Notes to The Metaphysics of Mass Expressions

1. Although some include them too. See Mill’s Logic pp.30–31, and Lowe 1995b, entry on “Things.”

2. Strawson 1995, p.137, 227. Parsing and quote from Laycock 2005, p. 63.

3. See Section 2.4 of Hylton, Peter and Gary Kemp, “Willard Van Orman Quine”, The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Spring 2020 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.), URL = <>.

4. An unfortunate choice of terminology, and not to be confused with the sense of a kind of material. As noted in the entry on substance, “The philosophical term ‘substance’ corresponds to the Greek ousia, which means ‘being’, transmitted via the Latin substantia, which means ‘something that stands under or grounds things.’” So, it should be looked at as a term of art, not univocal with, or an analysis of, the English word ‘substance.’

5. For an example of (i), see Sidelle 1989; for (ii), see Horgan & Potrč 2008 or Jubien 1993, for (iii) Markosian 2004, section 2.

6. Although this is often a matter of degree, since, for example, one cannot divide an H2O molecule in half and be left with water, and one can divide a number line and have two number lines. These issues are dealt with in Section 4 and the Supplement on Non-Atomicity.

7. See, e.g., Quirk et al. 1985 where an entirely lexical/syntactic distinction between mass and count is attempted, vs. criticisms of this as in Pelletier 2011, §2.3.

8. See Pelletier 1975; and Koslicki 1999, section II, for details on this issue.

9. For work on mass noun taxonomy, see Huddleston & Pullum 2002 ch. 5; Koslicki 1999; Nicolas 2002; and Pelletier & Schubert 1989/2002 pp. 2–26.

10. These are even sometimes referred to as ‘fake mass nouns,’ or, less tendentiously, ‘object mass nouns.’ See Chierchia 1998a,b; Gillon 1992, 1999; Barner & Snedeker 2005; and Rothstein 2017.

11. A distinction could still be maintained between kinds (a) and (b) without denying the former their +MASS/-COUNT status, by adding qualifications, e.g. in Landman 2011, who distinguishes between ‘neat mass nouns’ and ‘mess mass nouns’, and Huddleston & Pullum 2002 who distinguish between ‘aggregate terms’ and true mass terms; each of which corresponds to (a) and (b) above, respectively.

12. As well as issues having to do with whether there is something like a mass/count distinction that tracks the process/event distinction. See Steward 2015 and its bibliography for some details on this issue.

13. For example, the common kinds of analyses of “gold is not iron” analyze both ‘gold’ and ‘iron’ as referencing any and all portions of matter that they apply to and unpack the non-identity claim in terms of non-overlap of those portions. And “this ring is gold,” according to some treatments, takes the ring as a thing and analyzes the whole phrase as expressing a one-one relation of constitution of a thing by some stuff, or a one-many relation of composition of a thing by many things (gold atoms). These treatments, whether they are successful or not, come readily to mind and are easy to understand and prima facie plausible. But there are no corresponding ready-to-mind, easy to state, and prima facie plausible analyses available for grammatically similar relations between abstract stuff and (some other) abstract stuff (“phlogiston is not kryptonite,” “disinformation is still information”) or psychological ‘stuffs’ (“knowledge is only part of wisdom”) and so on. Likely this has to do with ordinary objects and matter occupying time and space in paradigmatic ways, whereas the referents of psychological, quantitative, and abstract count- and mass-expressions do not straightforwardly do so (even if, ultimately, they are physical as well).

14. Although, in an attenuated sense even a simple object has at least one part—itself. The everyday notion of ‘part’ implies that any part is smaller than the whole thing it is part of. Philosophers and logicians use the term of art ‘proper part’ to mean what the folk mean by ‘part’. We will follow ordinary usage, using ‘part’ to mean ‘proper part’.

15. See Bowers 2019, Carmichael 2015, Gamper 2019, Kriegel 2008, Markosian 2014, McKenzie & Muller 2017, Parsons 2013, Rocha 2019, Steen 2017, Torre 2015, and Waechter and Ladyman 2019, among others.

16. Cf. Cartwright 1965, 1975 etc. regarding ‘quantities,’ and Laycock 2006a for doubts about sums and mereology as applied to matter. For other critiques of unrestricted mereology, especially how it tends towards skepticism about familiar objects, see Elder 2004 and 2013, and Korman 2016.

17. Cf. Chappell 1970 on the ‘form indifference’ of matter; Steen 2008 on ‘bare objects’, esp. pp. 7–8; Jubien’s ‘Q-objects’ in 2009 ch 1; see Casati 2005, pp. 573–574, and Spelke 1990 for a contrast class. Complications having to do with the relation of time to fusions and fusing and the possibility of ‘gunk,’ or, matter whose parts all have parts ad infinitum, are glossed over here.

18. There are other arguments for unrestricted mereology, such as the ‘Argument From Vagueness’ of Ted Sider (2001, chapter 4), which was inspired by the Lewisian idea (1986, pp. 212–213) that any restriction on composition would entail indeterminacy in what exists, which is impossible. In addition, any restriction on composition would be unacceptably arbitrary and anthropocentric, and so there is no such restriction on this count as well. For a look at one criticism of the argument, and one extension of it, see Varzi (2005) and Kurtsal (2021), respectively.

19. This brings up issues and objections that will be covered later, such as the Supplement on Challenges to Mereological Essentialism for Masses, and the Supplement on Sums and Ordinary Objects. The foregoing argument is not intended to convince interlocutors who doubt the existence of Mere Sums—it is merely teasing out implications of the conception of a Mere Sum, and, as stated, assumes there are Mere Sums. Glossed over here is that this argument presupposes Extensional Mereology. (See section 3.2 of the Mereology entry for details). It also begs various questions against those who may deny Mere Sums, e.g. some interpretations of hylomorphism (cf. Koslicki 2018) and certain mereological views which include forms as parts of mereological sums (cf. ibid, ch. 6; Paul 2002).

20. The story is more complicated than this. See the entry on material constitution for more details. The focus here is on issues in material constitution especially salient for those who ‘take stuff seriously’ and hold identity to be absolute.

21. For a classic statement of the ‘ontological innocence’ of mereology, see (Lewis 1991, p.81). See Baxter 1988 and 1998 for early developments of many-one identity and composition-as-identity, and (Wallace 2011a & 2011b) for a survey of the literature. On some views, e.g. (Fine 2001 & 2009) and (Cameron 2008) we measure ontological commitment by only measuring commitment to fundamental entities, any other construction or summing out of these not being anything in addition to the fundamental entities posited. See, also, the entry on ontological commitment.

22. To be clear, Horgan & Potrč do not really have an ontological commitment to ‘stuff’, although they use the idea illustratively sometimes. Rather, they talk about properties in spatiotemporal regions of the ‘blobject’ instead of objects. This view is cited because the semantic theses in 2008 are the kinds a Stuff Ontologist would like to help themselves to. (We can see similar semantic moves that might appeal to the Stuff Ontologist in O’Leary-Hawthorne & Cortens’ “Towards Ontological Nihilism” (1995)). There are related views which should not be conflated with the view that there is only World-Stuff, namely, (i) various kinds of Existence Monism (which view reality as particular—it’s just that there is only one particular—the Cosmos), or (ii) Nihilism—i.e. various views that nothing at all exists (cf. O’Leary-Hawthorne & Cortens 1995, Turner 2011, 2016; and Nagarjunan Sunyata (‘Emptiness’)). For a modern version of Existence Monism, see Schaffer 2010a and 2010b. But there is also a 1000-year-old tradition of Existence Monism in Advaitan Vedantic Hinduism, and one could interpret Spinoza as an Early Modern Monist. (See Goff 2012). But both World-Stuff views and Monistic ones who also want to be compatible with commonsense views of ordinary objects would likely avail themselves of similar paraphrase strategies, since ordinary objects on either view are non-individuate ‘part-portions’ of a larger whole (Monism) or the non-particular World-Stuff.

23. This is not to deny that there may be other bases for a strong stuff/thing distinction.

24. For example, the notion of ‘fake mass nouns’ (Moltmann 2020, ch.1) or ‘count mass nouns’ (Chierchia 2021) has not quite found traction in the metaphysical work on stuff vs things.

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