Necessary and Sufficient Conditions
A handy tool in the search for precise definitions is the specification of necessary and/or sufficient conditions for the application of a term, the use of a concept, or the occurrence of some phenomenon or event. For example, without water and oxygen, there would be no human life; hence these things are necessary conditions for the existence of human beings. Cockneys, according to the traditional definition, are all and only those born within the sound of the Bow Bells. Hence birth within the specified area is both a necessary and a sufficient condition for being a Cockney.
Like other fundamental concepts, the concepts of necessary and sufficient conditions cannot be readily specified in other terms. This article shows how elusive the quest is for a definition of the terms “necessary” and “sufficient”, indicating the existence of systematic ambiguity in the concepts of necessary and sufficient conditions. It also describes the connection between puzzles over this issue and troublesome issues surrounding the word “if” and its use in conditional sentences.
- 1. Philosophy and Conditions
- 2. The Standard Theory: Truth-functions and Reciprocity
- 3. Problems for the Standard Theory
- 4. Inferences, Reasons for Thinking, and Reasons Why
- 5. Conclusion
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
1. Philosophy and Conditions
An ambition of twentieth-century philosophy was to analyse and refine the definitions of significant terms—and the concepts expressed by them—in the hope of casting light on the tricky problems of, for example, truth, morality, knowledge and existence that lay beyond the reach of scientific resolution. Central to this goal was specifying at least in part the conditions to be met for correct application of terms, or under which certain phenomena could truly be said to be present. Even now, philosophy’s unique contribution to interdisciplinary studies of consciousness, the evolution of intelligence, the meaning of altruism, the nature of moral obligation, the scope of justice, the concept of pain, the theory of perception and so on still relies on its capacity to bring high degrees of conceptual exactness and rigour to discussions in these areas.
If memory is a capacity for tracking our own past experiences and witnessings then a necessary condition for Penelope remembering giving a lecture is that it occurred in the past. Contrariwise, that Penelope now remembers the lecture is sufficient for inferring that it was given in the past. In a well-known attempt to use the terminology of necessary and sufficient conditions to illuminate what it is for one thing to be cause of another thing, J. L. Mackie proposes that causes are at a minimum INUS conditions, that is, “Insufficient but Necessary parts of a condition which is itself Unnecessary but Sufficient” for their effects (Mackie 1965). A schema like Mackie’s became the foundation for the “sufficient cause model” of disease in epidemiology (see Rothman 1976) and continues to have influence on medical thinking about disease causation, as well as on definitions of causation in psychology and law (VanderWeele 2017).
What, then, is a necessary (or a sufficient) condition? This article describes the difficulties in providing complete precision in answering this question. Although the notion of sufficient condition can be used in defining what a necessary condition is (and vice versa), there appears to be no straightforward way to give a comprehensive and unambiguous account of the meaning of the term “necessary (or sufficient) condition” itself.
2. The Standard Theory: Truth-functions and Reciprocity
The front door is locked. In order to open it in a normal way and get into the house, I must first use my key. A necessary condition of opening the door, without violence, then, is to use the key. So it seems true that
- If I opened the door, I used the key.
Can we use the truth-functional understanding of “if” to propose that the consequent of any conditional (in (i), the consequent is “I used the key”) specifies a necessary condition for the truth of the antecedent (in (i), “I opened the door”)? Many logic and critical thinking texts use just such an approach, and for convenience it can be called “the standard theory” (see Blumberg 1976, pp. 133–4, Hintikka and Bachman 1991, p. 328, Moore and Parker 2009, 310–11, and Southworth and Swoyer 2020, ch. 3.2 for examples of this approach).
The standard theory makes use of the fact that in classical logic, the truth-function “p ⊃ q” (“If p, q”) is false only when p is true and q is false. The relation between “p” and “q” in this case is sometimes referred to as material implication (see the entry on the logic of conditionals). On this account of “if p, q”, if the conditional “p ⊃ q” is true, and p holds, then q also holds; likewise if q is false, then p must also be false (if the conditional is true). The standard theory claims that when the conditional “p ⊃ q” is true the truth of the consequent, “q”, is necessary for the truth of the antecedent, “p”, and the truth of the antecedent is in turn sufficient for the truth of the consequent. This reciprocal relation between necessary and sufficient conditions matches the formal equivalence between a conditional formula and its contrapositive (“~q ⊃ ~p” is the contrapositive of “p ⊃ q”). Descending from talk of truth of statements to speaking about states of affairs, we can equally correctly say, on the standard theory, that using the key was a necessary condition of opening the door.
Given the standard theory, necessary and sufficient conditions are converses of each other: B’s being a necessary condition of A is equivalent to A’s being a sufficient condition of B (and vice versa). So it seems that any truth-functional conditional sentence states both a sufficient and a necessary condition as well. Suppose that if Nellie is an elephant, then she has a trunk. Being an elephant is a sufficient condition of her having a trunk; having a trunk in turn is a necessary condition of Nellie’s being an elephant. Indeed, the claim about the necessary condition appears to be another way of putting the claim about the sufficient condition, just as the contrapositive of a formula is logically equivalent to the original formula.
It is also possible—according the the standard theory—to use “only if” to identify a necessary condition: we can say that Jonah was swallowed by a whale only if he was swallowed by a mammal, for if a creature is not a mammal, it is not a whale. Equivalent to (i) above, on this account, is the sentence “I opened the door only if I used the key”—a perfectly natural way of indicating that use of the key was necessary for opening the door.
This account of necessary and sufficient conditions is particularly apposite in dealing with logical inferences. For example, from the truth of a conjunction, it can be inferred that each component is true (if “p and q” is true, then “p” is true and “q” is true). Suppose, then, that it is true that it is both raining and sunny. This is a sufficient condition for “it is raining” to be true. That it is raining is—contrariwise—a necessary condition for it being true that it is both raining and sunny. A similar account seems to work for conceptual and definitional contexts. So if the concept of memory is analysed as the concept of a faculty for tracking actual past events, the fact that an event is now in the past is a necessary condition of my presently recollecting it. If water is chemically defined as a liquid constituted mainly of H2O, then if a glass contains water, it contains mainly H2O. That the glass contains mostly H2O is a necessary condition of its containing water.
Despite its initial appeal, objections to the standard theory have been made by theorists from both philosophy and linguistics. In summary, the objections build on the idea that “if” in English does not always express a uniform kind of condition. If different kinds of conditions are expressed by the word “if”, the objectors argue, then it would be wise to uncover these before engaging in attempts to formalize and systematize the concepts of necessary and sufficient. In trying to show that there is an ambiguity infecting “if”-sentences in English, critics have focused on two doctrines they regard as mistaken: first, that there is a reciprocity between necessary and sufficient conditions, and, second, that “if p, q” and “p only if q” are equivalent.
3. Problems for the Standard Theory
Given any two true sentences A and B, the conditional “If A, then B” is true. For example, provided it is true that the sun is made of gas and also true that elephants have four legs, then the truth-functional conditional “If elephants have four legs, then the sun is made of gas” is also true. However, the gaseous nature of the sun would not normally be regarded as either a conceptually, or even a contingently, necessary condition of the quadripedality of elephants. Indeed, according to the standard theory, any truth will be a necessary condition for the truth of every statement whatsoever, and any falsehood will be a sufficient condition for the truth of any statement we care to consider.
These odd results do not arise in some non-classical logics where it is required that premisses be relevant to the conclusions drawn from them, and that the antecedents of true conditionals are likewise relevant to the consequents. But even in those versions of relevance logic which avoid some of these odd results, it is difficult to avoid all of the so-called “paradoxes of implication”(see the entry on the logic of conditionals and relevance logic). For example, a contradiction (a statement of the form “p and not p”) will be a sufficient condition for the truth of any statement unless the semantics for the logic in question allow the inclusion of inconsistent worlds.
These oddities might be dismissed as mere anomalies were it not for the fact that writers have identified a number of other problems associated with the ideas of reciprocity and equivalence mentioned at the end of the previous section. According to the standard theory, there is a kind of reciprocity between necessary and sufficient conditions, and “if p, q” sentences can always be paraphrased by “p only if q” ones. However, as writers in linguistics have observed, neither of these claims matches either the most natural understanding of necessary (or sufficient) conditions, or the behaviour of “if” (and “only if”) in English. Consider, for example, the following case (drawn from McCawley 1993, p. 317):
- If you touch me, I’ll scream.
While in the case of (i) above, using the key was necessary for opening the door, no parallel claim seems to work for (ii): in the natural reading of this statement, my screaming is not a condition for your touching me. James McCawley claims that the “if”-clause in a standard English statement gives the condition—whether epistemic, temporal or causal—for the truth of the “then”-clause. The natural interpretation of (ii) is that my screaming depends on your touching me. To take my screaming as a necessary condition for your touching me seems to get the dependencies back to front. A similar concern arises if it is maintained that (ii) entails that you will touch me only if I scream.
A similar failure of reciprocity or mirroring arises in the case of the door example ((i) above). While opening the door depended, temporally and causally, on using the key first, it would be wrong to think that using the key depended, either temporally or causally, on opening the door. So what kind of condition does the antecedent state? It may be helpful to consider the following puzzling pair of conditional sentences (a modification of Sanford 1989, 175–6):
- If he learns to play, I’ll buy Lambert a cello.
- Lambert learns to play only if I buy him a cello.
Notice that these two statements are not equivalent in meaning, even though the standard theory treats “if p, q” as just another way of saying “p only if q”. While (iii) states a condition under which I buy Lambert a cello (presumably he first learns by using a borrowed one, or maybe he hires one), (iv) states a (necessary) condition of Lambert learning to play the instrument in the first place (there may be others too). Understood this way, the statements taken together leave poor old Lambert with no prospect of ever getting the cello from me. But if (iv) were just equivalent to (iii), combining the two statements would not lead to an impasse like this.
But how else can we formulate (iii) in terms of “only if”? A natural English equivalent is surprisingly hard to formulate. Perhaps it would be something like:
- Lambert has learned to play the cello only if I have bought him one.
where the auxiliary (“has”/“have”) has been introduced to try to keep dependencies in order. Yet (v) is not quite right, for it can be read as implying that Lambert’s success is dependent on my having first bought him a cello—something that is certainly not implied in (iii). A still better (but not completely satisfactory) version requires further adjustment of the auxiliary, say:
- Lambert will have learned to play the cello only if I have bought him one.
This time, it is not so easy to read (vi) as implying that I bought Lambert a cello before he learned to play. These changes in the auxiliary (sometimes described as changes in “tense”) have led some writers to argue that conditionals in English involve implicit quantification across times (see, for example, von Fintel 1998).
An alternative view is that different kinds of dependency are expressed by use of the conditional construction: (iv) is not equivalent to (iii) because the consequent of (iii) provides what might be called a reason for thinking that Lambert has learned to play the cello. By contrast, the very same condition—that I buy Lambert a cello—appears to fulfil a different function in (iv) (namely that I first have to buy him a cello before he learns to play). In the following section, the possibility of distinguishing between different kinds of conditions is discussed. The existence of such distinctions would seem to provide some evidence for a systematic ambiguity about the meaning of “if” and in the concepts of necessary (and sufficient) condition.
The possibility of ambiguity in these concepts raises a further problem for the standard theory. According to it—as Georg Henrik von Wright points out (von Wright 1974, 7)—the notions of necessary condition and sufficient condition are themselves interdefinable:
A is a sufficient condition of B =df the absence of A is a necessary condition of the absence of B
B is a necessary condition of A =df the absence of B is a sufficient condition of the absence of A
Ambiguity would threaten this neat interdefinability. In the following section, we will explore whether there is an issue of concern here. The possibility of such ambiguity figures in work by Peter Downing on so-called “subjunctive” conditionals (Downing1959) and is explored subsequently as a more general problem in Wilson (1979), Goldstein et al. (2005), ch. 6, and later writers. The general argument, in brief, is that in some contexts there is a lack of reciprocity between necessary and sufficient conditions understood in a certain way, while in other situations the conditions do relate reciprocally to each other in the way required by the standard theory. If ambiguity is present, then there is no general conclusion that can safely be drawn about reciprocity, or lack of it, between necessary and sufficient conditions. Instead there will be a need to distinguish the sense of condition that is being invoked in a particular context. Without specification of meaning and context, it would also be wrong to make the general claim that sentences like “if p, q” are generally paraphrasable as “p only if q”. The philosophical literature contains numerous ways to make sense of the lack of reciprocity between the two kinds of conditions. Using a semi-formal argument, Carsten Held, for example, has suggested a way of explaining why necessary and sufficient conditions are not converses by making appeal to a version of truthmaker theory (Held 2016 – see Other Internet Resources). In what follows, the entry focuses on a rather different and possibly more widely accepted approach: the attempt to make sense of the lack of reciprocity in terms of the difference between inferential, evidential and explanatory uses of conditionals.
4. Inferences, Reasons for Thinking, and Reasons Why
Are the following two statements equivalent? (Wertheimer 1968, 363–4):
- The occurrence of a sea battle tomorrow is a necessary and sufficient condition for the truth, today, of “There will be a sea battle tomorrow.”
- The truth, today, of “There will be a sea battle tomorrow” is a necessary and sufficient condition for the occurrence of a sea battle tomorrow.
David Sanford argues that while (vii) is sensible, (viii) “has things backward” (Sanford 1989, 176–7). He writes: “the statement about the battle, if true, is true because of the occurrence of the battle. The battle does not occur because of the truth of the statement” (ibid.) What he may mean is that the occurrence of the battle gives a reason why the statement is true, but it is not conversely the case that the truth of the statement provides any reason why the battle occurred. Of course, people sometimes do undertake actions just to make true what they had formerly said; so there will be unusual cases where the truth of a statement is a reason why an event occurred. But this seems an unlikely reading of the sea battle case.
Now let S be the sentence “There will be a sea battle tomorrow”. If S is true today, it is correct to infer that a sea battle will occur tomorrow. That is, even though the truth of the sentence does not explain the occurrence of the battle, the fact that it is true licenses the inference to the occurrence of the event. Ascending to the purely formal mode (see section 4 of the entry on Rudolf Carnap), we can make the point by explicitly limiting inference relations to ones that hold among sentences or other bearers of truth values. It is perfectly proper to infer from the truth of S today that some other sentence is true tomorrow, such as “there is a sea battle today”. Since “there is a sea battle today” is true tomorrow if and only if there is a sea battle tomorrow, then we can infer from the fact that S is true today that it is true that a sea battle will occur tomorrow.
From this observation, it would appear that there is a gap between what is true of inferences, and what is true of “reason why” relations. There is an inferential sense in which the truth of S is both a necessary and sufficient condition for the occurrence of the sea battle. However, there is an explanatory sense in which the occurrence of the sea battle is necessary and sufficient for the truth of S, but not vice versa. It would appear that in cases like (vii) and (viii) the inferences run in both directions, while explanatory reasons run only one way. Whether we read (vii) as equivalent to (viii) seems to depend on the sense in which the notions of necessary and sufficient conditions are being deployed.
Is it possible to generalize this finding? The door example ((i) above) seems to be a case in point. The fact I used the key gives a reason why I was able to open the door without force. That I opened the door without force gives a ground for inferring that I used the key. Here is a further example from McCawley:
- If Audrey wins the race, we will celebrate.
Audrey’s winning the race is a sufficient condition for us having a celebration, and her winning the race is the reason why we will be celebrating. Our celebration, however, is not likely to be the reason why she wins the race. In what sense then is the celebration a necessary condition of her winning the race? Again, there is a ground for inferring: that we don’t celebrate is a ground for inferring that Audrey didn’t win the race. English time reference appears sensitive to the asymmetry uncovered here, in the way noted in the previous section. The natural way of writing the contrapositive of (ix) is not the literal “If we will not celebrate, then Audrey does not win the race”, but rather something like:
- If we don’t celebrate, Audrey didn’t win the race.
- If we aren’t celebrating, Audrey hasn’t won the race.
- If we don’t celebrate, Audrey can’t have won the race.
Gilberto Gomes (Gomes 2019) discusses in detail a range of cases in which sometimes elaborate paraphrasing of this, and other, kinds can be used to preserve reciprocity between conditionals and their contrapositives.
Ian Wilson (in Wilson 1979) proposes that there are five possible relations symbolised by “if, … then …” including the reason why reading. Subsequent authors have not adopted this proposal, preferring to focus mainly on three of these relations, each of which bears on questions of necessity and sufficiency. First is the implication relation symbolised by the hook operator, “⊃” or perhaps some relevant implication operator. Such an operator captures some inferential relations as already noted. For example, we saw that from the truth of a conjunction, it can be inferred that each component is true (from “p and q”, we can infer that “p” is true and that “q” is true). Hook, or a relevant implication operator, seems to capture one of the relations encountered in the sea battle case, a relation which can be thought of as holding paradigmatically between bearers of truth values, but can also be thought of in terms of states of affairs. For this relation, we are able to maintain the standard theory’s reciprocity thesis with the limitations already noted.
Two further relations, however, are often implicated in reflections on necessary and sufficient conditions. To identify these, consider the different things that can be meant by saying
- If Solange was present, it was a good seminar.
One scenario for (xiii) is the situation where Solange is invariably a lively contributor to any seminar she attends. Moreover, the contributions she makes are always insightful, hence guaranteeing an interesting time for all who attend. In this case, Solange’s presence at least in part explains or is a reason why the seminar was good. Note that some writers distinguish explanatory reasons of this sort from full-bodied explanations (Nebel 2018). A different scenario depicts Solange as someone who has an almost unerring knack for spotting which seminars are going to be good, even though she is not always active in the discussion. Her attendance at a seminar, according to this story, provides a reason for thinking—or is evidence—that the seminar is good. We might say that according to the first story, the seminar is good because Solange is at it. In the second case, Solange is at it because it is good. Examples of this kind were first introduced in Wilson (1979) following on from the attack on the validity of contraposition in Downing (1975). Notice that the hook (as understood in classical logic) does not capture the reason for thinking relation, for it permits any true consequent to be inferred from any other statement whatever. Where the conditional is a reason for thinking relation, then the antecedent must provide some support for the consequent—hence has to provide some supporting evidence for accepting the consequent. A formal exploration of one reason for thinking relation is given in Vincenzo Crupi and Andrea Iacona’s study of the evidential conditional (Crupi and Iacona 2020, and see the fully developed logic of the evidential conditional in Raidl, Iacona and Crupi 2021). These writers treat the reason for thinking or evidentiary relation as one in which the antecedent provides a “reason for accepting” the consequent. See also Igor Douven on the “evidential support thesis” (Douven 2008, 2016).
The reason why and reason for thinking that conditions may help to shed light on the peculiarities encountered earlier. That I opened the door is a reason for thinking that I used the key, not a reason why. In case (iii) above, that he learns to play the instrument is the reason why I will buy Lambert a cello, and that I buy him a cello is (in the same case) a reason for thinking that—but not a reason why—he has learned to play the instrument. Our celebrating is a reason for thinking that Audrey has won the race in case (ix), but is unlikely to be a reason why.
Although there is sometimes a correlation between reasons why, on the one hand, and evidentiary relations, on the other, few generalisations about this can be safely made. If A is a reason why B has occurred (and so perhaps also is evidence that B has occurred), then the occurrence of B will sometimes be a reason for thinking—but not a guarantee—that A has occurred. If A is no more than a reason for thinking that B has occurred, then B will sometimes be a reason why—but not a guarantee that—A has occurred. Going back to example (i) above, my opening the door (without violence) was a reason for thinking, that is to say evidence, that I had used the key. That I used the key, however, was not just a reason for thinking that I had opened the door, but one of the reasons why I was able to open the door. What is important is that the “if” clause of a conditional may do any of three things described in the present section. One of these is well captured by classical truth-functional logic, namely (i) introduce a sentence from which the consequent follows in the way modelled by an operator such as hook. But there are two other jobs that “if” may do as well, namely: (ii) state a reason why what is stated in the consequent is the case; (iii) state a reason for thinking that what is stated in the consequent is the case even when this is not a reason why.
In general, if explanation is directional, it may not seem surprising that when A explains B, it is not usually the case that B, or its negation, is in turn an explanation of A (or its negation). Audrey’s winning the race explains our celebration, but our failure to celebrate is not (normally) a plausible explanation of her failure to win. Solange’s presence may explain why the seminar was such a great success, but a boring seminar is not—in any normal set of circumstances—a reason why Solange is not at it. This result seems to undermine the usual understanding that if A is a sufficient condition of B, it will typically be the case that B is a necessary condition for A, and the falsity of B a sufficient condition for the falsity of A.
In defence of contraposition, it might be argued that in the case of causal claims there is at least a weak form of contraposition that is valid. Gomes proposes (Gomes 2009) that where ‘A’ is claimed to be a causally sufficient condition for ‘B’, or ‘B’ a causally necessary condition of ‘A’, then some form of reciprocity between the two kinds of conditions holds, and so some version of contraposition will be valid. Going back to example (ii), suppose we read this as stating a causal condition—that your touching me would cause me to scream. Gomes suggests that ‘A’ denotes a sufficient cause of B, provided that (1) ‘A’ specifies the occurrence of an event that would cause another event ‘B’, and does this by (2) stating a condition the truth of which is sufficient for inferring the truth of ‘B’. In such a case, we could further maintain that ‘B’, in turn, denotes a necessary effect of ‘A’, meaning that the truth of B provides a necessary condition for the truth of A (Gomes 2009, 377–9). It is notable that Crupi and Iacona’s evidential conditional also preserves contraposition, which they claim as a distinctive feature of of their analysis, based on their understanding that “provides evidence for” is another way of saying “supports” (section 6 of Crupi and Iacona 2020). For them, if Solange’s presence provides evidence for the seminar being good (see (xiii) above), then the seminar’s not being good is evidence of Solange’s absence. They—like Gomes (2019)—thus reject Downing’s (1975) general scepticism about contraposition. Wilson, by contrast, argues that the seminar not being good might also be a reason why Solange does not attend. But this, he claims, “saves only the appearance of contraposition” (Wilson 1979, 274–5).
While it is possible to distinguish these different roles the “if” clause may play (there may be others too), it is not always easy to isolate them in every case. The appeal to “reasons why” and “reasons for thinking” enables us to identify what seem to be ambiguities both in the word “if” and in the terminology of necessary and sufficient conditions. Unfortunately, the concept of what is explanatory itself may be too vague to be very helpful here, for we can explain a phenomenon by citing a reason for thinking it is the case, or by citing a reason why it is the case. A similar vagueness infests the word “because”, as we see below. Consider, for example, cases where mathematical, physical or other laws are involved (one locus classicus for this issue is Sellars 1948). The truth of “that figure is a polygon” is sufficient for inferring “the sum of that figure’s exterior angles is 360 degrees”. Likewise, from “the sum of the figure’s exterior angles is not 360 degrees” we can infer “the figure is not a polygon”. Such inferences are not trivial. Rather they depend on geometrical definitions and mathematical principles, and so this is a case of mathematically necessary and sufficient conditions. But it appears quite plausible that mathematical results also give us at least a reason for thinking that because a figure is a polygon its exterior angles will sum to 360 degrees. We may even be able to think of contexts in which someone claims that a figure’s being a polygon is a reason why its exterior angles sum to 360 degrees. And it might not be unnatural for someone to remark that a certain figure is a polygon because its exterior angles sum to 360 degrees.
A similar point holds for the theory of knowledge where it is generally held that if I know that p, then p is true (see the entry on the analysis of knowledge). The truth of p is a necessary condition of knowing that p, according to such accounts. In saying this we do not rule out claims stronger than simply saying that the truth of p follows from the fact that we know that p. That a belief is true—for example—may be (part of) a reason for thinking it constitutes knowledge. Other cases involve inferences licensed by physics, biology and the natural sciences—inferences that will involve causal or nomic conditions. Again there is need for care in determining whether reason why or reason for thinking relations are being stated. The increase of mean kinetic energy of its molecules does not just imply that the temperature of a gas is rising but also provides a reason why the temperature is increasing. However, if temperature is just one way of measuring mean molecular kinetic energy, then a change in temperature will be a reason for thinking that mean kinetic energy of molecules has changed, not a reason why it has changed.
As mentioned at the start of the article, the specification of necessary and sufficient conditions has traditionally been part of the philosopher’s business of analysis of terms, concepts and phenomena. Philosophical investigations of knowledge, truth, causality, consciousness, memory, justice, altruism and a host of other matters do not aim at stating evidential or explanatory relations, but rather at identifying and developing conceptual ones (see Jackson 1998 for a detailed account of conceptual analysis, and the supplementary entry on conceptions of analysis in analytic philosophy for an overview). But even here, the temptation to look for reasons why or reasons for thinking that is not far away. While conceptual analysis, like dictionary definition, eschews evidential and explanatory conditions, evidential conditions seem to be natural consequences of definition and analysis. That Nellie is an elephant may not be a (or the) reason why she is an animal, any more than that a figure is a square is a reason why it has four sides. But some evidential claims seem to make sense even in such contexts: being an elephant apparently gives a reason for thinking that Nellie is an animal, and a certain figure may be said to have four sides because it is a square, in an evidential sense of “because”.
To specify the necessary conditions for the truth of the sentence “that figure is a square” is to specify a number of conditions including “that figure has four sides”, “that figure is on a plane”, and “that figure is closed”. If any one of these latter conditions is false, then the sentence “that figure is a square” is also false. Conversely, the truth of “that figure is a square” is a sufficient condition for the truth of “that figure is closed”. The inferential relations in this case are modelled—even if inadequately—by an operator such as hook.
Now consider a previous example—that of memory. That Penelope remembers something—according to a standard account of memory—means (among other things) that the thing remembered was in the past, and that some previous episode involving Penelope plays an appropriate causal role in her present recall of the thing in question. It would be a mistake to infer from the causal role of some past episode in Penelope’s current remembering, that the definition of memory itself involves conditions that are explanatory in the reason why sense. That Penelope now remembers some event is not a reason why it is in the past. Nor is it a reason for thinking that it is in the past. Rather, philosophical treatments of memory seek for conditions that are a priori constitutive of the truth of such sentences as “Penelope remembers doing X”. The uncovering of such conditions simply provides insight into whether, and how, “remember” is to be defined. Reason why and reason for thinking that conditions seem not to play a role in this part of the philosopher’s enterprise.
Finally, it should be noted that not all conditional sentences primarily aim at giving either necessary or sufficient conditions. A common case involves what might be called jocular conditionals. A friend of Octavia’s mistakenly refers to “Plato’s Critique of Pure Reason” and Octavia says, “If Plato wrote the Critique of Pure Reason, then I’m Aristotle”. Rather than specifying conditions, Octavia is engaging in a form of reductio argument. Since it is obvious that she is not Aristotle, her joke invites the listener to infer (by contraposition) that Plato did not write the Critique of Pure Reason. Another case is the so-called concessive conditional, where the antecedent does not appear to be a condition on the consequent of even an inferential kind. Suppose we plan on having picnic and hope it will be sunny. But even if rain comes, we will still go. In such a case it does not seem plausible to maintain that the threat of rain provides any condition at all on accepting the consequent. Such concessive conditionals do not admit of contraposition (Crupi and Iacona 2022, and compare Gomes 2020). Others have argued that in cases where a conditional construction does not appear to be putting forward any genuine conditions, these are “nonconditional” conditionals (Geis and Lycan 1993)—in other words they may just be disguised affirmations.
Given the different roles for “if” just identified, it is hardly surprising that generalisations about necessary and/or sufficient conditions are hard to formulate. Suppose, for example, someone tries to state a sufficient condition for a seminar being good in a context where the speaker and all the listeners share the view that Solange’s presence is a reason why seminars would be good. In this case, Solange’s presence might be said to be a sufficient condition of the seminar being good in the sense that her presence is a reason why it is good. Now, is there a similar sense in which the goodness of the seminar is a necessary condition of Solange’s presence? The negative answer to this question is already evident from the earlier discussion. If we follow von Wright’s proposal, mentioned above, we get the following result: that the seminar is not good is a sufficient condition of Solange not being present. But this cannot plausibly be read as a sufficient condition in anything like the sense of a reason why. At most, the fact of the seminar not being a good one may be a reason for thinking that Solange was not at it. So how can we tell, in general, what kind of condition is being expressed in an “if” sentence? As noted in the case of the sea battle, when rewriting in the formal mode captures the sense of what is being said, and when the formulations “if p, q” and “p only if q” seem idiomatically equivalent, then an inferential interpretation will be in order, von Wright’s equivalences will hold, and the material conditional gives a reasonable account of such cases. As indicated above, there are limitations to such an approach and it provides at best a partial account of the circumstances under which conditional sentences express necessary or sufficient conditions.
As already noted, even the inferential use of “if” is not always associated primarily with the business of stating necessary and sufficient conditions. This observation, together with the cases and distinctions mentioned in the present article, shows the need for caution when we move from natural language conditionals to analysis of them in terms of necessary and sufficient conditions, and also the need for caution in modelling the latter conditions by means of formal operators. It appears that there are several kinds of conditionals, and correspondingly several kinds of conditions. As the developments outlined above have shown, there are as a result several formal schemes for translating and making sense of the variety of conditionals used in natural language and the conditions, if any, that they express.
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Other Internet Resources
- Held, Carsten, 2016. Conditions, download from philsci-archive.pitt.edu/12164.
- The Concepts of Necessary and Sufficient Conditions, maintained by Norman Swartz, Philosophy, Simon Fraser University.
I am grateful to Richard Borthwick, Jake Chandler, Laurence Goldstein, Fred Kroon, Y.S. Lo, Jesse Alama, Edward Zalta and Uri Nodelman for their generous help and advice relating to this entry.