Freedom of Association

First published Fri May 3, 2019

In almost all our activities, we engage with other people, usually in persistent connections or associations that vary according to our purposes. We have foundational associative experiences within our families; formative years of schooling with peers and teachers; workplace links with bosses, employees, and colleagues with whom we share at least corridors, carpet, and resources; and connections with like-minded companions, such as fellow hobbyists, devotees, friends, or union members.

Some of our associations are voluntary, such as a typical friendship. Others are non-voluntary, such as the childhood family or institutional environment in which we are born and raised. Some of our associations offer lasting connections with specific people, such as, usually, our parents, children, spouses, and colleagues. Others are looser affiliations with people we may not know directly, based on common identity, history, or ambition, such as a national club, a student union, the “Republican base”, the “American people”, the Jewish community, and Christians. Some of these latter affiliations stretch the notion of an association into a metaphor, but they highlight that associations are defined by people having a common purpose. That common purpose is sometimes the association itself: many of our intimate associations exist for their own sake, that is, for the sake of associating with one another. Other times, the common purpose is a further, independent goal, such as financial success, worship, recreation, achievement, joint self-expression, or political control.

This entry surveys several philosophical debates about the nature, scope, and value of our freedom to associate with other people in these different ways as well as our freedom to dissociate both from particular people and from people in general. Key questions concern, first, our degree of freedom to decide who is in and who is out: When may we refuse to associate with other people? When may we leave the associations we are in? When may we deny someone membership in our association? When may third-parties, such as the state, sever, compel, or intrude upon our associations? Second, key questions concern our degree of freedom to decide what to do as associates: What level of control should we have over the internal workings of our associations, especially if those workings harm either members or non-members? To what extent may we radically reshape, and thereby redefine, the associations we are in?

The answers to these two sets of questions will provide a unifying analysis of the vast and seemingly disparate array of associations to which we can belong. The analysis will explore the phenomenology of different kinds of associations, from the intimate world of family life to the detached relations among strangers that define citizenship. The analysis will assess the meaning, function, and value of freedom of association within this comprehensive image of associative life.

There are several different frameworks through which to assess the value of association and freedom of association. Kantians would emphasize the importance of securing equal external freedom for individual citizens, something which the state can help to secure by hindering those who would hinder others’ freedom. Rawlsians would highlight that freedom of association, like other basic rights and liberties, has a certain priority in political reasoning and cannot easily be defeated by countervailing considerations (Quong 2011: 15; cf. Moles 2014: 85–103). In a Rawlsian framework, the scope and limits of freedom of association are justified with reference to what we need in order to develop and exercise what Rawls calls the two moral powers (which are, first, the capacity for a sense of justice and, second, the capacity for a conception of the good) (Rawls 1993: 19–20). This entry will take a broader view of freedom of association, focusing on the diverse range of associations we can have, and highlighting, specifically, the array of social goods that our associations can make available to us.

This entry begins with a taxonomy of different ways of associating and the related phenomena of interacting and assembling (§1). It then elucidates the general apparatus of rights, duties, and freedoms that underpin different associative contexts (§2) before homing in on three rights in particular—the right to exclude (§3), the right to exit (§4), and the right to organizational autonomy (§5; White 2013)—distinguishing between the rights of individuals vis-à-vis groups, and the rights of groups qua groups. The entry connects individuals’ associative rights to other rights that contain associative aspects, such as freedom of expression and freedom of religion. The entry discusses groups’ associative rights in relation to kindred, collective, and national freedoms, such as national self-governance and immigration control, exploring how these latter freedoms connect to the wider framework of associative freedom. Examining states’ rights to exclude and self-govern is necessary here since some philosophers invoke a parallel between individuals’ associative freedoms and states’ rights in order to defend comprehensive state rights to exclude. The entry also assesses the importance of associative freedom relative both to competing rights (such as positive rights to inclusion, care, and companionship) and other values (such as equality and state interests).

1. Kinds of Associations

In taxonomizing the different associations to which we typically belong, we should note the contrast drawn in the literature between intimate associations and collective associations. This contrast is somewhat forced since, in reality, these association types are fluid. First, our various collegial, fraternal, romantic, political, creedal, professional, recreational, and philanthropic associations can have both intimate and collective aspects (Alexander 2008: 13). Falling in love at work or at school can change the meaning of those associations for the people involved. Second, all consequential associations—be they intimate or collective—are sites in which our beliefs are formed and their expression germinated (Shiffrin 2005: 841). Third, interesting contrasts—such as the contrast between voluntary and non-voluntary associations or between hierarchical and non-hierarchical associations—cut across any distinction we might draw between intimate and collective associations. Both non-voluntary associations and hierarchical associations are to be found in intimate settings, educational settings, and national settings, to name just a few, and these have constitutive power over the ways we view our lives (Walzer 2004: 1–20). Finally, a key argument for protecting associations—that they help to safeguard our individual freedom—applies to all manner of associations.

Consequently, our associations are possibly better understood as falling along a continuum that ranges from the more intimate and non-instrumental at one end to the more impersonal and instrumental at the other (Brownlee 2015: 269). Despite this fluidity, the distinction between intimate associations and collective associations remains useful since it identifies the central function of a given association. For instance, while it is possible to meet our spouse at work and to form friendships at work, doing these things is not the primary function of work environments and workplace associations. The fact that workplace settings can serve this secondary, or unintended, function of fostering intimate ties should not dictate or, in some cases, even influence the forms that workplace associations take. Hence, this entry retains the traditional contrast between intimate associations and collective associations in order to highlight the conceptual and normative issues that are particularly salient to specific paradigmatic forms of associations.

1.1 Intimate Associations

Paradigmatically, our intimate associations with friends, family, and loved ones are persistent, meaningful connections marked by frequent direct interactions animated by affection, interest, care, concern and love. As such, they form a core part of our lives. A central feature of such associations is that they exist for the acts and goods of the associations themselves, rather than as instruments for public expression or further advantage. As Justice Douglas says of family in Griswold v Connecticut, “It is an association that promotes a way of life, not causes” (381 U.S. 479 (1965)).

Families are often held up as the paragon of intimacy, love, and affection. Throughout human history, our spousal, parental, and sibling relations have been our primary forms of association. However, love and affection need not be the principal reasons for forming families. Security, financial advantage, and avoiding worse alternatives can all be reasons for us to marry and form families. Nonetheless, when children are raised in families conspicuously lacking in love and affection, children are denied the kinds of associations that are vital to their present well-being and their emotional, social and cognitive development (Liao 2006; 2015: ch. 3).

Friendships are also important parts of our childhood and adult experience. Without them, we struggle to discover, shape, and pursue our ideas of what constitutes a good life. But, again, friendships can take many forms for many reasons, not all of which are grounded in mutual affection and convivial warmth (Aristotle, Nicomachean Ethics, Book VIII). Friendships can be rooted in mutual advantage, status, and convenience.

As this implies, the “ways of life” afforded to us by our intimate associations can lack emotional intimacy. When they do lack it, the qualifier “intimate” is a placeholder for our “personal”, “individual”, or “dyadic” associations, rather than a description of the quality and value of our associative bonds. Given that emotional closeness—true intimacy—is an important part of our well-being, its presence or absence can identify the limits of the rights, powers, and duties we have within our intimate associations.

1.2 Collective Associations

“Collective” is a catchword for a smorgasbord of associations, from chess clubs, to trade unions, churches and businesses, which are usually not dyadic, and which have a primary function other than associating as such. We can distinguish different collective associations according to their primary functions, again recognizing that a given association can perform multiple functions, including those functions closer in spirit to intimate associations.

Educational associations are an important early form of association outside the family and perhaps, more than any other, illustrate the fluidity of associational types. Children associate non-voluntarily with teachers (hierarchical) and with peers (non-hierarchical), and thereby learn many of the social skills needed to make good on their rights of association within the wider world. School is most often assessed with a view to its important instrumental purposes, particularly for future, work-related imperatives, but is equally a site of often intense and long-lasting intimate relationships.

Expressive associations aim to give a larger microphone to a set of people than they would have individually, and can thus often serve to check the powers of other associations, interest groups, governments, and state bureaucracies (Craiutu 2008: 266–7). Expressive associations include not only advocacy groups and civil rights groups, but also segregationist groups and xenophobic groups. Examples of expressive associations include the ACLU, the NAACP, Amnesty International, the LGBTQIA community, the NRA, and the KKK. In addition to lending people a larger microphone, such associations can also serve a simpler, cathartic or identify-affirming function, enabling members to solidify through joint expression their sense of what they value (Farber 2001: 1494ff).

Recreational associations for the joint enjoyment of hobbies are not paradigmatically expressive, but instead are pleasure-oriented or progress-oriented. The members of a chess club do express a fondness for chess, but the primary function is to play and learn about chess, not to express that fondness.

Commercial and professional associations often consume more time in our day than our intimate connections do. Work associations can include collegiate relationships, trade unions, guilds, networking groups, and business groups. Such connections are almost invariably shaped by important associative asymmetries between employees’ and employers’ rights to decide about membership and associative activities (White 1998: 337).

The free association of producers, as it occurs in Marxism and some anarchist literature, points to a variation in the idea that employees have associative freedom, highlighting a deeper critique of the very concept of freedom of association. Given that work is, for most of us, an associational form of activity that we are compelled to undertake—on pain of potentially severe suffering—and over which we often have little control, Marxists wonder how free we can really be in our associative decisions (Gorz 1997 [1999]; James 2017: 285).

Intentional communities sit somewhere between clans and neighborhoods and nations. Such communities lack the organic spontaneity that usually typifies residential communities. Instead, these communities arise when people with similar interests, ideologies, and concerns come together to share those things in substantial ways. Often this sharing has an ecological aspect, as with communes, or a concern with security and property values, as with gated communities (Low 2003: 151–172). But, it can also be enacted by far-right political groups looking to preserve racial cultures which they perceive as under threat by the majority culture.

National and state associations, like our childhood family environments, are non-voluntary. We are born within a nation or state’s jurisdiction, and are compelled to associate at some level with the other people who fall under that jurisdiction. If we have adequate resources, we may leave. But, we will only end up within the circle of another such association (Dworkin 1986: 192–193). Similarly, if we are forced out, we will find ourselves within another state’s jurisdiction. Our state or national associations inevitably impact on our other associations, the social norms that define our families, the associative interests we develop, and the patterns of socialization we undergo at school, in churches, in clubs, and at work (Walzer 2004: 14–15). Moreover, the ways that nations and states are organized, being defined with and restricted by borders, limits who we, as employers, workers and potential partners, get to interact with and who gets to interact with us (Carens 1987: 253; Kukathas 2005: 210).

1.3 Related Phenomena: Interactions and Assemblies

Our persistent associations differ from, but intersect with, our practice of engaging in ordinary interactions with each other and our practice of assembling together.

Interacting: Interactions of some sort are a pre-requisite for associations. Two “friends” are hardly friends if they opt never to interact with each other when they could. Within large collectives, of course, many members won’t know or interact with each other at all. But, each member must interact with some other member for them to count as a member and for their collective to count as an association. Interactions are also a domain of interpersonal engagement unto themselves apart from associations. Our average day is full of incidental interactions with strangers and non-associates, on buses, in the streets, in parks with children, and in buying milk from the local shop. These micro-moments of connection constitute a significant portion of our experience of living together with other people (Fredrickson 2013: Part I; Speck 2012: 49; Cacioppo & Patrick 2008: 237). While philosophers tend to focus on larger-scale, substantive and active forms of association, they have reason to analyze as well the ambient sociability (or lack of it) that is available to us within our general environment, and the ways that our incidental interactions (or lack of them) can resonate with the rest of our associational life. For example, the phenomena of “neighborhood effects” on voting behavior, our attitudes to strangers, and our own self-esteem, are important in thinking about the associative value in our routine connections that fall short of thicker forms of association (Sampson 2011). These interactions and the incidental communities they create provide resources that can build up to, and support, the more substantive goods that flow from meaningful association (Fleischacker 1998: 273; Fredrickson 2013: Part II). Importantly, the quality and number of these incidental micro-interactions is subject partly to our control. We limit our opportunities for such moments if, for example, we choose to shop online, to commute alone in our car, or to retreat into a gated community with vigorous vetting processes for residents.

Assembling: Association and assembly are often discussed in the same breath. International agreements such as the Universal Declaration of Human Rights (UDHR) (Article 20.1) lump the two together to declare that “everyone has the right to freedom of peaceful assembly and association”. Commentaries on the drafting of the UDHR acknowledge that drafters conjoined these two activities in a single Article because drafters were thinking principally about how to protect political associations such as trade unions (Scheinin 1999: 418–419). Subsequent international agreements such as the International Covenant on Civil and Political Rights enumerate our rights to association and rights to assembly within different Articles. One reason for this could be to acknowledge that assembling is but one activity in which certain associates might partake and, equally, it can be done by people who are not associates. Assembling can be both a product of, and a Petri dish for, intimate and non-intimate associations. A second reason to divorce assembling from associating is to recognize properly that associative freedom includes intimate associations as well as collective and expressive associations (Scheinin 1999: 420). Assembling has political connotations. We prefer to speak of family members or congregations “gathering”, for example, or to describe an audience as being together “in attendance” (though we do speak of school “assemblies”). “Assembly” we tend to reserve for activists, protesters, town hall members, or lobbyists. In politics, people assemble in a physical space (we do not (yet) speak of people “assembling” on social media) usually to empower themselves individually and collectively, and to make non-participants aware of their energy, numbers, and intentions (Graeber 2013: 35–54).

2. Kinds of Freedoms

Section 1 above focuses on the nature and value of different kinds of associations, within the home, at work, in the marketplace, at places of worship, and in the pub or club. It does not distinguish associating from the freedoms to associate and dissociate. Here, §2 explores the nature of our associative freedoms, while §3, §4, and §5 explore these freedoms’ forms, force, and value, as well as their various limitations.

Prominent liberal philosophers such as John Stuart Mill defend a broad notion of freedom of association. Freedom of association is, for Mill, one of the core domains of individual freedom. Mill says that we have the freedom, in combination with other people, “to unite for any purpose not involving harm to others: the persons combining being supposed to be of full age and not forced or deceived”. He also says that we have “…the right to choose the society most acceptable to us”, free from government interference (Mill 1859: ch. IV). The other core freedoms he identifies are (1) freedom of thought, conscience, opinion and feeling, that is to say, complete control over our own inner domain of consciousness; (2) freedom of expression in speech and writing; and (3) freedom to shape our own lives according to our tastes and pursuits in line with our character and inclinations; he embraced the idea that we engage in different “experiments in living”. Unlike freedom of thought and opinion which are largely immune to Mill’s “very simple principle” which we now know as the harm principle, freedom of association is subject to this harm principle that we are permitted to interfere with someone’s conduct only to prevent harm to others.

Mill’s strong endorsement of associative freedom leaves many questions unanswered since it pertains only to consenting adults acting with full information. As §1 makes clear, many of our core associations have a different structure, as we could not consent to them. Especially in early childhood, we do not choose, though we often come to embrace, our familial arrangements. Also, many of our closest, familial associations can produce some often-unintended harm to others, since these associations are necessarily exclusive and, hence, disregard non-members’ associative needs. Moreover, Mill’s endorsement of free association among consenting adults may be too strong. Not all mutually consensual associations can be protected by freedom of association. Some consensual associations—such as a violently abusive marriage which neither spouse wishes to leave—do not automatically fall under the gaze of Mill’s harm principle, since his principle makes space for action that does affect other people with their free, voluntary, and undeceived consent and participation (Mill 1859: ch. I). But, such connections are too morally opprobrious to merit protection from third-party interference.

Many contemporary moral and political philosophers analyze our individual rights and freedoms with a conceptual apparatus developed by Wesley Hohfeld (1919), who identified eight normative positions which together make four pairs of correlates and four pairs of opposites. Claims correlate with duties. Liberties (or permissions), which are the opposite of duties, correlate with no-claims. Powers correlate with liabilities. And, disabilities, the opposite of powers, correlate with immunities, which are the opposite of liabilities. Using this Hohfeldian terminology, freedom of association can refer to any one of the following positions and its correlate:

  1. Permission: We might be at liberty, i.e., have a moral or legal permission, to associate or dissociate with other people. When we have a permission to associate with, or dissociate from, someone, we have no duty not to act, and, hence, correlatively, other people have no claim upon us that we act otherwise. Moral and legal permissions do not always go hand in hand. An adult might have a legal permission to marry a child, but he has no moral permission to do so.
  2. Claim-right: We might have a moral or legal claim-right against others interfering with our conduct, which issues in a protected sphere of action to associate with, or dissociate from, people in certain ways even if we commit moral wrongs by doing so. When we have such a claim, others have a duty not to interfere, and may have a duty positively to protect our sphere of action.
  3. Power: We might have a moral or legal power to alter our associative status in relation to other people. The power to join an association can produce new rights and duties, or remove previously valid rights and duties. When we marry someone, we exercise a power to alter both their normative status and our own by creating new claims, rights, duties, and powers. As parents, we have the power to decide whether our children will be friends with other kids. If we divorce, we exercise a power to alter our children’s associative position in relation to us and possibly each other. When we have such powers to affect others’ normative associative position, they have a liability to be affected by how we use our power.
  4. Immunity: We might have a moral or legal immunity against other people exercising their rights to association or dissociation in ways that would alter our associative status. When we are immune, other people are disabled from exercising a power over us (Brownlee 2015: 271; 2016a: 362). For instance, once we mature, our parents no longer have the power to decide whether we’ll associate with certain people or not.

This Hohfeldian apparatus can be used to assess the specific rights that comprise our freedom of association. These specific rights can be parsed as the right to exit, the right to exclude, and the right to organizational autonomy. Since our permissions, claim-rights, powers and immunities shift depending on the type of association under discussion, these rights will be discussed in connection with the different associational types outlined in §1.

Importantly, these three rights—to exclude, to exit, and to exercise organizational autonomy—do not include a positive right to associate. These three rights all presuppose, however, that we already belong to at least one association, since these rights can only be exercised from within associations. If someone is excluded from all associations, then the above framework does little to guarantee her any of the goods of associational life. The rights of association are important because they allow us some degree of control over how our lives go. However, precisely because the focus of these rights is our interpersonal relations, they can have the consequence of comprehensively excluding some people. There is, thus, an important tension between freedom of association and other possible goods of association. In getting to grips with this tension, it is necessary to assess the impact of employing the rights to exclude, exit, and exercise organizational autonomy across the different associational forms outlined above.

Sections §3, §4, and §5 consider, respectively, the content of the rights to exclude, exit, and exercise organizational autonomy, followed by considerations of possible limits to these rights which are necessary to protect or advance other values.

3. The Right to Exclude

3.1 Intimate Associations

At some level, we must be able to exclude others from our associations, especially our intimate associations: Families wouldn’t be families if the competent members couldn’t exercise some control over membership. Moreover, family members as individuals would lack all manner of meaningful personal freedoms if they could not control at least their own membership. Traditionally, and in many families today, not all competent family members enjoy equal power to determine membership. Patriarchs have long controlled who is welcome within the family: for instance, casting out children who failed to meet some standard of virtue. Denying other competent family members (equal) say over membership has far-reaching implications. As much feminist literature confirms, to have even minimal control over their bodies and their lives, women need a right to exclude, where that includes the right to refuse a marriage proposal, the right to access contraception, the right to divorce, and indeed the right to choose not to spend private time with certain people (Baylis and McLeod 2014). Arguably, both women and men also need a positive right to reproductive assistance where that includes meaningful rights to try to include new family members, namely rights to try to bear children or to adopt children. Taking these rights seriously means recognizing that they are all concomitants of freedom of intimate association (Karst 1980; Mill 1859).

Limits to intimate exclusion

A given family member’s rights to exclude must, however, be checked by other family members’ rights to retain membership and, indeed, checked also by some non-members’ rights to be sufficiently protected and cared for. First, parents have duties to ensure that their children are adequately associatively-embedded, especially if they’re not going to be primary carers themselves. Even with the parents involved, there may be good reason to mitigate parents’ “monopolies of care”, by requiring state-funded early-years childcare. Such mandatory childcare would reduce parents’ abilities to control the terms of familial association, in effect obliging them to permit state intervention at the level of the household (Gheaus 2018: 60).

Second, divorcing spouses cannot excuse themselves from all duties to their former partners, especially if that partner is caring for their children. There are, and should be, limits on the impact they can have on other family members’ associations with each other.

Third, more contentiously, families might also have duties to look to the associative needs of people who are bereft of close connection, for example by fostering vulnerable children or housing refugees. In crises situations such as the Blitz in Britain, many families living outside targeted areas were recruited to house evacuees, sometimes for the duration of WWII. Given the urgency of the situation, these families contributions are plausibly described in the language of duties and rights rather than that of supererogation. Our “obligatorily gregarious natures give us basic needs to be with other people, especially when we are highly dependent or vulnerable” (Cacioppo & Patrick 2008: 52). Put more strongly, our deep social needs identify a potential limit both to our freedoms of association and dissociation and to our control over the terms of our associations, to guarantee the goods of association to everyone when they need them (Liao 2015: ch. 3). A person shunned by everyone when everyone exercises their right to exclude is denied these important goods (Brownlee 2016b). These basic needs demand association with others, and this claim-right might override others’ permissions, claim-rights, and immunities to refuse such association.

Technology or the market might provide a way for us to “have our cake and eat it too”, as they might offer us the means to navigate simultaneously the often painful, boring, frustrating and demanding labor of carrying out our associative duties and maximizing our associative freedoms. For example, in a situation where robots could be programmed to simulate, approximate or perhaps even surpass in some ways, the kinds of reactions and behaviors typical of human beings, we can ask whether this could effectively replace the need for humans to take on such work. In Japan, for instance, some care homes have robots that can mimic human responses—tilting heads to express sympathy, blinking to indicate receptiveness—which are being used to comfort lonely people, in lieu of their absent children or partners. In Japan again, busy adult children can hire actors to visit their aging parents, instructing the actors to pretend to be them. By doing so, both sides—children and parents—can perceive this as an effective means of negotiating filial duties. Can such practices—technological or market-based—meet our basic associative needs while also maximizing our associative choices, meaning that we get to spend time only with those people with whom we really want to spend time? Or will such replacements inevitably fall short and, worse, eventually change the meanings of what it means to care, such that we, in the words of Sherry Turkle, come to expect more and more of technology and less and less of each other (Turkle 2011)? These thorny questions may become easier to answer as the relevant technologies and market initiatives come into their own.

3.2 Collective Associations

The importance of exclusion goes beyond the intimate settings of the family and friendships. It is also an integral part of collective associations. For a devotional community, recreational club, business club, union, or even nation to be what it is and to represent particular values, beliefs, or interests, it must be able to determine, at least broadly, the criteria by which members are selected. This fact has limited states’ rights to interfere with certain groups’ decisions about membership (Gutmann 1998a: 6). However, the purposes of an association are open to reasonable disagreement, and this often necessitates judicial interpretation and decision (see Roberts v. United States Jaycees 468 U.S. 609 (1984); Dale v. Boy Scouts of America 530 U.S. 640 (2000); Johnson 2001: 1641ff; Linder 1984).

One approach is simply to collapse all distinctions among different types of collective associations: associations are associations regardless of whether they are primarily expressive, commercial, or creedal, and they should enjoy an absolute right over whom to admit, for whatever reason they decide (Epstein 2008: 155). On this view, a nation, sports club, church, or business should devise its own rules on who is in and who is out (Lomasky 2008: 184–186). One argument for such a strong right is that only near or absolute freedom to exclude people adequately honors the great, inherent value of free association as something integral to the lives of free human beings (Kateb 1998: 37).

But, there are dangers in thinking that the right to exclude remains the same, or even looks similar, across all forms of collective association. Exile from a nation differs radically from exclusion from a sports club, which in turn differs markedly from ex-communication from a devotional community. A second approach interprets the scope and value of the right to exclude according to the primary goods and functions served by the relevant kind of association.

Expressive associations are distinct for several reasons. First, they are intertwined with other basic rights of expression such as freedom of speech and freedom of religion (UDHR Articles 18–19). A creed’s right to exclude people, sometimes cashed out in terms of shunning, where excommunication involves being excluded from familial associations as well (Greenawalt 1998: 142) is often justified in the name of worshipful or spiritual identity (i.e., the right of the Jews to be “separate” or view themselves as “chosen”, the right of the Catholic Church to refuse to appoint women as bishops) as well as the secondary functions of a creed to promote common identity, enhance internal harmony, expand the flock, raise funds, and gain further insight (Kymlicka 1995; Taylor 1995). The limits of creeds’ rights to exclude (or expel) are usually found in their harmfulness to non-members, whose interests, when push comes to shove, must take priority, in the name of equality of moral worth (White 1997: 383ff; Fine 2010: 352–3).

Second, expressive associations “are credited with enhancing the quality of democracy by cultivating citizenship and promoting open fora for public deliberation and self-government”, opening up a “parallel polis” through a “plurality of non-state social groups”, by which the state can be kept in check and its powers limited (Craiutu 2008: 263–4; Levy 2014: 27). Put differently, one core function of many expressive associations or “intermediate” associations is to check the power of the state. Intermediate groups give people an alternative to acting through the state. They enable people to act in concert and thereby more easily resist the wrongful threats to personal freedom that governments can pose (Levy 2014: 1). An important part of preserving this function of such associations is for a citizenry to become accustomed to the art of association, and to join with like-minded people in the pursuit of what they perceive, in competition with others, as the common good. This can only occur when groups are allowed to exclude people who have different understandings of that good. In other words, to create genuine space for democratic dissent, groups must be allowed to exclude people based on a principle of expressive discrimination: such “expressive exclusion” sits at the intersection of speech, association, and democracy (Bedi 2010).

Third, expressive associations also have a role to play in increasing the various “experiments of living” to which people have access. A plurality of opinions, creeds and ideologies increases the chance that people will find ways of life that suit them (Mill 1859: ch. III). The diversity of ways of life that is fermented by allowing groups to exclude people who fail to conform to their way of life, is something which also has collective value (Galston 1995: 523). However, Seana Shiffrin has argued for an alternative emphasis. In responding to Dale v The Boy Scouts of America, in which the right of the Boy Scouts to exclude James Dale because of his homosexuality was upheld, she suggests that we should think of such associations less in terms of the messages they express to others, i.e., that the Boy Scouts as an institution does not endorse homosexuality, and more in terms of the space that associations provide. Specifically, associations offer a space for a person

to control what influences she is exposed to, to what subjects she directs her mind, and whether she, at all times, directs her mind toward anything at all or instead “spaces out” and allows the mind to relax and wander. (Shiffrin 2005: 841; cf. Farber 2001)

If we are constantly exposed to people or subjects with which we are unfamiliar or uncomfortable, or reminded of lifestyles or values that unsettle us, then a prime function of association is being upset. Of course, as we will see below, this associative protection might have adverse effects on other kinds of associative duty.

Commercial associations vary from direct, tight-knit teams to looser, long-distance networks. Commercial enterprises have as their main purpose making, providing and selling goods and services to make a profit. Employers have an interest in excluding people whom they regard as incapable of doing the job well because their work won’t be profitable. For the same reason, employers can have an interest in excluding rabble rousers who aim to mobilize an otherwise compliant workforce. Employees may well take a different view of their own interests with respect to their share of the profits, the optimum patterns of inclusions and exclusion within the enterprise, and the degree of control they should have over shift-patterns, workload, and working conditions (Nichols & Armstrong 1976: 82).

The differences in bargaining power between employees and employers have led, historically, to the formation of particular kinds of associations within the workplace. Trade unions form to protect employees’ position vis-à-vis their bosses, and thereby introduce some parity between these groups. In industries where conflict between capital and labor is pronounced, this can also issue in the right of unions to operate closed shops. In other words, anyone wishing to take employment must join the relevant union and, thus, employers can be denied access to potential employees who refuse (White 1998: 346–347). Here then is a group right to compel association amongst a set of people—with possible provisos for conscientious objectors—to achieve the overall good of this associational form, which is to make good on workers’ basic rights (Rosenblum 1998; cf. Moreno 2008). However, implicitly, these mechanisms assume a particularly adversarial understanding of economic relations, such that granting people this kind of group right can serve as a self-fulfilling prophecy, exacerbating what might otherwise be congenial and mutually beneficial employer-employee relations. On such a view, the state might have to prevent freedom of association among the owners of capital, leading us into situations of monopoly. But, beyond those kinds of provisions, the state should avoid interfering with the spontaneous orderings that emerge from unimpeded association (Lomasky 2008; Epstein 2008; cf. Brody 1992 [1994: 386]).

Expressive and commercial associations are but two paradigms of collective associations. The arguments for their right to exclude—such as First Amendment-style rights or democracy in the case of expressive associations and bargaining power within an adversarial relationship in the case of unions—do not readily apply to the activities of other collective associations such as recreational groups, national groups, or cultural groups, which do not necessarily qualify as expressive associations.

Recreational associations: Members of a recreational group like a chess club have interests in excluding people who would join without any intention of learning about chess or playing chess, but with the (admittedly bizarre) desire to disrupt other people’s enjoyment of the game. Minimal rules of inclusion are likely to refer to basic decency and decorum: a club might exclude people who swear profusely during matches or react badly to losing. The right to exclude ensures the group can pursue such values as teamwork, competitive advantage, cohesiveness, autonomy, self-determination, and self-respect (McKinnon 2000: 498). In certain cases, a group may also wish to see a traditional pursuit continue because it is in danger of not having enough adherents. Yet, the group might desire not just that the pursuit survive, but that it survive for their group. They might exclude some would-be participants so as to ensure the activity is pursued by their specific community only. Were the practice to survive because of an increase in adherents outside this group, this might—in the minds of members—be a less valued, even worthless result. Among other things, the group might regard the pursuit as a uniquely powerful means by which to bond together. This wish, though understandable at one level, becomes especially troubling if exclusion is rooted in bigotry. The limits of such groups’ rights to exclude turn largely on potential harms to non-members.

Cultural associations: Like commercial associations, cultural associations vary from tight-knit clans to loose, anonymous collectives. Cultural groups, sharing a common history, ethnicity, language, and set of traditions, typically have distinct, persistent ways of life. The Romani people, whose lifestyle is traditionally nomadic, are an example. Histories of colonization, conquest and annexation have destroyed many such groups’ ways of life. Many countries have laws banning, or hindering, a nomadic existence. However, though ravaged, the cultural practices and associational forms that make sense of members’ conception of the good often remain in force. By preserving the associational forms of life that are organic to different communities, including their political decision-making procedures and their patterns and practices of inclusion and exclusion, these cultural practices can also be made sustainable (Kymlicka 1995).

National and state associations: Given their size and nature, states and nations seem to be peripheral examples of associations. Nonetheless, if they are stable and enduring, they tick many of the boxes of meaningful association by offering a persistent, exclusive social context laden with common purposes that heavily inform our sense of identity. States use borders and border-control to exclude non-members from their territories and to prevent them from acquiring membership (Dagger 1985; Goodin 1988; Mason 1997: 442). Borders limit the associative rights of people both within and without states’ boundaries. Such exclusion might be necessary to preserve a form and quality of citizenry-association that is conducive to a functioning political community. Of particular importance might be the need to sustain those forms of solidarity necessary to underpin social welfare provisions (Miller 2016: 27). However, such exclusion can find its limits when it bumps up against the basic human rights of would-be immigrants. A state must justify its exclusionary practices before it can justify treating its members better than it treats non-members. If a state denies someone membership unjustifiably, it cannot appeal to that person’s non-membership to justify treating her less well than it treats its members (Frick forthcoming).

Limits to collective exclusion

Meeting Basic Needs: As noted above, our freedom to associate (and disassociate) can often prevent particular people from enjoying the goods of association since a person’s positive right to associate is shaped partly by other people’s desire to associate or not with her. For some associations, this is not always problematic. Friendship, for example, operates according to a mutual desire to spend time together. Where this is lacking, a desire for the friendship to be sustained, even from the person scorned, will likely, though not always, dissipate. Unrequited love is another matter altogether. But, nobody believes that requiting love should be imposed on anyone (though other associative duties might nonetheless emerge, perhaps with the end of letting the rejected person down gradually).

However, in certain contexts, our right to refuse to associate is highly morally complex, such as when, for example, the excluded person has a legitimate interest in the set of non-associative goods that we are denying her by excluding her. Take for example the right to education. The Little Rock Nine who were turned away by National Guards at the doors of their school were primarily after a set of goods, the value of which had nothing to do with association (Baldwin 1958). The associational aspect was of little importance to either the students or their parents. Their right to an education and its opportunities conflicted with the alleged dissociative and expressive rights of the people who sought to deny them access to those goods. Here then, freedom of association was not really what was at stake. Rather, the association was the means (more rightly perhaps, the cost) of claiming some other kind of right. The same principles can be applied to cases where someone seeks employment amongst people with whom she would otherwise choose not to associate (cf. Lomasky 2008: 193ff).

Take as another example the purposes served by recreational clubs. Should chess clubs be allowed to discriminate based on gender, for example, in a boys’ club that deprives interested girls of the opportunity to learn amongst peers and mentors, especially if no other chess club exists for girls to join? To suggest that the interested girl is always free to set up her own chess club without trained mentors misses the point that chess is a game we learn best from people already schooled in the activity and its tradition, and this can often require resources to which she as an individual simply does not have access (MacIntyre 1981 [1985: 194]). Given persisting biases about whether girls can play chess well, a girls-only club, staffed by female mentors and peers, would be less problematic than a boys-only club—although there remain practical questions about how, in any given community, these are to be encouraged, established and maintained. But, if perceptions changed such that society came to doubt boys’ ability to play chess at the highest levels, then girls-only clubs would be more problematic than boys-only clubs. All that said, new associations sometimes do form in reaction to the perceived prejudices of existing groups. In the wake of Dale v The Boy Scouts of America, new Scouting groups developed with more inclusive membership policies and more liberal ideas about who can be a leader. While these groups might lack the historical prestige of the Boy Scouts of America, they at least solve the problem of scarcity.

Take as a final example asylum seekers’ fundamentally important needs for assistance. Should nations’ interests in self-governance take priority over such seekers’ basic needs? Given the intensity and severity of their needs, asylum seekers’ rights arguably take precedence over national interests in restricting people’s rights to free movement and association (Miller 2007; cf. Wellman 2008: 109). On the ground, this means that states must process applications of those asylum seekers who have reached their jurisdiction. But, they do not have to open their borders to every person anywhere in the world who is seeking refuge. Moreover, they may be able to meet their obligations to such people without admitting them to their own territories.

Associative Aspects of Other Personal Freedoms: When our right to exclude people prevents them from exercising other personal rights and freedoms, such as freedom of speech, freedom of religion, and rights to educational opportunities, then a tension arises between these competing freedoms. If someone is excluded from well-resourced groups because of the color of her skin, then her ability to develop her “political opinions, engage in literary and artistic pursuits and other cultural, economic and social activities” (UN Human Rights Council resolution 15/21, preamble) is undermined. Ensuring that her rights to equal respect, consideration, and fair opportunity are secured means protecting her from unjust discrimination by checking others’ rights to be exclusive (White 1997: 383ff).

In commercial domains, businesses can form, or refuse to form, associations with certain customers through commercial exchanges. A business might assert a right not to engage in certain kinds of exchanges with customers: the Christian owners of the Ashers Bakery in Northern Ireland refused to bake a cake with a slogan supporting gay-marriage. Their objection, they said, was to the message for the cake, not to the customers requesting the cake. By contrast, a black photographer might assert a right to refuse a commission to photograph a Neo-Nazi group that is holding a conference on their views. In that case, her objection would be both to the message and to the customers seeking her services.

Compelling State Interest I (Equality): The state has a compelling interest in ensuring that its citizens have access to those goods that allow them to participate fully in the life of the community. As such, the state has its own claim-rights and powers grounded in these interests. Women’s rights to gain access to the privileges and advantages bestowed on members of commercial institutions, ethnic minorities’ rights to live in safe neighborhoods irrespective of what local neighborhood associations might fear (Anderson 2010), children’s rights to attend properly equipped schools despite the racial prejudices of other students or their parents, and the rights of traditionally excluded groups to have employment opportunities, all count as state interests that are compelling enough to limit our rights to be exclusive.

Another potentially compelling interest we have is in being protected against the consequences of membership in our own associations. There is a tension, for instance, between the demands a community makes of its citizens and the impact that parental authority can have on children’s ability to learn about those demands. Focusing on the case of Wisconsin v Yoder (406 U.S. 205 (1972)), which ruled that Amish parents’ constitutionally protected freedom of religion allowed them to take their children out of state education after the eighth grade, Richard Arneson and Ian Shapiro note that these parents’ wishes to remove their children from school after the eighth grade might interfere with their children learning about the civic duties necessary to be effective members of the wider political community, rendering them ill-equipped to participate in that community. In such cases, Amish children’s associative rights and concomitant duties as US citizens are adversely affected by their parents’ desires to sustain their own associative preferences (Arneson & Shapiro 1996; cf. Galston 1995: 518–520). More broadly, we can speak of children having a right to an “open future”, which includes rights to freedom of association. As Joel Feinberg puts it, a proper education “equips the child with the knowledge and skills that will help him choose whatever form of life fits his native disposition and mature disposition” (Feinberg 1980 [1992: 84]). This open future, with its range of associative opportunities, is effectively foreclosed when a child is removed from a sufficiently advanced, formal education.

If the imperative to keep a child’s future open is not weighed appropriately against parents’ rights to influence their child’s development, oppressive consequences can follow. In Xinjiang province in North West China, the state has taken active measures to prevent young people from the Uighur majority from engaging in Islamic practices, forbidding people under 18 from entering Mosques and preventing them from using their native tongue in classrooms. In defending these policies, the Chinese state argues that it does this both to prevent what they perceive as the threat of terroristic activities (see d) below) and to keep open children’s possibilities to grow up with a more open future than they would have if they are inculcated in traditional Islamic practices. We can test the credibility of such defenses, specifically as they relate to threats of terrorism, by examining the community history, attitudes, and general behaviors of the people who are denied access to those religious practices.

Compelling State Interest II (Keeping the Peace): Exclusion can serve the development of associations which make it their target to destroy the state and the social peace. Terrorist groups for example will exclude people who are unsympathetic to the violent means they advocate, even though they may share doctrinal or creedal similarities. Exclusion here thus allows particular beliefs and intentions to thrive unchallenged. Such exclusion conflicts also with both other people’s general rights to associate as they please and the other goods that social peace makes possible. As a result, a “compelling state interest” can prevent certain associations from forming or staying together. In some cases, the state has a compelling interest to compel, i.e., force, associations, such as those achieved through desegregation, even when desegregation can (and historically did) trigger violent responses. In other cases, the state might claim that it has a compelling interest to prevent the free associations of, for example, communists or anarchists of various stripes (Hook 1953; Whittington 2008).

However, in connection with this “keeping the peace” interest, an array of other interests can be served or hindered when we seek to justify state action against particular associations. For instance, states and power-players sometimes use accusations of “moral disorder” and “threats of anarchy” against workers assembling for their rights to vote. Matthew Arnold’s reaction to the 1866 Hyde Park demonstrations, for instance, described such demands as “tending to anarchy” and called that order be imposed on such assemblages for the sake of civilization (Mitchell 2003: 13–14). Perception is an important part of “keeping the peace”. Where a group of people perceive another group as a threat, keeping the peace might involve appeasing them in their false picture of reality. Alternatively, other people might view seemingly disruptive associations as agitating for a more just political settlement. What this shows is that an association’s intentions always come with a certain level of opacity, which complicates the task of adjudicating between legitimate and illegitimate exercises of associative rights. It also complicates the task of drawing the limits of those rights: When struggles ensue between certain groups and the state, the state often uses intrusive tactics to render those groups’ aims transparent, such as police infiltration, surveillance, discrediting, and disrupting, to manage, undermine or destroy such organizations. How we judge these state measures will ultimately depend on the seriousness of the perceived threats that these groups pose.

4. The Right to Exit

Notwithstanding the threats posed by certain freely formed groups, the right to exclude is grounded in the belief that, for our associations to be valuable, they must be freely chosen in some measure (Kateb 1998: 36). However, since not all associations operate according to either implicit or explicit declarations of consent, exactly what counts as consent is a difficult thing to assess: How do we know when association is free (Okin 2002)? This problem is exacerbated by the hierarchical form that many associations take. The paradigmatic example of a hierarchical association is that between parents and children. But, hierarchy pervades other connections—between older and younger siblings, employers and employees, states and citizens, and spouses. For some, the fact of acquiescence is sufficient for consent: if a person remains in an association, then she seems to provide evidence that she consents to continued membership. Regardless of how high the cost of leaving an association might be, the person who remains does not exercise her right to exit, which she meaningfully has so long as she is not being physically restrained, and, thus, she is properly describable as free (Kukathas 2003: 113). According to this line of thought, a wife who is psychologically tormented by her spouse, suffering from extreme poverty, and terrified by the outside world as an inhospitable place, remains free to leave her husband.

For those who doubt that this extreme view is persuasive, the question becomes how to make rights of exit realistic. Galston identifies four conditions for a meaningful right to exit: knowledge, capacity, psychological independence, and fitness. The first condition refers to brute awareness that alternatives exist; the second refers to an ability to assess those alternatives; the third to freedom from pernicious forms of brainwashing and freedom to act on the results of that assessment; and the fourth to the ability to move into and participate in other forms of life (Galston 1995: 525). When these conditions are met, we can conclude that the person has a meaningful right to exit, and the association passes a threshold that should be acceptable to liberals. Such conditions show that in many fundamental associations, such as young children’s family arrangement, it makes no sense to talk of a right—a freedom—to exit. Children are liable to the associative powers of their guardians, and usually this serves their best interests.

In the case of employer-employee associations, the right to exit merits special attention since, for most of us, work is something we have to do, though we have varying degrees of control over the kinds of work we do and, consequently, the people with whom we do it. When our choice is between doing truly awful work and starvation, our options are severely limited. If we must—on pain of severe privation—say “yes” to dirty, dangerous, dull, or degrading work, then we lack a meaningful option to exit. On this view, genuine, or even minimal, freedom of association at work requires that we have the ability to say “no” to all and any work (Widerquist 2013; Pateman 2007).

In the same way that we have limited exit-rights in our work lives, we have limited exit-rights in our political lives as members of states and nations. As noted above, we cannot exit entirely from the realm of state jurisdiction. We will always fall within the jurisdiction of some state. And, to have a meaningful right to exit any one state’s jurisdiction, we must meet, if not exceed, Galston’s tests of knowledge, capacity, independence, and fitness. In a nutshell, we must not only have the resources to leave, but also be sufficiently appealing—or be in sufficient need—that another state will accept us.

Limits to the right of exit

The points above note some of the physical and psychological limits to our rights to exit. There are normative limits to these rights too.

Supporting Dissent: The rights to remain: Over and above questions of when exit is truly available, we can ask why excluders and people who push “exiters” out by imposing enormous costs on them to stay, should have so resounding a say on cultural and group organization. For instance, instead of focusing on the importance of women having the freedom to exit from their home, community, or culture, we could focus instead on securing them a significant voice within their family’s or culture’s formations and practices (Okin 2002: 207). For example, we could focus on why devout Catholic women who care deeply about their Church are denied a significant role in the ecclesiastical affairs of that group, for no reason other than their gender. For another example, we could ask why empirically dubious claims about homosexuals’ inability to lead should prevent people like James Dale from becoming Scout masters. By focusing on the right to exit as an adequate measure of an association’s members’ freedom, we ignore the goods that could be captured, and the justice done, by instead strengthening people’s rightswithin an association, which could force change from within. Undeniably, this argument that people be supported to remain must be qualified, since it invites the state to dictate both the membership and the internal rules of associations (an issue explored below).

Responsibilities to Dependents: In family life, caregivers have responsibilities to dependents, both young and old, which can limit their rights to exit from those family connections. Even when caregivers do successfully pass the caregiving torch to others, by outsourcing or formally transferring care duties, they usually cannot release themselves from all associative responsibility, but must pay financially for the care of their (former) associates. Additionally, if we adopt a strong view of the binding force of vows and promises, then caregivers lack the same kinds of exit rights that non-caregivers have, or at the very least caregivers do serious moral wrong when they assert their exit rights.

Importance of Education: As noted above, parents’ desires for their children can often conflict with the important forms of socialization that children usually experience at school. The United Kingdom and France offer two different approaches to how far parents’ control should impact on children’s educational experiences. France, with an undergirding principle of laïcité, offers an especially restrictive understanding of how far freedom of association may impact on the curriculum, dress code and purposes of education (Laborde, 2006; Galeotti, 2002: 115–137). At the other end, the UK’s support of religious schools, although somewhat restricted with respect to curriculum, permits broader scope for freedom of association. That said, both the UK and France, like most jurisdictions, limit children’s own right to exit from school before they reach a certain age of maturity. Whichever of these two educational strategies contributes best to forms of association more conducive to democratic citizenship is preferable in that respect to alternatives. This is potentially not a question that can be answered without attending to the economic, historical, and social fabric of the community in question.

Lifestyle Decisions and Social Good: Members of gated communities exercise both rights of exit and of exclusion: they leave behind the communities to which they did belong, often with the express intention of withdrawing contributions to which they believe their former communities have no entitlement. They also, as a community, then decide on who gets to live in their newly formed communities. Indeed, the two rights, exit and exclusion, often exist either in tandem or as a fall-back. When parents remove their child from a desegregated school, their lack of a right to exclude prompts them to exercise their presumably less preferred option of exiting.

When people are segregated from one another for whatever reason, there can be important reasons to limit their freedom of association, to encourage social mixing across class and race lines among other things. When people employ their rights of exclusion and exit too readily, and for reasons that conflict with equal citizenship, a society may need to resort to socially engineering certain forms of association, such as mixing rent-controlled and private housing, and shaping social space to encourage interactions among people of different races, ages and classes. If trust is a necessary feature of democratic life, then the citizenry’s habits and living patterns become an important resource. To generate this resource, a society must attend to the concrete spaces of interaction wherein trust, rather than distrust, is more likely to emerge (Ryan 1998: 322). A community divided into gated communities, racially-segregated suburbs and stigmatized ghettos is ill-equipped to provide space within the wider political association for trust to emerge (Anderson 2010: 34; Allen 2004: 165).

5. The Right to Organizational Autonomy

The right to organizational autonomy intersects with both the right to exclude and the right to exit since, typically, associates want not just to do certain things together, but to do those things with certain people and not other people. Indeed, in the eyes of many associations, the things they do wouldn’t be those same things if they couldn’t exclude unwanted people from joining them, or if they couldn’t exercise control over their own participation.

Maintaining rights to organizational autonomy does not necessarily issue in liberal practices (Alexander 2008: 14). The right of the family to operate, unimpeached, according to patriarchal values, the right of unions to maintain hierarchical decision procedures, and the rights of churches to refuse women access to positions of authority, are all consequences of those associations being allowed to shape their organization without outside interference. These rights find their limits when they do indefensible harm to members, particularly to those members who cannot consent.

Focusing on mutually voluntary associations, what kinds of associations do we have the right to consent to join? And, what kinds of conduct do we have the right to engage in as associates? For instance, can we have a right to voluntarily become a slave and our associate the master, an association that would deny us all prospects to make other associative decisions even if our master treats us kindly? Less radically, do we have a right to consent to harmful relations, such as sadomasochistic sexual relations, or to life-threatening connections, such as a marriage with a highly contagious asymptomatic carrier of typhoid or a marriage with a person who suffers from psychopathy? Our answers will depend partly on how we conceive of autonomy. If autonomous agency cannot be self-negating, then we cannot voluntarily enslave ourselves or enter self-destructive relations. But, if we can autonomously do things that eliminate all prospects for future autonomous agency such as seek voluntary euthanasia, then why could we not autonomously form associations that do or threaten the same thing?

Consent can do the work to protect the internal operations of many associations, even when the associates pose severe risks to each other and to themselves. But, there will be natural limits to these rights of organizational autonomy, despite worries about paternalism.

Limits to the right to organizational autonomy

When associations lack full rights to exclude or exit, they will inevitably lack full rights over their organizational autonomy. For many years, orchestras have been required by convention to have candidates audition behind a screen to ensure anonymity. The result has been that orchestras have hired far more musicians from traditionally under-represented groups than they did previously. In the eyes of defenders of an all-male preserve like the Vienna Philharmonic (which delayed admitting women as full members until 1997, far later than any other leading orchestra), this changes the character of the enterprise, and, some would say, costs it the vital comradery and cohesion necessary for great orchestral work. Unsurprisingly, leading orchestras have found that wonderful work can be produced by a diverse company of musicians. What matters is the performers’ musical ability and their ability to work well together. Their gender and ethnicity are, or should be, irrelevant to those things.

In other spheres, however, features such as sex, gender or nationality are not irrelevant. A Taiwanese students’ club at an American university might accept, or be required to admit, non-Taiwanese students who are interested in that country. But, if non-Taiwanese students make up the majority of the club members or are running the show, this will undoubtedly change the club’s character and possibly compromise its intended organizational identity.

As already noted in connection with the right to exclude, the state’s compelling interests can justifiably limit associations’ rights to organizational autonomy (Johnson 2001). In some respects, state interference with organizational autonomy is inevitably going to be more complex than state interference with associations’ efforts to exclude people: Here, the state is not simply refusing, for instance, to give schools permission to bar students of color. Instead, the state is setting down limits to how far a group can decide to organize itself. When the state gives an organization a quota that dictates how many women or people from different ethnicities it must include, the state then insists on particular patterns of inclusion. Quotas might thus be taken as an instance of the state attempting to achieve more substantive forms of integration. For instance, insisting on the inclusion of sufficiently large numbers of women in political parties and representative bodies can aim to improve the democratic credentials of an overall institutional structure (Phillips 1998; Mansbridge 1999). Similarly, having a quota for the number of corporate board members who must be women, 40% in the case of Norway, can aim to achieve greater integration as well as better working conditions for all women. In another example, the US government worked to create less segregated schools, with programs such as Moving to Opportunity (MTO), and more integrated neighbourhoods, with Chicago’s Gautreaux Program. Such actions can be described as attempts to bring about certain patterns of inclusion and connection within especially formative associations, even though they sometimes go against the wishes of some participants (Anderson 2010: 119–120).

A potential limit to this imperative is presented by Tommie Shelby, in explicit response to Elizabeth Anderson’s argument for integration. Shelby suggests that, in deeply unjust societies, ghettos perform important survivalist functions for their residents. They are spaces in which people can nourish a sense of community and a feeling of security from the familiarities of their own space, against a seemingly hostile outside world. To expect these residents, as Anderson does, to integrate into white neighborhoods is to potentially sacrifice those goods in the name of correcting for wider injustices, for which these people are not responsible. Even if additional (though, empirically, potentially spurious) access to a wider field of social capital can become available by integrating, the people most burdened by injustice should not have to make additional sacrifices in order to amend those structural failures (Shelby 2016: 49–79). Here, the freedom to associate, and the functions served by already existing associations, are given priority over the possibly beneficial associative relations that could be developed once existing associations are weakened. In addition to this freedom of association against interferences from the state, Shelby also describes the associative duties and solidarities that come with living in and belonging to ghetto communities (2016: 61).


This entry has distilled from the vast array of associations to which we belong a taxonomy that highlights paradigmatic forms of association while noting how those forms overlap with each other. The entry details the values protected by the rights to exclude, to exit, and to exercise organizational autonomy, while also noting how, only by limiting these rights, can other specific values, goods, and rights be achieved.

The values of association go far beyond what can be captured by reference to freedom of association and the rights and duties that give shape to this freedom. Given our constitutive sociality, we are creatures that come together with one another for all sorts of reasons: some good, some benign, and some nefarious. By looking to the wider field of values and functions performed by association, we can situate freedom of association within a proper appreciation of the complex realm of associative life, and thereby gain a full sense not only of the value of this freedom, but also of why such freedom might need to be limited in order to pursue other values. Some of these alternative values will also be associative in nature (such as ensuring simple connection to other humans, free or otherwise) and some will go beyond associative values altogether, to include the values of security, equality or economic efficiency.


  • Alexander, Larry, 2008, “What Is Freedom of Association, and What Is Its Denial?”, Social Philosophy and Policy, 25(2): 1–21. doi:10.1017/S0265052508080163
  • Allen, Danielle S., 2004, Talking to Strangers: Anxieties of Citizenship since Brown v. Board of Education, Chicago: The University of Chicago Press.
  • Anderson, Elizabeth, 2010, The Imperative of Integration, Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.
  • Aristotle, Nicomachean Ethics (various editions).
  • Arneson, Richard and Ian Shapiro, 1996, “Democratic Autonomy and Religious Freedom: A Critique of Wisconsin v. Yoder”, in Political Order, Ian Shapiro and Russell Hardin (eds.) (Nomos 38), New York: New York University Press, 365–411.
  • Baldwin, James, 1958, “The Hard Kind of Courage”, Harper’s Magazine, October: 61–65; reprinted as “A Fly in Buttermilk” in his 1961 collection of essays, Nobody Knows My Name, New York: Dial Press; reprined in turn in his 1998 Collected Essays, Toni Morrison (ed.) (The Library of America 98), New York: Library of America, 187–196.
  • Baylis, Françoise and Carolyn McLeod (eds.), 2014, Family-Making: Contemporary Ethical Challenges, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199656066.001.0001
  • Bedi, Sonu, 2010, “Expressive Exclusion: A Defense”, Journal of Moral Philosophy, 7(4): 427–440. doi:10.1163/174552410X535062
  • Brody, David, 1992 [1994], “The Breakdown of Labour’s Social Contract”, Dissent. Collected in Nicolaus Mills (ed.), Legacy of Dissent: 40 years of writing from Dissent magazine, New York: Touchstone Books, 371.
  • Brownlee, Kimberley, 2015, “Freedom of Association: It’s Not What You Think”, Oxford Journal of Legal Studies, 35(2): 267–282. doi:10.1093/ojls/gqu018
  • –––, 2016a, “Freedom of Association”, in Kasper Lippert-Rasmussen, Kimberley Brownlee, and David Coady, (eds), A Companion to Applied Philosophy, (Blackwell Companions to Philosophy), Chichester, UK: Wiley, 356–369. doi:10.1002/9781118869109.ch25
  • –––, 2016b, “Ethical Dilemmas of Sociability”, Utilitas, 28(1): 54–72. doi:10.1017/S0953820815000175
  • Cacioppo, John T. and William Patrick, 2008, Loneliness: Human Nature and the Need for Social Connection, New York: W.W. Norton.
  • Carens, Joseph H., 1987, “Aliens and Citizens: The Case for Open Borders”, The Review of Politics, 49(2): 251–273. doi:10.1017/S0034670500033817
  • Craiutu, Aurelian, 2008, “From the Social Contract to the Art of Association: A Tocquevillian Perspective”, Social Philosophy and Policy, 25(2): 263–287. doi:10.1017/S0265052508080266
  • Dagger, Richard, 1985, “Rights, Boundaries, and the Bonds of Community: A Qualified Defense of Moral Parochialism”, American Political Science Review, 79(2): 436–447. doi:10.2307/1956658
  • Dworkin, Ronald, 1986, Law’s Empire, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Epstein, Richard A., 2008, “Should Antidiscrimination Laws Limit Freedom of Association? The Dangerous Allure of Human Rights Legislation”, Social Philosophy and Policy, 25(2): 123–156. doi:10.1017/S0265052508080217
  • Farber, Daniel A., 2001, “Foreword—Speaking in the First Person Plural: Expressive Associations and the First Amendment”,, Minnesota Law Review, 85(6): 1483–1514. [Farber 2000 available online]
  • Feinberg, Joel, 1980 [1992], “The Child’s Right to an Open Future”, Whose Child? Children’s Rights, Parental Authority, and State Power, William Aiken and Hugh LaFollette (eds), Totowa, NJ: Rowman & LIttlefield, 124–153; reprinted in his Freedom and Fulfillment: Philosophical Essays, Princeton: Princeton University Press, 76–97.
  • Fine, Sarah, 2010, “Freedom of Association Is Not the Answer”, Ethics, 120(2): 338–356. doi:10.1086/649626
  • Fleischacker, Sam, 1998, “Insignificant Communities”, in Gutmann 1998b: 273–313.
  • Fredrickson, Barbara L., 2013, Love 2.0: How Our Supreme Emotion Affects Everything We Feel, Think, Do, and Become, New York: Hudson Street Press.
  • Frick, Johann, forthcoming, “National Partiality, Immigration, and the Problem of Double-Jeopardy”, presented at the 6th Annual Oxford Studies Workshop for Oxford Studies in Political Philosophy, June 2018. To appear in Oxford Studies in Political Philosophy, Volume 6, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Galeotti, Anna Elisabetta, 2002, Toleration as Recognition, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511487392
  • Galston, William A., 1995, “Two Concepts of Liberalism”, Ethics, 105(3): 516–534. doi:10.1086/293725
  • Gheaus, Anca, 2018, “Children’s Vulnerability and Legitimate Authority Over Children”, Journal of Applied Philosophy, 35(February): 60–75. doi:10.1111/japp.12262
  • Goodin, Robert E., 1988, “What Is So Special about Our Fellow Countrymen?”, Ethics, 98(4): 663–686. doi:10.1086/292998
  • Gorz, André, 1997 [1999], Misères du Présent, Richesses du Possible, Paris: Galilée. Translated as Reclaiming Work: Beyond the Wage-Based Society, Chris Turner (trans.), Cambridge, UK: Polity Press, 1999.
  • Graeber, David, 2013, The Democracy Project: A History, a Crisis, a Movement, New York: Spiegel & Grau.
  • Greenawalt, Kent, 1998, “Freedom of Association and Religious Association”, in Gutmann 1998b: 109–144.
  • Gutmann, Amy, 1998a, “Freedom of Association: An Introductory Essay”, in Gutmann 1998b: 3–32.
  • ––– (ed.), 1998b, Freedom of Association, (The University Center for Human Values Series), Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.
  • Hohfeld, Wesley Newcomb [d. 1918], 1919, Fundamental Legal Conceptions as Applied in Judicial Reasoning and Other Legal Essays, Walter Wheeler Cook (ed.), New Haven, CT: Yale University Press.
  • Hook, Sidney, 1953, Heresy, Yes—Conspiracy, No!, New York: American Committee for Cultural Freedom.
  • James, David, 2017, “The Compatibility of Freedom and Necessity in Marx’s Idea of Communist Society: The Compatibility of Freedom and Necessity in Marx’s Idea of Communist Society”, European Journal of Philosophy, 25(2): 270–293. doi:10.1111/ejop.12209
  • Johnson, Steffen N., 2001, “Expressive Association and Organizational Autonomy”, Minnesota Law Review, 85(6): 1639–1668.
  • Karst, Kenneth L., 1980, “The Freedom of Intimate Association”, Yale Law Journal, 89(4): 624–692. [Karst 1980 available online]
  • Kateb, George, 1998, “The Value of Association” in Gutmann 1998b: 35–63.
  • Kukathas, Chandran, 2003, The Liberal Archipelago: A Theory of Diversity and Freedom, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/019925754X.001.0001
  • –––, 2005, “The Case for Open Immigration”, in Andrew I. Cohen and Christopher Heath Wellman (eds.), Contemporary Debates in Applied Ethics, London: Blackwell, 207–220
  • Kymlicka, Will, 1995, Multicultural Citizenship: A Liberal Theory of Minority Rights, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/0198290918.001.0001
  • Laborde, Cécile, 2006, “Female Autonomy, Education and the Hijab”, Critical Review of International Social and Political Philosophy, 9(3): 351–377. doi:10.1080/13698230600900909
  • Levy, Jacob T., 2014, Rationalism, Pluralism, and Freedom, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780198717140.001.0001
  • Linder, Douglas O., 1984, “Freedom of Association after Roberts v. United States Jaycees”, Michigan Law Review, 82(8): 1878–1903. doi:10.2307/1288622
  • Liao, S. Matthew, 2006, “The Right of Children to Be Loved”, Journal of Political Philosophy, 14(4): 420–440. doi:10.1111/j.1467-9760.2006.00262.x
  • –––, 2015, The Right to Be Loved, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780190234836.001.0001
  • Lomasky, Loren E., 2008, “The Paradox of Association”, Social Philosophy and Policy, 25(2): 182–200. doi:10.1017/S0265052508080230
  • Low, Setha, 2003, Behind the Gates: Life, Security and the Pursuit of Happiness in Fortress America, New York: Routledge.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair, 1981 [1985], After Virtue: A Study in Moral Theory, London: Duckworth Press, 2nd edition.
  • Mansbridge, Jane, 1999, “Should Blacks Represent Blacks and Women Represent Women? A Contingent ‘Yes’”, The Journal of Politics, 61(3): 628–657. doi:10.2307/2647821
  • Mason, Andrew, 1997, “Special Obligations to Compatriots”, Ethics, 107(3): 427–447. doi:10.1086/233743
  • McKinnon, Catriona, 2000, “Exclusion Rules and Self-Respect”, The Journal of Value Inquiry, 34(4): 491–505. doi:10.1023/A:1004737330659
  • Mill, John Stuart, 1859, On Liberty (various editions).
  • Miller, David, 2007, National Responsibility and Global Justice, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199235056.001.0001
  • –––, 2016, Strangers in Our Midst: The Political Philosophy of Immigration, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Mitchell, Don, 2003, The Right to the City: Social Justice and the Fight for Public Space, New York: Guildford Press.
  • Moles, Andres, 2014, “The Public Ecology of Freedom of Association”, Res Publica, 20(1): 85–103. doi:10.1007/s11158-013-9222-x
  • Moreno, Paul, 2008, “Organized Labor and American Law: From Freedom of Association to Compulsory Unionism”, Social Philosophy and Policy, 25(2): 22–52. doi:10.1017/S0265052508080175
  • Nichols, Theo and Peter Armstrong, 1976, Workers Divided: A Study in Shopfloor Politics, Glasgow: Fontana.
  • Okin, by Susan Moller, 2002, “‘Mistresses of Their Own Destiny’: Group Rights, Gender, and Realistic Rights of Exit”, Ethics, 112(2): 205–230. doi:10.1086/324645
  • Pateman, Carole, 2007, “Why Republicanism?”, Basic Income Studies, 2(2): article 12. doi:10.2202/1932-0183.1087
  • Phillips, Anne, 1998, The Politics of Presence, (Oxford Political Theory), Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/0198294158.001.0001
  • Quong, Jonathan, 2011, Liberalism without Perfection, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199594870.001.0001
  • Rawls, John, 1971, A Theory of Justice, Cambridge MA: Harvard University Press.
  • –––, 1993, Political Liberalism, New York: Columbia University Press.
  • Rosenblum, Nancy, 1998, “Compelled Association: Public Standing, Self-Respect, and the Dynamic of Exclusion” in Gutmann 1998b: 75–108.
  • Ryan, Alan, 1998, “The City as a Site for Free Association” in Gutmann 1998b: 314–329.
  • Sampson, Robert J., 2011, Great American City: Chicago and the Enduring Neighborhood Effect, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Scheinin, Martin, 1999, “Article 20”, in The Universal Declaration of Human Rights: A Common Standard of Achievement, Guðmundur S. Alfreðsson and Asbjørn Eide (eds.), The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff Publishers, 417–430.
  • Shelby, Tommie, 2016, Dark Ghettos: Injustice, Dissent, and Reform, Cambridge, MA: The Belknap Press of Harvard University Press.
  • Shiffrin, Seana Valentine, 2005, “What Is Really Wrong with Compelled Association?”, Northwestern Law Review, 99(2): 839–888.
  • Speck, Jeff, 2012, Walkable City: How Downtown Can Save America, One Step at a Time, New York: North Point Press.
  • Taylor, Charles, 1995, “The Politics of Recognition”, in his Philosophical Arguments, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 225–256.
  • Turkle, Sherry, 2011, Alone Together: Why We Expect More from Technology and Less from Each Other, New York: Basic Books.
  • Walzer, Michael, 2004, “Involuntary Association”, in his Politics and Passion: Toward a More Egalitarian Liberalism, London: Yale University Press, chapter 1.
  • Wellman, Christopher Heath, 2008, “Immigration and Freedom of Association”, Ethics, 119(1): 109–141. doi:10.1086/592311
  • White, Stuart, 1997, “Freedom of Association and the Right to Exclude”, Journal of Political Philosophy, 5(4): 373–391. doi:10.1111/1467-9760.00039
  • –––, 1998, “Trade Unionism in a Liberal State” in Gutmann 1998b: 330–356.
  • –––, 2013, “Association, Freedom of”, in Hugh LaFollette (ed.), The International Encyclopedia of Ethics, Oxford: Wiley Press. doi:10.1002/9781444367072.wbiee701
  • Whittington, Keith E., 2008, “Industrial Saboteurs, Reputed Thieves, Communists, and the Freedom of Association”, Social Philosophy and Policy, 25(2): 76–91. doi:10.1017/S0265052508080199
  • Widerquist, Karl, 2013, Independence, Propertylessness, and Basic Income: A Theory of Freedom as the Power to Say No, New York: Palgrave MacMillan.

Other Internet Resources


For helpful feedback, we thank Sarah Fine, Christoph Hoerl, Adam Neal, David Woods, Kartik Upadhyaya and an anonymous referee.

Copyright © 2019 by
Kimberley Brownlee <>
David Jenkins <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free