Marcus Aurelius

First published Mon Nov 29, 2010; substantive revision Fri Dec 22, 2017

The second century CE Roman emperor Marcus Aurelius was also a Stoic philosopher, and his Meditations, which he wrote to and for himself, offers readers a unique opportunity to see how an ancient person (indeed an emperor) might try to live a Stoic life, according to which only virtue is good, only vice is bad, and the things which we normally busy ourselves with are all indifferent to our happiness (for our lives are not made good or bad by our having or lacking them). The difficulties Marcus faces putting Stoicism into practice are philosophical as well as practical, and understanding his efforts increases our philosophical appreciation of Stoicism.

1. Life and Works

Born in 121 CE and educated extensively in rhetoric and philosophy, Marcus Aurelius succeeded his adoptive father Antoninus Pius as Emperor of Rome in 161 CE and reigned until his own death in 180. His reign was troubled by attacks from Germany, rebellions in northern Italy and Egypt, and an outburst of the plague; at least part of the work for which he is famous, the Meditations, was written during the last years of his military campaigns. Aside from the Meditations Marcus’ extant works include some edicts, official letters, and some private correspondence, including a lengthy correspondence with his rhetoric teacher and lifelong friend, Fronto.[1] The private correspondence began before Marcus was twenty and continued into his imperial years. It includes what seem to be rhetorical exercises (for example, pieces in praise of sleep, and smoke and dust) written when Marcus was still in his 20s, an exchange about the value or disvalue of rhetoric to philosophy written soon after Marcus became Emperor, and throughout, personal information, frequently concerning illnesses, births, and deaths in his own family.

Marcus’ chief philosophical influence was Stoic: in Book I of the Meditations, he records his gratitude to his Stoic teacher and friend Rusticus for giving him Epictetus to read, and in a letter to Fronto written between 145 and 147, he reports reading the 3rd c. BCE Greek Stoic Aristo of Chios and finding intense joy in his teachings, growing ashamed of his own shortcomings, and realizing that he can never again argue opposite sides of the same question, as required by rhetorical practice. The Stoic influence, however, does not prevent Marcus from approvingly quoting Epicurus on ethical matters (as Seneca also had); in addition to Epictetus and Epicurus, Marcus quotes liberally from such figures as Antisthenes, Chrysippus, Democritus, Euripides, Heraclitus, Homer, and Plato. From Book I of the Meditations we also learn that Marcus’ political heroes included republican opponents of kingship: he thanks his adoptive brother Severus not only for exemplifying the love of justice and the vision of a constitution based on equality before the law, but also for the knowledge of Brutus (assassin of Julius Caesar), Cato, Dion (probably of Prusa), (Publius) Thrasea, and Helvidius (i.14). Consonant with this, he warns himself to see to it that he does not become ‘Caesarified’ (that is, act like a dictator, vi.30).

1.1 The Character of the Meditations

Marcus’ Meditations reads very differently from other ancient Greek and Roman philosophical texts. Outside of Book I, which acknowledges various relatives and teachers for benefiting Marcus by being exemplars of some virtue or bearers of some useful lesson (and concludes by acknowledging the gods for providing him with such exemplars and with other circumstances conducive to his moral development), it is difficult even to tell how the work is organized, for instance whether the order of the books and chapters is evidence of the order of events in Marcus’ life or follows some logical or topical order, or whether the chapter divisions reflect breaks in Marcus’ thought. Marcus returns insistently to issues that must have arisen from his experiences, such as the imminence of death and his irritation with his associates’ faults. Our own perennial concern with these topics, Marcus’ gift for vivid imagery, and the apparent extractability of individual sentences from the text given its lack of clear structure, have all contributed to making Marcus among the most quotable of philosophers. But the reader who wants to understand Marcus’ thought as a whole is bound to be frustrated; sometimes reading Marcus feels like reading the sententiae-spoofing lines given to Hamlet’s Polonius. Philosophical treatments of Marcus have to bring their own structure to the work.

We may begin with the work’s genre. The first clear mention of Marcus Aurelius’ Meditations in antiquity is by Themistius in the 4th c. CE, who calls it Marcus’ ‘precepts’ (parangelmata); in 900, Suidas’ dictionary calls it a leading or directing (agôgê) and the 10th-century bishop Arethas calls it ‘the [writings] to himself’ (ta eis heauton).[2] Scholars now generally agree (following Brunt 1974) that Marcus wrote for his own moral improvement, to remind himself of and render concrete the Stoic doctrines he wanted to live by, such as that the world is governed by Providence; that happiness lies in virtue, which is wholly in one’s own power; and that one should not be angry at one’s associates but regard them as siblings, offspring of the same God. While we do not have other examples of this kind of private writing from antiquity, we do have Epictetus’ advice to write down (as well as to rehearse) daily the sorts of responses one ought to have to situations one encounters, so that one might have them ready at hand (procheiron) when circumstances demand (Epictetus Discourses i.1.21–25, iv.1.111; cf. iii.5.11, iii.26.39 on moral improvement being the appropriate aim of reading and writing). And Marcus describes his own writings as supports (parastêmata, iii.11), records (parapêgmata, ix.3.2) and rules (kanones, v.22, x.2).

Marcus’ purpose of mentally equipping himself to deal with what comes his way explains the Meditations’ often aphoristic and sloganeering style (e.g. ‘Erase impressions!’; ‘Do nothing at random!’; ‘Those who now bury will soon be buried!’): as Marcus says, for the one who has been bitten by true doctrines even the briefest saying suffices as a reminder (hupomnêsis) of freedom from pain and fear (x.34). In i.7, Marcus speaks of reading Epictetus’ ‘hupomnêmata’; Arrian, who wrote down Epictetus’ teachings, named them hupomnêmata, apparently in reference to Xenophon’s Memorabilia (whose Greek title was ‘hupomnêmata’) of Socrates. Marcus’ purpose also explains why when Marcus refers to events in his life, he does not specify them in a way that would allow anyone else to identify them, and why he uses technical Stoic terminology without explanation.[3] Marcus’ purpose also makes sense of his collecting sayings of philosophers without much scruple as to whether the philosophical system from which the sayings come is consistent with Stoicism. Finally, this purpose suggests that the reader should look for the personal faults that Marcus is trying to combat, or the correct attitude he is trying to inculcate, when he brings up some doctrine or argument, whether Stoic or not. So for example, xi.18, which begins by saying that human beings came into the world for the sake of each other and that the metaphysical alternatives are atoms or Nature (see below, 4.1), is a list of ten prescriptions against anger, a particularly consequential failing in those with power (cf. ix.42). Again, ix.28 invokes the Stoic doctrine of eternal recurrence to bring to mind the insignificance of mortal things. This suggests that despite the quotability of individual assertions in the Meditations, we should approach them by studying their ‘therapeutic’ context, that is, by asking: what moral and psychological effects is Marcus trying to achieve by saying this? When Marcus says ‘p’, he is not always simply expressing his belief that p.

Building on this point about the genre of the Meditations and seeking to establish its particular philosophical content, Hadot 1998 organizes Marcus’ thoughts around the Epictetan disciplines of (i) desire, (ii) impulse and (iii) assent; according to Hadot, these appear in Marcus as the rules of (i) being contented with whatever happens, (ii) conducting oneself justly towards others, and (iii) exercising discernment in one’s judgments (35–36).[4] By contrast Gill 2013 identifies four recurring ‘strands’ in Marcus: (i) aspiration to an ethical ideal conceived in Stoic terms as the understanding that only virtue is good and that all human beings are akin, which involves (ii) acceptance of death and transience as features of our existence that are not up to us; both (i) and (ii) are enabled by (iii) our rationality and (iv) our sociality, two aspects of human nature that make us a special part of the whole cosmos; according to Gill, Marcus assumes the Stoic theory of the ethical development of (iii) and (iv) by appropriation (oikeiôsis) and focuses on its last stage, which is the bringing about of (i) by self-cultivation.

The approach taken in this article follows Hadot’s (1998, 5) idea that for the ancients philosophy was a way of life, and that Marcus’ Meditations show us what it was like for an individual to try to live a Stoic life. However, rather than trying to cover all the themes in Marcus in this light—in addition to the topics discussed below, he talks about time, fate, death, the cycles of change in the cosmos—I focus on one basic question for Marcus’ project of living Stoically: what does a Stoic use to guide his own conduct? Addressing this basic question leads into discussion of the two virtues Marcus has the most to say about: justice and piety.

2. Living Stoically

Although he acknowledges that he struggles to live as a philosopher, Marcus urges himself to that life, spelling out what it involves in Stoic terms:

…you are no longer able to have lived your whole life as a philosopher since youth; and it is clear to many others and to you yourself that you are far from philosophy. So you are confused: the result is that obtaining the reputation of a philosopher is no longer easy for you … If you have seen truly where the matter lies, then leave behind your reputation and be content even if you live the remainder of life, however long [it may be], as your nature wills. Consider what it wills, and let nothing else distract you. For your experience tells you how much you have strayed: nowhere in so-called reasonings, wealth, reputation, enjoyment, nowhere do you find living well. So where is it? In doing those things which human nature seeks. And how will one do these things? If one has doctrines from which [flow] one’s impulses and actions. Which doctrines? Those concerning goods and evils: that nothing is good for a human being which does not make them just, temperate, courageous, free; that nothing is bad, which does not make them the contraries of the aforementioned. (viii.1, emphasis mine)

In saying that living well lies in doing what his human nature seeks, Marcus is echoing generations of Stoic philosophers. Cleanthes says the goal (telos) is ‘living in agreement with nature’; Chrysippus, ‘living according to the experience of what happens by nature’; Diogenes, ‘being reasonable in the selection and rejection of what is according to nature’; Archedemus, ‘living completing all appropriate actions’; Antipater, ‘living continually selecting what is according to nature and rejecting what is contrary to nature’ (Arius Didymus 6a). These formulae indicate that the goal is to act in accordance with nature, and to be in a certain cognitive state in relation to one’s acts according to nature: in agreement, on the basis of experience, being reasonable, continually (dienekôs, i.e. consistently, stably?), all of which imply understanding.

But how is a Stoic to put this into practice? What is it to do what one’s human nature seeks, in the particular circumstances in which one finds oneself? Surely it does not mean doing whatever is one’s strongest desire to do in the moment.

In the passage quoted, Marcus explains how one might do what is in one’s nature by saying that one must modify one’s beliefs about good and bad, as these inform one’s impulses and actions. He says, for example, that if we believe that pleasure is good and pain evil, then we will be resentful of the pleasures enjoyed by the vicious and the pains suffered by the virtuous. And if we are resentful of what happens, we will be finding fault with Nature and will be impious (ix.3). But while false beliefs about good and bad hinder us from following nature and acting virtuously, how can their removal by itself enable us to follow nature and act virtuously? Once I know that pleasure and pain are neither good nor evil but are indifferent for my happiness, I still need to know how I should respond to this pleasure and that pain, in order to be following nature. The first century Stoic philosopher Seneca argues in his Letters to Lucilius for the usefulness of concrete advice for certain types of situations (praecepta) on the grounds that having eliminated vice and false opinion, one will not yet know what to do and how to do it (94.23), for inexperience, not only passion, prevents us from knowing what to do in each situation (94.32); Seneca also says that nature does not teach us what the appropriate action is in every case (94.19). Perhaps Marcus thinks that there is, in every choice situation, something one can do that is productive of virtue (he says, ‘nothing is good for a human being which does not make him just, temperate, courageous, free’; on the other hand, ‘make’ may have the sense of constituting rather than producing, in which case the reference to the virtues in the passage isn’t action-guiding at all). Alternatively, he may think that what produces virtue is not the content of one’s action, but the thoughts that go along with it. But what thoughts are these? Surely, if virtue is to have any content, thinking ‘only virtue is good’ is not going to be sufficient.

2.1 The Deliberative Content Problem: The Good, The Bad, and the Indifferent

To appreciate Marcus’s distinctive contribution to the question of how to live as a Stoic, it will be useful to begin with a background in early Stoic ethics. Stoicism teaches that virtue is the only good for oneself, that vice is the only evil, and that everything else is indifferent so far as one’s happiness is concerned. That is to say, only virtue can contribute to our happiness; only vice can contribute to our unhappiness. Poverty, ill-repute, and ill-health are not bad, for their possession does not make us unhappy; wealth, fame and good are not good because their possession does not make us happy. If one asks, ‘how shall I act? On what can I base my choices between health and sickness, wealth and poverty, so that my choices are rational and not arbitrary?’, then the textbook Stoic answer is that among indifferents some are to be preferred as being in accordance with nature (Diogenes Laertius vii.101–5; Arius Didymus 7a–b, Epictetus ii.6.9 [for these passages see Long and Sedley 1987, section 58]). So whereas it is absolutely indifferent how many hairs one has on one’s head or whether the number of stars in the sky is even or odd, we do, and in most cases should, prefer and select wealth, fame and good health over poverty, ill-repute and sickness, because these are (in most cases) in accordance with nature. Cicero gives one reason why there must be value-differences among indifferents: if everything aside from virtue and vice were absolutely indifferent, the perfected rationality of the Stoic wise person would have no function to carry out (On Ends iii.50). Wisdom’s exercise would consist in flipping coins to select one indifferent over another.

When we select things that are according to nature and reject things that are contrary to nature, our actions are appropriate (kathêkonta; for Marcus’ use of this term, see i.2, iii.1.2, iii.16.2, vi.22, vi.26.3), and an appropriate action is an action for which there is a reasonable (eulogon) justification. An appropriate action counts as a morally perfect or virtuous action (katorthôma) when it is done from understanding, i.e., from the wise and stable cognitive state possessed only by the fully virtuous person (Arius Didymus 8). Although the talk of the appropriate action having a reasonable justification might suggest that more than one action could be appropriate for a situation, or that what is appropriate could be relativized to the ordinary person’s grasp of the situation (as some utilitarians consider that action right which maximizes expected rather than actual utility), so that ‘reasonable justification’ would be like the law’s ‘reasonable doubt’ or ‘reasonable person’, the Stoics’ use of ‘reasonable’ in other contexts, such as the definition of the good emotions (eupatheiai) (Diogenes Laertius vii.116), the end (Arius Didymus 6a), and the virtues of reasoning and rhetoric (SVF iii.264, 268; 291, 294), clearly takes the standard of reasonableness to be the right reason of the fully virtuous person. This points to there being only one appropriate action per situation, a conclusion which is confirmed by Chrysippus’ claim that the fully virtuous person performs all appropriate actions and leaves no appropriate action unperformed (iii.510). (This discussion of the ‘reasonable’ and appropriate action follows Brennan 1996, 326–29.)

The appropriate action, for which there is a reasonable justification, is not in all cases the one that obtains or pursues the preferred indifferents for the agent. According to our evidence, while it is our nature to preserve our bodily constitution (Diogenes Laertius vii.85–86), there are situations in which we ought to give up our lives (Cicero On Duties iii.89–115, On Ends iii.60), for example, to save our country (for discussion of this issue, see Barney 2003 and Brennan 2005). Further, Chrysippus seems to have said that if he knew he was fated to be ill, then he would have an impulse towards illness, but lacking this knowledge he should select the things that are well-adapted (tôn euphuesterôn) to obtaining what is in accordance with nature (Epictetus Discourses ii.6.9). This seems to suggest that in the absence of knowledge that one is fated to be ill, one should select health, but either this selection is not guaranteed to be in accordance with nature or to result in an appropriate action, or a selection (e.g. the selection of health) can be in accordance with nature even though what it aims at (e.g. obtaining or enjoying health), is not. So perhaps knowing the preferred indifferents guides actions only in the way that Ross’s identification of prima facie duties is supposed to help with moral decision-making, namely, by making certain considerations salient to deliberation (for this picture, see Vogt 2008, 173–178), but the account is silent about how to weigh indifferents against each other in a particular situation. Alternatively, it may be that something’s being according to nature gives the agent only epistemic reasons for selection rather than practical reasons responsive to some intrinsic value of the indifferents (for this view see Klein 2015).

We might wonder why anything should be called according to nature, or preferred, if there are circumstances in which it is not. Why not reserve the label ‘according to nature’ for what is fated? The heterodox Stoic Aristo of Chios denied that any indifferents were to be preferred by nature, pointing out that the same thing could be preferred in one circumstance and dispreferred in another (Sextus Empiricus, Against the Professors 11.64–7). However, the orthodox Stoics seem to insist that preferability, and being in accordance with nature, is an intrinsic character of some things, and Diogenes Laertius reports a distinction between appropriate actions that do not depend on circumstances, such as looking after one’s health and sense-organs, and appropriate actions that are appropriate only in certain circumstances, such as mutilating oneself (Diogenes Laertius vii.108–9). So it is not true of all, but only some, appropriate actions that their appropriateness is circumstantial. Perhaps the idea is that while it is only true for the most part that health (or strength or well functioning sense organs) is in accordance with nature, this does not mean that the naturalness of health (strength, well functioning sense organs) depends on the circumstances. On this view, what health is for a species is defined by the species’ nature, and that is unconditionally according to its nature.

The fact that our sources understand what is according to nature both in terms of cosmic nature or what is fated and in terms of the individual natures out of which the nature of the cosmos is built up raises the question of conflict, for instance when my health, which is in accordance with my nature, is not fated, or in accordance with cosmic nature. Such conflict can be avoided for human beings by appeal to our rational nature, on the one hand, and providential cosmic nature, on the other: our rationality enables us to appreciate and will what is according to cosmic nature because the latter is best for the whole. On the specific question of why we ought to prefer, as in accordance with nature, the interest of the community to our own, Brennan 2005 appeals to the Stoic doctrine of oikeiôsis: we have a natural tendency to care for others, at first our family and friends and ultimately our fellow-citizens and fellow-humans (154–59). We may wonder how this impulse could be strong enough to overcome self-interest; however, Brennan observes that the Stoic’s realization that indifferents do not contribute to happiness weakens one barrier to impartial deliberation: if indifferents were good, the Stoic would want them for herself; since they are not good, she deliberates about how to distribute them as justice demands (164–65). Since considerations of virtue cannot (on pain of circularity) enter into her deliberations, what gives ‘justice’s demands’ content (at least in Cicero, and Cicero attributes similar views to Chrysippus) are considerations of the community’s utility and respect for property-rights (206–26). These indifferents are to be preferred as more in accordance with nature than, for example, one’s individual utility.

As we shall see, Marcus’ way of addressing the deliberative content problem is in one respect like Cicero’s: the characterization of right conduct comes from ideas about what justice demands, and the content of justice comes from outside Stoic ethics proper. In Marcus’ case, it comes from the idea that the cosmos is a city and that all rational beings are fellow-citizens of this city. The role of citizen brings with it certain conventional expectations of conduct which Marcus transfers to citizenship of the cosmopolis.

3. Justice: Acting for the Sake of the Cosmopolis

Marcus says that one should be concerned with two things only: acting justly and loving what is allotted one (x.11, cf. xii.1). He fleshes out ‘acting justly’ in terms of acting communally (ix.31), and adds that wherever one lives, one should live as a citizen of the cosmic city (x.15). Appeal to the idea that the cosmos is a city allows him to say that we should do well for all humanity (viii.23), for we each have a citizen’s duty to contribute to the welfare of the whole cosmopolis, i.e., to the welfare of all humans as our fellow-citizens. Conversely, anyone who does not contribute to the communal goal (to koinônikon telos) is acting seditiously (ix.23); one may not hate even one man, for this rends the community (xi.8).

Strikingly, Marcus seems to specify this communal goal in terms of indifferents rather than virtue, with the result that one should aim to bring about preferred indifferents for the whole of which one is a part. When he explains that that whatever happens to a part benefits the whole, and that what is advantageous (to sumpheron) to one person does not conflict with what is advantageous to another, Marcus writes that by ‘interest’ he means intermediate things (tôn mesôn) (vi.45; perhaps he takes this to follow from the coincidence of what is in accordance with nature for the whole and the part). Even though food is not a good and hunger not an evil, a Stoic will respond to a hungry person with food, rather than (only) a lecture that food is not a good and hunger not an evil.

Of course, one’s efforts to give food to the hungry, or to benefit the hungry by giving them food, may fail, so Marcus recommends pursuing such ends with reservation (hupexairesis), making one’s impulses conditional on what is fated to happen (iv.1, v.20, vi.50).

Presumably this response is grounded in our natural concern (oikeiôsis), which at its most fundamental is responsible for parents’ caring for their children (Diogenes Laertius vii.85), and Marcus tells himself to regard other human beings as most his own (oikeiotaton) when thinking how to benefit them and how not to obstruct their plans (v.20).

Marcus says that the rational nature does well when it directs impulses (hormai) to communal action (viii.7). We must do what follows from our constitution, and the communal faculty (to koinônikon) plays the leading part in the human constitution (vii.55). After the communal faculty comes the rational faculty (vii.55), but again, the rational faculty is perfected in justice (ix.22). As a human being, one is able to contribute to the perfectionn (sumplêrôtikos) of the whole political organization; Marcus urges himself to make his every action perfective of political life (ix.23). Sometimes Marcus goes so far as to identify the good (agathon) of a rational creature with community (v.16).

Finally, Marcus simply denies that there is ever any conflict between the good of the individual and the good of the whole community of which that individual is a part. He says, on the one side, that the perfection, well-being, and stability of the whole depends on what happens to each part (v.8). And on the other side, he says that what the nature of the whole brings about is good (agathon) for each part (ii.3), and that what is not hurtful to the city can’t be hurtful to its citizen (v.22). He compares the relationship between separate rational individuals and the community to limbs and body, which are so constituted as to work together (vii.13). The comparison between the citizen-city relationship and the limb-body relationship goes back to Plato’s Republic (462b–d), according to which in the ideal city, harm to one citizen or part of the city is felt as harm to the rest of the citizens or the city as a whole. While Plato uses the limb-body analogy to emphasize the unity of feeling the ideal city achieves, Marcus uses it to emphasize that the citizen is a functional part of the whole city: just as this material making up a limb would not be a limb at all without the body of which it is a part, so too, this human individual would not be what they are without a city of which they are a part (Marcus must mean the cosmic city). One might object that there is more to being a human being than being a citizen (Striker 1996, 259), but perhaps Marcus is not merely saying that the cosmos is like a city and we are like its citizens; perhaps he is saying that the cosmos actually is a city and human beings actually are its citizens, so that what it is to be human is exhausted by citizenship of the cosmos.

Marcus’ claims about the harmony between the welfare or advantage of wholes and parts are also central to his conception of piety.

4. Piety: Welcoming What Happens as Part of the Whole

Marcus writes,

Every nature is satisfied with itself when it goes along its way well, and the rational nature goes along its way well when it assents to nothing false or unclear among its impressions, when it directs impulses to communal actions, when it generates desires and inclinations for only those things that are in our power, and when it welcomes everything apportioned to it by common nature. (viii.7)

The last of these four behaviors is productive of piety. The key idea in piety is that the cosmos as a whole is providentially designed, and so is as good as it can be, and so its parts are as good as they can be, and so our attitude towards every part ought to be acceptance—or as he sometimes puts it more strongly, love. According to Hadot (1998, 128), Marcus follows Epictetus in distinguishing impulse (hormê) from desire (orexis), and innovates by restricting impulse to the sphere of our activity. Desire, parallel to impulse, is restricted to the sphere of our passivity; thus, we should desire whatever befalls us. Hadot is mistaken here, for according to the Stoics, our reactions to what befalls us are also impulses, and desire is a species of impulse. Marcus says either to restrict desire to what is up to us (ix.7) or to quench (sbêsai) it. Epictetus tells us to refrain from desire for the time being (iii.24.23, 24, 85). The reason to quench desire is the danger of desiring the wrong thing: to desire something is to believe it to be good, and to have a runaway impulse towards it. This also gives us an argument against desiring the things that befall one. We might note that Marcus, in the passage above, recommends not desiring but welcoming (aspazomenê) whatever befalls one. Perhaps we should associate desire (orexis) with pursuing, and welcoming with contentment upon receiving.

We can use our understanding of piety as appreciation of providence to illuminate two slogans frequently found in Marcus: ‘providence or atoms?’ and ‘erase impressions’.

4.1 Providence or Atoms?

Nine times in the Meditations, Marcus lays out the alternatives: providence, nature, reason, on the one hand, or atoms, on the other (iv.3, vi.24, vii.32, vii.50, viii.17, ix.28, xi.39, x.6, xi.18). (On these passages, see Cooper 2004.[5]) Although he does not explain, the reference is clear enough: either the world and what happens is the design of a providential God, as believed by the Stoics (and Platonists), or the outcome of atoms colliding randomly in the void, as believed by the Epicureans. What is not obvious is why Marcus is laying out these alternatives. Is it because his grasp of Stoic physics is so tenuous that he must be open to the possibility that Epicurean physics is true (Rist 1982, 43, Annas 2004, 116)? Marcus does at one point express despair about his own grasp of physics (vii.67). Or is his point that whether one’s physics is Epicurean or Stoic, one must live as the Stoics enjoin (Annas, 108–114, Hadot, 148), that is to say, rationally, with a single purpose, rising above conventional goods and evils (ix.28)? Does the convergence of Epicureans and Stoics on such ethical points, in view of the two schools’ very different physical opinions, strengthen his confidence in the ethics (Annas, 109)?

In one passage of the Meditations, Marcus gives the ‘providence or atoms’ alternatives when he is clearly interested in the convergence of ethical opinion among all the wise—not only Stoics and Epicureans, for he also cites Democritus, Plato and Antisthenes—on the insignificance of matters which ordinary people value most (life and death, pain, reputation) and the far greater importance of virtue (vii.32 ff.). In this context, Marcus puts Epicurus’ view that at death our soul-atoms are dispersed and we cease to exist on all fours with the Stoic view that Nature either extinguishes or transforms us at death. Here Marcus also quotes Epicurus on pain with approval: pain is either bearable (if long-lasting) or short (if intense). His point seems to be that whatever one’s particular philosophical allegiance, allegiance to philosophy involves rising above pain, death, and reputation—and also, it turns out, involves not grumbling: for if the way things are is due to providence, then they could not be better and one is wrong to grumble, but if the way things are is due to chance, then it is pointless to grumble (viii.17, ix.39).

Still, Marcus is not really open to the possibility of Epicurean physics. He asserts repeatedly, after laying out the ‘providence or atoms’ options, that the world is in fact governed by an intelligent nature of which he is a functional part, like a citizen of a state (iv.3, x.6). So we should not make too much of Marcus’ diffidence about his mastery of physics (vii.67), for he may only mean that his own technical grasp of Stoic physics is inadequate, rather than that he lacks confidence in its superiority over Epicurean physics. Elsewhere he insists that he has a sufficient conception (ennoia) of a life according to nature so as to live it (i.9, 17).

We also see Marcus’ reliance on Stoic physics in his innovative derivation of the Stoic doctrine of the indifference of everything except virtue and vice from providence. Since wealth, reputation, and health are distributed among the virtuous and the vicious indiscriminately, he reasons, they cannot be good, for that would be contrary to providence (ii.11). This does not mean Marcus is generally grounding ethics in physics, however.[6] According to the Stoics, the beliefs of anyone other than a wise and fully virtuous person are weak and unstable (since not anchored in an understanding of the whole), and so we should expect a non-wise Stoic like Marcus to seek out all kinds of reasons to shore up his ethical beliefs. Marcus can consistently regard these ‘back-up’ arguments for a moment of weakness as weaker and less plausible than the Stoic arguments and at the same time as important to have at hand—as, if you’re trying to quit smoking, you might hang on to ‘it gives you wrinkles’ for the moments in which ‘it gives you cancer’ isn’t doing the trick.

Finally, Marcus uses ‘providence or atoms’ in the Meditations to drive out an impious attitude:

Are you discontented with the part you have been assigned in the whole? Recall the alternatives: providence or atoms, and how many are the demonstrations, that the cosmos is a city. (iv.3.2)

To understand what the thought, ‘providence or atoms’, is doing here we have to connect it with the discontent that is the topic of the passage. Marcus is admonishing himself for his discontent with things as they stand, saying to himself, ‘if you are finding fault with things as they are, then you must think that they are not due to providence. But if they’re not due to providence, then they’re the result of random causes.’ In this passage, ‘atoms’ functions as the implicit commitment of one who finds fault with things as they are. The reasoning works to raise the stakes for someone who is grumbling at the way things are. It brings out that there is a contradiction between believing, as a Stoic must, that the world is providentially run, and being discontented with anything that happens. Once the contradiction is brought out, it becomes clear which of the two alternatives a Stoic must plump for, and what follows about the attitudes he must consequently adopt towards the world and every part of it. Sometimes Marcus spells out these steps: ‘But look at the evidence in favour of providence—the whole cosmos is organised like a city, that is to say, each part is so organized as to serve the good of the whole’. For example, at iv.27, Marcus appears to be starting to consider the twin possibilities that the world is a cosmos or a chaotic mixture (kukeôn, referring perhaps to Heraclitus fr. 125), but then he immediately asserts that it is a cosmos. Often, however, Marcus does not have to spell this out. In any event, what ‘atoms’ stands for, in this context, is impiety. So Marcus is telling his grumbling self: your grumbling is evidence of impiety, evidence of your being like an Epicurean—except that actual Epicureans are more philosophical and do not grumble about an irrational cosmos bringing them bad luck, but rather, try themselves to live rationally.

This last use of ‘providence or atoms’ shows that since Marcus is writing to effect certain psychological attitudes in himself, we have to look to context to determine what the desired attitude is, and then determine how the things he tells himself are supposed to effect the attitude. Perhaps bringing about the desired attitude calls for making hyperbolic statements in order to correct for some natural tendency he thinks he has. If we do not keep this in mind as we read Marcus, we will only find contradictions, tensions, and ambivalences and we will conclude that Marcus is an eclectic and imprecise thinker.

4.2 Erase Impressions

Marcus often tells himself, ‘erase (exaleipsai) your impressions (phantasiai)’ (v.2, vii.29, viii.29, ix.7, cf. ii.5, iii.16, v.36). According to Stoic epistemology, things in the world impress images of themselves on human and animal souls, as shapes can impress themselves on a wax tablet. Human beings may also assent to or withhold assent from these impressions; judgments are the result of our assenting to impressions, or more precisely to the propositional articulations of our impressions. While assent is voluntary, impressions are not (cf. Epictetus fr. 9). So clearly we can’t erase our impressions in the sense of simply wiping them out, but then what is Marcus telling himself to do? In exchanges with Academic skeptics, the Stoics say that the wise person does not assent except to impressions that represent accurately the thing in the world that is their cause (‘kataleptic’ impressions); how does Marcus’ injunction to ‘erase’ impressions relate to this standard?

According to Hadot (103–4), by ‘erase impressions’ Marcus means ‘assent only to objective and physical descriptions of externals’. What Marcus is telling himself to erase, Hadot says, is value-judgments about everything external to his character. Hadot thinks Marcus is simply confused in using the term phantasia for these judgments (the correct term, which he sometimes uses [cf. iv.39, v.26, viii.4], and which he sometimes distinguishes from phantasia [cf. viii.47–49], is hupolêpsis or ‘assumption’).

Yet the distinction between objective physical facts and subjective value judgments seems more existentialist than Stoic—for the Stoics value is objective, and indeed Marcus repeatedly exults in the beauty and goodness of the cosmos as a whole. (We should not assume that the evaluations are all added by us, the subjects, to the impression, for the Stoics think that there are evaluative impressions, cf. Epictetus fr. 9.) Nevertheless, it is right that Marcus, following Epictetus, recommends refraining from judging ‘good’ or ‘bad’ since those describe only virtue and vice and none but the fully virtuous person really knows those (see, e.g., Encheiridion 45). And it is also right that Marcus often deals with things that are conventionally accorded high value in reductive material terms. So, for example, he writes,

Take for instance the impression in the case of relishes and such edibles, that this one is the corpse of a fish, and that one of a bird or a pig. And again that this Phalernian [wine] is the little juice of a bunch of grapes, and the purple-edged robe is sheep’s wool dyed by the blood of a shellfish; and in the case of things having to do with sexual union [that it is] friction of the genitals with the excretion of mucus in spasms. Such are the impressions that get at things and go right into them, so that one sees how each thing really is. (vi.13, cf. viii.21, 24)

Indeed, Marcus himself describes what he is doing here as defining what each thing is stripped naked, and enumerating the components into which it disintegrates (iii.11); elsewhere he adds that this technique leads one to despise the thing so analyzed (xi.2).

However, this is only one of two complementary ways Marcus deals with his impressions. The other is to consider things that are conventionally disvalued in their larger context, so as to show what good they serve. Indeed, the passage recommending the examination of each thing stripped naked continues,

… nothing is so productive of greatness of mind as to be able to examine, systematically and in truth, each of the things that befall us in life, and to look always at it so as to consider what sort of use (chreia) it provides for what sort of cosmos and what value (axia) it has for the whole, and what in relation to the human being, they being a citizen of the highest city, of which other cities are like households (iii.11, cf. viii.11, iv.23, iii.2, vi.36, vii.13, x.20, 25)

Here Marcus is recommending, for the purpose of correct appreciation of the value of things, the reintegration of each thing into its cosmic context. So contrary to first appearances, the goal is not to regard things in the world as stripped of value, but rather, to see each thing’s true value, which is determined by considering its contribution to the whole cosmos. The physical description of each thing is not a description of its naked physical appearance when isolated from everything else, but its reintegration into the beautiful and intelligent design of the cosmos. So Marcus writes,

For example, when some parts of baking bread crack open, these cracks too, even though in a way they are contrary to the baker’s orders, are somehow fitting and in their own way rouse eagerness for food. Again, figs, when they are ripest, gape open … and many other things, if one were to look at them individually, would be far from beautiful of appearance, but nevertheless, on account of their following things that come to be by nature, are well-ordered and educate our soul. (iii.2)

Insight into what is in accordance with nature is gained by determining, for each thing that obtains, its contribution to, or functional role in, the cosmos (rather than by looking at what regularly happens, or what happens with healthy specimens, etc.). And once one understands this functional contribution, one is able to see the value of each thing, how beautifully it contributes to a well-designed whole.

Now that we have a sense of what erased impressions are to be replaced with, we can return to the questions of what is to be erased, and what it is to be erased. Marcus does seem to speak indifferently about judgments and impressions: he tells himself to erase his impressions, and he tells himself to remove opinion (iv.7, viii.40); he tells himself he can bear what his opinion renders bearable and do what his impressions deem advantageous or appropriate (x.3). But this need not be because Marcus is confused about the difference between an impression and a judgment; he may just be using the term ‘impression’ more loosely, as his predecessors, Stoic as well as non-Stoic, do. For the predecessors: Marcus’ Stoic role-model, Epictetus, says the Iliad is nothing but impressions and the use of impressions (i.28.13). Marcus himself uses the term ‘impression’ for a recognition (of his own need to be straightened out, i.7), the conception of a standard (of a constitution observing equality before the law) (i.14), the impression a person makes on others (i.15), and an appearance—the way a thing strikes someone (i.16). These are all accepted uses of the term. So it’s more fruitful to ask: what kind of impression are we supposed to erase?

Plato’s Protagoras, which greatly influenced the Stoics, can help us here. This text contrasts the power of phantasia (often translated ‘appearance’) with an art of measurement, the former often going wrong because comparative or perspectival (A looks tall because she’s beside the very short B; B looks taller than A because she’s closer to me), and standing in need of correction by an unchanging standard (a meter ruler, for example) (356b–57a). That Marcus may find the same defects of perspective in impressions is suggested indirectly by the corrections he prescribes: inspect your impressions (ii.7, iii.6, v.22, viii.13, viii.26); test them by ‘physicizing, ethicizing, dialecticizing’ (viii.13), that is to say, by seeing how they fare when tested against your physical, ethical, and dialectical understanding—all of which are informed by a picture of the whole. In xii.18, he tells himself:

Always look at the whole: what that thing is that gives you such an impression, and undo it, distinguishing it into its cause, its matter, its point, the time within which it must come to a stop.

To the extent that impressions are involuntary, Marcus’ ‘erase’ may mean ‘override’. He may be saying: for the purposes of action and response, wipe out the influence of such-and-such impressions (Plato’s Protagoras, similarly, speaks of rendering the power of appearance unauthoritative [356e]); focus instead on your understanding of the whole, which will give you a different impression. However, the Stoics’ image of the mind as a wax tablet being impressed by different shapes gives a particular point to talk of ‘erasing.’ The work Marcus is doing is to replace an inadequate impression with another impression, this one better grounded in a comprehension of reality. Perhaps making the second mark requires erasing the first—or perhaps making the second mark is a means of erasing the first, for it may be that the withholding of assent from compelling impressions requires countering them with others.

At v.16, Marcus says that one’s mind will be of the same character as the impressions it has. This seems unfair, if impressions are entirely involuntary. Marcus may think that while involuntary in the moment, impressions are subject to control in the long run. Perhaps if I keep refusing to assent to my present impression that wealth is good, wealth will eventually cease to appear to me as good. It is also not implausible that one’s character and opinion would influence one’s impressions, especially in the case of evaluative impressions (such as that x is good or to-be-preferred) and impressions that requires some expertise to have (such as that y is the treadle for a foot loom).

5. Conclusion

As mentioned above (1.1), Marcus’ Meditations touch on many more topics than the ones addressed here, but we get further in understanding Marcus if we focus on a topic and see how his remarks on that topic are related to his overall project of reminding himself how a Stoic should live. It would be worth working this out for others of his frequent remarks, such as that we are tiny and temporary fragments in the cosmos, that death takes us all in the end, that we ought to live purposively rather than like mechanical toys.


Primary Literature

Works by Marcus Aurelius: Texts and Translations

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Other Internet Resources


Thanks to Tad Brennan, Stephen Menn, and John Cooper for their helpful comments on this article.

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