Economics in Early Modern Philosophy
Economic discourse of the early modern period offers an analysis of specific core phenomena: property, money, commerce, trade, public finance, population growth, and economic development, as well as investigations into economic inequality and distributive justice. Many of the leading early modern philosophers, from Nicholas Copernicus to Adam Smith, made significant contributions to economics. This list includes Jean Bodin, Thomas Hobbes, John Locke, George Berkeley, Montesquieu, Jean-Jacques Rousseau, David Hume, Étienne Bonnot de Condillac, and Jeremy Bentham. Other philosophers of renown addressed the principles of property and commercial obligations, notably Hugo Grotius, Samuel Pufendorf, Thomas Paine, Immanuel Kant, Condorcet, and Sophie de Grouchy. If economics is construed more broadly as reflections on the moral dimensions of material betterment, then the list much expands, to include, for example, Bernard Mandeville, Frances Hutcheson, Voltaire, Thomas Reid, and Antonio Genovesi. If one expands the ambit of economics to include the complex interplay between reason and the passions as directed at the pursuit of happiness, then countless men and women of letters in the early modern period contributed to this discourse.
There were at least a dozen schools of economic thought in the early modern period. Impressively, by the close of the eighteenth century, many of the core principles and laws on money, markets, and trade had been articulated, and many of the methods of economics—model building, time series analysis, statistical estimation, game theory and decision theory—were already extant. In sum, the “science of commerce” as economics was mostly known at the time, was a mature inquiry and, as held true of the natural sciences in the early modern period, drew substantially on its philosophical roots.
- 1. Schools of Economic Thought
- 2. Temporal Boundaries
- 3. Pre-Modern Economic Thought
- 4. Ethics of Commerce and Trade
- 5. Principles of Property and Contracts
- 6. Philosophy of Money
- 7. Scientific Status of Economics and its Methodology
- 8. Distributive Justice
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
1. Schools of Economic Thought
Adam Smith’s An Inquiry into the Nature and Causes of the Wealth of Nations (1776) is without question the single most influential tome, both for the early modern period and for the entire history of economics. Smith’s analysis not only unpacked the core features of money and markets, but also provided a dynamic analysis of the “progress of opulence”, sweeping across the globe and reaching back to ancient times (see Rothschild & Sen 2006). He covered the entire range of economics, from price theory to public finance. Significantly—and this may prove his greatest contribution—his first and only other book, The Theory of Moral Sentiments (1759), developed a moral psychology that served as the foundation for his economics and, arguably, for economics to the present insofar as it still commits to the self-interest axiom (see Davis 2003; Schliesser 2017; Fleischacker 2013 ). Smith’s first book motivated the universal sympathetic regard that binds us to one another, even to strangers, and it established a restless desire for approbation and hence for wealth as the driving force of human betterment. Finally, his essays on the history of science served to elevate the epistemic standing of economics, and by the first half of the nineteenth century the science of political economy, as it came to be known, was widely esteemed (see Redman 1997).
Smith remains nonpareil, not only because of the breadth and depth of his work, but also because he provided one of the most penetrating analyses of human behavior to explain our economic condition. If Hobbes offered a political solution to conflict and penury, Smith grasped a century later that economic forces, the accumulation of wealth and the ever-expanding global trade, overrode the power of the most ambitious of sovereigns. Recognition of the immense power of markets, both local and international, commenced in the seventeenth century, as a number of prominent twentieth-century economists came to recognize. John Maynard Keynes paid tribute to the English Mercantilists, John Locke, and William Petty; Friedrich Hayek honored the insights of Bernard Mandeville and Richard Cantillon; Paul Samuelson admired François Quesnay; and Milton Friedman praised John Law. All four—Keynes, Hayek, Samuelson, and Friedman—admired and wrote about David Hume’s economics (see Schabas & Wennerlind 2020: Ch. 7).
Smith owed a sizable debt to his immediate predecessors, above all to his close friend Hume with whom he exchanged ideas for over twenty-five years (see Harris 2015). There is a grain of truth to Joseph Schumpeter’s harsh judgment that
the Wealth of Nations does not contain a single analytic idea, principle, or method that was entirely new in 1776. (Schumpeter 1954: 184)
This, however, is testament to the theoretical maturity of economics by the second half of the eighteenth century. The most robust verities of economics, even to this day, are to be found in the pre-Smithian literature (see Hutchison 1988). The core elements of the theory of prices had been broached, its grounding in use-value and exchange-value, the appeal to the costs of labor and the imperative of cost-recovery, as well as the laws of supply and demand in various guises, including the concept of the price-elasticity of demand. Pre-Smithian economists are renowned for contributions to monetary theory, stipulating the form and function of money, the principles of bimetallism, debasement and devaluation, the quantity theory of money, the specie-flow mechanism and the multiplier (see Murphy 2009; Arnon 2010). Gresham’s law, devised circa 1560, was extended from domestic currencies to foreign exchange markets. Financial markets became increasingly sophisticated, with a wide array of equities, bonds, and discounted banknotes in circulation. The state issued public debt in the form of bonds and Exchequer notes, and amassed significant funds through lotteries and annuities (see Neal 1990). In the stock markets of Hamburg (1558), Amsterdam (1602), and London (1698), one could find short selling (windhandel), bond-equity swaps, and futures (see De Marchi & Harrison 1994). In 1747, Émilie du Châtelet is reputed to have devised and profited from contracting a percentage of future tax revenues, a novel instrument akin to a modern derivative (Bodanis 2006: 217–218).
Economists before Smith, such as Cantillon, Hume, James Steuart, and Anne-Robert-Jacques Turgot, discerned some of the key arguments for the gains from trade and the dynamics of economic growth that stemmed from the division of labor, population growth, economies of scale and, above all, capital accumulation (see Murphy 2009). Because of the growth of markets and factor mobility, eighteenth-century economists recognized the regional manifestation of a uniform wage and profit rate, and thus made insights not only about the inverse relationship between profits and wages but also about the tendency of the profit rate to decline over time. Above all, they did what is essential to most if not all philosophical thought—drive a wedge between appearance and reality—distinguishing prices from underlying values, and the nominal or money wage from the real wage, its purchasing power. Petty, Hume, and Smith firmly entrenched the central distinction of the nominal and the real in economic discourse while also grappling with efforts to measure inflation.
As a field of inquiry, economics was prodigious during the early modern period. From the mid-sixteenth to the late eighteenth century, the catalogue of French and English publications on economics exceeded five thousand entries (see Massie 1760; Théré 1998; Hoppit 2006). These took the form of books, short tracts, essays, pamphlets, and dictionaries, as well as entries in periodicals such as the Gentleman’s Magazine or Éphémérides du citoyen.
There were at least a dozen distinct schools of economic thought in early modern Europe (see Hutchison 1988). By far the largest and most long-lived were the Cameralists, and their voluminous output is not included in the figure of five thousand given above. Cameralists were to be found across the Germanic, Scandinavian, and Italian principalities or republics for much of the seventeenth and eighteenth centuries. Kameralwissenschaft, or the economics of the chamber, was primarily a set of courses for young men as preparation for government positions. They also studied philosophy, the metaphysics of Christian Wolff for example, as well as botany, chemistry and metallurgy (see Tribe 1978; Wakefield 2009). Some of the leading Cameralists, notably Johann Joachim Becher, Joseph von Sonnenfels, and Johann Heinrich Gottlob von Justi, advanced distinct doctrines pertaining to autarky or public finance, vestiges of which endured in twentieth-century Fascism. Justi’s last book, System des Finanzwesens (1766), synthesized much of the extant knowledge of Cameralism, specifically on fiscal policy. As a group, they concentrated on resource extraction—mining and logging—as the means to enrichment and self-sufficiency, but there were also schemes, particularly by the Swedish botanist and Cameralist, Carl Linnaeus, to domesticate non-native plants as a means to reduce trade dependencies (see Koerner 1999).
Innumerable writings on money, trade and commerce were posthumously grouped by Adam Smith under the rubric of the “Mercantile System”, or what eventually came to be known as Mercantilism. Many of the texts were polemical and self-serving, and endorsed Crown rights and monopolistic trade. Mercantilist writings sprang up across western Europe, particularly in seventeenth-century Sweden, Holland, and England (see Magnusson 1994; Stern & Wennerlind 2014). Among these were important works by Gerard de Malynes (1622) and Edward Misselden (1623), each of whom made efforts to discover the underlying factors for the economic depression of the 1620s (see Appleby 1978). The two most influential English mercantilists, Thomas Mun (1664) and John Cary (1695) theorized about the gains from trade and its benefits for national wealth and well-being, and were by no means crude bullionists (see Reinert 2011).
Other schools were more localized and less enduring than the Cameralists or Mercantilists. One of the first is the Salamanca school of mid-sixteenth-century Spain that included Luis de Molina, Martín de Azpilcueta, and Francisco Suárez (see Grice-Hutchinson 1978). Another school drew inspiration from the natural law theories of Hugo Grotius and Samuel Pufendorf, who had addressed the principles governing contractual obligations in general, and the complexities of property rights in particular (see Skinner 1999). Johan De Wit and Christiaan Huygens of the Dutch Golden age recorded important insights into commercial mathematics (see Daston 1988; Sylla 2003). The Political Arithmeticians of seventeenth-century England and Ireland, notably William Petty, Edmund Halley, and John Graunt, devised ingenious methods for measuring population, the money supply, and the movement of core prices (see Rusnock 1999). The Stadialists of eighteenth-century Scotland, namely Lord Kames, Adam Ferguson, and John Millar, offered a theory of economic development based on four stages, hunting and gathering, shepherding, cultivation, and commerce and trade that was partly adopted by Hume and Smith (see Wolloch 2011).
Early modern France spawned a number of distinct groups, each one adhering to the dictates of a single leader, namely the Colbertistes (Jean-Baptiste Colbert), the Gournay Circle (Jacques-Claude-Marie-Vincent de Gournay), and most famously, the Physiocrats, who were also known as “les économistes” devoted to their founder François Quesnay, court physician at Versailles (see Meek 1962; Larrère 1992; Faccarello 1989 ). In the Italian cities, Milan and Naples, Enlightenment circles were renowned for espousing the ideals of pubblica felicità (public happiness) and economia civile (civil economy). Some of the leading thinkers were Antonio Genovesi, Cesare Beccaria, Pietro Verri, and Ferdinando Galiani (see Robertson 2005; Reinert 2018). Portugal housed an active group of economic thinkers, notably António de Vasconcelos Nogueira and Isaac da Pinto (Cardoso 1990). In colonial America and its early days as the republic of the United States of America, Benjamin Franklin, Thomas Paine, Alexander Hamilton, and James Madison, among others, devised a distinct set of principles on money, banking, capital markets, and property rights that were directly indebted to the teachings of Locke, Montesquieu, Hume, and Smith (see Pocock 1985).
From the standpoint of present mainstream economics, the legacy of the British utilitarians was by far the deepest and longest, starting with Francis Bacon, Shaftesbury (Anthony Ashley Cooper), and Francis Hutcheson, who coined the phrase “the greatest happiness for the greatest number” (1725 [1726: §3.8]), a governing principle for both Hume and Smith in their economic inquiries (see Gill 2006; Driver 2009 ). Hume’s quartet of “happiness essays” (1742 but collected in 1758), and Smith’s two books (1759, 1776) are replete with insights on the ethical dimensions of the pursuit of wealth. Each one recognized that there were many impediments to happiness, that humans are prone to self-deception, to overestimate their luck and to underestimate the adversities that life holds. They each positioned non-pecuniary goods, equanimity and friendship, as more valuable than material wealth, and issued numerous insights on the various paths one might take with one’s life. While the debate about the degree to which either Hume or Smith adhered more to virtue ethics than to utilitarianism may never be resolved, when it comes to their respective economic analyses, their consequentialist observations about untoward ambition or the value of foresight fits a utilitarian sensibility (see Sakamoto 2016: Schabas 2015).
The early utilitarians, grounded in British empiricism, laid the foundation for both the classical school of political economy and for neoclassical economics that commenced with the Marginal Revolution of the 1870s. Jeremy Bentham, John Stuart Mill and Henry Sidgwick made major contributions to the moral doctrine of utilitarianism and to political economy. It is important to distinguish the moral doctrine of utilitarianism from the utility theory of value that unpacks the formation of prices. Utilitarianism provided a framing for economic thought from the seventeenth century, whereas the utility theory of value, while broached multiple times in the eighteenth and nineteenth centuries, only replaced the labor theory of value in the 1870s.
Interestingly, the majority of the leading contributors to nineteenth economics lived in Britain. This list features David Ricardo, John Stuart Mill, Alfred Marshall—even Karl Marx, notwithstanding Jean-Baptiste Say, Léon Walras, or the Austrians. The prevalence of economic discourse in Britain might partly reflect its hegemonic standing in global trade, but a more significant factor might be its enlightened culture that fostered freedoms of the press, liberal mores, and religious toleration (see Winch 1996).
Eighteenth-century economic discourse was more evenly spread across the Continent, but the empiricist school in Britain left the most enduring imprint. Locke, Hume and Smith made important contributions to economics, whereas scholars have yet to locate significant economic insights in the work of the leading rationalists, Descartes, Spinoza, or Leibniz, although Leibniz also wrote extensively on politics. One discernible pattern is that the leading anglophone contributors to eighteenth-century economics were, for the most part, not English-born, but Dutch, Scottish or Irish; nor were they particularly devout. Locke is the notable exception on both counts. It is important to point out that Mandeville (Dutch), Cantillon (Irish-French), and the Scots Law, Hume, and Smith, were inclined to study and promote commerce and trade as the progressive face of a more secular world. If much of modern economic thinking builds upon moral philosophy, it is and was, with a few exceptions, grounded in non-sacred sources.
This pattern of thinkers on the periphery of the religious status quo is also manifest in the nineteenth century, with Say, Ricardo, and the Mills, père et fils. To engage in the study of economics demands a willingness to overcome the Biblical restrictions on commercial activities. As Voltaire observed, praising the degree of religious diversity in the London stock market,
where there is not liberty of conscience, there is seldom liberty of trade, the same tyranny encroaching upon commerce as upon Religion. (Voltaire [1952: 43])
The fact that individual liberties and religious toleration were more prevalent in Britain might provide a more plausible explanation as to why mainstream economic thought was most cultivated in the English language over the course of the eighteenth and nineteenth centuries (see Mokyr 2009). This is in marked contrast to the natural sciences, which were most concentrated in France in the eighteenth century and in Germany in the nineteenth century.
Many contributors to economics were actively engaged in scientific and philosophical societies. The members of the Hartlib Circle of mid-seventeenth century England conjoined natural science with economic objectives, not least alchemical pursuits as a solution to the dire shortage of coins (see Wennerlind 2014). Its best known member, the Irish philosopher William Petty, was a leading contributor to monetary theory and demography, as well as a founding member of the Royal Society. His economic writings fill two large volumes and he broached the concepts of the transactions level and the velocity of money, two key variables that cemented the core principle of the quantity theory of money. Two of the most renowned philosophers of the period, Locke and Isaac Newton, were actively engaged in debates over the value of the currency, specifically when Newton served as Warden and then Master of the Mint (see Westfall 1981). Hume and Smith were members of the Edinburgh Philosophical Society (Hume was co-secretary) and were close friends of the leading contributors to mainstream science, William Cullen, Joseph Black, and James Hutton in Scotland, as well as, in Hume’s case, the French proto-evolutionist Comte de Buffon and, in Smith’s case, the French botanist Charles Bonnet. Smith’s essays on the history of astronomy and of physics, first sketched in the 1750s but updated and revised for the rest of his life, display a sophisticated command of science and the history and philosophy of science. His stance was one of fallibilism and instrumentalism, and he broached the possibility that the Newtonian system, while ascendant, would one day be superseded (see Schliesser 2017).
In France, the Académie des Sciences offered prizes for contributions to economics, and the multi-volume Encyclopédie (1751–1780) produced by Denis Diderot and Jean le Rond d’Alembert distinctly positioned economics on the tree of knowledge, as one of the three branches of the moral sciences (politics and natural jurisprudence were the other two). It contained numerous entries on mining, metallurgy and textiles, including one that illustrated the production of metal pins that most likely inspired Smith for his analysis of the division of labor (Ross 1995, 273-274). There were important entries by Rousseau, entitled “économie ou œconomie” (1755), by Quesnay, entitled “fermiers” (1756) and “grains” (1757), and by Turgot, entitled “foire” (1756). In sum, eighteenth-century economics was conjoined with natural philosophy, both theoretical and applied. It is not by accident that Turgot, best known as an economist and as Contrôleur général des finances (1774-1776), devised one of the most critical breakthroughs for the Chemical Revolution. His concepts of expansibilité and vaporization recognized that each substance, when heated, underwent state changes from solid, to liquid, to gas. A number of the leading contributors to eighteenth-century science, notably Carl Linnaeus, Leonhard Euler and Antoine Lavoisier, also wrote about economics.
2. Temporal Boundaries
When writing the history of a segment of the past there is always a degree of arbitrariness in demarcating its temporal boundary. Early modern philosophy spans the early sixteenth century to the late eighteenth century, but where to draw the precise boundaries will forever garner debate. In the history of economics, there is little question that Adam Smith constitutes the founding authority on the subject. A few general treatises appeared before Adam Smith’s, starting with Antoine de Montchrétien’s Traicté de l’économie politique (1615), Pierre de Boisguilbert, Dissertation de la nature des richesses (1707) and culminating with Turgot’s Réflexions sur la formation et la distribution des richessess (1766), James Steuart’s Principles of Political Œconomy (1767), and Condillac’s Le Commerce et le gouvernement considérés relativement l’un à l’autre (1776). Nevertheless, Adam Smith’s Wealth of Nations (1776) was the definitive work of the period, although it took about two decades to reach that stature, and serve as the founding text for the classical school of political economy of the nineteenth century.
As Michel Foucault discerned in Les mots et les choses (The Order of Things, 1966 ), there was a significant transformation in economic discourse circa 1800, but not for the reasons he gave. It was not that the concept of wealth was merely represented before 1800, and then gained materiality. What distinguishes early modern economics from the classical period that took hold in the early nineteenth century was that the latter organized their analysis around “the economy”. Prior to that, the various core phenomena were either treated separately or, if bundled together, were for the most part treated as part of the natural order (see Schabas 2005).
It is important to recognize that “the economy” is a theoretical construct, an emergent order that sits upon patterns of human activity directed at production, distribution, and consumption. As a social kind, recognition of “the economy” took hold with Ricardo (1817) and John Stuart Mill (1848), among others (see Tribe 1981). This shift in part reflected the great economic transformation of the time, what has come to be known as the Industrial Revolution. Smith and his predecessors were still under the grip of a pre-industrial world, one of mercantile and agrarian capitalism, with only fleeting acknowledgments of the industrial take-off that had commenced by the 1760s.
Finally, the adjective “political” became paramount in the nineteenth century, but was seldom used in the early modern period. The primary name for economics in the eighteenth century was the “science of commerce”, as is evident in the titles of a number of leading texts at the time, for example by Forbonnais, Cantillon, Tucker, and Condillac. Moreover, the primary focus was on public debt, and appeals to significant political reforms were peripheral rather than central. As Hume observed in 1741, “trade was never esteemed an affair of state till the last century” (“Of Civil Liberty”, [1987: 88])—Niccolò Machiavelli made no mention of trade; moreover, it might prove too challenging to arrive at “general truths in politics” (ibid. [1987: 87–88]). When Smith took up the “science of political economy” in Book Four of the Wealth of Nations, he limited it to the policies of the legislator and public finance. Notwithstanding attention to the political restrictions on trade and commerce, the leading economists of the latter half of the eighteenth century, namely Hume, Quesnay, Turgot, and Smith, were inclined to downplay the influence of politics, and were conservative when it came to property rights. It was an age dominated by Montesquieu in France, and Edmund Burke in Britain, and the revolutions of 1776 and 1789 were bourgeois rather than socialist (see Pocock 1985; Sonenscher 2007).
In this respect as well, political economy of the nineteenth century was significantly different in tenor; it put center-stage the plight of the poor, the expansion of suffrage to working men, and their entitlement to form trade unions. Socialist economic thought only emerged in the beginning of the nineteenth century, particularly in France. There were antecedents, such as the English Levellers Gerrard Winstanley and John Lilburne, and the Dutch reformers Johan De Witt and Pieter de la Court, but they were not important contributors to economic discourse. To a significant degree, Smith served as the inflection point, with his famous statement that “no society can surely be flourishing and happy, of which the far greater part of the members are poor and miserable”, or that merchants “have an interest to deceive and even to oppress the public” (Smith 1776 [1976: 96, 267]). British and French economic thought, with some exceptions, leaned primarily toward socialism throughout the nineteenth century. Ricardo exposed the parasitical standing of the landowning class, and spawned a radical following that included both James and John Stuart Mill, as well as a group known as the Ricardian socialists. In fact, many of the early neoclassical economists, for example William Stanley Jevons, Alfred Marshall, and Léon Walras, were democratic socialists of one stripe or another. It is not a challenge to plaster a very different and far more conservative tenor to mainstream economics of the twentieth century, whether one looks to Vilfredo Pareto, Irving Fisher, Schumpeter, Hayek or Friedman. Attending to the political hue of economic discourse serves all the more to distinguish the early modern period from the classical school of political economy of the nineteenth century or the neoclassical school that persists to the present.
While there is no single definition of economics, most of the discourse of the early modern period centered upon a set of phenomena such as prices, trade, taxes, money and banking. In the nineteenth century, most texts foregrounded the laws that govern production and distribution and, starting in the 1870s, exchange and consumption. In the twentieth century, the best known definition is the one offered by Lionel Robbins in 1932:
Economics is the science which studies human behaviour as a relationship between ends and scarce means which have alternative uses. (Robbins 1932: 15)
Consumers maximize utility (preferences) and firms maximize profits (expected returns), and this seeps into virtually every facet of life. Given some limiting assumptions, modern welfare theory can prove that an economy in general equilibrium attains Pareto optimality, that it is the most efficient and the most just.
3. Pre-Modern Economic Thought
As with many sciences, Aristotle laid much of the groundwork for economic thought, and his legacy, with the medieval scholastics, with the early modern philosophers and last but not least with Karl Marx, was profound and far-reaching (see Meikle 1995). Aristotle’s unit of analysis was the oikos, or household, from which the word economy is derived, but he also issued important insights on money and prices, as well as property and slavery. Above all, he argued that commercial pursuits were, for the most part, unethical, because they distorted means and ends. He thus drove a wedge between material betterment and the pursuit of virtue. Economic pursuits must always be subsumed to the good life, or sustained happiness (eudaimonia). Usury was particularly problematic because it violated the natural order, obtaining a yield from an object, money, that was inanimate (Aristotle Politics 1258b).
Aristotle asked one of the most fundamental questions of economics: What is a price? The simple answer is a ratio of two goods, one of which might be the established currency, but he maintained that it made no difference; a price in barter is the same as a money price. However, he qualified this claim with the recognition of the evolution of money over time and the fact that many mistake it as an end in itself rather than simply a means to facilitate barter. More remarkably, Aristotle grasped that a price masks the fact that no two commodities are fully commensurable. Exchange of goods or services, he noted, is grounded in fulfilling specific human needs, and no two of those are ever the same.
Although [two] things so different cannot become commensurate in reality, they can become commensurate enough in relation to our needs … Currency, then by making things commensurate as a measure does, equalizes them. (Aristotle, Nicomachean Ethics, 1131b16-20)
He went further on this path and asserted what is one of the most enduring propositions in economics, namely that “everything must have a price”. (ibid.)
Aristotle identified the three functional properties of money that remain canonical: money serves as a unit of account (a measure), a medium of exchange (replacing barter), and a store of value (stockpile of wealth). Furthermore, he noted that the denomination is purely conventional and that legal authorities might alter this at whim. Money was but a yardstick to measure the exchange-value of goods but unlike those goods, lacked a use-value as the fable of Midas proved all too well. He also asserted that it made no difference what substance is used for money, but then went on to assert that the fetish for gold and silver had made metallic coins unique in human society. Moreover, precious metals offered certain advantages: they are durable, divisible, transportable, and easily stamped with the value of the coin. Finally, his analysis of monopolistic pricing displays a firm grasp of the principles of supply and demand.
Aquinas, Jean Buridan, and Nicole Oresme, among others of the late medieval period, assimilated Aristotelian economic thought to Biblical teachings and, by and large, cast commercial activities in a negative light (Jones 1989; Langholm 1998). To buy low and sell high was to engage in deception and hence to violate the Golden Rule. To practice usury contravened the Biblical dictum, to “lend, expecting nothing in return” (Luke 6:35). The late medieval philosophers dug more deeply into the evolving legal practices of their time, insofar as wholesale grain merchants, partnerships, and debasements had become increasingly commonplace. Aquinas and Buridan each accepted, albeit with qualifications, that money is but a unit of measure set by men, and thus decreed that the crown might alter the denomination to serve the common good (Kaye 1998; Hirschfeld 2018). Oresme’s Treatise on Money (1358) went further, acknowledging the problematic shortage of specie and thereby promoting the use of copper or “black money”, since the coins had turned this color from overuse. He positioned the currency within the commercial sphere and thus broke all the more from the Christian view that the established coins emanated from God via divine rule, and were thus the sole property of the prince (Lapidus 1997).
In the case of commercial transactions, particularly of necessities, the late scholastics recognized legitimate charges for mercantile services of transportation, storage, and risk-taking, but condemned the practices of price gouging and other types of market manipulations, particularly the forestalling, regrating and engrossing of grain supplies. As for singular purchases of land or a luxury item, Aquinas unpacked in considerable detail the question of whether or not it was ethical to sell a good for more than it is worth. Notwithstanding customary prices, he recognized numerous circumstances where this might prove not only legal but also ethical. While berating the Roman maxim of caveat emptor, he endorsed the prevailing principle of laesio enormis which stipulated that the contracted price could fall within a fifty percent range (plus or minus) of the customary price. The doctrine of the “just price”, one that covered costs but was also sensitive to local conditions of demand, was further developed in this period and is still at the core of commercial law. Aquinas also reviewed four different contexts that would permit the charging of interest. One articulated the concept of an opportunity cost, and another appealed to the arrangement of capital transfer known as a partnership still honored today by Islamic authorities. Increasingly, commercial loans saw the principal as a form of capital that had legitimate and alternative yields. In sum, the late scholastics offer many insights on commerce and trade, the status of the Crown in managing legal tender, and the inherent tensions between commerce and virtue.
4. Ethics of Commerce and Trade
As Albert O. Hirschman (1977) argued, philosophers in early modern Europe went to great lengths to position commerce, banking, and the accumulation of wealth in a positive light, and thus overturn the harsh judgments of Aristotle and Aquinas. The widespread doctrine of doux commerce cast the pursuit of pecuniary interests in an innocent light and tamed the other more untoward passions for political power or lust. The core idea was that the love of gain—relishing the ever-increasing pile of coins—eclipsed inclinations for other pleasures or more indolent pursuits. This in turn prompted industriousness, a virtue that had already been firmly established by Hobbes and Locke, among others. Furthermore, as Locke had argued, money served to reduce the affront to God in the event that plums or meat were left to rot rather than brought to market. That said, the modern era was a far cry from Locke’s vision of the American frontier. Many merchants made vast sums from importing luxuries—coffee, tea or tobacco—and some European nations imposed sumptuary laws or hefty taxes to reduce this trade. Several philosophers argued that the consumption of luxuries was unethical, Joseph Butler and Claude-Adrien Helvétius for example (see Berry 1994). Mandeville and Hume were two of the first to argue that the economic benefits of luxuries outweighed the potential deleterious effects (see Susato 2006). Hume also noted that goods that had once been luxuries, such as paper, had become not just conveniences but even necessities. Adam Smith condemned sumptuary laws as hypocritical, since the extravagant consumption by the aristocrats who set the laws tended to be far more ruinous to the well-being of the state (Smith 1776 [1976: 346]).
Money-making and material advancement also rendered human actions more predictable and transparent. The seventeenth-century maxim that “interest will not lie”, first coined by Henri de Rohan, was in wide circulation (Hirschman 1977: 36). The self-interest axiom also began to germinate in economic discourse, enhanced by appeals to other virtuous traits, prudence and foresight (see Force 2003). Self-interest did not eclipse other-regarding traits, however, nor entail selfishness. While serving their pecuniary interests, merchants maintained that they also served God and Country, by increasing crown revenues and by taming the open seas. Merchants also prompted the rise of artisanal techniques and hence the growth of towns. This in turn prompted more mild and moderate dispositions. As Montesquieu remarked in the Spirit of the Laws:
it is an almost general rule that everywhere there are gentle mores, there is commerce and that everywhere there is commerce, there are gentle mores. (1748: [1989: 338])
Commerce induced civility and more feminine sentiments. As Hume observed of those who
flock into cities, … both sexes meet in an easy and sociable manner; and the tempers of men, as well as their behaviour, refine apace… it is impossible but they must feel an increase of humanity, from the very habit of conversing together. (“Of Refinement in the Arts” [1987: 271])
Smith observed in his Theory of Moral Sentiments that “humanity is the virtue of a woman”, and that
among civilized nations, the virtues which are founded upon humanity, are more cultivated than those which are founded upon self-denial and the command of the passions. (1759 [1976: 190, 204–5])
Smith, however, also expressed the worry that the European upper crust suffered from excessive “flattery and falsehood”, and that the “man of fashion” lacked the more esteemed “masculine virtues” (1759 [1976: 63]). Modern commercial life, for Smith, was not unequivocally for the good.
In his overview of early modern economics, Hirschman foregrounded what he called the Montesquieu-Steuart doctrine, namely that international trade induced global peace. Montesquieu singled out the significance of the bill of exchange as a critical starting point. This was an international bank order that much expanded European trade in the early modern period, and constituted an extensive network of trust between the major banking families in different countries. To trade over great distances requires considerable coordination and cooperation, if only because of the need to recognize different currencies or to contract deliveries at a later point in time. The bill of exchange averted the risky practice of shipping silver and gold from one port to another, and allowed paper representations to circulate and hence the expansion of credit.
Hobbes had already grasped that the interdependency of nations for basic goods, such as Swedish timber for English wool, might lessen international conflict, particularly if nations depended on one another for necessities or conveniences. Conflict stemmed from the desire for imported luxury goods; these goods tended to instill a new type of cupidity that would endanger peaceful trade, or so Hobbes believed (see Sorell 2006). He thus endorsed the imposition of sumptuary laws. Montesquieu was of a different mind. War is always more destructive and more costly than trade under peaceful terms. His argument pivoted on an appeal to the mutual gains from trade, and the ensuing division of labor. Hume issued other worries. He observed that each war of his lifetime had lasted longer, and cost more in real terms, than was rational given the initial objectives (“Of the Balance of Power” [1987: 339]). Insofar as much of the funding came from the excessive issuance of government bonds, the mounting public debt was bound to cripple the British government. The best means to avoid state bankruptcy was to overcome protectionist policies and promote unrestricted global trade, thereby enriching the world and diminishing military conquests.
However myopic these theories might sound—given the horrific treatment of African slaves and Indigenous peoples throughout the early modern period, and given the bloodbath of the twentieth century between purportedly civil trading nations—it is important to underscore that a widespread optimism for a more peaceful and prosperous world characterized early modern economic thought. Immanuel Kant’s celebrated appeal to a world of perpetual peace may be viewed as the capstone to this long line of thought (see Nakhimovsky 2011). As Hirschman noted, Adam Smith was the exception, for exposing the monopolistic and rapacious tendencies of European merchants and colonizers. Smith deplored the European treatment of African slaves and Indigenous peoples, not only for the inherent injustices of their actions, but because this tended to inculcate deplorable traits in the colonizers, such as tyranny, cowardice and inhumanity (Smith 1759 [1976: 200–211]; Rothschild 2001).
Above all, Smith reduced the pursuit of wealth to mere vanity and the desire for the approbation of others. There may be a trickle-down effect to the lower orders, or a gradual enrichment of the globe, but the inherent parasitical nature of men, particularly of landlords—“who love to reap where they never sowed”—and the oppressive actions of the merchants ensured that our world would be permanently saddled with grave injustices and inequalities (Smith 1776 [1976: 67]). Smith was still a far cry from the stronger despairing claims of later critics of capitalism, notably Marx’s appeal to widespread alienation, Durkheim’s caveats about anomie, or Keynes’s ridiculing of stock market frenzies (see Hirschman 1977: Part 3). Nevertheless, there is a clear sense in Smith that, however entrenched our practices of commerce and trade, their potential to elevate humans to a kinder and better world beyond mere material gratifications is severely limited (see Griswold 1998; Hanley 2009). Smith looms large as the voice of pessimism.
5. Principles of Property and Contracts
Contracts lie at the very core of economic thought. A simple purchase is a type of contract, the use of money another. Property rights are also grounded in the idea of a contract, at least since the early modern period. Aristotle had argued in favor of private property, primarily with appeals to security and superior stewardship. Aquinas reinforced these claims but also argued that in the case of a famine or siege, one might appropriate available foods to fulfil the Christian dictate of self-preservation. In the early modern period, Bodin, Grotius, and Pufendorf reflected at length on the question of property rights, prompted by the breakdown of feudal land tenure and ever-expanding overseas trade. Grotius’s De Mare Liberum (1609) addressed the possibility of unregulated naval and fishing rights. Hobbes (1651) and Locke (1689), with their respective appeals to the state of nature, motivated the formation of property rights and hence the government. Sovereign rule would alleviate penury, facilitate the spread of trade and commerce and, above all, foster population growth, or so it was widely believed.
Population growth, providing more hands as well as the demand for more corn and cloth, was viewed as the primary source of economic prosperity for about two centuries, until the alarm bell sounded by Thomas Robert Malthus’s Essay on the Principle of Population (1798). Whereas for Hobbes, might made right, Locke grounded property rights in consent and the virtue of industriousness; those who enclosed and cultivated the land created a right to its yield that did no harm to one’s neighbors (see Sreenivasan 1995). Because children are one’s property, this also legitimated the transfer of accumulated wealth via inheritance. Over time, inequality became salient, as some owned land while others, less fortunate, were compelled to enter into a wage contract to earn their bread and ale. Locke, however, underscored the volitional nature of these arrangements, forged on equal terms and by “tacit consent”.
While a strong advocate of traditional property laws to insure economic flourishing, Hume underscored their contingent nature, pointing to the voluminous quantity of law books that meant interpretation would never come to an end. In opposition to Locke, Hume believed that the appeal to an ancient contract forming the commonwealth was merely a myth. Ancient land rights were primarily gained by conquest and usurpation, and sustained by privilege, rather than a reward to the sweat of one’s brow. By contrast, the modern commercial era that enabled the spread of capital and hence moveable wealth, moved in step with the rise of representative government, either in the form of a republic or a constitutional monarchy such as his own (McArthur 2007; Harris 2015).
In his Treatise of Human Nature (Book Three) Hume unpacked the essential components of a contract. He identified the implicit conventions in contracts and the importance of trust.
Your corn is ripe to-day; mine will be so to-morrow. ’Tis profitable for us both, that I shou’d labour with you to-day, and that you shou’d aid me to-morrow. (Hume 1739–40 [2000: 334])
Such contractual arrangements might exist and spread among strangers as individuals came to discern their benefits. As Hume observed,
the freedom and extent of human commerce depend entirely on a fidelity with regard to promises. (1739–40 [2000: 349])
This included the use of money, which Hume recognized symbolized a chain of pledges, extending backward and forward in time. Property, money, and markets were thus bundled together, as conventions that ran no deeper than the utility of promise-keeping and one’s honor.
Hume took up the matter of forging an honorable character in his Enquiry Concerning the Principles of Morals (1751). Although the sphere for exercising one’s free will to reform one’s character was very limited, Hume adhered to the gradual evolution of behavioral norms, forged by material conditions, particularly commerce and trade. Monkish virtues of the medieval period had given way to commercial virtues of the modern period, honesty, probity and industry. For Adam Smith, self-command, prudence, and courage were virtues ranked more highly than others. For these reasons, those in the middling ranks, merchants and bankers, were more likely to happen onto the road to virtue than those in the lower or upper classes. And because the nouveau riches were the ones to safeguard contractual settlements, this meant that the core institutions of property and commerce would, ceteris paribus, be sustained in the centuries ahead. The merchant or banker, not the knight, had become the paragon of honor, serving the national interests as much as themselves.
6. Philosophy of Money
A cornerstone of monetary theory, and arguably the most robust and enduring law in economics, is the quantity theory of money that commits to a causal and positive function between the price level and the money supply, treating the latter as the independent variable, that is, \(P = f(M^s)\) (see Schabas & Wennerlind 2020: 151–172). With the influx of silver from Latin America after Columbus, the money supply in Europe had more than doubled by 1510. While entering exclusively on Spanish ships, it spread rapidly, first to the Netherlands and then across Europe. Prices rose as well, although the underlying factors were not readily understood. Most purchases were of food, whose prices fluctuated with the harvests, good and bad. Consumer durables tended to be purchased infrequently, often at seasonal fairs, which had complex systems for price negotiations, pitching and haggling. The rise of middlemen, wholesale markets and retailing, became more prevalent in the seventeenth century, although the public was suspicious that these traders who lived well off their earnings were the cause of increasing prices. Although newspapers and broadsides posted prices, starting in the late seventeenth century, urban shopping still required negotiation. It was only with the department stores of the late nineteenth century that prices were routinely posted.
Pause and reflect on how difficult it would be to discern inflation in the early modern period, or perhaps even at present, and thus how brilliant was the insight that the overall price level is a function of the money supply. In the 1520s, the Prussian Diet commissioned none other than Nicholas Copernicus to investigate the recent increase in price instability. Drawing on his skills with handling large quantities of data, Copernicus’s Monetae cudendae ratio (1526) established the proposition that the value of the currency (its purchasing power) had diminished due to its abundance. We thus have the first inkling of a principle that is, in some respects, as central to economics as the principle of inertia is in physics.
Others in the second half of the sixteenth century, notably Navarrus, Luis de Molina, and Jean Bodin, arrived independently at a variant of the quantity theory of money. A century later, John Locke and William Petty added two additional variables, the velocity and the transactions level, to the core relation in the quantity theory of money. The velocity of money is something of a misnomer. It is the average rate at which a given unit of currency turns over in a given period of time. The transactions level is the rate at which payments are made, for example wages (daily or weekly) or rents (quarterly). For the capital bill, Petty estimated that five per cent of its value was manifest in liquid terms at any point of the year, a sum equivalent to the interest payment. As a remedy for the shortage of money, a problem that beset not only Petty’s Ireland but virtually every nation, the best policy was to shorten the temporal interval for the transactions level and hence increase the velocity. These four variables were cemented by Irving Fisher in 1911, with his equation that MV = PT (money supply (M) times the velocity of money (V) is equal to the price level (P) times the transactions level (T)). Fisher was also the first to measure the velocity of money. The average rate for the turnover of one dollar in New Haven was twenty times per annum.
The quantity theory of money also entails the neutrality of money. Hume broached a series of thought experiments, whereby the quantity of money in a nation doubled or halved overnight, or was reduced by an even greater amount, four-fifths (“Of Interest” [1987: 299]; “Of the Balance of Trade” [1987: 311]). He argued that this would have no lasting effect. In the case of an increase, prices would rise commensurate to the increase in money as dictated by the quantity theory. As a result, imports would surge because foreign goods were favorably priced, and the specie would flow out almost immediately and prices return to their original level, hence what came to be known as the specie-flow mechanism. Earlier contributors, such as Mun, had already argued that money would follow trade, and hence that the quantity of specie in England would reflect the balance of trade. If the balance was favorable, such that exports exceeded imports, the nation’s coffers would be augmented. Hume extrapolated from Mun’s one nation to the entire globe. Imposing the metaphor of the world’s oceans, Hume argued that it was no more possible to stockpile specie in a nation than to dam the oceans and raise them above sea-level. Each nation would see its domestic prices rise or fall in accordance with the quantity of money, and hence the strong propensity for the global supply of money to equilibrate in each nation in line with the balance of trade. It rested on a clear understanding of the distinction between the nominal and the real.
Notwithstanding his brilliant argument for the neutrality of money, Hume recognized that the specie-flow mechanism was never fully achieved; trade barriers, transaction costs, and other interferences with the money supply limited its full operation. As a result, Hume endorsed the non-neutrality of money as more veridical. He argued that, from roughly 1500 to 1750, the money supply had increased by a factor of eight but the price level had only increased by a factor of four. The simple reason was significant economic growth, a doubling of output that required the extant money to service the significant increase in transactions. The growth was stimulated by many factors, the gains from trade, the division of labor, and the accumulation of capital. Hume also acknowledged the importance of new technologies and their rapid spread once in place. Above all, he discerned that money could engender growth, even though this remained mysterious and was not “easily accounted for” (Hume “Of Money” [1987: 288).
Hume articulated the various steps by which an influx of good Spanish coins might magically stimulate economic growth. The circulation of the additional coins could induce a multiplier effect that essentially incentivized weavers and farmers to work more intensively. They did this for an interval of time, until prices and wages caught up to the additional money stock and reached a level once more. In short, the specie-flow mechanism was couched as an ideal (friction-free) process, understood as a thought experiment, whereas the injection of new money and its circulation resulted in genuine economic growth. Milton Friedman received the Nobel Prize for making these arguments, but he paid specific homage to Hume for the central analysis (Schabas & Wennerlind 2020: 208, 232). Friedman also credits Hume with asking what the optimal quantity of money for a given nation would be, but in fact several before Hume had grappled with this question, Petty and Berkeley most notably. Hume’s work is best known but there were dozens at the time who articulated one or more of the three core principles of monetary theory, the quantity theory, the specie-flow mechanism, and the multiplier.
Only the first of these three could be easily verified by empirical findings. Because legal tender was issued by the royal mint, it was possible to estimate the money supply. Hume, for example, claimed that about 90 million pounds circulated in Britain circa 1750. It was much more difficult to measure changes to the price level. Consumer price indexing, a systematic method for measuring inflation that would serve to confirm the quantity theory of money, was first devised in the late nineteenth century and only undertaken by state agencies in the decades after World War One. Nevertheless, early modern economists devised clever means to measure the purchasing power of the currency, whether by examining the price of corn (grains) or looking to other benchmarks. William Fleetwood’s Chronicon Preciosum; or an Account of English Money, the Price of Corn and other Commodities for the last 600 years (1707), proved an invaluable resource. He also made estimates of purchasing power, noting that his stipend as a Fellow of King’s College Cambridge, which had been fixed at five pounds in 1450 ought to be increased to thirty pounds to command the same value. Adam Smith proposed the longterm silver price of corn as the best metric for estimating inflation. His belief was that one must take a weighted average over a longer period of time, 50 to 100 years in order to eliminate the seasonal variations in harvests or isolated discoveries of silver reserves.
The focus on corn prices also unleashed another central principle of economics, the law of demand (quantity demanded is an inverse function of price). The so-called King-Davenant law, attributed to Gregory King (see Evans 1967) and Charles Davenant (1698) of the late seventeenth century, provided a time series analysis of corn prices (see Hutchison 1988: 46–53). They argued that in the case of a severe shortage of corn, a fall by fifty per cent of the normal supply, the price could increase by forty-five per cent. They also provided data in the case of a bountiful harvest. Their chart established that the function was an inverse one and, significantly, nonlinear.
The early modern period was plagued by a shortage of coins, and of those in circulation, most were clipped or hammered. Gresham’s law, that bad coins drive out the good ones, explained this phenomenon very well. It was estimated that the average coin had only half of the metallic content that had been stipulated by the mint. This meant that countless people were filing the coins and melting the shavings into bullion for additional remuneration from the mint. It was illegal to tamper with coins, and for most countries of Western Europe, the death penalty applied, even if one was caught simply with the tools of the trade. Other commonplace illegal activities were counterfeiting paper banknotes, bribery, smuggling, and adulterating products for sale. It would be difficult to estimate the overall level of such activities, but a background assumption in the writings of most early modern economists was the understanding that criminal methods were widespread (see Wennerlind 2011). The demise of Spain had become a trope, insofar as it had been illegally drained of its American silver. As Hume noted, smugglers in the previous two centuries had taken the Spanish silver over the Pyrenees where French prices were one-tenth those in Spain (“Of the Balance of Trade” [1987: 312]). The money had saturated most where there was international trade. By the early seventeenth century, it was the Dutch East India Company that commanded the envy of European traders, and its legacy was such that Mexican silver coins continued to dominate Asian trade until the nineteenth century.
Early modern philosophers weighed in on legal monetary interventions, notably debasement, devaluation, or recoinage. For most, the preferred policy was to leave the money stock untouched, or restore its nominal metallic value given the widespread hammering and clipping of coins. In the fourteenth century, the French crown had altered the currency, mostly with debasements, more than eighty times. As Bodin recognized, this increased the money supply and hence raised prices, but it also undermined confidence in the stability of the currency. There is no greater incident of leading philosophers tampering with the money supply than when Locke and Newton famously oversaw the Great Recoinage of 1696. Locke persuaded Newton to do the opposite of a debasement, namely to restore the silver content of the shilling to the amount stipulated by Elizabeth I circa 1600 (see Appleby 1978; Vaughn 1980). Newton thus affirmed Locke’s belief in essentialism (see Caffentzis 1989). This meant that those willing to break the law benefitted from a de facto money pump, and the crown lost some two million pounds (roughly thirty million pounds in total was in circulation). This contraction of the money supply engendered an economic downturn, but for other reasons the English economy began to expand and flourish under the reign of Queen Anne.
In their analysis of the essential properties of money, a number of early modern philosophers climbed several rungs of the ladder of monetary abstraction. George Berkeley, in his short tract The Querist (1725), recognized that the substance used for money was irrelevant, and thus promoted the concept of fiat money, a counter or token that was recognized as legal tender but not redeemable for a precious metal. (Caffentzis 2000). Benjamin Franklin (1729) proposed a novel schema whereby notes were issued with the land as the underlying asset, but the practice was short-lived in colonial Pennsylvania. Hume, while secretary to the British ambassador in France in 1765, oversaw the dismantling of a fiat-currency in Québec that had commenced in 1685 and the reinstatement of British Sterling in lower Canada.
In his Treatise, Hume broached the idea that money is analogous to language, both in its commencement in a prehistoric age, and in the sense that its primary role is to represent value, much as words represent objects (see Schabas & Wennerlind 2020: 99–101). Neither money nor language adequately refer to objects in this sense, but we tend to be duped into thinking that they do. Because of this imperfect mapping, and the fact that money embodies a pledge, a type of speech act, Hume was also inclined to appreciate paper banknotes, whether from private banks or the Exchequer. He did not share Locke’s view that nature had stamped an indelible value on gold and silver. Hume grasped that credit forms a continuum with money, and noted that there was a range of degrees of liquidity: mortgages, bonds, equities, promissory notes, bills of exchange, and so forth. Hume praised the recent innovations of Scottish bankers, to devise daily lines of credit so that merchants might monetize idle capital, and to issue ten-shilling notes denominated such that ordinary tradesmen might use them. He estimated that in 1750, over half the transactions in Britain were conducted with paper-notes, thus lubricating the wheels of trade that much the better.
Smith was more inclined to see banking and credit as precarious, and captured this sentiment with his metaphor of paper money as a “sort of wagon-way through the air”, bolstered by its “Daedalian wings” (Smith 1776 [1976: 321]). If banks were reckless with their issuance, their bills would soar in value and become over-heated, as witnessed in the serious bank failures of 1772. Smith in general was more circumspect about the benefits of merchants and overseas trade, and he argued for firm regulations to be imposed on banks and credit markets.
In the early 1670s, Shaftesbury, who had become chancellor of the Exchequer, encouraged Locke to oppose a measure that would set a legal ceiling of four percent on the interest rate. Locke revisited the debate in 1692, and in both cases, persuaded the government to keep a higher ceiling. Locke argued that in a world of perfectly competitive banking a “natural” rate of interest would override the legal one (see Vaughn 1980). Ironically, he made his arguments before the monopolistic Bank of England was formed in 1694. Jeremy Bentham’s Defence of Usury (1787), in opposition to Smith, restored Locke’s position that the interest rate ought to be unregulated and hence subject solely to market forces (see Sigot 2001). Smith’s position has remained a puzzle, since for the most part, interest rates were low and hence non-usurious, and because Smith in general embraced laissez-faire thinking (see Hollander 1999). Both Hume and Smith recognized the longterm tendency of the interest rate to fall, from ten percent under Elizabeth I to three or four percent in their day, and they arrived at the more profound understanding that this was due to capital accumulation and sophisticated commerce and trade. They did not articulate the principle of zero profits, but they understood that in a perfectly competitive world, the profit rate would equal the interest rate, the cost of borrowing capital.
The most central leitmotif of early modern economics was its appreciation for the transformative effects of money. Hobbes, drawing on William Harvey, had depicted money as the blood that courses through the body politic (see Christensen 1989; Apeldoorn 2017). Money vitalized a region, and was most effective if it was in circulation and “quickened”, that is, increased its velocity. Quesnay underscored the importance of the circulation of money, particularly bullion, and its multiplier effects, again drawing an analogy to Harvey’s great discovery. The French had initially, under the inspiration of the Scottish émigré John Law (1705), embraced private banknotes and equity swaps. But after the collapse of the Mississippi Company in 1720, for which Law was blamed, they chose to hoard silver as household plate, and banking did not recover until the end of the century. The Dutch and the British, looking to France, imposed a tax on silverware and promoted the use of chinaware as measures to reduce hoarding.
In the second of his Two Treatise of Government (1689), Locke provided an important fable as to how money came into being as a store of wealth given the existence of perishable goods. Hume, conversely, emphasized money as a medium of exchange, as the “oil” which lubricated the “wheels of trade” (“Of Money” [1987: 281]). Hume’s story looked more to the allure of luxury goods and the rise of towns and cities as prompting the thorough monetization of the countryside, such that “no hand is entirely empty of it [money]” (ibid. [1987: 294]). Once this was achieved, however, money took on a power of its own, one that no government could adequately control. As a general maxim, Hume declared that
a government has great reason to preserve with care its people and its manufactures. Its money, it may safely trust to the course of human affairs, without fear or jealousy. (“Of the Balance of Trade” [1987: 326])
Money may well be a human artifact, but as Hume and Smith, among others, argued, it operated according to laws that transcended individual human agency. “Money answers all things”, to quote the title of Jacob Vanderlint’s influential book of 1734. Money had become so complex and so deeply entrenched in the social fabric of modern commercial society that measures to retain or channel it were believed to be futile.
7. Scientific Status of Economics and its Methodology
Newton lay down the gauntlet in his well-known Query 31 to the Opticks (1704), namely that his methods for deciphering the natural world might prove efficacious in understanding the moral sphere. Many took up his plea to advance the moral sciences. In France, one could name Voltaire, Condillac and Condorcet, and in Britain, Hutcheson, Hume, and Smith. The common conviction was to identify sufficient uniformities to human nature that resulted in manifest patterns, whether in the economic or political sphere. Hume’s associationist psychology and the copy principle implied remarkable uniformity in the machinery of the human mind, while Smith treated the sympathetic regard as akin to gravitational attraction. Both believed that introspection meant that the moral sciences, including economics could become epistemically superior to the natural sciences. As both Hume and Smith pointed out, pre-modern philosophers had endorsed a geocentric universe for thousands of years and in modern times, mistakenly adhered to the system of Cartesian vortices for almost a century. Nothing compared to the occasionalism of Malebranche, that Hume deemed “a fairy land” (Hume 1748 [2000: 57]). In the moral realm, however, we could know right away if something is as fanciful as a system of vortices. Both Hume and Smith were fallibilists about all knowledge, but they each argued that we are more likely to know when we are wrong in the moral sphere than in the physical sphere. Introspection and experience of the world were important assets in this respect. But, as Hume averred, “nature will forever elude our grasp”, and even if we dig more deeply into the microphysical realm, this would simply expose the need for further investigations.
The scientific spirit that Hume and Smith brought to their economics was already present a century earlier; both Hobbes and Petty voiced the aspiration of rendering morals into a quantitative discourse. “Commercial mathematics” took hold during the first half of the seventeenth century and many of the formal methods that have become commonplace in postwar economics were first adopted in the early modern period (see Redman 1997; Sylla 2003). Blaise Pascal’s wager to believe in God (1670 ) and Daniel Bernoulli’s Saint Petersburg paradox (1738 ) are preliminary examples of decision theory (see Hutchison 1988). Both imposed probability measures on expected utilities and thus provided the scaffolding of what has become an important line of inquiry in mainstream economics. Pierre de Fermat (1654)  and Christiaan Huygens (1657) also studied games of chance (see Klein 1997). Game theoretical modes of thinking permeated the works of Hobbes and Hume (see Hampton 1986; Kavka 1986; Hardin 2007). Hume also articulated core elements of decision theory, including the idea of time discounting (see Diaye & Lapidus 2019; Sugden 2021).
Undergirding these preliminary efforts at both decision theory and game theory was a clear appreciation for strategic behavior, more or less a given among early modern philosophers following in the wake of Machiavelli. No one was more vocal on the widespread tendency to strategize for individual gain than Mandeville. As he observed, everyone in commercial society was duplicitous, dressing to a higher station, and rationalizing their frequent breach of ethical norms. It was well known that the hand holding the scales of justice “had often dropt ‘em, brib’d with Gold” (Mandeville 1714 [1988: 8]). Smith would echo these sentiments of duplicity:
civil government, so far as it is instituted for the security of property, is in reality instituted for the defence of the rich against the poor, or of those who have some property against those who have none at all. (Smith 1776 [1976: 715])
It is important to see that the rise of game theory in mainstream economics since the mid-twentieth century is to some extent an unwitting revival of ascriptions of strategizing and power imbalances that were commonplace in the early modern period.
Probability theory was developed in the early modern period, notably by Huygens and Abraham de Moivre (see Daston 1988). The early eighteenth-century English mathematician, John Arbuthnot, undertook calculations that resembled Neyman-Pearson testing (see Stigler 1986: 226). Hume may have copied this method, as a young admirer of Arbuthnot. Hume’s 100-page essay on population pivoted around the null hypothesis that ancient Rome was more populated than Europe in 1750, and he ably demonstrated that the likelihood that this was the case was vanishingly small. Hume may also have appreciated the insights of Thomas Bayes, who devised his theorem—now known as Bayesianism—in the 1750s, with a posthumous publication in 1764 (see Raynor 1980).
Hume appealed explicitly to the law of large numbers and invoked a number of mean-reverting tendencies, as in his commitment to uniform wages, prices and interest rates. Quantitative efforts to measure population or the money supply were undertaken with much regularity starting in the 1660s, despite a paucity of data (Endres 1985; Derringer 2018). Many, such as Graunt, understood the value of trimming outliers and seeking what Thomas Simpson (1755) coined as the arithmetic mean (see Stigler 1986; Klein 1997). Smith’s analysis of the wage spectrum was grounded in the belief that market forces had established stable and salient wages for each type of trade, and that deviations could be reduced down to his list of six key factors (Smith 1776 [1976: 82–104]).
There were some efforts at model building in the eighteenth century. Jean-François Melon (1734), whose work was widely known, constructed a model based on three similar islands with two goods in circulation (see Hont 2005: 30–32). Quesnay’s tableau économique (1758) was the most celebrated model. His disciple, Pierre Samuel Du Pont de Nemours, published a treatise in 1768 that promoted physiocracy as a “new science” on equal standing with the natural sciences. Adam Smith intended to dedicate the Wealth of Nations to Quesnay, but he died too soon.
Quesnay’s model made stylized assumptions about the French nation, ascribing three distinct classes: a quarter were landowners (aristocrats), a quarter artisans, and half farmers. He showed visually that after the initial payment of rent (the annual net product) by the farmers to the landowners, the entire unfolding of the economy would reach mathematical closure by the time of the next harvest and, like a perpetual motion machine, prompt the next period of production and distribution. No sector would increase or decrease in size and each would have its just reward in accordance with its station (a stylized assumption was that landowners consumed twice as much as the others, per capita). Quesnay also, brilliantly, introduced disturbances, for example, an unduly high interest rate, a tax, or an increased demand for artisanal goods, to demonstrate the rapid disequilibration of his system (see Quesnay 1758-1759). Contemporary modelling thrives on introducing slight variations or manipulations to disclose the underlying structure and is much indebted to Quesnay (see Hausman 2003 ; Morgan 2012).
8. Distributive Justice
As was recognized at the time, the transition from feudalism to capitalism commenced by the early sixteenth century. In his History of England, Hume argued that commerce arose in Britain under Henry VII circa 1500, drawing on the Flemish trade. Smith shared this view, and both looked to the Italian city-states of Florence and Genoa a century before as critical developments. The shift to capitalism intensified, as both Hume and Smith recognized, with the rise of the joint-stock companies, particularly the East India companies of the Dutch, French and English.
There may be no single event or even decade to mark the transition to capitalism. Aristotle’s analysis of the agora in central Athens reminds us that markets and money were commonplace in antiquity. What sets capitalism apart is the emergence and central role of markets for the three factors of production—land, labour, and capital—and it was these that took hold during the sixteenth century. By the end of that century, possibly galvanized by other major transformations, notably the Reformation and the Scientific Revolution, it had become evident that prominent bankers and merchants were wealthier than many aristocrats. By the mid-1600s, half the people in the Netherlands lived in towns or cities and most were wage-earners.
Land was still the primary source of wealth, and merchants were renowned for retiring to a country estate. And there was widespread suspicion of upstarts, not to mention appeals to the longstanding adage that the newly-acquired wealth would disappear by the third generation. Moreover, there was a deeply-rooted belief in the necessity of ranks, most explicitly voiced by Millar and Smith. Despite the considerable expansion of domestic manufacturing in Western Europe, there was a pronounced predilection, at least among the Physiocrats and Adam Smith, to foreground the agrarian sector and view the aristocratic landowning class as an essential part of the economic picture. Historical studies justify this emphasis. Until the twentieth century, the majority of capital was invested in the agrarian sector, far more than in manufacturing or trade. If anything best characterizes the early modern period, it was the sustained increase in population due to improved fishing and agrarian yields.
Egalitarian ideals reach back to ancient times, but in early modern philosophy the arguments appeared to have more efficacy. Locke, Rousseau, Paine, William Godwin, and Mary Wollstonecraft are just some of the more significant philosophers who left their mark on the modern transition to a more equal society. Diderot was an important voice for the abolition of the slave trade and slavery. Both Hume and Smith argued that wage labor was more efficient than slavery and thus gave economic motivations for the significant end to slavery that came to pass in the nineteenth century.
The primary emphasis in the early modern period was on the rights of the “middling sorts”, merchants, bankers, and manufacturers, in contrast to the landed aristocracy. Fiscal policy, as a means to address economic inequality and serve middle-class interests, spawned a large body of thought, running from Hobbes to Hume and finally to Smith, whose principles of taxation became canonical until John Stuart Mill. Hume’s essay “Of the Middle Station of Life”, in conjunction with his writings on economics, makes plain that this group would provide the impetus for future economic growth. The commercial class was far more likely to be industrious and enterprising, and serve as the backbone of modern civil society and the custodians of liberal values. In his Enquiry Concerning the Principles of Morals (1751), Hume portrays a hypothetical son-in-law, Cleanthes, as a paragon of virtue. He was also a lawyer and businessman and, as the father of Hume’s hypothetical grandchildren, the one most likely to insure that the family name would be sustained for at least one more generation.
The early modern philosophers reflected on the principles of international distributive justice and its implications for global peace. As Istvan Hont highlighted, the rich-country/poor-country question was vigorously debated in the eighteenth century (Hont 2005). Gershom Carmichael and Hutcheson, for example, gave voice to these concerns, but it was Hume and Smith who laid the analytic foundations. A country was wealthier than another not because of specie but because of its people and its accumulated capital in agriculture and manufacturing. Josiah Tucker (1755) gave voice to the potential for unlimited growth, noting that higher wages were correlated with more skilled labor and capital infrastructure. Both Hume and Smith advocated high wages, but feared that with time capital would be shifted to countries with lower wages until those regions were also enriched. Because of increasing demand worldwide, however, there was no reason to suppose that a nation with a healthy export sector would decline. As was widely understood, Holland was testament to the potential of long-lived wealth, having sustained its significant foothold in global trade since it reached its apogee as the most powerful economic nation in the 1620s.
Smith is recognized as the critical figure to shift attention to the working class and to advocate higher wages. He noted that merchants and manufacturers are strongly inclined to collude so as not to raise wages (Smith 1776 [1976: 267]). He noted the degradation of workers who were compelled to spend their entire lives “performing a few simple operations” (1776 [1976: 782]). With pointed words, he underscored the dehumanizing effects of unvaried work, such that a typical person
generally becomes as stupid and ignorant as it is possible for a human creature to become. (1776 [1976: 782])
Smith believed this would become widespread. In
every improved and civilised society this is the state into which the labouring poor, that is, the great body of the people, must necessarily fall, unless government takes some pains to prevent it. (1776 [1976: 782])
Smith advocated widespread schooling, with mechanics and gymnastics, and the fostering of theatre or dancing on the day of rest. He believed that inventions often came from the shopfloor, and that a more orderly standing army would be fostered by men who learned to develop both body and mind.
Above all, Smith exposed the emptiness of the pursuit of wealth, that it consisted primarily in “the parade of riches”, which feeds upon the envy of those without (Smith 1776 [1976: 190]). The rich garner far more pleasure from being observed riding in a carriage than from the comforts a carriage might offer. Our efforts to pursue wealth and power stem from the universal desire for admiration and approbation. There is also a deep asymmetry in Smith’s account of human sympathy, the act of fellow-feeling, in that we sympathize with the rich and shun the poor. The reason is that we imagine ourselves in their place and thus fill in the gaps of our otherwise inadequate lives. It is for this reason, Smith believes, that the state must insure that royalty indulge in opulent displays. Ranks are of great importance in the world, for motivating us to strive, driven by “the desire of bettering our condition” (Smith 1776 [1976: 341]). Smith believed that we are a restless lot, that
there is scarce perhaps a single instant in which any man is so perfectly and completely satisfied with his situation, as to be without any wish of alteration or improvement of any kind. An augmentation of fortune is the means by which the greater part of men propose and wish to better their condition. (1776 [1976: 341])
As a result, there is nothing worse than a fall from grace and ensuing loss of admiration. Smith observes that “bankruptcy is perhaps the greatest and most humiliating calamity which can befall an innocent man” and its fear has thus fostered widespread prudence in the modern commercial world (Smith 1776 [1976: 342]).
Smith’s portrayal of human nature is tinged with these dark thoughts, similar to the cynicism of Mandeville. We spend our entire life attempting to garner approval, grounded in the sympathetic regard, and are for the most part prone to vanity and greed. His parable about the poor man’s son, who is driven by ambition to become wealthy only to realize at the end of his life that the indignities he suffered “to serve those whom he hates” and to be “obsequious to those whom he despises” have robbed him of a “real tranquillity” that he might have achieved had he known his place and remained poor. (Smith 1759 [1976: 181]). Only at the end of his life does he grasp that “wealth and greatness are mere trinkets”, and that the loss of friendship and the “injustice of his enemies” that he has suffered as he climbed upwards has left him bereft of peace of mind (ibid.). Smith remarks that the beggar on the highway sleeps better than the king, and that the better aim in life is to achieve inner equanimity. Adam Smith, the philosopher most readily associated with the voice of capitalism, could not be more disparaging about its tendencies to reinforce the baser features of human nature. While he endorsed rising standards of living for the lower orders, his stoicism was the more dominant sentiment. Life was a lottery and one had best prepare for adversity. As Smith aptly put it, wealth might “keep off the summer shower, [but] not the winter storm” (Smith 1759 [1976: 183]). Early modern economics thus offered practical wisdom and served as a major resource for forging a wise and virtuous life.
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Literary. Revised edition, Eugene F. Miller (ed.), Indianapolis,
IN: Liberty Fund, 1741–77 . Essays cited in this entry and
their dates of original publication are:
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- 1742, “The Epicurean”, the first of the “Happiness Essays” [1987: 138–145]
- 1742, “The Stoic”, the second of the “Happiness Essays”, [1987: 146–154]
- 1742, “The Platonist”, the third of the “Happiness Essays” [1987: 155–158]
- 1742, “The Sceptic”, the fourth of the “Happiness Essays” [1987: 159–180]
- 1752, “Of Refinement in the Arts” originally titled “Of Luxury” [1987: 268–380]
- 1752, “Of Money” [1987: 281–294]
- 1752, “Of Interest” [1987: 295–307]
- 1752, “Of the Balance of Trade” [1987: 308–326]
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I wish to thank Carlos Eduardo Suprinyak for his feedback, and Zoe Zhiyu Luo and Joan Pauls for their sure-footed editing.