Epistemology in Classical Indian Philosophy

First published Thu Mar 3, 2011; substantive revision Wed Feb 13, 2019

Theory of knowledge, pramāṇa-śāstra, is a rich genre of Sanskrit literature, spanning almost twenty centuries, carried out in texts belonging to distinct schools of philosophy. Debate across school occurs especially on epistemological issues, but no author writes on knowledge independently of the sort of metaphysical commitment that defines the various classical systems (darśana), realist and idealist, dualist and monist, theist and atheist, and so on. And every one of the dozen or so major schools from early in its history takes a position on knowledge and justification, if only, as with the Buddhist skeptic (Prasaṅgika), to attack the theories of others. There are nevertheless many common epistemological assumptions or attitudes, the most striking of which is a focus on a belief’s source in questions of justification. Mainstream classical Indian epistemology is dominated by theories about pedigree, i.e., views about knowledge-generating processes, called pramāṇa, “knowledge sources.” The principal candidates are perception, inference, and testimony. Other processes seem not truth-conducive or reducible to one or more of the widely accepted sources such as perception and inference. However, surprising candidates such as non-perception (for knowledge of absences) and presumption (defended as distinct from inference) provoke complex arguments especially in the later texts—from about 1000 when the number of Sanskrit philosophical works of some of the schools begins to proliferate almost exponentially. The later texts present more intricate views and arguments than the earlier from which the later authors learned. Classical Indian philosophy is an unbroken tradition of reflection expressed in the pan-Subcontinent intellectual language of Sanskrit. Or, we should say it is comprised of interlocking traditions since there are the distinct schools, all nevertheless using Sanskrit and engaging with other schools. Later authors expand and carry forward positions and arguments of their predecessors.

Skepticism and the issue of whether knowledge that p entails that you know that you know that p are addressed as well as the question of the usefulness of knowledge not only for the purposes of everyday life but also the religious goal of world-transcendence, about which most schools take positions. The authority of testimony, among candidate sources, is considered by some to have special religious importance. Others view yogic perception and/or meditative experience as crucial for religious knowledge, which is usually distinguished from the everyday knowledge analyzed in the textbooks of epistemology.

1. Common Presuppositions of Classical Indian Schools

Commonalities in the classical Indian approaches to knowledge and justification frame the arguments and refined positions of the major schools. Central is a focus on occurrent knowledge coupled with a theory of “mental dispositions” called saṃskāra. Epistemic evaluation of memory, and indeed of all standing belief, is seen to depend upon the epistemic status of the occurrent cognition or awareness or awarenesses that formed the memory, i.e., the mental disposition, in the first place. Occurrent knowledge in turn must have a knowledge source, pramāṇa.

1.1 Knowledge and Knowledge Sources

A common failure of translators rendering the technical terms of the Indian epistemological schools into the technical terms, or even not so technical, of English and analytic philosophy, is ignorance of the latter. For example, several words, the most common of which is ‘jñāna’, are standardly rendered with the word ‘knowledge’ in English (e.g., Bhatt 1989). However, proper Sanskrit usage allows “false” jñāna, whereas there is no false knowledge as the words are used in (analytic) English. There is a deeper lesson here than that translators should study Western philosophy, the lesson, namely, that although there may be false jñāna—let us say “cognition”: there are true and false cognition—it is commonly assumed in everyday speech as well as by the Indian epistemologists (with a few exceptions, notably, the second-century Buddhist Nāgārjuna and certain followers including Śrīharṣa, the eleventh-century Advaitin) that cognition is ordinarily by nature true or veridical. It is error and falsity that are the deviations from the normal and natural. That is to say, cognition is regarded as knowledge as a kind of conversational default—and so to translate ‘jñāna’ as “knowledge” turns out not to be so bad after all. When the eighth-century Advaitin Śaṅkara says that from the perspective of spiritual knowledge (vidyā) the knowledge we recognize in everyday speech turns out to be illusory, mithyā-jñāna, “false knowledge,” this is supposed to be felt as almost a contradiction in terms (Brahma-sūtra Commentary, preamble).

Now it is argued by practically everyone (save the anti-epistemology group headed by Nāgārjuna) that at least everyday knowledge is proved by our unhesitating action (niṣkampa-prvṛtti) to get what we want and avoid what we want to avoid. We would not so act if we had doubt, guided as we are by our knowledge. Belief, which cognition embeds, is tied to action, and action, in turn, blunts the force of skepticism, it is pointed out in several of the classical schools. Buddhist Yogācāra as well as Mīmāṃsā and (most) Vedānta view knowledge as inherently known to be true. Even Nyāya, a school championing a view of knowledge as unselfconscious of itself as true, subscribes to the epistemological principle of “Innocent until reasonably challenged” (a slight weakening of the “Innocent until proven guilty,” as pointed out, e.g., by Matilal 1986, 314: “Verbal reports … are innocent until proven guilty”). Surprisingly (given the rancor in some exchanges across school), the sixth-century Nyāya philosopher Uddyotakara, who is famous for his attacks on Yogācāra positions, takes a similarly charitable attitude to be a rule applying to other philosophies: “For it is a rule with systems (of philosophy) that a position of another that is not expressly disproved is (to be regarded as) in conformity (with one’s own)” (under Nyāya-sūtra 1.1.4: 125).

Knowledge is cognition that has been produced in the right way. Cognitions are moments of consciousness, not species of belief, but we may say that cognitions form beliefs in forming dispositions and that veridical cognitions form true beliefs. A knowledge episode—to speak in the Indian manner—is a cognition generated in the right fashion. Whether this be because it is (as say the realists, Mīmāṃsā, Nyāya, Vaiśeṣika) that it has the right origins in fact, or whether it is because it guides successful action in helping us get our desires satisfied (as say Yogācāra idealists and pragmatists), knowledge is cognition that arises in the right way. There are different theories of truth, but everyone sees knowledge as not only revealing the truth but arising from it. Knowledge episodes form non-occurrent knowledge (it is assumed, we may say), and so an examination of what is crucial to the arising of a knowledge episode is crucial to the evaluations of epistemology. Knowledge cannot arise by accident. A lucky guess, though true or veridical, would not count as knowledge because it would not been generated in the right fashion, would not have the right pedigree or etiology. The central notion throughout classical Indian epistemology is the “knowledge source,” pramāṇa, which is a process of veridical-cognition generation.

Now the word ‘pramāṇa’ (“knowledge source”) and the result ‘pramā’ (“knowledge”; this is a technical usage that matches, practically perfectly, the analytic usages of ‘knowledge’ in English) along with the words used for individual knowledge sources, for perception and so on, are commonly used such that the truth of the resultant cognition is implied. This runs counter to English usage, along with broad philosophic supposition, which is different with the words ‘perception’ and company. For no knowledge source ever generates a false belief. Yogācāra Buddhists—who subscribe to the metaphysical view known as momentariness, which is a presentism (only things existing right now are real)—claim that there is no difference between source and result, process of knowledge and effect, pramāṇa and pramā. Thus there can be no wedge driven between cause and effect such that there could possibly be true belief by accident. The Vedic schools (Mīmāṃsā, Vedānta, Nyāya, Vaiśeṣika, Sāṃkhya, Yoga) do distinguish knowledge from true belief but also see the concepts of truth and knowledge-producing process as wedded in that, as indicated, no genuine knowledge source ever produces a false belief. Only pseudo-sources do. That is to say, no non-veridical cognition is knowledge-source-generated. A knowledge source is then not merely a reliable doxastic practice. Being merely reliable does not fit the bill. The concept of a knowledge source has a truth logic, like ‘knowledge’ in English; it is factive. Maybe we should say perception*, inference*, testimony* to render the classical Indian ideas. False testimony, for example, does not count as a knowledge-generator; the Sanskrit word for testimony is used only for what would be termed in English “epistemically successful testimony,” i.e., with a hearer having knowledge in virtue of a speaker telling the truth. A non-veridical perception is not really a perception at all but a “pseudo-perception” (pratyakṣa-ābhāsa), “apparent perception,” a perception imitator. You don’t really see an illusory snake; you only think you see one.

1.2 The Touchstone of Everyday Speech

Everyday patterns of speech (vyavahāra) are taken as a starting point for theorizing in epistemology as in other areas of philosophy. So, for example, perception and inference—more exotic candidate sources, too—are defended as veritable knowledge-generators by the observation that people commonly regard them in that way. People cite a belief’s pedigree in questions of justification. Note that even in English we do commonly recognize perception and some of the others as certificational. Thus this seems to be a common human practice, not restricted to classical Indian civilization, for sometimes we say, for instance, “S is indeed over there, since I see him,” and “You couldn’t really have perceived S because condition Y does not hold” (“You can’t see anyone from this distance”). Habits of speech are reinforced by success in action, classical theorists recognize in accepting the presumptive authority of common opinion. But “a knowledge source” may be thought of as a technical term, one that entails factivity, as we have seen, as a matter of definition. Similarly with justification (prāmāṇya), the having of which, if veritable (or objective), as opposed to the apparent (ābhāsa), means that the justified cognition is true.

1.3 Knowledge and World-Transcendence

There is much controversy over the religious goal of life among the several schools, both among schools accepting Vedic culture (liberation vs. heaven, individual dissolution into the Absolute Brahman, blissful yogic “isolation,” kaivalya, enjoyment of God’s presence) and among outsider schools (Buddhist nirvāṇa or becoming a bodhi-sattva or a Jaina arhat as well as Cārvāka’s entire rejection of soteriology). But from a distance, we can see common conceptions linking at least many of the Indian views. One is to draw a distinction between everyday and spiritual knowledge and to theorize about their relationship. A prominent position is that thinking about the world is an obstacle to spiritual enlightenment. Another is that proper understanding of the world helps one disengage and to know oneself as separate from material things, and so is an aid to transcendence. The most distinctive form of skepticism in classical Indian thought is that so-called worldly knowledge is not knowledge at all but is a perversion or deformation of consciousness. Who seems a philosophical skeptic is really a saint helping us achieve our truly greatest good of world-transcendence by helping us see paradoxes and other failures of theory.

2. Skepticism

With an eye to the alleged power of inference to prove the existence of God or personal survival, the Cārvāka materialist school recognizes perception as a knowledge source but not inference nor any other candidate. Inference depends upon generalizations which outstrip perceptual evidence, everything F as a G. No one can know that, Cārvāka claims. Testimony is also no good since it presupposes that a speaker would tell the truth and thus is subject to the same criticism of lack of evidence. And so on through the other candidates (Mādhava, Sarva-darśana-saṃgraha). The standard response is pragmatic. We could not act as we do if we could not rely on inference (etc.) albeit inference does depend on generalization that (often, not invariably) outstrips experience. The skeptic himself relies on such generalizations when he opens his mouth to voice his skepticism, by using words with repeatable meanings (Gaṅgeśa, inference chapter, Tattva-cintā-maṇi).

The Cārvāka argument identifying the problem of induction is turned by both Buddhist and Nyāya philosophers into an argument for fallibilism about inference. What we take to be the result of a genuine inference may turn out to hinge on a fallacy, a hetv-ābhāsa, an apparent but misleading “reason” or sign (see the section below on inference). But to accept that sometimes we reason in ways that mimic but fail to instantiate right forms is not to be a skeptic. Indeed, the very concept of a fallacy (hetv-ābhāsa) presupposes that of the veritable reason or sign (hetu), a veritable prover making us have new knowledge.

A different kind of skepticism is broader in scope, not restricted to inference or other candidate sources. It appears both in Buddhism and Advaita Vedānta, but let us rehearse only the Buddhist version. By discerning absurdities that arise in viewing anything as having an independent existence, one realizes, as Nāgārjuna says, that everything is niḥsvabhāva, “without a reality of its own.” Applying this to oneself, one comes to see the truth of the Buddha’s teaching of anātman, “no-self,” which is viewed as a decisive step toward the summum bonum of enlightenment and perfection (prajñā-pāramitā). In particular, Nāgārjuna identifies a problem of a justification regress in the pramāṇa program (Vigraha-vyavārtinī, v. 33), which assumes that process and result can be separated, along with various conundra or paradoxes concerning relations (such as the so-called Bradley problem). The Nyāya-sūtra argues that the Nāgārjunian type of skepticism is self-defeating (4.2.26–36), but many of the problems identified by the Buddhist (and his intellectual inheritors such as Śrīharṣa) occupy the reflections of philosophers for centuries, Buddhist as well as Nyāya and Mīmāṃsā among Vedic schools in particular.

3. Knowing That You Know

One of the philosophic problems that Nāgārjuna raised for epistemology has to do with an alleged regress of justification on the assumption that a pramāṇa is required in order to know and that to identify the source of a bit of knowledge is to certify the proposition embedded. Nāgārjuna claims that this is absurd in that it would require an infinite series of pramāṇa, of identification of a more fundamental pramāṇa for every pramāṇa relied on.

Mīmāṃsā and Vedānta philosophers argue that such a threat of regress shows that knowledge is self-certifying, svataḥ prāmāṇya. Vedāntins connect the Upanishadic teaching of a truest or deepest self (ātman) as having “self-illumining awareness” (sva-prakāśa) with a Mīmāṃsā epistemological theory of self-certification: at least in the case of spiritual knowledge (vidyā) awareness is self-aware. From this it follows that only awareness is right concerning all questions about awareness, since only awareness itself has, so to say, access to itself. Awareness itself is the only consideration relevant to any question about awareness itself, its existence or its nature.

Mīmāṃsā defends Vedic truth by claiming that knowledge of it wears its certification on its sleeve like everyday knowledge where the initial credibility of an occurrent cognition seems practically absolute. According to Prābhākara Mīmāṃsā (from the late seventh century), no cognition that in itself purports to be veridical is indeed non-veridical; no cognition is absolutely wrong but at worst a confusion. The same causal nexus that produces a veridical cognition produces knowledge of its veridicality. According to Bhāṭṭa Mīmāṃsā (deriving from Kumārila, Prabhākara’s teacher), veridicality is known through the process of inference whereby a cognition itself would be known as having occurred. A cognition, which is an act, produces a feature in the object it cognizes, a “cognizedness,” and then from apprehension of this feature both the original cognition and its veridicality are known. Certification is thus intrinsic to a cognition’s being known, that is, with cognitions that are veridical. With respect to knowledge of non-veridicality, extrinsic certification is necessary.

Nyāya takes an extrinsicality view of certification (parataḥ prāmāṇya)—it denies that Kp entails KKp; to know that you know requires apperceptive certification—and so seems vulnerable to the regress charge. The solution involves the notion of “apperception” (anuvyavasāya), which is a second-level cognition that has another cognition as its object without itself being self-aware. Certification, psychologically considered, involves apperception, a seeing that a challenged, target cognition is false or true.

Vātsyāyana (fourth century, whose Nyāya-sūtra commentary is the oldest extant) expressly rebuts the regress charge (we do sometimes certify our claims without having to certify the certifiers) under Nyāya-sūtra 2.1.20 (448–49, translation mine):

If comprehension of perception or another (knowledge source) landed us in infinite regress, then everyday action and discourse would not go on through comprehension of self-consciously known objects and their known causes. (However) everyday action and discourse do proceed for someone comprehending self-consciously known objects and their known causes: when (self-consciously) I grasp by perception an object or I grasp one by inference or I grasp one by analogy or I grasp one by tradition or testimony (the four knowledge sources according to Nyāya), the (apperceptive) cognition that occurs goes like this: “My knowledge is perceptual” or “My knowledge is inferential” or “My knowledge is from analogy” or “My knowledge is testimonial.”

And motivation to seek righteousness (dharma), wealth, pleasure, or liberation proceeds through these comprehensions (whereas if there is doubt, no such goal-directed activity would occur), as likewise motivation to reject their opposites. Everyday discourse and action would cease (to be possible for such a subject) if what is alleged were indeed to hold (justificational regress).

Nyāya’s strategy is then (1) to charge the objector with making a “pragmatic contradiction,” (2) to take veridicality as cognitive default, and (3) to certify cognitions by source identification as well as by inference from the success or failure of the activity that they provoke and guide. We assume without checking that our cognition is veridical, but sometimes we need to check. Note that the practical pursuits that Vātsyāyana mentions as guided by second-order, reflective knowledge are: “righteousness (dharma), wealth, pleasure, [and] liberation.”

4. Perception

All the classical schools that advance epistemologies accept perception as a knowledge source although there is much disagreement about its nature, objects, and limitations. Are the objects of perception internal to consciousness or external? Are they restricted to individuals, e.g., a particular cow, or are universals, e.g., cowhood, also perceived? How about relations? Absences or negative facts (Devadatta’s not being at home)? Parts or wholes? Both? A self, awareness itself? There are issues about perceptual media such as light and ether, ākāśa, the purported medium of sound, and about what is perceptible yogically (God, the īśvara, the ātman or self, puruṣa). What are the environmental conditions that govern perception, and how do these connect with the different sensory modalities? Are there internal conditions on perception (such as attention or focus, viewed by some as a voluntary act)? Is a recognition, e.g., “This is that Devadatta I saw yesterday,” perceptual? And does it prove the endurance of things over time including the perceiving subject? Do we perceive only fleeting qualities (dharma), as Buddhists tend to say, or qualifiers as qualifying qualificanda (a lotus as qualified by being-blue), as say realist Nyāya and Mīmāṃsā? Does all perception involve a sensory connection with an object that is responsible for providing its content or intentionality (nirākāra-vāda, Nyāya), or is the content of perception internal to itself (sākāra-vāda, Yogācāra)? How do we differentiate veritable perception, which is defined as veridical, and pseudo-perception (illusion), which is non-veridical? How is illusion to be explained? These are some of the outstanding issues and questions that occupy the schools in all periods of their literatures.

Yogācāra subjectivism views perception as “concept-free,” whereas the holist grammarian Bhartṛhari of the third century finds it all to be clothed in language. Mīmāṃsā and Nyāya realists emphasize the “concept-laden” nature of at least the type of perception that is epistemically foundational for observation statements containing basic sensory predicates. To be sure, Mīmāṃsā and later Nyāya also admit concept-free perception. Kumārila Bhaṭṭa mentions the cognition of an infant as an example (Śloka-vārttika commentary on the perception sūtra of the Mīmāṃsā-sūtra, verse 112, p. 94; see also Matilal 1986, 321–322). Phenomenologically humans would seem to have much in common with infants and animals considering this type of perception. But according to the great Mīmāṃsaka, perception does not so much divide into types as form a process with the concept-free as the first stage. Awareness of the object is only quasi-propositional in the first moment, and at the second has its content filled out to become the means whereby an individual is ascertained to have a certain character, to be a certain kind of substance or to possess a universal or an action, etc. (verse 120, p. 96). The object perceived, the lotus (or whatever), is known in the first stage as an individual whole, both in its individuality and as having a character. But the character, the thing’s being blue as opposed to red, and its being here right now, are not known without the mediation of concepts which are supplied internally. Seeing is ultimately “seeing as” and is “shot through with words,” to use the expression of Bhartṛhari (Vākyapadīya, ch. 1, verses 123–124, p. 199; see also Matilal 1986, 342). However, the mind or self does not, according to the realists, have any innate ideas (unlike then Yogācāra, which postulates a collective “storehouse consciousness,” ālaya-vijñāna). Concepts are the records of previous experiences.

Yogācāra holds that all predication, including the sensory, depends on ideas of unreal generality. All predication involves repeatable general terms. Thus the realists’ “propositional content” is suspicious just because this is not raw perception which alone is capable of presenting the truly real, the sva-lakṣaṇa, “that which is its own mark,” the unique or particular. Classical Indian realists hold that perception is none the worse for being concept-laden in that concepts are features of the world as impressed upon the mind or self. Perception founds true beliefs, and the repeatable predicates and concepts (cowhood) perceptually acquired and re-presented and employed in verbalizations pick out constituents of real objects, things that do re-occur (there are lots of cows in the world). For late Nyāya philosophers, concept-laden perception comes so to dwarf in importance the indeterminate, concept-free variety that the latter becomes problematic. Perception in its epistemological role is concept-laden. Otherwise, it could not be certificational. Perception as a knowledge source is a doxastic, belief-generating process. Beliefs (or anyhow perceptual cognitions and their verbalizations) are dependent on concepts (to believe or say that there is a pot on the floor, one must possess the concepts of “pot” and “floor”).

The Yogācāra Buddhists’ best argument for their subjectivism—which one suspects derives more fundamentally from a commitment to the possibility of a universal nirvāṇa experience, although this is not said—is perceptual illusion. Illusion proves that a perception’s object is not a feature of the world but is contributed somehow from the side of the subject. A rope can be perceived as a snake, with no difference, from the perspective of the perceiver, between the illusion and a veridical snake perception. Similarly, dreams are the “perceptions” of a dreamer but do not touch reality. (Our world is a dream, say Buddhists, and we should try to become buddha, “Awakened.”)

One way to resist the pull of the illusion argument belongs to Prābhākara Mīmāṃsā which insists that not only is perception invariably veridical but also cognition in general, jñāna. Nyāya philosophers hold in contrast that illusion is a false cognition. Rich debate occurs over Nyāya’s “misplacement” view of illusion and a Prābhākara “no-illusion” or “omission” theory (illusion is a failure to cognize of a certain sort, an absence of cognition, for example, an absence of cognition of the difference between a remembering of silver and a perceiving of mother-of-pearl when holding in hand a piece of shell S exclaims, “Silver!”). Here Nyāya agrees with the subjectivists: sometimes a person S apparently perceives a to be F—has an apparently perceptual cognition embedding Fa—when a is not in fact F, while S cannot discern from her own first-person perspective that the cognition is non-veridical. Nevertheless, the predication content, according to Nyāya as also Mīmāṃsā, the presentation or indication of F-hood, originates in things’ really being F, through previous veridical experience of F-hood.

Here we touch the heart of classical Indian realism. Snakehood is available to become illusory predication content through previous veridical experience of snakes. It gets fused into a current perception by means of a foul-up in the normal causal process through the arousing of a snakehood memory-disposition (saṃskāra) formed by previous experience. The content or intentionality (viṣayatā, “objecthood”) of an illusion is to be explained causally as generated by real features of real things just as is genuine perception though they are distinct cognitive types. Illusion involves the projection into current (determinate) cognition (which would be pseudo-perception) of predication content preserved in memory. Sometimes the fusion of an element preserved in memory is cross-sensory, tasting sourness, for instance, when perceiving a lemon by sight or smelling a piece of sandalwood which is seen at too far a distance for actual olfactory stimulation. These are cases of veridical perception with an obvious admixture or tinge of memory. Illusion, according to Nyāya, is to be analyzed similarly, but unlike veridical cases of projection illusion involves taking something to be what it is not, a seeing or perceiving it through a “misplaced” qualifier. This means that concept-laden perception is necessarily combinational—a position taken by Gautama himself, the “sūtra-maker,” and much elaborated by Vātsyāyana and the other commentators in text apparently aimed at an early form of Buddhist subjectivism (Nyāya-sūtra 4.2.26–36). The upshot of these sūtras is that, first, the concept of illusion is parasitic on that of veridical experience (not all coins can be counterfeit), and, second, that illusion shows a combinational (propositional) structure: this is a something or other. According to Nyāya, perceptual illusion is right in part, that there is something there, but wrong about what it is. Ontologically, Nyāya takes a disjunctivist position: an illusion is a different kind of critter than a genuine perception, since its intentionality is different.

To fill out the realist account in late Nyāya, thought-laden perception, determinate perception, gets its content or intentionality—its “object-directedness”—not only from the object in connection with the sense organ but also from the classificational power of the mind (or self). With the perceptual cognition, “That’s a pot,” for instance, the pot as an individual in connection with a sensory faculty is responsible for the awareness of a property-bearer, for what is called the qualificandum portion of the perception, without admixture of memory. But the sensory connection is not by itself responsible for the qualifier portion, the pothood, that is to say, the thing’s classification as a pot. A qualificandum as qualified by a qualifier is perceived all at once (eka-vṛtti-vedya), but a determinate perception’s portions have distinct etiologies. Now the classificational power of the mind (or self) is not innate, as pointed out, but is rather the product of presentational experience (anubhava) over the course of a subject’s life. Repeatable features of reality get impressed on the mind (or self) in the form of memory dispositions. For most adults, prior determinate cognition is partly responsible for the content predicable of a particular, or a group of things, presented through the senses. That is, in perceiving a as an F, an F-saṃskāra formed by previous knowledge-source-produced bits of occurrent cognition of things F would be a causal factor. The perception’s own content includes the repeatable nature of the qualifier through the operation of this factor. We see the tree as a tree.

But sometimes neither a prior determinate cognition nor a memory disposition is at all responsible for the predication content, for example, when a child sees a cow for the very first time. Rather, an “in the raw” perceptual grasping of the qualifier (cowhood) delivers it to an ensuing concept-laden and verbalizable perception. In other words, there are cases of determinate cognition where indeterminate, concept-free perception furnishes the qualifier independently and the ensuing concept-laden perception is not tinged by memory. Normally, saṃskāra, “memory-dispositions,” do play a causal role in determinate perception, according to Nyāya and Mīmāṃsā and indeed epistemologists of all flags. But sometimes an immediately prior concept-free perception of a qualifier plays the role of the saṃskāra, furnishing by itself the concept, the predication content, the qualifier portion of an ensuing determinate, proposition-laden perception, which is the type of cognition that founds our beliefs about the world.

If this were not an “immaculate perception” but itself a grasping of a property through the grasping of another property, we would be faced with an infinite regress and direct perception of the world would be impossible. Concept-free perception need not provide the classifying not only with second and third-time perceptions of something as F but not even, strictly speaking, with a first-time perception, since there could be an intervening cognitive factor (provided, say, by analogy: see below). But with that factor again the question would arise how it gets its content, and so since an indeterminate perception has to be posited at some point to block a regress it might as well be at the start. This is the main argument of Gaṅgeśa, the late Nyāya systematizer, in defense of positing the concept-free as a type or first stage of perception (Phillips 2001).

Nevertheless, for all intents and purposes, perception embodies beliefs, according to the realists. More accurately, a perceptual belief is the result of the operation of perception as a knowledge source. Everything that is nameable is knowable and vice-versa. There is nothing that when we attend to it cannot bear a name, for we can make up new names. We can in principle verbalize the indications of our experience, though many of them are not named since we are indifferent (pebbles perceived along the road). Concept-free perception is the classical Indian realist rendering of our ability to form perceptual concepts by attending to perception’s phenomenological side. Epistemologically, it plays no role, since it is itself a posit and is unverbalizable and not directly apperceived (A. Chakrabarti 2000 gives this and other reasons for jettisoning the concept from Nyāya’s own realist point of view).

As mentioned, Yogācāra takes issue with the realist theory of perception, viewing all perception as concept-free. What is perceived is only the unqualified particular, sva-lakṣaṇa. The realists’ “qualifiers” such as cowhood are mental constructions, “convenient fictions.” Various reductio arguments are put forth to show the incoherence of the realists’ conception of a qualificandum perceived at once to be qualified by a qualifier (eka-vṛtti-vedya). The different views of the objects of perception feed different views of inference.

5. Inference

Logic is developed in classical India within the traditions of epistemology. Inference is a second knowledge source, a means whereby we can know things not immediately evident through perception. Oetke (2004) finds three roots to the earliest concerns with logic in India: (1) common-sense inference, (2) establishment of doctrines in the frame of scientific treatises (śāstra), and (3) justification of tenets in a debate. The three of these come together (though the latter two are predominant) within the epistemological traditions in an almost universal regard of inference as a knowledge source.

Seeing classical Indian logic as part of epistemology, as explaining how we know facts through the mediation of our knowledge of other facts, makes it easy to understand why both the Buddhist and Vedic schools count a valid but unsound argument as fallacious: knowledge is not generated. Classical Indian philosophers are not focused on logic per se, but rather on a psychological process whereby we come to know things indirectly, by way of a sign, hetu or liṅga, an indication of something currently beyond the range of the senses, whether at a distance spatially or temporally or of a sort (such as atoms or God or the Buddha mind) that by nature cannot be directly perceived.

The two greatest names for classical Indian logic belong to logicians of the Buddhist Yogācāra school, Dignāga (sixth century) and Dharmakīrti (early seventh century). Dignāga laid out all the possible relationships of inclusion and exclusion for the extensions of two terms called the prover or “sign,” hetu, and the probandum, sādhya, the property “to be proved.” Thereby he revealed the underpinnings of the pramāṇa of inference in terms of sets of particulars, which, according to Yogācāra ontology, are the only reals. Dharmakīrti classified inferences based on the ontological nature of the class-inclusion relationship that underpins all inference as a knowledge source. Earlier philosophers, both Buddhist and non-Buddhist, provide examples of everyday reasoning, several of which are abductive in character, informal reasoning to the best explanation, from sight of a swollen river, for example, says Vātsyāyana in his commentary on the inference sūtra (1.1.5) of the Nyāya-sūtra, to the conclusion that it has rained upstream. But there are also instances of inferences comprised of deductive, extrapolative, and sometimes properly inductive reasoning on topics of everyday life as well as philosophy in numerous pre-Dignāga texts of several schools. It is not true, as is sometimes claimed, that no one before Dignāga had the notion of an inference-underpinning “pervasion,” vyāpti, of a prover property by a property to be proved. Dignāga does however get the credit for the earliest systematization, which employs three terms, a site or subject of a proposed inference (pakṣa, the mountain in the stock example of an inference from sight of smoke on a mountain to knowledge of fire on the mountain), the prover or prover property (hetu, smokiness), and the probandum (sādhya, fieriness).

Dignāga, it should be stressed, as a nominalist sees inference as proceeding from knowledge of particulars to other knowledge of particulars (avoiding the universals of the realists, as nicely explained by Hayes 1988 with reference to the Buddhist apoha, “exclusion,” theory of concepts). Dignāga formulates a threefold test for a good prover, trairūpya-hetu:

  1. the prover’s occurrence on the inferential subject of a proposed inference must be known to the subject S
  2. the prover’s occurrence at least once together with the probandum must be known to S
  3. no counter-case of a prover occurring without the probandum must be known to S.

Uddyotakara in his Nyāya-sūtra commentary incorporates Dignāga’s ideas to formalize many of Vātsyāyana’s informal inferences. The Nyāya philosopher owes almost everything to his Buddhist adversaries, as opposed to his Nyāya predecessors, but he does criticize and alter what he sees as the certification conditions of inference as a knowledge source, combining Dignāga’s second and third tests into a single requirement, knowledge of pervasion. He also adds a third condition, the subject’s having to “reflect” and put the information together, so to say:

  1. pakṣa-dharmatā: the prover has to be known to S as qualifying the inferential subject
  2. vyāpti-smaraṇa: the prover’s being pervaded by the probandum has to be remembered by S
  3. liṅga-parāmarśa: S must connect by reflection the pervasion with the inferential subject.

The upshot of the addition may be interpreted as the recognition that knowledge is not closed under deduction considered in abstraction from the psychological process of “reflection.” But through that process, epistemic warrant—or “certainty,” niścaya—passes from premises to conclusion, and we act unhesitatingly, for example, to put a fire on yonder mountain out.

Things are yet more complicated. Inferential knowledge is defeasible, or, more precisely stated, what a subject takes to be inferential knowledge may turn out to be pseudo, non-genuine, a false cognition imitating a true one, or even in Gettier-style cases an accidentally true cognition masquerading as one genuinely inference-born. Knowledge has a social dimension. Not only would awareness of a counterexample be a defeater, but also if someone were to present a counterinference to a conclusion opposed to ours, no longer would we have inferential knowledge. Awareness of any of several kinds of “blocker” of “reflection” can undermine the generalization on which such reflection depends. There are potential preventers of inferential awareness, “defeaters,” bādhaka, leading to belief relinquishment by someone who has hitherto not noticed a counterexample or the like and who has thus drawn a conclusion erroneously.

However, one should not think that the epistemologists’ inference is non-monotonic, as established by Taber (2004) against Oetke (1996) in particular. The paradigm logical form embedded in a good inference is monotonic. New information is irrelevant to the validity of the pattern itself, although it may well be relevant to a subject’s justification for acceptance of the premises. Examples of inferences in classical texts often seem non-monotonic because fallibility attaches to the premises. Such fallibility of course passes to the conclusion, too. (Cf. Israel 1980 who similarly voices an epistemological complaint against the very idea of non-monotonic logic, according to Koons 2013.)

Targeting the relationship of pervasion in Uddyotakara’s second condition, vyāpti-smaraṇa, which appears to be the ontological underpinning of Dignāga’s conditions (2) and (3), Dharmakīrti divides inferences into three kinds:

  • sva-bhāva (self-nature: “It’s a tree because it’s a śiṃśapā oak”)
  • tad-utpatti (causality: “Fire is there because smoke is there”)
  • anupalabdhi (non-perception: “There is no pot here because none is perceived”).

Yogācāra holds that with the first type of inference the underpinning pervasion is “internal” (antar-vyāpti). We may think of this as an internal relation between concepts and thus as similar to the a priori of Western philosophy. But it is actually a technical point about whether the term that picks out the inferential subject or subjects—think of the pakṣa as a set—closes it off from being included in the inductive base of the generalization (or extrapolation, according to Ganeri 2001b) that gives us knowledge of a pervasion relationship. Mīmāṃsā and Nyāya rule out this kind of inference as begging the question: we want to know whether the inferential subject possesses the probandum property and so to cite that subject itself, even a part of it, runs counter to the very purpose of inference.

Later Nyāya divides inferences not according to the ontology of pervasion (which is mapped onto the Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika ontology and causal theory, sometimes not very successfully) but rather by the way a pervasion is known:

  • anvaya-vyatireka (“positive and negative”): inferences based on positive and negative correlations where both are available, i.e., cases where, for example, smokiness and fieriness have been known to occur together, kitchen hearths, campfires, etc., like (it is claimed) yonder smoky mountain where being-fiery is to be proved, taken along with negative examples where the prover as well as the probandum is known not to occur
  • kevala-anvaya (“positive only”): inferences based on positive correlations only, where there are no known examples of an absence of the probandum property, such as would have to be the case with the universally present property, knowability (there is nothing that is not knowable)
  • kevala-vyatireka (“negative only”): inferences based on negative correlations only where outside of the inferential subject there are no known cases of the probandum.

Many of the inferences that Buddhists identify as hinging on an “internal pervasion” (antar-vyāpti) Nyāya philosophers see as “negative only” (kevala-vyatireka). Taking a particular śiṃśapā oak as the pakṣa, we have the negative correlation proving it is a tree: whatever is not a tree, is not a śiṃśapā oak, for example, a lotus.

Western interpretations and representations of inference as classically conceived have often missed its unity as a knowledge source. Ganeri (2001b: 20) claims that it is better to understand both the Buddhist and early Nyāya patterns as “not enthymematic,” not skipping a step of generalization and then implicitly using universal instantiation (UI) and modus ponens (MP) in applying the rule to a case at hand. Case-based reasoning need not be interpreted as relying on universal quantifiers, and the representation of Schayer (1933) and others which uses them is misleading. Theirs is indeed misleading, and Ganeri appears to be right with regard to the early theories. But with late Nyāya Schayer’s argument form of UI and MP misleads for yet another reason, namely, failing to be sufficiently sensitive to the logic of occurrence and non-occurrence of properties at a location, or qualifying a property-bearer, as Staal (1973) and others have brought out. Furthermore, Ganeri is right that in analyzing the pattern one tends to miss the unity of the causal theory that has one mental state brought about by another. In the Nyāya theory, everything is integrated in the notion of “reflection,” parāmarśa, as an inference’s proximate instrumental cause or “trigger,” karaṇa. While not the only necessary condition, this one is the last in place, securing the occurrence of inferential knowledge.

Following Matilal (1998), we can reconstruct such “reflection” as a singular inference:

(K)(SpHa) → (K)Sa

This says that on the condition that a subject knows that H-as-qualified-by-being-pervaded-by-S qualifies a, then the subject knows that Sa. The arrow should be interpreted as depicting causal sufficiency, in line with Uddyotakara and the later tradition. “Reflection” is a complex mental state that is nevertheless a unity, both as a particular cognition that can be a causal factor for the rise of another cognition and as having intentionality, or “objecthood,” expressible in a single sentence. Attempts to find a single rule are in consonance with both of these dimensions of the theory. But a lot of inductive depth is packed into the idea of a pervasion being known, and a lot about it is said that shows that there is generalization, at least in the later Nyāya theory. Knowing a general rule is considered crucial, not just extrapolation to a next case. From Uddyotakara on, Nyāya philosophers treat pervasion as the equivalent of a rule stating that—to use the language of sets and terms—the extension of the probandum term includes that of the prover term, includes it entirely such that there is nothing that locates the pervaded property (the prover) that does not also locate the pervader (the probandum), as argued by Kisor Chakrabarti (1995) among others.

The centralmost issue with inference, to consider the effort of late Nyāya philosophers, is to make plain the logic of pervasion as well as how we know the universalized items, or entire extensions, of the terms figuring in our knowledge of such rules, the items that underpin our knowledge of such inclusions, such naturally necessary pervasions of a prover by a probandum property. Lots of work from the earliest focuses on fallacies and inference in the context of formal debate. And there are many philosophical inferences advanced in the literatures of the various schools, such as proofs of momentariness, the existence of God, the possibility of liberation from birth and rebirth, and dozens more.

6. Testimony

Vaiśeṣika among the Vedic schools along with Buddhists who of course impugn the “testimony” of the Veda reject testimony as an independent knowledge source, pramāṇa. Buddhists claim that their religious teachings are founded on nothing other than reasoning and experience, albeit mystical experience, the nirvāṇa experience that makes a Buddha an expert about spiritual matters. As with memory, whose correctness is dependent on the veridicality or non-veridicality of the cognition that forms the saṃskāra memory-impression, the veridicality of testimony depends on the knowledge of the testifier, the speaker, whose source has to be bona fide, namely, depending on the epistemological theory, perception or inference or perhaps testimony in a series where an original testifier would know by means of a source other than testimony . Vaiśeṣika and Yogācāra join together in seeing a hearer H’s knowledge that p which other philosophers see as flowing from testimony as really resulting from an inference having as one premise that the speaker S is trustworthy and as another that S has said p, assuming that trustworthy people who know the truth communicate it faithfully, to conclude that p is true. Nyāya resists such as inferentialist account from the earliest, in the sūtras of Gautama, claiming that the inferentialist conflates inferential certification of the truth of p with testimonial knowledge that p at a first or unreflective level (as nicely explained by Mohanty 1994). Vātsyāyana and others argue (under Nyāya-sūtra 2.1.52) that the certification conditions are different for the two knowledge sources. The eighth-century Jayanta Bhaṭṭa writes (Nyāya-mañjarī 322): “The conditions that determine inferential knowledge and those that determine verbal knowledge are not the same.” The Nyāya position is that comprehension and acceptance are normally fused such that (normally) we do get knowledge immediately (non-inferentially) from being told. Here they join Mīmāṃsā, though there is also much controversy on this matter between the two schools.

Gautama provides a definition at Nyāya-sūtra 1.1.7: “Testimony is the (true) statement of an expert (āpta).” An “expert,” āpta, is a trustworthy authority such that “expert” is not entirely adequate as a translation. Vātsyāyana in defining the term outlines a moral dimension. An āpta is a person who not only knows the truth but who wants to communicate it without deception (Vātsyāyana’s commentary under Nyāya-sūtra 1.1.7). The commentator also brings out a certain egalitarianism in the workings of the knowledge source. Contra the privilege afforded the priestly caste in matters of Vedic interpretation, he says that even foreigners—“barbarians,” mleccha—can be the experts whose statements convey to us testimonial knowledge, provided, as always, they know the truth and want to communicate without deception.

According to those who accept testimony as a genuine knowledge source, the process of generating testimonial knowledge begins with a speaker S who knows a proposition p by perception, inference, or testimony (chains of testimony are okay) and who has a desire to communicate p to someone or other. A hearer H gains knowledge through a speech act of S communicating p to H, who has to be competent in the language in which p is expressed, to know the words and grammatical forms, which H has learned, on most accounts, also chiefly through testimony but also in other ways such as analogy (according to some).

Mīmāṃsā, whose leaders Kumārila and Prabhākara are followed by many Vedāntins and by some Nyāya philosophers, comes to the debate about testimony with an axe to grind, namely, to defend Vedic authority. The words of the Veda are not spoken by anyone originally. Speakers are subject to error but not the Veda, whose verses are not originally composed (apauruṣeya). Vedāntic theists, in the main, along with almost all Nyāya philosophers, take the position that like all sentences, those of the Veda should be understood as spoken (or composed, etc.) by someone with the intention to communicate. Thus the Lord, īśvara, is the author of the Veda (the best or only candidate, according to Udayana, eleventh century, Nyāya-kusumāñjalī). Mīmāṃsā, however, is atheistic, viewing the Veda as primordial, resounding in the ether that surrounds the universe, heard and memorized by great rishis in their pellucid consciousness (not cluttered by ordinary thought). Thus according to Mīmāṃsā, sentences can be meaningful without having a speaker with an intention to communicate. Vedāntin and Nyāya theists generalize from the everyday to assume that, no, statements and sentences require a speaker, a composer, who, in the case of S’s knowledge passing to H, must be an āpta expert, i.e., someone who knows the truth and wants to tell it without a desire to deceive. The Lord is this speaker in the case of the Veda, it is inferred by some.

The Prābhākara takes the view that everyday testimonial knowledge wears, like all knowledge, its truth on its sleeve; similarly Vedic knowledge. Speaker’s intention is irrelevant. A parrot can make us know something like a tape-recorder. And even a liar (S) deceived into believing p can communicate ¬p trying to deceive H who nevertheless learns the truth through S’s statement. Nyāya, in contrast, champions speaker’s intention, tātparya, as epistemically relevant. According to the later writers, speaker’s intention is not the trigger of testimonial knowledge on H’s part (which is instead the transmitting sentence under the interpretation of H), but is a slightly upstream causal factor relevant for certification. If we knew it were a parrot or a liar who was responsible for the statement, we would no longer believe. It is true that H has to understand something in the case of the parrot, etc. Otherwise, there would be nothing to check in finding out that the parrot’s speaking is a case of “apparent testimony,” śabda-ābhāsa (e.g., Gaṅgeśa, Tattva-cintā-maṇi, testimony chapter, 329). But discerning speaker’s intention is championed as necessary for disambiguation in some cases of testimony and as relevant to triggering figurative speech according to many including writers in the aesthetics literature called alaṅkāra-śāstra.

Testimonial knowledge is a matter of comprehending a statement, a transmitting sentence, and to be a transmitting sentence certain conditions must be met. The following three necessary conditions for a meaningful statement are proposed and discussed throughout the philosophical and grammatical literatures (Kunjunni Raja 1969: 149–169).

  1. words’ mutual “expectancy,” ākāṅkṣā
  2. semantic “fittingness,” yogyatā
  3. contiguity (or proper presentation, pronunciation and the like), āsatti

The words in a sentence have their “expectancy” mutually satisfied in the completion of the sentence as a string of words. This and the third condition are pretty obviously required for sentential meaning, but not the second, at least not to philosophers of language in the West, although the notion seems related to the a priori as understood in early modern philosophy. In any case, semantic “fittingness” is connected to a theory of figurative meaning throughout the schools including the aesthetics literature. A stock negative example is “The gardener is watering the plants with fire” (agninā siñcati). Watering cannot be done with fire, and so the meanings of the words do not fit together except possibly figuratively. Some define yogyatā in a positive fashion, but it seems easy to find counterexamples (Kunjunni Raja 1969: 164–166). Language has to be flexible so that we can report novelties. Furthermore, we understand something when we understand a false statement. Otherwise, again, we would not know where to look to determine its falsity, or truth, for that matter. Gaṅgeśa says explicitly that false statements as well as statements of doubt meet the requirement of semantic fittingness (Tattva-cintā-maṇi, testimony chapter, 372–373). Even statements that are not just false but that we know are false can pass the semantic-fittingness test, as, for example, (in the quip by A. Chakrabarti 1994) the views of one’s opponents! For these and other reasons, Gaṅgeśa, for one, defines yogyatā negatively as “absence of knowledge of a blocker (of testimonial knowledge)” (Tattva-cintā-maṇi, testimony chapter, Sanskrit, IV.iii.6, p. 136). This shows a coherence tie. We cannot even understand testimony way out of whack with what we know already.

Two Mīmāṃsā views compete to explain sentential unity, along with a third, a sentence holism belonging to the grammarian Bhartṛhari (third century), who holds that words have no meaning outside the context of the sentence, which is the basic semantic unit. Words are abstractions from sentences, and a sentence is understood holistically “in a flash” (sphoṭa; Bhartṛhari’s theory is called sphoṭa-vāda). This is an easy target for the Mīmāṃsākas, who point to our abilities to use the same words in different sentences. But the one camp, the Prābhākara, agrees with the grammarian that words do not convey meaning apart from the full sentence being understood, that is to say, apart from the full fact indicated being known “in a flash,” as it were. The other camp, the Bhāṭṭa, whose theory comes to be taken over by Nyāya, claims that individual words have reference in isolation, and that in understanding a sentence we understand the meaning of the individual semantic units which get combined not so much by the sentence as by the fact that makes a true sentence true, the relation holding the fact together becoming reflected in the unity of the sentence, so that each word’s meaning or referent is hooked up with every other. These two views are termed in Sanskrit anvita-abhidhāna-vāda, “reference of the connected,” which Siderits (1991) translates as the “related designation view,” and abhihita-anvaya-vāda, “connection of the referents,” which Siderits translates as the “words-plus-relation view.” However, the latter might not be the best rendering, since its advocates argue that the relation is nothing other than the individual denotees as related.

In other words, according to the more radically referentialist view, which is incrementalist, the relation is not just an additional element: it’s not words-plus-relation. No word is “unsaturated”; ‘bringing’ for example, requires that its referent be related to both an agent and an object and no reference to bringing would generate a bit of new testimonial knowledge if these were not also mentioned or the ideas of them supplied. There are only a few purely logical and syntactically binding words in Sanskrit, only a few (mainly connectives) that are just syncategorematic, since every other word is inflected and there is no need for prepositions, etc. Alternatively, we could say that every word is unsaturated because no word, no single semantic unit, conveys the meaning of a sentence by itself alone independently of its relation to at least one other unit. The main difference between the two Mīmāṃsā views is that the former insists that only a sentence successfully refers, not the individual words of which a sentence is composed, whose meanings have to be connected to one another in order for there to be reference (abhidhā, the primary mode or power, śakti, of language); whereas the latter holds that words do have reference individually but not to the connection of the things mentioned, which is given by the sentence as a whole. In both cases, the fact or object known by way of a sentence has constituents. On the second view, the fact is the relatedness of the words’ referents as they are in the world, a relatedness (anvaya) not indicated by a semantic unit. The connection is to one another of the things referred to, a connection in the world which we become aware of because of the order and connectedness (anvaya) of the words. Gopinath Bhattacharya writes apropos (seventeenth-century) Annambhaṭṭa’s discussion of the Bhāṭṭa theory (Annambhaṭṭa: 301–302): “It comes to this then that the understanding of a statement, i.e., of what is signified by the constituent terms in relation to one another, depends among other things on the presentation of the terms in the required order. But the order of arrangement of the terms is not itself a term of the sentence, so that it cannot be said that this order has its own śakti like the terms.”

Just what a word refers to is sometimes ambiguous not just apart from sentential context but within it. Still we know what the word means. We know that a speaker wants salt when S asks for it even though in Sanskrit the word used for salt, ‘saindhava’, is a homonym with a word that means horse. S’s intention to communicate p is in such a case crucial to disambiguation in that S speaks in a context (prakaraṇa). Ordinarily, the overall context need not be taken into account, according to New Nyāya philosophers, to ascertain the meaning of a sentence, which has to meet only the three conditions of grammaticality, semantic fittingness, and proper pronunciation. But we do have to take into account the overall context—let us say “speaker’s intention,” tātparya—it is stressed (e.g., by Annambhaṭṭa: 294–295), in some cases of ambiguity as also of figurative speech, which involves a second power of words, the power (śakti) to express meaning indirectly.

However, we have to be able to understand a spoken sentence to be able to determine a speaker’s intention, which we infer from what is said supplemented sometimes by contextual cues. Thus knowing the intention is not an invariable antecedent of testimonial knowledge. Understanding S’s intention is not a fourth condition on a statement’s meaningfulness from the perspective of H—except in some cases of ambiguity and indirect, figurative speech. But in those cases it is indeed crucial, and there is no way to get around the need to make it out in order to fix the meaning, which cannot be gathered at, so to say, a first pass.

But on a second pass, we are able to gather not only indirect, secondary meaning but also more information through inference. In this way, Annambhaṭṭa would explain what others see as the results of the activation of a third power of words, namely, dhvani, also called vyañjana, “suggestion” (289–293). In other words, if a sentence contains an ambiguous word or indirect, figurative meaning (admitted as a bona fide second power of words, śakti), there may well be no way to tell what it means without considering S’s intention. Now advocates of the third power analyze the stock example of indirect speech where a village is said to be in the Gaṅgā as suggesting that the village is cool and purified by association with the Gaṅgā. The whole point, they argue, of poetic use of indirect, figurative speech is to release the third power of suggestion. Why otherwise not simply say that the village is on the river bank? The speaker uses the figurative speech to suggest the attributes of coolness and purification. Annambhaṭṭa responds that if one understands from the statement these attributes then the indirect, figurative meaning (lakṣaṇā) of “in the Gaṅgā” is not just being on the bank of the river but on a bank that lends coolness and fosters purification. This is then just a more complex case of lakṣaṇā, which is indeed a second power of words (but there is no third), indicating a cool and purifying location on the indicated bank.

Finally we might mention that with veridical testimonial knowledge not involving figurative meaning where all three sentential conditions are met, we do not notice the grammaticality, etc., of the transmitting sentence or sentences. These factors have to be present, but we do not have to be aware of them. For figurative meaning, in contrast, we have to notice a blocker (Uddyotakara under Nyāya-sūtra 2.2.59), which paradigmatically may be thought of as a violation of semantic fittingness (Kunjunni Raja 1969: 166), though this is not precisely correct according to several theorists who provide examples of figures where semantic fittingness is not violated. Examples of less severe misfit occur than to water with fire. Violating yogyatā is not the only way to trigger the second power of words. Yet further exploration of figurative meaning and of “suggestion” (dhvani) would carry us outside of the epistemological into the aesthetics and grammatical literatures.

7. Analogy and Other Candidate Sources

7.1 Analogy and Similarity

Briefly we may consider the more exotic candidate sources proposed in the classical literature mainly within Mīmāṃsā (often elaborated by Vedāntins), beginning with analogy, which is viewed as the pramāṇa for knowledge of similarity in Mīmāṃsā and Vedānta but is rejected by the other schools, Vedic and non-Vedic alike, except for Nyāya which however provides a radical reinterpretation. To provide a hermeneutics of Vedic injunctions to make them suitable for practice in actual performances, the Mīmāṃsā exegetes need to be able to designate substitutes, of one type of grain for another, for example, or one animal for another, depending upon availability in the first place but upon similarity in the second place. In Vedānta, analogy is useful for understanding the Upanishads which make comparisons between spiritual or yogic experience and the experiences of ordinary humans, as pointed out by Kumar (1980: 110). Yogācāra, Jaina, and Nyāya logicians find similarity—or relevant similarity—to figure in inference as a knowledge-generating process. It is through cognizing similarity and dissimilarity that we arrive at knowledge of pervasion as required for inferential knowledge. A kitchen hearth counts as an “example” in the stock inference because of its relevant similarity to the mountain which is the center of inquiry. It is part of what is called the sapakṣa, the set of positive correlations, that make us know an inference-underpinning pervasion. Knowledge of similarity is not viewed in Nyāya (or Yogācāra, etc.) as the result of analogy as a knowledge source—for Nyāya, analogy is restricted to a subject’s learning the meaning of a word (and Yogācāra does not countenance it as a separate pramāṇa). But pervasion is known typically through generalization from cases (although in some cases a single observation, some say, will suffice), presupposing knowledge of relevant similarity which can be a matter of perception.

Vedānta and Mīmāṃsā philosophers, who take similarity to be a special object known through this special source, give examples different from the stock scenario provided by Gautama and elaborated by Vātsyāyana (under Nyāya-sūtra 1.1.8) who limit the scope of analogy to learning the meaning of a word. But for brevity’s sake, let us take up only the Nyāya theory. A subject S inquires of a forester about a gavaya, which is a kind of buffalo, having heard the word ‘gavaya’ used among his schoolmates but not knowing what it means, i.e., not knowing what a gavaya is. Questioned by S, the forester replies that a gavaya is like a cow mentioning certain specifics as also some dissimilarities. To simplify, Nyāya philosophers say that the forester makes an analogical statement (“A gavaya is like a cow”), whereby our subject S now knows in general (sāmānyataḥ) what the word means, according to Gaṅgeśa and followers (Tattva-cintā-maṇi, analogy chapter). But S does not yet know how it is used, does not know its reference, which is deemed a word’s primary meaning. Later encountering a gavaya buffalo, S says, “This, which is similar to a cow, is the meaning of the word ‘gavaya’,” a statement which expresses S’s new analogical knowledge. The knowledge has been generated by analogy, its “knowledge source,” pramāṇa.

The ontology of similarity is controversial. Several different theories are proposed, one of the best of which belongs to Gaṅgeśa, who sees it as a relational property supervening on other properties and defined as something’s having a lot of the same properties as something else. It is not a universal, he argues, for similarity relates a correlate (the gavaya buffalo) and a countercorrelate (the cow), whereas a universal, in contrast, rests as a unity in, for example, with cowhood, all individual cows. In this way it is like contact, samyoga, but there are also rather obvious differences. It is not reducible to any single category among the traditional seven (substance, quality, motion, universal, individualizer, inherence, and absence), for some substances are like one another as are certain qualities and actions. But similarity also is not, pace the Prābhākara, a category over and above the recognized seven. Gaṅgeśa’s main argument there is that similarity is not uniform. It is to an extent a property that is mind-imposed in that the counterpositive (the cow) is supplied from our side. Moreover, it supervenes on other properties.

7.2 “Presumption” (arthāpatti)

Another candidate source championed by Mīmāṃsā and Vedānta philosophers but rejected by everyone else as an independent pramāṇa is arthāpatti, a kind of reasoning to the best explanation which Nyāya views as the same as “negative-only” inference (see above). A stock example: from the premise, “Fat Devadatta does not eat during the day” (known by perception and/or testimony), the conclusion is known (by arthāpatti), “He eats at night.” For Nyāya, the inference (which is no special source) can be reconstructed where F = “is fat but does not eat during the day” and G = “eats at night”: Whoso F, that person G; what is not so (F) is not so (G), like Maitra (who eats during the day and not at night). This would be a “negative-only” inference so long as not only has Devadatta not been observed to eat at night but also there is no one else known to be like him in being fat and having been observed to eat only at night. We do know that he eats at night (though this has not been observed), and our inductive base is comprised only of negative correlations. Mīmāṃsā rejects this analysis and holds in contrast that presumption is an independent knowledge source and an important one, operative in basic language comprehension as well as in knowledge of various everyday facts. The reasoning is not inferential because no pervasion is known, it is commonly argued.

7.3 “Non-cognition” (anupalabdhi)

How do we know absences? I know that my glasses are not on the table but how? Dharmakīrti would answer, “By inference,” inferential knowledge of an absence being one of three fundamental types identified by the Yogācārin (see above). “If an elephant were in the room, I (S) would perceive it. I (S) do not perceive an elephant. Therefore, there is no elephant in the room”—similarly for my glasses not being on the table (presuming the table is not so cluttered that they could be concealed). Gautama and Vātsyāyana, without elaborating, agree that absences are known inferentially (Nyāya-sūtra 2.2.2). But Uddyotakara and the later tradition argue that we know absences sometimes perceptually. I cognize immediately my glasses’ absence when I look for them on the table.

Bhāṭṭa Mīmāṃsā says no, there is operative here a special knowledge source called “non-cognition” or “non-perception,” anupalabdhi. The main arguments center on the sufficiency of perception, or inference, to make known such negative facts, which clearly we do know. The Bhāṭṭa argues, for example, that perception makes known only presences. Indeed, Nyāya has a difficult time assimilating such knowledge to its theory of perception, in particular since the difficulty widens into what is known in analytic philosophy as the generality problem. Nyāya recognizes that an absence has a peculiar relational structure, namely, to relate a locus (the table) to a counterpositive (my glasses) and that the idea of the counterpositive is furnished by the cognizer entirely from memory. If memory can have such a crucial role in a type of perception, how then to draw the limits on what is perceptible? The Nyāya project threatens to spin out of control. Not surprisingly, therefore, there is a large literature on absence and its epistemology.

7.4 Gesture and Rumor

We learn some things from gesture (ceṣṭā), such as to come when beckoned by a conventionalized movement of the hand. Gaṅgeśa says this is an aid to testimonial knowledge, not really a form of it since it depends on other semanitc items, he says, being supplied (Tattva-cintā-maṇi, testimony chapter, 922–926). Rumor (aitihya) is defined by Vātsyāyana (under Nyāya-sūtra 2.2.1) as a testimony chain whose originator is unknown. The Nyāya attitude is to regard even it as presumptively veridical in consonance with the school’s overall theory of testimony.

8. “Suppositional Reasoning” (tarka)

Many classical Indian philosophers held that apparent certification may not be enough to warrant belief in some instances. Even if our beliefs/cognitions have indeed been generated by processes that would be counted knowledge sources did they not face counterconsiderations, in facing counterconsiderations—in being reasonably challenged—they are not trustworthy and do not guide unhesitating effort and action. There is a social dimension to knowledge, where reasoning reigns resolving controversy in ways over and above the sources. These are the ways of tarka, “hypothetical” or “suppositional reasoning.” Paradigmatically, tarka is called for in order to establish a presumption of truth in favor of one thesis that has putative source support against a rival thesis that also has putative source support, a thesis and a counterthesis both backed up by, for example, apparently genuine inferences (the most common situation) or by competing perceptual or testimonial evidence. By supposing the truth of the rival thesis and (in Socratic style) showing how it leads to unacceptable consequences or breaks another intellectual norm, one repossesses a presumption of truth, provided—the classical epistemologists never tire of emphasizing—provided one’s own thesis does indeed have at least the appearance of a knowledge source in its corner. The consensus across schools is that such arguments are not in themselves knowledge-generators, but they can swing the balance concerning what it is rational to believe.

Suppositional reasoning is what a philosopher is good at, drawing out of implications of opposed views and testing them against mutually accepted positions, according to, broadly speaking, criteria of coherence but also of simplicity. Here we come to the vital center of the life of a classical philosopher, which is reflected in honorific appellations and book titles, dozens of which use ‘tarka’ as in “Crest Jewel of Reasoning” (tarka-śiro-maṇi).

Udayana (Nyāya, eleventh century) appears to inherit a sixfold division of tarka according to the nature of the error in an opponent’s position, and expressly lists five types (a sixth, “contradiction” or “opposition,” either being assumed as the most common variety, or subsumed under Udayana’s fifth type, “unwanted consequence”). Philosophers from other schools present distinct but overlapping lists. The Nyāya textbook-writer, Viśvanātha, of the early seventeenth century, mentions ten, Udayana’s five plus five more, many of which are used by the Advaitin Śrīharṣa (probably Udayana’s younger contemporary) among other reasoners. They are: (1) self-dependence (begging the question), (2) mutual dependence (mutual presupposition), (3) circularity (reasoning in a circle), (4) infinite regress, and (5) unwanted consequence (including contradiction presumably)—Udayana’s five—plus (6) being presupposed by the other, the first established (a form of “favorable” suppositional reasoning), (7) (hasty) generalization, (8) differentiation failure, (9) theoretic lightness, and (10) theoretic heaviness.

It is tarka that establishes a presumption against skepticism. Gaṅgeśa (fourteenth century): “Were a person P, who has ascertained thoroughgoing positive correlations (F wherever G) and negative correlations (wherever no G, no F), to doubt that an effect might arise without a cause, then—to take up the example of smoke and fire—why should P, as he does, resort to fire for smoke (in the case, say, of a desire to get rid of mosquitoes)? (Similarly) to food to allay hunger, and to speech to communicate to another person?” (Translation from Phillips 1995: 160–161, slightly modified.) The argument, which is found in the Nyāya-sūtra and other works (e.g., Vātsyāyana, preamble to Nyāya-sūtra 1.1.1), is that without the confidence that presupposes knowledge, we would not act as we do.


Primary Texts

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Other Internet Resources

  • Bibliography, Encyclopedia of Indian Philosophies, by Karl Potter (University of Washington).


Portions of the present entry were taken from the author’s Epistemology in Classical India, London: Routledge, 2012.

Copyright © 2019 by
Stephen Phillips <stephen_phillips@utexas.edu>

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