Medieval Theories of the Emotions

First published Wed May 23, 2018

One of the many uses of the Greek word pathos in ancient philosophy referred, roughly speaking, to what we call emotions. The corresponding Latin terms were passio, affectus or affectio. Medieval theories of emotions were essentially based on ancient sources. The new developments included the discussion of emotions from the point of view of Avicennian faculty psychology, the production of systematic taxonomies particularly in thirteenth-century Aristotelianism, the detailed studies of voluntary and involuntary aspects of emotional reactions, as well as late medieval re-evaluations of the sharp divide between the emotions and the will.

1. Ancient Sources

The philosophical analysis of emotions was introduced by Plato and developed further by Aristotle. In the fourth Book of his Republic, Plato famously divided the soul into three parts: the rational part (logistikon), the spirited part (thumoeides), and the appetitive part (epithumêtikon). This terminology was also used by Aristotle and later ancient philosophers, even though its philosophical background assumptions varied. The Latin terms for the corresponding parts were intellectus, irascibilis and concupiscibilis. Plato’s view of emotions was basically negative, with the exception of love in the Phaedrus and the educational capacity of the spirited part in the Republic and the Laws. He regarded the emotions as irrational reactions of the lower psychosomatic levels of the soul, of which the appetitive part sought sensual pleasure and avoided suffering and the spirited part was the seat of self-affirmation and aggression. The immaterial reasoning part was the subject of knowledge and rational will. It was meant to govern the emotional parts by reducing the activity of the appetitive part as much as possible and controlling spontaneous suggestions of the spirited part and habituating it to supporting good conduct. Plato supplied the emotional parts with a measure of non-intellectual cognitive evaluation with respect to perceptual representations and took them to be accompanied by pleasant or unpleasant feelings and related action-initiating impulses. Plato’s main reason for this tripartition was the phenomenon of acrasy: while the undisturbed knowledge of right conduct makes people behave accordingly, uncontrolled lower impulses may draw them in other directions, most typically toward immediate pleasures or aggression.

The various aspects Plato associated with the dynamic movements of the lower soul were more systematically discussed in Aristotle’s theory of emotions as part of the human condition. Aristotle developed a detailed model for analyzing the psychological structure of occurrent emotions, which included four basic aspects, most extensively discussed in the section on emotions in the second book of the Rhetoric. First, the cognitive element is an unpremeditated evaluation (belief or phantasy) that something positive or negative happens or may happen to the subject or to someone else in a way which concerns the subject. Second, the affective element is a subjectively felt pleasant or unpleasant feeling about the content of the evaluation. Third, the dynamic element is a behavioral impulse towards action which typically accompanies emotional evaluation. Fourth, there are typical physiological reactions such as the changes in the heartbeat. (For emotions in Plato and Aristotle, see Cooper 1999; Fortenbaugh 2003; Lorenz 2006; Price 2010; Dow 2015.)

The compositional approach has been very influential in Western thought. As for the first element, practically all ancient and medieval theories were cognitive, associating some kind of evaluative representation with an emotion as its principal constituent. While the Stoics, following their reason-centered rationalist psychology, argued that it is philosophically sufficient to treat emotions simply as mistaken value-judgments, it was more common in ancient and medieval times to follow the view of Plato and Aristotle, who distinguished between the non-emotional intellectual power and the lower emotional parts of the soul, which were eliminated by the Stoics. This was the prevailing medieval view until the Franciscan conception of the passions of the intellectual faculty of the will (Knuuttila 2004).

As distinct from Plato’s control model, Aristotle proposed that education may change the emotional dispositions so that their affective evaluations and inclinations support the quest for the good life instead of disrupting it. This was the basis of his theory of the virtues, which included the good emotional habits of the sensory soul and the good habits of the practical reason. As part of his philosophical psychology, Aristotle developed a considered theory of how the rational part may co-operate with the powers of the sensory part (Irwin 2017).

Plato and Aristotle presented some lists of emotions, the most extensive being in Aristotle’s Rhetoric II.1–11 (cf. Plato, Timaeus 69d; Laws I.644c-d; Aristotle, Nicomachean ethics II.5, 1005b21–23), but they did not develop any systematic taxonomy of emotions except considering some as the affects of the appetitive part and some of the irascible part. Because of the feeling aspect always being associated with an emotional representation, Aristotle sometimes distinguished emotions on the basis of whether the emotional evaluation was pleasant or unpleasant; see also Aspasius’ commentary on the Nicomachean ethics (41.28–43.32). The first elaborated taxonomy was put forward by the Stoics, who divided emotions into four basic types, depending on whether the object was regarded as a present or future good or a present or future evil:

Present Future
Value Good Pleasure Desire
Evil Distress Fear

The Stoics produced longer lists of particular emotions included in these four types. (See Pseudo-Andronicus of Rhodes, Peri Pathôn, ed. Glibert-Thirry, I.1–5; Diogenes Laertius VII.110–14; Stobaeus II.90.7–92.17.) The fourfold classification was quoted in many well-known works, such as Augustine’s The City of God (XIV.5–9) and Boethius’ Consolation of Philosophy (I.7, 25–28, and it was generally known in medieval times, although the Stoic explanation of emotions as such did not garner followers.

A well-known part of Stoic philosophy is the philosophical therapy of emotions (therapeia) described in works by Cicero, Seneca and Epictetus. Stoic therapy aimed at apatheia, the extirpation of emotions, as a consequence of learning to see things in accordance with the Stoic conception of rational reality without self-centered commitments. Emotions were typically regarded as false judgments about the value of things and the behavioral reactions to them. The Stoics often described the types of emotion by referring to their typical psychosomatic reactions, but the positive beliefs about the propriety of these expressive movements and corresponding actions were regarded as irrational. The elements of the Stoic therapy were known in later Latin philosophy through Cicero’s Tusculan disputations, Seneca’s On anger and some Christian sources. Other Hellenistic philosophers such as Plutarch generally followed the psychology of Plato and Aristotle, arguing for the moderation of the emotions (metriopatheia). The Stoic apatheia was regarded as impossible because of the emotional part of the soul and as inhumane insensitivity with respect to other people. Plotinus and his Neoplatonic followers argued for apatheia, though this did not involve the disappearance of the emotional part—earthly emotions became useless in higher Neoplatonic spheres (see Nussbaum 1994; Sorabji 2000).

The Alexandrian theologians Clemens and Origen combined Stoic and Platonist ideas, arguing that freedom from emotion was part of Christian perfectibility and the precondition for divinization through participation in divine love (agapê). This mystical union was described in highly emotional language, but supernaturally caused spiritual feelings as experiences of the apathetic soul were not called simply emotions. John Cassian made this combination of divine love with freedom from mundane emotions known in Western monasticism. It was employed in influential treatises by Gregory the Great and Bernard of Clairvaux. While this approach was also present in the Cappadocian fathers and Augustine, they stressed the importance of Platonic control and moderation in everyday life to their non-monastic audience.

The monastic literature on mystical ascent developed introspective analysis of subjective feeling, which Bernard of Clairvaux called the sense of being affected by divine action (sentit intra se actitari, Opera II, 10, 28–29; Köpf 1980: 136–174). Many later theologians such as Albert the Great and Thomas Aquinas wrote commentaries on the Pseudo-Dionysius’s works (late fifth century), which taught on mystical experience from the point of view of Christian Neoplatonism. (For ancient Christian discussions, see Hadot 1995; Knuuttila 2004; for Augustine, see also Byers 2013; Gao 2018; for Gregory the Great, see Straw 1988; Humphries 2013; for medieval commentaries of Pseudo-Dionysius, see Coakley and Stang (eds., 2009); Blankenhorn 2015.

Monastic psychology also made use of the originally Stoic doctrine of first movements, which Origen, followed by Augustine and many others, applied to the Christian conception of sin. The Stoic idea, described by Seneca in On Anger (2.1–4), was that even apathetic people might react quasi-emotionally on exceptional occasions, but this was not really an emotion because it did not involve judgmental assent. Augustine taught that sinful thoughts which easily and frequently came to mind because of original sin became sins through a subsequent assent (Expositio quarundam propositionum ex Epistola ad Romanos, 2066).

According to Augustine’s influential doctrine of sin, the original fall was followed by shame, which Adam and Eve felt when they found themselves being moved by the movements of the lower soul and the body, the functions of which they as rational beings should control. Original disobedience of the higher part of the soul founded the functional mode of the inherited original sin in the sense of penal disobedience of the lower part, the relative autonomy of which continuously reminds humans of their shameful condition of not being what they should be and demands continuous control (Augustine, De civitate Dei, XIV.23). Augustine held that spontaneous emotional agitations are emotions even though they do not involve an assent to the emotional evaluation or its behavioral suggestion. In his view, the Stoics did not refer to these representations as emotions because of their sinful pride, which prevented them from realizing the weakness of the fallen soul in themselves (De civitate Dei IX.4). Augustine thought that the occurrence of evil thoughts and desires is not directly under voluntary control. The temptations are therefore not accountable sins (culpa) before one can in principle expel them from the soul. If this is not immediately done, they can be regarded as being freely consented to (as all sins are) (De sermone Domini in monte, 12.34–35). Augustine’s doctrine of sin was later developed into a detailed theory of the modes of assent as the degrees of venial and mortal sin. As distinct from Augustine, sinfully oriented first movements were increasingly regarded as venial sins even before a free choice. This was also the view of Aquinas. See Knuuttila 2004: 178–192.

Apart from the first sinful movements, love and compassion were other central emotions in medieval theology. Misericordia was a Latin translation of the term eleos used in Greek philosophy and literature. In the Vulgate translation of the Bible, the term misericordia was used of divine mercy as well as of a human emotion of sorrow for the misery of another. Compassio was not a Classical Latin word, but it came to be employed by some Christian authors and then increasingly used. The reason for this new terminology was apparently the need for an unambiguous word that would apply to the human part of the meaning of misericordia which continued to be used as a term with divine and human references. (See Konstan 2001: 106; Konstan 2006: 201-216.) It was usually assumed that God has no emotional sorrow or pity and no other emotion for that matter. Augustine wrote that “pity (misericordia) is a kind of compassion (compassio) in our hearts for the misery of others which compels us to help them if we can” (De civitate Dei IX.5). Gregory the Great’s understanding of compassion was similar to that of Augustine, and he treated it as a Christian sentiment which is included in the virtue of charity love. Because of the influence of Gregory’s works, compassion became a central notion in medieval theology (Straw 2013; Coolman 2008). Quoting Augustine’s definition, Aquinas explains that compassion is an emotion which as such is ethically neutral. When it is connected with charity, it becomes an affective part of misericordia (mercy), a virtuous concern for the miseries of others (Summa theologiae II.2.30). Aquinas writes that a person should be compassionate in affect and helpful in effect (Summa theologiae II-2.45.6, ad 3). (See also Miner 2016.)

2. Early Medieval Discussions

While the works of Augustine, Cassian, and Gregory the Great were among the main sources of the discussion of emotions in early medieval literature, new non-religious impulses were supplied by the Latin translations of some philosophical and medical works. One of these was the translation of the Arabic medical encyclopedia of ‘Alī ibn al-‘Abbās al-Mağūsī (in Latin Haly Abbas), which contained various remarks on the emotions based on Galen’s medical philosophy. The first partial translation by Constantine the African (c. 1080) was called the Pantegni and the complete translation by Stephen of Antioch (1127) the Regalis dispositio. Elements of ancient medical and philosophical theories of the emotions were also included in Nemesius of Emesa’s De natura hominis (17–21) from the late fourth century and John Damascene’s De fide orthodoxa from the eighth century, the latter being much influenced by Nemesius’s work. These treatises were translated into Latin in the eleventh and twelfth centuries. An important early medieval psychological source-book was the sixth book of Avicenna’s Shifā’, translated into Latin in the middle of the twelfth century by Gundisalvi and Avendauth. This translation was called Liber de Anima or Sextus de naturalibus. Avicenna’s work influenced the terminology of early commentaries on Aristotle’s De anima, which became the principal textbook of psychology in the middle of the thirteenth century; Aristotle’s work was translated c. 1150 by James of Venice and 1267 by William of Moerbeke.

Drawing from Aristotelian and Neoplatonic psychology, Avicenna distinguishes between the functions of the soul by attaching them to special powers or faculties. The most relevant in this connection are sensory moving powers and internal senses: common sense, imagery (retention of sensations), estimation, memory, and imagination (separation and combination of sensory forms). Inner senses are non-perceptual apprehensive powers of the sensory soul (De anima IV.1, 1–11; IV.3, 37–40). The moving power of the sensory soul is divided into a commanding power and an executive power, the former of which is the center of emotions. The executive moving power operates through the nervous system and the muscles. It is moved by the commanding moving power, the acts of which are triggered by an occurrent evaluation of estimative power and accompanied by bodily affections as well as behavioral changes, provided that the executive moving power is also actualized. If the commanding act is strong enough, the executive power is necessarily actualized in animals, but not so in humans because they can prevent the impulse of the executive moving power by their will. The will is the moving power of the immaterial intellectual soul. Together with practical intellect, it should control the emotions (De anima I.5, 94; IV.4, 54–56, 59).

The sensory commanding faculty is divided into concupiscible and irascible parts. The reactions of the concupiscible power are desires for things taken to be pleasurable, and the reactions of the irascible power are desires to defeat adversaries and repel harmful things (De anima I.5, 83; IV.4, 56–57). The objects of emotions are recognized as emotionally relevant by the estimative power. By this power, the sheep judges that the wolf is to be avoided, “even though the exterior sense has not previously perceived it”. Avicenna calls the representations of the estimative power “intentions”. The recognition of the intentions is often instinctive in animals, but it is mostly conscious and pre-intellectually conceptual in humans (De anima I.5, 86, 89; IV.1, 7; IV.3. 37–39; see also Black 2000; Hasse 2000: 130–141: Perler 2012). As an occurrent emotion involves acts of separate faculties, there must be some kind of governing awareness which combines these acts (De anima V.7, 158–159; Kitāb al-najāt 2.6.15, trans. Rahman, 64–68); cf. Toivanen and Yrjönsuuri 2014: 441–442).

Avicenna’s theory includes all elements of Aristotelian compositional theory, but he uses the behavioral suggestion as the central factor. For this reason, he does not include pleasure or joy among the concupiscible or irascible emotions, regarding them as affective apprehensive acts. Somewhat strangely, he adds pain or distress to the irascible motive acts such as fear and anger, apparently thinking that they are moving acts and not merely apprehensive (De anima IV.4, 57–59).

While there are emotions common to humans and animals, the human estimative faculty is also a sensory reason, which qualifies its recognizing emotional intentions. Hope and fear with respect to not yet actualized future things, shame at wrong action, and wonder at unusual things presuppose conceptualization that animals lack. It is also human to express wonder by laughing and anxiety by weeping (De anima V.1, 69–76). Avicenna discusses emotions also in his Canon of Medicine, translated into Latin by Gerard of Cremona in the twelfth century. His medical approach to the cardiac and spiritual affects shows similarities to that of the Pantegni. See Knuuttila 2004.

3. New Taxonomical Ideas

Early medieval medical theory of the emotions concentrated on the Galenic ideas of the humors and the system of the spirits, the vitalizing spirits in the heart and the psychic spirits in the nerves and the brain. In the Pantegni (Theor. VI.110–114), the physical aspects of the emotions were dealt with as slow or quick movements of the vital spirits towards the heart or away from it. (See also the translation by Stephen of Antioch, V.38, p. 69.) This led to a popular medical classification of emotions:

Centrifugal Centripedal
Intensity Slow Joy Distress
Quick Anger Fear

John of la Rochelle, a Franciscan theologian, referred to this scheme as a commonly known model in his Summa de anima (1235 [1995: 262]). It was presented as a table with brackets in the sixteenth-century handbook of Jacob Wecker, Medicinae utriusque syntaxes [1576, I.3, p. 181]. For a fourteenth-century formulation, see Maino de Maineri, Regimen sanitatis 3.8, Paris 1506, f. 38v. (Cf. Gil-Sotres 1994.)

Avicenna’s account of emotions was addressed in Dominicus Gundisalvi’s De anima, which consisted to a great extent of texts from the Latin translation of Avicenna’s De anima by Gundisalvi and Avendauth. Almost half of Gundisalvi’s quotations from Avicenna’s account of the sensitive motive acts concern the relationship between the concupiscible and irascible powers and the changes in the heart and the spirits. These were found interesting by the early thirteenth-century Latin authors John Blund and David of Dinant. They took the medical account of the physical aspect of emotions as causally primary, somewhat similarly to the James-Lange theory of emotions, but this was not an influential view (John Blund, Tractatus de anima, 25.380; David of Dinant, Fragmenta Quaternulorum, 36–39, 67–68).

Twelfth-century taxonomical discussions pertained to the division between concupiscible and irascible emotions, which proved to be cumbersome to many authors. A more simple but influential division is found in the small treatise on the nature of love by Hugh of St. Victor (d. 1141), in which he defined love (amor) as a pleasure of the heart which is directed to an object because of that object. It is first a directed affection (affectio) which becomes desire (desiderium) when it moves the subject towards the object and joy (gaudium) when the longing finds its fulfilment (De substantia dilectionis 82, 86). A similar tripartite sequence of appetitive acts was used in thirteenth-century classifications of concupiscible passions. In his The Twelfth Patriarchs, Richard of St. Victor (d. 1173) operates with a list of seven emotions which is not found in other authors: hope, fear, joy, distress, love, hatred, and shame (see Palmén 2014).

Isaac of Stella (d. 1177), a Cistercian theologian, presented an Augustinian classification which combined the Stoic fourfold table with Platonist concepts as follows

Present Anticipated
Faculty Concupiscible (about what is loved) Joy Desire
Irascible (about what is contrary to what is loved) Distress Fear

(Isaac of Stella, Letter on the Soul, 1878d, trans. in McGinn 1977). Isaac’s classification was quoted in the influential twelfth-century pseudo-Augustinian treatise De spiritu et anima (782; cf. 814, trans. in McGinn 1977) and through it in Philip the Chancellor’s Summa de bono (748–749). Before Isaac, the Stoic classification of emotions and the Platonic division of the soul were presented together in William of St. Thierry’s De natura corporis et animae (trans. in McGinn 1977), without an explanation of how they are related to each other (2.88–91). Distress is an irascible emotion in Isaac’s classification, as in Avicenna, but Isaac was influenced by the Latin tradition in which concupiscible emotions are directed to good objects and irascible to harmful ones (Knuuttila 2004: 229). William of St. Thierry writes that anger and love are good irascible dispositions of a pious soul and match together because of the fervor of love and the hatred of vices. Bernard of Clairvaux similarly classified joy and anger as irascible passions. (Opera V, 358–359). For the Cistercian list of affects, see also Boquet 2005.

These considerations show some uncertainty about how to combine various classificatory ideas. When Aristotle’s account became better known in the early thirteenth century, it was realized that the twelfth-century divisions between concupiscible and irascible emotions were not compatible with Aristotle’s idea of the contrary emotions of the same part of the soul. (See John Blund’s somewhat complicated attempt to solve this problem in Tractatus de anima 18–22.) An influential new taxonomic idea was introduced as a solution in the 1220s. (See the anonymous treatises De anima et potentiis eius, 47–48, and De potentiis animae et obiectis, 159, 164, as well as Philip the Chancellor, Summa de bono, 161). It was held that the objects of the contrary concupiscible acts were simply pleasurable or painful, and the objects of the irascible acts were also arduous (arduum), difficult to obtain or to avoid.

A detailed early thirteenth-century classification on the basis of the notion of arduum with contrary emotions was developed in John of la Rochelle’s Summa de anima. He regarded emotions as the acts of two moving powers, the concupiscible and irascible, both with several types of reaction divided into contrary pairs. The concupiscible pairs are associated with the contrary dispositions of liking (placentia) or disliking (displicentia) and irascible emotions with strength (corroboratio) and weakness (debilitas). These correspond to different types of estimative acts which are their causes. The new systematic idea was to use these dispositions of feeling and corresponding behavior reactions as classificatory principles. The emotions of the concupiscible power are classified as follows:

Liking Disliking
Self-regarding reactions first orientation appetite distaste
action initiation desire aversion
towards results joy pain
towards durable results delight distress
Other-regarding reactions towards another person who experiences: good love envy
evil hate pity

Pity and envy were treated as different forms of other-regarding distress in Nemesius of Emesa (c. 19) and John Damascene (c. 28); for pity, compassion and mercy, see also Aquinas, Summa theologiae II-2, 30. Love as liking with respect to another person’s prosperity was also a traditional characterization (cf. Aristotle, Rhet. II.4). The somewhat less used idea of hate as liking with respect to another person’s troubles was included in Calcidius’s Latin list of emotions in his commentary on the Timaeus (216–217). Liking and disliking were also used as principles in Radulfus Ardens’s late twelfth-century classification that otherwise was closer to the approach of Isaac of Stella (Speculum universale, book V).

Of irascible emotions with the “arduous and difficult objects”, ambition and hope pertain to future honor and prosperity, hope involving the belief that they will be achieved. The opposites of these are poverty of spirit and desperation. Three emotions, pride, lust for power, and contempt, are associated with attempts to strengthen one’s social rank and power. The opposite of pride and lust for power is humility, and the opposite of contempt is reverence. Of the acts directed towards evil things, courage is a desire to meet the enemy with confidence, anger is a desire for revenge, and magnanimity is rising up against evil. Three forms of the flight from evil are somehow opposites of courage: penitence toward past evil things, impatience with present evil things, and fear of future evil things.

Strength Weakness
ambition poverty of spirit
hope desperation
pride humility
lust for power
contempt reverence
courage fear penitence impatience

See Summa de anima, 256–262; Knuuttila 2004: 230–236; Knuuttila 2016. A more theological discussion of concupiscible and irascible emotions is found in William of Auvergne’s roughly contemporary De virtutibus, chs. 16–18. For a twelfth-century treatise on pride and humility, see Bernard of Clairvaux, On the Degrees of Humility and Pride (Opera III, 13–59).

4. Albert the Great, Bonaventure and Thomas Aquinas

Following Avicenna’s faculty psychology and the new division between concupiscible and irascible emotions, Albert the Great and Thomas Aquinas treated emotions as acts of the sensory moving powers. While Albert employed the Stoic-based classifications of Nemesius of Emesa and John Damascene in his works (De homine q. 66–67; De bono 3.5.2–3), Thomas Aquinas put forward a new taxonomy (Summa theologiae II-1, 22–48) which was probably influenced by John of la Rochelle. Albert argued that emotions should be regarded as qualities as Aristotle described them in Categories 8 (De bono 3.5.1, 3.5.3). Aquinas defended the characterization of them as movements of the soul, finding the basic classificatory principles of emotions in Aristotle’s doctrine of contrary movements in Physics V.5. Bonaventure differed from these authors in relativizing the difference between sensory and intellectual moving powers and attributing emotions to the intellectual soul in a proper sense and not merely metaphorically as was traditionally done. In addressing the soul of Christ in the third book of his Commentary on the Sentences, Bonaventure argues that there were concupiscible and irascible parts in Christ’s intellectual will as well as passions of joy and distress. Similar ideas were also put forward earlier in the so-called Summa Halensis (Bonaventure, Sent. III.16.2.1 (354); III.33.1.3 (717); see also Prentice 1957; Vaura 2017). Even though Bonaventure’s account remained sketchy, it influenced the Franciscan view of the emotions of the will that came to be more systematically analyzed by John Duns Scotus.

In discussing emotions in Summa theologiae II-1.22–48, Aquinas first divided them in terms of their generic objects: the concupiscible emotions react to what seems good or evil at the sensory level, whereas the irascible emotions react to arduous sense-good and sense-evil. The sensory moving faculties are activated by objects through cognition, and the modes of the resulting emotional movements serve as further qualifications in defining particular emotions. In employing the Avicennian conception of the estimative power that grasps the emotionally relevant aspects of objects, Aquinas says that this could be called particular reason in humans (Summa theologiae I.78.4) The recognizable evaluative property (such as being dangerous) could be called the formal object of emotion (Summa theologiae II-1.43.1; cf. Kenny 1963: 189; King 2011).

In his attempt to classify emotions with the help of Aristotle’s physical theory of movements, Aquinas distinguishes between two types of the contraries of movements: the approach to something and retreat from it, and movements associated with contrary endpoints. The contrary movements of the concupiscible power are of the second type, towards contrary ends (sense-good and sense-evil). The contrary movements of the irascible power are of the first type, with respect to the same objects.

Aquinas classifies (1) love, (2) desire and (3) pleasure or joy as the three self-regarding concupiscible emotions with respect to the sense-good; the contrary movements with respect to sense-evil are (4) hate, (5) aversion and (6) pain or distress. As for the irascible emotions, the arduous future sense-good may give rise to (7) hope or (8) despair, the arduous future sense-evil to (9) fear or (10) courage, and the arduous present sense-evil to (11) anger—this is without a contrary pair (Summa theologiae II-1. 24.2–4, 25.2; see also King 1999.)

Aquinas’s attempt to combine the Avicennian view of emotions as the act of the sensory moving power with Aristotle’s doctrine of movement involves some theoretical problems. In distinguishing between love, desire and pleasure as the incipient movement, actual movement, and rest, Aquinas treats emotions as the behavioral changes that the moving power is supposed to cause rather than the moving acts themselves (Summa theologiae II-1. 25.2; for moving acts, see 30.2; 23.4.) This is confusing, but he apparently assumes that the various acts of the moving power could be distinguished as causing various behavioral movements if these are not prevented. Aquinas also distinguishes between the formal constituent of emotion, which is the generic content of emotional evaluation, and the material constituent, which is the particular intentional object, and further between the movements of the moving power that constitute the form of emotions with respect to their material constituents such as the movements of the heart, the spirits and the humors (Summa theologiae II-1. 28.5, 30.2, 43.1, 44.1). The behavioral movements to which Aristotle’s physics is applied are not mentioned in these contexts. Emotions are essentially psychosomatic in Aquinas, and thus not possible for bodiless beings such as God and angels (Summa theologiae II-1.22.3).

As for pleasure and distress, Aquinas explains that while one might speak about a stone as loving its natural place and desiring to be there, it does not make sense to speak about the pleasure or pain of a stone because it does not feel. He holds that pleasure or distress is a pleasant or unpleasant awareness and this is an aspect of emotions in general since some kind of pleasure is involved in positive emotions and some kind of pain in negative ones (Summa theologiae II-1.43.1). Giles of Rome, who mostly followed Aquinas’s taxonomy, remarked that pleasure and distress as emotions are states of having moved rather than movements. He also wanted to add meekness, an opposite to anger in Aquinas’s taxonomy (see Marmo 1991).

Aquinas’s discussion of emotions, the most extensive in medieval literature, involves detailed terminological, psychological and ethical remarks on each emotion type. Like all medieval authors, Aquinas argues that the intellectual soul should keep emotions under strict control, but he also criticized the Stoic apatheia and Plotinus’s version of the freedom from emotions (Summa theologiae II-1.24.3, 59.2, 61.5). As in Aristotle, the virtues of the sensory soul are habits to feel emotions in accordance with the judgments of practical reason. Emotions themselves do not provide a sufficient guidance for a good life. Aquinas’s theory and taxonomy were very influential until the seventeenth century. (For medieval discussions from Avicenna to Aquinas, see Knuuttila 2004; for Aquinas, see also King 1999, 2002, 2010, 2011; Lombardo 2011; Miner 2009; Murphy 1999; for the discussion of the sensory passions in Christ, see Gondreau 2002; Madigan 2007.)

5. John Duns Scotus and Late Medieval Discussions

John Duns Scotus regarded the taxonomies based on the notion of arduousness as artificial and criticized the influential Avicennian idea that there are “intentions” in things which can be grasped by an estimative power and then move the motive power. He argued that representations of a certain kind cause learned or instinctual behavioral changes in some animals and others in others, this being a matter of law-like fact. A sheep naturally flees from a wolf which it perceives, not its inner hostility recognized by the inner sense as in Avicenna; it even flees from a peaceful sheep which looks like a wolf (Ordinatio I.3.1.1–2, p. 43–44; III.15, 42–43, p. 495–496; III.34, 35–38, p. 193–196; cf. Perler 2012). The influential part of Scotus’s approach to emotions was his systematic discussion of the Franciscan position of postulating the passions of the will, which appears in the discussion of the emotions of Christ. This was also where Scotus developed his theory of emotions. According to Scotus, when one is aware of the actuality of what was desired or its contrary, “there follows a passion of the will, joy or distress, which is caused by the object present in this way”. These passions are not directly caused by free will (Ordinatio III.15, 48, p. 498). Even though joy or distress are acts of the will in the sense of being actual states of the intellectual moving power, they are passions in the sense of having an external efficient cause and not being free acts of the will. This corresponds to the traditional view of emotions as passive reactions.

Scotus’s longer list of the factors which are sufficient to cause distress as a passion of the will involves the apprehension that what takes place is (1) what one actually wills against, (2) against the natural inclination to happiness (affectio commodi) even though no particular act of will is actual, (3) against sensory desire, (4) in accordance to what is reluctantly willed in circumstances in which the opposite is preferred but cannot be achieved (velleitas). There are corresponding factors which are sufficient to cause pleasure, the other passion of the will (Ordinatio III.15, 60, p. 505). The intellectual soul is consequently regarded as very emotional—its feelings are changed by the influence of actual volitions or nolitions as well as by the inclinations of the will and the sensory part of the soul. Since these states considerably influence people’s activities as motivations or hindrances, moral education should give strength to the natural inclination to justice (affectio iustitiae) and good moral habits. New habits of will change the condition for feeling pleasure and distress (cf. Boulnois 2003; Knuuttila 2012; Drummond 2012). Scotus treated liking and disliking (complacentia and displicentia), the unpremeditated first orientations of the will and necessary concomitants of its other acts, as analogous to sensory emotional reactions except that they were free acts. These not yet efficacious acts could be directly controlled, as distinct from the passions of the will. John Buridan, who otherwise followed Scotus’s analysis, stated that liking and disliking were not free acts and in this respect were similar to sensory emotions (Quaestiones super decem libros Ethicorum, X.2). Buridan’s revision increased the number of non-free emotional phenomena of the will, but the tendency to apply emotion terminology to the will took other forms as well. Ockham followed Scotus’s view of pleasure and distress as the passions of the will, though he restricted their conditions to the first and fourth case in Scotus’s list. But he also explained that “a passion is a form distinct from a cognition, which exists in the appetitive power as its subject and requires a cognition for its existence” (Quodlibet II.17, p. 186).

If this was a considered view, it made all occurrent volitions passions, whether free or not (see Hirvonen 2004; Perler 2017). Is Ockham speaking about passions or “pseudopassions”? King (2012) and Miner (2009) use this term in discussing Aquinas’s remarks on volitions as dispassionate passions. Since Ockham often employed Scotus’s account of pleasure and distress as the passions of the will, it is possible that his definition of passion was somewhat sketchy and not meant to introduce a new semantics for the term “passion” after all. However, Adam Wodeham, his younger colleague and collaborator, argues that volitions and nolitions are evaluative cognitions to which all human passions can be reduced because of the unity of the soul. An occurrent volition or nolition has a cognition as a partial cause to which the evaluation pertains. This cognitive account of emotions shows some similarities with the Stoic theory, but there seems to be no historical connection to it (Lectura secunda, prol. q. 1, secs. 2, 5–6; d. 1, q. 5, secs. 4–5, 11; cf. Knuuttila 2004: 275–282; a different interpretation in Pickavé 2012).

Many theologians criticized the postulation of the real distinction between love and pleasure in beatific vision (fruitio) by Scotus and Ockham who argued for this position because love is a free act of the will, but pleasure is not. The opposite view was particularly stressed by Peter Auriol who held that all intellectual pleasures are free acts of the will and love and pleasure are indistinguishable in the fulfilment of beatific vision. Auriol was followed by Wodeham and Walter Chatton with respect to the fruition, but not with finite objects. Scotus and Ockham offered various examples for the distinction between the fulfilment of love and the experience of pleasure, one of these being the successful action of the evil angel without pleasure (see Kitanov 2014).

Late medieval philosophical compendia on emotions includes Peter of Ailly’s influential Tractatus de anima (c. 1380), which eclectically employs the views of the anonymous thirteenth-century compilation of the views of Albert the Great, Summa naturalium, and Gregory of Rimini’s brief remarks on the theories of Scotus, Ockham, Auriol, and Wodeham on the passions of the will and the relationship between love and pleasure. Ailly’s work was one of the sources for introductions used in psychology teaching at the universities such as the Erfurtian treatises by John of Lutrea and Bartholomeus Arnoldi of Usingen in the late fifteenth- and early sixteenth-century (Kärkkäinen, 2009). Usingen applied the Buridanian version of the psychology of complacentia and displicentia and regarded them as non-accountable first movements (Saarinen 2011: 106–107). John Gerson’s treatises on emotions included long lists of passions classified under the eleven types of Aquinas’s taxonomy (Oeuvres IX, 1–25, 155–61).

Medieval theories of emotions were also discussed in many influential sixteenth-century scholastic works such as Gabriel Biel’s Collectorium on Peter Lombard’s Sentences and the commentaries on Aquinas’s Summa theologiae by Cardinal Cajetan, Bartholomé de Medina, and Francisco Suárez, often comparing the theories of Scotus and Aquinas. John of la Rochelle’s taxonomy of emotions was also known through a paraphrase in Gregor Reisch’s popular early sixteenth-century encyclopedia Margarita philosophica (12.4–5). Among the most discussed medieval theories in early modern thought were Aquinas’s taxonomy on emotions and Scotus’s theory of the passions of the will, both commented on by Suárez (King 2002; Knuuttila 2004, 2012).


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