 and McMahan 2002, p. 232).

5.2 Capacity to Develop Sophisticated Cognitive Capacities

The problem, at least from the standpoint of the commonsense view, of 5.1’s underinclusion of infants can be avoided while still retaining a shared source of FMS. The accounts can be modified as follows: sophisticated cognitive capacities or the capacity to develop these sophisticated capacities (without losing one’s identity) are necessary and sufficient for FMS. This is usually labeled the “potential” account in the literature (e.g., Stone 1987), although some authors do not use this terminology, but rather speak, for example, of the wrongness of killing due to the loss of a “future like ours” (Marquis 1989 and 1995). One can also treat potentiality as a ground for some, but not full, moral status (Harman 1999, notwithstanding the revisions in Harman 2003) or as only an enhancer of moral status (Steinbock 1992, p. 68). Views differ in their interpretation of potentiality. For example, some deny that a fetus that will die while still a fetus (of any cause) has the relevant potential (Harman 1999, p. 311).

These potentiality accounts, like the accounts in 5.1, avoid anthropocentrism without according most animals the same elevation in moral status. But, unlike the accounts in 5.1, they also include very underdeveloped human beings: not only infants and one-year-olds, but even early fetuses have the capacity to develop sophisticated cognitive capacities (barring unusual cases). (Of course, these accounts are of no help to those interested in according moral status to non-human animals, trees, species, and ecosystems.)

Although Boonin (2003) denies that his view is a potentiality account (p. 62), his view does implicitly appeal to potentiality, albeit with somewhat different implications than those above. He defends having the conjunction of “a future-like-ours” (a kind of potentiality) and “actual conscious desires that can be satisfied only if [one’s] personal future is preserved” as sufficient for FMS (p. 84). Barring early death, most two-year-olds and older children meet both conditions: they have a future like ours while also having conscious desires (e.g., for avocado tomorrow), which can only be satisfied if the child lives until the next day. Early fetuses also typically have a future like ours, but they lack mental states such as desires, and thus are excluded from FMS. Boonin is explicitly neutral on the question whether animals have a future-like-ours, so his proposal is compatible with several different views about the moral status of animals (p. 84, note 36).

Any attempt to ground moral status in potentiality introduces its own challenges. One could argue that mere potential cognitive capacity is insufficient for FMS or even a weaker moral status. A potential US president has neither rights nor even a claim to command the military; likewise in the case of potentially cognitively sophisticated beings and the rights associated with moral status (Feinberg 1980, p.193). While this particular analogy has been contested (Wilkins 1993, pp. 126–127 and Boonin 2003, pp. 46–49), one can appeal to other analogies: a small child (a potential adult) doesn’t have the rights of adults to own property or to watch any television program it wants (Boonin 2003, p. 48).

Still, there is room to press back on some aspects of this objection. We do, after all, often treat people with potential differently from those without it. We provide extra music instruction, music scholarships, and create music camps for those with the potential to become great musicians, whereas we do not do so for those lacking such potentiality. While being a potential adult human does not give one a right to vote, perhaps it gives us reason to act as trustees with regard to childrens’ future status and interests and thus to educate and prepare them to become voters by the time they are adults; it does seem that children would be wronged if we neglected to so prepare them. In this way, we treat children differently from dogs who lack the potential to become adult humans, even though neither is now an adult human. And perhaps this difference in treatment would extend even to not taking certain actions (e.g., killing) that would result in the loss of the relevant potentiality. But this line of response might only go so far when it comes to fetuses. With respect to a future-like-ours, some argue that the loss of this potentiality is morally problematic only if the being is sufficiently psychologically connected to that future person, and a fetus arguably lacks this sufficient connection (McInerney 1990).

Even though the potentiality accounts come closer to capturing the commonsense view than the Sophisticated Cognitive Capacities accounts, they still are, from that point of view, underinclusive. Many conscious human beings whose cognitive impairment is both severe and permanent cannot meet these accounts’ conditions for an elevated moral status. It might be that humans who currently suffer from severe, permanent cognitive impairment, but once had sophisticated cognitive capacities, have FMS in virtue of the past possession of these capacities. But it is unclear how to defend such a claim. Moreover, the moral status of permanently severely cognitively impaired humans who never had sophisticated cognitive capacities remains unaccounted for (see the entry on cognitive disability and moral status). Even the versions of the accounts that offer only sufficient conditions for FMS still leave their moral status open and possibly on a par with animals who similarly lack both the sophisticated cognitive capacities and the capacity to develop them. In Boonin’s case, since he is agnostic about animals and so, presumably, about cognitively impaired human beings with similar prospects, his view will either overinclude the former or underinclude the latter, as both types of beings will be treated on a par.

5.3 Rudimentary Cognitive Capacities

In response to the criticisms just discussed, one could lower the standards for the kind of cognitive capacities that are necessary and sufficient for FMS. If the relevant cognitive capacities were rudimentary enough, even severely cognitively impaired human beings would qualify. Such an account might appeal to the capacity to experience pleasure or pain (sentience), to have interests or basic emotions, or the capacity for consciousness. Whether fetuses at various stages of development will thereby have FMS depends on which rudimentary capacity is appealed to. For example, an early fetus has interests but not consciousness.

This accommodation does not fit well with the commonsense view, which would see it as overinclusive. Most (but not all) animals meet these lowered standards for FMS – they have the capacity for pleasure, pain, interests, and consciousness – and so their moral status would be on a par with most human beings (namely all those who possess these rudimentary capacities). For example, some authors claim that respecting rational nature entails respecting beings that have only parts of rational nature or necessary conditions of it (Wood 1998, p. 197). Such a view seems to treat animals, infants, and severely cognitively impaired humans, all of whom exhibit only parts of rational nature, as morally on a par with each other and with unimpaired adult humans. (See O’Neill 1998 for additional critiques of this kind of Kantian approach.) Many advocates of such views explicitly and gladly embrace this inclusiveness and reject the commonsense view of the status of animals (Regan 2004).

Some philosophers only indirectly focus on rudimentary capacities. Their focus is on the “equal moral consideration” of interests, but they make it clear that possessing rudimentary cognitive capacities is a necessary condition for having interests. Utilitarianism is the best known equal consideration view, e.g., maintaining that equal amounts of suffering and pleasure should be factored equally into the utilitarian calculus, regardless of whether the suffering and pleasure is that of a human or animal. Equal consideration may be interpreted this way: since equal interests are treated equally, the beings with those interests are of equal moral status. Singer (1993), famously associated with the equal consideration view, might fit this interpretation. However, because he thinks that self-conscious beings have interests that merely conscious beings lack, he allows that the former beings might have rights that the latter lack. Interestingly, DeGrazia (2008) embraces the same ideas but goes further by saying that beings who have additional rights due to more complex interests have a higher, and thus unequal, moral status compared to beings lacking those interests and rights. Some non-utilitarian philosophers adopt the terminology of equal moral consideration (e.g., Regan 2004), as do philosophers who wish to transcend the dichotomy between utilitarian and rights-based approaches (DeGrazia 1996).

While 5.3 accounts and the equal moral consideration approach may seem to imply treating human beings and most animals alike, many of the defenders deny this counterintuitive implication by showing that two beings can have equal moral status (or deserve equal consideration) and yet require differential treatment due to differences in the interests impacted. What an unimpaired adult human stands to lose in being killed, for example, is much weightier than what a bird would lose. The capacity of foresight, for example, can make for weightier interests, and so human beings with this or other forms of cognitive sophistication are harmed more by death (Rachels 1990, pp.186–194; Regan 2004, pp. 304 and 324; and DeGrazia 1996). Potentiality can also explain differential treatment of two beings based on interests impacted, while maintaining the beings’ equal moral status. For example, there is a stronger reason not to harm a baby as opposed to a cat, given the potential of the baby and not the cat for a cognitively sophisticated future (Harman 2003, p. 187, although this is not explicitly an equal consideration view). Admittedly, in some cases comparative judgments of whose interests are morally weightier, and hence judgments about differential treatment, can be difficult, in part due to the difficulties in knowing the capabilities of minds very different from ours and of comparing well-being across species (DeGrazia 1996).

In spite of allowing for differential treatment of morally equal beings, the above accounts remain unable to capture a key aspect of the commonsense view: they are unable to account for the differential treatment of both conscious humans with severe irreversible cognitive impairments and infants who will die due to disease before acquiring cognitive sophistication, as compared with many animals (such as a dog), since here the affected interests are similar. Thus, while one may grant that rudimentary capacities ground some moral status, one must look beyond such capacities to explain the difference in moral status between humans and most animals.

Anderson (2004), although not an advocate of equal consideration, might seem to have a way around this last criticism. She points out that one can have an interest in being dignified in the eyes of the human community. While both dogs and humans have this interest, what it takes for a human with severe cognitive impairments to be dignified might be quite different from what it takes for an animal with similar cognitive abilities to be dignified, possibly leading to different rights (pp. 282–3). However, she doesn’t explain how the interests in dignity can lead to the strong protections associated with FMS, such as the right not to be killed.

Irrespective of whether Anderson succeeds, all equal moral consideration views, despite their name, seem to be incompatible with McMahan’s interpretation of the equal wrongness thesis (discussed in section 2.1). Admittedly, these views are explicitly concerned with what should be done rather than with how to evaluate an action’s degree of wrongness when one fails to do what one should. Nonetheless, in allowing or even requiring differential treatment based on differences in the interests impacted, such views seem to also imply that an action (such as killing) is more wrong if it impacts the victim’s interests more severely, whereas McMahan holds that the victim’s age or level of intelligence should not affect the wrongness of killing.

Notice that an even more rudimentary feature, which is not cognitive, would have to be considered if one were to accord any moral status to all living beings. For example, one can appeal to having a good or well-being of one’s own that can be enhanced or damaged as a ground of moral status (Taylor 1986, p. 75, and Naess 1986, p. 14). If “interests” are understood broadly enough, then nonconscious entities, such as plants, species, and ecosystems have interests (e.g., an interest in fulfilling their nature) and thus some moral standing (Johnson 1993, pp. 146, 148, 184, 287). Of course, the central challenge for such views is to explain how and why inevitable conflicts among all those with a well-being or interests should be settled. It is not enough to provide principles adjudicating these conflicts (as does Taylor 1986, p. 261); one must justify these principles in a way that is not grounded in the moral status of the beings under consideration (since their status is taken to be equal). For additional discussion and critique of these and other views, see the entry on environmental ethics.

5.4 Member of Cognitively Sophisticated Species

One way to avoid the key problems of the previous accounts is to posit membership in the human species as a sufficient condition for FMS. This is not the view that the human species itself has FMS, but rather that membership in the species gives an individual FMS. Feinberg (1980) discusses this view, whereas Dworkin (1993, ch. 3) actually posits it, although without distinguishing between this version and the modified version addressed below. Benn (1967, pp. 69–71) considers membership in the human species necessary and sufficient for FMS. Note that belonging to the human species is a relational feature (the relation of being a member of a kind), unlike the features invoked by the accounts considered thus far.

If there are non-human cognitively sophisticated individuals, such as higher animals or alien species, they would seem to deserve a high moral status equal to that of human beings. Thus, this account should not make human species membership a necessary condition for FMS, but rather be disjunctive: having sophisticated cognitive capacities or belonging to the human species is necessary and sufficient for FMS.

By introducing the latter condition (human species membership), such a view can establish FMS not only for infants and severely cognitively impaired human beings but even for fetuses and permanently unconscious human beings. Moreover, any non-human individual who lacks cognitively sophisticated capacities, which includes most (but not all) animals, lacks FMS. Thus this view accounts rather nicely for much of the commonsense view described in section 1. However, it is of no help grounding the claim that non-human animals, trees, species, or ecosystems have any moral status.

One possible cost of this approach is the loss of a unified account of FMS. That is, there are now two routes to FMS: having sophisticated cognitive capacities or belonging to the human species. Whether one is cognitively sophisticated is determined purely by psychology, while whether one belongs to the human species is determined purely by biology. Of course, it is true that the human species (as opposed to its membership criteria) is characterized both psychologically and biologically, and so in this sense the second route to FMS is related to the first.

A second problem is an arbitrary distinction between severely cognitively impaired humans and members of other similarly cognitively sophisticated species, were they to exist, who have analogous severe cognitive impairments. Imagine, for example, a cognitively sophisticated biological species of “Martians,” which has some severely cognitively impaired members. Even if an impaired Martian and an impaired human have similarly limited cognitive capacities, and even though they bear the same metaphysical relation to members of their species (they are both tokens of a biological type whose unimpaired members are cognitively sophisticated), this account nevertheless treats them as having a different moral status. This is unacceptably arbitrary.

One could modify this account by substituting membership in a cognitively sophisticated species for membership in the human species as the second sufficient condition for FMS (Cohen 1986; possibly Scanlon 1998, pp.185–86; and Finnis 1995). This approach is often implicit rather than explicitly stated and defended. For example, Korsgaard (2004) regards infants and severely cognitive impaired human beings as rational agents – presumably in the sense of being members of the kind “rational agents” – and hence deserving of respect.

This version of the account is now more unified and avoids the above charge of arbitrariness, while retaining the alignment with the commonsense view. Both sufficient conditions of FMS now ultimately appeal to the value of cognitively sophisticated capacities, and cognitively impaired members of all cognitively sophisticated species have the same moral status. Moreover, most animals still lack FMS since neither they nor their species are cognitively sophisticated.

Despite its advantages, even this modified version has problems. First, whether one belongs to a given species depends on biological criteria, such as whom one can mate with, whom one is born of, or having the relevant DNA. But it is unclear why these biological criteria are relevant for moral status. The point can be sharpened this way. The human species, for example, is a morally relevant category because the species is characterized, in part, by morally relevant properties such as sophisticated intellectual and emotional capacities, and not merely by biological criteria (e.g., mating abilities). But it is unclear why a token member of a species, a token lacking any of these morally relevant capacities, should get the moral status from the type it belongs to (the species). If membership in the type does not require any of the morally relevant features, how can the membership be morally relevant? Consequently, this modified account has its own problem of arbitrariness (Feinberg 1980, p. 193; Sumner 1981, pp. 97–101; and McMahan 2002, pp. 212–214, 216). McMahan provides an especially interesting imaginary example involving cognitively enhanced Superchimps, which, on the account under consideration, generates counterintuitive consequences for the moral status of the unenhanced chimps. For example, if the Superchimps came to outnumber ordinary unenhanced chimps, the norm for the chimp species would have changed and for this reason alone the unenhanced chimps would have gained higher moral status. A related counterintuitive consequence, not mentioned by McMahan, is the following: if the Superchimps become their own species (via gene therapy and interbreeding), a cognitively impaired member of this newly created Superchimp species with the same cognitive capacities as a non-impaired ordinary chimp (assumed here not to be sufficiently cognitively sophisticated to have FMS) would have a very different moral status from the ordinary chimp. And yet the two chimps would be alike in every respect other than their species classification.

Notice also that, on this account, an anencephalic human baby (born without the higher brain) is a member of the human species and so would have FMS. But some might find this inclusion counterintuitive.

The possibly problematic inclusion of anencephalic infants does not seem to apply to the view underlying Little’s (2008) claim that FMS is achieved late in pregnancy (pp. 332 and 348), when the fetus, which was a human organism, becomes a human being (pp. 339–341). She does not state what the criteria are for being a human being, but she may be partially following Quinn 1984 and conceiving of a human being as one who belongs to the human species and has the capacity to learn (see her page 340), where the latter feature would exclude the anencephalics. While on this view being a human being is not a merely biological matter, the view is still open to the problem of arbitrariness insofar as it holds that the morally irrelevant, merely biological feature of membership in the human species does make a difference to moral status.

One may think that the above objections can be overcome if the relevant criterion for FMS is not conceived of at all in terms of membership in a cognitively sophisticated biological species, but rather in terms of membership in a cognitively sophisticated kind. However, this approach faces a dilemma: either (a) a cognitively sophisticated kind does not include members who can never be cognitively sophisticated and thus leaves out many severely cognitively impaired human beings or (b) cognitive sophistication is not a requirement of membership in a cognitively sophisticated kind (e.g., membership requires merely having the relevant genes even if their expression is blocked by other genes or the environment), but then this membership does not seem to require any morally relevant features (e.g. the genes themselves are not morally relevant – see criticisms along these lines in McMahan 2008), and its moral relevance becomes dubious.

5.5 Special Relationships

Some views attempt to ground strong reasons not to interfere, and perhaps also to aid and treat fairly, not only by appeal to sophisticated cognitive capacities but also by appeal to special relationships (these are therefore disjunctive accounts). On such accounts, specific agents must not interfere with an individual or must respect that individual’s rights in virtue of being in a relationship with that individual. On one popular version, the relevant relationship is being a fellow member of a community, where the community is composed of all those of the same biological species (Nozick 1997 and possibly Scanlon 1998, p.185).

The motivation for this version of the Special Relationship account comes from thinking about the species relationship as analogous to other relationships (biological, social, etc.) that generate special duties and rights. For example, the relationship between a parent and his child creates an especially strong reason for the parent not to kill and to aid his child. Also, some people believe that even a gamete donor has special reason to aid the resulting child.

Other authors focus on non-species relationships, either as sufficient conditions for FMS or as merely enhancers of moral status. Kittay (2005) holds that the biosocial relation of being someone’s child is sufficient for FMS while Stienbock (1992, pp.9, 13, and 69–70) maintains that being someone’s child only enhances one’s moral status. So, for example, having a well-being, sentience, or consciousness (all of which both animals and humans have) might be sufficient for some moral status (e.g., weak rights not to be harmed and to be aided), but the status is full (e.g., the rights are at full strength) when the individual is in a specific relationship with a moral agent. Instead of being someone’s child, the relationship might be co-belonging to a community where the community’s membership requirements need not be strictly biological, but could be both biological and cognitive (see Quinn’s discussion of rights of humanity 1984, pp.32–33 and 50–54), or both biological and social (Warren 1997, p. 176).

According to Anderson (2004), the capacity for reciprocal accommodation with moral agents is a necessary (not sufficient) condition of having rights (pp. 287–9). This may appear to be a 5.3 type of view. However, unlike the capacities in 5.3, a rat, for example, might fail to have this mutual accommodation capacity vis-à-vis most humans, and so would not have the right to be killed by these humans; but the rat might nonetheless have this capacity vis-à-vis other moral agents (human rat lovers, angels, etc.), and so might be able to gain this right from these agents based on additional conditions. When this capacity for mutual accommodation is combined with membership in the human society (which does not require being a human), then, according to Anderson, this is sufficient for a relationship that grounds rights to non-interference and aid from human beings, though perhaps not as strong as those associated with FMS (p. 284).

All of these Special Relationship accounts escape one drawback of the Member of a Cognitively Sophisticated Species account. The reason not to interfere (or aid, etc.) is not based on being a token of a type with morally irrelevant criteria for membership. Merely belonging to a species or other type of group is not the source of the reason not to interfere. Instead, by being a member of a species or another group, a token individual is thereby in a relationship with another token member of the group and this relationship is taken to be the source of the reason not to interfere.  

A central problem with these approaches is that they do not truly offer an account of moral status, but only of particular agents’ reasons vis-à-vis the individual at issue. A being’s moral status should give every moral agent, whether human or not, reasons to protect that being (see section 2.4). But on these accounts, by contrast, only those moral agents who are members of the same species, or are in some other special relationship with the being, have a reason, let us say, not to kill the being (McMahan 2005, p. 355). For example, a human being, in virtue of being in a special relationship (via species community) with a human infant, has a reason not to kill the infant, but a Martian, if there were one, would not have this reason, since he would lack this special relationship with the human infant. Similarly, a human being does not have a reason not to kill an ape infant, even if adult apes are cognitively sophisticated, because the two are not in a special species-based relationship. Reasons of this sort, constitutive of special obligations, are different in kind from, and contrasted with, reasons constitutive of moral status, which are impartial. Recall the contrast between two reasons a parent has not to kill his child: the reason constitutive of his parental obligation versus the impartial reason constitutive of the child’s moral status (section 2.4).

Perhaps some Special Relationship accounts (e.g., Quinn’s discussion of rights of humanity as distinct from rights of respect) do not take themselves to be offering an account of FMS but rather only to be capturing, e.g., a strong right against others to not be killed (the key component of FMS). If so, they leave behind both the term “moral status” and the concept of impartiality. Other special relationship accounts (Steinbock’s and Kittay’s) do use the term “moral status” leaving it unclear whether they think that special relationships could somehow generate impartial reasons.

Another concern with those Special Relationship accounts that attempt to ground rights and requirements analogous to those of FMS is that they are overinclusive (although see exceptions below). If the relevant relationship is one with those in one’s social community then, depending on how this is interpreted, any animal incorporated into human social communities (e.g., dogs) would gain strong rights, contrary to the commonsense view. If the relevant relationship is instead one with those in one’s species community, then all humans are in a special species relationship with an anencephalic human baby and so, according to such an account, owe it a high level of moral protection. But, as noted earlier, some would find this counterintuitive. A related problem emerges once we notice that humans might have more of a relationship with other “embodied minds” (i.e., any being with both a body and mind, such as an animal) than with human organisms that lack minds (such as an anencephalic baby). The Special Relationship approach would then be committed to claiming that animals have stronger rights than some cognitively impaired humans (McMahan 2002, pp. 225–226). But the account would not welcome these implications of its own approach and, if it did so, it would then suffer the problem of overinclusiveness with respect to animals.

Quinn’s view (1984), although quite similar to the species community relationship view, may not be overinclusive with respect to anencephalics or animals. Though Quinn does not consider this case, he would likely conclude that anencephalic infants are mere human organisms, not human beings (because they lack the capacity to learn), or are at most partially, rather than fully, existent human beings. Thus, they do not stand in a special relationship with other human beings to the degree that unimpaired infants or cognitively impaired human beings with the capacity to learn do. Moreover, it is plausible to accept that we have more of a relationship with human beings in Quinn’s sense, which are human embodied minds, than with non-human embodied minds, such as animals. Steinbock’s view also would not be overinclusive with respect to anencephalics or animals, since the full strength of rights she discusses requires both consciousness and being someone’s child.

Insofar as Special Relationship accounts intend to ground the notion of FMS, they will also suffer from another problem encountered earlier: they are not unified since they offer two unconnected routes to FMS (sophisticated cognitive capacities or special relationships).

5.6 Incompletely Realized Sophisticated Cognitive Capacities

Almost all the accounts we have considered so far recognize cognitively sophisticated capacities as sufficient qualifications for FMS. The search for additional sufficient qualifications for FMS, meant to secure the justification for the commonsense view of who should have this highest status, has run into considerable difficulties, chiefly: overinclusion, appeal to criteria of questionable moral relevance, and loss of the impartiality characteristic of FMS.

Jaworska and Tannenbaum (2014) offer an alternative approach, anchored in the idea that cognitively sophisticated capacities can be realized incompletely. If cognitively sophisticated capacities are sufficient to elevate a being’s moral status, so too should the same sophisticated capacities incompletely realized.

To understand this proposal, let’s begin with incompletely realized activities. These are activities one engages in when one learns X “by doing”: e.g., a novice piano player learns to play by slowly reading simple note sequences and pressing (at least some) corresponding piano keys, guided by the end of mastering the instrument. With certain background conditions in place, the pressing of the keys is best thought of not as playing the piano badly, but rather as incomplete realizations of what piano playing amounts to. Jaworska and Tannenbaum interpret certain activities of cognitively unsophisticated humans analogously. With certain background conditions in place, when a child or a cognitively impaired adult models, even in a most rudimentary way, a cognitively sophisticated activity, guided by a mentor’s (parent’s, caretaker’s) end of the mentee acquiring cognitive sophistication, the mentee incompletely realizes the corresponding cognitively sophisticated activity. For instance, playing a simple game like “I-smile-then-you-smile” becomes rule following as an incomplete realization of practical reasoning.

The key background conditions are: (1) it must be reasonable for the mentor to adopt this end and (2) the mentee’s activities must be feasible means of achieving the mentor’s aim. These conditions ensure a sufficiently firm connection between the mentee’s rudimentary activities and the mentor’s end of the mentee mastering the sophisticated activity.

Now consider capacities, since they, and not activities, ground moral status. Unimpaired babies’ activities with their caretakers can straightforwardly fit the above template, so babies have the capacity to incompletely realize cognitively sophisticated activities, and thus have the corresponding elevated moral status. Perhaps more surprisingly, even many human beings incapable of achieving cognitive sophistication can fit the above template. A caretaker of such impaired humans is required, in virtue of that role, to have that human’s flourishing as an end, and the flourishing of a human being encompasses developing sophisticated cognitive capacities. When circumstances are unfavorable and the caretaker cannot reasonably hold the latter, subsidiary end as an aim to be realized, the caretaker can still reasonably hold this end as a standard (meeting condition 1), i.e. as a guide as to what next best aim to adopt. The activities of many cognitively impaired human beings can be feasible means to the caretaker’s next best aim guided by this standard (meeting condition 2). In this way, these beings have the capacity to incompletely realize cognitively sophisticated activities and so also have the corresponding elevated moral status. By contrast, it would never be reasonable for a dog’s caretaker to hold the standard of developing the dog’s cognitive sophistication, since the dog can fully flourish without such sophistication. Moreover, typically it is also unreasonable to hold the end of making the dog cognitively sophisticated as an aim (not merely as a standard). But even in some odd circumstances a caretaker could reasonably adopt this aim, the activities of the dog would fail the feasibility condition (2). So, either way, dogs lack incompletely realized cognitively sophisticated capacities.

Thus, this account overcomes the under- and overinclusion problems of the accounts canvassed above. Moreover, the capacities this account appeals to are modest extensions of the capacities deemed morally relevant by a broad spectrum of views. In addition, the account grounds impartial rather than relationship-based reasons for moral regard: the feature grounding status is not a relationship but rather is vested in the individual, just as the capacity to play a squash match is vested in the individual even though this requires that someone could play with her. The main shortcoming of this account is that, although it provides grounds for an elevation of moral status, there is no guarantee that this elevated status reaches the full array (and strength) of protections and entitlements associated with FMS. The goal of this particular account was to show that two beings (e.g. a baby and a dog) who are otherwise cognitively on a par, can have differing moral statuses in virtue of the fact that one, and not the other, currently has cognitively sophisticated capacities incompletely realized. The account assumes that cognitively sophisticated capacities are sufficient for FMS but does not address whether such incompletely realized capacities ground FMS or only a somewhat lesser moral status.

5.7 Other Grounds

In addition to some of the features noted in section 5.3 (e.g., having interests, having a good, etc.), some philosophers have attempted to ground the moral status of an entity on features that do not connect with interests in any way. One such feature is not being designed by anyone to fulfill any purpose, which some philosophers hold as a ground for being treated as an end and not a mere means, and thus having at least some degree of moral status (Brennan 1984, pp. 44 and 56 and Katz 1997, pp. 129–131). Naturalness, that is, being unaltered by humans, has also been proposed as itself a ground of intrinsic value, and so as grounding at least some degree of moral status (Elliot 1997, p. 80). Perhaps harmony and beauty might be yet other features one could appeal to as grounds of the moral status of ecosystems (Leopold 1949 and Callicott 1980). These views do not discuss whether moral status comes in degrees and provide no guidance for how to adjudicate the numerous conflicts that would arise among entities with moral status. Insofar as these two issues are addressed by supplementing these views with one (or more) of the accounts discussed in sections 5.1–5.6, the views will inherit the problems of those accounts. For elaboration of these and other such views as they arise in environmental ethics, along with critiques, see the entry on environmental ethics.

6. Justifying the Grounds of Moral Status

The survey in section 5 of the various proposed grounds of moral status largely sidestepped the question of why the proposed grounds can play their purported role in grounding moral status. What is so special about these grounds that they can confer special status on their possessors? For most of the proposed grounds this issue is not addressed in the literature. However, this issue is addressed extensively by some views that take sophisticated cognitive capacities, especially the capacity for autonomy, to ground FMS, and also by some views that take rudimentary cognitive capacities, such as sentience, to ground some moral status. So these are the views we will briefly summarize here.

Authors working within the Kantian tradition have elaborated and defended various versions of the claim that autonomy, or the capacity to set ends according to reason, is unconditionally valuable and the ultimate condition of value of everything else (see the entry on autonomy in moral and political philosophy, sections 2 and 2.1). Numerous variants of the argument for this claim can be found in the literature, and the most prominent ones take the transcendental form (see the entry on transcendental arguments, section 5). On one version, in rationally choosing or valuing anything at all one must presuppose the supreme value of one’s own rational capacities, and, by extension, the supreme value of rational capacities in general (Korsgaard 1996a and 1996b). On this picture, rational agents must recognize the supreme value of rational capacities as a condition of valuing anything else, and this recognition takes the form of affording FMS to beings with rational capacities. This argument has spawned numerous responses from both critics and proponents. For critiques, see, for example, Regan (2002) and Bukoski (forthcoming). For alternative defenses and responses on the Kantians’ behalf, see Sussman (2003).

Contractualist conceptions of morality attempt to derive all of morality, together with full moral status of individuals, from a hypothetical reciprocal agreement (entered into under conditions specified variously by different versions) among rational agents (see the entry on contractualism). The claim is that all able parties would agree (make a contract) to be bound and to bind others to treat them in the agreed-upon ways (that encompass FMS). These views work well to explain why the capacity to enter and adhere to such a reciprocal agreement, which includes the capacity to both demand moral status for oneself and to respect the moral status of others by assuming duties and responsibilities, would confer FMS on an individual.

More generally, on views that conceive of morality as at least partly originating from rational agents actively binding, obligating, or imposing authority on one another, it is easy to see why those with sufficient cognitive capacity to impose their authority on others would have FMS that others are bound to respect. For example, Quinn (1984) speaks of a “picture of morality as a nexus of independent spheres of authority to permit, forbid, and require” (49) and, because he sees the capacity to will as sufficient for such authority, it is also sufficient for FMS.

Utilitarians and those sympathetic to utilitarian approaches often see the protection and promotion of interests, where this is understood to presuppose consciousness, as the central subject matter of morality (e.g., DeGrazia 1996, p. 39). On such views it is straightforward why the capacity to have interests is crucial to having any moral status at all. On some views, the capacity to experience pleasure or pain (sentience) is a prerequisite of having interests and this explains why sentience is a ground of moral status (Singer 1993, p. 57). Environmentalists, unlike Utilitarians, do not assume consciousness is a necessary condition for having interests and hence use the term in a broader fashion.  However, they do not explain why interests, broadly construed in this way, give rise to moral status.


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Special thanks to Amy Kind and the reviewers for SEP for feedback, to Yvonne Tam and Monique Wonderly for research assistance, and to the John Templeton Foundation and the Brocher Foundation for financial support.

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