Seneca is a major philosophical figure of the Roman Imperial Period. As a Stoic philosopher writing in Latin, Seneca makes a lasting contribution to Stoicism. He occupies a central place in the literature on Stoicism at the time, and shapes the understanding of Stoic thought that later generations were to have. Seneca’s philosophical works played a large role in the revival of Stoic ideas in the Renaissance. Until today, many readers approach Stoic philosophy through Seneca, rather than through the more fragmentary evidence that we have for earlier Stoics. Seneca’s writings are stunningly diverse in their generic range. More than that, Seneca develops further and shapes several philosophical genres, most important, the letter and so-called “consolations”; his essay On Mercy is considered the first example of what came to be known as the “mirror of the prince” literature.
After several centuries of relative neglect, Seneca’s philosophy has been rediscovered in the last few decades, in what might be called a second revival of Senecan thought. In part, this renewed interest is the result of a general reappraisal of Roman culture. It is also fuelled by major progress that has been made in our understanding of Greek Hellenistic philosophy, and by recent developments in contemporary ethics, such as a renewed interest in the theory of emotions, roles and relationships, and the fellowship of all human beings. And finally, some influential scholars have found, in the wake of Foucault’s reading of Seneca, that Seneca speaks to some distinctively modern concerns.
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Lucius Annaeus Seneca (c. 1 BCE – CE 65) was born in Corduba (Spain) and educated—in rhetoric and philosophy—in Rome. Seneca had a highly successful, and quite dramatic, political career. Even a brief (and by necessity incomplete) list of events in his life indicates that Seneca had ample occasion for reflection on violent emotions, the dangers of ambition, and the ways in which the life of politics differs from the life of philosophy—among the topics pursued in his writings. He was accused of adultery with the Emperor Caligula’s sister and therefore exiled to Corsica in 41; having been Nero’s “tutor” in his adolescent years, he was among Nero’s advisors after his accession in 54; Seneca continued to be an advisor in times that became increasingly difficult for anyone in the close proximity of Nero, in spite of requests from his side to be granted permission to retire; he was charged with complicity in the Pisonian conspiracy to murder Nero, and compelled to commit suicide in 65 (on Seneca’s life, see Griffin 1992; Maurach 2000; Veyne 2003; Wilson 2014; Romm 2014; on his perspective on Nero, see Braund 2009).
Seneca’s philosophical writings have often been interpreted with an eye to his biography: how could his discussions of the healing powers of philosophy not reflect his own life? However, as personal as Seneca’s style often is, his writings are not autobiographical (Edwards 1997). Seneca creates a literary persona for himself. He discusses the questions that occupy him in a way that invites his readers to think about issues in their own life, rather than in Seneca’s life.
The writings that we shall primarily be concerned with are: the Moral Letters to Lucilius (Ad Lucilium epistulae morales), the Moral Essays (‘dialogi’ or dialogues is the somewhat misleading title given in our principal manuscript, the Codex Ambrosianus, to the twelve books making up ten of these works, including three “consolatory” writings; among the Essays are two further works that came down to us in other manuscripts), and the Natural Questions (Naturales quaestiones) (on the full range of Seneca’s writings, see Volk and Williams 2006, “Introduction,” and Ker 2006; a comprehensive overview, with individual chapters on specific writings and themes, is offered in Heil and Damschen 2014).
A brief note is in order here on the relative chronology of Seneca’s works, which is hard to establish given that we know so little about Seneca’s life apart from his imperial service, as noted above, and its consequences. The Consolation to Marcia is probably the earliest surviving piece of Seneca’s work. Similarly, the Consolation to His Mother Helvia and the Consolation to Polybius are considered early (perhaps dating to 43 or 44), the former actually being composed on the occasion of Seneca’s banishment to Corsica. All other surviving works seem to be written later, mostly after Seneca’s return to Rome in 49 from his Corsican exile. Among the Moral Essays, the only one we can date with some certainty is On Mercy, an essay in which Seneca directly addresses Nero in the early days of his reign (55 or 56). The Moral Letters to Lucilius as well as the Natural Questions are the product of the last years of Seneca’s life, the brief period (62–65) that Seneca spent in retirement before following Nero’s order to commit suicide (on the dating of Seneca’s writings see the introductions in Cooper/Procopé 1995, and Griffin 1992).
In the Imperial Period, Stoicism had significant influence on Roman literature, and Seneca’s tragedies are of particular interest here. In Seneca’s case, we do not see a poet appropriating or integrating Stoic ideas, but actually a Stoic philosopher writing poetry himself. The precise way in which Seneca’s Stoicism is relevant to his tragedies is controversial. Traditionally scholars debated whether and why a philosopher like Seneca would write poetry at all—to some this seemed so unlikely that prior to Erasmus it was thought that there were two ‘Senecas,’ the philosopher and the tragedian (cf. Fantham 1982, 15). Today it is widely assumed that some of the themes in Seneca’s tragedies are at least related to his philosophical views. Seneca’s interest in ethics and psychology—first and foremost perhaps the destructive effects of excessive emotion—seems to figure in his plays, and perhaps his natural philosophy plays an equally important role (cf. Fantham 1982, 15–19; Fischer 2014; Gill 2003, 56–58; Rosenmeyer 1989; Schiesaro 2003; Volk 2006; on the range of Seneca’s writings, see Volk and Williams 2006). In this article, we do not consider his tragedies, but only his prose writings. Some recent work on Seneca suggests that one should see his prose writings and his tragedies as complementary sides of his thought (Wray 2009). The tragedies are arguably darker than the prose writings, and topics on which Seneca seems to have a consoling philosophical view are explored in rather less consoling ways. For example, death is seen as a liberation in Seneca’s philosophical writings. But in the tragedies, death can appear as a transition to even greater sufferings, or, equally bad, the dead seem to demand ever new deaths, to provide them with fresh companions in the underworld (Busch 2009).
Readers who approach Seneca as students of ancient philosophy—having acquired a certain idea of what philosophy is by studying Plato, Aristotle, or Chrysippus—often feel at a loss. To them, Seneca’s writings can appear lengthy and merely admonitory. Partly, this reaction may reflect prejudices of our training. The remnants of a Hegelian (and Nietzschean, and Heideggerean) narrative for philosophy are deeply ingrained in influential works of scholarship. On this account, the history of ancient philosophy is a history of decline, the Roman thinkers are mediocre imitators of their Greek predecessors, and so on (Long 2006; see Griffin 2018 for a collection of Griffin’s work on politics and philosophy in Rome). Such prejudices are hard to shake off; for many centuries watered-down versions of them have shaped the way students learnt Latin and Greek. In recent years, however, many scholars have come to adopt a different view. They find in Seneca a subtle author who speaks very directly to modern concerns of shaping ourselves and our lives.
Seneca does not write as a philosopher who creates or expounds a philosophical theory from the ground up. Rather, he writes within the track of an existing system that he is largely in agreement with. A reconstruction of Seneca’s philosophy, if it aimed at some kind of completeness, would have to be many-layered. At several points, it would have to include accounts of earlier Stoic philosophy, and discuss which aspects of these earlier theories become more or less prominent in Seneca’s thought. At times Seneca’s own contribution consists in developing further a Stoic theory and adding detail to it. At other times, Seneca dismisses certain technicalities and emphasizes the therapeutic, practical side of philosophy.
Seneca thinks of himself as the adherent of a philosophical system—Stoicism—and speaks in the first person plural (‘we’) in order to refer to the Stoics. Rather than call Seneca an orthodox Stoic, however, we might want to say that he writes within the Stoic system. Seneca emphasizes his independence as a thinker. He holds Stoic views, but he does not see himself as anyone’s disciple or chronicler. In On the Private Life, he says: “Surely you can only want me to be like my leaders? Well then, I shall not go where they send me but where they lead” (1.5, tr. Cooper and Procopé). Seneca sees himself as a philosopher like the older Stoics. He feels free, however, to disagree with earlier Stoics, and is not concerned with keeping Stoicism ‘pure’ from non-Stoic ideas. Seneca integrates ideas from other philosophies if these seem helpful to him. As he explains, he likes to think of philosophical views as if they were motions made in a meeting. One often asks the proponent of the motion to split it up in two motions, so that one can agree with one half, and vote against the other (Letter 21.9). For example, Seneca thinks that there is something salutary in Platonic metaphysics (Boys-Stones 2013; Donini 1979, 179–199; Reydams-Schils 2010; Sedley 2005; Setaioli 1988). While he dismisses the theory of Forms, he still holds that studying it can make us better. It acquaints us with the thought that the things which stimulate and enflame the senses are not among the things that really are (Letter 58.18 and 26). Seneca also adopts metaphors or images that are associated with other philosophical schools, such as Platonically inspired images of the body as prison of the soul (e.g., NQ I.4 and 11). But invoking such images need not commit Seneca to holding the theories in which they originate.
Another side of Seneca’s independence has been emphasized by Inwood (2005 , 18–22): Seneca, educated by Roman philosophers, is genuinely thinking in Latin. In order to see the force of this point, let us compare Seneca to Cicero. Cicero conscientiously tells his readers which Greek term he translates by which Latin term. It is thus possible to read Cicero’s Latin philosophy with the Greek terminology in mind; at least for the most part, we can think about his arguments in the terms of the Greek debates. Seneca is, at many points, not interested in mapping his terminology directly onto the Greek philosophical vocabulary. Rather, he thinks in his own language (see Long 2003, who situates Seneca vis-à-vis other Roman philosophers), and he expects to be read by people who do their philosophizing in Latin, as well.
Like other late Stoics, Seneca is first and foremost interested in ethics. Although he is well versed in the technical details of Stoic logic, philosophy of language, epistemology, and ontology, he does not devote any significant time to these fields (Barnes 1997, 12–23; Cooper 2004). However, we should not let the old prejudices about Roman versus Greek thought influence our interpretation of Seneca’s interest in practical questions. As Veyne puts it, “Seneca practiced neither a debased nor a vulgarized philosophy aimed at the supposed ‘practical spirit’ of the Romans” (2003, ix). Rather, it is Seneca’s very conception of philosophy as a salutary practice that makes the ethical dimension of his thought so prominent (on philosophy as therapy, see Nussbaum 1994; Setaioli 2014).
Seneca’s writings usually have an addressee—someone who is plagued by a ‘sickness of the soul’ (On Peace of Mind begins with a full diagnosis of the addressee’s state of mind—first by the patient, and then by the insightful therapist Seneca). Seneca steps back from a format in which a philosopher justifies a theory in a step-by-step argument (Long 2003, 204; on the question of why Seneca chooses to write letters, see Inwood 2007, xiv-xv). Discussion proceeds from a (perhaps merely presumed) situation in the addressee’s life, meandering back and forth between more general and more specific considerations, arguments, side-issues, and sometimes consolation (see Wildberger 2020 for the view that Seneca’s Letters involve the creation of a persona who, over the course of the Letters, gains increasing interest in technical questions in philosophy). This engaging style views the reader as a participant in philosophical thought (Roller 2015; Schafer 2011). Seneca thinks that in order to benefit from philosophy, one cannot passively adopt insights. One must appropriate them as an active reader, thinking through the issues for oneself, so as then to genuinely assent to them (Letter 84.5–10; Wildberger 2006).
It has often been noted that later Stoics, including Seneca, seem to lose interest in the ideal agent—the sage or wise person—who figures so prominently in early Stoic ethics. Rather than assume that the later Stoics are disillusioned or more realistic, we should note that Seneca’s focus on the progressor (proficiens)—the person who is seriously trying their best to move forward in their way of life toward that ideal—is part and parcel of his own, specific way of doing philosophy. The early Stoics’ sage may, first and foremost, be a tool for developing theories. The early Stoics spell out what knowledge or wisdom is by explaining what a knowledgeable or wise person would do (how she assents, how she acts, etc.). But Seneca’s philosophy is a practice of training ourselves to appreciate to the fullest the truths of Stoicism. In this practice, accounts of, for example, the wise person’s assent, can only play a limited role. We need precisely what Seneca offers: someone who takes us through the various situations in life in which we tend to lose sight of our own insights, and fall victim to the allurements of money and fame, or to the violence of emotions evoked by the adversities of life. We need to learn how to overcome our own residual tendencies, despite our better intentions, to suffer such failures.
Three of Seneca’s writings bear the title ‘consolatio’—consolation. They, too, are letters, and, as Williams argues, Seneca in them transforms the genre of philosophical consolation into his own mode of therapy (2006). In the ad Heluiam (To His Mother Helvia), Seneca consoles his mother for his absence and exile. Seneca uses his exile as a metaphor, and ultimately addresses what he takes to be a many-faceted condition in human life: any kind of alienation from one’s immediate community, any enforced detachment from it, raises the issues that political exile raises. As this example shows, his consolations are thus rather independent of his particular situation, and of the particular addressee. Still, we might want to note that at times, in consoling his mother for his exile, or, in ad Marciam (To Marcia), a woman for the loss of her child, Seneca discusses virtue with a view to gender. In her life up to now, he tells his mother, she has moved beyond the ordinary faults of women; her virtue was her only ornament. In accordance with this, she should now try not to fall into grief in the way women tend to—excessively. By holding on to virtue, it seems, his mother can transcend what Seneca considers typical, yet merely contingent features of female life. (On Seneca’s depiction of female virtue, cf. ad Heluiam 14–18 and ad Marciam 1 and 16; Harich 1993; Wilcox 2006).
Seneca tells us that there is a much-debated choice between three kinds of life—the life of theory, the life of politics (or practice), and the life of pleasure. This is not a Stoic distinction. Rather, it is (by Seneca’s time) a conventional division, going back, on the one hand, to Aristotle’s discussion of the life of theoria (‘contemplation’) as compared to the life of politics, and on the other hand to Plato’s and Aristotle’s engagement with prominent views about the good (the good is pleasure, the good is honor, the good is wisdom). Seneca is not committed to the view that the life of theory is a different life from the life of practice. But the Aristotelian way of framing the question helps him describe choices which he and some of his addressees face in life: whether to retire from an active role in politics, or to single-mindedly pursue one’s political career (for a discussion of traditional interpretations, which aim to explain Seneca’s views on retirement in the context of his biography, see Williams 2003).
In On the Private Life and in On Peace of Mind, Seneca addresses this very question of how to choose between the active life of politics, and a life devoted to philosophy. The choice is, for Seneca, partly about the right kind of balance. How much do we need to retreat in order to be at peace with ourselves? Philosophy has two functions. We need philosophical insight on which to base our actions. But we also need to devote time specifically to reflecting on such truths as that only virtue is good, and thus restore our peace of mind (cf. On Peace of Mind 2.4 for a description of tranquility).
Both philosophy and politics are spheres in which we can benefit others (On Peace of Mind 3.1–3). The contrast between the life of theory and the life of politics helps Seneca spell out his version of Stoic cosmopolitanism. We should not think of the choice between philosophy and politics as a choice between theory and practice. Rather, philosophy and politics represent two worlds that we simultaneously belong to. The world of politics is our local world; the world of philosophy is the whole world. By pursuing an active career in politics, we aim to do good to the people in our vicinity. By retreating into philosophy we choose to live, for a while, predominantly in the world at large (Wildberger 2018a). By studying, teaching, and writing philosophy, Seneca thinks, we help others who are not necessarily spatially close to us. Philosophical study is beneficial (or ‘of benefit’), it is of use to others, in the world-wide community to which we all belong (On the Private Life 3.4–4.2).
While Seneca takes it for granted that cosmopolitanism is concerned with the idea that it is good to benefit others, he does not seem to think that cosmopolitanism burdens us with the unfeasible task of helping everyone. Rather, cosmopolitanism liberates us. As things may play out in our individual lives, we may be in a better position to benefit others as philosophers than as Roman senators; and since both are good things to do, we can in fact be content with our lives either way. Cosmopolitanism creates a beneficial form of life that a narrower political picture may not accommodate: not only those who happen to be appreciated in their own states can benefit others (cf. Letter 68.2; cf. Williams 2003, 10–11 and 19–24). In On the Private Life 3.5, Seneca says: “What is required, you see, of any man is that he should be of use to other men—if possible, to many; failing that, to a few; failing that, to those nearest him; failing that, to himself.”
In Stoic philosophy, cosmopolitanism includes a view of the nature of human beings: human beings are, by virtue of the kind of beings they are, connected. Seneca at times explores fellowship among human beings in terms of family relationships. The family in a conventional sense is a place of ethical learning. Beyond this, there is an idealized and broader familial relation among people and Seneca is open to the idea that one chooses one’s intellectual ancestors independent of biological relationships (Gloyn 2017). The Stoics see human beings as parts of a whole, namely as parts of the cosmos (Vogt 2008, chapter 2). Seneca fully embraces this idea. In On Benefits, a treatise concerned with beneficere as a social practice, but also, more literally, with beneficere understood as ‘doing good,’ Seneca asks in which ways God benefits human beings. His answer aims to explain why, though we do not have the natural weapons other animals have and are in many ways weaker than they are, human beings have the kind of standing in the world he takes them to have, the standing of “masters.” “God has granted two things that make this vulnerable creature the strongest of all: reason and fellowship. […] Fellowship has given him power over all animals […] Remove fellowship and you will destroy the unity of mankind on which our life depends.” (tr. Griffin/Inwood 2011, 4.18.2–3). Seneca’s focus on fellowship is in line with earlier Stoic thought about affiliation (oikeiôsis) between human beings, as well as with the Stoic view that the cosmos is a large animal with us as some of its parts. Ideally, human beings relate as friends to each other. On the orthodox Stoic conception of friendship, only wise and virtuous people are friends (Vogt 2008, 148–160). Seneca endorses this ambitious notion of friendship. In order to be a friend, one must first attain a consistent mindset (Letter 35.2 and 4, cf. Wildberger 2018b).
The two most prominent features of the Stoic account of the soul are these: first, the soul is corporeal; second, the adult human soul is rational (in the sense that all its operations involve the use of reason) and one (psychological monism). Although Seneca appreciates Platonic imagery that presents the soul as ‘loftier’ than bodily things, he is fully committed to the Stoic view that the soul is a body. Discussion of this issue is, to his mind, somewhat academic, and thus not as salutary as the elevating themes about virtue that he often prefers. But Letter 106 explains why we must think of the soul as a body. Only bodies act on anything, cause effects; therefore, the soul must be a body (cf. Letter 117 on the good being a body).
Traditionally, Stoic philosophy is considered to have three phases: early (Zeno, Cleanthes, Chrysippus, et al.), middle (Panaetius, Posidonius, et al.), and late (Seneca, Epictetus, et al.). This periodization importantly hangs on a possible development in the philosophical psychology of the Stoics—the question of whether Panaetius and Posidonius move away from so-called psychological monism. According to psychological monism, there is no non-rational part or power of the soul. Rather, the soul is one insofar as its commanding faculty is one, and rational. According to psychological monism, motivational conflict and irrational action do not result from a ‘struggle’ between the rational and the non-rational aspects of the soul; what we call irrational must be understood as (bad) states of the rational soul. Psychological monism is thus a counterposition to Plato’s and Aristotle’s account of the soul, and has major implications for the theory of action, ethics, and the theory of emotion. It is a difficult question whether middle Stoicism departs from psychological monism. The view that it did was for a long time widely accepted. However, this traditional picture has recently been contested in influential studies (Cooper 1999; Tieleman 2003). Perhaps early and middle Stoicism are more in agreement than it was previously thought. Accordingly, some recent studies of Seneca proceed on the assumption that we need not attempt to figure out whether Roman Stoicism agrees with monistic early or with pluralistic middle Stoicism (Inwood 2005).
But Seneca may agree with psychological monism insofar as he does not distinguish between rational and non-rational powers of the soul (as in fact, arguably neither did the middle Stoics) and still modify a related aspect of the early Stoic account of the soul. Psychological monism implies that there is no distinction between practical and theoretical reason. Knowledge bears directly on action. Indeed, all philosophical knowledge is needed for good decision-making. There is thus, according to Stoic “orthodoxy,” no real distinction between theorizing and aiming to lead a good life (I. Hadot 1969, 101). Seneca brings to bear this aspect of Stoic thought in his own way. For him, studying the arguments for a particular claim will not bring us peace of mind. At the outset of Letter 85, Seneca goes so far as to swear that he does not take pleasure in producing proofs for a piece of doctrine that looms large in his Letters: that virtue alone brings happiness (85.1). His addressee, Lucilius, is presented as urging him to put forward all arguments and objections that are relevant to this issue, and in response, Seneca discusses some of them in Letter 85. But ultimately—and this is evident throughout his writings—this is not enough. Rather, it is important to think through the implications of the Stoic thesis in a variety of practical contexts, so as then to be able to live by it, for example, when one is or is not elected to office, has more or less money than others, and so on (Griffin 2007). One needs to think one’s way through these issues repeatedly—and ultimately, thinking about them in the right way must become a way of life.
But is not this conception of philosophy as a practice in tension with the Stoic conception of reason? Strictly interpreted, this conception might imply that whatever is once understood has become a piece of knowledge, and thus guides our action (see I. Hadot 1969, 106). Seneca, however, assumes that it is one thing to know something, and another to “feel” its truth and relevance to one’s own life. Here is one of his examples: he knows that it does not matter whether he travels in a fashionable or in a humble carriage, but he blushes if people see him in a humble one (Letter 87.4). Why should this be so? Why does Seneca suggest, in Platonic fashion, that one’s desires for fame and money are going to raise their heads if they are not constantly kept down? Second, why should not the complete system of philosophical knowledge, including the study of rigorous dialectical argument, be relevant to leading one’s life well? In these respects, Seneca seems to weaken the earlier Stoic identification of virtue and knowledge—or perhaps, depending on the view we take, he remedies some of the starkness of this identification (on Seneca’s dismissive attitude toward the syllogisms of “dialecticians,” and on how this differs from early Stoic thought on the value of knowledge for a good life, see Cooper 2004, 314–320).
The Stoic understanding of the soul further involves core epistemological ideas. Human beings have “impressions” (imprints or alterations of the soul). We acquire the views we hold by assenting to impressions; in every given case, we can assent to an impression, negate it, or withhold judgment. Since this is in our power, it is in our power to become wise (by assenting only to cognitive impressions, which represent things precisely as they are). Human action is generated through “assent” to practical impressions; such assent sets off impulse (hormê). If there is no external impediment, impulse leads to action. It is in our power to become virtuous, because assent is in our control; we decide how we act. Seneca discusses these and related issues with the help of a term that has no equivalent in Greek Stoicism: voluntas.
Traditionally, Seneca was seen either as the discoverer of the will, or, at least, a major stepping-stone towards St. Augustine (for detailed discussion of the literature, see Inwood 2005 ; key contributions are: I. Hadot 1969, Voelke 1973, Dihle 1982, Donini 1982, Kahn 1988; for the view that already Aristotle has a conception of the will, see Irwin 1992; for a critique of the traditional view see Rist 1969, and, recently, Inwood 2005 ; for the view that Epictetus, as opposed to Seneca, plays a major role in the development of the conception of a will, see Frede 2011.).
It is a difficult question what precisely would count as the discovery of the will. Clearly, voluntas and velle (‘willing’, ‘wanting’) figure prominently in many of Seneca’s arguments. Does Seneca think there is a separate faculty of the will, thus modifying psychological monism? Or is he interested in exploring the phenomenology of decision-making and self-improvement, and this leads him to describe certain mental acts as acts of willing (velle)? This second suggestion seems more persuasive, and seems to capture much of what is important to the traditional interpretation: that Seneca keeps discussing how we must be continually committed to self-improvement (cf. Letters 34.3 and 71.36). Perhaps Seneca’s depictions of the mental act that the Greek Stoics call assent appear in some sense richer than those of the earlier Stoics (without changing the substance of the theory), because Seneca likes to use metaphorical language. Rather than stick with the abstract description that, in deciding what to do, we assent to a practical impression, Seneca envisages us as judges, passing judgment over what we should be doing, and issuing commands to ourselves (cf. Inwood 2005,  and ; Star 2012, 23–52). With respect to the emotions, Seneca distinguishes between involuntary reactions (what earlier Stoics call “proto-emotions” or propatheiai) and full-blown emotions, which involve assent and thus are voluntary (On Anger II; see below). They are voluntary in the sense that assent is in the agent’s power. This is a key piece of Stoic doctrine—that, whether we are foolish or wise, it is in our power to assent or not assent to impressions. But at other times, Seneca employs a normative notion of voluntariness. Only virtuous action is free in the sense of being fully reasonable, while other actions spring from irrational movements of the mind such as emotions; in this sense, only virtuous action is voluntary (Letter 66.16).
Seneca’s discussions of self-improvement raise a further question: Does Seneca discover the self (or, as Veyne puts this question, “the I”; Veyne 2003)? In a famous passage of On Anger (III 36.3–4) Seneca tells his readers how he, every evening, examines himself. Does Seneca’s emphasis on reflection involve a turn to the self, as it has seemed to many recent readers inspired by Foucault’s discussions of these matters? Is Seneca concerned with a practice of self-shaping? In order to think about the question of whether Seneca discovers or even invents the self, we might distinguish different versions of it. First, we may ask whether Seneca modifies psychological monism, so as to make room for a self reflecting upon itself (in a way which makes the self have a complex structure that the Greek Stoics would not have envisaged for the rational soul of human beings). Second, we might think that what readers, in the wake of Foucault’s influential studies, have found modern about Seneca is simply his therapeutic concern with fashioning one’s own life. This second view is much weaker, and is by now widely accepted (Long 2006, 362). The first view is forcefully critiqued by Inwood (2005 ; cf. Bartsch and Wray 2009). While Seneca invites us to engage reflectively with our lives, this does not revise basic Stoic assumptions about the soul. But we might also raise a third question: Can we acceptably, to borrow a term from Veyne, “abuse” Seneca for our own purposes, knowing full well that we are reading a certain kind of concern with the self into his works which has more to do with our own times than with a precise interpretation of his work? This is Veyne’s suggestion: “Stoicism has thus become, for our use, a philosophy of the active turning in on itself of the I […]. It was nothing of the kind in its own day, but the Letters permit us to view it as such.” (2003, x).
When Seneca discusses how we must hold on to the insight that only virtue is good, in order to improve ourselves, it may sometimes seem as if he blamed the world (competition, superficial lifestyles, etc.) for the difficulty of the task. But ultimately, Seneca argues that we are standing in our own way. He tells his addressees that, by living in such-and-such a way, they weigh themselves down (‘tibi gravis eris’; On Peace of Mind 3.6), or become a problem to themselves (‘tu tibi molestus es’; Letter 21.1). It is with a view to this reflective engagement with one’s thought that Hadot finds ‘spiritual exercises’ in Roman Stoic philosophy (P. Hadot 1995, 79–144; cf. Letter 6.1 on self-transformation).
Care for one’s soul involves the Socratic project of aiming to know oneself. In the Natural Questions, Seneca says that nature has given us mirrors so that we may know ourselves (ut homo ipse se nosset). Even this external means of seeing ourselves—which, Seneca deplores, is mostly put to less than virtuous uses—serves a purpose; for example, the young see the bloom of their youth, thus being reminded that this is the time for study and bravery (NQ 1.16.1–17.10; cf. Williams 2005). Ultimately, however, coming to know oneself is a matter of reflective self-examination and philosophical study. At the same time, Seneca argues that the private life and the public life are cures for each other (On Peace of Mind 17.3; cf. Inwood 2005 ). This balance may indicate that the project of improving the states of one’s mind or soul (or ‘self’) might ultimately involve what the Stoics call oikeiôsis, ‘affiliation.’ According to Stoic theory, one should fully appreciate the way in which everything outside of one’s mind ‘belongs to one’ (one’s body, other human beings, other parts of the world, the world as a whole). That is, in finding a balance between retreat and philosophy on the one hand, and the life of politics on the other, one is aiming to be a citizen of one’s local community and of the world (cf. Gill 2009).
Like St. Augustine, whose “turn inside” is as much debated by scholars as Seneca’s “turn to the self,” Seneca seems to think that turning to one’s soul is not enough—we need to further turn to God. However, for Seneca, the study of nature and God seems to be motivated by care for one’s soul (rather than, say, by love for God). In the Natural Questions, Seneca suggests that the reflective engagement with our own soul is but the first step. Even if we escape the violent emotions and disruptions of a public life, we might not yet have escaped from ourselves, that is, from an excessive concern with our own particular situation and needs. We must turn into ourselves (in se recedendum), but then we must also retreat from ourselves (a se recedendum) (NQ 4.20). From a care of ourselves that revolves around ethical questions, we must turn to the study of nature and theology (NQ 1.1–8). How does such study liberate us? By removing us from our localized concerns, and offering us a distanced, disengaged perspective on them. The study of nature is an attempt at overcoming one’s mortality (NQ 1.17). More than that, the ideal of virtue that is at issue in taking care of one’s soul is, ultimately, the ideal of becoming like God (Russell 2004). This is a thought that perhaps is rather foreign to modern psychotherapeutic techniques, and to Foucaultian ideas about self-care.
Questions relating to Stoic psychological monism have been most widely discussed with a view to the theory of the emotions—here, it makes a great difference whether we think that irrational desires can overcome reason, or are irrational acts of the rational soul. Seneca’s treatment of the emotions has been scrutinized for indications of both points of view. Sorabji interprets Seneca as situating his account of the emotions vis-à-vis early and middle Stoic theories that differ from his own (1989); Fillon-Lahille studies On Anger with source-critical methods (1984). According to others, On Anger can be studied as a treatise on emotion that is basically in agreement with Stoic psychological monism, and appreciated for the detailed treatment that Seneca devotes to this, as he sees it, particularly violent emotion (Cooper 1999; Vogt 2006).
According to the Stoics, the ideal agent has no emotions. Stoic theory of the emotions does not aim at moderation or “adequate” emotional responses. Rather, it aims at a life without emotions. However, the Stoics do not suggest that the perfect agent is affectively inert. Rational affective reactions and dispositions replace emotion. The ideal agent has “good feelings” of wishing (which replaces desire), caution (which replaces fear), and joy (which replaces pleasure) (Cooper 2005; Graver 2007, 51–55; Kamtekar 2005). Further, the ideal agent has proto-emotions, that is, initial affective and physiological reactions that do not depend on assent (On Anger 2.1–4; 1.16.7). These responses which, for Seneca and early Stoics, do not count as emotions, have recently been a starting point in comparing Stoic and Chinese philosophy, and described in terms of self-emerging feelings (Machek 2015).
The conceptions of good or rational feelings (i.e., the affective dispositions and reactions of the wise person) and proto-emotions render Stoic thought on the emotions less implausible than it is sometimes taken to be. But still, students of ancient theories of emotion have often felt that one simply must side with an Aristotelian position—with the view that there are adequate, measured emotions. Suppose someone commits a crime; are we not justly angry, and should we not react to the crime? As Seneca puts it, will the ideal agent not be angry if he sees his father murdered and his mother raped? Yes, he argues, we should react, but not with emotions and emotional action (revenge), no matter how curbed they might be through reflection. The idea of “moderate emotions,” says Seneca, is about as absurd as the idea of “moderate insanity” (Letter 85.9). Emotions are irrational (85.8); there is no taming of the irrational, precisely because it is irrational. Emotions thus cannot be moderated—they must be replaced with rational responses. The ideal agent will avenge and defend others out of duty (quia oportet) (On Anger 1.12), not out of anger or lust for revenge. Scholars disagree, however, whether Seneca’s consolatory writings are an exception. According to Konstan (2015), Seneca’s consolations recommend metriopatheia, moderate affection, instead of apatheia, the elimination of grief. Alternatively, Fournier argues that Ad Marciam displays a progression from the aim of moderate grief to the aim of elimination of grief (2009). According to Machek (2015), moments where Seneca seems to advocate metriopatheia can be interpreted as invoking the ideal agent’s proto-emotions.
Seneca’s detailed analysis of anger adds in interesting ways to our knowledge of how, precisely, the Stoic claim that emotions are opinions plays out. According to the early Stoics, there are four generic emotions: pleasure (in the sense of being pleased about something), pain (in the sense of being distressed or feeling displeased), desire, and fear. Pleasure is directed at a presumed good that is present; pain at a presumed bad that is present; desire at a presumed good in the future; fear at a presumed bad in the future. Since emotions are impulses, they result in action (if there is no external impediment). Anger counts as a kind of desire. In anger, the agent assents to the impression that she should take revenge. But the judgment that first generates anger is something like ‘He wronged me’. On Anger thus helps shed light on the way in which several judgments can figure in one emotion, and how emotion is tied up with irrational action (Vogt 2006; Kaster 2010, Introduction).
In recent years, scholars have increasingly turned to a topic that is prominently discussed in the Aristotelian tradition, so-called akrasia or lack of control (for discussion of Seneca’s engagement with Aristotelian ideas in ethics and psychology, see Inwood 2014, 73-104). On the Aristotelian account, the akratic agent acts contrary to her correct reasoning and based on desire. This view seems recognizable to many. It captures that desire can seem overpowering, “winning” in a perceived struggle between reason and desire. Stoic psychological monism can appear colorless and unrealistic in comparison. It cannot accommodate the sense that reason and desire are in conflict. For the Stoics, each motivational state is a thought. What Aristotelians call akrasia is, on one early Stoic account, an oscillation between opinions (Müller 2014). For example, an agent thinks in quick succession “I’ll have another cookie” and “I won’t have another cookie”; her hand reaches out to take the cookie at a moment when she thinks the former. Recent Seneca scholars have asked whether Seneca adheres to the oscillation view of conflicted motivation, or whether his account is closer to Aristotelian akrasia. Sorabji argues that the Latin term “impotens” is Seneca’s translation of the Greek “akrates” (lacking control); he proposes that in Seneca all cases of anger are cases of akrasia (2000, 61). According to Gartner (2015), on the other hand, On Anger is fully in agreement with Stoic monism. Seneca’s analysis of anger involves tumultuous states of mind, but it does not involve the distinctive state of akrasia. Within the framework of Aristotelian theory, akrasia is worse than control (enkrateia) and much worse than virtue. Gartner notes that Seneca also cannot accommodate control, because control—just as akrasia—involves a distinction between reason and desire that is alien to Seneca’s framework. Other scholars pursue intermediate approaches. Rather than avoid the Aristotelian term akrasia, Müller (2014) discusses Seneca’s views on motivational conflict in terms of akrasia; but he ascribes distinctively Stoic views to Seneca. On his reading of Seneca’s tragedy Medea, Medea’s conflicted motivations exemplify the oscillation model. Maso (2018) emphasizes Seneca’s engagement with the corporeality of the soul, as the Stoics conceive of it. On his reading, On Anger develops a version of psychological monism that permits dualist imagery and that explains motivational conflict in part in terms of the physiology of inner turmoil (on the physiology of anger in On Anger, see also Riggsby 2015).
Next to anger, Seneca pays most attention to fear and grief, emotions that tend to dominate human life due to human mortality (NQ 6.1.1–4.2; 32.1–12; on grief, see esp. Letters 26, 63, 77). Fear of death is paradoxical: It wants to preserve life, but it spoils life (6.32.9). It is one of the key tasks for the progressor to come to terms with death (Edwards 2014; Mann 2006; Letters 1.2 and 4.3–9). Fear makes us “lose our minds,” and thus literally removes rationality (NQ 6.29). It is through changing our views regarding the presumed badness of death that we can overcome fear and grief. Death is a natural event, and understanding death is part of the study of nature. We fear most what we do not understand; knowledge cures fear (NQ 6.3.4). Seneca takes seriously two accounts of death: either death is a transition to a better afterlife, or it is a genuine end. In his tragedies, Seneca explores more troubling scenarios (see above). The tragedies might illustrate irrational attitudes to death; or they might be a testament to the fact that consolatory philosophy cannot silence these darker visions (for a discussion of death in Seneca’s prose writings and poetry, and a defense of the latter view, see Busch 2009).
In On Peace of Mind 15.1, Seneca raises an interesting question. Why does the ideal agent not deplore vice, and so feel in some way bad about it? This question bears on a key aspect of the Stoic theory. Although there are four generic emotions, there are only three rational feelings; they replace pleasure, desire, and fear. There is no rational correlate to pain or distress, i.e., to those emotions in which we judge something bad to be present. Of course, the wise person will not judge that illness or loss of money is bad; she knows that only vice is bad. But why does she not make precisely this judgment—that vice is bad—in such a way that an affective stance of ‘rational deploring’ goes along with it? Seneca gives an answer that is in agreement with the fundamental Stoic claim that virtue benefits. The sage puts on a smile, rather than being saddened, because his cheerfulness gives hope. This reply, brief as it is, perhaps contains the core of an argument relevant to the Stoic stance on (what we call) the ‘negative moral emotions’. Part of this argument might be that virtue does not allow for rational negative affective responses, since such responses would not benefit.
In his discussion of how the virtuous person responds to weaknesses in others, Seneca extends the Stoic spectrum of rational feelings to include mercy (clementia). Seneca’s treatise On Mercy has puzzled historians: by praising the goodness of the young Nero as Emperor—his mercy, as opposed to cruelty, severity, and pity—Seneca creates the prototype of “advice to princes” literature (see Long 2003; cf. Kaster 2010 for a brief introduction to the treatise). We cannot here enter into the question of whether Seneca chooses to ignore or did not know of the murder Nero had recently committed. Perhaps the answer is simply that things look different in hindsight (see Braund 2009). The Latin term for mercy, clementia, is difficult to translate; sometimes scholars opt for clemency, thus signaling that Seneca discusses a virtue that we are not immediately familiar with. In On Mercy, clementia is a virtue of a superior. This is in itself a novelty within Stoic ethics. Earlier Stoics did not conceive of virtues for particular roles. Instead, virtue or wisdom is thought to translate into role-specific kinds of expertise whenever a virtuous person comes to have such a role. The notion of clemency, as Seneca develops it, has its origin in Roman self-descriptions: clemency is a virtue that Rome exercises vis-a-vis defeated peoples (on Seneca’s conception of the state in On Mercy, see Wildberger 2018c, 169-171). That is, clemency is an attitude that was originally displayed towards enemies, not towards one’s own citizens; with Caesar, it becomes the virtue of an emperor (these are the outlines of a highly instructive sketch of the concept’s history in Braund 2009).
In Seneca, clementia is a kind of restraint in a powerful person who might otherwise lash out and act cruelly, and it is something like equity (cf. Braund 2009). Arguably, the first kind of clementia is not a Stoic virtue. A person whose savagery needs to be contained cannot count as virtuous (Vogt 2011). Scholars also raise the question of whether equity, understood as the ability of a ruler to judge a case by all its particular characteristics (rather than simply apply a rule) fits into Stoic philosophy (Braund 2009). ‘Equity’ is the standard translation of the Greek epieikeia, which Aristotle discusses in Nicomachean Ethics V.10. Aristotle discusses a well-known problem: the law is general, but every case that needs to be judged is particular. Equity is a juridical virtue; it aims to remedy an inevitable feature of the law understood as a set of rules: its generality. According to two doxographical passages, the Stoics do not ascribe equity to their wise person (DL 7.123 and Stobaeus, 2.96.4–9). However, these texts are plausibly understood as making the claim that the Stoics do not ascribe Aristotelian equity —and that is, the equity that aims to remedy the shortcomings of general rules—to the wise person. The law, as the Stoics conceive of it, is not the positive set of laws in a given political community. For them, the only law worthy of the name ‘law’ is identical with reason, and thus with what should be done (Vogt 2008, chapter 4). Equity of a distinctively Stoic kind, understood as the ability to judge every case by fully appreciating all particular circumstances, fits perfectly into the larger framework of Stoic ethics (Vogt 2011).
The Stoic distinction between valuable and good things is at the center of Seneca’s Letters. So-called preferred indifferents—health, wealth, and so on—have value (their opposites, dispreferred indifferents, have disvalue). But only virtue is good. Again and again, Seneca discusses how health and wealth do not contribute to our happiness. Seneca approaches this issue not as an academic puzzle, as if we needed to be compelled by intricate proof to accept this point. He speaks very directly to his readers, and his examples grip us moderns as much as they gripped his contemporaries. We tend to think that life would be better if only we did not have to travel for the lowest fare, but in a more comfortable fashion; we are disheartened when our provisions for dinner are no better than stale bread. By addressing these very concrete situations, Seneca keeps hammering home the core claim of Stoic ethics: that virtue alone is sufficient for happiness, and nothing else even makes a contribution. It is important to note that preferred indifferents have value though they are not good in the terminological sense of the Stoics. Scholars sometimes suggest that, for Seneca, preferred indifferents are worthless and to be frowned upon (for example, Braund 2009). In doing so, they pick up on the metaphors and examples that Seneca employs. Seneca writes with an acute awareness of how difficult it is not to see things like health and wealth as good, and that is, as contributing to one’s happiness. Accordingly, Seneca keeps giving vivid examples, aiming to help his audience become less attached to things of mere value. However, he does not suggest that things like health or wealth should be regarded dismissively, or not taken care of.
A related and equally important aspect of Stoic ethics is the distinction between appropriate and correct action. Appropriate action takes indifferents adequately into account. Both fools and the wise can act appropriately. But only the wise act perfectly appropriately, or correctly: their action is based on their perfect deliberation, and reflects the overall consistency of their soul. Seneca explains matters in precisely this fashion: while we should take indifferents (health, illness, wealth, poverty, etc.) judiciously into account, as things of value or disvalue to us, the good does not reside in getting or avoiding them. What is good is that I choose well (Letter 92.11–12). In response to the question ‘What is virtue?’, Seneca says “a true and immovable judgment” (Letter 71.32; tr. Inwood). Attributing any real importance to indifferents, Seneca argues, is like preferring, among two good men, the one with the fancy haircut (Letter 66.25). This comparison is typical for Seneca’s tendency to capture the standing of valuable indifferents in forceful, figurative language. A nice haircut, one might think, could be seen as entirely irrelevant. But this is not Seneca’s point. Compared to the good, preferred indifferents pale, and appear as insignificant as a fashionable haircut when compared with genuine virtue. But preferred indifferents are valuable. In deliberation, we do not compare them with the good; we consider them next to dispreferred indifferents.
In appropriate action, the agent takes things of value into account. This, however, does not happen in the abstract—she does not weigh the value of wealth against the value of health in a general fashion. Rather, she thinks about the way in which a specific situation and the courses of action available in it involve indifferents—for example, putting on the appropriate clothes for a given occasion (Letter 92.11). Since the features of the situation in which one acts thus matter to appropriate action, the Stoics apparently wrote treatises (now lost) in which they discussed at length how this or that feature may bear on what one should be doing (Sedley 2001). Seneca’s Letters 94 and 95 seem to be examples of this kind of treatise. The very fact that such treatises are written testifies to the fact that indifferents are not simply irrelevant: they are the material of deliberation.
Since Kidd (1978), Letters 94 and 95 have been read with a view to the question of whether rules figure in Stoic ethics (for a discussion of the letters that is not framed by this question, see I. Hadot 1969, 8–9). This question, in turn, is relevant to our interpretation of the Stoic conception of law. The Stoics have long been considered the ancestors of the natural law tradition (Striker 1987). If the Stoics formulate rule-like precepts, then perhaps this means that the law, as the Stoics understand it, consists of a set of laws.
In Letters 94 and 95, Seneca discusses two notions, praecepta and decreta, usually translated as ‘precepts’ and ‘principles’. The topic of Seneca’s discussion is this. If we seek a good life by studying philosophy, do we need to study only decreta, or also praecepta? According to the first position, the only thing needed to achieve virtue is to immerse oneself in the core tenets of Stoic philosophy. It is these that Seneca calls decreta; decreta thus are not practical principles or rules. They are principles of philosophy, in the sense of being the most abstract and fundamental teachings of the Stoics.
According to the second position, which Seneca seems to endorse, studying the first principles of Stoic philosophy is not sufficient; we should also think in detail about the demands that specific situations in life might make on us (and so, we should study praecepta relating to them). It may seem that these lower-level considerations involve rules: in such-and-such a situation, one should act in such-and-such a way (Annas 1993, 98-105; Mitsis 2001). However, it is not clear whether Seneca indeed envisages such rules. As students of virtue, we will benefit from thinking our way through a variety of situations that one might encounter in life, contemplating how the different features of these situations matter to appropriate action, and so developing a sharpened sense of the particular value of the various things that do have value or disvalue for a human being. Seneca’s ‘case studies’ (e.g., a previously married wife should be treated differently from a previously unmarried wife) perhaps only hone the students’ appreciation for the kinds of issues that matter to appropriate action, where different things of value or disvalue impinge case by case, rather than providing them with rules for specific situations. Further, Seneca envisages an advisor who reminds us of insights such as ‘money does not bring happiness’. Such almost proverbial sayings, however, do not appear to be rules. Finally, the advisor is someone who can come up with specific advice for a given occasion, such as ‘walk in such-and-such a way’ (see On Favors 15.2; Inwood 2005 ; Schafer 2009, esp. regarding Letters 94 and 95; Vogt 2007, 189–198). As Seneca emphasizes in Letter 71.1, advice is adjusted to situations, and situations are in flux. If one needs advice, one is not asking to be told the correct rule to cover the situation; one is asking how to balance various considerations.
Although the Stoics are, with respect to the good, most famous for the claim that only virtue is good, they define the good as benefit. Seneca agrees with the early Stoic view that the good benefits. As we have seen, Seneca thinks that both public life and philosophy are good forms of life, if conducted right, precisely because both are of benefit to others. When discussing the benefit that a philosophical life brings to others, he claims that the virtuous person’s life is beneficial even if she performs no public function whatsoever. Her gait, her silent persistence, and the expression of her eyes, benefit. Just as some medication works merely through its smell, virtue has its good effects even from a distance (On Peace of Mind 4.6–7).
Seneca devotes an entire treatise to the question of how one should benefit others, and how one should receive benefits, On Benefits (or: On Favors, lat. De beneficiis). On Benefits is the longest extant Senecan treatise on one specific ethical topic. Though the treatise is firmly situated in the Roman social context, its detailed analysis and richness of examples make it more than an historical document. Seneca discusses good deeds and badly performed favors, graceful and ungraceful receiving, the joy or burden of returning favors, as well as gratitude and envy. Seneca’s topic is a hybrid of the kind of phenomena anthropologists discuss in terms of gift exchange, the specific configuration of these phenomena studied in ancient Rome, and Stoic views to the effect that only the good person benefits others. This mix makes for a rather difficult text. It is no surprise, then, that there used to be almost no helpful literature. This state, however, is ameliorated by recent translations with philosophical introductions, by John Cooper and J.F. Procopé (1995; Books 1–4) and by Miriam Griffin and Brad Inwood (featuring also an Introduction by the series editors E. Asmis, S. Bartsch and M. Nussbaum, 2011), as well as Griffin’s new “guide” to On Benefits (2013)
What, then, are benefits or favors as Seneca uses the term? Roughly speaking, one can think of beneficia as any kind of help a person might offer to another person qua member of a group, such that this strengthens the cohesion of the group and affirms or creates social bonds. Examples include: to give money or other material assistance, to use one’s influence in someone’s favor or in favor of someone’s family member, to advance someone’s health or personal safety, to save someone (her child, etc.) from calamity, to get someone out of prison, to console, to speak on someone’s behalf, to further someone’s career, to teach and educate someone, to instruct or advise someone.
Benefits are given largely between those who do not belong to the same household. They thus differ from the responsibilities that attach to the roles of son or wife and from the services that slaves or employees are expected to perform (3.18.1). What parents do for their children, however, counts as benefit and not as role-specific responsibilities. Sons are returning what they owe, thus fulfilling the obligations that attach to their role. But it is important to Seneca that sons can also genuinely benefit their parents (3.29.1–38.3), for example, if through their outstanding achievements they put the parents into the spotlight, in Seneca’s eyes a priceless benefit (3.32.2). Moreover, Seneca spends much of Book 3 arguing that slaves can benefit their masters, namely when they do more than they are compelled to do. Seneca thinks that, given how hateful compulsion is for anyone, benefits conferred by slaves reflect an admirable ability to overcome resentment for being in the position they are in (3.19.4).
Lending (as opposed to giving) money is not a beneficium. If money or wealth is involved in a favor, it must be freely given. Indeed, if one does not want to stand in the kind of social relationship that the giving and receiving of benefits creates, one can accept money only as a loan. If, say, a person whom you did not want in your life were to free you from captivity through paying the ransom, you might accept this, but you should quickly raise the money to repay her. That way, no bond is established (2.21.1–2). The distinction between lending and giving runs through the treatise as a whole. It connects to two further ideas. First, that the right attitudes of giving, receiving, and returning a benefit involve freedom (1.4.3; on the kind of freedom that, according to Seneca, masters and slaves share, to the effect that slaves too can confer benefits, see Gianella 2019). The addressee of On benefits is called Liberalis, a name that drives home a point that Seneca wants to emphasize. For something to count as a benefit it must not be given slowly, grudgingly, or in some other reluctant way; it must be given freely. To be rightly received, the good deed should not be perceived by the recipient as a burden; it must be accepted freely. Indeed, the kind of emotion that reflects the appropriate attitudes on both parts is joy. Anything else would be suggestive of hesitations, concerns about undesired ties, and so on. Second, the distinction between lending and giving is reflected in a distinction between justice and beneficence (3.14.3–15.3). Justice appears inferior to Seneca insofar as, in that sphere, we are putting faith in seals rather than souls (3.15.3). If the domain of ‘good deeds’ was invaded by attitudes appropriate to lending and contractual obligations, Seneca thinks that something of great value would be lost.
Throughout the treatise, Seneca’s focus is on attitudes, not on de facto performed actions. It is not the transfer of an object, or the return of a favor, that ultimately counts. Strictly speaking, a favor consists in the relevant state of mind of the giver (that he wants to benefit someone) and similarly in the grateful state of mind of the receiver. What we might call the intention to benefit, and the intention to gratefully repay the favor are the relevant actions of giving and receiving correctly. As some scholars put it, it is the act of willing which counts as a correct action (Inwood, 2005 ; cf. Letter 81.10–13). These arguments reflect core intuitions of Stoic ethics. Scholars traditionally judge Book 4 to be the part of the treatise that addresses more abstract philosophical questions, thus aiming to integrate a discussion about the norms pertaining to a historical practice in Rome with Stoic tenets in ethics. However, this assessment is best seen as making a comparative judgment. There is more explicit Stoic theory in Book 4 than in the other books. Seneca discusses the benefits conveyed by God, drawing on Stoic theology and philosophy of nature (see 5.3 below on Stoic theology).
Otherwise, one might argue that Book 4 is not all that different from the rest of the treatise. In particular, Seneca’s question whether benefits ought to be given for their own sake or for the sake of some advantage to the giver does not employ any quintessentially Stoic assumptions. Indeed, one might even say that it is in considerable tension with central intuitions of earlier Stoic ethics. For the Stoics, the good and the advantageous really are one and the same. Moreover, Book 4 does not, as one might expect, address the subtleties of the Stoic conception of the good, which would be a way of pushing the discussion to a more theoretical level. Seneca’s arguments about good deeds are essentially already laid out in Books 1 to 3. The claim that what matters are intentions and attitudes was already established in ways that are relatively independent of Stoic premises about the good: by distinguishing benefits from obligations; by pointing to the dangers of burdening others with expectations they shall not be able to meet; by elaborating on the fact that there must be a way of repaying even for those who are without material means; and so on. Seneca addresses in rather concrete ways the problems that are likely to arise in a society that is held together by the exchange of favors. As a result of imperfect giving, recipients easily become dependents and feel enslaved by their donors.
Much of On Benefits is normative, aiming to lay down “a law of life” (1.4.2.) about giving, receiving, and returning. Seneca’s recommendations, however, are based on what he perceives to be facts about human psychology. For example, he thinks that the negative aspects of how others conduct themselves towards us shall stick more firmly in our minds than the positive aspects (1.1.8), and that we tend to have ever new desires, so that we are inevitably less aware of benefactions received in the past than we are of what we want for the present and future (3.3.1.). To give well involves recognition of such facts. Often, Seneca observes, we are evasive and assist only grudgingly. No wonder that our reticence sticks out more in people’s minds than the fact that we eventually relented; no wonder that we are not held in esteem for such ungracious giving (1.1.8).
Assuming that Seneca is right, and that it is difficult to be good at helping, the focus of an ethical discussion about helping should not be in the first instance on how much help should be given (as it often is today). Rather, it should be on how one achieves something rare and difficult, namely to help in such a way that the recipient does not end up being worse off for having been helped. Among works in modern moral philosophy, the treatise that perhaps bears most resemblance with On Benefits is Kant’s Doctrine of Virtue, a book that contains so-called “casuistical” sections where Kant discusses such matters as how certain ways of helping might lower the recipient in her own eyes and the eyes of others, thus making the receiver appear more manifestly inferior than she should be (Vogt 2008). Indeed, Kant and Seneca agree on the following point (though of course much of the background reasoning differs): good giving may even require leaving the recipient of help in the dark, because otherwise the negative effects (the social positioning of someone as recipient and ultimately dependent) can outweigh the benefit (2.10.1). Seneca’s tone suggests that he agrees with a popular sentiment when he says that ungratefulness is an extremely grave and widespread vice. And yet, he thinks that bad giving is prior to and often directly responsible for bad receiving or lack of repaying; Book 1 and Book 2 both begin with this idea.
In Letter 120, Seneca explains how we arrive at the notion of the good. This question is a much-discussed topic in Stoic ethics. The Stoics hold that, in the process of growing up, human beings acquire rationality, which importantly consists in acquiring preconceptions (prolêpseis). Once a human being has reason in this minimal sense, she can improve and eventually perfect her rationality. As part of this process she comes to acquire the concept of the good. The transitional moment in which a human being finally and fully recognizes that only virtue (consistency) is good is momentous: this is the moment in which a fool becomes a wise person (Cicero, De fin. 3.20–22). At that point, a human being acquires what we might call the scientific concept of the good. She now masters a concept of the good that gets things right—once one has this concept, one is not going to fall back on misguided ideas such as ‘money brings happiness’. But does it not seem that we have a notion of the good before, eventually, turning into wise people, if we do? We here must distinguish two notions. First, human beings have a preconception of the good—we call things good before understanding any of the truths of Stoic philosophy. But second, we might, as progressors, also come to see the point of the Stoic claim that only virtue is good, without yet being fully able to consistently appreciate its truth in our lives. As we have seen, it is this condition of the progressor that Seneca has in mind as the objective he hopes to achieve in many of his writings.
Letter 120 seems to contribute to Stoic thought about the acquisition of the concept of the good in precisely this fashion. Unlike Cicero, Seneca does not discuss the transitional moment in which an agent becomes wise. Rather, he discusses how we come to understand what the Stoics are talking about when they say that only virtue is good (supposing that neither we nor those we live with are virtuous). When reading about great deeds, we magnify the virtuous features of the agents, and minimize their negative features (Inwood, 2005 ; Hadot 2014 replies to Inwood). By these and similar cognitive operations, we arrive at an understanding of what virtue would actually be. This realization enables us to see virtue’s goodness without having encountered a real-life instance of virtue (for the Stoics, the fully wise are rarely or never encountered).
Seneca’s Natural Questions consist of eight books on meteorology. Two recent publications argue forcefully for a revised order to the books: 3, 4a, 4b, 5, 6, 7, 1 and 2. Harry Hine’s translation is the first edition to print the books in this order (2010), and Gareth Williams argues that this is the most likely intended sequence in which the books should be read (2012).
Today’s readers tend to show little enthusiasm when they turn to the Natural Questions. What are we to think of long discussions about clouds, rain, lights in the sky, lightning and thunder, wind, comets, and earthquakes, combined with detailed treatments of terrestrial waters and, specifically, the Nile? Why does Seneca devote so much time to these phenomena? Scholars read the Natural Questions against the background of the meteorological tradition, a long-standing genre. Seneca, it is argued, engages in a project that is rather well established (Graver 2000, 45 and 51). Different contributions to this genre share a common goal. The rational explanation of natural phenomena will change the way we live in the world. To take a simple example: a person who understands the workings of thunder and lightning is not going to think that Zeus is sending her the message that he is angry. As Graver points out, at the time when Seneca writes the Natural Questions, this kind of concern is most prominently associated with Epicurean philosophy (2000, 51). Epicurean physics is in the business of fighting superstition and fear. The person who thinks that Zeus is speaking to her through the weather is in turmoil; the person who understands how the elements interact can live a more rational and better life. Now, a Stoic philosopher writing on these matters faces a challenge. Epicureans argue that God does not concern himself with the particulars of human life to the extent of signaling to us that a certain action of ours did not meet his approval. The Stoic God, however, is caring, benevolent, and concerned with the details of human life. Thus, the fear that easily attaches to meteorological phenomena must be fought with nothing but the detail of physical analysis. The argument that God would not care to send us signs is unavailable: the Stoic God, and Seneca agrees on this, is in principle such as to send us signs, which is why divination counts as a science (cf. 2.32–51 on lightning and divination; Williams 2012, chapter 8; on Seneca’s reaction to Epicureanism, see Graver 2015).
Ultimately, the project of the Natural Questions is to “take measure of God” (1.17), to “walk through the universe” (mundum circuire; 3.1), to celebrate the works of the gods (3.5), and to free us from fear induced by natural events (6.4). The study of clouds or thunderstorms is interesting because we want to understand how clouds or thunderstorms arise—but more than that, it must be salutary (2.59.2), and it helps us achieve human excellence (3.10–18) (Inwood, 2005 ; on the relationship of ethics and physics, cf. I. Hadot, 1969, 111–117). Seneca pursues a long-standing concern with making nature less scary, thus approaching meteorology partly from an ethical perspective. Moreover, the Natural Questions contain a number of discussions of human beings who act in what Seneca sees as particularly sordid and depraved ways. These passages are often described as digressions. Another reading, put forward by Williams (2012, Chapter 2), characterizes the Natural Questions as going beyond the meteorological tradition precisely because the text is in this particular way colorful, imaginative, and dramatic. Williams argues that Seneca’s treatise is importantly an artistic engagement with nature. Seneca aims to make some of his points by contrasting the beauty of nature’s workings with the ugliness of vicious action.
Seneca’s study of nature is importantly about a human being’s place and standing within the world. How could a person not investigate nature, knowing that ‘all this’—the world—pertains to her (ad se pertinere; Natural Questions 1.13)? Seneca’s cosmopolitanism is integral to the way he leads his readers into the study of nature. Only when we view our local lives from the perspective of the stars do we come to see the insignificance of riches, borders, and so on (NQ 1.9–13). In an influential phrase, Pierre Hadot calls this perspective the ‘view from above’ (1995)—a view that liberates us insofar as we come to see many seemingly important issues as mere trifles. We need the study of nature in order to reach the kind of distance from our everyday concerns that eventually frees us from unreasonable concern for them. And we investigate nature as something that we are a part of. In agreement with early Stoic thought about the universe as a large living being with parts, Seneca thinks that we are rightly motivated to study nature—nature is the large entity of which we are parts. Natural philosophy thus is necessary for fully engaging with one’s life. We might note that Seneca contrasts the study of nature with the study of history; for him, it is the seemingly more theoretical field of physics that has greater practical value. It is better to praise the gods than to praise the conquests of Philip or Alexander (NQ 3.5). Further, the study of nature is particularly valuable because it is the study of what should happen (quid faciendum sit), as opposed to the study of what in fact did happen (quid factum) (NQ 3.7).
The Stoics are considered ancestors of the natural law tradition. The standard epithet of the law, in early Stoicism, is ‘common’ (koinos), not ‘natural’. Seneca, however, characterizes laws or the law as natural and talks of the lex naturae (“law of nature”). Early Stoic thought about the law is partly rooted in the theory of appropriate action, and partly in a physical account of how reason—Zeus—pervades the world.
It is this physical notion of the law that is most prominent in Seneca. In his discussion of earthquakes and human fear, Seneca points out that we err by assuming that in some places, there is no danger of earthquakes; all places are subject to the same law (lex) (6.1.12). In another context, Seneca points out that the natural laws (iura) govern events under the earth as much as above (3.16.4). The world is constituted so that everything that is going to happen, including the conflagration of the world when it comes to an end, is from the very beginning part of it. Natural events like earthquakes, and in fact all events, help nature go through with the natural statutes (naturae constituta) (3.29.4). Since nature (or Zeus) decided in the beginning what was going to happen, everything is easy for nature (3.30.1). The study of nature aims at accepting facts of nature, first and foremost the fact that human beings are mortal. Seneca refers to the necessity of death as a natural law (NQ 6.32.12: mors naturae lex est). Death is a “done deal” already at conception (On Peace of Mind 11.6; cf. NQ 2.59.6). It is the task of science to understand why death need not be feared, that the philosophical life is particularly indispensable because it prepares us for death, and that the kinds of death that we are prone to fear particularly, such as death through an earthquake, are really not much different from more usual kinds of death. To be free according to the law of nature is to be prepared to die any minute (3.16). That we are all equals in death reflects the justice of nature (6.1.8).
A theme that is equally present in Seneca’s natural philosophy and in his therapeutic practice is time. Book 3 of the Natural Questions is entitled On the waters of the earth and begins with reflections on the enormous time which the task of natural philosophy may consume; on time that has been wasted with worldly concerns; and the claim that it can be regained if we make diligent use of the present. The fact that human life is finite is thus present from the very first lines of the book. Seneca then turns to the way in which the world’s life-cycle is as finite as that of a human being. Just as a human foetus already contains the seed of its death, the beginnings of the world contain its end (3.28.2–3). It is precisely for this reason that things are easy for nature. Its death does not, as it were, come as a surprise—nature is well-prepared. Nature does what it initially determined; nothing in nature’s doings is ad hoc (3.30.1). Seneca points to examples: Look at the way the waves roll onto the beaches; the oceans are trained in how to flood the earth (3.30.2). The world’s preparedness for its death seems to be the perfect analogue of how, for Seneca, we ought to spend our lives. In Letter 12.6–8, Seneca says that everything, light and darkness, is contained in a single day. To use the present well is to be aware of this completeness. More days, and months, and years, will (or at least may) make up our lives. But we should not think of them as stretching out into the future; rather, they are concentric circles surrounding the day which, right now, is present. And since even this very day stretches out, from its beginning to its end, we can appreciate it as containing everything—there can be more such days, but they will be more of the same. Thus, on every such day, if it is lived well, we can be fully prepared to die.
The study of nature—of the heavens—eventually leads to knowledge of God (or at least, to the beginnings of such an understanding; NQ 1.13). Seneca characterizes God in a number of ways: (i) God is everything one sees and everything one does not see. Nothing greater than his magnitude is conceivable (magnitudo […] qua nihil maius cogitari potest); he alone is everything—he keeps together his work from the inside and the outside (NQ 1.13). (ii) God is completely soul (animus) and reason (ratio) (1.14), or, as Seneca puts it in Letter 65.12, “reason in action” (ratio faciens). (iii) Like earlier Stoics, Seneca emphasizes that God (‘Jupiter’) can be referred to by many names: fate, the cause of causes (causa causarum), providence, nature, universe (NQ 2.45.2). (iv) Seneca agrees with the orthodox Stoic view that God is corporeal. God is a part of the world (pars mundi; NQ 7.30.4). At the same time, he emphasizes that it is in thought that we have to see God—he flees human eyes. The study of God is thus not the study of a visible entity (7.30.3–5). (v) God, or nature, is beneficial (5.18.13–15). Two of these ideas are particularly important to Seneca’s ethics. Much of Book 4 of On Benefits is devoted to the fact that God is beneficial (4.3.3–4.9.1). It is through the example of God’s goodness that Seneca aims to explain why giving should really not be done with a view to one’s own advantage: there is no advantage that God could possibly gain from us, and yet God benefits all of us (4.3.3). Indeed, God is the ultimate source of benefits; as cause of all causes, God is also the cause of everything that is good for us, and that includes the sun, the seasons, and so on. This connects to the point that God is referred to by many names. Seneca envisages the objection that these gifts do not come from God, but from nature; but whoever makes this objection fails to understand that nature is but another name for God (4.7.1).
Earlier Stoic theology is partly developed in conversation with and contradistinction from Epicurean theology. The central point of contention in this debate is whether God concerns himself with us, whether he is caring in the sense of attending to the details of how our lives are going. Seneca clearly shares the orthodox Stoic view that God is supremely caring. For example, Seneca describes the way in which God made the world as if he had built a wonderfully stable and beautiful house to present to us as a gift (4.6.2). In response to the question of how we know that there are gods, the earlier Stoics argued that every human being has a preconception of God. Seneca offers a version of this. The common practice of praying would be “insane” if there were no caring God. People would be addressing deities who are deaf (4.4.2). The fact that people everywhere seem to turn to God in prayer indicates for Seneca that there must be a caring God.
Seneca further agrees with earlier Stoic physics in taking divination seriously. In his discussions of thunder and lightning in the Natural Questions, Seneca explains that, while every natural event is a sign, we should not think of God busying himself with sending us, as it were, a sign at every particular occasion. Rather, we should explain natural events by seeking out their natural causes, and at the same time understand that the order of things as a whole is established by God. Since there is this order, divination is possible (NQ 2.32.1–4). Fate is the necessity of all events and actions, which no power can disrupt (2.36). Prayer cannot change fate; but since the gods have left some things unresolved, prayer can be effective (2.37.2).
Like other ancient philosophers, Seneca discusses virtue as the ideal of “becoming like God.” This is, however, not an otherworldly ideal—rather, it is the ideal of perfecting our rationality, as agents living in this world (Russell 2004). We are a part of God; to perfect our reason is to achieve the perfect rationality of divinity. In agreement with earlier Stoics, Seneca thinks that the virtuous man is an equal to the gods (Letter 92.30–31; 87.19). Seneca’s natural philosophy and his theology are thus closely related to his ethics and philosophical psychology. Ultimately, he is concerned with how we can perfect our soul, and he pursues this question in a variety of ways—by discussing virtue, the soul, nature, and theology.
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- Wray, D., 2009, “Seneca and tragedy’s reason,” in S. Bartsch and D. Wray (eds.), Seneca and the Self, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 237–254.
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I’m grateful to Luke Lea and Sam McVane for valuable suggestions and recommendations of secondary literature.