Mental Causation

First published Thu Dec 18, 2003; substantive revision Thu Feb 2, 2023

Questions about the existence and nature of mental causation are prominent in contemporary discussions of the mind and human agency. Originally, the problem of mental causation was that of understanding how an immaterial mind, a soul, could interact with the body. Most philosophers nowadays repudiate souls, but the problem of mental causation has not gone away. Instead, focus has shifted to mental properties. How could mental properties be causally relevant to bodily behavior? How could something mental be a cause qua mental? After looking at the traditional Problem of Interaction, we survey several versions of the property-based problem along with potential solutions.

1. Preliminaries

1.1 The Importance of Mental Causation

Mental causation—the mind’s causal interaction with the world, and in particular, its influence on behavior—is central to our conception of ourselves as agents. Mind–world interaction is taken for granted in everyday experience and in scientific practice. The pain you feel when you sprain your ankle causes you to open the freezer in search of an ice pack. An intention to go to the cinema leads you to get into your car. Psychologists tell us that mental images enable us to navigate our surroundings intelligently. Economists explain fluctuations in financial markets by citing traders’ beliefs about the price of oil next month. In each case, a mental occurrence appears to produce a series of complex and coordinated bodily motions that subsequently have additional downstream effects in the physical world. Instances of apparent mental causation are so common that they often go unremarked, but they are central to the commonsense picture we have of ourselves. It’s not surprising, then, that questions about the nature and possibility of mental causation arise in a variety of philosophical contexts.

Ontology: Suppose you accept the “Eleatic Principle” that power is the mark of being: to exist is to have causal powers (Armstrong 1978, pp. 45–6; Oddie 1982). It’s plausible to think that if the mental has any causal powers at all, it can affect the physical world. Without such powers, the mental faces ontological embarrassment, even elimination.

Metaphysics: Mental causation is “at the heart of the mind-body problem” (Shoemaker 2001, p. 74), often figuring explicitly in how the problem is formulated (Mackie 1979; Campbell 1984; Crane 1999). To ask how mind and body are related just is, in part, to ask how they could possibly affect one another.

Moral psychology: Agency of the sort required for free will and moral responsibility appears to require mental causation. If your behavior is not caused by your mind’s activities—its deliberations, decisions, and the like—what sense would it make to hold you responsible for what your body does? You would appear to be scarcely more than a passive observer of your body’s activities. We would then need to abandon what Strawson (1962) calls our “reactive attitudes”, the moral attitudes and feelings (e.g., gratitude, resentment) so central to our interpersonal lives.

Action theory: It is widely believed that psychological explanation hinges on the possibility of mental causation. If your mind and its states, such as your beliefs and desires, were causally isolated from your bodily behavior, then what goes on in your mind could not explain what you do (Davidson 1963; Mele 1992; for dissent, see “noncausalists” such as Ginet 1990; Sehon 2005; Tanney 2013; and see the essays in D’Oro 2013). These observations about agency suggest a more basic conceptual point: if minds did not influence behavior, in what sense would anyone truly act? Sounds would be made, but no one would mean anything by them. Bodies would move, but no one would thereby do anything (Malcolm 1968; Horgan 2007).

Although each of the above points could be contested, collectively they create pressure to address the problem of mental causation—problem or problems: as will become clear, there is more than one way in which puzzles about the mind’s causal efficacy can arise.

1.2 Is This an Empirical Issue?

At least since Hume, philosophers have assumed that causal questions are largely empirical. We look to science to tell us, for example, the moon’s role in causing the tides, or smoking’s contribution to lung cancer: these are not considered philosophical questions. It might seem equally obvious that the mind’s causal role in producing behavior is also a matter for science to settle. So is it in fact the case that working scientists, and in particular, psychologists, find it necessary to appeal to distinctively mental phenomena to account for behavior? Is there evidence in neuroscience that mental states and processes figure in the production of actions?

Although most psychologists would without hesitation accept the causal interaction of minds and bodies, a small but growing number of empirical researchers have insisted that the evidence supports some version of epiphenomenalism, the thesis that mental states, while caused by physical happenings, exert no efficacy in return. Wegner, a psychologist, contends that accumulated empirical evidence overwhelmingly supports epiphenomenalism, at least with respect to conscious willing (Wegner 2002, 2004). He draws on influential work by Libet (1985, 2001, 2004) and others to argue that conscious intending is itself a product of nonconscious processes that do the real causal work, so that free will is “an illusion”. If Wegner and his colleagues are right, these results could have ancillary implications for the physical efficacy of mental states generally. (Note, that some dualists (e.g. Lowe 2006; Gibb 2013) have appealed to the same work by Libet to defend their own non-traditional models of psychophysical causation).

Because this research has received extensive treatment in recent work on free will, we will not consider it further, but instead refer interested readers to the sources cited above and to Mele 2014 for critical discussion and references. Here we simply note that traditional and contemporary attempts to assess the efficacy of mental states have run up against philosophical difficulties as well, difficulties that tend to overshadow the experimental evidence accumulated thus far. In this sense, the efficacy of mind is quite unlike that of, say, the moon or smoking. This will, we hope, become clear in the discussion to follow.

2. The Problem of Interaction

Some historians (e.g., Matson 1966; King 2007) say the mind-body problem is relatively recent, the most important source being Descartes’s “real distinction” between mind and body. That said, you can find topics closely related to mental causation in, for example, Plato’s Phaedo and Aristotle’s De Anima, and it might turn out that many features of the contemporary debate are present in some form or other in pre-modern texts (Caston 1997). Skirting such historical questions, we begin with Descartes, who, for better or worse, set the agenda for modern discussions of mental causation. The cluster of causal problems arising from the Cartesian conception of mind is The Problem of Interaction.

2.1 What is the Mind-Body Nexus?

According to Descartes, minds and bodies are distinct kinds of thing, or, in the technical terminology of the day, distinct kinds of substance. Bodies, he held, are spatially extended substances, incapable of feeling or thought; minds, in contrast, are unextended, thinking, feeling substances: souls. (We use “soul” with no theological implications to designate minds considered in the Cartesian way as immaterial substances.) Despite recognizing these deep differences, Descartes accepted the common belief that mind and body causally interact: “Everyone feels that he is a single person with both body and thought so related by nature that the thought can move the body and feel the things which happen to it” (in Cottingham et al. 1991, p. 228). But if minds and bodies are so radically different, it is not easy to see how they could interact. Descartes was well aware of the difficulty. Princess Elisabeth of Bohemia puts it forcefully to him in a 1643 letter, pressing Descartes to tell her

how the human soul can determine the movement of the animal spirits in the body so as to perform voluntary acts—being as it is merely a conscious substance. For the determination of movement seems always to come about from the moving body’s being propelled—to depend on the kind of impulse it gets from what sets it in motion, or again, on the nature and shape of this latter thing’s surface. Now the first two conditions involve contact, and the third involves that the impelling thing has extension; but you utterly exclude extension from your notion of soul, and contact seems to me incompatible with a thing’s being immaterial (in Anscombe and Geach 1954, pp. 274–5).

Elisabeth is expressing the prevailing mechanistic view as to how causation of bodies works: it must involve the cause’s impelling the body, where this requires contact between cause and effect. Since a soul could never come into contact with a body—souls have no spatial location—an immaterial soul could never impel, and so could never causally interact with, a body.

Elisabeth’s worries might seem quaint and outdated. Causal relations countenanced by contemporary physics can take several forms, not all of which are of the push-pull variety. Why shouldn’t soul–body interaction simply be included as another sort of “non-mechanistic” causation (Richardson 1982)? But Elisabeth’s objection is in fact just one version of a more general worry about soul–body interaction, a worry that rests on the following thesis about causation:

  • (CN) Any causal relation requires a nexus, some interface by means of which cause and effect are connected.

Elisabeth presumes that when an effect is bodily motion, the required nexus is spatial contact. But even if she is wrong about this (Garber 1983), (CN) nevertheless poses problems for the dualist: if contact is not the mind–body nexus, what is?

One line of thought appeals to the transference theory of causality. Here the idea is that identity—the persistence of something from cause to effect—provides the needed link. If something in a soul could become present in a body, this could bridge the immaterial and material. Descartes himself appears to accept such a theory, declaring in the Third Meditation that there could be nothing in an effect not present in its total efficient cause (Descartes 1642/1996, p. 28). But now the problem reasserts itself: if, as the substance dualist insists, bodies and minds are radically different, they have no properties in common. According to Descartes, a body’s properties are modes of extension, ways of being extended, while a soul’s properties are modes of something quite different, thought or consciousness. If causation involved transference, a Cartesian soul could not interact with a body (but see Hart 1988; Hoffman and Rosenkrantz 1991).

Does a dualist need to accept (CN), however? The notion of a causal nexus has come under criticism, often from philosophers working in the Humean tradition (Blackburn 1990). More generally, (CN) and kindred principles might be thought to rest on a conception of causality that is now obsolete, finding no place in modern physics (for further discussion, see the metaphysics of causation, §2). But the next three versions of the problem can arise even for those who reject the need for a causal nexus.

2.2 The Pairing Problem

A second version of the Problem of Interaction is the “Pairing Problem” (Kim 1973, 2005; Sosa 1984; Foster 1991, ch. 6). Imagine two exactly similar minds M1 and M2 and the bodies B1 and B2 to which they are “attached”, that is, the bodies with which they directly interact. In virtue of what is M1 causally paired with B1, and M2 with B2?

This is not the epistemological question of how we could know that these are the pairings (although this is troublesome, too). The question, rather, is metaphysical: in virtue of what are these the pairings? If minds were, like bodies, located in space, causal pairing could be achieved by the relative spatial locations of the substances (Bailey et al. 2011). Particular minds might be inside or “inhabit” particular bodies. But if minds are non-spatial souls, relative spatial location is unavailable to fill the pairing role. And since M1 and M2 are, by hypothesis, exactly similar, we cannot appeal to the different intrinsic properties that they might possess.

In reply, a dualist could appeal to “individualistic” powers (Unger 2006, pp. 242–59; Foster 1991, pp. 167–8). Powers are standardly thought of as powers to interact with some type of object. A key has the power to open this lock, but only by virtue of having the power to open any lock of this kind, the power to open any intrinsically comparable lock. Individualistic powers, in contrast, are powers possessed by an object to affect or be affected by a particular object. Think of a key with the power to open this lock, but without the power to open any intrinsically indiscernible lock. Likewise, a soul could have the power to interact with a particular body and no other. As the key example suggests, however, it is by no means obvious that powers could be individualistic in this sense (but see Audi 2011).

2.3 Conservation Laws

A third version of the Problem of Interaction appeals to conservation laws. The leading idea is simple: Soul–body interaction would have to change the amount of energy in the physical universe. When souls act, new energy would appear in, say, the brain. When souls are acted upon, some quantity of energy in the brain would vanish. But either scenario would contravene established conservation laws, which permit only the conversion and redistribution of energy (or mass–energy) within the physical universe, not its addition or subtraction.

This version of the problem has dogged dualism since the scientific revolution (Lowe 1992; Papineau 2000), and a number of contemporary philosophers present conservation as a major obstacle for dualists (Fodor 1981; Dennett 1991, p. 35; Heil 2012, p. 26; Papineau 2000). That said, turning the leading idea into a compelling argument has proven difficult. First, the conservation laws do not dictate what kinds of energy exist, only that they must operate conservatively. Hence, if sui generis mental energy existed, as long as it operated conservatively, this would be consistent with the conservation laws. Appealing to this fact, Hart (1988) advances a substance dualism and, combining it with a transference theory of causation (§2.1), argues that psychophysical causation consists in the transfer of such psychic energy. (For arguments against the existence of sui generis mental energy, see Papineau 2000). Secondly, what is needed is a conservation law weak enough to have been confirmed by physical science, but strong enough to preclude soul–body interaction. Averill and Keating (1981) consider a number of candidate “laws” and argue that none meets both criteria. Thirdly, it’s not clear in any case that a soul would have to add energy to (or receive it from) the brain in order to interact with it. Broad (1925, pp. 103–9) suggests a soul could act merely by redistributing the brain’s energy without changing its quantity. Furthermore, Lowe (2000) and Gibb (2013) both advance dualist models of psychophysical causation according to which the mental does not affect the brain either by affecting the amount of energy in it or by redistributing it. (For more recent discussion of these and other complexities, see Montero 2006; Koksvik 2007; Gibb 2010.)

2.4 The Completeness of the Physical

A fourth version of the Problem of Interaction is related to the third, but, because it is more prominent in the contemporary literature, especially in some of the “property-based” problems we examine below, we will develop this last version at greater length. The first premise is:

The Completeness of the Physical: Every physical effect has a sufficient physical cause.

When you trace the causal history of any physical effect—that is, of anything physical that has a cause—you will never need to appeal to anything non-physical. The physical universe contains within itself the resources for a full causal explanation of any of its (caused) elements, and in this sense is “complete”. The point applies, then, to whatever might occur to or within our bodies. Any instance of bodily behavior has a sufficient physical cause, which itself has a sufficient physical cause, and so on. In tracing the causal history of what we do, we need never appeal to anything non-physical.

This principle appears frequently in the mental causation literature under a number of labels: most common are variations of Completeness of the Physical (Crane 1995, 2001; Papineau 1993, 2000; O’Connor and Churchill 2010) or Physical Closure (Crane 1992; Baker 1993; Melnyk 2003; Kim 2005). We’ll call it Completeness for short.

Labels aside, several versions of the premise appear in the literature, and they can differ in strength. Note that the principle as formulated says nothing about whether the non-physical can affect the physical; a strengthened version prohibits this. (Closure is sometimes reserved for this stronger principle: LePore and Loewer 1987; Kim 1998, p. 40; Marcus 2005; compare Strong Causal Closure in Montero 2003.) An even more ambitious version blocks the non-physical from being cause or effect; such is suggested in Davidson’s work (see §5.1 and McLaughlin 1989, who uses Physical Comprehensiveness for this thesis.) As for weaker versions, Completeness could be limited to physical effects within the human body without affecting its relevance to the current topic. Note also that the principle is apparently committed to deterministic physical causation; a weakened version permits probabilistic causes. (For complications with such a weakening, see Montero 2003, and for other challenges with formulating Completeness, Lowe 2000; Gibb 2015.)

For simplicity, we stay with the principle as formulated at the outset. Why think that it’s true? Perhaps it is a conceptual truth: for an effect to be physical is, at least in part, for it to have a physical cause. This defense turns on the proper analysis of the concept physical, itself the subject of a contentious literature (see physicalism). Here we simply note that the principle does not seem analytic; it appears to be a substantive, empirical claim about the causal structure of the universe. (For more on the conceptual defense, see Crane 1991; Papineau 1991, 1993, §1.9; Lowe 1996, p. 56.)

It’s natural, then, to look to science for a defense, and especially physics (or physiology). Appeals to “current physical theory” (Antony and Levine 1997, p. 100), “the development of the sciences” (LePore and Loewer 1987, p. 630), and “physics textbooks” (Melnyk 2003, p. 289) are common, but what exactly in physical science supports the premise? An appeal to the conservation laws (2.3) might be thought to generate one such argument. Another argument is the no-gap argument. (See, for example Melnyk 2003, pp. 288–90; Papineau 1993, pp. 31–32). Physics has been hugely successful in identifying the causes of various kinds of physical event. To do so physicists have only needed to appeal to physical events. Not once have they had to appeal to sui generis mental events. Without doubt the causal account that physics provides of physical events contains gaps. But the crucial point is that is highly unlikely that physics will ever need to appeal to sui generis mental causes to fill these gaps—or so proponents of the no-gap argument claim. A similar no-gap argument can be presented at the level of neurophysiology. (See, for example, Melnyk 2003, p.187).

We will look at challenges to Completeness in a moment, but note for now that the premise by itself does not preclude the efficacy of souls. Even if every physical effect has a sufficient physical cause, some physical effects might have non-physical causes as well. This latest version of the Problem of Interaction thus requires a second premise:

No Overdetermination: There is no systematic overdetermination of physical effects.

This principle enjoys wide support in the literature. It is said that postulating systematic overdetermination in this context is “absurd” (Kim 1993a, p. 281), one of the “nonstarters” in the mental causation debate (Kim 1998, p. 65). But why? Perhaps it just looks like bad engineering (Schiffer 1987, p. 148). Or maybe the problem is that it would involve an “intolerable coincidence” (Melnyk 2003, p. 291): every time you act, there are two independent causal processes—one from your brain, another from your soul—converging on the same effect.

With the two premises now in place, the Problem of Interaction in our final version is straightforward. Assume for reductio that our souls routinely cause behavior. By Completeness, such effects also have sufficient physical causes, so behavior is systematically overdetermined. But this contradicts No Overdetermination. The dualist’s options would then seem to be severely limited. One is to embrace epiphenomenalism, a doctrine on which the mental, while caused by the physical, exerts no “downward” causal influence in return. A more radical option, parallelism, depicts bodies and souls as running in tandem, with no causal influence in either direction.

The two premises can, however, be challenged. Start with Completeness. Baker (1993), not herself a Cartesian dualist, argues that if the principle threatens to undermine our ordinary (and scientific) explanatory practices—many of which cite the mental—it’s Completeness that has to go. Entrenched explanatory practices trump any abstract metaphysical principles with which they might conflict (see also §§6.3, 7.5). Others argue that physical science, far from supporting the principle, may in fact undermine it. Hendry (2006) finds indications of “downward causation” in chemistry, while Stapp (2005) culls evidence from contemporary physics suggesting that there are, contrary to Completeness, causal gaps in the physical world, gaps filled in by the mental (see also Sturgeon 1998; Davies 2006). Emergentists in general deny the principle, either on scientific grounds or by appeal to our conscious experiences of agency (see emergent properties, esp. §4). And although the death of emergentism has been declared more than once on empirical grounds (McLaughlin 1992; Papineau 2000), the view continues to attract philosophers and scientists. (See Wilson 2021 and the contributions to Clayton and Davies 2006; Bedau and Humphreys 2008; Macdonald and Macdonald 2010; Paoletti and Orilia 2017; and Gibb, Hendry and Lancaster 2019.)

No Overdetermination has been targeted as well. Mills (1996), for example, defends mental–physical overdetermination as the most plausible route for the dualist to take. Overdetermination is plausible, the reasoning goes, if for any behavioral effect B, both a non-physical (mental) cause M and physical cause P satisfy the following counterfactual conditionals (among others):

  1. If M had occurred in the absence of P, B would still have occurred.
  2. If P had occurred in the absence of M, B would still have occurred.

If the dualist can reasonably claim that (1) and (2) are true, this will make a strong prima facie case for overdetermination. Along different lines, Lowe (2003) presents a model of dualist interaction on which, owing to systematic mind–body dependencies, overdetermination is not the intolerable coincidence worrying opponents of dualism. And more generally, the ban on systematic overdetermination has come under increased scrutiny in the context of the Exclusion Problem, to be discussed in §6.

3. The Ascent to Properties

Cartesian dualism has fallen out of favor among philosophers and cognitive scientists. There are, to be sure, non-Cartesian forms of substance dualism that might have the resources to confront the Problem of Interaction in its various guises (Hasker 1999; Lowe 2006). But the dominant view today would appear to be that if the mind is a substance at all, it is a physical substance—the brain, for instance. This sort of “substance monism” is in fact a consequence of the more general token identity theory: every concrete mental particular (token) is physical. We will assume token identity in what follows: minds, mental events, and any other mental “objects” are physical (see the mind/brain identity theory).

What becomes of the Problem of Interaction on such a view? It would seem to dissolve. While causation between brain and body is complex, even to the point of being empirically inscrutable, it does not pose the same problems as soul–body interaction. There are no special philosophical problems with brain–body interaction, nor is there anything especially odd or worrisome about an event in your brain causing, say, your arm to go up. Any philosophical questions here belong to the metaphysics of causation generally and have no special application to mental causation.

Nevertheless, philosophical worries about mental causation persist. Theoretical and commonsensical considerations leading us to think the mind or mental events cause behavior should also make us think that they do so as mental, i.e., in virtue of their mental properties. Properties figure in causal relations (Kim 1973; Mackie 1974, ch. 10; Armstrong 1989, pp. 28–9; Ehring 1997). Drop a square paperweight into soft clay and it will produce an impression. The shape of the impression can be traced to the shape of the paperweight, the depth of the impression to the mass of the paperweight. Here shape and mass are “causally relevant” or “causally efficacious” properties. In particular, they are relevant to certain properties of the impression. By contrast, other properties of the paperweight, such as its color or value, appear to be irrelevant to producing this kind of impression. Or consider a soprano who sings a high note, thereby shattering a glass. The sound, we can suppose, has a meaning—a semantic property—but it is the sound’s acoustic properties that are operative in producing the shattering; the semantic properties play no causal role, at least not with respect to this effect (Dretske 1989).

By themselves, these observations pose no special problem for the philosopher of mind. While the notion of a causally relevant property calls for analysis (Horgan 1989; Dardis 1993; Braun 1995), there is no reason at the outset for a token-identity theorist to be especially concerned about the efficacy of mental properties. Gus smiles because of the way his food tastes, that phenomenal property; Lilian walks to school along a particular route because of what she believes, that representational property. Assuming the mind is something physical, why should a mind’s causing behavior in virtue of its mental properties be any more puzzling than a paperweight’s causing a square impression in virtue of its shape?

Recent philosophical work on mental properties has revealed that matters are not so simple, however. Mental properties are alleged to have, not just one, but up to four features that make their efficacy philosophically puzzling, no less problematic than mind–body interaction is for the Cartesian dualist. These features will be discussed in the following sections. Each feature makes it appear as though mental properties, or some important family of them, are irrelevant to the production of behavior. The threat is a form of epiphenomenalism: even if minds and mental events are causes, they are not causes as (or qua) mental.

4. Problem I: Property Dualism

This “new epiphenomenalism” (Campbell 1984, ch. 7) immediately confronts a particularly strong version of property dualism, one insisting that mental properties are sui generis, perhaps dependent on, but in no way reducible to the dispositional and structural properties recognized by the physical sciences. Some property dualists accord this status only to a certain class of mental property, namely qualia, the “what it’s like” features of conscious experience. Other property dualists, including some emergentists, are willing to extend the thesis to all mental properties.

Suppose that this robust form of property dualism is true. Can mental substances or events cause what they do qua mental, in virtue of their mental properties? The arguments against soul–body interaction, now couched in terms of properties, could enter again here. For example, if you were worried about the mind–body nexus for souls (§2.1), it seems you should also wonder how non-physical properties can find any traction in the physical world. Similarly, Completeness (§2.4) seems to lose none of its attractiveness when formulated explicitly in terms of properties. You could add to the principle a clause stipulating that a “sufficient physical cause” is one that’s sufficient in virtue of its physical properties (see also §5.4). Bring in No Overdetermination, and the efficacy of mental properties is again threatened. The arguments here and the responses to it are structurally similar to those in §2, so we will not pursue further this version of the property-based problem. (Property dualism also faces the Exclusion Problem, to be discussed in §6.)

5. Problem II: Anomalous Monism

Another version of the property-based problem of mental causation can be traced to Davidson’s influential paper, “Mental Events” (Davidson 1970). There Davidson defends an account of the mind–body relation he calls “anomalous monism”, a view that at first appears to save mental causation, but in the end might deny efficacy to mental properties.

5.1 The Argument for Anomalous Monism

At the core of anomalous monism are three principles:

Principle of Causal Interaction: Some mental events interact causally with physical events.

Principle of the Nomological Character of Causality: Events related as cause and effect fall under strict laws.

Anomalism of the Mental: There are no strict laws on the basis of which mental events can be predicted and explained.

According to Davidson, the apparent tension among these principles gives rise to the mind–body problem. Most of us unquestioningly assent to the first principle. The second is more controversial, although Davidson provides little argument for it. Here we just note that it’s not as strong as it seems, for “strict” is not synonymous with “deterministic”. A strict law is exceptionless, but could be either deterministic or probabilistic.

The third principle is the most contested of the three. It rules out strict laws in psychology; in particular—and most importantly for present concerns—it rules out strict psychophysical laws, that is, laws connecting the mental and physical. According to Davidson, application conditions for mental predicates feature a rationality constraint absent from the application conditions for physical predicates. In ascribing beliefs to others, for instance, we employ a principle of charity that counsels us to make these believers as rational as possible. But this normative constraint has, as Davidson puts it, “no echo” in the physical realm. In this regard, mental and physical predicates are misaligned in a way that precludes strict psychophysical laws.

Now the second two principles seem to rule out the first. If causation requires strict laws, and there are no strict psychophysical laws, how can the mental be causally efficacious? But Davidson notes there is a way to save the first principle: as long as every mental event is physical, the first principle is compatible with the other two. In this way, the three principles entail event monism. At the same time, Davidson’s view entails type dualism, for the anomalism of the mental (the third principle) precludes identities between mental and physical types. Most philosophers find it natural to say that types are properties, so Davidson is sometimes described as a property dualist, a convenient label for the time being (but see §5.5).

5.2 The Charge of Epiphenomenalism

Davidson’s property dualism, and the principle that lies behind it, have led to a serious charge: anomalous monism robs mental properties of any causal significance.

Suppose Gus decides to illuminate the room and subsequently flips a switch, thereby turning on the light. In this case we have a cause that, if Davidson is right, could be given both a mental and a physical description, and an effect that has a physical description. If this means that the cause has a mental property (in virtue of which it satisfies a mental description) and a physical property (in virtue of which it satisfies a physical description), we are faced with a further question. Granting that the event with the mental property is the event with a physical property, why should we think that the mental property had anything at all to do with the event’s physical effect? Davidson’s second two principles appear to block such relevance. If all causal relations are subsumed under strict laws, and if there are no strict psychophysical laws, then any instance of mind–body causation is subsumed only by physical laws. But then it looks as though only a mental event’s physical properties are relevant to what it causes. The mental properties (or mental types) are causally irrelevant (see, e.g., Stoutland 1980; Honderich 1982; Sosa 1984; a review of this literature is in McLaughlin 1989).

5.3 Counterfactual Dependence

LePore and Loewer (1987) look to counterfactuals to answer this charge (see also Horgan 1989; LePore and Loewer 1989; Block 1990; Loewer 2007). The central idea is that anomalous monism permits physical effects to depend counterfactually on mental properties. And such dependence secures an important kind of causal relevance for the mental, the sort that LePore and Loewer call “bringing about”. On their view, a’s being F brings about b’s being G when the following conditions are met:

  1. a causes b.
  2. a is F and b is G.
  3. If a had not been F, b would not have been G.
  4. a’s being F and b’s being G are logically and metaphysically independent.

Now suppose a mental event, such as a decision to turn on the light, causes Gus to move his finger, thereby flipping the light switch. Here the crucial counterfactual is: If the cause had not been a decision to turn on the light, the effect would not have been a switch-flipping. This is plausible, as are similar counterfactuals in a wide range of cases. But are such counterfactuals compatible with anomalous monism? LePore and Loewer say Yes: while Davidson prohibits strict laws connecting mental and physical properties, he apparently leaves room for non-strict laws. Such laws are enough to ground or “support” counterfactuals. Consider, by analogy, the properties of being a match-striking and being a match-lighting. If there is a law connecting such properties, it is evidently non-strict: striking causes lighting only ceteris paribus. Nevertheless, we can assert with confidence, after a given lighting, that if the match had not been struck, it wouldn’t have lit. Non-strict psychophysical laws would similarly appear to ground counterfactuals connecting mental and behavioral properties.

This counterfactual defense is attractive for a number of reasons. It captures a sense in which mental properties make a difference to behavior, but in a way that’s apparently compatible with anomalous monism. It respects our causal intuitions about a wide range of cases. And it fits well with the more general counterfactual theory of causation, which many philosophers have found independently plausible. Moreover, Davidson himself seems sympathetic to the defense (Davidson 1993; but see §5.5).

In spite of these advantages, a worry is that the pertinent counterfactuals don’t after all ensure causal relevance, and in this sense don’t vindicate anomalous monism. This objection can take the form of direct counterexamples (Braun 1995; Garrett 1999), but here we look at a broader concern.

When a counterfactual is true, there should be something in the world that makes it true. Even granting that, if the cause had not had its mental property, the effect would not have had its behavioral property, in virtue of what is this true? This truthmaker, not the counterfactual itself, is what matters in determining whether a property is causally relevant. And the worry is that once we look at the truthmakers in the mental case, the threat of epiphenomenalism crops up again. Although the effect counterfactually depends on the mental property, this is only because the mental property depends on a physical property doing the real work. The mental property looks like a freeloader (Kim 1998, pp. 70–3, 2007; compare Crane 2008 on a similar issue).

LePore and Loewer discuss a version of this worry. Condition (3), an objector might say, is too crude to test for causal relevance, for the counterfactual holds only because removing F from a also removes some other property F* of a, and it’s the absence of F* that’s responsible for b’s not being G. A better counterfactual test evaluates the effect’s status given that a is not F and all of a’s other properties—or at least all that are potential causal rivals to F—are held fixed. If b is not G in that case, only then can we credit F with causal relevance. But mental properties fail this more refined test. Consider again Gus’s decision to turn on the light, and remove its mental property, this time holding fixed its physical properties. It seems clear that he would still flip the switch. After all, the physical properties of the cause figure in an exceptionless law according to Davidson. It looks as if the physical properties of your decision “screen off” the mental property, making the latter irrelevant.

LePore and Loewer concede that mental properties are screened off by physical properties. But they argue that this more refined test is too demanding, for it would also mean that the physical properties of a mental cause are irrelevant. Note in particular that the decision’s mental properties screen off its physical properties: if the cause had lacked its physical properties yet had still been a decision to turn on the light, it would have caused Gus to flip the switch (ceteris paribus: here a hedged law, which anomalous monism permits, is in play). Screening off thus goes both ways, and since few would want to deny causal relevance to the physical properties, we should not let screening off impugn the significance of mental properties either.

Antony (1991) replies that there is no symmetry here, at least not given anomalous monism. While the decision’s physical properties screen off its mental properties, the reverse doesn’t hold. Suppose again that the cause had lacked its physical properties but had still been a decision to turn on the light. On anomalous monism, Antony argues, there’s no saying what Gus’s decision would have caused, for mental properties, being anomalous, place no constraints on the causal structure of the world. (See also Leiter and Miller 1994.)

The freeloader problem arises in a variety of contexts in the mental causation literature, not just in discussions of anomalous monism. It will return under a number of guises in what follows.

5.4 Lawful Sufficiency

Fodor (1989) apparently agrees that counterfactuals capture a kind of causal relevance, but he argues that LePore and Loewer have settled for too little. On Fodor’s view, mental properties can be relevant to behavior in a stronger sense in which they are sufficient for their effects and in this way “make a difference”. Fodor spells out sufficiency in terms of laws: a property makes a difference if “it’s a property in virtue of the instantiation of which the occurrence of one event is nomologically sufficient for the occurrence of another” (Fodor 1989, p. 65, note omitted).

Might such an account save anomalous monism from the charge of epiphenomenalism? On the face of it, it cannot, for as we’ve noted, mental properties on Davidson’s view appear only in hedged laws, laws that include an implicit ceteris paribus rider. Consider a candidate psychological law:

  • (L) If an agent, a, wants x, believes x is obtainable by doing y, and judges y best, all things considered, then a forms the intention to y and subsequently y’s on the basis of this intention, ceteris paribus.

The ceteris paribus clause here would seem to block the mental properties in question from being causally sufficient for the behavioral effect. But perhaps not: according to (L), the mental properties are sufficient for the behavioral effect when the ceteris paribus conditions are satisfied. And this sort of causal sufficiency, Fodor argues, is all anyone could reasonably want for mental properties.

But can Davidson help himself to such an account? Davidson appears to think so (1993, p. 10), as does McLaughlin (1989), who also appeals to hedged laws. Fodor, however, doubts his account is compatible with anomalous monism; such doubts are developed by Antony (1991) and Kim (1993b). The question turns largely on Davidson’s reasons for thinking the mental is anomalous, and on whether these reasons permit him to appeal to hedged laws in the way the laws account requires.

Supposing anomalous monism is compatible with Fodor’s account, you might still wonder whether nomological sufficiency is enough for causal relevance. An account of causal relevance in terms of laws is natural given the tight connections between laws and properties (see laws of nature, §3). But those sympathetic to Fodor’s position might still ask (as Fodor himself does) what the causal mechanism is in mental–physical interactions. For example, it could turn out that the reason psychophysical laws such as (L) hold is that mental properties are themselves grounded in more basic, physical properties, and that only the latter do genuine causal work: mental properties again look like freeloaders (§5.3), merely piggybacking on the real bearers of causal powers (LePore and Loewer 1989; Block 1990; Leiter and Miller 1994; Marras 2003).

5.5 The Ascent to Properties Reconsidered

Davidson replies to his critics in “Thinking Causes” (Davidson 1993). In that paper he sometimes speaks favorably of “causally efficacious” properties, and he helps himself to both hedged laws and counterfactuals to secure the efficacy of mental properties. But his considered position appears less conciliatory. He clearly denies a crucial assumption of his critics, namely, that causes do their causing in virtue of their properties. When an event causes something, it doesn’t do so qua this or that: it just causes what it does, full stop. Were this so, none of the property-based problems discussed here could get off the ground (Crane 1995; Campbell 1997; Gibb 2006).

Such a response seems to miss the point (Kim 1993b; McLaughlin 1993; Sosa 1993). All parties in this dispute agree that mental events can cause physical events. The difficulty is to understand how they could do so in virtue of their mental (rather than their physical) properties, how they could have physical effects qua mental. The principle of the Nomological Character of Causation (§5.1) apparently requires that, when one event causes another, it does so in solely virtue of its physical properties.

But Davidson is part of a nominalist tradition that rejects properties, at least as his critics conceive of them. Davidson instead formulates anomalous monism in terms of predicates and descriptions. An event is mental if it answers to a mental predicate (that is, it can be picked out using a mental description), physical if it answers to a physical predicate (it can be referred to using a physical description). Davidson’s critics assume that if an event answers to both sorts of predicate, it includes a mental property and a physical property. But Davidson thinks about the mental–physical distinction as merely a difference in description, not as the expression of an ontological divide between kinds of property. For Davidson, then, it makes no more sense to ask whether an event had a particular effect in virtue of being mental or in virtue of being physical than it would to ask whether its effect stemmed from its being described in English or in German. (For further discussion, see Heil 2009.)

6. Problem III: Exclusion

While reflection on property dualism or anomalous monism can lead to our next property-based problem, another route is by way of the doctrine of non-reductive physicalism. Like the property dualist, the non-reductive physicalist holds that mental properties are not physical. But unlike the property dualist, the non-reductive physicalist insists on a strong dependence of the mental on the physical: mental properties are “realized” or “constituted” by physical properties. This strong tie between the mental and physical is the subject of a large contemporary literature, some of which we touch on below.

6.1 Functionalism and Multiple Realizability

Non-reductive physicalism in its current form grew out of functionalism, according to which mental properties are functional properties. To be in pain, for example, is a matter of being in a state with a certain causal profile, a state that’s caused by tissue damage, and causes certain overt responses (moans, attempts to repair the damage) as well as other mental states (e.g., beliefs that one is in pain). But, argue functionalists, it is most unlikely that we could identify a single kind of physical state playing this role in every actual and possible case of pain. Human beings differ in endless tiny physiological ways: your neurological states, including states you go into when you are in pain, probably differ subtly from another person’s. Human beings’ neurological states, in turn, differ from those of a cat or a dog, and perhaps dramatically from states of an octopus. You might even imagine encountering aliens with vastly different biologies, but to which you would unhesitatingly ascribe pains.

Here we arrive at a core thesis of functionalism: states of mind are “multiply realizable”. The property of being in pain can be realized in a wide variety of physical (and perhaps non-physical) systems. A creature is in pain in virtue of being in a state with the right sort of causal profile, some sort of neurological state, say. But the property of being in pain cannot be identified with this neurological state, because creatures of other kinds can be in pain in virtue of being in vastly different physical conditions. Functionalists often put this point by saying that mental properties are “higher-level” properties, properties possessed by objects by virtue of their possession of appropriate “lower-level” properties, their realizers.

6.2 The Exclusion Problem

Now, however, we are again confronted with the threat of epiphenomenalism. If mental properties are not physical, how could they make a causal difference? Whenever any mental (functional) property M is instantiated, it will be realized by some particular physical property P. This physical property is unproblematically relevant to producing various behavioral effects. But then what causal work is left for M to do? It seems to be causally idle, “excluded” by the work of P.

This version of the problem of mental causation has appeared in various guises. Much of the contemporary literature is inspired by Malcolm 1968, especially as refined in Kim 1989, 1993c, 1998, 2005. Whatever its precise formulation (cp. Shapiro and Sober 2007; O’Connor and Churchill 2010; historical perspective is in Patterson 2005), the Exclusion Problem has clear affinities with the other problems we’ve looked at so far. Consider our claim that the realizing property P must play a role in producing a particular behavioral effect. This would seem to be justified either by an appeal to Completeness (§2.4) or to Davidson’s doctrine (§5.1) that causal relations must fall under strict (and so physical) laws. Moreover, the argument’s depiction of P and M as competing for causal relevance—one must exclude the other—would seem to require a principle such as No Overdetermination (§2.4). And the fundamental worry that P might exclude M looks exactly like the freeloader problem that badgers mainstream attempts to save anomalous monism (§§5.3–4).

In spite of these similarities, the Exclusion Problem is in one important respect unique: unlike the problems we’ve looked at so far, exclusion worries generalize to a wide range of phenomena outside of the mental. Any properties, mental or otherwise, that are multiply realizable in physical systems are threatened with causal irrelevance. (For discussion of this and related issues, see Kim 1998, pp. 77–87; Noordhof 1999; Bontly 2001; Gillett and Rives 2001; Block 2003; Walter 2008.)

Some philosophers (e.g., Fodor 1989; Baker 1993; Shapiro 2010) take this general nature of the problem to be an encouraging sign. We happily accept biological, or meteorological, or geological properties as causally significant despite their being distinct from their physical realizers. Why then imagine that exclusion threatens the efficacy of mental properties? Others turn this argument around, insisting that the alleged efficacy of biological and other “special science” properties is by no means sacrosanct (Antony 1995). Causal powers we attribute to them must respect what our best metaphysics tells us. And in any case, the central issue is not so much whether mental properties (and the rest) are causally relevant to the production of physical effects, but how they could be (Kim 1998, pp. 61–2, 78–9; Antony and Levine 1997, p. 96; McLaughlin 2006). Even if the Exclusion Problem, because it generalizes, does not tempt us to embrace epiphenomenalism, it presses on us a responsibility to explain how mental properties could play a causal role given that they appear to be screened off by their physical realizers.

The Exclusion Problem is the subject of a large and still-growing literature. In the next few sub-sections, we look at some of the main lines of response, dividing them into three broad categories.

6.3 Autonomy Solutions

The Exclusion Problem presents us with a picture on which higher-level mental properties compete with their lower-level physical realizers. Physical properties are unproblematically relevant in the production of behavior, and so mental properties must either find a way to do the work that their realizers are already doing or face exclusion. But some philosophers would insist that this picture is deeply misleading: mental properties enjoy causal relevance in their own right and are not threatened by exclusion from physical properties.

This “autonomy solution” (Jackson 1996, §2) can take a variety of forms. One version starts by observing that psychological explanations—and more generally, explanations in the special sciences—are in an important sense independent of physical explanations. Psychological explanations typically abstract away from details of lower-level implementation, appealing instead to their own distinctive kinds and laws. Explanations in the special sciences can thus proceed independently of those in the lower-level physical sciences. If the structure of the causal order reflects these explanatory practices, mental properties need not be threatened by exclusion. Mental and physical causes can peacefully coexist. (Variations on this theme appear in Dennett 1973; Baker 1993; Van Gulick 1993; Garrett 1998; Hardcastle 1998; Marcus 2001; Menzies 2003; Raymont 2003; Ross and Spurrett 2004; Woodward 2008; Zhong 2014; see also §7.5.)

This appeal to explanation can naturally lead to (though it does not entail) another autonomy solution, the dual explanandum strategy. The Exclusion Problem presents a mental (functional) property M and its physical realizer P as competing to be causally relevant to the same effect, namely a bit of behavior. But M might not be threatened with exclusion if M and P are causally relevant to different properties of the effect. Return for a moment to the paperweight example from §3. The shape of the paperweight is relevant, not to the impression simpliciter, but to the impression’s shape. In general, a causally relevant property is relevant to some particular property of the effect (Horgan 1989). Perhaps, then, M and P do not causally compete because they are parts of separate, autonomous causal lines to different properties of the effect.

Consider one way this might work. Behavioral properties, just like mental properties, appear to be multiply realizable. For example, there is more than one way to hail a cab, many different physical realizations of this kind of behavior. Now suppose a belief causes you to hail a cab. In accordance with Completeness, some physical property P of the belief is sufficient for your behavior. But strictly speaking, P is relevant only to the particular way in which you hailed the cab, the particular physical realization of your hailing. What, then, is responsible for your behavior’s higher-level property of simply being a cab-hailing? It’s natural to suppose that it’s a higher-level property of your belief, namely, some mental property, such as the belief’s representational content. (For proposals along these lines, see Yablo 1992; Thomasson 1998; Marras 1998; Crisp and Warfield 2001; Gibbons 2006; Schlosser 2009; see also §§7.3–4.)

A strength of autonomy solutions is that they secure a causal role for mental properties without running afoul of Completeness, as the physical realization of behavior is always matched with some physical properties of its cause. But do autonomy solutions respect No Overdetermination? Here matters are not as straightforward. Autonomy solutions present us with two properties, P and M, each sufficient for the behavioral effect. It might seem as if the dual explanandum strategy avoids this awkwardness, since P and M are relevant to different properties of the effect. But even here, overdetermination threatens, as the effect’s behavioral property is produced twice: directly by M, and indirectly by P, which produces the behavioral property’s physical realizer, which itself necessitates the behavioral property.

Proponents of autonomy solutions might grant these points but claim that such “overdetermination” is innocuous, far from the “intolerable coincidence” threatening Cartesian dualist accounts of mental causation (§2.4), for the two causal lines present are not independent. (The nature of overdetermination has itself become the subject of a literature inspired, in part, by the Exclusion Problem. See, e.g., Funkhouser 2002; Bennett 2003; Sider 2003; Walter 2008; Carey 2011; Bernstein 2016; Kroedel 2019.)

6.4 Inheritance Solutions

Autonomy solutions can make it appear that the causal powers of mental properties “float free” of their physical realizers, bringing to mind the doctrine of parallelism (for replies, see Thomasson 1998; Marcus 2001, §3.3). Some non-reductive physicalists have accordingly looked to tie the causal powers of mental properties more closely to those of their physical realizers. The idea is that mental properties are so intimately related to their realizers that the former “inherit” the causal powers of the latter. The relation between levels is not one of rivalry, such that the physical might exclude the mental, but one of cooperation. Nor, moreover, does there seem to be any threat of overdetermination, since the mental works through the physical. (Compare the metaphor of “transparency” in Jackson 1996.)

On some versions of the inheritance solution, what the higher-level mental property derives from its physical realizer is some weaker or “lower-grade” form of causal relevance. For example, Jackson and Pettit (1988, 1990) distinguish the robust “causal efficacy” of physical properties from the weaker “causal relevance” of higher-level properties. Causal relevance in this sense is an explanatory notion: as one might put it, behavior is produced at the physical level, but by being realized in the physical, mental properties inherit an explanatory relevance they wouldn’t have otherwise. An advantage of such a view is that it accords a derived form of relevance to mental properties, but in a way that respects both the priority of physical causation embodied in Completeness as well as the principle of No Overdetermination. (For similar views, see Kim 1984; Levine 2001, §1.5; Segal 2009. Those who appeal to the counterfactual dependence of behavior on the mental [§5.3] might also fall into this category. For an answer to the charge that counterfactual dependence is “causation lite”, see Loewer 2007, Menzies 2007.)

If such a weakening seems to amount to epiphenomenalism, you might look for an inheritance solution on which mental properties are efficacious in the same sense that their physical realizers are (compare the “homogeneity assumption” in Crane 1995). How can this be done without violating No Overdetermination? Well, suppose that a mental property is, in spite of being distinct from its physical realizer, immanent in this realizer; M, that is, is somehow nothing over and above P. In that case, any causal work done by P is, in a straightforward way, inherited by M. Overdetermination is avoided because M’s work is included in P’s.

The metaphysical details of such a picture matter. Otherwise, “immanence”, “nothing over and above”, and the like will turn into mere labels for that psychophysical relation, we know not what, that solves the Exclusion Problem. Accordingly, several promising lines of inquiry have been pursued. Mental and physical properties are said to be related by, for example, the determinable–determinate relation (Yablo 1992; critics include Ehring 1996; Worley 1997; Funkhouser 2006), constitution (Pereboom 2002; critics include Ney 2007; Heil 2011), metaphysical necessitation (Bennett 2003, 2008), physical explicability (Antony 1991), physical implementation (Marras 2003), and grounding (Kroedel and Schulz 2016).

You might ask why any of these relations should secure the desired solution. One thought is that if mental properties are immanent in their physical realizers, the causal powers of a mental property are included among those of its realizer. Consider again mental property M and one of its realizers in a given instance, P. Plausibly, M’s powers are included in P’s. Both properties, for example, have the power to cause a certain kind of behavior, but because of its greater “specificity”, P has in addition to this powers that M lacks. Now in general we don’t think that wholes causally compete with, or are excluded by, their parts. When Gus steps on Lilian’s toe, his foot’s causing Lilian discomfort doesn’t exclude Gus’s causing her discomfort. Both Gus and his foot coexist as causes, without competition and, we might add, without overdetermination. A similar point could be made about properties: if the causal powers of M are included in those bestowed by P, then P’s causal relevance to behavior, far from excluding M’s, includes it. (Approaches along these lines have been developed in Antony 1999; Shoemaker 2001, 2007; Wilson 1999, 2011; Clapp 2001; critical discussions include Heil 1999, 2011; McLaughlin 2007; Kim 2010; Ney 2010; Audi 2012.)

6.5 Identity Solutions

Autonomy and inheritance solutions grant at least this much to the Exclusion Problem: mental and physical properties are numerically distinct, however intimately they are otherwise related. But a third sort of strategy tries to undermine the argument at exactly this point: any mental property just is its physical realizer. If M=P, there’s no question of one’s excluding the other, nor is there any mystery of how M can work through P, for M and P are one and the same.

This sort of psychophysical property identity would seem to be blocked by the multiple realizability argument sketched earlier. But that argument, in spite of its wide appeal, has come under attack from several directions (see multiple realizability, §2). For example, some (Kim 1992; Lewis 1994; Jackson 1995; Heil 2003) take the argument to show, not that mental properties are distinct from their physical realizers, but that what we thought was one kind of mental property is actually many. Pains realized by different physical properties, in spite of having the same name (“pain”), are different, though similar, mental properties. There is no such property as pain simpliciter, only pain-for-this-physical-structure and pain-for-that-physical structure. Once such “structure-specific” identities are allowed, we can say that M (now just, say, pain-for-human beings) is identical with P, M’s “realizer” in human beings (replies include Fodor 1997; Block 1997; Marras 2003; Moore and Campbell 2010).

This solution comes at a price: it forces us to abandon the belief that pain is a single, natural kind. There is, however, a way to preserve this doctrine while pursuing a strategy that’s otherwise similar to the one just sketched. The essential idea is that “property” as we’ve used the term so far is ambiguous. A property could be what characterizes an object (event), or what unifies several objects as a “one across many”. Now suppose the characterizing properties are tropes: particularized properties, unique to each object. And suppose the unifying properties are something else—call these “types”. If the mental “properties” that are causally relevant to behavior are tropes, and the mental “properties” mentioned in the multiple realizability argument are types, there’s no reason to think that this argument rules out psychophysical property-identities in any way that leads to exclusion worries. The M-trope and the P-trope are one and the same trope falling under two types, mental and physical. This proposal allows for a single type pain shared by diverse creatures; it’s just that this type is not the same sort of entity (a trope) that’s efficacious in the production of behavior (Heil 1992; Robb 1997; Heil and Robb 2003; what appears to be a similar view is defended by Macdonald and Macdonald 1986, 1995a; see also Whittle 2007.)

One worry about this proposal is that it appears to raise the Exclusion Problem all over again, this time at the level of properties (tropes). If a single property is both mental and physical, Completeness and No Overdetermination force us to say that it’s efficacious only qua physical, not qua mental. (For this and other criticisms, see Noordhof 1998; Raymont 2001; Gibb 2004; Macdonald and Macdonald 2006; Alward 2008; Maurin 2008; see Robb 2013 for some replies.)

6.6 Necessary Effects: A Deeper Problem for Functionalism?

Functionalism, along with any non-reductive theory of mind, faces the problem just discussed. But even if exclusionary worries are finessed, functionalism faces an additional and possibly more fundamental problem.

As we noted earlier, functionalism characterizes states of mind causally. To be in a given mental state is to be in a state with the right sort of causal profile, a state bearing the right sorts of relation to other states. Think of functional states as nodes in a network of states, the identity of which depends on the relations they bear to other nodes, and think of the realizers as occupants of these nodes. All there is to a node is the potential causal relations it bears to other nodes (not so for the occupants, which have intrinsic properties). Suppose, then, that F and G are functional properties—nodes in this network—and that all there is to something’s being F is its being a G-causer. The resulting generalization, “Fs cause Gs”, is no doubt true, but it is vacuous, equivalent to the generalization that G-causers cause Gs.

This appears to strip functional properties of their causal efficacy. Why? One line of thought appeals to Hume’s celebrated doctrine that there can be no necessary connections between distinct existences. A mental property and its would-be effect are distinct, yet functionalism entails that they enjoy a necessary connection. On the Humean doctrine, such a connection could not be causal. Another, closely related, version of the problem requires that causal relations be subsumed by empirical laws. But there are no such laws available for functional properties if all of the relevant generalizations are analytic and vacuous. (The foregoing argument in either version threatens to generalize to all dispositional properties: see dispositions, §6. For the problem aimed at functionalism in particular, see Block 1990; Rupert 2006; functionalism, §5.2.)

This argument echoes the logical connection argument advanced in the 1950’s and 60’s against causal accounts of action (e.g., Melden 1961, pp. 52–3). Given that reasons (desires, intentions) are not logically distinct from the actions they rationalize, reasons could not cause actions. In response, Davidson (1963) noted that logical connections hold among predicates or descriptions of events, not among events themselves. A cause could be described in various ways, some of which will involve the effect: consider “the cause of the fire caused the fire”. This is hardly informative, but it’s not thereby false. And of course the statement, far from precluding a causal relation, explicitly asserts it. That said, if the claim is true, it should be possible to identify the cause of the fire independently of reference to the effect—as “the match’s igniting”, for instance. In defense of his own causal theory of action, Davidson argued that such a re-description of mental causes is always available, at least in principle (see §5.1).

But Davidson’s saving move appears not to be available for the functionalist, for in the case of functional states and properties, no such independent descriptions are available, as the nature of a functional property is exhausted by its place in the causal network.

The functionalist has a number of options available, some of them mirroring solutions to the Exclusion Problem (Rupert 2006 provides a critical survey). For example, a functionalist could settle for a weaker, explanatory role for functional properties, leaving causal efficacy to the realizers of functional states (§6.4; see, e.g., Segal 2009; compare Roth and Cummins 2014). Or a functionalist might identify states of mind with their realizers (§6.5); indeed, some of the early functionalists were identity theorists (Lewis 1966, 1994; Armstrong 1968/1993). This would permit the sort of re-description that the more mainstream version of functionalism apparently blocks. A third option is to look for non-vacuous, empirical generalizations subsuming functional properties (Antony and Levine 1997). Yet a fourth option rejects the Humean doctrine, permitting necessary connections between a causally efficacious property and its effect. Such a proposal would find a home in the more general “causal theory of properties” defended by Shoemaker (1980, 1998) and others.

7. Problem IV: Externalism

Our final version of the property-based problem is restricted to intentional mental properties, that is, properties in virtue of which some mental states—propositional attitudes, perceptual experiences, mental images, and so on—are about something, properties in virtue of which mental states have representational content. We assume here that externalism is true, so that the contents of representational states of mind depend, not merely on intrinsic features of those states, but on relations, in particular, on the causal, social, and historical relations agents bear to their surroundings. In the simplest case, Lilian is thinking about water (H2O) because she stands in the right sorts of causal relation to water. The key move here is to reject the idea that meaningful objects or states owe their meaning to their intrinsic make-up alone.

7.1 How Could Content Make a Causal Difference?

The causally problematic feature for externalism is this contextual or relational component of representational mental states. Suppose that our mental representations are physical structures in the brain. Now suppose with the externalist that the content of these representations is determined, not just by our intrinsic features, but by context as well. Lilian (or Lilian’s brain) represents a tree in the quad by going into state T. But T represents a tree in the quad, not by virtue of T’s (or, for that matter, Lilian’s) intrinsic makeup, but by virtue of T’s (and by extension Lilian’s) standing in the right kind of relation to the tree. The very same kind of state in a different context (in the brain of someone in different circumstances) might represent something very different—or nothing at all.

Now if the content of Lilian’s thought that there is a tree in the quad is “broad”, if the significance of her thought depends on factors outside Lilian’s body, then it is indeed hard to see how this content could figure in a causal account of her actions, including Lilian’s expressing her belief that there is a tree in the quad by uttering the sentence, “There is a tree in the quad”. This is bad news for any attempt to explain why we do what we do by reference to the contents of our thoughts.

Consider an analogy (Dretske 1998). Gus inserts a quarter into a vending machine. The coin has a range of intrinsic qualities common to quarters, but its being a quarter does not depend solely on these intrinsic qualities: a quarter’s intrinsic qualities would be shared by a decent counterfeit. The coin’s being a quarter depends on its having the right sort of history: it was produced in a United States mint. This is something the vending machine cares nothing about. The machine reacts only to the coin’s intrinsic features. You might put this by saying that the coin affects the machine, not qua quarter, but only qua possessor of a particular kind of intrinsic makeup. (Vending machines are built to take advantage of the contingent fact that objects with this intrinsic makeup are almost always quarters.)

The worry is that we apparently operate, in important respects, as vending machines do. We respond to incoming stimuli solely in virtue of our intrinsic makeup and the intrinsic character of the stimuli. But if our thoughts possess their content in virtue of our standing in complicated environmental–social–historical relations to our surroundings, it is hard to see how such contents could make a causal difference in our psychological economy, how they could figure in the production of behavior. Thoughts have contents, but these contents could have no direct influence on the operation of mental mechanisms (Stich 1978; Kim 1982; Fodor 1980, 1987, ch. 2, 1991; Jackson and Pettit 1988).

7.2 Intrinsic Causal Surrogates

One general line of response notes that whenever we explain a bit of behavior by appeal to extrinsic content, there is a local, intrinsic property available as a “causal surrogate” to produce the behavior (Crane and Mellor 1990). Such a surrogate may be neurophysiological or, as on computationalist views, a complex of “formal” or “syntactic” properties of internal representations. Now by itself, this point seems just to highlight the problem: if intrinsic surrogates are always needed, all the more reason to reject the efficacy of content. Some have indeed drawn such a lesson, concluding either that content has no role to play in an explanatory psychology (Stich 1978, 1983), or perhaps that psychological explanations appealing to content were never causal to begin with (Owens 1993; see also the noncausalists cited in §1.1).

But this might be too hasty. Far from precluding the causal efficacy of content, the surrogates might in fact play a role in ensuring it. Note that while Lilian’s intrinsic properties don’t guarantee the contents of her beliefs, her intrinsic properties are, in her environment, reliably correlated with these contents—so reliably, in fact, that content, in spite of being extrinsic, enters into the counterfactuals or laws often thought to ground causal efficacy. It seems clear, after all, that if Lilian had not believed there was water in front of her, she would not have extended her hand. This counterfactual could be secured by the fact that Lilian’s believing “There’s water in front of me” covaries with some internal state of her brain, but the counterfactual, for all that, is still true. A similar point could be made using (hedged) laws connecting content with behavior. The terrain here in any case is similar to that explored earlier in §§5.3–4, though the extrinsic nature of content introduces its own complexities. (On the counterfactuals, see Mele 1992, ch. 2; Yablo 1997; on the laws, see Braun 1991; Fodor 1995.)

There’s a more direct way that the intrinsic surrogates might secure the efficacy of content: perhaps the surrogate properties are content, or rather a kind of content. Distinguish narrow from broad content. Think of narrow content as the content of a representational state of mind minus its “broad” components. Consider Lilian (or Lilian’s brain) and an intrinsically indiscernible brain in a vat wired to a supercomputer. Grant that Lilian and the envatted brain entertain intrinsically indiscernible thoughts with utterly different representational contents. Now imagine that we could abstract a common element from the contents of Lilian’s and the brain’s intrinsically indiscernible thoughts. This element is their narrow content. Because narrow content is something all intrinsic duplicates must have in common, the hope is that such content could be the very intrinsic properties that produce behavior.

The notion of narrow content might raise suspicion, however. Return to the vending machine. The quarter Gus inserts in the machine has a particular value owing to relations it bears to outside goings-on: it was minted in the Denver mint. A counterfeit placed in the machine could have the very same intrinsic makeup as the quarter, but it would lack the quarter’s value. It looks as though it is the quarter’s intrinsic makeup, not its value, that matters to the operation of the machine. Now imagine someone arguing that a quarter and an intrinsically indiscernible slug do in fact share a kind of value: narrow value. Because narrow value accompanies an object’s intrinsic qualities, we need not regard narrow value as epiphenomenal. But what could narrow value be? Whatever it is, could it in any way resemble value ordinarily conceived—broad value? Narrow value looks like a phony category posited ad hoc to accommodate an otherwise embarrassing difficulty. Nevertheless, some philosophers remain optimistic about the prospects of a viable internalist account of content, one that would allow fully fledged thoughts to have a role in the production of behavior. (For references and further discussion, see narrow mental content.)

7.3 Reasons as Structuring Causes

Another, much different, attempt to preserve a causal role for content can be found in Dretske 1988, 1989, 1993. So far we’ve assumed that a behavioral event is distinct from the mental event that causes it. On Dretske’s view, however, behavior is a process that includes, as a component, its mental cause. When mental event a causes bodily movement b, the behavior in this case is not b itself, but the process of a’s causing b. When Lilian raises her hand because she wants to get the teacher’s attention and she believes that raising her hand will accomplish this end, her behavior is not her hand’s going up, but the process of this belief-desire pair’s causing her hand to go up.

Dretske grants that when mental event a initiates (“triggers”) a process ending in bodily movement b, a does so solely in virtue of its intrinsic makeup. Nevertheless, a’s relational, intentional properties have a causal role, for they can be relevant to the fact that a causes b. Reasons are “structuring causes” of behavior: it’s because of what a indicates that it was “recruited” during the learning process as a cause of b. (Indication here is a matter of reliable co-variation.) It’s because, for example, Lilian’s belief indicates what it does—raising one’s hand (in these circumstances) is a way to get the teacher’s attention—that it was (together with the relevant desire) recruited as a cause of her hand-raising. Relational, intentional mental properties thus become causally relevant to behavior, because they are relevant to structuring the very causal processes that, on Dretske’s view, constitute instances of behavior.

Dretske’s proposed solution quickly produced a number of responses (e.g., Smith 1990; Block 1990; Baker 1991; Horgan 1991; Kim 1991; Mele 1991). One question is whether relational, intentional properties in fact play a causal role in the structuring (or “wiring”) of causal processes in the brain. Even during the learning process, the states of Lilian’s brain would seem to be sensitive only to local, intrinsic features of one another, features that screen off external goings-on. Dretske might be able to avoid such screening-off by appealing to the counterfactual dependence of behavior-structuring on these goings-on. His view would then stand or fall with the success of counterfactual theories of causal relevance (§5.3). A second question is whether intentional states, even if they were relevant in the way Dretske says they are, deliver the kind of causal relevance we want. When Lilian raises her hand, the structuring of the relevant processes in her brain has already occurred. If intentional properties are relevant at all, then, they are apparently relevant only to what happened in the past during the learning process. But we normally regard mental properties as causally relevant to what’s going on here and now, the very time when Lilian (or anyone) acts (but cf. Allen 1995; Dretske replies to critics in his 1991, esp. pp. 210–7; for a more recent discussion see Hofmann and Schulte 2014).

7.4 Broad Behavior

Dretske’s proposal is a version of the dual explanandum strategy (§6.3). The idea is that physical and mental properties are causally responsible for different effects. For Dretske, the (triggering) physical properties are responsible for bodily motions, while the (structuring) mental properties are responsible for behavior.

Another version of this strategy begins with a point also made in §6.3, namely that to question a property’s causal relevance is really to question its relevance to some property of the effect. The form of our central causal question, that is, is whether a mental cause qua F causes a behavioral effect qua G. Now when F is an intentional mental property, what G is the object of our question? One possibility is that it is a behavioral property that, like the mental property, is itself “broad” (see, e.g., Enc 1995).

Consider a simple example: Suppose Lilian believes that a glass in front of her contains water, and this belief (together with her desires) causes her to reach for the glass. Her behavior is an instance of trying to get water, and it’s the instantiation of this property (and not, say, the property of being a certain kind of bodily motion) that we’re wondering about when we ask whether the intentional property of her belief is causally relevant. (If our interest lay solely in explaining a particular bodily motion, we would rest content with a non-psychological, purely physiological explanation.) But now the answer seems straightforward. For what makes Lilian’s behavior a trying for water is that it’s caused by a belief whose content concerns water. Once we realize that the behavioral property of the effect is itself broad, its connection to the intentional mental property seems clear.

This is not to say that the physical properties of Lilian’s belief do no work: it’s just that they are responsible for a different property of the effect, for instance, the property of being a forward arm-movement. The intentional properties of her belief are relevant to the effect qua (broad) behavior; the physical properties are relevant to the effect qua (narrow) bodily motion. And as we noted earlier (§6.3), such a solution can be employed in response to the Exclusion Problem as well. If a mental property and its physical realizer are relevant to different properties of the effect, they need not compete causally.

Because it promises to solve two outstanding problems of mental causation, this approach is potentially quite powerful. (For discussion, see Fodor 1991; Burge 1995.) One question to raise here, however, is whether the fact that some behavior can be described broadly makes the intentional mental property of its cause relevant. The undeniable conceptual connections between mental and behavioral descriptions might point to a kind of explanatory relevance, but it’s a further question whether causal connections grounding these explanations involve broad properties. Those motivated by the original epiphenomenalist arguments will worry that narrow, physical properties are really doing all the work here: the apparent relevance of the broad properties is an illusion created by the way we, in describing and explaining behavior, conceptualize both cause and effect (see Owens 1993). This point leads to a fourth, related response to the problem.

7.5 The Appeal to Explanatory Practice

Some theorists would challenge the distinction—implicit in the foregoing discussion—between explanation and causation. Our concept of causality, they would insist, is bound up with the concept of explanation: causally relevant properties are those that figure in our best causal explanations (Segal and Sober 1991; Wilson 1992; Burge 1993; Raymont 2001; §6.3). We find out what causal relations amount to by starting with clear cases of causal explanation. Given that we (and the cognitive scientists) routinely explain physical events by citing mental causes (and mental events by invoking physical causes), questioning whether real causal relations answer to these explanations is to succumb to the kind of metaphysical hubris that gives metaphysics a bad name.

This appeal to explanatory practice has the potential to answer in one fell swoop all four of the property-based problems we’ve considered.

Doubtless our understanding of the notions of causality and causal relevance depends importantly on our grasp of causal explanations. But there are at least two areas of concern about the explanatory strategy (compare Kim 1998, pp. 60–7). First, you might wonder whether the strategy addresses the right question. Earlier, we pointed out that the central question of mental causation is not so much whether mental properties are causally relevant but how they could be, given some alleged feature of mental properties (in the case at issue here, the feature is their being relational properties). The explanatory strategy would at best seem to be addressing only the “whether” question, not the “how” question. Second, even when restricted to the “whether” question, the strategy rests on a conflation of what appears to be an epistemological notion (explanation) with metaphysical notions (causation and causal relevance). A full evaluation of the view would thus require a deeper look into how the two are related.

8. Metaphysics and the Philosophy of Mind

We have been treating the problem of mental causation as though it were a problem in applied metaphysics. Perhaps this approach is wrong-headed. Perhaps the problem really falls under the purview of the philosophy of science. What if we began with a look at actual scientific practice (as suggested in §§6.3, 7.5) and determined what exactly science requires for acceptable causal explanation? An examination of established special sciences reveals that the very features (multiple realizability, higher-level and “broad” properties, for instance) metaphysically inclined philosophers regard as posing apparently insuperable difficulties for mental causation, are routinely invoked in causal explanations in those sciences. This suggests that, rather than let a priori conceptions of causation (or properties, or causal powers) lead us to regard mental causation with suspicion, we should reason in the other direction: revise our conception of causation to fit our actual scientific beliefs and practices. If the metaphysicians were right about causation, no science would be possible beyond basic physics (biological properties, for instance, would lack causal efficacy).

This is one way to go. Another way is to take a step backward and ask which features of our conception of the mental, features we commonly take for granted, might be the source of our difficulties. Eliminativists aside, all parties evidently agree that “realism about the mental” requires that mental predicates figuring in causal accounts of behavior designate distinctively mental properties. If we aim to honor psychology (and the other special sciences), our job is to show how these properties could be causally relevant to physical goings-on. Suppose, in contrast, that you took the goal to be, not the preservation of mental properties, but the preservation of mental truths. In that case we would seek an account of the mind that provides plausible truthmakers for psychological and psycho-physical claims, including claims concerning mental causation.

One possibility is that truthmakers for psychological truths include irreducibly mental properties. This is not the only possibility, however. Another is that psychological assertions are made true by physical states and properties, states and properties answering to predicates belonging to physics and chemistry. A view of this kind (which is close to Davidson’s as spelled out in §5 and to the identity solutions discussed in §6.5) would endeavor to resolve the problem of mental causation, not by tinkering with the causal concept, but by rejecting the idea that mental and physical properties are distinct kinds of property. All parties agree that mental predicates and descriptions differ from physical predicates and descriptions. Application conditions for mental terms and physical terms diverge in ways that preclude definitional reduction of the one to the other. Perhaps it is a mistake, however, to move from this linguistic fact to a substantive ontological thesis: mental and physical predicates designate properties belonging to distinct families of properties.

Whether anything like this could be made to work is an open question. To the extent that you regard the current state of play as unsatisfying, however, it is perhaps a question worth pursuing.


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