Informal Logic

First published Mon Nov 25, 1996; substantive revision Fri Jul 16, 2021

The study of logic has often fostered the idea that its methods might be used in attempts to understand and improve thinking, reasoning, and argument as they occur in real life contexts: in public discussion and debate; in education and intellectual exchange; in interpersonal relations; and in law, medicine and other professions.

Informal logic is an attempt to build a logic suited to this purpose. It combines accounts of argument, evidence, proof and justification with an instrumental outlook which emphasizes their usefulness in the analysis of real life arguing. Blair 2015 identifies two key tasks for the informal logician: (i) the attempt to develop ways to identify (and “extract”) arguments from the exchanges in which they occur; and (ii) the attempt to develop methods and guidelines that can be used to assess their strength and cogency.

Though contributions to informal logic include studies of specific kinds or aspects of reasoning, the overriding goal is a general account of argument which can be the basis of systems of informal logic that provide ways to evaluate arguments. Such systems may be applied to arguments as they occur in contexts of reflection, inquiry, social and political debate, the news media, blogs and editorials, the internet, advertising, corporate and institutional communication, social media, and interpersonal exchange.

In the pursuit of its goals, informal logic addresses topics which include, to take only a few examples, the nature and definition of argument, criteria for argument evaluation, argumentation schemes, fallacies, notions of validity, the rhetorical and dialectical aspects of arguing, argument diagramming (“mapping”), cognitive biases, the history of argument analysis, artificial intelligence (AI), and the varying norms and rules that govern argumentative practices in different kinds of contexts.

1. History

Puppo 2019 provides a recent collection of articles on the history of informal logic and the issues it addresses. In many ways, informal logic as we know it is a contemporary version of historical attempts to explain, systematize, assess and teach arguing for practical purposes.

In ancient times, the First Sophistic is a movement motivated by the notion that one can teach the art of logos in a way that can be effectively employed in public argument and debate. In the century that follows, Aristotle’s logical and rhetorical works — notably the Prior Analytics and the Rhetoric — provide a systematic account of logic and argument which is applicable to an impressively broad range of real life arguments. Today, they remain important works that inform discussions of informal logic.

In modern times, The Port Royal Logic (Arnauld and Nicole 1662, originally titled Logic or the Art of Thinking) is an attempt to outline a logic that can guide everyday reasoning. It is a celebrated (and often disdained) introduction to the art of arguing which has been published in more than fifty French editions and five popular English translations. It understands “logic” as “the art of directing reason aright, in obtaining the knowledge of things, for the instruction both of ourselves and others” (25). In keeping with this, it provides a practical account of good and poor argument, discussing fallacies, syllogisms, definitions, and deductive and probable reasoning, emphasizing real rather than concocted examples of argument (see Finocchiaro 1997).

One finds other analogues of contemporary attempts to study and teach informal reasoning in nineteenth century textbooks on logic and rhetoric. Richard Whately is of special note in this regard. He began his career as a professor of political economy at Oxford, was appointed Archbishop of Dublin, and attempted to establish a national non-sectarian system of education, writing texts on reasoning that could promote this cause. In many ways, Whately’s Elements of Logic and Elements of Rhetoric (1826, 1830) are close analogues of early versions of today’s informal logic textbooks.

Another important text, critical of Whately, but in the same broad tradition is Mill’s A System of Logic (1882) (see Godden 2014). It defines logic as the “art and science of reasoning,” stipulating that “to reason is simply to infer any assertion from assertions already admitted.” The end result is a broad account of inference which is, like systems of informal logic, designed to inform real life instances of argument.

The first use of the term “informal logic” occurs in the last chapter of Gilbert Ryle’s book Dilemmas (1954). He introduces it in an attempt to distinguish between formal logic and the more varied, less strict, and less defined ways in which we need to assess many of the arguments that are used in philosophical discussion.

In North America, the rise of informal logic as it is now understood is tied to educational trends rooted in the 1960s — a time of social upheaval and protest (most notably, against the War in Vietnam) which produced calls for an education relevant to the issues of the day. This fueled an interest in the logic of everyday argument and the teaching of introductory logic, which was at the time taught with textbooks like Copi’s popular Introduction to Logic (1953).

In Logic and Contemporary Rhetoric: The Use of Reason in Everyday Life (1971), Kahane more fully embraced instances of real life arguing, discussing a wide range of examples in newspapers, the mass media, advertisements, books, and political campaigns. Other attempts to provide a general introduction to logic — by Carney and Scheer (1964), Munson (1976), and Fogelin (1978) — employed the term “informal logic” to distinguish between formal logic and other methods of argument analysis which lay outside of it.

The idea that informal logic should be developed as a distinct field of inquiry was championed by Johnson and Blair at the University of Windsor. They published a popular textbook, Logical Self-Defense (1977); organized and hosted “The First International Symposium on Informal Logic” and edited the proceedings (Blair and Johnson, 1980); established the Informal Logic Newsletter (1978-1983); and ultimately turned the newsletter into the journal Informal Logic (subtitled “Reasoning and Argumentation in Theory and Practice”). In this and other ways, they established informal logic as a field for study, research and development. Their contributions (and those of colleagues at Windsor and in Ontario and Canada) is reflected in the notion that informal logic is a Canadian (or, more narrowly, Windsor) school of argument (see Puppo 2019).

Much of the discussion that has shaped the evolution of informal logic as a field has taken place in a number of journals that have played a major role in its development. They include Informal Logic, Argumentation, Philosophy and Rhetoric, Argumentation and Advocacy (formerly the Journal of the American Forensic Association), Teaching Philosophy, and (more recently) Cogency and Argument and Computation.

A key catalyst that promoted the development of informal logic was the “Critical Thinking” Movement within education (well described in Siegel 1988, Ennis 2011, and Blair 2021). The movement pushed (and continues to push) for educational developments which make the critical scrutiny of our beliefs and assumptions a fundamental goal, highlighting the significance of reasoning, inference, argument and critical assessment.

In 1980, a California State University Executive Order promoted the teaching of critical thinking and informal logic by requiring post secondary institutions to include formal instruction in critical thinking in their curriculum. According to the order: “Instruction in critical thinking is to be designed to achieve an understanding of the relationship of language to logic, which should lead to the ability to analyze, criticize, and advocate ideas, to reason inductively and deductively and to reach factual or judgmental conclusions based on sound inferences drawn from unambiguous statements of knowledge or belief” (Dumke 1980, Executive Order 338).

The accounts of argument that informal logic and the Critical Thinking movement provide are tied to pedagogical attempts to teach students and learners how to reason well. One result has been hundreds (perhaps thousands) of introductory textbooks used to teach logic, critical thinking, and argumentation skills to university and college students in Canada, the United States, the United Kingdom, Italy, Poland, Chile, and other countries.

Textbooks in English offer many theoretical and pedagogical innovations. Established texts include Battersby 2016 (Is That a Fact? A Field Guide for Evaluating Statistical and Scientific Information, 2nd ed.); Bowell and Kemp 2014 (Critical Thinking: A Concise Guide, 4th ed.); Browne and Keeley 2018 (Asking the Right Questions, 12th ed.); Govier 2019 (A Practical Study of Argument, 7th ed.); Groarke, Tindale and Carozza 2021 (Good Reasoning Matters!, 7th ed.); Hughes, Lavery and Doran 2014 (Critical Thinking: An Introduction to the Basic Skills, 7th ed.); Seay and Nuccetelli 2012 (How to Think Logically, 2nd ed.); Weston 2018 (A Rulebook for Arguments, 5th ed.); and Wilson 2020 (A Guide to Good Reasoning: Cultivating Intellectual Virtues, 2nd ed.).

In Poland, Ajdukiewicz’s Pragmatic Logic (1974) is an introduction to an independently developed “pragmatic logic” which shares similar goals, teaching and promoting tools of logic as a central element of a general education. Its application aims to ensure that students think clearly and consistently, express their thoughts and ideas systematically and precisely, and justify their claims with proper inferences (see Koszowy 2010).

In part because reasoning and argument are ubiquitous and of interest across many disciplines, informal logic has in many ways been influenced by cognate fields which analyze argumentation in some way. The latter include formal logic, speech communication, rhetoric, linguistics, artificial intelligence, discourse analysis, feminism, semiotics, cognitive psychology, and computational modelling. Considered in this broader context, informal logic is a subfield of a broader multi-disciplinary attempt to develop a comprehensive account of real life arguing which is commonly called “argumentation theory.”

Informal logic and argumentation theory have been highlighted at numerous international conferences hosted by organizations committed to the study of argument. Key conferences include nine Amsterdam conferences (and a tenth conference in Zhenjiang) hosted by the International Society for the Study of Argumentation (ISSA); twelve Windsor conferences hosted by the Ontario Society for the Study of Argumentation (OSSA); six Tokyo Conferences on Argumentation hosted by the Japanese Debate Association; three meetings of the European Conference on Argumentation (ECA); eight meetings of the International Conference on Computational Models of Argument (hosted by COMMA), and many workshops on issues of argumentation, dialogue, and persuasion organized by the Polish group ArgDiaP.

1.1 Formal and Informal Logic

One of the driving forces behind the early development of informal logic was a desire for a logic which contained tools of analysis and assessment above and beyond the standard formal methods of the day: propositional logic, truth tables, syllogisms, the predicate calculus, and so on. Johnson emphasizes a “dissatisfaction with formal logic as the vehicle for teaching skill in argument evaluation and argument formation” and a “desire to provide a complete theory of reasoning that goes beyond formal deductive and inductive logic” (2014, p. 11). Though Ryle never developed a detailed account of what he meant by “informal logic,” his comments point in a similar direction.

Philosophers and logicians teaching general courses on argument have often managed the issues that this raises by mixing formal and informal methods of analysis. Though the artificial examples of argument that characterize early editions of Copi (and some other texts that emphasize formal logic) have been roundly criticized (see Johnson 1996 and Blair 2015), other authors more successfully meld classical formal logic and examples of real argument. Harrison 1969 is an example. So are the texts of Pospesel, which contain many examples of real life reasoning which illustrate the patterns of inference associated with propositional and syllogistic logic (Pospesel and Marans 1978, Rodes and Pospesel 1991, and Pospesel 2002). Little 1980 develops an approach to critical thinking and decision making that integrates propositional and syllogistic reasoning.

Some informal logicians moved in an opposite direction, developing versions of informal logic that were independent of formal logic, appealing to alternative accounts of argument borrowed from or influenced by philosophical reflection, or by other fields that study argument (notably, rhetoric, dialectics, and speech communication). Toulmin’s The Uses of Argument (1958) and Hamblin’s Fallacies (1970) became theoretical touchstones for those looking for an informal logic rooted outside of formal logic.

Even in these latter cases, systems and accounts of informal logic shared some core notions with their formal cousins. Most significantly, formal and informal logic assume (i) a premise, inference, and conclusion conception of argument; (ii) the notion that a good argument has premises which are true (or “acceptable”) and a conclusion which follows from them (making the inference the argument depends on “valid” in some way); and (iii) the idea that many arguments can be assessed by treating them as instances of more generalized forms of argument (“schemes of argument” which include standard deductive patterns of reasoning).

Today, informal logic is “informal” rather than “formal” primarily because it studies arguments as they occur in natural language discourse, and not in formal languages of the sort that characterize formal logic. The latter are notable for their rigorously defined syntax, semantics, and grammar, and precisely defined proof procedures. In contrast, arguments as they occur in real life discourse are notable for their use of everyday language; for the many different norms that apply to them in different contexts; and for the diverse ways of making meaning (using pictures, facial expressions, non-verbal sounds, music, etc.) that they employ.

The emphasis that informal logic and its historical precursors place on natural language argument is in keeping with the social and pedagogical goals that motivate their development. The latter are best served by an easily understood, broadly disseminated, understanding of the difference between strong and weak instances of real life argument. Formal methods (Venn diagrams, probability theory — see Zenker 2013, different kinds of formal logic, etc.) can at times support this goal, especially in analyses of particular kinds of argument, but the overriding aim is natural language discourse guided by the principles of successful reasoning.

1.2 Argumentation Theory

Argumentation theory is a broad interdisciplinary field that studies real life argument. Developments in argumentation theory have been greatly influenced by formal and informal logic; pragma-dialectics (developed by van Eemeren and Grootendorst and their Dutch or “Amsterdam” school of argumentation); the Critical Thinking Movement; American speech communication; rhetoric; pragmatics; and the Polish School of Argument (which has published a relevant manifesto). In its attempt to understand argument, argumentation theory does not hesitate to make use of these and other related disciplines: cognitive psychology, computational modeling, semiotics, discourse analysis, the history of art, AI, and so on.

Above and beyond their study of general methods of argument analysis, argumentation theorists investigate arguments in a variety of ways: by exploring particular aspects of arguing (e.g., onus, burden of proof, or the norms that govern arguments in specific contexts); by analyzing arguments from historical, social, political or feminist points of view; by studying particular kinds of argument (e.g., those expressed in works of art, or those that arise in specific legal contexts); and by investigating the assumptions, conditions (philosophical, epistemological, social, political, institutional, psychological, educational, etc.) which give rise to disagreement, arguing and argument in the first place. In many ways, such endeavors intersect with informal logic.

Theoretically, argumentation theory incorporates three approaches to argument that have been associated with logic, rhetoric, and dialectics since ancient times. Logic understands an argument as an attempt to justify a conclusion, emphasizing its probative or epistemic merit. Rhetoric treats an argument as an attempt to persuade, emphasizing its persuasive force. Dialectics understands an argument as an element of an exchange between interlocutors with opposing points of view, emphasizing its place in an interaction between arguers who argue back and forth.

Like other forms of logic, informal logic emphasizes the epistemic merit of an argument. That said, its development has been greatly influenced by rhetorical and dialectical considerations, for successful real life arguments must convince their intended audiences (the public, scientists, the Members of Parliament, the readers of a particular magazine, etc.) and (as Johnson 2000 emphasizes) include answers to reasonable objections made by those with opposing points of view. Bermejo Luque 2011 has proposed a relevant theory of argument which aims to accommodate logical, rhetorical and dialectical points of view.

2. Systems of Informal Logic

As Hansen (2012) emphasizes, there are many different methods that informal logicians use to analyze instances of argument. An account of informal logic needs to make room for the different approaches this implies, at the same time that it explains how they constitute a shared field of inquiry. I will attempt to provide such an account by emphasizing systems of informal logic.

I understand an informal logic system to be a collection of principles and methods designed for the analysis and assessment of real life arguments. Considered from this point of view, informal logic can be described as a field devoted to the creation, study and application of systems of informal logic (or, more simply, “informal logics”) and the issues that this raises.

The first textbook that described itself as an informal logic textbook was Munson’s The Way of Words: An Informal Logic (1976). As his title emphasizes, his book aims to teach a specific informal logic (a specific informal logic system) which outlines one approach to the analysis and assessment of real life argument. Other approaches and other systems are developed in other textbooks and in scholarly discussion.

Different systems of informal logic vary in a number of ways — often, by incorporating formal, rhetorical, dialectical and other methods of analysis to a greater or lesser extent. Many systems propose unique approaches or mix methods that they borrow from other systems. Groarke 2020 has outlined a “BLAST” approach to the identification and definition of systems of informal logic. It defines a specific informal logic system I, as I = {B,L,A,S,T}, where:

  • B = the theoretical background that informs I,
    L = the language used to express the arguments I analyzes,
    A = a concept of argument,
    S = a way to “standardize” arguments, and
    T = tools and methods for testing the strength of arguments evaluated using I.

As I show below, a particular system of informal logic can be defined by outlining and explaining each of its five BLAST elements. When they have been defined, different systems of informal logic and the elements they contain can be more precisely compared, contrasted, and evaluated. Historical precursors to present day informal logic can be investigated from a similar point of view.

2.1 A Concept of Argument (A)

In many ways, the third element in the BLAST list — a concept of argument (A) — is the root of all informal logics. In ordinary discourse, the word “argue” can mean “to disagree,” usually with the further implication that someone does so aggressively. Informal logics, like other logics, assume a narrower conception of argument (so called “argument-1”), which understands an argument as an attempt to resolve disagreement (or potential disagreement) by providing reasons for accepting the point of view that it advances.

This notion of argument is “evidentiary” in the sense that it understands an argument as an attempt to provide evidence in support of some conclusion. The premises in the argument convey the evidence which provides those who consider the argument reasons for accepting the conclusion. As Hitchcock 2007 puts it, an argument is “a claim-reason complex” consisting of (1) premises, (2) a conclusion, and (3) an inference from the premises to the conclusion (and the implied claim that the conclusion is true, likely true, plausible or should in some other way be accepted).

The following sentence, taken from an article in the Houston Chronicle (Devra Gartenstein 28/01/19) is a simple example of argument in this sense.

EXAMPLE 1: Small businesses are important because they provide opportunities for entrepreneurs and create meaningful jobs with greater job satisfaction than positions with larger, traditional companies.

In this example, the word “because” is an inference indicator. It tells us that the initial statement in the sentence (“Small businesses are important”) is a conclusion backed by a premise (that small businesses “provide opportunities...”) that provides a reason for believing it to be true.

The example below is taken from an opinion piece (in the Western Courier 25/10/08) which criticizes conservative groups opposed to research using human embryos.

EXAMPLE 2: This [opposition to embryonic research] is shortsighted and stubborn. The fact is, fetuses are being aborted whether conservatives like it or not. Post-abortion, the embryos are literally being thrown away when they could be used in lifesaving medical research.... Lives could be saved and vastly improved if only scientists were allowed to use embryos that are otherwise being tossed in the garbage.

We can summarize the elements of this argument as follows.

Premise: Fetuses are being aborted anyway (whether conservatives like it or not).
Premise: Lives could be saved and vastly improved if scientists were allowed to use embryos that are otherwise being tossed in the garbage.
Conclusion: The conservative opposition to embryonic research is shortsighted and stubborn.

This is another example of a simple argument. In real life arguing, complex arguments may contain tens (or even hundreds) of premises, and are usually made up of layers of inference that proceed from initial premises to intermediate conclusions which function as premises for further conclusions, culminating in a “main” or “principal” conclusion.

All systems of informal logic are attempts to understand and assess arguments in the premise/conclusion sense. In view of this, the core value of A in the BLAST definition is shared by all informal logics, though there are many variations that occur when informal logicians expand this conception by adding other elements to it. This can be done by understanding an argument as a premise-conclusion complex which is directed at an audience, or backed by a warrant, or provided as an answer to an opponent who has an opposing point of view. When they expand the definition of argument in these ways, systems of informal logic make an audience, warrant, and/or dialectical context an essential element of a case of argument.

2.2 Theoretical Background (B)

Other elements recognized in the BLAST definition are notable for the extent to which they vary from one informal logic to another. The different theoretical backgrounds that inform different systems of informal logic (B in the BLAST definition) are of special note, for they reflect the extent to which the development of informal logic has been a search for new and novel methods of analysis that can be applied to real life arguing. In a particular case, this search may end in Aristotle, in feminist theories of argument, in rhetoric, in dialogue theory, in speech communication, in formal logic, or in some combination of these and/or other theoretical points of view.

The theoretical background that characterizes systems of informal logic can be used to identify, not only specific systems, but also families of systems which share key theoretical elements. Many informal logicians have, to take one example, turned to fallacy theory in their attempt to find a logic that can account for real life arguing. In some cases, the result has been fallacy oriented textbooks which introduce tens or hundreds of fallacies used to dismiss straw man reasoning, hasty generalizations, slippery slope reasoning, and so on (see, e.g., Bennett 2018).

Systems of informal logic that adopt a fallacy approach can be summarized as instances of I in which I = {B, L, A, S, T}, where: B = Fallacy Theory, and T = a set of fallacies used to judge instances of argument. An even narrower set of (“Hamblin”) systems can be defined as systems in which B = Hamblin. This is a family of systems which is rooted in the account of fallacies proposed in Hamblin 1970.

Systems of informal logic that combine fallacy theory with other methods of testing arguments can be understood as systems which define T in a way that includes a specific a set of fallacies along with other criteria for argument evaluation (e.g., Johnson and Blair’s ARS criteria).

2.3 Language (NL and NL+)

One key element of informal logic is its focus on arguments as they occur within natural rather than formal languages.

Initially, informal logic texts defined natural language arguments as verbal arguments: i.e. as arguments expressed and conveyed in words associated with some established natural language. This is an important focus given that arguments of this sort are a staple in the kinds of arguing that informal logic emphasizes — in letters to the editor; parliamentary debate; court proceedings; and in essays and books written in defense of some point of view (that humans could colonize Mars, President Trump was misunderstood, socialism is the best political system, and so on).

When a system of informal logic is designed to analyze and assess verbal arguments of this sort, the language of argument they assume (L in the BLAST definition) consists of the words and sentences (and the rules governing them) associated with some natural language (“NL”). This makes the language of argument a complex and nuanced system of meaning which expands the possibilities of argument beyond the “informative” statements of fact that authors like Copi took to be the only legitimate realm of argument. One notable feature of the expanded realm that informal logic studies is the extent to which metaphor and other figures of speech are used to support conclusions — something that must be accounted for in a comprehensive account of informal reasoning.

As the scope of informal logic has expanded to provide a more comprehensive account of ordinary argument, this verbal paradigm has frequently been expanded to make room for real life arguments which depend on non-verbal elements. Paradigm examples of these non-verbal elements are photographs, illustrations, drawings, videos, etc. which are used to provide evidence in support of some conclusion -- as when a photograph or video is used to prove someone’s identity, or produced in court to give the court a reason to believe that they were present at the scene of a crime. As Hitchcock (2002) notes, “a poster with a giant photograph of a starving emaciated child and the words ‘make poverty history’ can reasonably be construed as an argument.”

Arguments that employ premises and/or conclusions that arguers convey using non-verbal visual elements are commonly called “visual” arguments. I leave for elsewhere the question whether such arguments are visual in some deeper sense. In most cases, they have verbal as well as visual elements and can, in view of this, be described as arguments which are expressed as an amalgam of verbal and non-verbal (visual) elements.

The two photographs in EXAMPLE 3 (below), taken by the NASA Mars rover Phoenix, were part of a visual argument proposed by the NASA scientists who directed the Phoenix mission. The first photo provides an initial view of a dig made by the rover; the second a view of the same dig four Martian days (sols) later. When we look at the bottom left hand corner of the first photograph and compare it to the bottom left hand corner of the second photograph, we can see white crust in the first photograph but not the second. According to the NASA scientists, the only way to plausibly explain this change is by understanding the crust as water ice which evaporated when the dig exposed it to the sun.

nasa rover


We can summarize the argument as follows.

(Visual) Premise: What we see in the bottom left hand corner of the first photograph of the dig.
(Visual) Premise: What we see in the bottom left hand corner of the second photograph of the dig.
(Verbal) Premise: The most plausible way to explain the changes we see (the disappearance of the white crust) is by understanding it as water ice.
Conclusion: There is water on the planet Mars.

This argument can be described as visual and verbal. Visual because our looking at the photographs and seeing the difference between them is a non-verbal component of the argument that provides key evidence that supports the conclusion. At the same time the argument is verbal because it contains a key verbal component provided by the scientists’ explanation of what we must be seeing. The conclusion is established by combining these visual and verbal components.

When a system of informal logic recognizes visual arguments of this sort, the value of L in its BLAST definition can be understood as NL+, where the + indicates that the language of argument includes words and non-verbal elements like photographs and other non-verbal visual images.

One might compare the expansion of informal logic to account for visual arguments to the attempt to expand the language of formal logic (and, some argue, the notion of argument it embraces) to allow visual deductions (see Barwise and Etchemendy 1998). Visual premises can be used in geometric proofs, in legal arguments (to proving that someone committed a crime, that the murder was heinous, etc.), in reasoning about planets, stars and black holes, and in aesthetic criticism and evaluation. In ornithology, a well authenticated, clear photograph of a rare species (say, the Ivory Billed Woodpecker) is widely accepted as the proper proof that the species is not extinct.

In other cases, a visual image may serve as a conclusion which is backed by visual and/or verbal premises. A forensic artist concludes that their drawing of a suspect correctly depicts what they look like by inferring this from verbal and visual evidence which is provided by the witnesses they interview.

Kjeldsen 2015 has provided a comprehensive overview of the study of visual arguments. Informal logics that recognize visual arguments do so for the same reason that they recognize verbal arguments: in order to account for the kinds of arguing that play an important role in real life discourse and exchange. Visual arguments are increasingly significant at a time when digital communication facilitates the creation and distribution of visual images, enhancing and increasing the use of arguments which employ photographs, videos, art, political cartoons, virtual reality, 3D modeling and other kinds of visuals (see Godden, Palczewski, and Groarke, 2016).

As is the case with words, the images used in visual arguments may, as Kjeldsen and other rhetoricians point out, not be intended as literal depictions of something they represent, but function as visual metaphors which characterize some situation in an argumentatively charged way.

The cartoon of Napoleon III below (EXAMPLE 4) appeared in Punch on Feb. 19, 1859.

Political cartoon of a porcupine with the face, hands, and boots of a man. The porcupine/man is saying, 'L'Empire c'est la paix'. The caption reads, 'The French Porcupine: He may be an Inoffensive Animal, but he Don't Look like it'.


This is a clever caricature, but it is something more than a simple caricature, for the cartoonist uses a drawing of Napoleon-as-porcupine to convey a reason to doubt his profession of peace. We might summarize his point as the suggestion that Napoleon’s actions -- his amassing of the armaments which encircle him like quills on a porcupine -- are not the actions of someone committed to peace. The dissonance between his actions and his profession of peace invites the viewer to respond to him as they would respond to an actual porcupine -- with caution, concern and suspicion, wary of what he might do with his weapons (even though he has an “inoffensive” posture and makes an inoffensive sound).

In this case the visual image in the argument is not an attempt to literally replicate some state of affairs. The core argument we might extract from the cartoon can be understood as follows.

Premise: Napoleon declares that “The Empire embodies peace” (“L’Empire c’est la paix”).
Premise: Napoleon has surrounded himself with many armaments.
Conclusion: Napoleon may sound inoffensive when he says that “The Empire embodies peace,” but his build up of armaments suggests we should be wary of the empire he has built.

This is a visual argument (and the second premise a visual premise) at least in the sense that it is conveyed visually (and not with the words in our paraphrase). The verbal paraphrase summarizes the argument, though the non-verbal visual elements the cartoonist uses must be replicated if we want to exactly replicate their act of arguing. This is especially important when such arguments are open to contrary interpretations or have meanings that are difficult to convey in words.

In the case of the Punch cartoon, we might interpret it in a second way by adding to our initial paraphrase, understanding the Napoleon III-as-porcupine caricature as an allusion to another famous “Louis” King of France: Louis XII, who ruled from 1498 to 1515. Popularly known as the “porcupine” King of France, he adopted the animal as his royal emblem, portraying the French kingdom as a porcupine -- an animal he chose because it was popularly believed (to some extent now as well as then) that it could shoot its quills, symbolizing the offensive and defensive capabilities of the king’s army.

If we understand the cartoonist’s depiction as an allusion to Louis XII, the argument in the cartoon is plausibly assigned another premise that reminds the viewer of the rule of Louis XII, a king who was famous for rebuilding the French army, which he then employed in a series of wars against his neighbors (his general strategy is criticized by Machiavelli in The Prince). The additional premise can be summarized as the suggestion that Napoleon is acting like Louis XII did — something which provides another reason to be wary of him.

In many circumstances, the visual elements of an argument (like verbal elements in arguments which are ambiguous or vague) are open to multiple interpretations. This raises issues of representation and interpretation. In the Napoleon example, it is difficult to say whether the cartoonist or his audience understood his depiction to be a reference to Louis XII. In such circumstances, the simplest strategy is one that identifies and evaluates all the plausible interpretations of an argument.

Visual metaphors are common in works of art, political propaganda, and political cartooning. One popular motif depicts politicians with a growing Pinocchio nose, suggesting that they are, like the childhood hero, preposterous liars (see Tseronis and Forceville 2017). In cases such as this, visual images can have rhetorical as well as logical significance, allowing arguers to convey their arguments in rhetorically powerful ways.

2.4 Modes of Arguing

Informal logicians who advocate for systems of informal logic that broaden the language of argument from NL to NL+ sometimes expand the standard notion of argument even further, beyond verbal and visual arguments, to make room for other ways of arguing.

The role of non-verbal carriers of meaning in real life discourse allows many different semiotic modes to contribute to informal arguments. In view of this, some argue that a fully comprehensive account of argument must include a “multimodal” account of meaning which recognizes many different modes of arguing (see Groarke 2015). The latter may employ gestures, facial expressions, sounds of different sorts, tastes, smells, musical notes, and a host of other non-verbal phenomena.

Groarke 2018, Kišiček 2018, and Eckstein 2018 have investigated “auditory” (or “acoustic”) modes of reasoning that depend on non-verbal sounds. Examples are situations in which the sound of a siren is pointed to as evidence that the police are on their way, or the sound of an automobile engine (or an irregular heart) is the basis of an inference to the conclusion that it has a leaky valve.

Other modes of arguing invoke the senses in other ways. In 2019, Space Cargo Unlimited and the University of Bordeaux’s wine institute (the ISVV) sent fourteen bottles of Château Petrus to the International Space Station to determine how a year in space would affect their taste and character. A year later, the wine returned to earth where it was analyzed. A key element of this analysis was a blind tasting conducted by 12 professional tasters who compared the wine from space to bottles of the same vintage which had remained on earth. The sommeliers concluded that the wine which had been in space had a different, distinct (“more evolved”) taste, inferring their conclusion from their two tastings (which functioned as ‘taste premises’).

Here is another example from a wine tasting.


A wine steward attempts to convince a customer that Napa Valley “Frogs Leap PS 2015” is an exceptional Petite Syrah by quoting high praise in a wine guide, and by handing them a glass, inviting them to taste it.

In this case, the steward provides evidence for their claim that Frogs Leap PS 2015 is an exceptional Petite Syrah in two ways: (i) via a verbal premise that cites the authority of a wine guide, and (ii) via a taste test that aims to support this conclusion. In the first case, the result is a verbal appeal to authority, in the second an argument by taste.

In real life arguing different modes are often mixed. In the case of verbal arguments, the meaning of oral arguments is often notable for its dependence on the sound of the human voice — which can convey meaning above and beyond that implied by words. As Gilbert (1997) notes, uttering the sentence “Fine, fine, you’re right, I’m wrong, we’ll do it your way,” “can indicate agreement with what has been said if presented flatly and intended sincerely, or, if accompanied by an expression of anger, can mean that the respondent does not agree at all, but is capitulating.” (pp. 2–3) Kišiček 2014 has highlighted the important role that the paralinguistic features of oral arguments play in many instances of verbal argument.

Gilbert 1997 was the first informal logician to suggest that there are different modes of arguing that need to be distinguished. His “multi-modal” theory of “coalescent” argument accepts the traditional conception of argument as one mode, adding to it “emotional,” “visceral” (physical) and “kisceral” (intuitive) modes of arguing. He pairs this with a very broad account of arguing which understands it as an attempt to resolve conflicting attitudes, beliefs, feelings and intuitions in a way that brings about the “coalescence” of competing points of view.

According to Gilbert’s account, an argument may consist of sentences and/or expressions of emotion, physical demonstrations and difficult to define intuitions. This allows a forlorn look or tears to count as premises in an argument insofar as they provide evidence that promotes coalescence (and inference in this broad sense). As Gilbert argues, his non-traditional modes of arguing may, in real life situations, provide effective ways of resolving the disagreement that gives rise to argument.

Gilbert’s account of modes radically expands our understanding of argument beyond “language” as it is traditionally conceived. In an account of the “anthropology” of argument, Tindale 2021 defends the alternative “logics” this makes possible. In doing so, he promotes informal logics that recognize verbal arguments (and in this sense L) but add to it a much broader range of everyday communication which can convey the substance of an argument via expressions of emotion, physical actions (including non-verbal means of communication like so called “body language”), and difficult to define intuitions. This expands the language of argument far beyond words and sentences, in a way that maximizes the breadth of L+.

3. Standardizing Arguments

The ultimate goal of informal logic is normative: i.e. systems of logic that provide us with tools that can be used to evaluate real life arguments and the key components they contain. Because real life discourse often fails to present the latter clearly, most systems of informal logic prepare the way for argument evaluation by explicitly identifying an argument’s premises, conclusions, and inferences. The process of doing so is commonly called “standardizing” (S in the BLAST definition).

In the process of standardization, informal logics aim to untangle issues that obscure the structure and content of real life arguments. Arguments in ordinary discourse are, for example, frequently vague, ambiguous or in other ways unclear. Premises and conclusions can be conveyed by rhetorical questions (“Can anyone seriously believe...?” “Could the defendant have been in two places at once?”) and the key components of an argument may be interspersed with irrelevant digressions and repetition. When we extract an argument from the context in which it occurs, it can be important to recognize what is implicit but relevant at the same time that we discard what is explicit but irrelevant.

Standardizing clarifies the structure of an argument in ordinary discourse by:

  • discarding irrelevant and distracting digressions, repetition, and remarks (“noise”) which do not play a role in the reasoning the argument contains;
  • restating the content of rhetorical questions and other stylistic devices that may obscure the meaning of the argument’s components;
  • clarifying incomplete, vague or ambiguous claims and utterances; and/or
  • recognizing components of the argument which are not explicitly expressed.

Systems of informal logic may standardize arguments in a variety of ways. In its simplest form, a standardized argument is a list of premises and a conclusion (the argument’s inference is the implicit move from the premises to the conclusion). EXAMPLE 1 above can be standardized as follows.

EXAMPLE 1: Small businesses are important because they provide opportunities for entrepreneurs and create meaningful jobs with greater job satisfaction than positions with larger, traditional companies.

Premise: [Small businesses] provide opportunities for entrepreneurs and create meaningful jobs with greater job satisfaction than positions with larger, traditional companies. Conclusion: Small businesses are important.

In this example, the word “because” functions as an “inference indicator” which tells us that the claim that follows is a premise offered in support of the conclusion which precedes it. In other cases, words like “for,” “given that,” “since,” are ways of introducing premises, while words like “so,” “hence,” “thus,” “therefore,” are used to introduce conclusions.

Verbal inference indicators are an important, but not necessary or sufficient, sign of argument. For indicator words can be used in other ways (“because” may indicate an explanation rather than an argument, a causal connection, emphasis of some sort, a temporal order, etc.), and are not necessary when a context makes it clear that someone is providing reasons for a conclusion.

3.1 Implicit Premises and Conclusions

One issue that is frequently addressed in standardization is an argument’s dependence on premises and conclusions which are assumed but not explicitly stated.

The following report from the New Hampshire Rockingham News (30/8/2002) comments on a court case which sent the organizer of dog fights to jail for cruelty to animals.

EXAMPLE 6: A co-ordinator for the Humane Society supported a prison sentence, claiming that the minor penalties normally associated with misdemeanor convictions are not a sufficient deterrent in this case.

We can standardize the co-ordinator’s argument as follows.

Premise: The minor penalties normally associated with misdemeanor convictions are not a sufficient deterrent in this case.
Implicit Premise 1: Penalties for crimes should have a deterrent effect.
Implicit Premise 2: Prison is a sufficient deterrent.
Conclusion: A prison sentence, but not the minor penalties normally associated with misdemeanor convictions, is appropriate.

It is important to recognize the assumption which is rendered as Implicit Premise 1 (which is, in Toulmin’s words, “a warrant”) for it is a claim that the argument depends on when the arguer concludes that the penalties normally associated with misdemeanors are not a sufficient deterrent in this case. The remaining part of the conclusion — the suggestion that a prison sentence is appropriate — depends on Implicit Premise 2, which recognizes the further assumption that this will have a deterrent effect.

Recognizing the argument’s implicit premises prepares the way for argument evaluation, for they, like the argument’s explicit premise, need to be evaluated when the argument is assessed. If we reject the implicit premises (by, e.g., arguing that the goal of criminal penalties should be retribution, not deterrence), then the argument fails to provide convincing evidence for its conclusion.

Arguments with implicit premises or conclusions are recognized in ancient discussions of enthymemes: syllogisms with unstated premises. A contemporary example is American Vice-President Dick Cheney’s defense of the Bush administration’s decision not to try foreigners charged with terrorism offenses as prisoners of war (something that would guarantee legal protections for those accused of terrorism).

EXAMPLE 7 (from a report in the New York Times, 15/11/2001):
“The basic proposition here is that somebody who comes into the United States of America illegally ... is not a lawful combatant.... They don’t [therefore] deserve to be treated as a prisoner of war.”

We can standardize the argument as:

Premise: Somebody who comes into the United States of America illegally ... is not a lawful combatant.
Implicit Premise: Someone who is not a lawful combatant doesn’t deserve to be treated as a prisoner of war.
Conclusion: They don’t deserve to be treated as a prisoner of war.

As in many other cases, the argument’s implicit premise identifies the link that ties the explicit premise to the conclusion. When we evaluate the argument, it raises a number of questions. How should a “lawful combatant” be defined? Why are combatants who illegally enter a country for the purpose of war (in undertaking surveillance or going behind enemy lines) widely recognized as prisoners of war? What are our moral obligations to combatants, lawful and unlawful?

In other enthymemes, the conclusion of an argument may be unstated. In a debate over the question whether witnesses to a crime can be trusted, an arguer might state: “They are friends of the accused, and no friends of the accused can be trusted.” Such claims clearly suggest that “They cannot be trusted,” a claim that needs to be recognized as an implicit conclusion in an attempt to standardize and evaluate the argument.

As in the case of verbal arguments, implicit premises and conclusions play an important role in many visual and multimodal arguments. In EXAMPLE 9 (below), the title “Just Add Vodka” is superimposed over a gigantic bottle of vodka pouring its contents on the scene below. Outside the vodka splash, one sees a sleepy hamlet. Inside the vodka splash, it is transformed into a bustling cityscape which boasts skyscrapers and a nightlife with lights, people, nightclubs, bars, and restaurants.

vodka print ad


The image in this advertisement is a visual metaphor which suggests that vodka can transform one’s life in the way that it transforms the scene in the advertisement, turning the (dreary) life one lives in a sleepy hamlet into the kind of exciting nightlife one finds in a cosmopolitan urban center. Insofar as this message is featured in an advertisement, we can plausibly understand this message as a proposed reason to buy the vodka in question.

We might standardize the argument this implies as follows.

(Visual) Premise: If you drink our vodka, it can transform your night life in the way it transforms the village in the photograph: into an exciting major city.
Implicit Premise: A life of urban excitement is preferable to the quiet life of a village.
Conclusion: You should “Just Add Vodka” to your life.

I have summarized the first premise in the argument in a way that refers to the image because it is difficult to fully capture the (almost magical) transformation the advertisement promises if we try to translate it into words. The implicit premise in the standardization is a key part of the argument because it is a key assumption made in the move from the (visually) explicit premise to the conclusion. So understood the argument can be analyzed and evaluated as an argument which has a questionable explicit and implicit premise (and an inference which is an instance of the fallacy “Affirming the Consequent”).

The attempt to identify implicit premises or conclusions in an argument can raise some significant theoretical questions when it is standardized. All arguments rely on many assumptions, raising the question whether and when and how they should be recognized. In cases in which it is clear that an unstated premise or conclusion needs to be recognized, it can often be interpreted in different ways.

One principle that many systems of informal logic use to choose between alternative interpretations of implicit argument components is the “Principle of Charity.” It favors an interpretation of an argument which makes it as credible as possible. In many situations, this can best be accomplished by attributing it a “logical minimum,” understood as the weakest implicit component needed to successfully connect the argument’s premises to its conclusion.

3.2 Key Component Tables and Diagrams

Standardizing arguments by listing their premises and conclusions is one way to delineate the content of an argument and prepare it for evaluation. But standardizing of this sort has a major shortcoming, for it does not distinguish between different kinds of inferences an argument may contain. One way to address the issues that this raises is by standardizing an argument with a table that catalogues an argument’s premises and conclusions (a Key Component or “KC” table) and combining it with an argument diagram (a “mapping”) that depicts the structure of its inferences.

In EXAMPLE 10 (below), I have used this method to standardize an argument that Kretzmann uses in his account of the medieval philosopher William of Sherwood, where he concludes that it is likely that William was a Master at the University of Paris. The first column of the KC table lists the premises and conclusion of the argument; the second assigns them their role as premise or conclusion; the third lists the source from which they are derived. The diagram that follows depicts the relationships between the argument’s key components, using arrows to indicate the inferences it includes.

image text


This standardization shows that the Sherwood argument is supported by three “convergent” premises which provide three independent reasons that support the argument’s conclusion in different ways.

In other instances of argument, two or more “linked” premises combine to support a conclusion with a single inference. The argument “The murderer was very strong, so George cannot be the murderer.” is an enthymeme which assumes that “George is not very strong.” Using square brackets ([ ]) to indicate this implicit component, we can standardize the argument with the following KC table and diagram. In this case, the linked premises are indicated with a plus sign (“+”) that connects them in the diagram. It indicates that they support a conclusion (only) when combined.

image text


The use of KC tables and diagrams is not limited to purely verbal arguments. When arguments have non-verbal key components, visual and multimodal premises and conclusions can be recognized in a key component table by ostension, or by reproducing them in some way. Once they are identified in a KC table, the inferences such arguments depend on can be mapped in standard ways.

The following table and diagram standardizes EXAMPLE 3, which contains an inference from three linked premises (two visual and one verbal) to the conclusion that there is water on the planet Mars.

image text

KC table are not the only way to diagram the structure of real life arguments. Diagramming (mapping) has its own history, which incorporates many different ways of diagramming arguments. The usefulness of diagramming is already recognized in Whately 1826 and, in the early twentieth century, in Wigmore 1913, who develops a form of mapping (“evidence charts”) designed to portray and analyze complex chains of judicial reasoning.

The development of informal logic has kindled a renewed interest in different kinds of diagrams which are supported by the development of associated software (Rationale, Reason!Able, Araucaria, Athena, Compendium, Theseus) and online aids (Debate Mapper, TruthMapping.Com, Argunet, Agora).

3.3 Supplemented Diagrams

KC tables and diagrams prepare the way for argument evaluation by clarifying the internal structure and content of an argument. Other aspects of an argument that may need to be considered in argument assessment can be included in a “supplemented” diagram which adds an account of the context in which it is embedded. Three aspects of arguments merit note in this regard.

The first is the audience to which an argument is addressed. Most real life arguments are used in an attempt to convince some intended audience of some point of view. In view of this, successful arguments must be built with this in mind.

A convincing argument for the conclusion that the United Nations cannot be trusted must address different issues when it is directed at a Chinese, Norwegian, Kenyan, Israeli, Swiss, Palestinian, etc. audience. As rhetoric has emphasized since its beginnings, this means that successful arguers must construct their arguments in ways that recognize the beliefs, attitudes and values of their intended audience (and in this sense ‘speak’ to them). Tindale (1999, 2004, 2010) has imported this notion into informal logic, advocating an informal logic that incorporates an analysis of audience.

A second contextual factor relevant to the evaluation of an argument is the goal of the arguer. As Hitchcock 2002 points out, acts of arguing may make a declaration (“The evidence shows that you committed an assault, so I find you guilty as charged.”); command or make a request (“You were there, so you must tell us what happened.” “The children are shivering, so please close the door.”); make a promise (“I know it matters to you, so I promise to go tomorrow.”); express a sentiment (“What we did was inexcusable, so we beg your forgiveness”); and function in many other ways.

As Pinto and Gilbert have emphasized, this means that a successful argument (which is successful in the sense that it accomplishes the arguer’s purpose in presenting the argument), may produce a withholding of assent (or full assent) to some proposition, a particular attitude, an emotional state like fear or hope, or a certain kind of behavior (by, e.g., as when an argument demands that people take up arms against a foe or take action in support of social change). When one bargains, the goal of argument is not truth, but a bargain that serves one’s interests. As Hoffman 2016 notes, an argument may not aim to resolve disagreement, but to promote reflection and the raising of important questions.

The different goals arguer’s try to achieve via argument may make their success and legitimacy turn on norms and rules that add to (or subtract from) the traditional strictures that guide argument evaluation. In some circumstances, it makes ultimatums, exaggerations, threats and insults a permissible element of arguing. In sharp contrast, they are unacceptable in attempts to determine what is true from a scientific point of view, where such behaviors are instances of the fallacy ad baculum.

Walton 2007 accommodates the different goals associated with real life arguments by distinguishing between different kinds of dialogues in which arguing occurs. The rules for a particular kind of dialogue define what types of argumentative moves are allowed, what kinds of questions and responses are permitted, and what norms arguments must adhere to.

The seven basic types of dialogue he distinguishes can be summarized as follows.

Type Situation Arguers’ Goal Dialogue Goal
Persuasion Conflict of Opinion Persuade Other Party Resolve Issue
Inquiry Need to Have Proof Verify Evidence Prove Hypothesis
Discovery Need for Explanation Find a Hypothesis Support Hypothesis
Negotiation Conflict of Interests Secure Interests Settle Issue
Information Need Information Acquire Information Exchange Information
Deliberation Practical Choice Fit Goals and Actions Decide What to Do
Eristic Personal Conflict Attack an Opponent Reveal Deep Conflict

In dialogues of inquiry, arguments are used as tools in an attempt to establish what is true. So understood, arguments must adhere to strict standards that determine what counts as evidence and counter-evidence for some point of view. In eristic dialogue, arguing is combat and the aim is to vanquish one’s opponent (and humiliate them, ideally by wowing one’s audience with one’s mental gymnastics). In doing so, sophistical tricks and fallacious reasoning are welcome if they serve this end.

Walton’s dialogue typology leaves room for more narrowly defined kinds of dialogue. Collective bargaining is a specific kind of negotiation dialogue which is governed by legal rules and well established practices that very precisely delineate what is and is not allowed in bargaining. Different subdialogues are associated with different norms, rules and practices.

A third contextual factor that may warrant comment in a supplemented diagram is the dialectical context in which an argument occurs. In his account of argument, Johnson 2000 distinguishes between the “illative” core of an argument and the argument’s “dialectical tier,” understanding the former as a “proto-argument” which consists of a set of premises offered in support of some conclusion. It is the kernel of an argument, but he considers it an argument in the full sense only if it fully engages the dialectical tier, considering alternative points of view, addressing objections to the conclusion it proposes.

4. Testing Arguments

The ultimate goal of informal logic is normative: an account of argument and systems of informal logic that can be used to determine when and whether real life arguments are strong or weak, good or bad, convincing or unconvincing. Standardizing prepares arguments for such assessment. This makes T in the BLAST definition — the tools and methods which are used to test argument strength — the most important defining element in a system of informal logic.

Almost all informal logics understand a good (strong) argument to be an argument with “acceptable” premises and a “valid” inference — i.e. a conclusion that follows from them. Hansen 2012 has argued that informal logic should follow classical logic, and not concern itself with the assessment of premise acceptability, but its engagement with real life arguments (and the desire to evaluate them in a fulsome way) has produced a field that includes this within argument evaluation. In this and in other regards, systems of informal logic adopt many different approaches to argument assessment.

4.1 AV Criteria

In classical logic, an argument is (deductively) valid if it is impossible for its premises to be true and its conclusion false. On this account, the ultimate aim of arguing is a “sound” argument: i.e. a valid argument with true premises.

Within informal logic, the simplest criterion for good arguments is an informal analogue of soundness. It understands a good argument to be an argument that justifies its conclusion by providing good (strong, credible, etc.) reasons for believing it. Within the argument, this implies premises which are “acceptable” and a conclusion that follows from them. We can summarize this basic criterion as T = {A,V}, where A is an account of premise acceptability, and V is an account of informal validity which determines when a conclusion follows from premises in a way that is approved of (deductively, inductively, conductively, and/or abductively, etc.).

Following Johnson and Blair (1977, 1994), many systems of informal logic adopt an ARS version of these AV criteria, making “Acceptability, Relevance and Sufficiency” the requirements for good argument. On this account, premises are acceptable when they are true or acceptable in some other way; relevant when they provide some (i.e. any) support for the conclusion of the argument; and sufficient when they provide enough support to warrant its acceptance — as likely, true, plausible, etc.

Premise Acceptability

Within informal arguments, premises may be acceptable in a variety of ways. In many circumstances, they are acceptable if they are likely true and unacceptable if likely false.

It is worth noting that this truth criterion can be expanded to apply to visual premises. An image functioning as a visual premise may, for example, be evaluated as a “true” or “false” depiction of what it represents. A photograph or an image may be unacceptable because it is untrustworthy or categorizes a situation in a misleading way. Photographs are often ‘doctored’ or in other ways designed to present things in ways that do not accurately reflect what is photographed. Other kinds of multimodal premises can be understood as likely true to the extent that they are a reliable basis for an inference.

In some kinds of dialogue — in the exchanges that characterize negotiation, bargaining, eristic, and persuasion — acceptable premises may not need to be true. In bargaining (“haggling”) a buyer may claim that “I will not give you a penny more than $300 for that lamp” as a premise in support of the conclusion that the seller should agree to a lower price. This counts as an acceptable premise even if it is an idle threat that the buyer will never carry out, for threats of this sort are an acceptable element of the arguments that take place in this kind of dialogue.

In other cases, informal logics use acceptability rather than truth as a criterion for judging premises in contexts in which it is difficult to judge premises as true or false. In such cases, acceptable premises may be plausible (or exploratory) hypotheses, claims that can only be said to be generally accepted or assumed, or ethical or aesthetic judgments which are not easily categorized as true or false.

In still other circumstances, truth may be required for acceptability, but only one of a number of conditions that must be satisfied. Even when a premise is true, it may be unacceptable because it violates the rules of interaction that govern the dialogue in which it is embedded. In a legal proceeding or a formal hearing, premises and arguments must not entertain premises that violate rules of procedure.

In situations in which arguments are attempts to convince a specific audience of a conclusion, an acceptable premise may need to be true, but also acceptable to the members of this audience. As Aristotle suggests in the Rhetoric, successful arguments may need to have premises that are in keeping with the pathos of an audience (and do so in a way that does not undermine the character — the ethos — of the arguer). As Gilbert 1997, 2014 has emphasized, there are many real life circumstances in which the emotional acceptability of a premise is required for argument success.

One of the first VR productions by the New York Times was “Kiya,” a production which recreated an incidence of domestic abuse in an attempt to provide support for the importance of attempts to address issues of domestic violence. Its producer describes it as an attempt to use “the immersive power of virtual reality: its ability to generate intense empathy on the part of the viewer; to wring from the audience the intense emotional connection that these stories deserve” (NYT, Jan 21, 2016).

Inference Validity

In its attempt to account for a broad range of real life arguing, informal logics have expanded traditional notions of premise acceptability. Something similar has happened in the case of inference validity. The end result is an expansion of both sides of the AV criteria for good argument.

In the case of inference validity, this expansion has been accomplished by treating deductive validity as one variant of validity, and by recognizing other “defeasible,” non-deductive ways in which premises may entail conclusions. Govier 1987 dubs the deductive/inductive distinction as “the great divide,” emphasizing the latter over the former. Sometimes informal logic systems understand inductive arguments narrowly, as inductive generalizations. Sometimes more broadly, as arguments which have premises that imply that a conclusion is (only) probable or plausible, leaving open the possibility that it is false.

“Conductive” arguments support their conclusions by accumulating non-decisive reasons in their favor. They are valid when they collective enough reasons to warrant their conclusions. In a particular case, different elements of evidence may suggest but not prove that someone charged with murder is guilty but make the conclusion likely if enough evidence of this sort is accumulated (a witness claims he pulled the trigger, the ballistics report shows that the bullet came from a gun he owned, he wrote an e-mail saying he would “get” the victim, etc.).

Strong “abductive” arguments are convincing instances of “inference to the best explanation” (see Harman 1965). They recognize some facts, point out that they are entailed by some hypothesis, and conclude that the hypothesis is true. Taken at face value, abductive arguments appear to be instances of the deductive fallacy “affirming the consequent,” but play an important role to play in medical, scientific and legal inquiry (see Walton 2004).

4.2 Fallacy Theory

AV criteria are in many ways an extension of the notion of good argument enshrined in classical logic. In the search for ways to deal with real life arguments, some informal logicians have moved in a different direction, reviving fallacy theory as an alternative. Hamblin 1970 has become a touchstone for moves in this direction.

Systems of informal logic that rely on fallacies test arguments by asking whether their proponents are guilty of fallacious reasoning. While there is no agreed-upon taxonomy of fallacies, many canonical fallacies have been emphasized in the analysis of informal arguments. They include formal fallacies like affirming the consequent and denying the antecedent; and informal fallacies like ad hominem (“against the person”), slippery slope, ad baculum (“appeal to threat or force”), ad misericordiam (“appeal to pity”), “hasty generalization,” and “two wrongs” reasoning (as in “two wrongs don’t make a right”). The systems of informal logic taught in textbooks often add specialized variants of the standard fallacies (“misleading vividness” designates the misuse of vivid anecdotal evidence in hasty generalizations, and so on.)

Woods and Walton 1982 and Hansen and Pinto 1995 contain detailed discussions of the definition, analysis and assessment of fallacies. In argumentation theory, van Eemeren and Grootendorst 1992 propose a “pragma-dialectical” account of fallacies which treats them as violations of rules that govern critical discussion -- dialogues that attempt to resolve a difference of opinion. Battersby and Bailin 2011 view fallacies as patterns of argument patterns “whose persuasive power greatly exceeds its probative [i.e. evidential] value,” making fallacies errors in reasoning that ordinary arguers are attracted to in view of their rhetorical appeal.

Some fallacies — e.g., equivocation and begging the question (i.e. circular reasoning) — highlight important issues that frequently interfere with real life arguing, but fallacy theory has been criticized when it is adopted as a general account of argument. The issues this raises include its unsystematic nature, disagreements about the definition and nature of specific fallacies, and the emphasis that fallacy theory places on faulty reasoning rather than good argument. Hitchcock (1995, 324) writes that the idea that we should teach reasoning by fallacies is “like saying that the best way to teach somebody to play tennis without making the common mistakes is to demonstrate these faults in action and get him to label and respond to them” (see Feldman 2009).

The theoretical issues raised by fallacy theory are compounded by instances of traditional fallacies which have a reasonable role to play in real life arguing. Appeals to pity and other appeals to emotion have, to take one example, a legitimate role to play in moral, political and aesthetic debate. The following examples highlight other circumstances in which arguments which fit the definition of a traditional fallacy cannot be so readily dismissed.

A remark from a Danish television debate over the question whether the Danish church should be separated from the Danish state (Jorgensen 1995, 369): “You should not listen to my opponent. He wants to sever the Danish church from the state for his own personal sake.” This seems a classic example of ad hominem, Kahane 1995 (p. 65), describing it as a fallacy that occurs when an arguer attacks “his opponent rather than his opponent’s evidence and arguments.” But this is an accusation of conflict of interest which cannot be dismissed out of hand. If there is reason to believe that an arguer favors a point of view because they have something to gain from it (say, the purchase of a company in which they own shares), this does raise questions about the extent to which their arguments should be entertained.

Martin Luther King Jr., influenced by Gandhi, argued that one can justifiably break laws in a struggle for social justice. Such arguments play a central role in the civil rights movement. They cannot be summarily dismissed, though they appear to be clear cases of “two wrongs make a right.”

The argument that “the attempt to use military force to put an end to terrorism is wrong because it will take us down a slippery slope that will end in improper interference in the affairs of independent states” cannot be dismissed because it is an instance of slippery slope reasoning. If it is true that some action will precipitate a chain of consequences that lead down an alleged slippery slope, this is a good reason to question it.

Examples of this sort have forced careful accounts of fallacies to make room for reasonable arguments which share the form of traditional fallacies.

In doing so, it is helpful to distinguish between fallacies which do and do not have non-fallacious instances. Equivocation, post hoc ergo propter hoc, non sequitor and hasty generalization are commonly classified as forms of argument that are inherently mistaken. In contrast, traditional fallacies like ad hominem, two wrongs reasoning, guilt by association, and appeal to pity are patterns of reasoning which can, when they are constructed in the right way, play a legitimate role within real life reasoning (and are, in view of this, sometimes treated as argument schemes rather than fallacies).

4.3 Natural Language Deductivism

Natural Language Deductivism (“NLD”) is an approach to informal reasoning that retains classical logic’s focus on deductive validity (see Groarke 1999, and Govier 1987, who develops an initial account NLD, but ultimately favors a more radical break from classical logic). It suggests that we should interpret informal arguments as attempts to create deductively valid inferences which can be analyzed and assessed accordingly. In a deductivist system of informal logic, the V in the AV criteria for good arguments is this classical notion of validity.

NLD has frequently been rejected on the basis of the common, but mistaken, notion that deductively valid arguments must have certain conclusions — a misconception that seems founded deductive validity’s historical connections to formal logic and mathematics (see Groarke 1999). It is true that ordinary arguing rarely satisfies the strict proof procedures they imply, but deductive validity is not restricted to this compass and there are many instances of ordinary argument which are clear examples of deductively valid argument.

In cases of deductive reasoning, the conclusion of an argument need not be certain, but only as certain the premises, creating ample room for conclusions which are merely likely, plausible, or probable. EXAMPLE 15 is taken from a radio commentary on population growth.

The population of the world will grow from 6 to 9 billion in the next fifteen years so we will, if we are to provide sufficient food for everyone, need to find a way to provide food for an additional 3 billion people.

In this case, the premise of the argument is not certain, but reasonably thought to be true — because it was (in the commentary) backed by an extrapolation from well established population trends. The deductively valid inference based upon it makes it reasonable to judge the conclusion of the argument true as well, though it is not certain, as all predictions about population growth are, at best, plausible conjectures.

NLD’s plausibility as a general theory of argument turns on its account of arguments which are not prima facie deductive. Faced with arguments of this sort, it preserves the deductivist approach by attributing an implicit premise (essentially, a deductive warrant) to such arguments in a way that deductively connects an argument’s premises to its conclusion. Typically this is an “associated” conditional of the form “If P, then C” where P is the argument’s premises and C is its conclusion.

A 2015 blog by a professional dietician (Dr. Cristina Sutter) criticizes arguments that justify the claim that garcinia cambogia is a miracle weight loss pill by appealing to the authority of the popular television personality “Dr. Oz.” — instances of the reasoning “Dr. Oz Says It, So It Must Be True.” We can standardize the pattern of argument she criticizes as:

Premise: Dr. Oz says [that gracinia cambogia is a miracle weight loss pill].
Conclusion: This must be true.

If one judges only by the explicit premise in this argument (“Dr. Oz says...”), this is not a deductively valid argument, for it is obvious that the premise could be true and the conclusion false: Dr. Oz could say gracinia cambogia is a miracle weight loss pill and be wrong. That said, anyone using this argument must assume an associated conditional which can be understood as an implicit premise, allowing us to standardize the argument as:

Premise: Dr. Oz says [that gracinia cambogia is a miracle weight loss pill].
Implicit Premise: If Dr. Oz says this, it must be true.
Conclusion: This must be true.

So understood, the Dr. Oz argument is deductively valid, but not sound, as it is a valid argument with a problematic implicit premise.

NLD deals with inductive generalizations in a similar way. Consider the following example from a conversation about French men.

“French men are fastidious about their appearance. I have worked with many and this was what I found.”

In this example, the move from the premise to the conclusion of the argument assumes that the sample of French men the arguer is familiar with are a representative sample of French men. If this is not likely, then the sample does not provide good reasons for concluding that French men are, in general, as fastidious if they are. If we recognize this assumption as an implicit premise when we standardize the argument, then the argument is deductively valid, for a representative sample is a subset of a population that accurately reflects the characteristics of the larger group.

In this way, NLD turns the uncertainty that characterizes inductive generalizations (and other forms of informal validity) into uncertainty that is connected to an associated conditional which warrants the move from an argument’s premises to it conclusion. This does not eliminate such uncertainty, but maintains it as a key consideration in argument evaluation, for it makes the status of this warrant an essential element of premise acceptability.

In favor of NLD, it has been argued that reconstruction of many arguments it proposes is a dialectically useful way to make explicit the key assumptions that arguments depend on, and frees us from the need to distinguish between different kinds of validity in ways that can be problematic when they are applied to real life arguing. The pragma-dialectical account of indirect speech acts (Eemeren and Grootendorst 2002, Groarke 1999) provides a way to reconstruct arguments as deductive arguments when NLD requires it, though Johnson 2000 and Godden 2004 argue that NLD is an artificial theory which forces informal arguments to adhere to an overly restrictive model of inference.

4.4 Argument Schemes

Argument (or “argumentation”) schemes are recurring patterns of reasoning. Once identified they can be used to evaluate an argument which is instance of a scheme, or as a template or recipe arguers can use when they construct an argument which is an instance of a scheme. Walton, Reed and Macagno 2008 provide a compendium of 96 schemes. Wageman has developed a Periodic Table of Arguments which provides a systematized account of basic schemes.

Rules of inference like modus ponens and modus tollens can be understood as deductive schemes. Other schemes commonly used in ordinary arguing include Argument by Sign, Argument by Analogy, Argument by Example, and Slippery Slope Reasoning. Dove 2016 and Groarke 2019 have shown how visual arguments with non-verbal visual elements may be instances of common schemes, and have identified some schemes which are inherently visual.

The most common approach to argument schemes combines a pattern of argument with a set of “critical questions” with which it is associated. The scheme Argument from Authority (“Appeal to Authority,” “Appeal to Expert Opinion”) and the critical questions it raises can be formalized as follows.

A is an authority in domain D.
A says that T is true.
T is within D.
(Therefore) T is true.
Critical questions:
1. How credible is A?
2. Is A an authority in domain D?
3. What did A assert that implies T?
4. Is A someone who can be trusted?
5. Is T consistent with what other experts assert?
6. Is A’s assertion of T based on evidence?

Prakken 2010b understands argument schemes as inference rules, some critical questions ensuring the truth of an argument’s premises, others ensuring that the context of the inference is appropriate.

Another approach to schemes builds the answers to critical questions into a ‘full’ definition of the scheme, treating them as required premises in convincing instances of the scheme. Taking this approach, the scheme Argument from Authority can be defined as follows.

A is a credible authority in the domain D.
A asserted X, which implies T.
A can be trusted and T is within domain D.
T is consistent with what other experts in domain D assert.
A’s assertion of T is based on evidence.
(Therefore) T is true.

The critical question approach to schemes suggests that a credible argument from authority must include acceptable premises of the form outlined in the definition of the scheme, and is valid if it is backed by answers to the scheme’s critical questions. Taking the ‘full’ approach, a valid argument from authority must include the premises that define it as as a good argument as explicit (or possibly implicit) premises. In both cases, the result is an account of premise acceptability and validity which is tailored to specifically apply to arguments from authority.

Different argument schemes are a refinement of general AV criteria, creating specific criteria which can be applied to different kinds of argument.

When a student essay claims that “we should not stockpile nuclear weapons” because Einstein told us that this would lead “to destruction even more terrible than the present destruction of life” (EXAMPLE 18), this is an appeal to authority which invokes Einstein as an authority. In order for it to be a convincing argument from authority, it would need to fully satisfy the conditions outlined in our definition of the scheme Argument from Authority.

The attempt to satisfy the requirements this implies produces a version of the argument which can be summarized as follows.

EXAMPLE 18 expanded to satisfy the criteria for a convincing argument from authority:
1. Einstein (A) is a credible authority on nuclear weapons (D).
2. Einstein (A) asserted that the stockpiling of nuclear weapons would precipitate “destruction even more terrible than the present destruction of life” (X), which implies that we should not stockpile nuclear weapons (T).
3. Einstein (A) can be trusted and questions about stockpiling nuclear weapons (T) are questions about nuclear weapons (D).
4. The claim that we should not stockpile nuclear weapons (T) is consistent with what other experts on nuclear weapons (D) assert.
5. Einstein’s (A’s) assertion that we should not stockpile nuclear weapons (T) is based on evidence.
6. (Therefore) We should not stockpile nuclear weapons (T).

This attempt to satisfy the conditions for a good instance of argument from authority fails because it produces a number of problematic premises. Other experts disagreed (and continue to disagree) with Einstein’s suggestion that it is a mistake to stockpile nuclear weapons. More fundamentally, the proposed argument is founded on too loose an account of nuclear weapons as a domain of expertise. Einstein is a renowned expert on nuclear physics but this it does not make him an expert on the social and political issues raised by nuclear weapons. This is something that a convincing version of the argument would have to establish.

In some ways, the scheme approach to argument assessment rectifies problems that arise in systems of informal logic that adopt the fallacy approach to argument evaluation. For traditional fallacies which have non-fallacious instances can be understood, not as fallacies, but as argumentation schemes which are legitimate forms of reasoning when they are properly employed. Fallacy definitions can be turned into scheme definitions by identifying a list of critical questions (or required premises) that specify what is required to make the arguments in question valid.

Ad hominem is a case in point, for there are many instances in which criticisms of an arguer (rather than their position) are a reasonable way to cast doubt on their views. We can specify when this is so by listing critical questions that determine whether this is so in a particular case of argument. The basic question that must be asked is whether there is a good reason why the arguer’s views should not be taken seriously — a question that subsumes the more specific questions whether they have repeatedly shown poor judgment, are biased, lack expertise in the area in question, or are for some other reason an arguer who should not be listened to.

Treated in this way, ad hominem is a legitimate scheme of argument, but there are (as there are in the case of all schemes) many situations in which ad hominem arguments are poor instances of the scheme. In this and many other cases, traditional fallacies can be regarded as deviations from an inherently correct scheme of reasoning.

4.5 Testing Systems

Most informal logics combine different ways of evaluating arguments. In this way, T in a particular system tends to be some combined set of tools that can be used in this endeavor. In most cases, T = {F, AV, AS}, where F is some list of fallacies, AV is some kind of AV criteria (say, the standard ARS criteria) and AS is some set of argumentation schemes.

But systems of informal logic can accommodate other, less common criteria for deciding whether arguments are good or bad, strong or weak. A system might, for example, incorporate criteria which are founded on a virtue-based approach to argument (see Virtues and Arguments), on feminist principles, or on notions derived from rhetoric, theories of communication, or other cognate fields.

The issues raised by the different kinds of standards that govern arguing in different kinds of dialogue can be be accommodated by formulating complex testing systems that include different criteria which apply to different kinds of dialogue. A system which aggregates these different criteria may be the best way to build a truly comprehensive account of real life reasoning.

5. Informal Logic Within A Broader Context

Informal logic’s attempt to understand argument as it occurs in a broad range of real life situations continues to evolve in a way that is influenced by the study of real life reasoning that takes place within the broader scope of argumentation theory.

One cognate field of note is Artificial Intelligence (AI). It relies on step by step accounts of informal reasoning in a wide array of contexts. Informal logics provide this in a general way that has influenced the attempt to model argumentation between agents in multi-agent systems which mimic or assist human reasoning. Computational models have been applied to large-scale collections (‘webs’) of inter-connected arguments, and to reasoning about medical decisions, legal issues, chemical properties and other complex systems. Automated argument assistance functions as a computational aid that can assist in the construction of an argument. Verheij 2014 provides an overview of the issues that this raises.

The development in the empirical study of real life reasoning is the study of argument “corpora” — large collections of argument drawn from natural language discourse. In an early study of this sort, Jorgenson, Kock and Rorbech 1991 analyzed a series of 37 one-hour televised debates from Danish public TV. The debates featured well-known public figures arguing for and against policy proposals. A representative audience of 100 voters voted before and after the debate. Their conclusions were compared with standard notions of “proper” and “valid” argumentation. Other studies consider corpora made up of large databases of selected written texts (see, e.g., Goodwin and Cortes 2010, and Mochales and Ieven 2009).

Argument mining is a subfield of data mining, or text mining (and computational linguistics). It uses software and algorithms that automatically process texts looking for argument structures — for premises, conclusions, argumentation schemes, and extended webs of argument. The texts studied include legal documents , on-line debates, product reviews, academic literature, user comments on proposed regulations, newspaper articles and court cases, as well as dialogical domains. ARG-tech, the Centre for Argument Technology, has played a central role in studies of this sort.

Other research relevant to informal logic has highlighted many ways in which the success of real life arguments depends on aspects of argumentation which are not well integrated into standard systems of informal logic. The latter include an arguer’s ability to draw attention to their argument (using “argument flags” that attract the attention of an intended audience); their personal credibility, ethos, or standing; or their ability to situate their argument within a broader context of debate or dialogue. The study of these and other pragmatic, social, dialectical, semiotic and rhetorical features of arguing will probably play a role in the continued development of informal logic.

The expansion of informal logic to account for an ever broader range of argument is evident in discussions of the use of narratives within argument. In Plato’s Republic, Glaucon uses the mythical story of “The Ring of Gyges” to prove that humans are inherently selfish. In this and many other situations, stories of various kinds (accounts of some historical event, biographies, fables, parables, morality plays, etc) are designed to provide support for some conclusion. It is often been said that a novel or some other work of fiction is an argument for socialism, freedom of expression, or some other value.

One can understand the argumentative use of narratives in a variety of ways: as rhetorical embellishment, as a form of argument by analogy, as implicit generalization (the characters in a story functioning as variables within such generalizations), or reasoning that requires the development of unique standards of argument assessment. According to Fisher 1987, argument itself is best understood as narrative. According to Nussbaum 1990, literature is a way to better understand, and argue about, complex moral situations. Within informal logic, Walton, Reed, and Macagno 2008 identify narrative-based schemes of argument while others continue to debate the role that narratives play in ordinary argument (see Govier and Ayer 2013, Olmos 2014, Plumer 2015).

Informal logic’s interest in real life argument has, from the start, been tied to its interest in the teaching of reasoning skills. In view of this, its interests overlap with fields and disciplines that study education and pedagogy — links manifest in its own influence on critical thinking and the philosophy of education (and movements like “Philosophy for Children”).

Some of the educational issues raised by informal logic are manifest in the development of critical thinking tests which attempt to measure argumentation skills. They are used to test the abilities of students or others and, in a self-reflective way, as an empirical way to test the success of attempts to teach informal reasoning.

Critical thinking (or, even more so, creative thinking) skills are not easily assessed using standardized tests which are designed for large scale use, and typically rely on multiple choice question and answers (see Sobocan 2021). In real life contexts, what counts as good arguing (and thinking) is open ended and unpredictable, dialectical, and influenced by pragmatic and contextual considerations which are difficult to incorporate within standard tests. The California Critical Thinking Test reflects the view of critical thinking elaborated in “The Delphi Report,” commissioned by the American Philosophical Association in 1987, a report that focuses on a narrow range of critical thinking skills which tends to oversimplify the competencies required for good informal argument.

Ennis 2013 provides a comprehensive proposal for dealing with the issues raised by critical thinking tests, and with other challenges raised by attempts to teach critical thinking.

6. Informal Logic and Philosophy

The field of informal logic is a recent invention, but one that continues historical attempts to understand and teach others how to argue. In the Western philosophical tradition, it begins with the sophists’ fifth century boast that they could teach others how to be successful arguers. In Aristotle it is manifest in his systematic account of reasoning, which is expressly designed to teach others how to argue well. Within the history of philosophy, one finds numerous other attempts to formulate accounts of argument that can be used to explain, evaluate, and teach real life reasoning.

The practice of philosophy itself assumes (and frequently develops) an account of argument as it assembles evidence for different philosophical perspectives. Systems of informal logic assume, and often depend upon, the resulting views of reason, rationality and what counts as evidence and knowledge. The philosophical issues in play are tied to complex, unsettled epistemological questions about evidence and knowledge.

Mercier and Sperber (2011) argue that reasoning is a practice which has evolved from, and needs to be understood in terms of, the social practice of argumentation. Johnson 2000 pushes in the opposite direction, arguing that a comprehensive account of argument must be built upon a philosophical account of rationality. Goldman 1999 situates knowledge in the social interactions that take place within interpersonal exchange and knowledge institutions, emphasizing informal argument and the constraints which make it a valuable practice. A 2002 volume of Philosophica on Hilary Putnam’s philosophy suggests pragmatism as an epistemology that best fits informal logic as a discipline.

Some aspects of informal logic raise deep questions that have implications for logic and philosophy. One notable feature of informal logic as it is now practiced is a proliferation of different systems of informal logic which approach the analysis and evaluation of informal reasoning in different ways — employing fallacies, AV criteria, argumentation schemes, methods of formal analysis, and other models of good argument. One implication is a broadening of the conditions for argument felicity.

Other issues are raised by informal logic’s recognition that real life arguments frequently employ visual images, non-verbal sounds, and other non-verbal elements, challenging the traditional assumption that arguments are sets of sentences -- or the propositions (“the bearers of truth value”) that sentences refer to. However one understands visual and multimodal arguments, there is no easy way to reduce them to sets of sentences, for there is no precise way to translate what we see, hear, experience, etc. into words.

In its current state of development, informal logic’s connection to philosophy does not lie in its influence on key philosophical disciplines so much as their influence on it. In North America and elsewhere, informal logic is a field in which philosophers apply theories of argument (rationality, knowledge, etc.) to everyday argument. In keeping with this, philosophers continue to be the core contributors to informal logic; philosophy departments in colleges and universities continue to be the core departments that teach the courses that are its pedagogical focus.

The influence of informal logic courses on the enormous numbers of students that enrol in them require that we at least qualify Rescher’s remark (2005, p. 22) that: “The fact is that philosophy has little or no place in American popular (as opposed to academic) culture... philosophy nowadays makes virtually no impact on the wider culture of North America.” The extent to which informal logic’s attempt to broadly instill good reasoning habits within public education and public discussion and debate is difficult to judge.

Though informal logic addresses many issues relevant to core philosophical disciplines (most notably, epistemology and philosophy of mind; evident in the work of Goldman, Crosswhite, Thagard, and others), it has had limited impact on mainstream approaches to their subject matter. Woods 2000 has speculated on the reasons why. In part, informal logic’s position within philosophy reflects the broader fragmentation of philosophy within North America, Rescher 2005 (p. 4) writing that: “The most striking aspect of contemporary American philosophy is its fragmentation. The scale and complexity of the enterprise is such that if one seeks in contemporary American philosophy for a consensus on the problem agenda, let alone for agreement on the substantive issues, then one is predestined to look in vain.”

In this context, it can best be said that informal logic, like applied ethics, has become a standard offering that helps sustain philosophy departments in North America by contributing to what Rescher describes as “The rapid growth of ‘applied philosophy’ ...[that] is a striking structural feature of contemporary North American philosophy.” (p. 9). The goal of applied philosophy is philosophically informed and nuanced reasoning that addresses complex real life situations. Informal logic is one field which has made a valuable contribution to this goal.


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The author would like to acknowledge and thank the members of ARGTHRY, Tony Blair, and the SEP reviewer for many corrections and suggestions.

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