Feminist Perspectives on Science
There are a variety of ways that feminists have reflected upon and engaged with science critically and constructively each of which might be thought of as perspectives on science. Feminists have detailed the historically gendered participation in the practice of science—the marginalization or exclusion of women from the profession and how their contributions have disappeared when they have participated. Feminists have also noted how the sciences have been slow to study women’s lives, bodies, and experiences. Thus from both the perspectives of the agents—the creators of scientific knowledge—and from the perspectives of the subjects of knowledge—the topics and interests focused on—the sciences often have not served women satisfactorily. We can think of these perspectives as generating two types of equity issues: limitations on the freedom to participate as reflected in the historical underrepresentation of women in the scientific professions and the relative lack of attention to research questions relevant to women’s lives.
Feminist perspectives encompass more than equity issues however. They extend to questions about the methodology, epistemology, and ontology of scientific inquiry as well. Feminists have scrutinized explicit ways that scientific research has been affected by sexist and gendered presuppositions about the subject matter and the methods appropriate to the sciences. Such investigations have sometimes revealed how scientific practice has failed to meet standards of good science. Additionally, and more radically, feminists have questioned traditional methodologies and offered alternative approaches better suited to feminist subject matter and goals. Feminist perspectives on scientific knowledge production have been constructive where criticisms have motivated alternative conceptualization of subject matter, greater attention to the goals of scientific research, and reflection on the epistemological and ontological commitments of methodology.
Most generally feminists are united in urging recognition of the social contexts in which scientific research takes place and scientific knowledge is received. As such, feminist approaches to science are situated in broader movements in philosophy of science and science studies that emerged during the second half of the twentieth century. Such approaches acknowledge and explore the social nature of scientific knowledge (for example: Kuhn 1962 ; Longino 1990, 2002; Kitcher 1993, 2001; Solomon 2001). Additionally, they are situated in the liberatory movements of the 1960s and 1970s. As the participation of women in the sciences increased in the second half of the twentieth century, the effects of the absence of women as researchers and women’s lives as subjects of knowledge were more readily apparent. The coinciding feminist movements during the same period provided frameworks through which to theorize these lacunae and understand them as aspects of oppression.
While the discussion thus far might suggest that feminists are a united group whose perspectives differ only over their focus that is not the case. Feminists vary among themselves in their political goals as well as in their epistemic and ontological commitments (see Feminist Philosophy). Not all feminisms are the same and consequently this is an additional dimension on which perspectives on science differ. Feminist philosophy of science and science studies is now a mature area of research and subtle, internal debates reflect this. Even so it is possible to identify some general areas of agreement. Minimally, feminist perspectives on science start from the premise that the question of whether sex/gender matters to the production of scientific knowledge should be taken as an open question. It cannot be assumed to be irrelevant as it so often was in the past. The question of how, where, why, and when gender is relevant is where various feminist views differ. Additionally, the sciences themselves vary and so how they are viewed, which are deemed most relevant to feminism and affected by sex/gender and in what ways they might be affected is not likely to be uniform. Accordingly, this entry seeks to capture feminist perspectives both from the different political, epistemic, and social locations through which feminists view science as well as from the differences in focus feminists have when considering scientific knowledge production. That being said, it should be noted that the entry prioritizes the social and life sciences when discussing subject matter (although not when discussing the participation of women in the science professions). This is because feminists have been most active in investigating the operation of sexist assumptions in the social and life sciences. It should also be noted that the philosophical perspective of this entry is predominantly Anglo-American and so does not include an analysis of, for example, feminist approaches in the tradition of Continental philosophy or careful consideration of issues that affect the global South. There are likely other lessons to learn from how feminist approach science in these other cultural, social, and historical contexts. Some recent work by Sandra Harding on Latin American science studies offers an example of how such differences in context matter (Harding 2017, 2019).
- 1. Equity Issues
- 2. Feminist Critique of Science
- 3. Feminist Methodology
- 4. Feminist Philosophy of Science
- 5. Queer Science Studies and the New Materialisms
- 6. Recent Areas of Study: The Brain and Human Behavior
- 7. Conclusions
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
1. Equity Issues
Equity issues in the sciences often focus on underrepresentation. However, equity in any field has different causes and manifestations. Thinking of equity as a matter of “how many” from the group in question participate is important insofar as it may reflect injustices in access to science education, employment, or promotion. These issues of social justice are a core element of feminism, but they do not exhaust it.
Small numbers are indicative of other equity issues that feminists have explored. The connection between who it is that participates in knowledge production and the nature of the knowledge produced is one. This connection has both negative and positive aspects. On the negative side, the unwarranted biases of researchers who share unexamined and unsupported assumptions go unchallenged when those who have experiences conflicting with those assumptions are excluded. This point is addressed in literature on the epistemic value of diversity. As Kristen Intemann puts it
by including individuals from relevantly diverse social positions, the resulting epistemic community will be comprised of scientists informed by diverse experiences that can increase the rigor of scrutiny brought to background assumptions, theories and models. (Intemann 2011: 126)
On the positive side, when such differences in experiences are included in the research process it may increase the quality and relevance of the knowledge produced. Exploration of how this is so is one way in which feminist perspectives have contributed to the growing awareness of the social nature of scientific knowledge (Intemann 2009, Rolin 2006, Fehr 2011).
While social justice concerns about equity are best understood as inseparable from epistemic concerns, this entry begins by considering them individually with a focus on some specific aspects of equity issues. A more expansive and detailed account of the history of how these issues have been addressed can be found in an earlier iteration of Feminist Perspectives on Science in the archives (Crasnow et al. 2015 ).
1.1 Women in the Sciences
Although there have always been women interested in the world in ways that came to be identified as scientific, their participation has neither been uniformly encouraged nor consistently acknowledged. The relative absence of women from the history of science, the low numbers of women formally participating in science prior to the twentieth century, and the continuing difficulties of many women in those fields even after they entered in significant numbers—lower promotion rates, lower wages, and lesser positions than men in the field—are one focus of feminist attention. Feminist approaches have included efforts to publicize the role of women in the past (e.g., the History of Women in Philosophy and Science, Paderborn University), increase the participation of women and girls in science through education (for example, the ADVANCE initiative discussed in greater detail in Crasnow et al. 2015 ), and to identify factors that create barriers to women persisting or advancing in the sciences.
Sandra Harding describes projects that reveal various ways in which women involved in science have been overlooked or forgotten as “women worthies” projects (Harding 1986). Such projects involve discovering and honoring women who were overlooked or forgotten in the history of science. There are multiple motivations for such projects. One is simply the desire to correct the historical record and give women contributors their due. Another aim is to encourage future participation by girls and women. If one reason for the historically low participation of women in the sciences is that stereotypes of women conflict with their ability to imagine themselves as scientists, then countering such stereotypes is one way to alter that circumstance.
Persistently low participation—or the appearance of low participation because of the invisibility of women—lends support to a problematic schema. Schemas are “hypotheses that we use to interpret social events” (Valian 1999: 103)—in this case, the hypothesis that girls and women are not suited to the pursuit of scientific knowledge. The cultural milieu in which girls and women find themselves pursuing science is one in which stereotype threat (Steele 1997) is just one of the many challenges they must face. Stereotype threat is the activation of internalized negative stereotypes, so that when the subject is reminded of their belonging to the stereotyped group their performance is affected so that it is consistent with the stereotype. Girls reminded that they are girls perform less well on mathematics tests when the dominant stereotype is that “girls don’t do math”. Thus it can be part of a cycle that helps perpetuate the low numbers through impacting scores on tests and in classes that function as entry points to science careers. However, there is evidence that counterexamples—such as the awareness of successful women in these fields—can diminish this effect thus potentially ending the cycle.
There is certainly reason to think that such projects are worthwhile, however they do not fundamentally alter the nature of the disciplines in question on their own. Harding describes these projects as part of a progression in feminist approaches to science in order to contrast them with later conceptual critiques of the sciences in both feminist science and feminist philosophy of science. According to this narrative feminist critique moves from a discussion of women worthies to a deeper examination of the features of scientific knowledge production. While the progressive story is appealing, looking back on the past 30 years it would seem that the need for rewriting history to include women has not vanished and, while there have been many positive changes, some of which have been spurred by feminist critique, work remains to be done to address remaining inequities. The uptake of many feminist ideas about who should do science, what science ought to study, and how such research should be carried out has been disappointingly slow. Although a greater number of women attain both undergraduate and graduate degrees in science fields than ever before, their participation in the science and engineering workforce remains comparatively low at roughly 28% when considering all disciplines (Science and Engineering Indicators, National Science Board 2018: chapter 3, 3-106). Additionally, there is a persistent wage gap (decreasing with higher levels of education, but nonetheless remaining even as level of education increases).
The 2010 American Association of University Women (AAUW) report, Why So Few? Women in Science, Technology, Engineering, and Mathematics identified three themes that persist in conventional explanations of the gender disparities in STEM fields. The first is the idea that there are innate sex-linked differences in talent—specifically that men typically have better mathematical and spatial skills required for success in STEM fields. The second is the idea that both drive and preferences differ by gender—that girls are simply less interested in STEM disciplines and so do not choose to pursue STEM careers. The third focuses on inequities related to the workplace, including both explicit and implicit biases within the workplace and life-work balance issues that are thought to drive women out of STEM fields. These conventional themes resurface periodically in the discussion of gender inequities in STEM fields suggesting an inevitability of the status quo. The AAUW report challenges each of these standard explanations in turn and makes suggestions designed to address features of STEM education that seem likely to contribute to this persistent gender disparity.
The first sort of explanation for the lower participation of women reflects a tension between feminism and science that will be discussed in more detail in section 2.1. The suggestion is that science itself reveals (or will reveal) the innate differences between men and women/girls and boys that account for the ability to do science. This claim is countered by challenging the evidence in two ways: revealing biases in the research or noting that when differences in ability appear to be present they can equally well be ascribed to culture (societal influences) rather than nature.
The second claim also postulates gendered differences, framing them in terms of natural preferences rather than abilities. Again, this is countered by urging consideration of culture rather than nature. Another approach is to critique the language of preferences, noting that the structural nature of sexism shapes researchers’ readings of preferences but also that what options are believed to be available shapes preferences.
The third theme has received more attention recently, in part because it goes some way towards explaining why the increase in the number of women receiving science education has not been matched by a comparable increase in their participation in the workforce. While participation varies by discipline—with most of the social sciences (except economics and political science) having women in the majority and the life sciences close to parity—overall it remains comparatively low (28% as noted previously; National Science Board 2018: chapter 3, 3-106), particularly when more leadership or prestigious roles are considered. There is a growing awareness that “microinequities”—small slights and injustices that have an accumulative discouraging effect over time—may play a role in this low rate of participation.
Alison Wylie offers an account of these subtle forms of discrimination as first fully acknowledged in the 1999 MIT report “A Study on the Status of Women Faculty in the School of Science” (MIT 1999).
Discrimination in the 1990s, …, takes the form of innumerable small differences in uptake and response…. (Wylie 2011: 157)
This report notes the challenges faced by girls and women entering science fields and clarifies how they had been underestimated or discounted. Wylie’s discussion of the reception of “chilly climate” reports, like the MIT report gives some insight into the depressing lack of progress in the past 30 years.
Even when systematic gender differences were successfully documented, either in a particular context or as a pervasive feature of academic life, the critics of chilly climate studies routinely denied that they reflect any unfairness on the part of individuals or institutions; if no harm was intended, and no intent to discriminate had been demonstrated, allegations of injustice were unfounded. (Wylie 2011: 171)
Further evidence of the pervasiveness and structural nature of the challenges that women face appear in more recent research. The 2018 Consensus Report Study carried out under the auspices of the National Academies of Science, Engineering, and Medicine, Sexual Harassment of Women: Climate, Culture, and Consequences in Academic Sciences, Engineering, and Medicine explores the extent to which women are driven out of the academy through sexual harassment (Johnson et al. 2018). The Consensus Report Study makes concrete suggestions for improving the environment to prevent sexual harassment and for handling cases if they do occur. The very existence of the study and the felt need that gave rise to it are indicators that the equity issues that feminists have been concerned with have not been satisfactorily addressed. Consequently, increasing the participation of girls and women, as well as retaining women once they enter the scientific professions, remain of interest to feminists.
1.2 Sciences Studying Women
As more women entered scientific fields during the twentieth century they begin to focus on a variety of phenomena that previously had been overlooked—phenomena present in the lives, domains, and experiences of women. This point is beautifully illustrated by the note that Claude Lévi-Strauss made in an article describing his field work in 1936:
the entire village left the next day in about thirty canoes, leaving us alone in the abandoned houses with the women and children. (1936: 283, translated in Eichler & Lapointe 1985: 11)
The anthropologist finds himself “alone” since the proper subjects of research have left the village. As women entered anthropology they recognized those left behind as part of the fabric of the culture that they sought, as social scientists, to understand.
Neglect was sometimes the result of lack of access. In some cultures men do not have access to women and domains identified with women due to cultural restrictions on the interactions among genders. In other cases, lack of awareness or interest in the phenomena that were identified as connected to women resulted in lacunae in research. In economics, for example, the failure to identify the role of (mostly) women’s domestic work as labor and hence as relevant to economic analysis was not a result of its invisibility—domestic labor is present throughout human experience—but rather because of conceptualizing labor so that such unpaid domestic labor remains outside of the economic sphere. It was economically invisible. Women economists noticed and sought to correct this omission by clarifying the ways in which paid labor depends upon domestic support and the role this plays in capitalism (Dalla Costa & James 1972; Federici 1975 ; Himmelweit & Mohun 1977). Perhaps in part because of roots in the Marxist tradition and so its association with a non-mainstream economics, this understanding of labor is still not fully incorporated into economics research.
Additionally, the domination of economics by rational choice theory pushes against treating gender and gendered social structure as relevant. The conception of the economic agent in rational choice theory relies on an abstract understanding of agents as guided by their preferences. Any variation in the choices made by different genders must be interpreted as a matter of differences in preferences. Embedded in rational choice theory’s fundamental assumption about agents is the idea that gender is irrelevant to the analysis of human behavior. A number of feminist economists have noted that the reliance on rational choice approaches is a factor in the failure to incorporate feminist interests and insights into economics (see Barker 1995; Barker & Kuiper 2003). Although behavioral economics has challenged many assumptions of rational choice theory, its emergence as a new approach has not necessarily ameliorated the situation. Recent research suggests that much work in behavioral economics is affected by stereotypical assumptions about differences in the behavior of men and women (Sent & van Staveren 2019). Thus the responses to attempts to incorporate gender analyses into economics can be summarized as follows: relevant gender differences are identified but there is a lack uptake (domestic labor/work); gender is treated as irrelevant; or when identified as relevant, sexist stereotypes permeate research.
Medicine provides another example of the limited responsiveness of a field to feminist critique. Heart disease in women was often not recognized or understood primarily because the research had focused on men. Although more recent research has included women, as late as 2017 research on medical practice indicated that women still are not screened for heart disease as regularly as men during routine health examinations. In addition, 45% of women in a nationwide survey were unaware that heart disease is the number one cause of fatality for women (Bairey Merz et al. 2017). Since 1993 the National Institutes of Health (NIH) has required that women (and minorities) be included in research projects that are NIH funded (see Other Internet Resources). However, there are problems recruiting and retaining sufficient numbers of women for such research as evidenced by the literature review on the topic at the NIH website. The requirement does not, in itself, correct gender inequities in medical research which tend to be more systematic and structural.
As a final example, consider Pamela Paxton’s critique of indices of democracy commonly used in political science research. Paxton argues that often the operationalization of democracy in the most commonly used indices treats one of its key indicators, “universal suffrage”, as universal male suffrage—either implicitly or explicitly. When understood as including women’s suffrage, Paxton notes that many of the key claims of research on democracy—including a standard interpretation that identifies three waves of democracy—may need to be revised (Paxton 2000). Although decisions about how to operationalize a concept like democracy can have far-reaching effects for theoretical explanation, this is another case where uptake has been limited. Democracy indices have not been revised following Paxton’s critique.
These are just three examples of how attempts to challenge content, while widely recognized as legitimate, have failed to bring about fundamental change. Such examples suggest that feminist goals require more than the inclusion of women as researcher or their lives as objects of inquiry. It is not enough to “add women and stir”—as has become clear in the struggle to gain parity in employment, education, and research. Deeper conceptual change and critique of the way scientific research is structured are needed.
2. Feminist Critique of Science
It is tempting to think that the main benefit of feminist perspectives on science has been to identify sexist bias in science and that the consequently the elimination of bias would be a sufficient corrective. Undeniably, there are cases where bias is the primary issue, however, it is not clear that its removal is sufficient to serve feminist aims. Even if it were, however, identifying and eliminating bias may be more difficult than it might seem for a number of reasons.
First, bias is not always easy to identify. Even with a good will, scientists may be unable to identify problematic background assumptions since such assumptions are often deeply embedded in research practices, shared by the community involved in those practices (the broader social milieu), and so not readily available to scrutiny. Bias is not simply the tendency of individuals to prefer particular views or to ignore the alternatives.
[I]t also includes unreflective assent to background assumptions about, for instance, causal relationships or how natural or social phenomena are to be classified. (Brister 2018: 214–215)
Second, the idea that the best science is that which eliminates bias evokes an ideal of science as value-free—that is, free from moral, cultural, or political values. While this conception of science dominated philosophy of science in the first half of the twentieth century it has since been challenged. The extent to which values may play a legitimate role, when, and in what aspects of science, has been extensively explored during the past few decades (see feminist epistemology and philosophy of science—section 7, also Lacey 1999; Kincaid, Dupré, & Wylie 2007; Elliott 2017). Feminist philosophers of science have been active participants in this discussion.
Finally, bias has sometimes been understood as a matter of the idiosyncratic and irrelevant beliefs or attitudes of individual scientists. This understanding of bias obscures the social nature of science. Scientists typically work in teams, not in isolation, and the frameworks within which they labor have their own social histories. Researchers are trained by other scientists to adopt the practices of the disciplines within which they work. In addition, the assessment of their research is done within that social context. These social aspects of science provide an intellectual architecture that both shapes and constrains research.
2.1 Feminist Science as the Elimination of Sexist Values
Women entering science also absorb the culture of their disciplines and so their research begins with the assumptions, frameworks, and dominant methodology of those disciplines. If they are feminists, or even if they are not, they sometimes come to their work with different interests and goals. These differences may be because of an awareness of aspects of the world that are either not of interest or invisible to their counterparts who are men. They may frame research through questions not asked by others and see phenomena that had been overlooked, deemed irrelevant, or misinterpreted. They also may be more likely to notice when research has been guided by assumptions about the subject matter that are informed by stereotypical understandings of gender.
On the face of it, there is no reason to think that better implementation of the practices of science could not correct these absences or misinterpretations. One could argue that social science that fails to acknowledge the fundamentally gendered nature of society simply fails to be empirically adequate. However, as Judith Stacey and Barrie Thorne put it,
Over time … feminists discover that many gaps were there for a reason, i.e., that existing paradigms systematically ignore or erase the significance of women’s experiences and the organization of gender. This discovery … leads feminists to rethink the basic conceptual and theoretical frameworks of their respective fields. (Stacey & Thorne 1985: 302)
Doing traditional science better but with the same basic assumptions does not eliminate many of these problems.
Worries about what it would mean to “rethink basic conceptual and theoretical frameworks” of science were among the reasons that feminist critique of science was a target of the “science wars” of the 1990s. As philosophers, historians, and other social scientists recognized social influences on scientific research and the fact that scientific communities were social entities their accounts threatened the notion that moral, political, cultural, or social values should not play a role in the assessment of evidence, the choice of methodology, or ultimately the acceptance of theories—the value-free ideal. While those embracing the ideal had always recognized that some values—epistemic or cognitive values that include, for example, the commitment to the pursuit of truth, the empirical adequacy of theories, the consideration of total evidence—do and should play a role in science, they rejected that social, political, or moral values should. From the perspective of the value-free ideal, feminist values are precisely the sort of values that ought to be excluded.
Thus, we see the value-free ideal evoked in philosophical discussions of feminist epistemology and philosophy of science during the 1990s. For example, Susan Haack describes feminist epistemology as “incongruous on its face” (Haack 1993: 32; for similar sentiments see Pinnick 1994). In response, feminist philosophy of science during the 1990s was formulated as a defense against the charge that forsaking the value-free ideal would undermine the objectivity of science and result in a pernicious relativism.
Critiques like Haack’s and Pinnick’s mischaracterized at least some feminist philosophy of science and science studies from this period. Not all feminists were arguing for a radical rethinking of science and most were committed to maintaining some notion of objectivity and resisting relativism. Harding described those who believed that science was fundamentally sound and feminist goals could be achieved through eliminating bias “feminist empiricists” (Harding 1986). The view is not, prima facie, implausible. Consider the cases discussed in section 1.2 from economics, medicine, and political science. The idea that unpaid domestic work should figure in economic analysis could be described as contributing to a more empirically adequate economics. However, such an analysis fails to account for the lack of uptake of feminist critique in the broader discipline.
For rational choice things are a bit trickier. For the agent of rational choice theory gender characteristics are not considered relevant and so claiming that the approach is tainted by sexist values might seem difficult to defend. Nonetheless a feminist empiricist (in Harding’s original sense) response is possible. Rational choice accounts can fail in circumstances when gender is in fact a relevant feature—and so in such cases accounts that do not consider gender fail to be empirically adequate. Empirical adequacy requires that all the significant or relevant phenomena be accounted for. But from the feminist perspective that requirement raises questions: “Relevant for whom?” and “Relevant for what end?” Questions of significance and relevance suggest that values are unavoidable.
This is even more clear in the medical example. The failure to consider women when investigating cardiac health looks like sexist bias in the research. This might be seen as straightforward sexism resulting from considering the lives of men to be more important than the lives of women. However, we need not assume such overt sexism in order to see values at work in this case. A more nuanced analysis recognizes that on average heart disease has an earlier age of onset in men, striking them in the “prime of life”. Consequently, heart disease in men has a greater impact on economic productivity in a society in which gender roles proscribe that men are in the workforce to a greater extent than women—as has historically been the case in the industrialized north. The value placed on the lives of (younger) men as opposed to (older) women is reflected in the prioritizing of research on men. The impact of heart disease on the economy because it affected more men of working age than women, is a reflection of the gendered structure of the economy. Understanding such priorities requires identifying how values are implicit in research decisions.
What researchers (and the society in which they are embedded) take to be important, and so, what they investigate, always sits in the background. The questions that are asked, what counts as evidence, and ultimately what counts as knowledge, is dependent on those interests. Eliminating bias in science does not mean eliminating interests.
While there is general agreement that science improperly informed by unexamined sexist assumptions is bad science, current thinking is that what makes it bad is less that it incorporates values but rather that the values that it incorporates either are the wrong ones (Kourany 2010), are used in the wrong way (Anderson 2004), or are adopted uncritically (Longino 1990). These differing feminist attitudes towards the role of values as they appear in feminist philosophy of science will be discussed in more detail in section 4.2.
2.2 Critique of Concepts and Background Assumptions
One reason why eliminating bias sometimes involves more than merely doing science better is that gender assumptions are not always apparent to the researchers that are in their thrall. For example, gender assumptions sometimes enter scientific research through metaphor. Some early feminist critique emphasized this avenue (Merchant 1980/1990; Keller 1985; Spanier 1995). When their understanding of the objects of inquiry is shaped through unexamined gendered metaphors, scientists risk misdescribing and consequently misunderstanding the material world. Additionally, metaphors often aid in the reproduction or reinforcement of unequal power relations by carrying sets of associated expectations with them.
Evelyn Fox Keller offers the following example. The understanding of ovum/sperm reproduction was shaped (wrongly) by thinking of the sperm as masculine and the ovum as feminine. The projection of human gender expectations onto the gametes resulted in an assumption that the ovum was passive (as women stereotypically are) and the sperm active (as men stereotypically are). Writing in 2001, Keller recounts a shift to the recognition of an active role for both gametes:
The story provides a powerful lesson. It illustrates the ways in which language can shape the thinking and acting of working scientists—that is, by framing their attention, their perception, and, accordingly, the fields in which they can envision experiments that might be useful to undertake. (Keller 2001: 106)
Metaphors may signal hidden assumptions that play a role in identifying what counts as relevant evidence. Sarah Richardson exposes and explores projective attributions of gender in the ways that stereotypical ideas about male and female traits shape research on chromosomes and sex determination. She argues that
[f]rom the earliest theories of chromosomal sex determination to the midcentury hypothesis of the aggressive XYY supermale, the longstanding belief that the X is the “female chromosome”, and the recent claim that males and females have “different genomes”, cultural gender conceptions have influenced the direction of sex chromosome genetics. (Richardson 2013: 2)
As one example of the effects of this projection she discusses the failed supermale hypothesis—the idea that XYY males have more “maleness” in virtue of having two Y chromosomes. Supermales were hypothesized to be, among other things, more aggressive. Their greater numbers in both psychiatric and correctional institutions seemed to support this. The gendering of the Y chromosome—thinking of it as having stereotypically male traits—supported a flawed transitive reasoning: Y distinguishes maleness, males with double Y should have more (double?) maleness (e.g., aggression). The result was not only a false conclusion but a failure to examine evidence that did not support the hypothesis. For example, institutional populations also contain a disproportionate number of XXY males. Using the same gender stereotypical reasoning, this evidence would be inconsistent with the supermale hypothesis. Ultimately the hypothesis was discredited for a variety of reasons, but this “embarrassment” in chromosomal sex determination research is only one example of how assumptions about gender can shape understanding of the object of inquiry. Richardson argues that such areas of research carry with them “gender valence”—a more nuanced projective gendering of the subject matter that is more subtle than what is typically referred to as “gender bias”.
Metaphor is not the only avenue through which projections occur. Assumed similarity of the experience of men and women and the further assumption that the experiences of men are the norm is another. Elisabeth Lloyd’s extended case study of accounts of female orgasm illustrates how an assumption of this sort can prevent the consideration of relevant evidence (Lloyd 2005). She examines 21 accounts (hypotheses) proposed for giving an evolutionary explanation for female orgasm—a seeming anomaly in that it does not appear to be necessary for reproduction. Of these, only one (the byproduct account proposed by Donald Symons in 1979) incorporates a key piece of evidence—that many women do not experience orgasm with intercourse and many women do experience orgasm without intercourse.
She reviews the accounts and identifies two background assumptions that inform all accounts except Symons’s. They are: the adaptationist assumption that
natural selection, rather than other evolutionary forces, directly shaped the trait into its present form, or that natural selection is currently maintaining the trait in the population….(Lloyd 2005: 230)
the androcentric assumption that males are taken to be the normal type or the exemplar.
The second of these has the problematic result that “to the extent that they differ from the male type, females are invisible” (Lloyd 2005: 233). She takes these background assumptions to be responsible for the failure to consider the evidence that human females do not consistently achieve orgasm with intercourse and do achieve orgasm without intercourse. She argues that any account that does not explain this anomalous evidence should be considered problematic.
Although Symon’s account is not without problems, Lloyd argues that it fits the evidence better than the alternatives. Symons proposes that female orgasm is a byproduct of evolution rather than a result of natural selection, a hypothesis that he is able to consider because he is not assuming that orgasm in females must serve a reproductive function since it does in males. His explanation for female orgasm is that the biological development of males and females is parallel so that the features that lead to orgasm in males (nerves, erectile tissues, etc.) are also present in females, but not always activated. Female orgasm is thus a byproduct of human evolution in much the same way that male nipples are a byproduct and just as the male nipples play no role in human reproduction neither does female orgasm.
Lloyd argues that the inclusion of sexist values (the androcentric understanding of orgasm) prevent the consideration of the available data on female orgasm as evidence. Symons’ account does not rely on this androcentric understanding of the phenomenon under investigation and consequently his hypothesis can both consider and account for these data.
The examples offered here indicate that the way the objects of inquiry are understood can shape the resulting science, but the example from Lloyd’s work also suggests that an epistemology that takes into account the role of background assumptions (beliefs) in the context of inquiry is better equipped for thinking through how beliefs about gender can affect knowledge production. Both concerns point us towards feminist philosophy of science, to be discussed in section 4. But first, section 3 considers the question of the appropriate methods for feminist research.
3. Feminist Methodology
The discussion of methodology in this section focuses on the social sciences, primarily because it is in these fields that most of the debate on this topic has taken place. “Methodology” is understood following Harding’s distinction between method, methodology, and epistemology. Methods are “techniques for gathering evidence”, whereas methodology is “a theory and analysis of how research should proceed”. Epistemology is the “theory of knowledge or justificatory strategy” that underlies the methodology (Harding 1987: 2). This three-way distinction provides a framework for thinking about the relationship among method, methodology, and epistemology. The framework is reflected in sociologist Joey Sprague’s account of feminist methodology.
Each methodology is founded on either explicit or, more often, unexamined assumptions about what knowledge is and how knowing is best accomplished; together, these assumptions constitute a particular epistemology. That is, a methodology works out the implications of a specific epistemology for how to implement a method. (Sprague 2016: 5)
Some feminists have been skeptical about the capacity of conventional research methods to address feminist interests and goals. But others have chosen to use conventional methods in support of those goals. Consequently, a review of feminist social science gives no reason to think that there are any particular methods that are distinctively feminist. And indeed feminist research often uses a plurality of methods or “mixed methods”—usually the combined use of both qualitative and quantitative methods within a single research project. Nonetheless, there are elements of methodology that do seem distinctly feminist. Most notable among these is the core commitment to “start research from the lives of women”—their lived experience.
The idea that research should start from the lived experiences of those who are studied suggests an ethnographic approach and it is perhaps for this reason feminists have been thought to favor qualitative methods. But the frequent use of statistical (quantitative) methods used to support feminist goals belies this idea. Londa Schiebinger offers an example from primatology. In the 1970s Jeanne Altmann (1974) used representative sampling techniques to effectively change research. The opportunistic sampling that this approach replaced failed to note the frequency and duration of behavior among primates and so gave a distorted picture of primate life, emphasizing high drama events centering around reproduction and male conflict over commonplace events. The role of females in the group and family life had thus been overlooked (Schiebinger 1999: 7).
The rise of quantitative methods throughout the social sciences has been associated with the idea that greater objectivity can be achieved through numerical representation (see Porter 1995 for an account of the history of this view). The notion that quantitative methods are more objective is again closely tied to an understanding of science as value-free and the desire to make the social sciences more “scientific”. In comparison qualitative methods like those involved in ethnographic research—interviews, participant observation, and the like—appear to be vulnerable to subjectivity. A more accurate understanding of what feminist methodology is, how it relates to the choice of method, and what this has to do with epistemological commitments requires a more nuanced account than focusing on quantitative/qualitative divide in method can provide.
What does it mean to say a methodology is feminist? As Sprague puts it,
while feminists are a very heterogeneous group and we disagree on many issues, there are two points on which we have consensus: (1) gender, in interaction with other forms of social relations such as race/ethnicity, class, ability, and nation, is a key organizer of social life; and (2) understanding how things work is not enough—we need to take action to make the social world more equitable. (Sprague 2016: 3)
A feminist methodology is one that is shaped by and serves these commitments. It requires adopting approaches and methods that are sensitive to the key structural elements of social life and it aims at producing knowledge that can be used to further feminist goals. Minimally, meeting those requirements calls for starting research from the lives of women—that is, starting research from the daily experiences of their lives. Feminist methodological approaches are strongly unified in this respect and it is this aspect of feminist methodology that much feminist epistemology is responsive to. We see this particularly in philosophical accounts of feminist standpoint theory with its thesis that all knowledge is situated (to be discussed in section 4.3), but arguably all feminist epistemology calls for a recognition of the situated nature of knowledge.
Sprague notes that qualitative methods are often thought to be better suited to challenge inequalities that are apparent from “the downside of the social hierarchies”—that is, from the lives of those who are the subjects of research (Sprague 2016: 140). Doing science as a feminist means paying attention to the way that gender structures the differential distribution of power in society and consequently access to the means of production of knowledge. We see evidence of this in the invisibility of those who are marginalized, the silencing of their voices, and the failure to acknowledge them as trustworthy epistemic agents—all of which are varieties of epistemic injustice (see feminist social epistemology, also Fricker 2007; Dotson 2011; Medina 2013). While the feminist commitments that Sprague details are consistent with the idea that feminist researchers are not confined to any specific methods, to start from the lives of women when those lives are not among those who are producing knowledge or being listened to in the production of knowledge means that researchers should be thinking about the extent to which their methods will allow lived experience to be recognized as evidence. Consequently, feminist methodology calls for methods to be chosen consciously—that is, with awareness of their strengths and weakness in relation to the lives of those researched and researcher’s feminist commitments and goals. Feminist methodology is thus self-reflective in the sense that appropriateness of methods should always be considered.
It is not surprising then that methodological debates coincided with more women entering the social sciences and finding that the tools that they had been trained to use were not always adequate. In sociology we see several examples of this. The feminist sociologist Margaret DeVault altered her interview transcription practices, rejecting the traditional practices she had been taught, when she came to believe that the hesitations—the “ums”, and “you knows” in the responses of those she interviewed—were relevant as evidence. Traditionally these would have been eliminated or smoothed out in a transcription but DeVault found that they often marked topics that needed to be returned to and reflected emotional factors that were relevant to the research questions she was investigating (DeVault 1999: 78). DeVault starts from the lives of the women she studies as standpoint methodology urges, and in doing so she is attentive to the emotional valences of their lives (see section 4.3 on standpoint theory). She chooses and adjust her methods in response to this guiding methodology.
Sociologists Dorothy Smith and Patricia Hill Collins also advocate standpoint methodology. Smith notes the mismatch between the lived experience of those who are researched and the concepts and methods sociology prescribes. She refers to this tension as producing “lines of fault” and urges critical feminist sociologists to rethink practices in order to better capture experience. Smith describes this as problematizing everyday life, with the result that what was taken to be “natural” is reassessed and reinterpreted (Smith 1987). Using a similar approach—starting from the lives of women in the African American communities she studies—Collins finds that neither mainstream sociological accounts nor standard (white) feminist approaches fit the experiences of the women she studies—nor should they all be thought of as all having the same experiences (Collins 1990 [2000/2009]). Thus the self-reflective nature of feminist methodology directs the researcher to question tools (methods), assumptions about how to support knowledge (epistemology), and standard assumptions about the nature of the objects of inquiry (ontology).
Methods are not neutral. They carry with them assumptions about what it is to produce knowledge (epistemology) and the world that they are used to explore (ontology). If those assumptions are flawed or not adequate to research goals then they can result in a failure to take appropriate evidence into consideration, distorting both the results and interpretations of research. When researchers avail themselves of a plurality of methods, they are more likely to think through the benefits and drawbacks of the various techniques and reflect on their assumptions.
Methods may also carry value commitments—another reason for reflecting on their use. Quantitative methods in the social sciences are aimed at providing information about average effects in large populations. When evidence is constrained by an epistemological commitment to a method that only allows for evidence of average effects, then the method itself may result in treating characteristics of particular individuals as irrelevant. The methods force the disappearance of differences which may be relevant with the result that they may de-value minority populations or individuals. Methods that produce evidence of average effects threaten to have a disproportionate impact on those who are who are not “average” in the requisite sense.
The adept use of quantitative methods may ameliorate these worries to some extent. If populations are recognized as heterogeneous then researchers might engage in further research on subpopulations. Some aspects of the problem of erasure of difference could be addressed, but which characteristics indicate relevant subpopulations will require attention to the lived experience of those who are studied. The need to identify relevant subpopulations reinforces a need for pluralism regarding methods, since recognition of relevant difference depends on the sort of scrutiny most frequently provided through qualitative methods. Recent feminist attention to intersectionality and the ways power differentially structures society through gender, race, ability, sexuality, socioeconomic class, ethnicity, and other salient features of individuals raises a further worry. It is not entirely clear how a subpopulation strategy can address social justice issues intertwined in this way. There is some recent research that attempts to address intersectionality. Bright, Malinsky, and Thompson (2016) offer one approach to examining intersectional causality, for example. But intersectional effects cannot be understood as additive—once again counting against reliance on exclusively quantitative approaches. Finally, there is the problem that further partitioning of the reference class may also decrease the sample size and thus undermine the power of the method. In any case, these worries further support the feminist intuition that methods must be chosen consciously and with attention to the aims of research.
In summary, feminist methods sometimes reveal that standard disciplinary conceptions of the objects of inquiry do not get at what is significant relative to feminist research questions. Furthermore, some methods are suitable for studying large populations but not for revealing what we may need to know about individuals or smaller populations. (Longino makes this point as well in another context in Part 2 of Longino 2013.) Finally, what theory of evidence we have—how we understand scientific knowledge to be justified—matters to how we understand the way gender matters to knowledge production. Thus we turn to feminist epistemology in the context of philosophy of science.
4. Feminist Philosophy of Science
As noted in section 2, feminist philosophies of science came of age during the 1980s and 90s, the period of the “science wars”. The interdisciplinary analysis of science during this period included an exploration of the ways that society shaped the context of research. Critics interpreted this shift in interests as opening the door to relativism and undermining the presumed objectivity of science—an objectivity thought to be guaranteed by scientific method understood as value-free. Much early feminist philosophy of science and epistemology was centered on defending the idea that science informed by feminist analysis would be better science and so not antithetical to the aims of science (such as the pursuit of truth) in the ways that critics feared. The concern of feminist philosophy of science and epistemology with objectivity reflects this.
Sandra Harding (1986) characterized three approaches to feminist philosophy of science: feminist empiricism, feminist postmodernism, and feminist standpoint theory. Much of the subsequent work took this tripartite distinction among feminist approaches as a starting point (see feminist epistemology and philosophy of science). In part, because of work on science and values in both feminist philosophy of science and philosophy of science more broadly, the early forms of feminist empiricism described in section 2.1 have evolved into an empiricism that acknowledges that values may play a role in science. This is reflected in a convergence of the two dominant Anglo-American feminist approaches of the late twentieth and early twenty-first centuries—feminist empiricism and feminist standpoint theory. Kristen Intemann suggests that the resulting views might be labelled “feminist standpoint empiricism” (Intemann 2010).
The following is an account of some of the ways in which feminist philosophers have responded to the challenge of acknowledging that social, political, and cultural values can play a positive role in scientific knowledge production.
4.1 Feminist Empiricist Holism
One way in which feminist philosophers of science have accounted for the role of values in science is through an empiricist holism. As Miriam Solomon has noted, many feminist empiricists were influenced by the American pragmatists of the second half of the twentieth century, particularly Wilfred Sellars, Willard van Orman Quine, and Donald Davidson. Among the similarities that result from this influence is their naturalized approach to the philosophy of science, in that they base their accounts on the knowledge practices of the sciences on which they focus. They are empiricists in taking experience as the ultimate arbitrator of our beliefs; they are holists in that they take beliefs to answer to experience as whole—in Quine’s phrase, as a “web of belief”—rather than one-by-one.
Lynn Hankinson Nelson (1990) is explicit in her debt to Quine, others are less so. Longino’s contextual empiricism, discussed in detail elsewhere (see the entries on feminist epistemology and philosophy of science, feminist social epistemology, the social dimensions of scientific knowledge, and briefly in this entry in section 4.2), is one of the most influential of these approaches and differs from other empiricist approaches, most notably in the role that she ascribes to values and how she believes that differences in values should be adjudicated (Longino 1990, 2002). Other versions of holism appear in the work of Lynn Hankinson Nelson (1990), Elizabeth Anderson (1995a, 2004), and Sharyn Clough (2003a, 2003b, 2012) all of whom, unlike Longino, argue that values should answer to empirical evidence. Solomon has dubbed the latter approach “feminist radical empiricism” (Solomon 2012: 435).
Since it is clear that problematic sexist values can distort science (see the examples discussed previously in section 2) much of the work of feminists exploring the role of values in science focuses instead on the distinction between legitimate and illegitimate uses of values, and also on the legitimacy of the values themselves.
Anderson argues that values are used legitimately when they are used non-dogmatically. As an illustration she offers an analysis of Abigail Stewart et al.’s (1997) research on divorce (Anderson 2004)—research that was explicitly guided by feminist values in a variety of ways. According to Anderson, the values that Stewart and her team of researchers brought to their investigation are of the sort that are answerable to empirical evidence—the evidence of emotional states.
Anderson examines how background values function at various stages of Stewart et al.’s research: the framing of research questions, the understanding of the objects of inquiry, the making of decisions about what data to collect, the generation and sampling of data, the analysis of the data including the choice of technique for analysis, decisions about when to end data analysis, and what conclusions are drawn. To illustrate, consider just one of these stages—the way that values enter into understanding the objects of inquiry.
In the case of studying divorce, there are a variety of such objects that need to be considered, but prominent among these are “divorce” and “family”. Stewart’s research team identifies these objects of inquiry as “thickly” described—meaning that values are incorporated into their descriptions. Anderson notes that, for example, Stewart’s team understanding of divorce incorporated different values than those used in Judith Wallerstein and Joan Kelly’s research (Wallerstein & Kelly 1980). For Wallerstein and Kelly loss and trauma are fundamental aspects of divorce. Stewart’s team, in contrast, took divorce to be a process of adjustment to a new state. On this alternate understanding divorce is not treated as a one-time event with an aftermath but rather as an ongoing life adjustment. This framing also treats the process of adjustment as open-ended allowing for both positive and negative effects. Wallerstein and Kelly’s framing of divorce as a trauma or loss calls for researchers to focus on the negative effects and so shapes the data collection. Both studies incorporate values, however only Stewart et al.’s values are explicitly acknowledged and self-consciously present and thus, open to empirical scrutiny.
Anderson evaluates Stewart et al.’s work as better science because it is more empirically adequate.
She argues that since Stewart’s conception of divorce allows for both negative and positive experiences to count as evidence of the effects of divorce, the way Stewart’s team conceptualizes divorce as an object of inquiry allows for a consideration of all of the evidence. Wallerstein and Kelly’s research focuses only on the negative effects and consequently is less empirically adequate. Thus Anderson argues that in this case the feminist values incorporated into the research produce more empirically adequate, and hence better, science. Anderson also notes that because the values in Wallerstein and Kelly’s account are not explicitly identified they are not open to empirical examination. They are consequently held dogmatically, whereas Stewart et al.’s are explicit and so open to empirical test. In this way, she argues that values are not problematic for science per se, but become problematic when held dogmatically.
Sharyn Clough also argues for a legitimate role for values in science, contending that they are subject to the same sort of empirical evidence that other beliefs are. She takes Donald Davidson’s account of belief formation as her starting point. For Clough, “some political claims (e.g., feminist claims) are better supported by empirical evidence than others” (2003b: 4). Sexist and racist values, for example, are not well-supported by evidence and hence science that is sexist and racist is clearly not good science (Clough 2003a; Clough & Loges 2008).
Clough agrees with Anderson that feminist values can improve science and offers an illustration in her analysis of research on the hygiene hypothesis—the hypothesis that increased levels of concern about sanitation and the consequent decrease in exposure to micro-organisms and pathogens is causally related to increasing rates of auto-immune disease and allergies, particularly in the industrialized nations of the North and West (Clough 2011, 2012). Clough explores this case from a feminist perspective noting some additional data related to gender—the affected populations (those suffering from allergies and auto-immune diseases) include a disproportionate representation of women and girls. Clough argues that the additional information that gender norms in the most severely affected societies generally require higher standards of cleanliness for girls than for boys is evidentially relevant since research shows that increased exposure to microbes in childhood increases immunity to pathogens in adulthood. Since early exposure to pathogens may decrease the incidence of allergies and auto-immune diseases, the higher incidence of these conditions among girls and women in cultures where the they are subject to stricter norms of cleanliness is predicted by the hygiene hypothesis. Thus this correlation can provide additional evidence for the hypothesis when gender is taken into consideration. Adopting the minimal feminist value that gender matters improves research in this case. These values increase the empirical adequacy of the account and thus improve the science.
For both Anderson and Clough the values incorporated into the science in this way are subject to empirical test as part of the theory as a whole. Since the research relies on those values, when the evidence supports the account as superior, it also confirms the values the account incorporates. The objectivity of science is not threatened by the inclusion of values since the account as a whole is still subject to empirical evidence.
Feminist radical empiricist holist accounts such as Anderson’s and Clough’s present challenges however. Solomon questions whether any single approach to values will be able to provide an account of the varied ways that they can function appropriately in science. She argues that values are not all of one type and consequently, when relevant (and she notes that they may not always be relevant) they may be relevant in different ways, playing different roles in knowledge production (Solomon 2012: 446). Audrey Yap worries that some values may not be sensitive to evidence in the ways that Anderson’s and Clough’s accounts would seem to require (Yap 2016). Other feminist empiricist approaches, such as Helen Longino’s contextual empiricism discussed briefly in the next section, may avoid these concerns.
The commitment to the objectivity of science and the association of objectivity with the value-free ideal are among the reasons many philosophers of science found it difficult to accept that feminist values can make a constructive contribution to science. But as Lloyd (1995) notes, the meaning of “objectivity” is complex, unstable and hence far from clear. In one philosophical picture, “objectivity” characterizes a relationship between knowers and reality-as-independently-existing; methodologically, the knower must be detached, because investment in a particular belief or attachment to a point of view (“bias”) “could impede the free acquisition of knowledge and correct representation of (independent) reality…”. On Lloyd’s analysis the problem lies with the claim that this “objective” reality—what she refers to as the “Really Real”—is “converged upon through the application of objective methods”. The Really Real can be known since it is publicly accessible to those who use these objective methods and who are properly detached or disinterested. As Lloyd points out, this view assumes (a) that the Really Real is completely independent of us; thus, (b) objective knowledge of this Reality requires an “objective method” characterized by detachment, because (c) attachment or point of view might interfere with our independence from the reality we wish to know, and (d) this reality is publicly accessible, if it is accessible at all (Lloyd 1995: 354–356). These assumptions are each problematic and this section and section 4.3 address them.
The first assumption, that the Really Real is completely independent of us, fails to acknowledge that in addition to “resistances by reality”, sociocultural factors are “necessarily involved in the development of knowledge and concept-formation”. Anthropologists are virtually unanimous in holding that “sex and gender roles lay the foundations of every human society’s other social practices”, therefore, any epistemology or philosophy of science that includes social interests and values as integral to the acquisition of knowledge should include sex and gender related values and interests (Lloyd 1995: 373 and 367–368).
Lloyd elaborates that when researchers investigate a phenomenon their goal is not only to represent reality, but to give a significant, that is, relevant, representation. Scientific accounts (theories and hypotheses) must focus on the parts of reality that are relevant to the interests (and values) that give rise to the research questions that motivate the research (2005: 244–245). While reality may be independent of us, our accounts of reality are accounts of the aspects of reality that matter to us and are shaped by the interests that give rise to our research programs. Additionally, the questions addressed through research arise, in part, from what is thought to be known at the time that the research commences, this means that part of the evidence for the account rests in that background knowledge. The ineliminability of values in both the background knowledge and the current projects challenges the traditional ideal of objectivity.
In addressing the question of objectivity, both Lloyd and Anderson make use of Hugh Lacey’s distinction between two aspects of the value-free ideal: neutrality and impartiality (Lacey 1999, 2–6). Neutrality is the requirement that scientific theories neither presuppose nor support any non-epistemic (moral, political, social, or cultural) values. Impartiality requires that theories be evaluated on the basis of evidence and the extent to which they exhibit other epistemic values (Anderson uses Kuhn’s 1977 list: empirical adequacy, consistency, scope, and compatibility with other established theories) (Anderson 2004: 3). Impartiality is not interest or value-free, but rather
a commitment to pass judgment in relation to a set of evaluative standards that transcends the competing interests of those who advocate rival answers to a question. (Anderson 1995b: 42)
Thus Lloyd and Anderson take impartiality to be the key feature of objectivity, as does Lacey (Lacey 1999: 78). However, as noted in section 4.1, Anderson takes at least some value judgments to answer to empirical evidence and so they may legitimately serve as part of the evidence for background theories against which evidence for hypotheses under consideration is evaluated. This realization forces a reassessment of the ideal of impartiality—background theories may affect our assessment of the evidence and so we must be prepared to determine when such influence is pernicious and when beneficial. As we have seen, Anderson makes the distinction by examining the extent to which values are responsive to evidence—that is, the extent to which they are held non-dogmatically. In order to meet the ideal of impartiality researchers must consider all of the evidence. Since some of the evidence is either value-laden or supports the values that direct the research questions, impartial science need not be neutral.
Much feminist work on values has been influenced by Helen Longino’s contextual empiricism (see the entries on feminist epistemology and philosophy of science, feminist social epistemology, and the social dimensions of scientific knowledge). Using Kuhnian arguments for underdetermination of theory by evidence, Longino argues that since empirical evidence can never fully determine that we should accept any particular theory, contextual values (social, moral, political, and cultural) may play a role in that determination by “filling the gap”—and thus Solomon refers to this version of feminist empiricism as “gap feminist empiricism” (Solomon 2012: 436). As a result, Longino emphasizes that evidence is relative to the contextual values against which the evaluation of the theory occurs. As a result, scientific theory is not neutral in Lacey’s sense; it presupposes certain social and political values that are among the background assumptions against which the theory is evaluated—its context. Hence scientific theory is not objective in the traditional sense that requires neutrality. For Longino, it is not impartial either since social and political values can play, and often do play, a role in theory acceptance.
Longino proposes an alternate understanding of objectivity. The social character of science provides the opportunity for “transformative criticism”. Such criticism requires the adherence to social norms: publicly recognized forums for the criticism of evidence, methods, and assumptions and reasoning; uptake of criticism, which requires that the community not merely tolerate dissent, but alter its beliefs and theories over time in response to the critical discourse; publicly recognized standards by reference to which theories, hypotheses, and observational practices are evaluated and by appeal to which criticism is made relevant to the goals of the inquiring community; and finally, communities must be characterized by tempered equality of intellectual authority (Longino 1993, 2002). When science is conducted according to these norms, Longino argues that it balances partialities and hence is objective to the degree that it fulfills these norms. But it is neither neutral nor impartial since scientific theory is informed by values that shape the context in which the relevance of evidence is determined.
4.3 Feminist Standpoint Theory
While there are various standpoint theories, the commonalities include endorsement of the following three theses: the situated knowledge thesis, the thesis of epistemic privilege, and the achievement thesis (Wylie 2003; Rolin 2009; Intemann 2010; Crasnow 2013, 2014). The thesis of situated knowledge is based in the understanding that knowledge is for and by a particular set of socially situated knowers and so is always local—a cultural/social/political “location” characterized by the power relations endemic in such settings. The differential distribution of power and differences in interests are closely related—and thus the questions asked and the features of the world that are relevant to answering those questions vary depending on location as well. Among the differences that are most salient are those that are in conflict with the interests of the dominant groups. Thus the metaphors of situated knowledge and social location give rise to one of the key ideas of feminist standpoint theory—the idea of the researcher as an insider/outsider who has “double vision”. She has access to the lived experience of those studied and the dominant culture of those who are doing the studying (the scholars). It is this double vision that aids in recognizing the limits of the dominant frameworks.
Patricia Hill Collins (1986), for example, advocates the use of standpoint to analyze race and class. She argues that the researcher who is marginalized may recognize that many of the concepts and procedures adopted by the discipline are problematic when her colleagues do not, precisely because she understands the objects of inquiry through her disciplinary research tradition and through her own experience occupying a marginalized social location. It is this double vision that makes the social scientist sensitive to the lines of fault that give rise to shifts in concepts and methods discussed in section 2 and section 3.
The thesis of epistemic privilege is one of the more contentious components of feminist standpoint theory. Many criticisms of the view stem from the mistaken understanding of epistemic privilege as automatic. As Intemann points out, if this had been feminist standpoint theory’s claim the view would be either trivial or false (Intemann 2010). But feminist standpoint theory is not committed to the trivial claim that only those who have had a particular experience know what that experience is like. Nor does it make the obviously false claim that any woman can automatically know about the experience of all other women. Such a claim would depend on a presupposition of some sameness of women’s experience—a presupposition that is not only false, but problematically so since it erases the differences that race, class, disability, sexuality, and gender identification make among women’s experiences.
Misunderstandings of the situated knowledge and epistemic advantage theses are partly due to two errors: thinking of them in isolation from each other and mistakenly taking them to be claims about individualistic knowledge. Feminist standpoint theory is not an account of how an individual acquires knowledge, but rather an account that treats knowledge as social. This point can be made more clearly by considering the achievement thesis—the idea that standpoint is not automatic and must be achieved. Harding distinguishes between a perspective and a standpoint in order to clarify this. First, feminist standpoint theory
intends to map the practices of power, the ways the dominant institutions and their conceptual frameworks create and maintain oppressive social relations. Secondly, it does this by locating, in a material and political disadvantage or form of oppression, a distinctive insight about how a hierarchical social structure works. (Harding 2004b: 31)
Harding goes on to point out that just recording what members of oppressed groups say is not adequate since they may have absorbed dominant understandings of the hierarchy. Standpoint requires the creation of a group consciousness, and this is not equivalent to the shift in perspective of an individual (Harding 2004b: 31–32). A change in the location of an individual automatically brings a different perspective, however the achievement of a standpoint requires working out where one is socially situated with others whose experiences come to be mutually understood as shared.
Harding’s account of what it is to achieve a standpoint thus emphasizes the deeply political nature of feminist standpoint theory. This characterization also makes clear the challenge that feminist standpoint theory raises for objectivity since both neutrality and impartiality are in tension with feminist standpoint theory. Since knowledge is situated, it is also always partial. Recognizing that some social locations provide epistemic privilege depends on acknowledging that partiality. Given this, it is not surprising that resistance to feminist standpoint theory has revolved around the way it has been perceived as a threat to the objectivity of science (Pinnick 2005).
Harding has addressed the concern about objectivity repeatedly, most recently in Harding 2015, through what she calls “strong objectivity”. “Strong objectivity”, calls for the subject of knowledge (the knowers) and the process through which knowledge is produced to be scrutinized according to the same standards as the objects of knowledge. The contextual elements that function as part of the evidence, the selection of problems, the formation of hypotheses, the design of research (including the organization of research communities), the collection, interpretation, and sorting of data, decisions about when to stop research, the way results of research are reported and so on need to be open to critical evaluation. But such evaluation requires that these contextual elements be accessible to researchers. The insider/outsider double-vision that feminist standpoint theory produces gives rise to the epistemic advantage through which researchers have this access.
…[A] maximally critical study of scientists and their communities can be done only from the perspective of those whose lives have been marginalized by such communities. Thus, strong objectivity requires that scientists and their communities be integrated into democracy-advancing projects for scientific and epistemological reasons as well as moral and political ones. (Harding 2004a: 136)
Alison Wylie (2003) offers an alternative account of how feminist standpoint can be understood to produce objectivity. Her approach is also characteristic of shifts in the feminist epistemological landscape that blur the lines between feminist empiricism and feminist standpoint theory (Intemann 2010). Wylie notes that “objectivity” is frequently used to indicate a relationship between theory and the world and so is identified as a property of knowledge claims. She proposes that we think about objectivity as the degree to which these claims conform to some standard set of epistemic virtues. She proposes empirical adequacy, explanatory power, internal coherence, consistency with other established bodies of knowledge, although she notes that some other such list might serve as well. These theoretical virtues are rarely, if ever, all maximized by any one theory. Consequently, researchers must make judgments about which virtues are most important at any given time for any particular knowledge project. These judgments depend on the interests, purposes, intentions, and goals of the researchers and research community, which can be seen as reflective of a standpoint. Consequently, feminist standpoint can improve objectivity through determining what sort of empirical adequacy, explanatory power, or other virtues are relevant for a particular knowledge project and the degree to which each is relevant.
On Wylie’s account, science is not neutral (values inform hypotheses and are implied by them), nor is it impartial, given that values determine which among the characteristics that determine objectivity are to be considered the most relevant for any specific knowledge project. But impartiality has not entirely vanished in that what counts as empirical is not determined by values, even though its relevance is. Those in positions of subordination have epistemic privilege regarding some kinds of evidence and its relevance, special inferential heuristics, and interpretative or explanatory hypotheses.
Both Harding and Wylie appeal to standards (epistemic values) that do not depend on any social/political (non-epistemic values) and yet their accounts accommodate social/political values and provide ways of understanding how such values play a positive role in knowledge production. Kristen Intemann (2010) has argued that refinements in both feminist empiricism and feminist standpoint theory have resulted in a convergence of the two approaches. She identifies three shared features: they are contextual, normative, and social. Feminist (holist) empiricism (both radical and gap empiricism) is contextual in that it takes background assumptions and beliefs within a particular context either as part of the evidence for a theory or as determining what counts as evidence. Contemporary standpoint approaches are contextual in that they point to social situatedness as a determinant of knowledge through the role that it plays either in revealing the evidence itself or the relevance of it. Both sorts of approaches are normative in their focus on the role of social, political, and cultural values for knowledge production, in specification of evidence, and in determining the ends or goals of science. Both are also social, focusing on the socio-political structure of the knowledge community. However, Intemann identifies two remaining areas of difference: feminist empiricism and feminist standpoint theory differ over the kind of diversity needed for objectivity and they differ over the role that non-epistemic values play in enhancing objectivity (Intemann 2010: 790). For the former, Intemann argues that standpoint’s understanding of diversity as social location offers a better grounding for a positive account of the role of feminist values in science than feminist empiricist approaches in that it better explains the significance of particular sorts of evidence and why it is relevant for some knowledge projects and not others. But the question of which knowledge projects are the ones that should be pursued remains. It is not enough to say “women’s knowledge project” since women form a heterogeneous and unstable group. That is to say, which characteristics—sex, gender, race, socio-economic class, ethnicity, sexuality, or differences in ability—matter will vary depending on context.
Sharon Crasnow (2013, 2014) suggests that while the interests of the heterogeneous group “women” are often in conflict, through conversation, negotiation, and political action shared interests can be identified and serve to provisionally stabilize evidential relevance relations around a particular knowledge project. She conceives of this process as part of what it means for standpoint to be achieved. Such an extension of feminist standpoint theory also suggests a connection with current research in social epistemology (see the entry on feminist social epistemology).
5. Queer Science Studies and the New Materialisms
Several ways of thinking about science that are closely related to or build on feminist perspectives have emerged in recent scholarship. Two of these will be discussed here. The first, queer science studies, provides an extension of feminist thought in that it challenges the traditional assumptions about gender, many of which are also targets of feminist work. Another, the “new materialisms”, challenges the idea that knowledge should be understood as representing passive matter, arguing that such an analysis is not sufficiently attentive to the material aspects of embodiment. These approaches are related to each other (and to feminist perspectives) in their focus on the embodied nature of human subjects, and the importance of lived experience as evidence (see also Biology and the New Materialisms).
5.1 Queer Science Studies
Challenges to assumptions about sex and gender and the role that they play in shaping both scientific research and what counts as scientific knowledge suggest that while feminist approaches start with an examination of these categories that very examination motivates fundamental rethinking of them. Just such a rethinking is taken up as an aspect of queer science studies. Queer science studies is queer both in its challenge to beliefs about what are “ordinary” or “natural” features of the world (beliefs about sex and sexuality, for example) and in its subject matter—behavior and subjects that have not traditionally been topics of science.
While queer perspectives are not equivalent to feminist perspectives—there are feminists who do not consider the gender binary to be a problem in itself, for example—they may nonetheless be thought of as extending approaches that feminists have taken to critiquing dominant assumptions about sex and gender. Queer studies does so more radically, however. Consider the distinction between sex and gender. The distinction arose as a way of separating biological characteristics through which humans are classified into sexes from social attributions through which they are gendered. Roughly, characteristics directly associated with reproduction or secondary sex traits were to be classed as the former whereas the social roles, clothing, and behavior associated with the different sexes were said to belong to the latter category. The idea allowed feminists to argue that biological distinctions should not determine social role—that biology was not destiny. Some feminists ultimately challenged the distinction in part because of the presumed “naturalness” of sex, its associations with a “natural” sexuality, and the recognition of the role that such assumptions play in science, including biology (ideas about reproduction) and scientific work on sexuality. In addition, the way social understandings of sex—beliefs about gender—shaped these sciences also has become clearer. (See the discussion in section 2.2.) Thus, in practice, ideas of sex and gender turn out to be difficult to separate. Although the distinction has not been without benefit—Deboleena Roy and Banu Subramaniam point out how the distinction gave rise to productive work countering claims of biological determinism by providing tools for discussing the social construction of the body, for example (Roy & Subramaniam 2016: 25)—it has problems as well.
Queer science studies have been more explicit about addressing difficulties with the distinction and the reasons for doing so. Of particular concern is the way medicine is implicated in the lives of intersex and trans individuals and the role of problematic assumptions underlying that medicine. Prominent among these are the assumptions that sexual identity is based in nature (biology) and also the belief that characteristics that are stereotypically identified with one or another gender are natural (based in biology). For example, Dussauge and Kaiser, voice such a challenge to the first of these and argue that it should be replaced with an understanding of sexual identity as constructed through “complex heteronormative power relations and sex/gendered norms” (Dussauge & Kaiser 2012: 122). This alternative framing encourages new approaches to scientific research from a queer perspective.
A recent collection, Queer Feminist Science Studies: A Reader (Cipolla et al. 2017), emphasizes the connection to feminism both in its title and in the editors’ introduction where the focus is on the dualisms that are part of the sex/gender framework (e.g., nature/culture, male/female, normal/deviant) and how they shape society and consequently the social practices of scientific research.
[W]e argue that queer theory sharpens feminist engagements with science by turning critical attention to the imbrication or dependence of center and periphery, inside and outside, natural and artificial, and normativity and deviance. Rather than being opposed, these terms are coentangled divisions produced through specific histories. Thus, there is now a rich array of queer work that contests the naturalization of the categories of normal and deviant sexuality and binarized notions of sexed anatomy, gender identity, sexual desire, and sexual identity. (Cipolla, et al. 2017: 12)
Anne Fausto-Sterling’s research on the historical emergence of the idea that there are two sexes exemplifies the kind of critique that informs queer science studies. She traces this particular binary to the increasing involvement of science in deciding the fate of intersexual individuals, beginning in the nineteenth century. This development was partly a result of the emergence of sexuality as a proper subject of scientific study at this time, coupled with a belief that science describes nature as it really is and hence should be appealed to when we were uncertain about nature. Fausto-Sterling identifies several questionable assumptions underlying this research. The first is that science is indeed able to provide objectivity on issues of sexual identity and sexuality. Second, that the classification of humans into two sexes is natural. The final assumption she identifies is that science will find this classification in nature through identifying the defining or essential characteristics of each of the two sexes.
Fausto-Sterling addresses each of these assumptions in turn. She argues that science does not provide an objective account of biological sex, since science is a social and historical human activity and many of the ways of thinking about sexuality and sexual identity were guided by pre-existing conceptions of gender (also see the discussion of objectivity in section 4.2). As an illustration, she examines the gendered understanding of female sexuality as passive and the way that understanding influenced the design of experiments meant to test the effect of sex hormones on the sexual behavior of rats (Fausto-Sterling 2000: 195–232). These hormones were themselves classified as male and female, in spite their having other functions besides those related to reproduction and in spite of their presence in both those identified as male and those identified as female. The results of these experiments were in turn used to make claims about behavior and sex in humans. This move is problematically circular and additionally depends on analogical reasoning to human sexual behavior from the behavior of rats.
As for the other two assumptions, that there are only two sexes and that they are to be identified through essential characteristics, Fausto-Sterling points out that the idea that there are only two sexes should be rejected on the basis of two sorts of evidence, social and scientific. The social evidence indicates that there are cultures that recognize more than two sexes and the evidence from science indicates this as well. In addition, various different forms of intersexuality belie the notion that there are two mutually exclusive and jointly exhaustive sexes (Fausto-Sterling 2000: Chapter 4). The belief that there are essential characteristics that are identifiers for each of the two sexes is rejected through similar arguments. Fausto-Sterling’s discussion is in the context of the harms done to intersexual persons—usually as infants who are unable to make choices for themselves—and so her concerns focus on the injustice done in the name of a science that fails to examine these assumptions.
Sarah Richardson’s work on the human genome also illustrates the problematic intertwining of assumptions about gender and research on sex (Richardson 2013; section 2.2). In a 2012 article, she focuses on how the X chromosome came to be identified as “female”—something that happened in spite of the anomalous presence of male sperm genes on X chromosomes and the fact that males also have X chromosomes (Richardson 2012, reprinted in abridged form in Cipolla et al. 2017).
Fausto-Sterling and Richardson provide examples of the sort of thinking that queer science studies is engaged in. The challenges to traditional understanding of sex, sexuality, gender, gender identity, what is natural and what is cultural, what is normal and what is deviant seek to disrupt conventional thinking and approaches. Insofar as sexist thinking is conventional, it too will be challenged.
5.2 The New Materialisms
Much of the feminist work discussed thus far has focused on how the world is conceptualized—that is, various different ways of representing what is studied and the effects of these different representations. The new materialisms challenge this emphasis on representation, arguing that it treats matter as passive and that this sort of analysis is not sufficiently attentive to the material aspects of embodiment. As Pitts-Taylor puts it, “matter matters”. As part of the corrective she proposes that science studies take the following steps—some of which we have already seen in some of the feminist work discussed. The first is breaking down the distinction between the social and biological by recognizing how they are intertwined. The second involves documenting the way the biological can be shaped by human needs which are in turn shaped through modes of power. Finally, she proposes rejecting dominant dualisms of the sort that queer science studies challenges (Pitts-Taylor 2016b: 1).
Although Pitts-Taylor recognizes these moves may grow out of feminist approaches to science, the new materialisms are also critical of some feminist thinking about science, claiming that science is too often recognized as an instrument of oppression, but not engaged with sufficiently to support the development of feminist science. The new materialisms note that this is particularly true of feminism’s lack of engagement with the physical sciences—those areas of science concerned with the basics of matter.
Karen Barad’s work seeks to correct this, developing a view that she calls it “agential realism”. For Barad,
phenomena are not the mere result of laboratory exercises engineered by human subjects; rather, phenomena are differential patterns of mattering (“diffraction patterns”) produced through complex agential intra-actions of multiple material-discursive practices…. (emphasis in the original).
Such patterns may or may not involve humans, however these practices constitute “boundaries between humans and nonhumans, culture and nature, science and the social” (Barad 2007: 140).
Barad’s metaphor of “diffraction patterns” is taken from Donna Haraway (see particularly Haraway 1992), who proposed diffraction as an alternative to the metaphor of reflection. While both are optical metaphors, Barad notes that reflection emphasizes sameness and so evokes essentialism—the discovery of what is the same in what is under investigation. Diffraction is about differences and moves the researcher towards tracing the histories of these differences, rather than fitting them into preconceived binaries (Barad 2007: 29–30). Barad describes this process of knowing the material world as “intra-action” rather than interaction. In doing so, she emphasizes that agency is not an attribute—something that someone has—but rather is the involvement in the iterative practices that constitute materiality (Barad 2007: 178). For Barad this intra-action entails the inseparability of science, ontology, epistemology, and ethics and hence the pun on “matter” that runs throughout the new materialism. Our practices matter both in the sense of making a difference and in the sense of being involved in the configuring and reconfiguring of the material world.
6. Recent Areas of Study: The Brain and Human Behavior
The work in the previous sections has focused primarily on examples of feminist perspectives in biology and the social sciences. This may not be surprising since in much of biology, sex is relevant and thinking about sex has been among the issues that feminists have explored. The social sciences examine various aspects of society and the way gender structures society has again been a major concern for feminists. Barad and the new materialists suggest ways in which feminist (and queer) critique can be extended to the physical/material sciences. There are other areas of scientific research that have also drawn the attention of feminists however. Two of particular interest are neurofeminism which focuses on sexism in the study of the brain and feminist critiques of the closely related field of cognitive science.
The development of neuroscience in the twentieth and twenty-first century resulted in feminist examination of these fields—particularly in connection with cognitive science and research on differences in the brains of men and women (Bluhm, Jacobson, & Maibom 2012; Fine 2010; Pitts-Taylor 2016a; Jordan-Young 2010). Feminist work in this vein approaches neuroscience in ways similar to the approaches described in the previous sections. It involves investigating sexist bias through examining background assumptions and other means through which such bias could enter, as well as identifying background beliefs that shape research.
It may be somewhat misleading to treat neuroscience as a new area of interest from a feminist perspective. As Bluhm, Jacobson, and Maibom point out,
Feminist neuroscientists were among the first to critique androcentric theories and assumptions in their disciplines,…. (Bluhm, Jacobson, & Maibom 2012: 6)
However, the twenty-first century has seen substantial advances in neuroscience and cognitive science coupled with new tools for studying the brain. These advances have been accompanied by worries about how androcentric assumptions have persisted in research and how they manifest in the use of new ways of investigating the brain, such as fMRI.
One research area that has attracted feminist attention is the study of sex differences in the brain. There is a considerable range of work that might qualify under this heading. As an example, Rebecca Jordan-Young’s book Brain Storm: The Flaws in the Science of Sex Differences (2010) focuses on a dominant approach in that area of study which she dubs “brain organization research”. She argues that the main theoretical framework guiding sex difference research is that
prenatal hormone exposures cause sexual differentiation of the brain—that is, early hormones create permanent masculine or feminine patterns of desire, personality, temperament, and cognition. (Jordan-Young 2010: xi)
The prenatal hormone exposure referred to here is the flooding of androgens during fetal development prior to which the there is no sex differentiation between fetuses. The organizational hypothesis is that this same infusion of androgens that determines differential reproductive development also determines brain development and ultimately differential brain structure in males and females. Jordan-Young is particularly interested in how conclusions are drawn about sexuality from brain organization research. Her main concern about the uncritical use of the hormonal theory of brain organization is that alternative hypotheses—specifically the hypothesis that social factors, expectations, and learned behaviors play a role in brain organization—fail to be considered adequately.
As Jordan-Young acknowledges, most brain organizational researchers claim to be interactionists—that is, they recognize that social factors play some role and that both hormones and society affect the brain. However, she argues that their accounts are typically additive rather than truly interactive, with the hormonal influence acting first and social influence coming in later. Additive accounts treat the causal factors as separable whereas a truly interactive account would not do so. Jordan-Young credits Doell and Longino’s work on the topic with having pointed this out decades ago (1988: 59).
The failure to question organization theory is one point of Jordan-Young’s account, but she also considers other assumptions about hormones, the relationship between sex and gender, and sexuality. Specifically, in considering other assumptions about hormones, she notes that the understanding of steroid hormones from the onset of this research was that some were masculine and some feminine. (For this account she relies on the work of Nelly Oudshoorn (1994)). Further, she argues that thinking of hormones in this way—as androgens (male hormones) and estrogens (female hormones)—is not without problems for researchers that make these assumptions, since both types of hormones are present in both males and females—an anomaly the approach does not account for (see also section 5.1). She identifies this as a failure to take into account evidence that does not fit with the prior interpretation of hormones as sexed. Thus features of accounts depending on organization theory appear to be both value-laden and held dogmatically.
Jordan-Young is using patterns of feminist critique similar to those described in previous sections. She interrogates unexamined assumptions, traces the ways in which those assumptions shape the understanding of the objects of inquiry and determine what will count as evidence. She reveals the line of thought from the assumptions—the conceptualization of hormones as sexed—to understandings of the world that are problematic including conclusions about sexual desire, sexual orientation, and “sex-typed” interests and behaviors.
6.2 Cognitive Science
The last of these brings us to cognitive science, which focuses more specifically on connections between the structure of the brain and behavior—such as career choices. Arguments from brain differences to a differential ability of men and women when it comes to math and science (see section 1.1) are not unusual. Such moves and the scientific research on the brain that surrounds them have led Cordelia Fine to identify these approaches as part of a pattern that she calls “neurosexism” (Fine 2010). Simon Baron-Cohen’s work provides an example (2003) in that he connects the different structures of the brain with behaviors that are identified as specifically male or female. His argument relies on combining two theoretical tools—brain organization theory and evolutionary theory. The resulting evolutionary psychology seeks to give an account of differences in the behavior of men and women that result from the different adaptive pressures that males and females have had to face (the evolutionary portion of the argument relies on Darwinian sexual selection). The sexual differentiation and brain differentiation go together to produce differences in brains adapted for different reproductive roles. In Baron-Cohen’s account, these different adaptive pressures result in a female brain that evolved for empathizing with others (E brains) and a male brain that evolved for systematizing (S brains).
Again, this sort of approach relies upon organizational theory, which is not critically examined, and is extended to non-reproductive behavior, such as the ability to do science—an ability claimed to be greatly diminished in the sex that (on average) does not have a systematizing brain. The fundamental point that these approaches are resistant to the consideration of alternatives is at the heart of this feminist critique.
Additionally, there is some dispute about whether the claimed sex differences in behavior are real. As examples, Grossi and Fine challenge the claim that mental spatial rotation skills are superior for males. Recent evidence suggests that when girls and women practice spatial rotation, say through video games, the differences in performance rapidly disappear (Feng, Spence, and Pratt 2007). Similar arguments can also be made about empathizers. Sex differences in language proficiency tend to disappear as children grow older. There are also reasons to doubt the accuracy of the tests used to produce evidence of cognitive sex difference given that not all methods of testing produce the same results (Grossi and Fine 2012: 78). Finally, when there does seem to be evidence of sex differences in behavior these differences are highly sensitive to the social context. Girls whose performance is poorer on math tests when they are reminded of their gender, do better when gender is made less salient (see the discussion of stereotype threat in section 1.1).
Feminists have offered several other lines of response to claims that differences in brain structure and behavior are linked. Letitia Meynell argues that the illusion of transparency in brain imaging through fMRI and the consequent understanding of these images as objective evidence disguises the ways they are read and interpreted through our already existing notions of gender (Meynell 2012). Ginger Hoffman (2012) appeals to the plasticity of the brain and a truly interactive understanding of the relationship between the brain and the social environment in which it functions to challenge the idea that observed differences in brain structure indicate immutable differences between the sexes. Victoria Pitts-Taylor (2016a) argues for understanding the brain as both biological and social—shaped by its bodily/social presence in the world.
These last points reinforce that the assumptions underlying the critiqued accounts (e.g., that organizational theory is correct, that hormones are sex hormones) are held dogmatically. It is worth noting that this is not an idle claim—these assumptions can be and have been investigated. For example, the assumption about the “maleness” of testosterone and its causal relation to certain “male” behaviors is challenged by recent research that indicates that engaging in stereotypically male behaviors (making movements that are associated with wielding a sword) can increase the production of testosterone in both males and females (van Anders, Steiger, & Goldey 2015). This sort of research lends plausibility to a more interactive account and erodes a sharp distinction between biology and society.
In spite of the wide-range of topics covered in this entry—from equity issues, philosophy of science, queer science studies, and neuroscience—the focus has been incomplete in its focus on feminism in the global North. The entry thus fails to fully represent feminist perspectives on science. It is more accurate to describe it as presenting some feminist perspectives on science. Those that are presented here have been important to those working in these traditions and to some degree they include elements that have informed other feminisms, but not all. An example of the sort of work that has not been considered is research on colonial, postcolonial, and decolonial science studies (see Harding 2017 for an example of the last). And, as Uma Narayan has pointed out, because western feminist philosophers of science have so often targeted the value-free ideal associated with positivism (see section 4.2), they sometimes fail to see the usefulness of that ideal for nonwestern feminists who may use it as a tool to challenge, for example, oppressive religious values within their own culture (Narayan 2004: 216–217). Another area of interest also not addressed here is data science and questions about how power hierarchies are often reinforced through the categories and algorithms used in the collection and interpretation of data—including but not limited to gender classifications (D’Ignazio & Klein 2020). There is also an increasing body of work on the intersection of sex/gender, race, class, and how science is implicated in the oppressions such intersections support. Also missing are discussion of disability and its problematic intersection with science, as well as reproductive technologies and feminist concerns (for example, see de Melo-Martín 2017).
The result is that the entry provides background, but there is much more that could be said and those interested would do well to begin with the additional readings. What is covered here only gives a starting point from which to investigate the many ways in which power, sex/gender, sexuality, and science are intertwined.
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