The Emotions in Early Chinese Philosophy

First published Mon Dec 6, 2021

In many schools of Western philosophy and psychology, emotions are understood as inner subjective feelings that are sharply contrasted with the intellectual faculties of the mind. In Chinese philosophy, however, emotions are not fully explained by inner subjective feelings or inexplicable passions. Rather, they are understood as interactive, responsive, and holistic affectivity that plays broad psychological, cognitive, and moral roles in one’s understanding of the world (its objective reality, nature of things, and their situations and circumstances) and one’s dispositions and reactions to external stimulation. The present essay discusses the diverse conceptual dimensions, psychological orientations and moral significance of emotions discussed in major philosophical texts of ancient China from the early sixth to the late first centuries BCE. Specifically, it focuses on how early Chinese philosophers explained the nature of emotions and how they identified and categorized emotions. The essay consists of the following sections. First, general philosophical orientations of Chinese philosophy will be compared and contrasted with Western approaches to emotions. Second, early Chinese notions of emotions will be identified through the lens of qing (情), a unique Chinese notion of affectivity (or onto-affectivity) that includes such semantic elements as essence, nature, reality, disposition, desire, and feelings. Third, the philosophical interpretations and the semantic dimensions of qing in early Chinese philosophy will be discussed. Fourth, terms and lists of emotions in early Chinese texts will be analyzed to illustrate how Chinese philosophers categorized and individuated emotions. Fifth, early Chinese philosophical texts and their theories of emotions will be surveyed to explain how emotions and the broad domains of the affective mind (such as innate dispositions, psychological inclinations, subjective feelings, and desires) are discussed in ancient Chinese texts.

1. Emotions, Affective Sensitivity, and Chinese Philosophy

1.1 Emotions in Western Philosophy and Psychology

In Western philosophy and psychology, emotions are defined as inner psychological states with subjective feelings that are contrasted with cognitive states and processes of the mind. If one believes that ‘1+1=2’, this cognitive state, in itself, does not come with particular feelings, motivate specific actions, or facilitate observable embodied expressions. Nor does it draw any evaluative judgments. Regardless of one’s feelings or motivations, one can simply believe that ‘1+1=2’ is true. In addition, emotions are often associated with strong desires or passions that can conflict with rational reasoning and reflective thinking. In his Republic (Book IV), Plato argues that the soul (psyche) consists of three distinctive components, reason (logistikon), spirit (thumoeides), and appetite (epithumetikon). He puts reason against the affective components of the mind. Stoic philosophers characterized emotions as inexplicable passion, uncontrollable urge, or irrational fear. According to Arius Didymus (a Stoic philosopher of the early Roman Empire), emotional states are “excessive impulses which are disobedient to reason” (translated in Pomeroy 1999: 65A). Descartes (1649 [1989: 385]) believed that passion is internal dispositions and tendencies moved by external events that can go against rational understanding of the world. Although recent publications demonstrate strong academic interest in emotions in Western philosophy and psychology (Damasio 1994; De Sousa 1987; Gibbard 1990; Haidt 2001; Lutz 1988; Nichols 2004; Nussbaum 2001; Prinz 2004; Solomon 1984), emotions are still understood from the viewpoints of subjectivity, phenomenality, motivation, passion and desire.

1.2 Emotions in Chinese Philosophy

In Chinese philosophy, however, emotions are not necessarily or fully understood as subjective feelings. Nor is it characterized as an irrational or excessive urge of passion that disrupts or challenges rational thinking. Instead, emotions play broad psychological and moral roles in the cultivation of virtue and the political order and stability of society. From this unique Chinese perspective, one can understand that one’s affective interaction with the personal, social, and physical environments constitutes one’s moral agency and an essential property of the interdependent and communal self. For example, Confucius states that the duty of serving one’s parents (filial piety) has no meaning if one does not have genuine affection toward one’s parents (Analects, 2.7) and ritual propriety becomes a blind rule following behavior if one does not have caring heart for others (Analects, 3.3). Mozi (Mozi, 13.1) states that a ruler cannot govern his or her state successfully without understanding the affective dispositions and circumstances of people. That is, emotions are not simply inner subjective feelings but interactive, perceptual, cognitive, motivational, and affective states of the mind in their constant dealings with the world that in itself is affectively constituted and embedded. As Virág (2017: 194) states, emotions in early Chinese philosophy “did not simply represent the individual realm of subjective experience” but constitute “the crucial interface between self and the world, mind and cosmos”. Cheng (2001: 79) captures this holistic and interactive viewpoint with a broad notion of the mind in Chinese philosophy.

Mind is not simply an intellectual entity or a mechanism for thinking or reasoning. It is rather an inter-linked entity of sensibility, feeling, awareness, thinking and willing as testified by common experience of reflective subjectivity of the self-identified as the “I”.

Therefore, emotions, in Chinese philosophy, are understood as the holistic affectivity of the sensing, thinking, and feeling mind that is always related to and interactive with the world.

1.3 Qing and Chinese Philosophy

At the center of this broad, interactive, and holistic understanding of the mind and emotions in Chinese philosophical traditions, one can observe a unique notion of qing (情). Qing is commonly understood, in modern Chinese, as affective states of the mind but, in classical Chinese philosophy, it is neither contrasted with cognitive states nor distinguished from intellectual functions of the mind (Marchal 2013; Perkins 2002; Wong 1991). Specifically, in early Chinese philosophy, qing refers to a broad category of objective properties of the world and their interaction with the mind resulting in diverse forms of psychological states such as feelings, motivations, desires and hopes. It means nature, essence, reality, situations, and circumstances, as well as affective dispositions and interactive reactions (Bruya 2003; Eifring 2004b; Graham 1990; Harbsmeier 2004; Hansen 1995; Puett 2004; Seok 2013). Qing’s broad semantic scope can be summarized as one’s concrete understanding of the world, living sense of reality, and realization of the interdependent and interactive self that resonates with others and their circumstances. That is, qing is not simply subjective feelings that resides in a private, solipsistic mind but a comprehensive mode of one’s conative, cognitive, intentional and embodied dealings with the world.

Many Chinese philosophers discuss qing and its interactive responsiveness and affective sensitivity as a core foundation of moral agency and the communal self. Confucius explains that the virtue of ren (benevolence, compassion) is based on one’s love for others (one’s other-caring emotion) and xiao (filial piety) comes out of one’s genuine feeling for one’s parents (Analects, 2.7, 3.3). Mozi talks about impartial caring (jian ai) (Mozi, 16.2). Laozi asks for loving kindness and non-contention toward others (Laozi, 67, 68) and Zhuangzi focuses on our inborn nature and spontaneous affective dispositions (Zhuangzi, 24.1). Mencius’s four moral sprouts (siduan 四端) are innate emotional inclinations deeply rooted in the moral mind (Mencius 2A6). Xunzi’s discussion of self-cultivation through ritual and music focuses on the affective and interactive sensitivity of the mind (Xunzi, Chs. 19, 20; Sung 2012; Wang 2015). The same affective approach to the mind and morality can be witnessed in Neo-Confucian philosophy and contemporary Chinese philosophy, for example, in Zhu Xi’s discussion of Mencius’s moral sprouts (siduan) (Marchal 2013; Zhu 2011) and Wang Yangming’s discussion of xin (心the heart-mind) and liangzhi (moral awareness or conscience) (Lu 2019; Wang 1963). In his theory of emotion as foundational substance (qing benti lun 情本體論), a renowned contemporary Chinese philosopher Li Zehou (1998) takes qing as the foundational substance (benti 本體) of morality and humanity.

2. Emotions and Qing in Early Chinese Philosophy

2.1 Emotions and Qing

Many psychologists and philosophers report that emotions have particular psychological properties such as phenomenology, intentionality, motivation, embodiment, and appraisal (Charland 2002; Fehr & Russell 1984; Goldie 2002; Russell 1980). For example, one’s emotional state of anger against unfair discrimination can be explained by one’s feeling (distress, frustration), intentionality (unfair discrimination), motivation (complaint, protest), embodiment (rapid heartbeat, high blood pressure), and appraisal (oppose, dislike). An emotional state, therefore, is a psychological complexity consisting of multidimensional or multifactorial processes of the mind. On the basis of these psychological properties, one can easily understand Blackburn’s (1996: 117) definition:

The typical human emotions include love, grief, fear, anger, joy. Each indicates a state of some kind of arousal, a state that can prompt some activities and interfere with others. These states are associated with characteristic feelings, and they have characteristic bodily expressions.

In the Liji (禮記 the Book of Rites), one of Confucian classics, one can find comparable categories (such as joy, anger, and love) and characteristics (such as feeling, arousal, and activity) of emotions:

What are the feelings [qing] of men? They are joy, anger, sadness, fear, love, disliking, and liking. These seven feelings belong to men without their learning them. (Liji, 9.18; Legge 1885a: 379)

Before the feelings of pleasure, anger, sorrow, and joy are aroused it is called equilibrium (chung [zhong], centrality, mean). When these feelings are aroused and each and all attain due measure and degree, it is called harmony. (Liji, 31.1; Zhongyong, 1; Chan 1963: 98)

It seems that ancient Chinese notions of qing and feelings are comparable with the Western psychological categories and characterizations of emotions as illustrated in Blackburn’s definition and the passages of the Liji. In many ancient Chinese texts, however, this similarity does not hold. Qing does not always refer to inner feelings or emotional states. It refers to many different things, some of which have little to do with inner psychological states.

2.2 Meanings of Qing

Qing, in modern Chinese, means emotions and subjective feelings. 感情 (ganqing) means feeling and 情绪 (qingxu) means affective mood. In early Chinese texts in the pre-Han (500 to 200 BCE) period, however, the term qing does not always refers to emotional states of the mind. It can mean real facts, truth, or essence that does not seem to have any relation to inner subjective states of the mind. Graham (1990: 59–65) argues that, in pre-Han literature, qing should not be understood as “passions”. Instead, it should be understood as “the facts” or what is “genuine”. Although in some texts, the Xunzi, for instance, qing is used in the contexts of feelings and emotions, in other texts, such as the Mozi and the Sunzi bingfa (孫子兵法 the Art of War), it means essence, nature, genuineness, situation, and reality with little semantic affinity to emotions or subjective feelings. For this reason, many sinologists and comparative philosophers (Bruya 2003; Eifring 2004b; Graham 1990; Hansen 1995; Harbsmeier 2004; Middendorf 2008; Puett 2004; Virág 2017) discuss the polysemy of qing in early Chinese texts and analyze its peculiar patterns of emergence and development in the pre-Han period. Regarding the meaning of qing in pre-Han texts, Graham (1990: 59) states that “As a noun it [qing] means ‘the facts’…, as an adjective ‘genuine’…, as an adverb ‘genuinely’”. By following Graham’s (1990) interpretation of qing, Eifring (2019: 190) develops a non-psychological interpretation of qing (i.e., qing as nature, essence, or genuineness) in pre-Han Confucian and Daoist texts. He states that

qing is hardly used in the sense of ‘emotion’ at all…The term itself has a number of different meanings, most of them clearly related, and when the meaning ‘emotion’ gradually emerges, some of these meanings still continue to vibrate along, suggesting that emotions are genuine and that they belong to human nature.

Following the same line of interpretation, Ivanhoe and Van Norden (2001: 391) define qing as “‘the genuine’, ‘essence’, or ‘disposition’”. They state that

The qing of something is what it genuinely is, as opposed to what it might appear to be. This is often conceived of in terms of how it would spontaneously behave and develop if given a proper environment and support. More specifically, some interpreters have argued that the qing of a thing can be the essential characteristics of that thing. Toward the end of the Warring States period, qing came to refer to human emotions or dispositions (perhaps because some thinkers regarded these as essential to human beings).

Adding more semantic details, Santangelo (2007: 296) states that the most common Chinese term, qing is

a polysemous word that basically means: “feeling or affective state of mind”, “inclination or desire”, “circumstances”, “authenticity”. Even if we consider the most common terms that are usually translated into English as “emotion”, qinggan or ganqing, in fact they express a semantic space different from the English or Italian equivalents.

As these interpretations and reports show, qing, unlike the common meaning of emotion in modern Chinese, has non-psychological meanings (nature, essence, reality etc.) in pre-Han Chinese texts that may coexist with psychological meanings (feelings, inclinations, desires, etc.) of qing. Seok (2013: 140), therefore, explains the meanings of qing in three dimensions: ontological (dynamic nature, human existence), epistemological (sense of reality and experience), and psychological/moral (emotional expressions and feelings) dimensions. He states that

different meanings of qing such as the essential identity of things, affective states of the mind, and the concrete understanding of situation/reality are all related to the open interactive and embodied interaction between the self and the world.

Harbsmeier (2004: 71) provides probably the most comprehensive list of qing’s meanings. According to him, qing has following meanings in the pre-Buddhist (before 1st century CE) China.

  1. Factual: The basic facts of a matter. This particularly common in historical and “scientific” prose.
  2. Metaphysical: Underlying and basic dynamic factors. This is particularly common in YI [Yijing, the Book of Changes] and philosophical writings.
  3. Political: Basic popular sentiments/responses. This occurs in writings on political theory.
  4. Anthropological: General basic instincts/propensities. This is particularly common in writings on ritual and philosophy.
  5. Positive: Essential sensibilities and sentiments, viewed as commendable. This is particularly cultivated in Taoist writings.
  6. Personal: Basic motivation/attitude. This is particularly common in historical texts and texts on political philosophy.

2.3 Semantic Dimensions of Qing

Underneath the polysemy of qing, there are two semantic dimensions: one is the ontological and objective dimension (qing as nature, essence, or reality) and the other is the psychological and subjective dimension (qing as inner feelings or subjective emotions). Regarding the two semantic dimensions of qing, Bruya (2003: 157) states that

qing carried a range of meaning, from mere facts on one end of a spectrum, to pure emotion on the other.

The two seemingly contrastive or even conflicting semantic dimensions caught the academic interest of many sinologists and comparative philosophers. Why does qing have the seemingly contrastive or conflicting meanings? Are the two semantic dimensions incompatible with each other? What is the conceptual or philosophical foundation of qing’s polysemy? The polysemy of qing will guide us to discover the underlying conceptual foundations of emotions in early Chinese philosophy, specifically its diverse viewpoints on the affective nature of the mind.

3. Interpretations of Qing

Various attempts have been made to explain the semantic, conceptual, historical, and philosophical relations among different meanings of qing, specifically the onto-objective (qing as essence, nature or reality) and the psycho-subjective (qing as inner subjective feelings) meanings that early Chinese philosophers discussed in their theories of the mind and morality.

3.1 Qing as Nature, Essence or Genuineness

Graham (1990: 59) argues that qing should never be interpreted as feelings or passions (i.e., inner subjective states of the mind) in early Chinese philosophy. According to him, the internalized or psychologized meanings of qing became fully and explicitly available later in the Song dynasty (960 CE and after) when qing is paired with xing (性 objective nature or essence) in Neo-Confucian metaphysics. He states that qing as a noun in the context of pre-Han literature means “’the facts’…as an adjective ‘genuine’”. However, he explains in the contexts of the Xunzi and the Liji how qing is associated with emotions as expressions of genuine of human nature. He (1990: 64) states that

In these texts [the Xunzi and the Liji], but nowhere else in pre-Han literature, the word [qing] refers only to the genuine in man which it is polite to disguise, and therefore to his feelings.

According to him, Xunzi uses qing in the sense of the genuine or essential nature and explained its affective expressions from the viewpoint where the nature of human beings can be found in inner affective states. In this way, Graham defends his interpretation of qing as essence or genuineness even in the contexts of subjective feelings in some early Chinese texts.

3.2 Qing as the Inputs from Reality

In Hansen’s non-belief or non-doxastic approach to Chinese philosophy, specifically to Chinese epistemology and philosophy of mind in pre-Buddhist period, qing is an intriguing example of semantic duality. He (1995: 182) discusses two different, almost opposite definitions of qing in a typical Chinese English dictionary.

A typical Chinese-English dictionary…has two entries under qingfeeling: The first is “affections, the feelings, desires”; translations of character compounds under this meaning include love, desire, emotion, and sentiment. The second definition is “circumstances; facts of a case”; examples of compounds under this meaning include truth, situation, reason, origin, real facts.

He (1995) characterizes this semantic duality of qing as an intriguing combination of the two contrastive properties of qing: qing is understood partially as a subjective inner state and partially as an objective and external state of affairs. He argues that the two meanings of qing poses a conceptual conflict only under the exclusive and dichotomous schemes of Western philosophy, i.e., the distinction between the inner-subjective-psychological mind and the outer-objective-material world and the contrastive or confrontational relation between emotion and reason. He states (1995: 183) that

Chinese views of language, mind, and action do not center on an inner subjectivity or a conception of a mental/intellectual world populated by mental/intellectual objects set off against an external world of physical objects or matter. Nor do they make the familiar Indo-European faculty and functional distinction between cognitive and affective states. A single faculty/organ, the xinheart-mind, guides action rather than separate faculties of heart and mind.

From the viewpoint of these dichotomies, the semantic duality of qing becomes puzzling or confusing. However, if, as Hansen argues, Chinese philosophy does not subscribe the dichotomies of subjectivity-objectivity and emotion-reason, one can find a way to combine the two meanings of qing in a consistent and meaningful manner. Following this unique Chinese approach to language, mind and action, Hansen explains how different meanings of qing coexist in Chinese philosophy. According to him (1995: 196), qing, in early Chinese philosophy, should be understood as “the inputs from reality” or “reality induced discrimination or distinction-making reactions” such as dark-light, left-right, sweet-sour-salty-bitter, and high-low pitch. That is, qing refers to the inputs from our reaction or interaction with reality. From this broad meaning of qing, one can understand, as Hansen argues, how qing is discussed in early Chinese texts. On the basis of this interpretation of qing, he argues that the semantic transition from qingreality to qingemotion can be explained by the introduction of Buddhism to Chinese philosophy. He (1995: 183) states that

I implicitly accept the possibility that the introduction of Buddhism imported an Indo-European psychological theory and thus introduced new theoretical roles for qingfeelings and yudesire.

Hansen argues that, with the introduction of Buddhism, Chinese philosophers found a way to understand the mind from the perspective of the inner, subjective, representational states, and this psychological viewpoint of Buddhism facilitated the development of a new semantic dimension of qing (i.e., qing as subjective feelings) in Chinese philosophy.

3.3 Qing as Mutual Arousal and Response among Things

Bruya (2003) reports that, in many pre-Han texts, qing refers to affective states of the mind. Although he does not disagree with Graham (1990) that qing, in some contexts of pre-Han literature, means nature, essence, or genuineness of things, he points out that qing also means feelings or emotions in other contexts. In fact, qing is closely related to affective states in several pre-Han texts such as the Mencius and the Xunzi. He states that “the defining of ‘qing’ in terms of emotions can be now be seen explicitly as early as Mencius…” and argues that the “implicit early cosmology of spontaneous interrelation among things (humans included)” is in the background of the polysemous nature of qing (Bruya 2003: 163). He explains that qing has at least two different meanings, one being facts or situations and the other being feelings and emotions. However the two meanings, although contrastive or distinctive, are not necessarily incommensurable or incomparable to each other because qing has “implicit emotional overtones in early usage” and these implicit connections between the two meanings became apparent and explicit in Chinese texts in the late Warring States period such as the Mencius and the Xunzi (Bruya 2003: 152n3). According to him, the gradual transition or perhaps transformation from the onto-objective pole (i.e., qing as nature or reality) to psycho-subjective pole (i.e, qing as an interactive psychological state of the mind) of qing took place in Mencius’s period and clearly observed in the Xunzi. He (2003: 169) states that

qing is closely associated with mutual arousal and response, the processes of transformation through interpenetration

and this general (albeit vague and implicit) understanding of the universe and human affairs precedes the philosophical discussions of qing as an affective state of the mind in the Warring States period (Bruya 2003: 168–169). For example, he (2003: 163) states that

the defining “qing” in terms of emotions can now be seen explicitly as early as Mencius, and its implicit content can be seen as far back as the Shujing [書經 the Book of Documents].

It is important to note that, in Bruya’s explanation, the semantic transition or conceptual change of qing is not understood as a sudden shift of viewpoints from the external to internal dimensions of qing. Rather, it is understood as a gradual process of the integration and interpenetration of the external and internal aspects of qing via a particular form of philosophical psychology, i.e., understanding of the mind and its inner states as a resonating and interactive flow that derives from the generative and interpenetrative cosmological force.

3.4 Semantic Transition and Transformation of Qing

Following this semantic divide and transition from the onto-objective to psycho-subjective meanings of qing, one can understand the polysemy of qing and its semantic change in early Chinese philosophy. First, qing had or acquired many different meanings over several centuries in ancient Chinese philosophy. Second, there are two major semantic dimensions (onto-objective and psycho-subjective dimensions) of qing. Third, the meanings of qing had been expanded from the first dimension to the second dimension. Fourth, regarding the period of the semantic transition or expansion of qing, different views are proposed: the semantic transition had occurred during the Warring States period (specifically around the time of Mencius and Xunzi, i.e., 300 BCE) (Bruya 2003), after the introduction of Buddhism to China (the Han Dynasty around 250 CE) (Hansen 1995) or during the Song dynasty (around 960 CE) (Graham 1990). Regardless of the exact timeline of the semantic transition, Chinese philosophy is greatly influenced by its philosophical reflection on the nature of qing through its broad semantic spectrum of objective nature and subjective feelings. Cai (2020: 424–425) summarizes the polysemy and the semantic transition of qing in the following way.

The Chinese thinking about qing basically follows an objective-to-subjective trajectory. It begins with philosophical investigations into the nature of the myriad things or wanwu 萬物 (ten thousand things) during the late Spring and Autumn period and the early Warring States period (roughly the late sixth and fifth century BCE). This is followed by a shift of attention from the objective nature of the things to the subjective nature of humans—their emotion and moral nature—during the middle and late Warring States period (roughly fourth and third centuries BCE). From the Han onward, the locus of qing discussions shifts from philosophy to music and literature, with emotion being qing’s core referent.

4. Categories and Lists of Emotions in Early Chinese Texts

Although qing does not always mean emotions and feelings in many Chinese texts in the pre-Han period, it is sometimes discussed in the context of cataloging or categorizing psychological states. Probably, the most common list of emotions in ancient Chinese texts is xi nu ai le (喜怒哀樂 joy, anger, sadness, and pleasure). They appear in many Chinese texts as representative terms or categories of inner affective states. There are other lists of emotions in early Chinese texts but they are somewhat similar to each other.

4.1 Lists of Qing as Emotions

The following lists show the general scope of emotions in early Chinese philosophy and how these emotions are compared against Western categories of emotions such as those of Descartes’s (1648 [1989]) list of passions and Ekman’s (1999) basic emotions.

  • Liji (9.18) (Fourth Century BCE)
    joy, anger, sadness, fear, love, disliking (hate), and liking (desire).
  • Xunzi (17.4, 22.2) (Third Century BCE)
    liking, disliking (hate), joy, anger, sadness, pleasure
  • Xunzi (22.5) (Third Century BCE)
    persuasions and reasons, joy and anger, sadness and pleasure, love and dislike (hate), liking (desire)
  • Zhuangzi (2.2) (Third Century BCE)
    喜怒哀樂 慮嘆變慹 姚佚啟態
    joy, anger, grief, delight, worry, regret, fickleness, inflexibility, modesty, willfulness, candor, insolence
  • Xing Zi Ming Chu [Human] Nature comes from the [Heavenly] Decree (1.1) (Fourth Century BCE)
    joy, anger, sadness, sorrow
  • Nei yei (Inward Training; Roth 1999: 51) (Fourth Century BCE)
    worry, pleasure, joy, anger, desire, profit (material interest)
  • Bai Hu Tong (8.2) (First Century CE)
    joy, anger, sadness, pleasure, love, disliking (hate)
  • The Passions of the Soul (Les Passions de l’âme) (Descartes 1649)
    wonder, love, hatred, desire, joy, sadness
  • “Basic Emotions” (Ekman 1999)
    joy, anger, sadness, fear, disgust, surprise

These lists demonstrate that ancient Chinese philosophers used categories of emotions that are comparable to those of Western philosophy and psychology. In his The Passions of the Soul (Les Passions de l’âme), Descartes (1649) designates six primitive passions: wonder, love, hatred, desire, joy, and sadness. Except wonder, one can see his primitive passions in early Chinese texts. Ekman’s (1999) list of the basic emotions (emotions that are universally perceived and recognized across cultures and societies, i.e., joy, anger, sadness, fear, disgust, surprise) also overlap substantially with those of early Chinese philosophers. Although the notion of qing is quite idiosyncratic and polysemous, the individuation of emotions in early Chinese philosophy seems comparable to that of Western philosophy and psychology.

4.2 Unusual Categories of Qing

In the Chinese lists of emotions, however, one can see some unusual categories: “persuasion and reason” (說故) in the Xunzi (22.5) and profit (material interest) (利) in the Nei yei. They do not look like categories of emotions. In addition, it is unclear whether these lists of emotions refer to the designated emotions or the whole spectrum of emotions. For example, Eifring (2019: 190) suggests that xi nu (喜怒 joy and anger), a pair of antonyms, should be understood broadly as the whole spectrum emotions, not simply as the two specific emotions (joy and anger). He states that xi nu

is used as a simple two-character phrase…usually referring to emotions in general rather than to these two specific emotions.

It is also unclear whether these lists provide a set of mutually exclusive or jointly exhaustive emotions. Since some of the lists include overlapping categories of emotions. For example, love (ai 愛) and liking (hao 好) seem very similar to each other so that they have the same antonym, i.e., disliking (e 惡) in their contrastive pairs. In the Liji, ai (love) is paired with e (disliking) but in the Xunzi, hao (liking) is paired with e (disliking). In addition, motivational states such as desire (yu 欲) and liking (hao 好) seem to share some common psychological elements. Therefore, the lists and categories of emotions in early Chinese texts should not be understood as complete and exhaustive lists of emotions because they are composed of overlapping categories that are not mutually exclusive and jointly exhaustive. It make little sense to compare them directly against Descartes’ primitive passions or Ekman’s basic emotions although they have some similarities with the Western counterparts.

4.3 Terms of Emotions in Early Chinese Texts

These lists of emotions do not appear in ancient Chinese texts before the Warring States period such as oracle bone inscriptions (甲骨文, jiaguwen) and bronze script of the Shang dynasty (second millennium BCE). They began to show up in the mid to late Warring states period. For example, the Analects and the Mencius, although they discuss affective states of the mind, do not list emotions in the form of xi nu (喜怒) or xi nu ai le (喜怒哀樂). The Xunzi and the Zhuangzi, however, list emotions in various forms that include xi nu ai le (喜怒哀樂) (Bruya 2003; Eifring 2019; Harbsmeier 2004; Puett 2004). Harbsmeier (2004: 70) reports that terms that refer to emotions such as xi (喜 joy), nu (怒 anger), ai (哀 sadness), ju (懼 fear), ai (愛 love), wu (惡 disliking), and yu (欲 desire) are not used in ancient Chinese oracle bone inscriptions. (Xi [喜] was only used as a proper name but not as a name for an emotion.) He also lists the following terms and points out that they are “absent in oracle bones and gradually emerge in the bronze, bamboo and silk inscriptions of later times” (Harbsmeier 2004: 70).

  • xin 心 heart
  • si 思 think of, long for
  • nian 念 think about
  • zhi 志 ambition, aspiration
  • shen 愼 be careful about
  • zhong 忠 impartial, honest
  • gong 恭 respect
  • ci 慈 be loving
  • wu 悟 understand
  • wei 慰 console
  • mu 慕 admire
  • xu 恤 show compassion
  • yu 愚 be stupid
  • dai 怠 be lazy
  • wang 忘 forget
  • huo 惑 be confused
  • ji 忌 resent
  • yuan 怨 resent
  • nu 怒 be angry
  • hui 悔 regret
  • bei 悲 be sad
  • gan 感 be moved
  • kong 恐 be terrified
  • lian 憐 love

The absence of these terms in the ancient Chinese inscriptions, as Harbsmeier (2004) explains, do not imply that ancient Chinese had no conceptions of emotions or other psychological states. Nor does it mean that these terms were not used in ancient China outside the record keeping purposes of the inscriptions. It simply means that the conception and the public discourse of emotions (including writing and compiling texts with these psychological terms) had been changed and new terms had been developed in ancient China, specifically during the Warring States period. It is important to note that some of the terms in this list (such as “to be lazy” and “to be terrified”) are related to behavioral or embodied states, i.e., states that are experienced by or manifested in the body. That is, in ancient Chinese texts, the domain of the mind is not limited to the internal or representational states. It is extended to bodily states as well.

5. Emotions in Early Chinese Philosophical Texts

Major philosophical texts of early Chinese philosophy such as the Analects, the Mozi, and the Laozi, were written in the Warring States period, the historical period known as the period of the “Hundred Schools of Thought” (百家). Many philosophical schools competed against one another for their visions for personal happiness, virtue, ideal society, stable government, and the peaceful world. Some of these schools of philosophy developed inspiring and stimulating theories of the mind and emotions. The following sections will survey and explain how philosophical texts of the Warring States period, specifically those of Confucianism, Daoism, and Mohism, describe and discuss emotions in their theories of the mind, morality, and human nature.

5.1 The Analects

In many passages of the Analects, Confucius (551–479 BCE) states that true virtue comes out of a genuine affective state of the mind. He emphasizes that carefully focused affective state is an essential component of Confucian virtue. Although Confucius does not make any explicit connection between qing and emotions, his general approach to emotions and virtue through the genuineness or sincerity of the mind makes an implicit connection between qing and emotions in the cultivation of virtue: virtue should reflect the affective genuineness that emerges from the essence (qing) of humanity. From this moral-psychological viewpoint, one can understand how qing comes to include subjective feelings and emotions and, at the same time, still refers to the essential human nature in early Confucian philosophy.

Feelings and emotions are discussed in many passages of the Analects. Confucius believes that having appropriate emotional states is essential in cultivating and perfecting ideal virtues. True filial piety, according to him, is not just one’s behavior of supporting one’s parents but sincere respect and care for them (Analects, 2.7). What distinguishes true filial piety from a mere act of fulfilling one’s duty to serve one’s parents is this inner state of sincere love for one’s parents. When Fanzi asked about ren (benevolence, the central virtue of Confucianism), Confucius answered that ren is to love others (Analects, 12.22). When Lin Fang asked about ritual propriety, Confucius states that

In the ceremonies of mourning, it is better that there be deep sorrow than a minute attention to observances. (Analects, 3.4; Legge 1960a: 156)

He stresses an appropriate state of the mind, i.e., deep sorrow and sincere sadness, not the formal details of the ceremony in ritual propriety. At the foundation of Confucian virtues such as filial piety (xiao 孝), benevolence (ren 仁), and ritual propriety (li 禮), one can always see genuine and appropriate emotional states with the fully dedicated mind.

A diverse group of emotions such as le (樂 joy), ai (哀 sorrow), hao (好 liking), and you (憂 worry) are discussed in the Analects. Confucius always sees, underneath the observable actions and behaviors, deep emotional flow as a critical element of humaneness and moral excellence.

The Master said, “High station filled without indulgent generosity; ceremonies performed without reverence; mourning conducted without sorrow (ai 哀 sorrow)—wherewith should I contemplate such ways?” (Analects, 3.26; Legge 1960a: 164)

The Master said, “They who know [zhi 知] the truth are not equal to those who love [hao 好 liking] it, and they who love it are not equal to those who delight [le 樂 joy] in it”. (Analects, 6.20; Legge 1960a: 191)

Confucius not only explains virtues through emotional states but also expresses the excitement of cultivating and perfecting virtues through learning (xue 學). The beginning chapter of the Analects starts with Confucius’s excitement of learning:

Is it not pleasant [le 樂] to learn with a constant perseverance and application? Is it not delightful to have friends coming from distant quarters? Is he not a man of complete virtue, who feels no discomposure though men may take no note of him? (Analects, 1.1; Legge 1960a: 137)

The excitement and delight in this passage are not simple hedonic states of the mind but a fully engaged sense of one’s virtuous mind. Confucius also expresses his sadness when his beloved disciple Yan Yuan died. Confucius

bewailed him exceedingly, and the disciples who were with him said, “Master, your grief is excessive!” “Is it excessive?” said he. “If I am not to mourn bitterly for this man, for whom should I mourn?” (Analects, 11.10; Legge 1960a: 240).

He does not hide his naturally aroused emotions as expressions of his genuine heart-mind. In the Analects, therefore, Confucius shows that emotions and feelings are essential components of virtue and self-cultivation, and highlights the affective nature of the moral mind.

None of these emotions and feelings, however, are explicitly linked to qing in the Analects. Qing appears twice in the Analects, in the contexts where it means genuineness, truthfulness, situations or circumstances. For example, there is no direct connection between qing and emotions in the following passages of the Analects.

If he [a superior person] love good faith, the people will not dare not to be sincere [qing, truthful]. (Analects, 13.4; Legge 1960a: 265)

The rulers have failed in their duties, and the people consequently have been disorganized, for a long time. When you have found out the truth [qing, situation] of any accusation, be grieved for and pity them, and do not feel joy at your own ability. (Analects, 19.19; Legge 1960a: 345)

In these passages, qing means genuineness, truthfulness and objective reality. It seems that when Confucius’s teachings were recorded around 500 BCE, qing had little relation to subjective inner feelings even though Confucius discussed emotions and feelings in the Analects. As Graham (1990) and Hansen (1995) argue, qing gets associated with emotions and feelings in the later stages of Chinese philosophy. This does not mean that emotions are not important or not discussed in Chinese philosophy in the Warring States period. In fact, the Analects is filled with Confucius’s teachings on emotions and feelings. Le (樂 joy) appears 23 times in the Analects when filial piety (xiao 孝) and righteousness (yi 義) show up 14 and 20 times respectively.

5.2 The Mozi

Mozi’s (480–390 BCE) vision for the peaceful and prosperous world lies in his philosophy of jian ai (兼愛), impartial caring or impartial concern for all. He believes that all the major problems of the world such as war, violence, and poverty are caused by the unregulated psychological tendency of partiality and the relentless pursuit of self-interest. According to him, subjective feelings or emotions for others, although they can promote love for others and care for their wellbeing, can become partial and biased because emotions are typically aroused, expressed, and shared in small communities of personal relations and social networks. He believes that spontaneously aroused emotions, because of their tendencies of partiality, inconsistency, and bias, do not help people to deal with their hardships and fix the calamities of the world. He states that

It is things such as great states attacking small states, great families wreaking havoc with lesser families, the strong robbing the weak, the many doing violence to the few, the clever deceiving the ignorant, and the noble acting arrogantly toward the humble. These are some of the great harms being done in the world. In addition, there are rulers who are not kind, ministers who are not loyal, fathers who are not loving, and children who are not filial. These too are some of the great harms being done in the world…. If we try to discover the origin of these different harms, where do we find they come from?…it is those who are partial in their dealings with others who are the real cause of all the great harms in the world. (Mozi, 16.1; Ivanhoe and Van Norden 2001: 68)

Mozi proposes, therefore, jian ai, impartial caring i.e., a sense of broad, fair, and consistent moral interest for others’ wellbeing beyond one’s narrow confinement of personal relations and local networks. Generally, ai (愛) means love or care. In the context of Mozi’s philosophy, however, it means universal love, i.e., one’s unbiased and impartial interest for others’ wellbeing. It is love, concern, or care without affective partiality such as one’s strong feeling for one’s parents but lack of concern for strangers. For this reason, ai does not seem to be a typical emotion of care and concern. Graham (1989: 31–32) states that it is “unemotional will to benefit and avoid harming people”. However, ai does not necessarily exclude the affective elements of caring or concern. As Shun explains (1997: 31), it can include “reacting affectively in response to negative conditions of the objects of concern”. Virág (2017: 59) also points out that

Jian ai possesses a spectrum of meanings in the text [the Mozi], from strong affection to a more detached concern for the well-being of others.

The unique aspect of Mozi’s jian ai is that it seems to be an affective duty constructed out of his argument to overcome partiality and bias. If jian ai is an emotion, it is not a spontaneous feeling but a cultivated emotion, i.e., one’s carefully developed, unbiased, impartial, and affective interest for the benefit of others and the world.

Mozi presents his famous argument for impartial love in the following passage.

If people were to regard others’ states as they regard their own state, then who would still mobilise their own state to attack the states of others? They would regard others’ [states] as they regard their own. If people were to regard the capital cities of others as they regard their own capital city, then who would still raise their own capital city to strike at the capital cities of others? They would regard others’ [capital cities] as they regard their own. If people were to regard the houses of others as they regard their own house, who would still stir their own house to bring disorder to the houses of others? They would regard others’ [houses] as they regard their own. Now if states and cities did not attack and strike at each other, and if people’s houses did not bring disorder to and damage each other, would this be harmful to the world? Or would it be beneficial to the world? This must be beneficial to the world. For the moment let us think about the origin of these many benefits, what it is they arise from….We must say that it is from loving people and benefiting people that they arise. And, if we were to distinguish and name those in the world who love people and benefit people, would it be as “discriminating” or as “universal”? We must say it would be as “universal”. In this case, then, it is “mutual and universal” which gives rise to the world’s great benefits. (Mozi, 16.2; Johnston 2010: 147–149)

Mozi’s argument, in this passage, does not seem to prove the existence of an emotion of universal love and mutual caring. Instead, the argument attempts to prove the importance of impartiality and the necessity of an emotional dedication for the universal love. It is a rational justification that calls for a reciprocal and universal viewpoint where one should take equal interest for oneself and others. In this context, one can suspect the psychological reality and practical effectiveness of Mozi’s universal love. The main theoretical challenge is to explain the motivation of impartial caring on the basis of a reasoning that impartial caring is morally justified and a rationally right thing to do (Graham 1989: 31–32; Nivison 1996: 84; Virág 2017: 61–62). Can the affective motivation of jian ai come out of a rational argument or doxastic moral justification? Although one does not need to distinguish rationality and emotionality of jian ai and can accept the diverse forms of moral motivation (Fraser 2011; Robins 2012), Mozi’s approach to emotion is clearly different from that of Confucians, such as Confucius and Mencius. The Confucians believe that natural or genuine emotional states can align themselves with moral will and ideal virtues through the process of self-cultivation, learning or other mental practices. Mozi seems to focus primarily on reasoning and rational justification for jian ai, although he does not completely reject or devalue the affective elements of jian ai and the various means of its cultivation. According to him, jian ai makes rulers kind, ministers loyal, and fathers compassionate, and the gentleman carefully examining it and diligently practicing it (Mozi, 16.2; Johnston 2010: 165).

Qing appears 26 times in the Mozi but it does not refer to inner affective states of the mind. Instead, it is used in at least three different ways. Mozi states that

Every creature living between Heaven and earth and within the four seas partakes of the nature [qing 情] of Heaven and earth and the harmony of the Yin and the Yang. Even the greatest sages cannot alter this. How do we know? When they taught about Heaven and earth, they dwelt on the upper and the lower spheres and the four seasons, the principles of Yin and Yang and human nature [ren qing 人情], the phenomena of men and women, birds and animals, and that of the sexes. Even the early kings could not escape from the fundamentals of nature. (Mozi, 6.8; Mei 1929: 26).

In this passage, Mozi describes qing (情) as the firm and objective nature of the world (天壤之情) including human nature (ren qing 人情), that is unalterable and unmodifiable even by the sage kings. The whole passage explains the natural order of the universe (time, space, living and non-living things) and the natures of human beings and animals. Here, qing has no relation to emotions or feelings.

In another passage, Mozi uses qing to explain the sociopolitical environment of a state. He states that those rulers who understand the qing of common people will be successful leaders but those who do not understand the qing will bring chaos (Mozi, 13.1; Mei 1929: 70). Here qing means a broad sociopolitical environment, specifically the living (economic, cultural, social and political) conditions of people. Mozi states that understanding people’s qing is a critical element of successful leadership. Rulers should carefully observe the socio-political reality of their states and the living conditions and opinions of their people. This type of qing falls in the semantic category of situations, circumstances, or reality. Cai (2020: 403) interprets it as existential conditions of people and Virág (2017: 56) takes it as sentiment or affective dispositions of people.

Qing also means truth or truthful in the Mozi (36.1). When Mozi explains the (epistemological) standard of judgments, he states that

Now that the truth and error [qing wei 情偽] (of a doctrine) in the world is hard to tell, there must be three tests. (Mozi, 36.1; Mei 1929: 189)

Mei (1929) translates qing wei as truth and error but it can be understood as genuine (truthful) and artifice (deceiving), i.e., a contrastive pair of epistemological properties. Qing is also used adverbially. It means sincerely, earnestly, seriously, or really. Mozi states that if

the rulers now really [qing 情] desire gain and avert loss, desire security and avert danger, they cannot but condemn offensive wars (Mozi, 18.4; Mei 1929: 104)

Although, the adverbial meaning is related to qing’s nounal meaning, i.e., genuineness, it reveals a unique way emotions relate to their objects. Emotions, like beliefs and perceptions, have their own intentionality, i.e., their own way of referring to their target objects. For example, people are not just angry. They are angry about certain things or events (someone stole their cars, for example) in certain ways (highly stressful and frustrating ways). Regarding this unique form of affective intentionality, Bockover (1995: 174) states that

the difference between beliefs and emotions…is that emotions entail distinctively affective ways of being conscious about things.

In its adverbial use in the Mozi, qing shows this unique aspect of affective intentionality. Emotions do not simply relate to their targets: they can relate to their targets with diverse adverbial modes (i.e., strongly, weakly, sincerely, or superficially etc.).

5.3 The Mencius

By following Confucius’s views on the genuineness of emotion in moral virtues, Mencius (372–289 BCE) develops a moral-psychological explanation of the heart-mind (xin 心) and its innate moral foundations with spontaneous arousal and motivational purity. He puts moral emotions at the center of his philosophy and argues that the affective genuineness of Confucian virtues emerges from innately given affective inclinations. His four moral sprouts (siduan 四端, the four moral-psychological foundations of Confucian virtues) are the heart-mind of pity and compassion (惻隱), shame and dislike (羞惡), modesty and compliance (辭讓), and approve and disapprove (是非) (Mencius, 2A6, 6A6). For example, one cannot bear to see the suffering of others and quickly develops empathic concern for them. This naturally aroused affective inclination is the foundation of the Confucian virtue of benevolence (ren) (Mencius, 2A6). He often compares the cultivation of the moral sprouts to an agricultural process: the sprouts can grow naturally because of their inborn nature under the particular external conditions (such as water, soil, and nutrition) for their full maturation. From this onto-generative and innate viewpoint of moral emotions, one can see the moral-psychological connection between qing and emotions. Even though no explicit connection between qing and emotions is made in the Mencius, the genuineness of the human mind in Confucian virtues such as ren (仁 benevolence), yi (義 righteousness), li (禮 ritual propriety), and zhi (智 wisdom) is traced back to the inborn nature or essence, (i.e, qing) of humanity that manifests itself in such emotional reactions as buren (不忍 not bearing to see others’ suffering) or ceyin (惻隱 pity and compassion).

When I say that all men have the mind which cannot bear to see the suffering of others, my meaning may be illustrated thus: Now, when men suddenly see a child about to fall into a well, they all have a feeling of alarm and distress, not to gain friendship with the child’s parents, not to seek the praise of their neighbors and friends, nor because they dislike the reputation [of lack of humanity if they did not rescue the child]. From such a case, we see that a man without the feeling of commiseration is not a man; a man without the feeling of shame and dislike is not a man; a man without the feeling of deference and compliance is not a man; and a man without the feeling of right or wrong is not a man. (Mencius, 2A6; Chan 1963: 65)

As one can see in Mencius’s discussion of the four moral sprouts in this passage, Mencius’s moral psychology of the heart-mind focuses on the psychological and ontological foundation of moral emotions. According to him, Confucian virtues derive from the innate foundations (siduan) and these foundations are naturally given affective moral inclinations. As Confucius stresses the significance of sincere emotions in the cultivation of virtues, Mencius highlights their innate emotional foundations. However, these are not just psychological foundations. They are ontological foundations, too. He (2A6) states, for example, lacking the heart-mind of ceyin means lacking the essence of humanity. This foundational and ontological approach in Mencius’s moral philosophy provides a stimulating opportunity to connect emotions (affective inclinations) and qing (genuine nature) in the context of the four moral sprouts.

According to Mencius, certain emotions are aroused by innately given psychological orientations of the mind that flow spontaneously from the original nature of human beings. The four moral sprouts (siduan) are such emotions that deserve careful cultivation because their genuineness derives from human nature. Mencius (2A6, 6A6) believes that emotions, like living organisms, have roots and foundations, grows and expands, and reaches out to realize their natural potential. They begin and grow like a fire that starts to spark and a spring that breaks out (2A6). They should not be obstructed or stopped. They should be developed and cultivated to realize their full potential. This is Mencius’s moral-psychological nativism that highlights the affective and generative moral sprouts at the foundation of the heart-mind and human nature (Seok 2008).

Flanagan (2014) characterizes Mencius’s moral psychology of the four moral sprouts as natural teleology because the moral emotions have deep foundations in human nature with the designated endpoints, i.e., Confucian virtues. This ontological and teleological approach to emotions shows why emotions are important in Confucian philosophy and how emotions and qing can relate to each other. For example, qing appears four times (3A4, 4B46, 6A6, 6A8) in the Mencius and they mean nature/essence or situation/reality. Generally, the semantic content of qing in the Mencius follows that of the Analects: qing is not directly related to inner subjective feelings. Wu zhi qing (物之情) means nature of things (3A4) and ren zhi qing (人之情) means the nature or natural disposition of human beings (6A8). In 6A6, however, qing is used to explain the goodness of human nature in the context of affective feelings, i.e., the four moral sprouts. He states that “From the feelings [qing] proper to it [nature], it is constituted for the practice of what is good” (6A6; Legge 1960b: 402). In this passage, qing refers to the foundation or root of the moral emotions. Mencius explains that all humans, despite their individual differences, have the same foundation of goodness such as the four moral sprouts which are basically moral feelings. These feelings are the foundational essences (qing) of humanity that can become virtuous through the process of cultivation and learning. Although qing in this passage does not refer to inner subjective states of the mind, it means genuine and truthful dispositions of human beings such as the affective orientations of the mind that can be observed in the four moral sprouts. In this passage, qing (nature/essence) comes close to emotions and feelings, not just random feelings but certain feelings with specific innate inclinations that reflect underlying nature of human beings. Here, Mencius opens the door to emotional qing in his discussion of how human beings can become virtuous through the innately given affective sprouts of morality.

Other than the four moral sprouts and their foundational nature, Mencius discusses emotions and subjective feelings of love, concern, and sadness. For example, he discusses king Shun’s (舜) emotions such as sorrow and love to his parents and brother and explains true filial piety (5A1). Shun’s parents and brother tried to kill him but he kept his sincere feelings for them. Like Confucius, Mencius believes that genuine emotions are critical component of ideal moral virtues. He also points out how emotions change our sense of appropriateness and motivate to adopt certain norms. He states that

Anciently, there was no rule for the size of either the inner or the outer coffin. In middle antiquity, the inner coffin was made seven inches thick, and the outer one the same. This was done by all, from the sovereign to the common people, and not simply for the beauty of the appearance, but because they thus satisfied the natural feelings of their hearts [ren xin 人心]. (Mencius, 2B16; Legge 1960b: 221)

It seems that the thickness of coffin has little to do with emotions or feelings but Mencius explains that our feelings for deceased people is the reason why the inner coffin has certain thickness. It is not because of an aesthetic consideration, a universal principle, or a sense of duty but because of an affective sense for others that motivated the decision to adopt the particular thickness. From this perspective, one can easily understand Mencius’s criticism (3B9) of Yang Zhu’s and Mo Di’s views (Yangism and Mohism). Yang’s view is egoism that promotes one’s self-interest but does not acknowledge the authority of one’s ruler. Mo’s view is impartial caring that supports the benefit of others but does not recognize one’s feelings and respect for one’s parents. Mencius states that “to acknowledge neither king nor father is to be in the state of a beast” (3B9; Legge 1960b: 282). It is important to note that what Mencius criticizes here is not simply their rejection of the authority of ruler and father. Rather it is their denial of the caring heart at the center of morality that renders humanity little more than bests. Mencius explains why feelings and emotions for others, specifically for our parents, is important and why Yangism and Mohism fail: they propose uncaring ways of life. This is clearly presented in Mencius’s comment on Mohist thinker Yi Zhi’s (夷子) view. Mencius discusses the following example.

In great antiquity there were some who did not bury their parents. When their parents died, they took them up and threw them into a ditch. Later when they passed by them and saw foxes and wild cats eating them and flies and gnats eating them, their perspiration started out upon their foreheads, they looked askance and could not bear to look straight. Now the perspiration was not for the sake of other people. It was something at the bottom of their hearts that showed in their expressions. Their immediately went home and returned with baskets and spades and covered the bodies. If it was indeed right to cover them, then there must be certain moral principles which made filial sons and men of humanity inter their parents. (Mencius, 3A5; Chan 1963: 71)

In this passage, Mencius clearly states that the physical changes in the body are not caused by one’s deliberation or consideration of reputation and reward. They simply come out from the bottom of the heart (zhong xin 中心—the center or core of the heart-mind) in their feelings for others. He believes that Yangism and Mohism miss this critical element of the affective moral mind. According to him, we are moral creatures because of the feelings and emotions that flow from our genuine nature in its caring heart-mind for others.

5.4 The Xunzi

Xunzi (310–235 BCE) approaches emotions from the perspective of the functions and processes of the mind. The mind, according to him, is a functional complexity consisting of diverse processes of feelings and its nature is not to draw upon the innate moral orientation but to manifest affective sensitivity and reactivity in expressible forms. If the mind has the spontaneous reactivity to external stimuli, emotions and feelings show how the mind interacts with or reacts to the world (Xunzi, 11.10). Therefore, his approach to emotions and feelings, in comparison to Mencius’s foundational and moral approach, is naturalistic and psychological. Unlike Mencius, he does not investigate and analyze the innate foundations of Confucian virtues. Instead, he discusses how emotions and feelings are aroused in the mind to serve particular perceptual, conative, and moral functions.

Xunzi focuses on naturally given inclinations of the mind without necessarily implicating the underlying norms of ideal virtues. He states that

The natural disposition [qing 情] of people is that for food they want meats, for clothes they want embroidered garments, for travel they want chariots and horses, and moreover they want the riches of surplus wealth and accumulated goods. Even if provided these things, to the end of their years they would never be satisfied; this is also the natural disposition [qing 情] of people. (Xunzi, 4.11; Hutton 2014: 29)

In this passage, Hutton translates qing as “the natural disposition”. It is important to note that the meaning of qing as the natural disposition does not necessarily mean normative or teleological sense of nature (i.e., nature as an ideal standard or ultimate goal of human life) but spontaneous, unregulated and uncultivated tendencies of human behavior in Xunzi’s philosophy because human qing (人之情) can be disruptive and disorderly (Xunzi, 23).

From this naturalistic viewpoint, Xunzi actively links qing with psychological states and dispositions. In earlier Chinese texts such as the Mozi, for example, ren qing does not refer to inner psychology or affective states. In the Xunzi, however, ren zhi qing (人之情, qing of human beings) or ren qing (人情, human qing) refers to psychological dispositions or affective states. Cai (2020: 407) reports that qing appears 119 times in the Xunzi and

Of the 119 appearances of qing, fewer than 20 carry the neutral or positive import of “the nature of things”.

Specifically, Xunzi connects qing with inner subjective states. He states that

The feelings of liking and disliking, happiness and anger, and sadness and joy in one’s nature are called the dispositions [qing 情]. (Xunzi, 22.2; Hutton 2014: 236)

Among Chinese texts in the Warring States period, this is one of the passages where qing is discussed explicitly in the context of inner subjective feelings. However, the passage, in itself, does not necessarily show that qing is understood or identified as emotions in Xunzi’s philosophy. Instead, emotions can be understood as expressions, derivations, or one of the manifestations of the underlying nature or essence of human beings, as Graham (1990: 64) suggests. Whether one takes Graham’s interpretation or not, it is clear that Xunzi brings qing close to the affective dimension of the mind. In fact, the careful observation, modification, and cultivation of qing as an affective disposition is a key element of Xunzi’s moral philosophy as illustrated in his chapters on ritual and music.

According to Xunzi, human qing has a distinctive inclination of yu (欲 desire). People like to satisfy their desires for material goods such as fancy food and fine clothes.

The natural disposition [情] of people is that for food they want [yu 欲] meats, for clothes they want embroidered garments…. (Xunzi, 4.11; Hutton 2014: 29)

In this passage, yu (欲) means desire for material values and one’s interest in maximizing one’s self-interest. Xunzi believes that yu is an inborn disposition of human psychology and human beings are self-interested individuals who seek to satisfy their desires that are not completely satisfied. As a result, yu generates competitive struggle and violence. He states that

They [people] are born with desires of the eyes and ears, a fondness for beautiful sights and sounds. If they follow along with these, then lasciviousness and chaos will arise…. (Xunzi 23.1; Hutton 2014: 248)

Unlike Mencius’ optimistic approach to innate dispositions such as the four moral sprouts, Xunzi’s approach to the natural disposition of yu is cautious and despairing if not completely hopeless: yu is a major threat to the orderliness and stability of human living. Human nature is evil, he declares (Xunzi, 23.1), because of this natural but self-interested psychological disposition of the human mind.

Yu is typically understood as a conative state, a state of wanting or seeking (Xunzi, 4.11, 23.1). However, Xunzi explains it in the context of perceptual states such as seeing, hearing, and tasting, i.e., how our sensory organs search for their objects.

As for people’s natural dispositions [qing 情], their eyes desire [yu 欲] the utmost in sights, their ears desire the utmost in sounds, their mouths desire the utmost in flavors, their noses desire the utmost in smells, and their bodies desire the utmost in comfort. These “five utmosts” are something the natural dispositions [qing 情] of people cannot avoid desiring. (Xunzi, 11.10; Hutton 2014: 104)

In this passage, Xunzi describes the way our sensory organs are related to their targets. Perceptual states have their objects, i.e., what they see, hear, and smell. Yu describes this relational property (i.e., intentionality) of the mind in addition to its original function of desiring “five utmost objects”. That is, yu is not just a natural tendency to satisfy one’s desires but also perceptual intentionality that resides at a foundational (perceptual) level of the human mind. If intentionality, as Brentano (1874) explains, is a distinctive and an essential nature of the mind, Xunzi’s yu and qing include this foundational aspect of the mind (the relationality or about-ness of the mind) from an affective viewpoint.

The relation between qing and yu, therefore, should be understood at a deeper level of human nature or perhaps the nature of the universe. Xunzi provides such an explanation. He states that

Human nature [xing 性 nature] is the accomplishment of Heaven [tian 天]. The dispositions [qing 情 natural disposition or essential property] are the substance of the nature [xing 性 nature]. The desires [yu 欲] are the responses of the dispositions [qing 情] to things. Viewing the objects of desire as permissible to obtain and seeking them are what the dispositions [qing 情] cannot avoid. (Xunzi, 22.15; Hutton 2014: 244)

In this passage, Xunzi explains that yu derives from qing and qing comes from xing (the foundational nature of things). Against this broad process of derivation from tian (Heaven) to yu through xing and qing (as indicated in the schematic diagram below), yu can be understood as an unavoidable inborn disposition of human beings.

Tian (天 Heaven) → Xing (性 nature) → Qing (情 natural disposition) → (Qing’s Response [Ying 應] to external stimulation) → Yu (欲 desire)

This cosmological process can help us understand how qing came to include a new semantic dimension, i.e., psychological disposition of desire or emotion from its original meaning of nature or essence. According to Xunzi, qing is related not only to objective and essential nature of things (xing 性) but also to the psychological inclinations of human beings (yu 欲), because qing derives from xing (nature) and generates yu (desire). In this process of qing’s origination and projection, one can understand that qing does not simply refer to objective, static, and eternal nature of things but also to the interactive and responsive dispositions of human beings. A similar approach to qing can be found in Xing Zi Ming Chu (性自命出 Human Nature comes from the Mandate), an excavated Confucian text written in the mid-fourth to early third century BCE. According to Xing Zi Ming Chu, qing is aroused when xing (human nature) is stimulated by external objects.

Emotional (xi, nu, ai, bei [delight, anger, grief, sadness]) qi [material force or physical energy] is due to xing. When it manifests externally, it is due to sensual contact with things (wu qu zhi 物取之). (Xing Zi Ming Chu, 1.1; Tang, Bruya, and Wen 2003: 275; Middendorf 2008: 152)

From this broad perspective of foundational xing and responsive qing, one can understand how the objective and subjective aspects of qing are integrated in Xunzi’s philosophy through the interactive responsiveness or resonance among things.

Xunzi’s naturalistic and psychological approach, however, does not imply that emotions are just subjective feelings and the mind is only amoral or immoral. The genuineness of emotion is still important in Xunzi’s moral psychology, as in Confucius’s and Mencius’s. Xunzi discusses, for example, why it is important to pay full respect to deceased people with loyalty, generosity and the full decoration of coffins. He explains that people have genuine feelings for deceased people because treating life and death with one and the same care is what people all wish for (Xunzi, 19.17; Hutton 2014: 207). He also explains how genuine emotions can be cultivated through the affective transformation. According to him, emotional genuineness can be developed through various means of social and cultural activities such as ritual and music because affective states, through careful adjustment and modification, can be enriched and refined to become sincere states of the mind. For example, people find joy in music with their deep and affective resonance with musical performance. Xunzi states that “Sounds and music enter into people deeply and transform people quickly” (Xunzi, 20.5; Hutton 2014: 219). Even though emotions are influenced by the natural disposition of yu, they can transform the heart-mind to follow the way of the sages through the process of responsive refinement in music and ritual. Xunzi’s philosophy shows this developmental and transformative nature of emotions.

5.5 The Laozi (Dao De Jing)

The Laozi (老子), also known as Dao De Jing (道德經, The Book of Dao and De), is a Daoist text in the Warring States period. Laozi (Lao-tzu or Lao Dan) is believed to be its single author although many scholars today believe that it is a composite work by several authors and/or editors. In the Laozi, the term qing is not found. There is no discussion of particular natures and dispositions of human beings under a single term such as qing (情) or xing (性). However, individual emotions or affective states such as anger (nu 怒), resentment (yuan 怨) courage (yong 勇), loving kindness (ci 慈) and desire (yu 欲) are discussed in the Laozi. Laozi believes that emotions have lasting influence on human behavior and destructive emotions can threaten the wellbeing of people and damage their harmonious social interactions. Although he does not discuss seriously whether emotions are genuine or superficial or whether they change or transform the inner states of the mind as Mencius or Xunzi does, he discusses how emotions affect behaviors of people and motivate them to help or harm themselves and others.

He states that

I have three treasures that I hold on to and preserve:
The first I call loving kindness [ci 慈];
The second I call frugality [jian 儉];
The third I call never daring to put oneself first in the world.
The kind can be courageous [yong 勇];
The frugal can be generous;
Those who never dare to put themselves first in the world can become leaders of the various officials.
Now to be courageous without frugality,
To put oneself first without putting oneself behind others,
These will lead to death. (Laozi, 67; Ivanhoe 2002: 70)

In this passage, Laozi mentions loving kindness, frugality and not being self-interested or self-centered as the three treasures and explains how they influence the success and failure of people. Among them, loving kindness and courage are affective dispositions that help individuals to be successful leaders but lacking them would lead to failure and death.

Following the same line of thinking, he explains that emotions can help or harm people depending on their circumstances. Like rain helps people when the land is dry but harms people when the river is flooding, emotions should be carefully aroused and expressed. He states that

To be courageous in daring leads to death, To be courageous in not daring leads to life. These two bring benefit to some and loss to others. (Laozi, 73, Ivanhoe 2002: 76)

Laozi also warns us about harmful or destructive emotions. Some of these are negative emotions, emotions that have negative valence such as anger and resentment. Laozi suggests that one should carefully deal with anger and resentment. He states that one should “repay resentment with Virtue [de 德]” (Laozi, 63; Ivanhoe 2002: 66) and “Those good at attack are never enraged [nu 怒]” (Laozi, 68; Ivanhoe 2002: 71). Specifically, he talks about confrontational or contentious attitudes and dispositions: they are antagonistic or hostile toward others and their interest by focusing exclusively on one’s own interest. He states that

Those good at conquering their enemies never confront them. Those good at using others put themselves in a lower position. This is called the Virtue of noncontention. (Laozi, 68; Ivanhoe 2002: 71)

One of the frequently discussed emotions in the Laozi is desire (yu 欲). Desire, specifically a natural tendency to satisfy one’s basic needs, is not necessarily negative or evil but Laozi mentions it 26 times in this relatively short text and carefully explain its potentially harmful effects because of its exclusive nature (its selfish or self-centered orientation that excludes or disregards others’ interests or viewpoints). Laozi states that “the great Way [大道] is always without desires [欲]” (Laozi, 34) and “those who preserve the Way [道], do not desire [欲] fullness”. (Laozi, 16). He emphasizes that one should minimize one’s desire (Laozi, 1, 19) to understand and follow the Way (dao). Virág characterizes Laozi’s rather cautionary and reproving approach to emotions, specifically desire, as one of the salient features of the Laozi. She (Virág 2017: 76) states that

One of the salient features of this text [the Laozi] is its negative account of emotions and desires as fundamentally contrary to the realization of the perfected life—a life in accordance with the natural process of the cosmos.

Laozi’s reproving approach to desire, however, should be carefully understood since he does not say that one should simply reject or suppress one’s desire. In the first chapter of the Laozi, he makes a paradoxical statement about desire and desirelessness in their relations to the ultimate Way:

A Way that can be followed is not a constant Way.
A name that can be named is not a constant Way.
Nameless, it is the beginning of Heaven and earth.
Named, it is the mother of the myriad creatures.
And so,
Always eliminate desires in order to observe its [Way’s] mysteries;
Always have desires in order to observe its [Way’s] manifestations.
(Laozi, 1; Ivanhoe 2002: 1).

Laozi, as he does in many chapters of the Laozi, presents an intriguing paradox of desire and desirelessness in this passage. The passage can be interpreted in many different ways. From a contextual viewpoint, desire (yu) can be beneficial or harmful, or cultivated or eliminated as courage (yong) can be beneficial or deadly in certain situations to certain people (Laozi, 73). From a psychological viewpoint, certain aspects of desire (such as exclusive promotion of self-interest, sensual indulgence, or self-centered viewpoint) is harmful but others (such as a natural inclination to satisfy one’s basic needs) are acceptable. However, considering the significance of this chapter, i.e., the beginning chapter of the Laozi where the ultimate Way and the linguistic or conceptual limitation of properly identifying and describing it are discussed, the paradox of desire and desirelessness can be understood from the viewpoint of the intriguing relation between desire and the Way. The relation between the two can be explained in two opposite ways: desire may distort the Way (in this case, desirelessness is needed) but it helps us to initiate our journey toward the Way (in this case, desire is needed). These conflicting approaches to desire show both the limitation and the openness of desire in our journey to understand the Way. Perhaps the relation between the Way and desire can be characterized as a form of affective intentionality where emotions open up, guide, and change our emotional projection to the world and the Way. Regardless of these interpretations of desire, it is clear that Laozi’s view is not simply ascetic and eliminative toward desire, even though he cautions against its potentially harmful and destructive nature, specifically the exclusive pursuit of self-interest and self-centered viewpoint that can generate the confrontational, narrow-minded and myopic understanding of the self and others.

Overall, the Laozi develops a stimulating view on the nature of emotions and affective dispositions. It provides a seemingly negative but cautiously practical and ingenuously encouraging discussion of how emotions affect people. Some emotions, specifically anger and desire, can be harmful and destructive in certain contexts, not just because of their negative valance but because of the exclusive and self-oriented viewpoints. In addition, the Laozi focuses on how emotions interact with other emotions, how they affect behaviors, and how they contribute to the wellbeing of people and the stability of their communities.

5.6 The Zhuangzi

The Zhuangzi is a Daoist text in the late Warring States period. It is believed to be written by a Daoist philosopher Zhuangzi (369–286 BCE) but his authorship is debated especially in the outer chapters (wai pian 外篇, chapters 8 through 22) and the miscellaneous chapters (za pian 雜篇, chapters 23 through 33) of the text. It consists of stories and anecdotes that deliver the insightful and intriguing messages of Daoism and the Daoist way of life. It also develops an inspiring approach to emotions and their foundations in the natural inclinations of the human mind. Although qing refers to the essential nature of things in some passages of the Zhuangzi, in other passages it refers to the psychological foundation of affective dispositions. Therefore, it is important to see how he understands qing and how qing and emotions are related in the Zhuangzi.

Zhuangzi believes that emotions are natural phenomena like wind, rain, and thunder. As we cannot change wind, rain, and thunder, we cannot avoid naturally arising feelings. He states that

Joy, anger, grief, delight, worry, regret, fickleness, inflexibility, modesty, willfulness, candor, insolence— music from empty holes, mushrooms springing up in dampness, day and night replacing each other before us, and no one knows where they sprout from. Let it be! Let it be! (Zhuangzi, 2.2; Watson 2013: 8)

In this passage, Zhuangzi lists emotions along with natural events such as growing mushrooms and alternating day and night. Zhuangzi’s point in this passage is that, like natural phenomena, emotions are aroused spontaneously without any plans or forethoughts. This naturalistic approach, however, does not imply that emotions are unpredictable and unregulated chaos and one should not feel or react to any emotions. Rather, it suggests that one should feel emotions without any expectations or suppositions. Unlike early Confucian philosophers such as Mencius or Xunzi who searches for the ontological or moral foundation of emotions in qing (情) or xin (心 the heart-mind), Zhuangzi, in this passage, takes emotions as they are without relating them to their foundations or analyzing them with their originations. He suggests that one should not judge or inculcate them with social conventions or moral norms.

It is, therefore, meaningless to feel emotions as positive, negative, attractive or repulsive as it is equally meaningless to describe day and night as positive or negative. Zhuangzi believes that developing likes or dislikes (affective interpretations or evaluations of our sensory and perceptual interaction with the world) is an inappropriate way to feel or understand naturally arising emotions and can hurt individuals who are caught by their likes and dislikes. Thus, he says that one should not “by his likes and dislikes do any inward harm to himself” (Zhuangzi, 5.6). In the following conversation, he explains his thoughts on how one should approach feelings and emotions.

Huizi said to Zhuangzi, “Can a man really be without feelings [qing]?”

Zhuangzi: “Yes”.

Huizi: “But a man who has no feelings [qing] —how can you call him a man?”

Zhuangzi: “The Way gave him a face; Heaven gave him a form—why can’t you call him a man?”

Huizi: “But if you’ve already called him a man, how can he be without feelings [qing]?”

Zhuangzi: “That’s not what I mean by feelings [qing ]. When I talk about having no [qing] feelings, I mean that a man doesn’t allow likes or dislikes to get in and do him harm. He just lets things be the way they are and doesn’t try to help life along”. (Zhuangzi, 5.6; Watson 2013: 40–41)

In this passage, Zhuangzi distinguishes two different forms of qing. When he says “a man has no feelings”, he is talking about the feelings of likes and dislikes. This type of feelings can affect us and motivate us to accept and follow certain viewpoints, rules, or norms. However, natural feelings come to one’s mind without bringing in any suppositions or judgments of acceptance and rejection. In their analysis of this passage, Ma and van Brakel (2021: 137) state by quoting Graham (1981 [2001: 82]) that

Zhuangzi himself says explicitly that Huizi’s and his understandings of qing are different: “You are misunderstanding what I mean by qing” (Legge 1891: 235); “shifei” [evaluative judgments such as likings and dislikings] is what I mean by “qing”.

Here one can see Zhuangzi’s naturalistic or phenomenological approach to emotions. According to him, having no feelings does not mean that one should feel no emotions. Instead, he suggests that one should take emotions simply as spontaneously and naturally arising feelings so that sadness and pleasure cannot find a way in to disturb and hurt one’s mind. Thus he states that “If you are content with the time and willing to follow along, then grief and joy have no way to enter” (Zhuangzi 3.5; Watson 2013: 21). Zhuangzi, therefore, does not promote asceticism, fatalism, or apathy. Instead, he emphasizes one’s full acceptance of naturally given qing (xing ming zhi qing 性命之情 naturally given affective disposition). Emotions come and go like day and night and we should be happy and sad as they show up and strike us with certain moods and feelings.

For this reason, Zhuangzi warns about one’s desire (yu 欲) to satisfy and extend one’s likes and dislikes and emphasizes the importance of accepting and accommodating the naturally arising feelings of emotion. He states that

If you try to fulfill all your appetites and desires and indulge your likes and dislikes, then you will bring affliction to the true form of your inborn nature and fate [xing ming zhi qing 性命之情, naturally given qing]. (Zhuangzi, 24.1; Watson 2013: 199)

In this passage, he argues that one’s desire is the foundation of one’s likes and dislikes that cause the deviance from or distortion of naturally flowing emotions. Once one’s likes and dislikes distort or mislead one’s natural feelings, one is likely to be caught by mental struggle and psychological illness such as frustration, depression, and stress. Therefore, he suggests one should preserve and follow the spontaneous nature of the mind in one’s feelings and emotions. He states that

People of today, when they come to ordering their bodies and regulating their minds, too often do it in a manner like that which the border guard described. They turn their backs on the Heavenly part, deviate from the inborn nature, destroy the true form [qing], and annihilate the spirit, just to be doing what the crowd is doing. (Zhuangzi, 25.6; Watson 2013: 220)

Perhaps one of the stimulating ways to understand Zhuangzi’s view on emotions and naturally given qing (xing ming zhi qing 性命之情) is to compare his approach to qing with that of Xunzi’s. Xunzi believes that qing can be perfected by ritual, music, or other means of self-cultivation. To Zhuangzi, the whole idea of modifying or transforming qing through Confucian propriety and self-cultivation for the purpose of social order and moral edification misses critically important properties of qing, i.e., its natural spontaneity and unbiased openness. According to him, our feelings and emotions are important to us not because they can be perfected or matured but because they help us to sense and feel things without any premeditated or predetermined viewpoints or biases imposed upon by social conventions and moral norms. He stresses that one should preserve one’s naturally given qing because one’s achievement of the ultimate rightness consists in not losing one’s natural qing. (Zhuangzi, 8.1). Therefore, he criticizes Confucian virtues of benevolence (ren) and righteousness (yi) by stating that

My definition of expertness has nothing to do with benevolence and righteousness; it means following the true form of your inborn nature [xing ming zhi qing 性命之情 naturally given qing]. (Zhuangzi, 8.3; Watson 2013: 63)

Hansen (1995: 21) explains these contrastive approaches to qing by stating that

Zhuangzi…is normally positive about 情 qingreality responses. Xunzi is notoriously negative. Zhuangzi is negative about Confucian traditions and conventions. Xunzi is positive about them.

As Hansen describes in his comparison between Xunzi’s and Zhuangzi’s views, there are at least two contrastive approaches to emotions in early Chinese philosophy. According to Xunzi’s Confucian approach, emotions are understood as the manifestations of human nature and the developmental potential of virtue. According to Zhuangzi’s Daoist approach, however, the ontological foundation and moral cultivation of emotions are neither important nor necessary in understanding and feeling emotions. Emotions are spontaneously and naturally arising feelings that we should not attempt to judge and modify for the sake of human nature, moral norms or social conventions.


A. Translations of Early Chinese Text

  • Chan, Wing-Tsit (ed.), 1963, A Source Book in Chinese Philosophy, Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.
  • Giles, Lionel (trans.), 1910 [2003], The Art of War, New York: Barnes and Noble Classics.
  • Hutton, Eric (trans.), 2014, Xunzi: The Complete Text, Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.
  • Ivanhoe, Philip J. (trans./ed.), 2002, The Daodejing of Laozi, Indianapolis, IN: Hackett Publishing Company.
  • Ivanhoe, Philip J. and Bryan W. Van Norden (trans), 2001, Readings in Classical Chinese Philosophy, Second Edition, Indianapolis, IN: Hackett Publishing Company.
  • Johnston, Ian (trans.), 2010, The Mozi: A Complete Translation, New York: Columbia University Press.
  • Legge, James (trans.), 1885–1891, The Sacred Books of the East, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • 1885a, Volume 27, The Li Ki, I – X.
    • 1885b, Volume 28, The Li Ki, XI – XLVI.
    • 1891, Volume 39, The Writings of Kwang-Tze, Books I – XVII.
  • ––– (trans.), 1960, The Chinese Classics, Hong Kong: Hong Kong University Press.
    • 1960a, Volume 1: Confucian Analects, The Great Learning, and the Doctrine of the Mean.
    • 1960b, Volume 2: The Works of Mencius.
  • Mei, Yi-Pao (trans.), 1929, The Ethical and Political Works of Motse, Westport, CT: Hyperion Press.
  • Middendorf, Ulrike, 2008, “Again on ‘Qing’. With a Translation of the Guodian ‘Xing zi ming chu’”, Oriens Extremus, 47: 97–159.
  • Roth, Harold (trans.), 1999, Original Tao: Inward Training (Nei-yeh) and the Foundations of Taoist Mysticism, New York: Columbia University Press.
  • Watson, Burton (trans.), 2013, The Complete Works of Zhuangzi, New York: Columbia University Press.

B. Chinese Text Project

The chapter and section numbers of the primary sources of early Chinese texts used in this essay follow the chapter and section numbers posted in the Chinese Text Project site ( For example, the first section of the first chapter of the Xunzi, as designated in the Chinese Text Project, is notated as “Xunzi, 1.1” in this essay.

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