Omnipresence

First published Fri Jul 15, 2005; substantive revision Sun Apr 21, 2019

The psalmist asks God,

Where can I go from your spirit?
Or where can I flee from your presence?
If I ascend to heaven, you are there;
If I make my bed in Sheol, you are there.
                        (Psalms 139: 7–8, NRSV)

Philosophers and theologians have taken such texts to affirm that God is present everywhere. This passage suggests, first, that God is really present at or located at various particular places. Second, it suggests that there is no place where God is not present, that is, that God is present everywhere. This is the claim that God is omnipresent. Divine omnipresence is thus one of the traditional divine attributes, although it has attracted less philosophical attention than such attributes as omnipotence, omniscience, or being eternal.

Philosophers who have attempted to give an account of omnipresence have identified several interesting philosophical questions that an adequate account of omnipresence must address: How can a being who is supposed to be immaterial be present at or located in space? If God is located in a particular place, can anything else be located there, too? If God is present everywhere, does it follow that he has parts in each of the particular places in which he is located? Various philosophers have proposed accounts of omnipresence in terms that are supposed to apply to an immaterial being. This essay will examine some of these proposals.

1. Some Issues involving Omnipresence and Historical Background

According to classical theism, God is omnipresent, that is, present everywhere. But classical theism also holds that God is immaterial. How can something that is not, or does not have, a body be located in space? Early discussions of divine presence typically began by distinguishing God’s presence in space from that of material bodies. Augustine (354–430) writes,

Although in speaking of him we say that God is everywhere present, we must resist carnal ideas and withdraw our mind from our bodily senses, and not imagine that God is distributed through all things by a sort of extension of size, as earth or water or air or light are distributed (Letter 187, Ch. 2).

Elsewhere Augustine continues this theme and introduces a new element, namely, the suggestion that divine presence might be understood by analogy with the presence of the soul:

[Some people] are not able to imagine any substance except what is corporeal, whether those substances be grosser, like water and earth, or finer, like air and light, but still corporeal. None of these can be wholly everywhere, since they are necessarily composed of numberless parts, some here and some there; however large or however small the substance may be, it occupies an amount of space, and it fills that space without being entire in any part of it. Consequently, it is a characteristic of corporeal substances alone to be condensed and rarified, contracted and expanded, divided into small bits and enlarged into a great mass. The nature of the soul is very different from that of the body, and much more different is the nature of God who is the Creator of both body and soul (Letter 137).

Augustine adds two further points: First, God “knows how to be wholly everywhere without being confined to any place” (Letter 137). In contrast to material objects, which, having parts in various parts of the space they occupy, are not wholly present at any of those regions, God is wholly present wherever he is. Second, God is not contained in or confined by any of the places at which he exists. Augustine is thus explicit that God is not present in the way corporeal substances are present, but his positive proposal for divine presence is less well developed. He notes that God’s light, strength, and wisdom reach everywhere (Letter 187, Ch. 7), and he holds that “God so permeates all things as to be not a quality of the world, but the very creative substance of the world ruling the world without labor, sustaining it without effort.” Rather than going on to explain these ideas, however, this passage simply ends with what became a familiar formula:

Nevertheless, he [God] is not distributed through space by size so that half of him should be in half the world and half in the other half of it. He is wholly present in all of it in such wise as to be wholly in heaven alone and wholly in the earth alone and wholly in heaven and earth together; not confined in any place, but wholly in himself everywhere.

Anselm (1033–1109) also distinguishes God’s presence from the way in which material objects are contained in space, and he, too, appeals to the concept of being wholly present. In his Monologion Anselm discusses omnipresence in a series of chapters with paradoxical titles. In chapter 20 he states that “the Supreme Being exists in every place and at all times.” But in the following chapter, he argues that God “exists in no place and at no time.” Finally, he attempts to reconcile these “two conclusions—so contradictory according to their utterance, so necessary according to their proof”, by distinguishing two senses of “being wholly in a place.” In one sense those things are wholly in a place “whose magnitude place contains by circumscribing it, and circumscribes by containing it.” In this sense, an ordinary material object is contained in a place. God, however, is not thus contained in space, for it is “a mark of shameless impudence to say that place circumscribes the magnitude of Supreme Truth.” Instead, God is in every place in the sense that he is present at every place. According to Anselm, “the Supreme Being must be present as a whole in every different place at once.” Like Augustine, then, Anselm denies that God is contained in space. Also, like Augustine, he seems to leave unexplained this second relation of being “present as a whole” in every place.

In his (1988) Edward Wierenga attempts to supply the missing details. He notes that Anselm holds that souls could be wholly present in more than one place, provided that they sensed in more than one place, and that Anselm (in his Proslogion) adds that perception for God is a matter of having direct or immediate knowledge. Combining these two ideas, Anselm could say that God is present everywhere in virtue of having immediate knowledge of what is happening everywhere. Brian Leftow (1989) objects to the details of this interpretation and proposes instead that, for Anselm, God is everywhere in virtue of his power. We will explore the combination of knowledge and power below. It should be noted, however, as Christopher Conn (2011) emphasizes, that Anselm himself discusses time in conjunction with space; perhaps an adequate interpretation of Anselm would exploit this idea and develop an account, as Conn suggests, according to which God “contains” all of space-time.

The two ideas of knowledge and power figure prominently in the account of omnipresence given by Thomas Aquinas (1225–1274), which we will take up in the next section. Section 3 will consider two 20th century proposals very much in the spirit of Aquinas’s. Some treatments of the problem of omnipresence seem to have the consequence that God is related to the world as though it is his body. That will be the subject of Section 4. In the final section we will consider several recent proposals that depart from the traditional formula.

2. Power, Knowledge, and Essence

According to Thomas Aquinas, God’s presence is to be understood in terms of God’s power, knowledge and essence. (In this view he followed a formula put forth by Peter Lombard (late 11th C.–1160) in his Sentences, I, xxxvii, 1.) He writes, “God is in all things by his power, inasmuch as all things are subject to his power; he is by his presence in all things, inasmuch as all things are bare and open to his eyes; he is in all things by his essence, inasmuch as he is present to all as the cause of their being” (Summa Theologica I, 8, 3). Aquinas attempts to motivate this claim with some illustrations:

But how he [God] is in other things created by him may be considered from human affairs. A king, for example, is said to be in the whole kingdom by his power, although he is not everywhere present. Again, a thing is said to be by its presence in other things which are subject to its inspection; as things in a house are said to be present to anyone, who nevertheless may not be in substance in every part of the house. Lastly, a thing is said to be substantially or essentially in that place in which its substance is.

Perhaps there is a sense in which a king is present wherever his power extends. In any event, Aquinas seems to think so. He distinguishes two kinds of being in place: by “contact of dimensive quantity, as bodies are, [and] contact of power” (S.T. I, 8, 2, ad 1). In Summa contra Gentiles he writes that “an incorporeal thing is related to its presence in something by its power, in the same way that a corporeal thing is related to its presence in something by dimensive quantity,” and he adds that “if there were any body possessed of infinite dimensive quantity, it would have to be everywhere. So if there were an incorporeal being possessed of infinite power, it must be everywhere” (SCG III, 68, 3). So the first aspect of God’s presence in things is his having power over them. The second aspect is having every thing present to him, having everything “bare and open to his eyes” or being known to him. The third feature, that God is present to things by his essence, is glossed as his being the cause of their being.

This way of understanding God’s presence by reference to his power and his knowledge treats the predicate ‘is present’ as applied to God as analogical with its application to ordinary physical things. (For a fuller explanation of analogical predication, see Medieval Theories of Analogy.) As applied to God, ‘is present’ is neither univocal (used with the same meaning as in ordinary contexts) nor equivocal (used with an unrelated meaning). Rather, its meaning can be explained by reference to its ordinary sense: God is present at a place just in case there is a physical object that is at that place and God has power over that object, knows what is going on in that object, and God is the cause of that object’s existence. Nicholas Everitt (2010, p. 86) objects to this analogical approach, stating that “if this is how omnipresence is interpreted, one might well think that it would be clearer to say straightforwardly that God is not omnipresent at all,” and he cites Joshua Hoffman and Gary Rosenkrantz (2002, p. 41)) as agreeing with him. But Hoffman and Rosenkrantz in the cited passage merely say that “there is no literal sense in which [God] could be omnipresent,” which leaves it open that there is an analogical sense in which God is omnipresent. Hud Hudson (2009) also denies that God’s presence is analogical, but that is because he thinks that there is a literal way in which God is present everywhere. We will consider Hudson’s proposal in Section 5.

This account of omnipresence has the consequence that, strictly speaking, God is only present where some physical thing is located. Perhaps, however, this is exactly what the medievals had intended. Anselm says, for example, that “the supreme Nature is more appropriately said to be everywhere, in this sense, that it is in all existing things, than in this sense, namely that it is merely in all places” (Monologion, 23).

3. Two Recent Traditional Treatments

More recent philosophers have agreed that God’s presence is to be understood analogically. Charles Hartshorne (1897–2000), for example, claims that “the relation of God to the world must necessarily be conceived, if at all, by analogy with relations given in human experience” (1941). Rather than taking the relations to be knowledge of and power over things, however, Hartshorne assumes that God’s relation to the world is analogous to that of a human mind’s relation to its body.

Hartshorne develops this idea by making distinctions between kinds of knowledge and kinds of power. Some things that human beings know are known immediately, by “vivid and direct intuition”, while other things are known only indirectly or through inference. Hartshorne holds that the former kind of knowledge is infallible, and it is the kind of knowledge human beings have of their own thoughts and feelings. Since this kind of knowledge is the highest form of knowledge, it is the kind God has, and he has it with respect to the entire cosmos.

Similarly, some things human beings have power over they control directly; other things can be controlled only indirectly. Human beings have direct control only over their own volitions and movements of their own bodies. Again, since this is the highest kind of power, it is the kind of power God has—and he has it over every part of the universe.

Thus far Hartshorne may be seen as developing the medieval view of divine presence. God is present everywhere by having immediate knowledge and direct power throughout the universe (with the addition that his presence extends to unoccupied regions of space). But Hartshorne endorses a surprising addition. He adds that whatever part of the world a mind knows immediately and controls directly is, by definition, its body. The world, therefore, is God’s body.

Richard Swinburne (1977) also begins his discussion of omnipresence by asking what it is for a person to have a body. Although he insists that God is an immaterial spirit, he supposes this claim to be compatible with a certain “limited embodiment.” Subsequently (2016) he withdraws this suggestion, saying that since “God is not supposed to be tied down to acting or learning through … [the universe] or any chunk of matter … it seems less misleading to say that he is not embodied.” Swinburne develops his account by appeal to the notions of a “basic action” (an action one performs, for example, moving ones limbs in the typical case, without having to perform another action in order to do it) and of “direct knowledge” (knowledge that is neither inferential nor dependent on causal interaction). He then presents the claim that God is omniscient as the claim that God “can cause effects at every place directly (as an instrumentally basic action) and knows what is happening at every place without the information coming to him through some causal chain—for example, without needing light rays from a distant place to stimulate his eyes” (2016, p. 113). Swinburne’s account is thus, as he notes, in the spirit of that of Aquinas.

4. The World as God’s Body

As we have seen, Hartshorne explicitly endorses as a consequence of the doctrine of divine omnipresence that the world is God’s body, and Swinburne is initially willing to accept a “limited embodiment.” But some philosophers have been loath to accept divine embodiment as a consequence of omnipresence. Charles Taliaferro, for example, while endorsing this overall account of omnipresence, notes that the basic actions human beings perform “can involve highly complex physical factors…[including] many neural events and muscle movements, whereas with God there is no such physical complexity” (Taliaferro, 1994). Taliaferro then adds that this immediacy in the case of God’s action is precisely a reason to say that “the world does not function as God’s body the way material bodies function as our own.” Edward Wierenga adds a second objection. He holds that as Hartshorne and Swinburne develop accounts of God’s power and knowledge, God would have the same knowledge of and control over what happens in empty regions of space as he does with respect to those regions occupied by material objects (Wierenga, 2010). In other words, Hartshorne’s and Swinburne’s accounts of omnipresence, unlike that of Aquinas, do not interpret God’s presence as presence in things. But it would be implausible to count a thing as part of God’s body on the basis of his knowledge of and power over the region of space that thing occupies, when God’s knowledge and power would extend in the same way to that region if it were unoccupied. So it seems as though one could accept a version of the traditional account of divine omnipresence without having to conclude that the world is God’s body.

5. Some Recent Alternative Proposals

Although conceiving of omnipresence in terms of power, knowledge, and essence is the traditional approach, with continued adherents, in recent years several philosophers have proposed quite different accounts of omnipresence.

Robert Oakes (2006) suggests that space is “constituted by” God’s omnipresence. He holds that things located in space and the world itself are therefore distinct from God. Oakes then draws on these claims to argue that divine omnipresence is incompatible with pantheism.

Some recent work appeals to esoteric concepts from metaphysics. Luco Johan van den Brom (1984; see also 1993) suggests that “God has a spatial dimension of his own which he does not share with the created cosmos.” Brom’s idea is that just as a two-dimensional surface “transcends” a line on that surface but is present at every point on the line, and similarly for a three-dimensional space and a two-dimensional plane in that space, “God, by existing in a higher dimensional system, is also present in the places of all the objects in the three-dimensional space of created cosmos without being contained by that three-dimensional space” (1984, 654). Brom even conjectures that God possesses at least two extra dimensions, making it impossible for our space to bisect his.

Other recent work draws on contemporary discussions on the metaphysics of material objects and their relation to spacetime. Hud Hudson (2009) describes several possible “occupation” relations. One of these relations is “entension”, where an object entends a region r just in case it is wholly and entirely located at r and at every proper subregion of r. An object is entirely located at a region r just in case it is located at r and there is no region disjoint from r at which it is located. And an object is wholly located at r just in case it is located at r and no proper part of it is not located at r. The typical way in which an object is located at a region of space is by having various of its parts at different subregions of that region; that is, typically material objects are “spread out” or distributed through a region they occupy (they “pertend”, to use a technical term). In contrast, if an object entends a region, then it is located as a whole throughout that region. Hudson then proposes a “literal occupation account of omnipresence as ubiquitous entension” (2009, 209). Omnipresence is location at “the maximally inclusive region” plus being wholly located at every subregion there is. Alexander R. Pruss (2013) also endorses a version of this account, with slightly different details to allow explicitly for divine timelessness. In Hudson’s view, any object that occupies a region is space is a material object. He is thus willing to accept as a consequence of his account of omnipresence as ubiquitous entension that God is a material object. Ross Inman (2017), while sympathetic to the appeal to ubiquitous entension, is unwilling to accept the conclusion that God is a material object. Accordingly he shows that careful attention to medieval discussions of the distinction between material and immaterial objects yields at least three ways of marking that distinction according to which God is not material.

Eleonore Stump (2010, see also 2008, 2011, 2013) defends adding additional conditions to the traditional understanding of omnipresence in terms of knowledge and power. She writes, “I … think, however, that the attempt to capture personal presence in terms of direct and unmediated cognitive and casual contact misses something even in the minimal sense of personal presence” (2010, 111). She continues, “what has to be added to the condition of direct and unmediated casual and cognitive contact … are two things––namely, second-person experience and shared attention” (2010, 112). Second-person experience involves being aware of and attending to someone else as a person when that other person is conscious and functioning as a person. Shared attention requires that two persons be aware of each other and aware of their awareness, whether of each other or a third object. Stump’s goal is to provide an understanding of the kind of union to be desired in love. It may be, then, that her real topic is the nature of God’s offer of love to people. But she explicitly applies her remarks about personal presence to omnipresence when she writes, “in order for God to be omnipresent, that is, in order for God to be always and everywhere present, it also needs to be the case that God is always and everywhere in a position to share attention with any creature able and willing to share attention with God” (2010, 117). Perhaps, then, Stump can be seen not only as attempting to analyze omnipresence but to identify what is required for it to be of religious or theological importance.

Georg Gasser (2019) also defends adding an additional condition involving agency to the traditional appeal to knowledge and power. He considers a variety of proposed accounts of omnipresence, giving special attention (and initial sympathy) to Hudson’s development of ubiquitous entension. But he concludes that this proposal has a hard time explaining “the biblical tradition and personal religious experiences [according to which] God acts differently at different places” (2019, 59). Perhaps he takes Stump’s second-person attention and shared experience, which he references, to provide the requisite agency, or perhaps he intends such actions as, for example, God’s speaking to Moses in the burning bush and also preventing the consumption of the bush by fire. In any event, Gasser assumes that omnipresence includes, not only God’s presence through his knowledge and power everywhere, but also “acting from time to time … ‘specially’ in miraculous ways” (2019, 60).

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Copyright © 2019 by
Edward Wierenga <edward.wierenga@rochester.edu>

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