Feminist Perspectives on Rape
Although the proper definition of ‘rape’ is itself a matter of some dispute, rape is generally understood to involve sexual penetration of a person by force and/or without that person’s consent. Rape is committed overwhelmingly by men and boys, usually against women and girls, and sometimes against other men and boys. (For the most part, this entry will assume male perpetrators and female victims.)
Virtually all feminists agree that rape is a grave wrong, one too often ignored, mischaracterized, and legitimized. Feminists differ, however, about how the crime of rape is best understood, and about how rape should be combated both legally and socially.
- 1. Common Themes and the Liberal-to-Radical Continuum
- 2. Criteria: What Counts?
- 3. The Wrongs and Harms of Rape
- 4. Conclusion
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
Virtually all feminist thinking about rape shares several underlying themes. First among these is feminists’ emphasis on “breaking the silence” around rape. Feminist thought and activism have challenged the myth that rape is rare and exceptional, showing that it is in fact a common experience in the lives of girls and women. In recent decades, this awareness emerged in feminist “speakouts” and consciousness-raising groups, where women shared their experiences of rape and other forms of abuse. It has now been amply confirmed by research: according to one study of over 16,000 Americans, 18.3% of women report having been victims of rape or attempted rape at some time in their lives (Black et al., 2011). Of these women, 42.2% were under age eighteen when they were first raped; an earlier study showed that these women were twice as likely to report having been raped as adults (Tjaden and Thoennes, 2000). Indeed, many women suffer multiple rapes in their lives: in the same earlier study, among those who reported having been raped in the past year, the average number of rapes per woman during that time period was 2.9.
An accurate estimate of rape’s frequency requires a clear understanding of rape itself and of the varied circumstances in which it occurs. Often contributing to the underestimation of rape’s frequency is a narrow and stereotypical conception of what rape is: for instance, the image of a stranger jumping out from behind the bushes, brandishing a weapon at a woman he has never seen before. While such rapes do occur, the great majority of rapes are committed by a man or men known to the victim: dates, relatives, friends, bosses, husbands, neighbors, co-workers, and more. (For this reason, again contrary to stereotype, most rapes are intraracial.) In the study of over 16,000 Americans mentioned above, 51.1% of female victims were raped by an intimate partner, and 40.8% by an acquaintance (Black et al., 2011). Remarkably few assailants are punished: with estimated U.S. state conviction rates of two to nine percent of total rapes (Kim 2012, 264), “ninety-four to ninety-eight percent of total rapists and approximately eighty-four percent of reported rapists go free” (Kim 2012, 272).
Perhaps the most basic challenge that feminists have posed to traditional views of rape lies in the recognition of rape as a crime against the victim herself. For much of recorded history women were the property of men, with their value as property measured largely by their sexual “purity.” In this context, rape was regarded as a property crime against a woman’s husband or father (Burgess-Jackson 1996, 44-49). A raped woman or girl was less valuable as property, and penalties for rape often involved fines or other compensation paid to her husband or father (Burgess-Jackson 1996, 68). The marital rape exemption in law, which survived in the U.S. into the 1990’s, is clearly a remnant of this approach, assuming as it does that no crime is committed when a man forces intercourse upon his wife, since she is his own property; the property status of enslaved African-American women was also thought to entitle their owners to the women’s unrestricted sexual use. A further corollary of this view was that women who were not the private property of any individual man—for instance, prostitutes—were unrapeable, or at least that no one important was harmed by their rape (Dworkin 1997, 196–202, Burgess-Jackson 1996, 46-47, 69). Given this entrenched historical and cultural legacy, feminists’ redefinition of ‘rape’ as a crime against the woman herself is nothing short of revolutionary.
Sadly, the rate of rape reporting remains low; studies using random sample surveys of large numbers of women find reporting rates ranging from 16% to 36% (Anderson 2003, 78). Rates of conviction, too, remain substantially lower than for other violent crimes; some studies estimate a conviction rate of 5% (Caringella 2008) in the U.S. Feminists’ recognition of the severity and pervasiveness of rape’s harms, and of how infrequently victims receive justice, has inspired decades of activism for social and legal change. Feminists in many U.S. states have succeeded not only in changing legal definitions of rape (see below), but also in ending many damaging and sexist practices in rape trials. For instance, “rape shield” laws now restrict the admissibility of evidence about a victim’s sexual history, and most jurisdictions have eliminated the “prompt reporting” requirement, the corroboration requirement, and the reciting of the traditional “cautionary rule” (that rape is a charge easy to make and hard to disprove). All of these practices reflect sexist and false assumptions—for instance, that rape only happens (or only matters when it happens) to sexually “pure” or “virtuous” women, and that women are likely to lie about having been raped—while increasing the trauma of rape trials for victims and decreasing the likelihood of convictions. In addition to pressing for changes in law and in police and prosecutorial practices, feminists have founded and staffed rape crisis centers and hotlines to support victims, whether or not they choose to pursue charges against their attackers.
Feminist views of rape can be understood as arrayed on a continuum from liberal to radical. Liberal views tend to regard rape as a gender-neutral assault on individual autonomy, likening it to other forms of assault and/or illegitimate appropriation, and focusing primarily on the harm that rape does to individual victims. More radical views, in contrast, contend that rape must be recognized and understood as an important pillar of patriarchy. Johnson defines patriarchy as a social system in which men disproportionately occupy positions of power and authority, central norms and values are associated with manhood and masculinity (which in turn are defined in terms of dominance and control), and men are the primary focus of attention in most cultural spaces (2005, 4-15). Radical feminists see rape as arising from patriarchal constructions of gender and sexuality within the context of broader systems of male power, and emphasize the harm that rape does to women as a group.
In addition, radical feminist approaches to rape often share one or more of the following three features. First, they regard the deprivation of women’s bodily sovereignty—in particular, male control over the sexual and reproductive uses of women’s bodies—as a central defining element of patriarchy (Whisnant 2007). As a result, they analyze rape as one of multiple forms of men’s sexual violence and exploitation, looking at their interconnections and how they work in concert to maintain and reinforce women’s oppression. Second, they expand the definition of ‘rape’ to encompass more than just overt physical force and violence (or the explicit threat thereof). Recognizing the ways in which broad patterns of male power systematically compromise women’s bodily and sexual freedom, and challenging the equation of female submission with meaningful consent, they tend to see a kind of continuum (rather than a bright dividing line) between rape and much “normal” heterosexual activity. Third, the focus on group-based oppression has also led many radical feminist thinkers to examine the role of rape itself, and of ideologies about rape, in creating and reproducing not only patriarchy but multiple systems of domination, including racism and colonialism.
Feminists are committed to ensuring that women’s and girls’ experiences of sexual violation are taken seriously as such, that the harm they suffer therein is recognized, and that those who inflict that harm are held accountable. Achieving these goals has often involved arguing that certain kinds of encounters that have previously not been socially or legally recognized as rape should be so recognized—thus, challenging overly restrictive ideas (often encoded in law) about what counts as rape (Burgess-Jackson 1996, 77-86; Sanday 1996, 161-183; Bevacqua 2000). Obvious examples include the abolition of marital-rape exemptions and the recognition of date and acquaintance rape. Feminists have also challenged the idea (derived from English common law) that, in order for an encounter to count as rape, the victim must have displayed “utmost” (or even any) physical resistance, as well as the assumption that rape must involve vaginal penetration by a penis (victims are raped orally, anally, and/or with fingers or objects).
There are varying feminist views about whether and how the concept of rape, and hence its framing in the law, requires further renegotiation or expansion.
Both social and legal understandings of rape are typically based at least partly on the notion of consent. (Many laws also include a force requirement, about which more below.) To consent to something is to reverse a prima facie supposition about what may and may not be done. In most contexts, there is a standing presumption that one does not have access to and may not make use of another’s body, property, personal information, or other elements of his or her personal domain. This presumption is reversed, however, when (and for as long as) the other consents to such access. Consent thus alters the structure of rights and obligations between two or more parties.
Assuming for the moment that, in sexual encounters, rape exists where consent is lacking, the question then becomes what counts as consent. Women’s sexual consent has in many instances been understood quite expansively, as simply the absence of refusal or resistance; feminists have criticized this approach on the grounds that, among its other untoward implications, it regards even unconscious women as consenting (MacKinnon 1989b, 340; Archard 1998, 85). Furthermore, it has too often been assumed that a woman’s appearance, attire, status, location, prior sexual history, or relationship to the man in question either function as stand-ins for consent (that is, as “asking for it”) or render her consent irrelevant or unnecessary. A vital task on the feminist agenda has been to challenge and discredit such ideas—to deny that what a woman wears, where she goes and with whom, or what sexual choices she has made in the past have any relevance to whether she should be seen as having consented to sex on a particular occasion.
Consent in general may be understood as either attitudinal or performative (Kazan 1998). Attitudinal accounts see consent as a mental state of affirmation or willingness, while performative accounts see it as a certain kind of action or utterance (for instance, saying “yes” or nodding). Because the kinds of behaviors mentioned above (such as wearing revealing clothes, going somewhere alone with a man, or engaging in heavy petting) have often been claimed by perpetrators to constitute evidence that a woman was in a mental state of willingness to have intercourse, feminists have often rejected attitudinal accounts in favor of performative ones; with a performative account, in contrast, a defendant can be challenged to articulate exactly what the woman said or did that constituted her consent to intercourse. An added advantage of a performative account is that it suggests that sexual consent is not a woman’s implied default state, but rather must be actively and affirmatively granted. Again, this is in contrast to traditional patriarchal views, which often assumed that unless a woman physically resisted—again, even “to the utmost”—a man’s attempt to have intercourse, she was consenting (or at least he was justified in proceeding on that assumption).
One limitation of a purely performative account of consent is that it does not take into account the context in which the relevant behavior or utterance occurs. For instance, if a woman says “yes” or even feigns sexual enthusiasm in order to keep a knife-wielding attacker from becoming angry and hurting or killing her, it would be absurd to regard her behavior or utterance as consent (or at least as meaningful consent). The question is what other contextual constraints and pressures may also undermine the validity of a woman’s (apparent) consent. To put the point another way, having granted that “no” always means no, we must recognize that, in some cases, “yes” also means no. There are many kinds of explicit and implicit threats that render a woman’s consent to sex less than meaningful: the man may threaten to sue for custody of their children, to derail her green card application, to evict her, or simply to sulk and make her life miserable for days should she refuse to have sex. Which (if any) such nonviolent coercive pressures should be regarded as rape, either morally or legally, is a matter of some controversy (Schulhofer 1998; Burgess-Jackson 1996, 91-106).
The question is especially important from a feminist point of view, since it is to be expected that in a patriarchal society men frequently hold positions of social, legal, and/or institutional power over women and are thus positioned to withhold important benefits from women who refuse them sexual access, in addition to threatening harms and penalties. Viewing at least certain kinds of nonviolent coercive pressures as incompatible with meaningful consent may yield the conclusion that some quid pro quo sexual harassment is also rape (Falk 1998). Furthermore, some radical feminists’ description of prostitution as “commercial sexual violence” (Jeffreys 1997) reflects an expansive understanding of the economic and other coercive pressures that often compel women’s consent to sexual acts in prostitution (even where physical violence does not play a role).
A further complicating question is whether the criminal law’s usual requirement of mens rea (or “guilty mind”) should apply to rape and, if so, how that requirement should be interpreted. In the most general terms, a mens rea requirement means that the prosecution must show not only that nonconsensual sex occurred, but also that the man was in a certain state of mind with regard to the woman’s lack of consent. Just what that state of mind is—what counts as mens rea in cases of rape—is a matter of some dispute (Burgess-Jackson 1996, 137–161).
The most conservative position—defended most famously in the 1976 DPP v Morgan decision (Baron 2001, 9–14)—holds that a man has mens rea only if he believes the woman is not consenting (or that she is at least probably not consenting). On this view, a man who sincerely believes that the woman is consenting is not guilty of rape, no matter how unreasonable his belief may be under the circumstances. A more moderate view is that a man has mens rea if he either believes the woman is not consenting or believes unreasonably that she is consenting. Thus, in jurisdictions where this understanding of mens rea is in force, the question of whether the woman actually consented often gives way—particularly in cases of date and acquaintance rape—to the question of whether the man reasonably believed she consented.
Theorists have different views about the conditions under which it is reasonable for a man to believe that a woman is consenting to sexual intercourse. Husak and Thomas (1992) argue that there are social and behavioral conventions (or “courtship rituals”) by which women manifest their willingness to have sex, and that where a woman has engaged in such conventions, it is reasonable for a man to believe she is consenting to sexual intercourse. Archard (1997) argues forcefully against this view, however, pointing out that any such conventions are likely to be ambiguous and not universally understood (particularly since research shows that men routinely interpret women’s behavior in more sexual terms than women mean or intend), that a man risks doing serious harm by relying on his beliefs about such conventions, and that there is a ready alternative to risking such harm, namely, inquiring explicitly as to his partner’s consent or lack thereof.
One influential interpretation of “reasonable belief” in sexual consent is that of Lois Pineau (1989), who points out that judgments of reasonableness in this area must be based on some normative conception of healthy, normal sexual interaction. The prevailing conception, which she calls the “aggressive-contractual model,” holds that women’s sexually provocative behavior generates enforceable agreements to have sex, that male sexuality is uncontrollable past a certain point, and that women are not to be trusted in matters of sexuality. Pineau believes that this model is the backdrop against which many people base their judgments about reasonable belief in rape cases. The aggressive-contractual model should be replaced, she argues, with a model of “communicative sexuality,” one that emphasizes “an atmosphere of comfort and communication, a minimum of pressure, and an on-going checkup on one’s partner’s state” (1989, 231). Communicative sexuality is most likely to be rewarding for both parties, allows them to promote each other’s sensual ends non-manipulatively and non-paternalistically, and observes norms appropriate to friendship and trust. Because it is through communication that one gains knowledge of one’s partner’s desires or lack thereof, Pineau contends that “where communicative sexuality does not occur, we lack the main ground for believing that the sex involved was consensual.” She continues:
where a man does not engage in communicative sexuality, he acts either out of reckless disregard, or out of willful ignorance. For he cannot know, except through the practice of communicative sexuality, whether his partner has any sexual reason for continuing the encounter. And where she does not, he runs the risk of imposing on her what she is not willing to have. All that is needed, then, in order to provide women with legal protection from date rape is to make both reckless indifference and willful ignorance a sufficient condition of mens rea, and to make communicative sexuality the accepted norm of sex to which a reasonable woman would agree. (239–40)
In short, if a man does not engage in communicative sexuality, then he does not really know whether his partner is consenting; thus, if he nonetheless believes that she is consenting, then that belief is unreasonable.
Finally, some feminists have argued that rape should be a strict liability offense, that is, one with no mens rea requirement at all. According to MacKinnon, a mens rea requirement means that “the man’s perceptions of the woman’s desires determine whether she is deemed violated,” and this approach is problematic because “men are systematically conditioned not even to notice what women want” (1989, 180–81). Adopting a “reasonable belief” standard does not help, in her view, because the standard for “reasonableness” masquerades as objectivity while almost inevitably relying on patriarchal and pornographic assumptions; thus “measuring consent from the socially reasonable, meaning objective man’s, point of view reproduces the same problem under a more elevated label” (181).
Here MacKinnon speaks to a broader debate in feminist legal theory, in which some feminists have argued for the adoption of a “reasonable woman standard” in matters ranging from sexual harassment to stalking, battering, and rape. Proponents of this approach believe that a gender-neutral standard of reasonableness is impossible given the differences between men’s and women’s social positioning. They point out, for instance, that men have greater social and (in most cases) physical power than women and, relatedly, that women’s beliefs and reactions are shaped by the constant threat of male violence with which women live (Kerns 2001). Because of these differences, women and men often have divergent perceptions of interpersonal behavior (Scheppele 1991, 45): for instance, behavior that men see as merely flirtatious may be experienced by women as offensive or even threatening, and women may see advances as physically intimidating that men see as aggressively amorous. Proponents thus contend, in the words of Hubin and Haely (who reject this approach), that “when we seek to determine whether the actions and words of the victim constitute or indicate consent to sexual intercourse – it is the standard of the reasonable woman we must employ” (1999, 119). Thus, for example, in assessing the reasonableness of an alleged victim‘s judgment that it would be dangerous to resist a particular sexual advance, a jury would ask whether a reasonable woman in that situation would so judge. Opponents of the reasonable woman standard contend that it is both possible and desirable to account for common differences between men’s and women’s physiologies, social experiences, and perceptions without importing gender into the definition of reasonableness itself. For instance, while granting that a reasonable person standard should often yield different conclusions for men than for women, Hubin and Haely contend that “this is not because the reasonable person standard fails to present a single (gender neutral) standard, but because the standard we are employing is sensitive to features of the agent and the situation that are correlated with gender” (1999, 133).
In many jurisdictions, the law defines the crime of rape as comprising two separate elements: force and lack of consent. As West observes, in such jurisdictions
sex that is undeniably forced is, nevertheless, not rape if the victim “consented” to it; and … sex that is undeniably nonconsensual is, nevertheless, not rape if there was no force used to obtain it. (1996, 233)
West explains that, historically, rape law has seen two kinds of forced sex as consensual: first, the sex that a man forces on his wife (since she was thought to have “consented” permanently and irrevocably to sex by getting married); and second, submission or acquiescence in the face of a show of force and/or a threat of more violence to come. Furthermore, she points out, women are often portrayed in both pornographic and mainstream media as enjoying, and (the assumption is) therefore consenting to, forceful and even violent sex; such assumptions often derail rape cases, as when a defendant claims that the encounter was simply “rough sex” that was enjoyed by the victim. Underlying the inclusion of a nonconsent requirement over and above the force requirement, according to West, is the view that “women consent to forced sex all the time—so forced sex alone can’t be rape” (239). Cases of nonconsensual but unforced sex, on the other hand, include those in which the victim is induced to have sex through fraudulent misrepresentation (for instance, a doctor telling her that sex with him is necessary for her cure), and those in which she is coerced through nonviolent means (for instance, a professor telling her that she must have sex with him to pass the course). The tendency of the law to see such encounters as meaningfully consensual departs strikingly from how consent is understood in other areas; as West observes, “fraud or coercion that vitiates consent in nonsexual contexts constitutes either criminal or tortious activity” (240).
Most feminists see the dual requirement of force and nonconsent as redundant at best and, at worst, as defining many rapes out of existence. Feminists differ, however, as to how rape laws should ideally be structured. Perhaps the most common view is that the force requirement should be eliminated, and rape defined simply as nonconsensual sex, with differing degrees of severity depending on whether and how much force and violence are employed (Estrich 1987). While some state statutes are now written this way, they often build physical force into the definition of non-consent; thus in practice they function very much like the dual requirement of force and non-consent (Anderson 2005a, 630).
Another alternative is to eliminate the nonconsent requirement, defining rape simply as forced sex. MacKinnon defends a variant of this strategy, contending that “Rape should be defined as sex by compulsion, of which physical force is one form. Lack of consent is redundant and should not be a separate element of the crime” (1989, 245). This approach has the advantage of focusing on what the perpetrator did, rather than on how the victim responded (that is, on whether her behavior constituted, or could reasonably have been seen by the perpetrator as constituting, consent).
A third approach is to separate the two elements into two separate crimes, one based on the use of force and the other on the lack of consent. McGregor defends this idea, proposing that:
If either the offender engaged in sexual activity through the use of force or he failed to secure meaningful consent, then [he] has committed an offense …. Rather than requiring both conditions, as the current statutes do, or attempting to pack all cases into one or the other of the conjuncts … this approach recognizes that there are at least two different offenses … for which there are different conditions and different levels of seriousness. (1996, 190)
Schulhofer (1998) argues, in a similar vein, that the law should recognize two different offenses: sexual assault, which involves the use of “physical force to compel another person to submit to an act of sexual penetration” (283); and sexual abuse, a lesser (though still felonious) crime, which involves sexual penetration without the other person’s affirmative and freely given consent. Some commentators have observed that developing such a lesser offense may aid in winning convictions, as juries are reluctant to convict nonviolent offenders of rape. Anderson (2005a) criticizes this approach, however, pointing out that survivors of what she calls “all-American rape” (nonconsensual sex without extrinsic force or violence, usually committed by an acquaintance) suffer trauma at least as severe as do survivors of forceful rape. She contends that “all-American rape” should retain the powerful label (and potentially severe penalty) of rape, while rapists who employ violence extrinsic to the rape itself should be charged with rape and other offenses (such as kidnapping or aggravated assault) as appropriate.
Recent scholarship includes some novel approaches to the legal definition of rape. MacKinnon, for instance, has recommended that a broadened understanding of force (as including hierarchies of power) should be supplemented not by a nonconsent requirement, but by a standard of “welcomeness.” A consent standard, she observes, incorporates gender hierarchy by assuming that men initiate sexual contact which women then either accept or refuse, whereas a welcomeness standard suggests the centrality of “choice, mutuality, and desire” (2005, 243). She explains her approach as follows:
The idea here is not to prohibit sexual contact between hierarchical unequals per se but to legally interpret sex that a hierarchical subordinate says was unwanted in the context of the forms of force that animate the hierarchy between the parties. To counter a claim that sex was forced by inequality, a defendant could (among other defenses) prove the sex was wanted—affirmatively and freely wanted—despite the inequality, and was not forced by the socially entrenched forms of power that distinguish the parties. (247–48)
MacKinnon also recommends the passage of new, sex-equality-based civil rights laws that sexual assault victims can use against their attackers. Such laws, in her view, would offer survivors a kind of dignity and control that criminal prosecutions often do not, while attaching the “stigma of bigotry” to perpetrators (248).
Anderson (2005b) urges the elimination of both the force requirement and the nonconsent requirement, and the adoption in their place of what she calls the “negotiation model.” She contrasts her approach with the two most common “reform” positions, which she calls the No Model and the Yes Model. According to the No Model, a sexual act is consensual unless the victim says no or resists physically. According to the Yes Model, a sexual act is rape unless consent is affirmatively granted (by verbal or physical behavior). Against the No Model, Anderson points out that many victims suffer peritraumatic paralysis and/or dissociation—that is, conditions at the time of trauma that render them unable to protest or resist. Furthermore, both the No and Yes models rely heavily on men’s ability to interpret women’s nonverbal behavior, despite strong evidence showing that men routinely fail in this endeavor: the No Model, for instance, allows a man to infer consent from a woman’s silence and lack of physical resistance. Finally, both models in practice tend to assume that a woman’s willing participation in non-penetrative sexual activity is a reliable indicator of her consent to penetration (for instance, Anderson points out that according to Schulhofer, an advocate of the Yes Model, a woman’s engaging in heavy sexual petting typically indicates her affirmative willingness to have intercourse). This assumption, Anderson emphasizes, is not only often untrue but, in the age of AIDS, especially dangerous.
Like MacKinnon, Anderson sees a fundamental problem in the notion of sexual consent as “a woman’s passive acquiescence to male sexual initiative” (1406). Negotiation, in contrast, “suggests not the granting of permission for the actions of another … but an active consultation with someone else to come to a mutual agreement” (1421). The negotiation model thus requires “consultation, reciprocal communication, and the exchange of views before a person initiates sexual penetration” (1421). (This requirement of consultation before penetration distinguishes Anderson’s approach from Pineau’s, despite their shared emphasis on communication; in addition, Pineau’s model retains an overall consent standard whereas Anderson abandons that standard.) Unless and until a relational context has been established that enables partners to interpret reliably each other’s nonverbal behavior, the negotiation must be verbal. The negotiation model is gender-neutral, requiring that any person who initiates sexual penetration consult verbally with his or her partner (of either gender) to come to a mutual understanding of whether both parties want penetration to occur. Such communication, Anderson observes, “expresses an interest in the other person’s perspective … [and] a willingness to consider the other person’s inclinations and humanity. It expresses that the other person matters” (1423). The negotiation model thus differs at least in spirit from even a version of the Yes Model that requires verbal consent, in that it emphasizes mutuality rather than a one-sided permission-seeking.
Martín Alcoff, having emphasized that the legal system is not always the best, and certainly not the only, arena for reaching truth and understanding regarding rape, also suggests that we “move away from simplistic binary categories” (for instance, rape versus not-rape) and embrace the broader, more flexible and capacious notion of sexual violation. “To violate,” she observes,“ is to infringe on someone, to transgress, and it can also mean to rupture or break. Violations can happen with stealth, with manipulation, with soft words and a gentle touch to a child, to an employee, or anyone who is significantly vulnerable to the offices of others” (2018, 12). Among the benefits of this approach, in Alcoff’s view, is to make room for the complex experiences of survivors, who often struggle and/or evolve over time in developing and articulating their interpretations of what was done to them.
Legal theorist Jane Kim has argued that “rape tolerance” in the United States—evidenced by low rates of arrest, prosecution, and conviction of rapists at the state level—indicates a need for new legal approaches (2012, 273). In her view, “rape should be considered a form of slavery prohibited by the Thirteenth Amendment of the Constitution, allowing for the creation of a federal criminal regime to prosecute and prioritize rape in conjunction with state regimes” (266). She argues that the Thirteenth Amendment was intended to prohibit slavery and involuntary servitude in all of its forms, and that neither the brief duration of many rapes nor concerns about a “slippery slope” warrant excluding rape from its purview. “In order to construct and prosecute rape in a manner consistent with its purported gravity,” Kim contends, “rape must be effectively prosecuted, prohibited, protected against, and abolished under the Thirteenth Amendment” (267).
It bears noting that successful rape prosecutions depend not only on how rape is legally defined but, at least equally importantly, on the general public’s willingness to believe women’s testimony (rather than seeing them as lying or confused) and to recognize particular encounters as instances of the applicable legal definition (that is, to see this behavior as force, or this utterance as expressing nonconsent). Also posing a challenge to successful prosecution is what Estrich calls the “assumption of risk approach to culpability”: the common belief that, as she puts it, “women who put themselves in compromising positions shouldn’t complain when they are compromised” (1992, 10). The continuing prevalence of such rape-supportive beliefs can render even well-intentioned prosecutors unwilling to pursue legitimate cases, given the likelihood that juries will refuse to convict.
Any legal definition of ‘rape’ implies some correlative idea of what is morally wrong with rape: its illegitimate use of force, its disregard of the victim’s nonconsent, and so on. Feminist theorists have often sought to articulate a more richly textured sense of rape’s wrongness, and of its distinctive harms, than the law alone can provide. They have thus developed a number of interpretive frames—ideas about what rape is most closely akin to, and/or a form of—for understanding rape’s wrongs and harms. No doubt both the wrong and the harm of rape are complex and multifarious; these interpretive frames suggest emphases that may be illuminating in different contexts and for different purposes.
The view most commonly identified with feminism in popular discourse is that rape is a crime of “violence, not sex”—that is, a form of assault whose sexual nature is irrelevant, and which is analogous to other violent crimes. While this view has rarely been defended by feminist philosophers, it has been prominent in some feminist anti-rape public education and activism. (One feminist theorist often claimed to have held this view is Susan Brownmiller (1975); see Cahill 2001, 16-28.) Such efforts often seek to challenge views of rape as a “crime of passion,” motivated by the perpetrator’s overwhelming lust (presumably in response to the victim’s sexual attractiveness and/or provocation). Thus, in addition to challenging victim-blaming assumptions, feminists often emphasized rapists’ non-sexual motivations, such as anger and the desire for dominance and control; on this view, the rapist is a violent criminal like other violent criminals, not just a guy seeking sex a bit too vigorously. Similarly, this approach emphasizes that rape victims are real crime victims, not vaguely titillating people who had some overly rough sex and might just have liked it.
The limitations of the “violence, not sex” approach, however, are fairly glaring. Rape’s sexual nature is central to understanding both its perpetrators’ motivations and its effects on victims, not to mention the crime’s broader social and ideological roots and consequences. While perpetrators differ in their strongest occurrent motivations, it is important to ask why so many men who wish to harm or violate women do so in a sexual manner. Furthermore, some rapes do occur because a man wants to have sex, and perhaps would even prefer it if his partner consented, but is prepared to proceed without her consent. Rape’s sexual character is central from the perspective of both actual and potential victims; as Cahill observes, “few women would agree that being raped is essentially equivalent to being hit in the face” (2001, 3). Furthermore, many rape survivors are damaged specifically in their sexuality, facing difficulties in their sexual relationships in the months and years following the rape. Finally, because many rapes do not involve overt extrinsic violence, the “violence, not sex” slogan may make it more difficult for people to recognize less obviously violent experiences of sexual force as rape. In short, rape is forced, abusive, and/or violent sex; recognizing rape’s sexual nature is crucial to understanding not only its wrongs and harms, but also the cultural and political meaning of sex in patriarchal cultures. As MacKinnon observes, “so long as we say that [rape, sexual harassment, and pornography] are abuses of violence, not sex, we fail to criticize what has been made of sex, what has been done to us through sex” (1987, 86–87).
The violation of bodily and sexual autonomy is no doubt among rape’s most central harms. In their classic discussion, Frye and Shafer (1977) employ the concept of “domain” to elaborate on such violation. A person’s domain—“the physical, emotional, psychological, and intellectual space it lives in” (338)—defines the range of matters over which the person has rightful power of consent. Because a person’s body is at the very center of her domain and is the locus of the properties and capacities that make her a person, the intentional invasion of the body is an especially egregious attack: “to presume to wield an effective power of consent over the personal properties and/or the body of [a] creature … is ipso facto to deny that there is a person there at all” (340). Thus, rape treats the victim not as a person but as an object, and one with a purely sexual function. Frye and Shafer emphasize that rape’s communication of this message constitutes one significant element of its harm: “[rape] gives [the victim] a picture of herself as a being within someone’s domain and not as a being which has domain …. Whether it is the rapist’s intention or not, being raped conveys for the woman the message that she is a being without respect, that she is not a person” (341–42). Hampton sounds a similar theme, contending that through its expressive content—“representing the rapist as master and the victim as inferior object”—rape does an objective “moral injury” to its victim’s value (1999, 135). It is not surprising, then, that many rape survivors describe feeling not only worthless, but also numb, absent, or deadened. The reaction is understandable since, as Cahill observes, “Rape, in its total denial of the victim’s agency, will, and personhood, can be understood as a denial of intersubjectivity itself …. The self is at once denied and … stilled, silenced, overcome” (2001, 132).
Some recent discussions emphasize that a full account of rape’s harm must incorporate both its denial of victims’ personhood and its intimate, sexual and bodily nature. According to Cahill, “rape must be understood fundamentally … as an affront to the embodied subject …. a sexually specific act that destroys (if only temporarily) the intersubjective, embodied agency and therefore personhood of a woman” (2001, 13). Anderson, seeking to define rape’s harm based on the “lived experience” of those who go through it, cites “dehumanization, objectification, and domination” as prominent in the accounts of both rapists and rape victims (2005, 641). Rape, she concludes, is best understood not only as the denial of sexual autonomy, but as “sexually invasive dehumanization” (643).
Linda Martín Alcoff, too, emphasizes rape’s specifically sexual harm, arguing in particular that sexual violations can be both identified and criticized on the basis of their damage to victims’ sexual subjectivity. Alcoff contends that “As a concept, sexual subjectivity provides an alternative to the singular focus on the violation of our consent, desire, the capacity for pleasure, or will . . . our central concern with sexual violations should be their inhibiting and transformative effects on sexual subjectivity or our self-making capacities” (2018, 111). Sexual subjectivity, in her view, includes the capacity for sexual agency, but more broadly amounts to “our concernful making relationship to ourselves as sexual subjects” (121). Survivors of sexual violations, Alcoff contends, suffer damage to their ability to develop and live out, in a caring, reflective, and flexible way, their own sexual selfhood. “What is violated,” she writes, “is not a substantive set of normative or normal desires, but the practical activity of caring for the self. Trauma atrophies possibilities” (145).
The humiliation and shame often experienced by rape victims are predictable results of experiencing total subjugation and the intimate loss of control of one’s body. These reactions—not to mention victims’ feelings of contamination, of having been defiled or desecrated—are often exacerbated by cultural judgments of raped women as dirty and impure, or as “damaged goods.” In some cultures, these ideas are so powerful that a woman who is raped (or who has consensual illicit sex) is thought to bring shame on her entire family; such women sometimes become the victims of so-called “honor killings” at the hands of male relatives (Banerjee 2003, Baxi et al. 2006, Ruggi 1998).
A distinctive set of harms enters the picture when, as is increasingly common, women and girls are violated while unconscious, often with pictures or videos taken and circulated. As Kelly Oliver points out, “lack of consent is valorized within popular culture to the point that sexual assault has become a spectator sport and creepshot entertainment on social media … sex with unconscious girls, especially accompanied by photographs as trophies, has become a goal of some boys and men” (2016, 59–60). In such cases, Oliver observes, “The trauma of victimization not only becomes public but also infinitely repeatable. It can go viral. It doesn’t go away” (91). Cressida Heyes (2016) provides a phenomenological account of the devastating harms of raping an unconscious victim. Raping someone who is unconscious, Heyes contends,
exploits and reinforces a victim’s lack of agency and exposes her body in ways that make it especially difficult for her to reconstitute herself as a subject. It damages both her ability to engage with the world in four dimensions (through a temporally persisting body schema) and her ability to retreat from it into anonymity … Sexual assault while unconscious can make the restful anonymity of sleep impossible, leaving only the violent exposure of a two-dimensional life. (2016, 365)
The assumption that such rapes are less harmful than the rapes of conscious victims--since the rape itself is not directly experienced--is therefore badly mistaken, Heyes argues. The victim of unconscious rape, she points out, “struggles to feel safe lapsing into the one form of anonymity that is biologically and existentially necessary for human life, yet ultimately she will have no choice but to revisit this place over and over … no one can avoid going to sleep for very long” (2016, 379).
Many rapes lead to additional harms beyond those intrinsic to the rape itself. Some rapes cause pregnancy or sexually transmitted diseases (including HIV infection), and some rapists physically injure their victims. Victims who do not reveal their rapes to others, whether due to shame or to the expectation that they will not be believed, experience profound isolation and lack of support; and indeed, many who do report their rapes are disbelieved or blamed by friends, family, and/or police. Even those survivors who are believed too often face, as Alcoff points out, a kind of “preemptive disauthorization or assumption that [they] are incapable of measured and thoughtful analysis” (2018, 50). Due to both low reporting levels and low conviction rates, relatively few victims see their rapists punished; many of those raped by relatives, co-workers, friends, or other ongoing acquaintances must then face continuing interaction with the rapist, while those raped by strangers often fear that the rapist will find and re-victimize them.
With or without these additional harms (but especially with them), rape constitutes severe trauma. Undergoing trauma shatters the victim’s most basic assumptions about herself and her safety in the world. According to Brison, who survived a violent rape and attempted murder, trauma
introduces a “surd”—a nonsensical entry—into the series of events in one’s life, making it seem impossible to carry on with the series … . Not only is it now impossible to carry on with the series, but whatever sense had been made of it in the past has been destroyed. The result is an uneasy paralysis. I can’t go, I can’t stay. All that is left is the present, but one that has no meaning, or has, at most, only the shifting sense of a floating indexical, the dot of a “now” that would go for a walk, if only it knew where to go. (2002, 103–104)
With its profound effects on social connection, cognition, memory, and emotion, trauma disrupts the continuity of the self. It is strikingly common for a trauma survivor to feel that she is not the same person she was prior to the trauma, and even that at least a part of her has died; as Brison puts it, “I felt as if I was experiencing things posthumously … as though I’d somehow outlived myself” (8–9). To reconstitute the self in a new form, the survivor must construct a meaningful narrative that incorporates the trauma, but many survivors face obstacles in this endeavor such as disordered cognition, memory gaps, feelings of despair and futility, and the lack of an audience willing to hear, believe, and understand their story. Such isolation is exacerbated when the trauma was humanly inflicted (as with rape), since such assaults, as Brison puts it, “[sever] the sustaining connection between the self and the rest of humanity” (40). Brison’s own account emphasizes the “extent to which the self is created and sustained by others and, thus, is able to be destroyed by them” (62); this relational element is central both to trauma itself and to any possible recovery. Because “violent intrusions by others … severely impair our ability to be connected to humanity in ways we value” (61), recovery requires slowly repairing connections—both to others and to damaged parts of oneself—and rebuilding a sense of trust (again, of both oneself and others).
For many women, rape is not a one-time event; rather sexual violence and exploitation are, for at least some period of time, routine conditions of their lives. Such women experience female sexual slavery, defined by Barry as any situation in which
women or girls cannot change the immediate conditions of their existence; where regardless of how they got into those conditions they cannot get out; and where they are subject to sexual violence and exploitation. (1984, 40)
As Barry observes, such situations include battering relationships, most prostitution, and the sexual abuse of girl children, all of which are common around the world. It is thus important to consider the distinctive effects of such repeated and routine sexual trauma. Herman has recommended the adoption of a new diagnosis, complex post-traumatic stress disorder, to describe accurately the psychological impact of “prolonged, repeated trauma” (1997, 119). (This diagnosis is intended to encompass various forms of humanly inflicted trauma, not only sexual trauma.) The damage of such prolonged trauma to a victim’s personality may be so severe as to constitute what Frye has called mayhem: a psychic “maiming” in which the exploiter instills in his victim such a grossly distorted perspective on herself, her function, and her worth that she becomes (whether temporarily or permanently) unable to identify or pursue her own interests, assert her rights, or defend herself against further aggression (1983, 70).
Rape is unquestionably a gendered crime: 91% of rape victims are female, while almost 99% of perpetrators are male (Greenfield 1997). In light both of these numbers and of rape’s broader ideological dynamics and social consequences, feminists have long contended that rape harms not only its individual victims, but also women as a class. Brison, for instance, calls rape “gender-motivated violence against women, which is perpetrated against women collectively, albeit not all at once and in the same place” (2002, 98). Understanding how rape harms women as a group requires analyzing it not only as an individual act but also as an institution—that is, a structured social practice with distinct positions and roles, and with (explicit or implicit) rules that define who may (or must) do what under what circumstances (Card 1991). Feminists have highlighted the ways in which the institution of rape reinforces the group-based subordination of women to men: for instance, by making women fearful, and by enforcing patriarchal dictates both about proper female behavior and about the conditions of male sexual entitlement to women’s bodies. As Burgess-Jackson puts it, “Rape—the act and the practice—subjugates an entire class of individuals (women) to another (men) …. every woman, qua woman, is wronged by it” (2000, 289).
Feminists have long claimed that, in patriarchal cultures, rape is not anomalous but paradigmatic—that it enacts and reinforces, rather than contradicting, widely shared cultural views about gender and sexuality. As Dworkin puts it, “rape is not committed by psychopaths or deviants from our social norms—rape is committed by exemplars of our social norms …. Rape is no excess, no aberration, no accident, no mistake—it embodies sexuality as the culture defines it” (1976, 45–46). A core dynamic of patriarchal sexuality, on this view, is the normalizing and sexualizing of male (or masculine) control and dominance over females (or the feminine). This dynamic finds expression in a number of beliefs about what is natural, acceptable, and even desirable in male-female sexual interaction: that the male will be persistent and aggressive, the female often reluctant and passive; that the male is invulnerable, powerful, hard, and commanding, and that women desire such behavior from men; that “real men” are able to get sexual access to women when, where, and how they want it; that sexual intercourse is an act of male conquest; that women are men’s sexual objects or possessions; and that men “need” and are entitled to sex.
One study of undetected, self-reported acquaintance rapists found that these individuals’ propensity to rape was significantly related not only to their acceptance of rape myths and of traditional ideas about male and female sexuality, but also to their belief that male sexual aggression is normal (Hinck and Thomas 1999, 816). Such beliefs have repeatedly been shown to play a role not only in men’s self-reported likelihood of committing rape, but also in people’s tendency to define rape more restrictively, and to attribute responsibility and blame to rape victims (1999, 816). (The influence of rape myths on people’s definitions of rape explains why most men who report engaging in “sexually assaultive, abusive, or coercive behavior in order to procure sexual intercourse” (1999, 816) do not define their own behavior as rape.) Feminists have coined the term ‘rape culture’ to describe the pervasiveness and acceptability of rape-supportive messages in media and popular discourse. Some have further contended that many rapes, being at least partially motivated by group-based animus as expressed in rape-supportive beliefs, should be categorized as hate crimes (Wellman 2006).
On this view, rape is a political practice by which spurious beliefs about gender and sexuality are expressed, inscribed, and enforced via the violation and control of women’s bodies. Hampton thus claims that “rape as it occurs in our society … is a moral injury to all women … insofar as it is part of a pattern of response of many men toward many women that aims to establish their mastery qua male over a woman qua female …. Rape confirms that women are ‘for’ men: to be used, dominated, treated as objects” (1999, 135). This underlying gender ideology helps to explain why, when men and boys are raped (almost always by other males), they are often seen as having been feminized, treated like women and thus rendered shamefully woman-like.
Many feminists have emphasized the role of rape in controlling women’s behavior through fear. Dworkin contends that, due to the threat of rape, “all women live in constant jeopardy, in a virtual state of siege” (1976, 37); and several feminists have drawn analogies between rape and lynching as forms of terrorizing, group-based social control (Burgess-Jackson 2000, 286-88). Card argues that rape is a terrorist institution, one which—despite its admitted differences from acts more normally labeled terrorism, such as bombing and hijacking—advances its political purpose, the continued subordination of women, by terrorizing a target population (1991). Like all terrorism, she contends, rape has two targets: the direct victims, who are seen as expendable, and the broader population to whom a message is sent, and who can then be manipulated by fear into complying with demands they would otherwise reject. In response to the threat of rape, women scrutinize and restrict their own choices—what they wear, where they go and with whom, whether they drink, what “messages” they may be inadvertently sending men, and so on—to ensure that they are following the unwritten rules that govern female behavior and that (supposedly) distinguish the bad girls who get raped from the good girls who do not. Even women who, because of their conformity to these rules, do not feel afraid of being raped have nonetheless, Card points out, been terrorized into compliance.
A central element of rape as a terrorist institution, Card claims, is a protection racket in which men, as the group both creating the danger and proposing to deliver women from it, dole out protection—sometimes temporary, sometimes permanent, often illusory—in exchange for women’s service, loyalty, and compliance. In this system, “good” men protect virtuous and deserving women from “bad” men, and part of what defines a woman as deserving protection is her conformity to rules of patriarchal femininity. Women who are not offered protection, or who decline it when offered, are then frequently blamed for being raped. Furthermore, as Card points out, the rules of the institution often grant “protectors”—whether husbands, boyfriends, or pimps—sexual access to the woman or women whom they protect, so that nothing they do to those women is taken to count as rape. The institution thus requires a woman to give up her sexual autonomy in relation to one man, in order to gain his (conditional and unreliable) “protection” from other men.
The threat of rape, with its false promise that by being “good” we can avoid disaster, plays an important role in training women in the requirements of femininity. Describing a “feminine bodily comportment that is marked by fear,” Cahill observes that the female body well-trained in femininity “is that of a pre-victim” (2001, 157). The feminine body is marked by hesitancy, relative weakness, delicacy, and restraint—qualities that in fact render women more vulnerable to violence—and yet the woman or girl is taught to view her sexual body as dangerously provocative because inherently “rapable” (159). Hence her duty to control, conceal, and monitor her body and its movements, so as not to bring disaster upon herself. “The socially produced feminine body,” Cahill claims, “is the body of the guilty pre-victim …. she was somewhere she should not have been, moving her body in ways she should not have, carrying on in a manner so free and easy as to convey an utter abandonment of her responsibilities of self-protection and self-surveillance” (160). By molding women both to femininity and to self-blame, the threat of rape thus systematically undermines women’s capacity to resist not only rape itself, but various other elements of their oppression as well. The threat is so pervasive in the cultural environment that, according to Brison, girls “enter womanhood freighted with postmemories of sexual violence” (2002, 87), and years of peremptory warnings and cautionary tales lead many victims to experience rape as “a threat fulfilled” (Cahill 2001, 164).
Many feminists contend that even as the institution of rape systematically disadvantages women, it benefits men as a class by underwriting beliefs about the naturalness of male dominance, defining women of certain kinds or in certain circumstances as “fair game,” rendering women dependent on and thus beholden to men for protection, and giving men a competitive advantage by restricting women’s freedom of action and movement. May and Strikwerda contend that “just as the benefit to men distributes throughout the male population in a given society, so the responsibility (for rape) should distribute as well” (1994, 148); in their view, men as a group bear collective responsibility for rape. Rape’s role in increasing the burden of fear in women’s and girls’ lives leads Burgess-Jackson to highlight it as an issue of distributive justice (1996, 181-205). He contends that the state’s obligation to advance justice requires that it take steps to redistribute fear so that women no longer bear it as an unfair and disproportionate burden; furthermore, he claims, since men as a class are overwhelmingly the cause of women’s fear, most or all of the costs of such redistribution should be borne by men.
Rape is a tool not only of patriarchy, but also of racism, colonialism, nationalism, and other pernicious hierarchies. These and other power relationships in turn make women and girls even more vulnerable to rape. In virtually any situation where women and girls belonging to especially desperate or powerless populations are at the mercy of men in authority—from female inmates and girls in foster care, to undocumented immigrants, to refugees dependent on U.N. peacekeepers and/or humanitarian aid workers for survival—some of those men use their authority to force or extort sexual access.
In the United States, the racial dynamics of rape are shaped by a long history of white men raping their African-American female slaves. Because the women were chattel property, the owners (and often overseers) could and did use them sexually at will, with complete legal and social impunity. Because children born of slave mothers were slaves, regardless of their paternity, many slave owners benefited from rape by producing more slaves for themselves. Roberts emphasizes, however, that
the rape of slave women by their masters was primarily a weapon of terror that reinforced whites’ domination over their human property. Rape was an act of physical violence designed to stifle Black women’s will to resist and to remind them of their servile status … . Whites’ sexual exploitation of their slaves, therefore, should not be viewed simply as either a method of slave-breeding or the fulfillment of slaveholders’ sexual urges. (1997, 29-30)
Slaves were frequently forced into undesired sexual liaisons with each other as well, based on the whims or the breeding plans of their owners. Ultimately, as Collins observes, “Black women as a class emerged from slavery as collective rape victims” (2005, 223), and the rape of black women, like the lynching of black men, was a centerpiece of Klan activity post-Emancipation. Collins points out, however, that unlike lynching, black women’s sexual abuse by white men during and after slavery did not become a central or universally understood icon of American racism. The legacy of slavery and its attendant ideologies has meant that, both legally and socially, “for most of American history the crime of rape of a Black woman did not exist” (Roberts 1997, 31).
Black women’s unrapeability was not only written into law, but reinforced by a racial ideology that defined them as lascivious and promiscuous by nature. This same racial ideology stereotyped black men as savagely oversexed and thus sexually dangerous, especially to white women. The post-Civil War terror campaign of lynching, which continued through the 1930’s, was frequently claimed to be punishment for black men who had raped white women, although in fact only a minority of lynching victims were even accused of having done any such thing (Hall 1983, 334; Davis 1981, 189), and of those, many had in fact had consensual relationships with white women (Hall 1983, 340). The racist association of rape with black men rendered rape by white men comparatively invisible, thus making white men as a group unaccountable for rape (Davis 1981, 199), a dynamic that continued well into the 20th century (Dorr 2008).
These destructive racial stereotypes remain powerful today, exerting influence on people’s judgments of whether a rape has occurred, how serious an offense it is, and who is to blame (Foley et al. 1995; Donovan and Williams 2002; George and Martinez 2002). Popular culture plays an important role in conveying and legitimizing these stereotypes. For instance, the image of sexually savage and animalistic black masculinity is a central trope of the popular “interracial” genre of pornography, marketed to white men, in which black men are often depicted as damaging white women’s bodies with their unusually large penises (Dines 1998, 2006). As Collins observes, “movies, films, music videos, and other mass media spectacles that depict Black men as violent and that punish them for it have replaced the historical spectacles provided by live, public lynchings” (2005, 242).
The stereotype of black women as sexually deviant and aggressive “Jezebels” finds one contemporary reflection in the “hoochie” image, which is increasingly prominent in black as well as white cultural and media venues (Collins 2000, 81–84). One study, designed in part to measure the influence of the Jezebel stereotype on young black women’s perceptions of their own rapes, found that the “stereotype of Black women as sexually loose appeared to be internalized by Black participants and identified as an important reason why they were raped” (Neville et al. 2004, 91). Another researcher, having found that the African-American women in her study were less likely than white women to have disclosed their rapes (Wyatt 1992, 86), attributes this difference in part to the fact that “African American women …. do not anticipate that they will be protected by traditional authorities and institutions” (88). Meanwhile, both the stereotypes of black women and their structural vulnerabilities contribute to a situation in which, for too many, sexual abuse is a routine condition of life: “being routinely disbelieved by those who control the definitions of violence, encountering mass media representations that depict Black women as ‘bitches,’ ‘hoes,’ and other controlling images, and/or experiencing daily assaults such as having their breasts and buttocks fondled by friends and perfect strangers … may become so routine that African American women cannot perceive their own pain” (Collins 2005, 229).
Black women who have been raped by black men are sometimes silenced, either in order to maintain their own hard-won image as “respectable” or to avoid further tarnishing the public image of black manhood. They may be penalized or shunned by their families and communities for speaking out, and thus cut off from important sources of support (Collins 2005, 226-27).
Racist ideologies about rape are also prominent in the history of colonialism and genocide against Native Americans. Ideas about Native men as savage rapists, Native women as downtrodden and raped squaws, and white men as heroic saviors of both white and Native women were essential to the “colonial imagination” that explained and justified the taking of Native lands (Smith 2005, 7–33). These ideas were conveyed in widely read captivity narratives, stories—usually apocryphal, and often written by white men—of the abduction and brutal treatment of a white woman by the “savages” (Smith 2005, 21–22; Faludi 2007, 200–279). The message was that white women desperately needed white men’s protection, not only in the usual form of restrictions on the women’s behavior and mobility, but also by the men’s efforts to control and kill off dangerous natives. As for supposedly downtrodden Native women, white men proposed to deliver them from their oppression by civilizing them, assimilating them to more enlightened European values and culture. In short, the ideology held that “Native women can only be free while under the dominion of white men, and both Native and white women have to be protected from Indian men, rather than from white men” (Smith, 23). In fact, the reality was quite the contrary. Smith argues that rape was a key method of forcibly instituting patriarchal values in what had been relatively egalitarian Native cultures:
In order to colonize a people whose society was not hierarchical, colonizers must first naturalize hierarchy through instituting patriarchy. Patriarchal gender violence is the process by which colonizers inscribe hierarchy and domination on the bodies of the colonized. (23)
History bears out Smith’s claim, as white men routinely raped and brutalized Native people—first as prisoners and in massacres (Smith 2005, 7–23), and later in epidemic levels of sexual abuse of Native children in white-run boarding schools (Smith 2006).
Rape is a common, indeed arguably universal, form of abuse in war. It takes many forms, including the mass rape of female civilians as recreation and/or as a prize for military victory, the mass rape of female civilians as a strategy or weapon of war, and the enslavement of women and girls to provide sexual service for soldiers and officers. The latter is frequently practiced both by official armies (as in the enslavement of mostly Korean and Chinese women and girls by Japanese forces during World War II) and by rebel militias (as in the abduction of women and girls as “bush wives” for rebels in Sierra Leone). Additionally, as more women enter military forces, the rape of military women by their own male colleagues is an increasingly reported abuse (Jeffreys 2007).
Seifert criticizes the common view of rape as simply a regrettable byproduct of wartime social breakdown and lack of military discipline (as well as of naturally aggressive male sexuality), contending that, in fact, rape is a routine element of military strategy, aimed at undermining the will, morale, cohesion, and self-conception of the enemy population. She observes that, during wartime,
the women are those who hold the families and communities together. Their physical and emotional destruction aims at destroying social and cultural stability …. in many cultures [the female body] embodies the nation as a whole …. The rape of women of a community, culture, or nation can be regarded … as a symbolic rape of the body of that community. (1996, 39)
It is thus not surprising that rape in war often involves heightened sadism, as well as additional abuses such as forcing men to watch the rape of their wives or daughters and forcing women to engage in sex with their own sons, brothers, or other family members. In these and other cases, according to MacKinnon, the rape of female civilians is often “a humiliation rite for the men on the other side who cannot (in masculinity’s terms) ‘protect’ their women. Many of these acts make women’s bodies into a medium of men’s expression, the means through which one group of men says what it wants to say to another” (2006, 223).
Because rape in war frequently seeks to undermine and destroy bonds of family, community, and culture, there are important points of connection between rape in war and genocidal rape (Nenadic 2011). Genocide is the attempt to destroy a racial, ethnic, religious, or national group as such, in whole or in part, by committing any of a number of acts against the group’s members; the acts include not only killing, but also causing serious bodily or mental harm, creating conditions of life intended to destroy the group physically, and imposing restrictions intended to prevent births within the group. When such acts are committed with genocidal intent, the victim is not only the individual targeted, but the group itself. As Sarah Clark Miller observes, rape is an extraordinarily effective genocidal strategy, since it “corrupts women’s roles as caretakers of relationships, conveyors of cultural practices, and sustainers of meaning … . In these ways, genocidal rapists twist the way in which women are pivotal to the life of a community, rendering them pivotal to its destruction” (Miller 2009, 513–514).
Genocidal rape has been recognized and condemned by both the International Criminal Tribunal for Rwanda (ICTR) and the International Criminal Tribunal for the Former Yugoslavia (ICTY) (Askin 2003, Nenadic 2011). In both cases, rape was employed systematically against the women of a certain group, as part of an organized campaign to destroy that group. In Rwanda, the interahamwe raped hundreds of thousands of women and girls belonging to the Tutsi ethnic group, as part of an effort to exterminate the Tutsi people entirely. MacKinnon describes the genocidal rape of Muslim and Croatian women in Bosnia-Herzegovina as
ethnic rape as an official policy of war in a genocidal campaign for political control …. It is specifically rape under orders …. It is also rape unto death, rape as massacre, rape to kill and to make the victims wish they were dead. It is rape as an instrument of forced exile, rape to make you leave your home and never want to go back …. It is rape to drive a wedge through a community, to shatter a society, to destroy a people. (2006, 187)
The Serbian mass rape campaign was distinguished not only by its extraordinary brutality and notorious “rape camps,” but also by the systematic forced impregnation of Muslim and Croatian women and girls. The aim was to claim and colonize the women’s bodies reproductively as well as sexually, while increasing the population of children identified as Serb: “Croatian and Muslim women [were] being raped, and then denied abortions, to help make a Serbian state by making what the perpetrators imagine[d] as Serb babies” (MacKinnon 2006, 188). Goodhart points out that in such forced impregnation, the soldiers’ (and their commanders’) hope is to “create a baby (a son) who will infiltrate, undermine, or destroy the mother’s group” (2007, 309). The resulting children are in fact seen by the maternal community as “children of the enemy … a sort of nascent fifth column within an already victimized community” (310) and are thus often stigmatized, mistreated, or abandoned. Goodhart argues that the rapist-fathers have violated the rights not only of the women they rape, but also of the children thereby produced. The rapists are guilty of wrongful procreation, a “deliberate, malicious, and sadistic” use of procreative power with the intent of creating a child who is unlikely to be able to enjoy his or her human rights (317-18).
Some have puzzled over how war rape aimed at enforced pregnancy and birth can be genocidal, since it aims to produce rather than prevent births within the targeted population. In the case of mass rapes in Bosnia, some Serb perpetrators may have believed they were producing “little Chetniks [Serbs].” But Claudia Card points out that such a belief, even if sincerely held, does not provide good grounds for regarding these rapes as genocidal, since “in terms of biological parentage, the child will be as much non-Serb as Serb, and the child’s culture will almost certainly not be Serbian” (2008, 184). Thus, she seeks to explain the genocidal nature of rape aimed at enforced pregnancy without appealing to perpetrators’ beliefs about the ethnic identity of any resulting children. A better explanation, in her view, emphasizes that the Serbian campaign of forced impregnation “imposed a social death on its victims … it turned them into living (and gestating) corpses. … Whether the perpetrators thought they were producing little Serbs is irrelevant. What counts is the attack on the social meanings of the lives of the women they tortured” (185). Card also develops and expands Beverly Allen’s proposal (1996) that military rape aimed at enforced pregnancy employs sperm as a weapon of biological warfare. Such attacks meet the criteria for biological warfare found in international documents, she points out, since
a product of a living organism (the rapist) is used to attack a biological system (the reproductive system) in members of the enemy population. Although this attack need not produce illness, it is designed to produce social chaos … . Sperm so used becomes a social and psychological toxin, poisoning the futures of victims and their communities by producing children who, if they survive, will remind whoever raised them of their traumatic origins in torture. … Unlike bacteria and viruses, sperm is easily containable, storable, preservable, and deliverable by means of men’s bodies. (187)
Schott takes a different approach to explaining the genocidal nature of military rape aimed at enforced pregnancy, drawing centrally on Hannah Arendt’s concept of natality. War rape aimed at forced impregnation, Schott observes, “[transforms] birth into a weapon of death. This is so for women who are raped, who lose a sense of being at home in their own bodies and of having a future, and it is so for the children born of forced maternity, who may suffer expulsion from the mother’s community” (2011, 14). Thus such rape undermines natality, or the capacity for new beginnings, which Arendt regarded as fundamental to human political life. Thus, Schott contends, “war rape can be understood not only as a tool for the unmaking of the social and cultural world, but also a tool for the unmaking of the political world” (2009, 86).
Rape is used as an instrument of genocide because it is extremely effective in doing what genocides do: destroying not only individual group members, but “that aspect of the group whole that is more than the sum of its individual parts … the substance and glue of community that lives on when individual members die” (MacKinnon 2006, 225). This is especially true when the rapes leave children motherless, the victims with AIDS, other diseases, infertility, fistulas, and/or other internal injuries, and families broken as victims are abandoned and shunned by their husbands or other relatives. Even absent these additional harms, however, sexual assault may be especially well suited to creating a kind of self-annihilating shame in its victims, a shame that can focus on one’s group identity. MacKinnon points out that
sexual atrocities can reasonably produce revulsion to the identity that marked the person for the intimate violation, making the raped want to abandon who they are forever. When the shared identity for which one is raped is ruined, shattered in oneself and relationally between oneself and others, the group quality of the group so defined is destroyed. (229)
Smith underlines this point, and its special applicability to genocidal contexts, observing that “in my experience as a rape crisis counselor, every Native survivor I ever counseled said to me at one point, ‘I wish I was no longer Indian’” (2005, 8).
In February 2001, the ICTY found three Serbian soldiers guilty of rape as a crime against humanity. Crimes against humanity are certain extraordinarily inhumane acts (including murder, torture, enslavement, and deportation) when those acts are systematically committed against civilian populations in the course of armed conflict. The ICTY judgment marked international humanitarian law’s first official recognition of rape as a crime against humanity. According to Campbell,
the axiological foundation of the crime against humanity … lies in a conception of a fundamental trauma to a social body, which consists of the denial of the humanity of others. This model of rape as a crime against humanity therefore involves not only a physical and psychic trauma to the subject but also a symbolic trauma to “humanity.” (2003, 510)
The ICTY verdict thus conveyed a judgment that the Serbian perpetrators of mass rape, in addition to violating their individual victims and damaging the cultural and religious groups to which those victims belonged, also insulted and injured humanity as such. Debra Bergoffen (2012) points out that, in addition, the ICTY verdict created a new human right to sexual self-determination--a right grounded neither in the agency of an autonomous and inviolable subject (implicitly gendered male) nor in an assumed feminine weakness needing male protection, but rather in the dignity of a humanly shared vulnerability.
Feminist theorizing about rape draws on a rich tradition of feminist scholarship in many disciplines, as well as on women’s insights into their own rape experiences and on the knowledge gained through decades of feminist anti-violence activism. As such theorizing continues to develop—growing both more radical in its challenges to patriarchal social and sexual assumptions, and more global and intersectional in its analysis—it constitutes an essential support for feminist movements against sexual violence.
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- Davis, Angela, 2000, ‘The Color of Violence Against Women.’
- End Violence Against Women.
- Incite!: Women of Color Against Violence.
- National Online Resource Center on Violence Against Women.
- National Sexual Violence Resource Center.
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