# Paradoxes and Contemporary Logic

*First published Tue Oct 16, 2007; substantive revision Tue Apr 20, 2021*

By “paradox” one usually means a statement claiming
something which goes beyond (or even against) ‘common
opinion’ (what is usually believed or held). Paradoxes form a
natural object of philosophical investigation ever since the origins
of rational thought; they have been invented as part of complex
arguments and as tools for refuting philosophical theses (think of the
celebrated paradoxes credited to Zeno of Elea, concerning motion, the
continuum, the opposition between unity and plurality, or of the
arguments entangling the notions of truth and vagueness, credited to
the Megarian School, and Eubulides of Miletus). Paradoxes—termed
as *Insolubilia*—form also a substantial part of logical
and philosophical investigations during the Middle Ages.

This entry concentrates on the emergence of non-trivial logical themes and notions from the discussion on paradoxes from the beginning of the 20th century until 1945, and attempts to assess their importance for the development of contemporary logic. Paradoxes involving vagueness, knowledge, belief, and space and time are treated in separate entries.

A terminological warning is in order. The word “antinomy” is used below as alternative to, and synonymous with, “paradox”. Most paradoxes—but not all—involve contradictions; for such cases, we often use the word “contradiction” as well.

- 1. Introduction
- 2. Paradoxes: early developments (1897–1917)
- 2.1. Difficulties involving ordinal and cardinal numbers
- 2.2 Russell’s contradiction
- 2.3 Russell’s paradox involving propositions and truth: the emergence of type theory
- 2.4 The mathematicians and the contradictions: Hilbert and Zermelo
- 2.5 Around 1905: difficulties arising from definability and the continuum

- 3. Paradoxes, predicativism and the doctrine of types: 1905–1913
- 4. Logical developments and paradoxes until 1930
- 5. Paradoxes: between metamathematics and type-free foundations (1930–1945)
- 6. A glance at present-day investigations
- Bibliography
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

## 1. Introduction

Between the end of the 19th century and the beginning of the 20th
century, the foundations of logic and mathematics were affected by the
discovery of a number of difficulties—the so-called
paradoxes—involving *fundamental notions and basic methods of
definition and inference*, which were usually accepted as
unproblematic. Since then paradoxes have acquired a new role in
contemporary logic: indeed, they have led to theorems (usually
negative results, such as unprovability and undecidability) and they
are not simply confined to the realm of a sterile dialectic. Several
basic notions of logic, as it is presently taught, have reached their
present shape at the end of a process which has been often triggered
by various attempts to solve paradoxes. This is especially true for
the notions of *set* and *collection* in general, for
the basic *syntactical and semantical concepts of standard
classical logic* (logical languages of a given order, the notion
of satisfiability, definability). After the first forty years, the
by-products of the paradoxes included axiomatizations of set theory, a
systematic development of type theory, the foundations of semantics, a
theory of formal systems (at least *in nuce*), besides the
introduction of the dichotomy *predicative/impredicative* which
was important for conceptual reasons, but also for the future of proof
theoretical methods.

## 2. Paradoxes: early developments (1897–1917)

Early work on paradoxes of particular importance pertained to the following notions:

- ordinal and cardinal numbers (Burali-Forti, Cantor);
- property, set, class (Russell, Zermelo);
- proposition and truth (Russell);
- definability and the arithmetical (or atomistic) continuum (Richard, König, Bernstein, Berry, Grelling).

Some of these contradictions are already treated as separate entries in this encyclopedia (liar paradox, Russell’s paradox); the emphasis here will be on the background problems, their mutual links and the interaction with foundational and philosophical issues.

### 2.1. Difficulties involving ordinal and cardinal numbers

The earliest modern paradoxes concerned the notions of ordinal and cardinal number. Burali-Forti, a mathematician of Peano’s school, attempted to prove that the ordinal numbers are not linearly ordered. Assuming by contradiction that the class \(\mathbf{ON}\) of all ordinals could be linearly ordered, he observed that then \(\mathbf{ON}\) itself would be well-ordered and it would possess an ordinal \(\Omega \in \mathbf{ON}\). Thus \(\mathbf{ON}\) would be similar (order-isomorphic) to a proper initial segment of itself, the one determined by \(\Omega\), contradicting a well-known theorem about well-ordered sets. The result was published in 1897 and, though Burali-Forti’s original aim is impossible to achieve, his argument showed that the collection \(\mathbf{ON}\) is problematic at best (Moore-Garciadiego 1981).

The father of set theory, Cantor, had noticed similar difficulties already in 1895 (as witnessed by Bernstein and by letters to Hilbert and Dedekind). Indeed, in a second letter to Dedekind of August 31, 1899 Cantor pointed out another problem, involving the notion of the cardinal number and implying that one cannot consistently think of “the set of all conceivable sets”, say \(M\). Were \(M\) a genuine set, then it would possess a cardinal number \(m\), which would be the maximum cardinal number. But one could also consider the set \(\wp(M)\) of all subsets of \(M\), and by Cantor’s theorem the cardinality of \(\wp(M)\) ought to be strictly bigger than the purported maximum \(m\): contradiction.

As a consequence, Cantor suggested a crucial distinction—still
regarded as “subjective”, i.e., mathematically not
precise, by Hilbert (as late as 1904, see van Heijenoort 1967, p.
131)—between totalities that cannot be conceived as a whole (the
*inconsistent* ones) and those which can be regarded as
completed (*fertige Menge*). Roughly, the former is a
collection that cannot be an element of other collections, whereas the
latter is a small collection, which can be an element of other
collections (see also the entry on
the early development of set theory).
This corresponds to the distinction between *classes* and
*sets*, later made precise and axiomatized in the
class-theoretic approach (von Neumann, Bernays, Gödel); it is
reminiscent of the Russellian limitation-of-size doctrine (see
3.1
below; Garciadiego 1992).

In the case of the difficulty discovered by Burali-Forti, the
consequence for Cantor was that the multiplicity
(*Mannigfaltigkeit*) of ordinal numbers is itself well-ordered,
but is not a set: hence, no ordinal can be assigned to it, and the
antinomy is resolved.

### 2.2 Russell’s contradiction

The second famous published antinomy (Russell 1903, paragraphs 78,
101–106; Frege 1903, Appendix, dated October 1902; see the entry
Russell’s paradox
and Klement 2010) takes us from Cantor’s paradise into the
realm of the foundations of logic and the philosophy of mathematics.
It is strikingly simple, involves only predicate application, and it
has an explicit self-referential (*reflexive*) character. In
Russell’s own words (June 16, 1902, letter to Frege, translation
in van Heijenoort 1963, pp. 124–125),

let \(w\) be the predicate: to be a predicate that cannot be predicated of itself. Can \(w\) be predicated of itself? From each answer, the opposite follows. Likewise, there is no class (as a totality) of those classes which, each taken as a totality, do not belong to themselves. From this I conclude that under certain circumstances a definable collection does not form a totality.

Russell was at first entangled in the study of “the
contradictions in the relation of continuous quantity to number and
the continuum” (cited in Moore 1995, p. 219), and he obtained
his contradiction (May 1901) as a result of considering the antinomy
arising with Cantor’s theorem (see Russell 1903, footnote 7,
par. 344; par. 100, p. 101). Russell probably realized the importance
of the discovery only after Frege’s reply. The effect of the
antinomy is that it is impossible to have an abstraction operation
\(\phi \mapsto \{x \mid \phi \}\) mapping injectively any concept
(property) \(\phi\) into its extension (the class of all \(x\) such
that \(\phi(x))\) (i.e., so that if the classes defined by \(\phi\)
and \(\psi\) are equal, then \(\phi(a)\leftrightarrow \psi(a)\), for
every object \(a)\). As a consequence, it is also impossible to lay
out the foundations of set theory on a *pure logical notion of
set* where membership faithfully mirrors predicate application, in
the sense that, in the light of Frege, \(x \in y\) means that (1) \(y
= \{x \mid \phi(x)\}\) for some concept \(\phi\), and (2) \(\phi\)
truly applies to \(x\). (For historical details on Russell’s
discovery of the paradox, see Moore 1995).

### 2.3 Russell’s paradox involving propositions and truth: the emergence of type theory

Russell’s *Principles of Mathematics* (1903) contains
extended discussions of Russell’s and Burali-Forti’s
paradoxes in various forms in the sections 78, 84–85, 101, 301.
Russell’s paradox is adapted to show that a propositional
function \(\phi\) cannot be a logical subject (i.e., as separated from
its argument; it is not *saturated* in Frege’s terms);
otherwise, \(\phi\) would apply to itself, \(\neg \phi(\phi)\) would
be a propositional function and it would be possible to reproduce the
inconsistency.

In ch. 10, section 102, Russell also gives a form of Cantor’s theorem, which captures the logical essence of diagonalization (this version is by now folklore): no binary relation can parameterize all unary predicates over a given domain \(U\) (i.e., no binary relation \(R\) exists such that for all unary predicates \(P\) over \(U\), there is an object \(a\) in \(U\) for which one has: for all \(x\) in \(U, R(a, x) \leftrightarrow P(x))\).

In sum, Russell’s contradiction shows the critical status of apparently safe logical principles: either one has to give up the assumption that “any propositional function containing only one variable is equivalent to asserting membership for a class defined by the propositional function” (i.e., the comprehension principle); or one has to reject the idea that “every class can be taken as one term” (pp. 102–103).

In Russell’s hands the paradox applies to predicates, classes,
and propositional functions and leads to a new picture of the
logico-mathematical universe, which is outlined in a first exposition
of the doctrine of types: to each propositional function \(\phi\) is
associated a *range of significance*, i.e., a class of objects
to which the given \(\phi\) applies in order to produce a proposition;
moreover, precisely the ranges of significance form types. However,
there are objects that are not ranges of significance; these are just
atoms (i.e., *urelemente* or individuals) and they form the
lowest type. The next type consists of classes or ranges of
individuals; then one has classes of classes of objects of the lowest
type, and so on (see also the entry on
type theory)..

New difficulties still arise if one accepts that propositions form a
type (as they are the only objects of which it can be meaningfully
asserted that they are true or false). First of all, there are
obviously at least as many propositions as objects (just consider the
map associating with \(x\) the proposition expressed by \((x = x)\);
p. 527). On the other hand, if it is possible to form types of
propositions, there are more types of propositions than propositions,
by Cantor’s argument. Then we can inject types of propositions
into propositions by means of the notion of *logical product*.
Let \(m\) be a class of propositions and let \(\Pi m\) be the
proposition “every proposition of \(m\) is true” (regarded
as a possibly infinitary conjunction); then, if \(m\) and \(n\) are
different classes, the propositions \(\Pi m\) and \(\Pi n\) are
different, i.e., the map associating to \(m\) its product \(\Pi m\) is
injective. Therefore, if we consider the class

we have, by injectivity, a contradiction.

Of course, if one were to adopt the extensional point of view, and
hence identify equivalent propositions, the contradiction above could
not be derived. Russell, however, sticks to an intensional point of
view, stressing that equivalent propositions often can be quite
different. So one is apparently forced to reject the assumption that
propositions form *one type*, and hence to require that they
ought to have *various types*, while logical products ought to
have propositions of only one type as factors.

This was eventually the basis of the ramified theory of types, but in 1903 Russell still regarded the suggestion as harsh and artificial. As the footnote on p. 527 shows, he believed that the set of all propositions is a counterexample to Cantor’s theorem.

### 2.4 The mathematicians and the contradictions: Hilbert and Zermelo

Zermelo independently discovered Russell’s paradox in Göttingen (as witnessed by Hilbert and Husserl) in the following form: a set \(M\) that comprises as elements all of its subsets is inconsistent. Indeed, consider the set \(M_0\) of all elements of \(M\) which are not elements of themselves (e.g., the empty set is in \(M_0)\). This set is a subset of \(M\) and hence by assumption on \(M, M_0 \in M\). If \(M_0 \in M_0\), then \(M_0\) is not a member of itself. Hence \(M_0 \not\in M_0\) and since \(M_0 \in M, M_0 \in M_0\): contradiction.

In addition, Hilbert had noticed in unpublished work (see Kahle and Peckhaus 2002) that additional contradictions of a mathematical nature can arise. The first one derives from assuming that there is a well-defined set \(C\) which satisfies the following closure conditions: (i) the set \(N\) of natural numbers is an element of \(C\); (ii) \(X^X \in C\), whenever \(X \in C\) (where \(X^X\) is the set of all functions from \(X\) to \(X)\); (iii) \(\cup X \in C\), whenever \(X \subseteq C\). Then by (iii), \(\cup C = U \in C\) and finally \(F = U^U \in C\). But by definition of union, \(F \subseteq U\); hence there would exist a map of \(U\) onto \(F\) and a contradiction could be derived by diagonalization.

Furthermore, as is witnessed by Hilbert’s unpublished *Sommer
Vorlesung* 1905 (see Kahle 2004), Hilbert discovered a remarkable
functional version of Russell’s paradox, later to become popular
in the context of combinatory logic, lambda calculus and recursion
theory. The argument is based on *functional self-application*
and hence *direct self-reference*.

The contradiction is obtained by assuming that the universe includes everything, i.e., variables range over both objects and functions, and that there are at least two distinct objects. Then one introduces a new operation (universal application in our sense): \(xy\) is the result of applying \(x\) to \(y\). Given two distinct objects 0 and 1, and on the assumption that the universe is closed under arbitrary definition by cases, there exists an object \(f\) such that \(fx = 0\), if \(xx \ne 0\), and \(fx = 1\), if \(xx = 0\). Then one chooses \(x = f\) (as \(x\) ranges over everything) and easily derives a contradiction.

The results of the Hilbert school were not published because contradictions and paradoxes were regarded as symptoms of growth and as temporary difficulties. The diagnosis was that traditional logic is insufficient and the theory of concept-formation needs to be sharpened. Any concept \(C\) is given in a network of concepts (letter of Hilbert to Frege, Dec. 27, 1899; see Frege 1976, pp. 79–80), and this network is determined by the axioms. Only the consistency of the axioms that define the concept guarantees the legitimacy of \(C\). In a nutshell: paradoxes tell us that we must develop a metamathematical analysis of the notions of proof and of the axiomatic method; their importance is methodological as well as epistemological.

### 2.5 Around 1905: difficulties arising from definability and the continuum

As the reactions of the mathematical world made clear, the paradoxes
were crucially involved around 1905 when basic problems of set theory
were worked on. Indeed, the new contradictions not only affected the
conception of set and logical concepts, they also came to include the
notion of *definability* and its relation with a fundamental
issue: the structure of the mathematical continuum and in particular
whether the continuum can be well-ordered and whether Cantor’s
Continuum Hypothesis (CH) holds.

At the Heidelberg Congress in 1904, Julius König tried to refute Cantor’s continuum hypothesis. Due to a mistake discovered by Zermelo, his paper was immediately withdrawn, but the subsequent year, König produced a new argument.

Consider the reals which are *definable in finitely many
words*. They form a countable sequence: \(E_0, \ldots,
E_n,\ldots\). Since the continuum is uncountable, there exist reals
not occurring in the given enumeration. Assuming that the continuum is
well-ordered, there exists “the least real \(E\) which is not in
the sequence \(\{E_n \mid n \in \Omega \}\)”; this real is not
in the sequence, but the very expression “the least real \(E\)
which is not in the sequence” *defines \(E\) with finitely
many words*; so \(E\) occurs somewhere in the sequence:
contradiction!

König also observed that the argument extends to the second number class and a similar paradox could be obtained by considering the collection \(\mathbf{FOD}\) of finitely definable countable ordinals. In this case, taking inspiration from Cantor, König’s solution is that Cantor’s second number class is not a set in a proper sense (a completed totality). To define a set, according to König, one should provide not only a rule for defining its elements, but also a means for distinguishing them.

A contradiction related to König’s had been published slightly earlier by Jules Richard, a mathematician of a Lyceé in Dijon. Using an enumeration of all permutations with repetitions of the twenty-six letters of the French alphabet, Richard noticed that the set \(E\) of reals that can be defined by finitely many French words is denumerable and hence one can assume to have an enumeration \(u_1, u_2,\ldots\) of all those numbers. But then one can define the following real \(N\): the integer part of \(N\) is 0, while its \(n\)th decimal digit of \(N\) is \(p+1\) if \(u_n\) has the \(n\)th decimal digit \(p\) different from both 8 and 9; otherwise, the \(n\)th decimal digit of \(N\) is 1. By construction, \(N\) will not occur in \(u_1, u_2,\ldots\). On the other hand, if we consider that \(N\) is defined by means of a finite collection of letters, this must occur in \(u_1, u_2,\ldots\).

Contrary to König, Richard did not rely upon the well-ordering of the continuum, and the proposed solution is interesting for the foundational debate to come. He pointed out that the definition of the number \(N\) refers to the totality of definable reals, to which \(N\) itself belong; but no object should be definable in terms of a collection containing it. So it appears that the definition is viciously circular, and that makes the definition illusory. This idea soon became the basis of Poincaré’s solution, and eventually also Russell’s (see below 3.1, the issue of impredicatively defined collections).

So, why definability? The motivation was made clear for instance by
Bernstein’s “Die Theorie der reellen Zahlen”
(1905a), where Cantor’s continuum hypothesis was claimed to be
settled in the positive. He criticized the so called “Dirichlet
notion” of arbitrary function and stated that it is possible to
give a foundation to the continuum using only computable reals, i.e.,
reals possessing an explicit “formation law”
(“*Bildungsgesetz*”).

According to him, this is not a restriction since—he claims—there are nondenumerably many computable reals in his sense. He also states that it is possible to display the new computable continuum in a hierarchy (i.e., a \(\subset\)-increasing sequence) \(\{B_{\alpha} \mid \alpha \lt \aleph_1\}\) of subsets of \(N^N\), which is defined in such a way that each \(B_{\alpha}\) is at most of cardinality \(\aleph_1\) and hence that the cardinality of the union of the sequence is at most \(\aleph_1\). The idea is to start with a basic domain \(B_0 \subset N^N\) of simple functions (e.g., those having finitely many values), then to define a new domain \(B_1\) which extends \(B_0\) with operations that are defined from elements of \(B_0\), and so on.

Though his claims are not justified, in the light of Gödel’s later work on constructibility, one might say that Bernstein’s basic intuition was sound: the continuum problem can be settled, if one has an appropriately general notion of definability (or computability, constructibility) and by iterating it along the ordinals.

This question was ultimately connected with the problem of
understanding the atomistic continuum. The arithmetized
conception—in the sense of Dedekind or Cantor, where real
numbers are identified with suitable sets of rationals—shifted
the attention towards *arbitrary infinite sequences of natural
numbers*. But this notion was not so easy to accept. According to
Bernstein (Bernstein 1905a, p. 449), an infinite sequence (or an
infinite set) must be given by a genuine rule. But *what is a
rule*? Since one must be liberal (in order not to have just
special classes of reals, if one is too restrictive), one is naturally
driven to think of arbitrary finitely described laws, shifting the
attention towards *the syntax of the rules*. However, unless
one considers ordinary language, no such syntax is available and this
engenders indeterminacy (this is Peano’s diagnosis, see below
Peano 1902–1906).

The need for a specification of infinite sets is crucial in the discussion of the related well-ordering problem. It also affects the related issue of the classification of discontinuous functions and analytically representable functions of real variables, tackled by the French semi-intuitionists Borel, Baire and Lebesgue. At the same time, they held the view that a mathematical entity (like an infinite set or a function) exists only insofar as it is “nameable by a finite number of words”, against the platonistic views of Hadamard and Zermelo (see Borel et al. 1905).

## 3. Paradoxes, predicativism and the doctrine of types: 1905–1913

In the light of the foundational debate, the following years were rich in seminal work: new paradoxes were discovered (Berry, Grelling-Nelson), an old paradox—the Liar—showed up again, a comprehensive view of the contradictions of logic and mathematics was masterfully outlined in the opening section of Russell’s 1908 paper and the preceding Russell 1906a, while a conceptual distinction between two kinds of paradoxes was set forth in Peano’s paper of 1906. Also, the basic ideas of predicativity emerged in the discussion between Poincaré, the leading mathematician of the time, and Russell. Even more important for the history of mathematical logic, fundamental technical advances for solving the paradoxes and shaping the foundations of logic and mathematics were made: Russell’s theory of (ramified) types and Zermelo’s axiomatization of set theory.

### 3.1 Poincaré and Russell on contradictions

Russell’s and Poincaré’s ideas for solving paradoxes are to be found in a number of papers published in the period 1905–1912:

- the long essay “Les mathématiques et la
logique”, in the
*Revue**de Métaphysique et de Morale*(Poincaré 1905, 1906a), wherein Poincaré strongly criticizes axiomatic and logicist foundations; - Russell’s “On some difficulties in the theory of transfinite numbers and order types” (read in 1905, published in 1907);
- Poincaré’s counter-attack (Poincaré 1906b),
the subsequent papers by Russell in the
*Revue*(Russell 1906) and the*American Journal of Mathematics*(Russell 1908), and Poincaré’s last articles (1909a, 1910, 1912).

Poincaré (1906b) took the contradictions as grounds to defend
an intuitionistic, Kantian point of view. According to him,
number-theoretic induction and the axiom of choice constitute
independent intuitions, truly synthetic a priori judgements. He then
argues against Russell’s logical definition of natural numbers
as those numbers which belong *to all recurrent classes* (those
classes which contain 0 and are closed under successor). His objection
is that the definition is not admissible since it refers essentially
to a totality to which the class to be defined belongs—the
definition is *impredicative*—and hence it is to be
regarded as *circular.* But, according to Poincaré,
*mathematical objects do not exist without a proper
definition*, and a proper definition must be *predicative*,
i.e., it must avoid *vicious circles*; Poincaré thus
somewhat extended Richard’s diagnosis.

Poincaré’s views evolved over the years and in the debate
with Russell. In the later period, he advanced a novel approach to
predicativity, which, though informally sketched, is suggestive of
later developments in definability and proof theory (see Feferman
1964, Heinzmann 1985). He no longer insisted on the vicious
circularity of the definition involved in the contradictions; instead,
he held the view that *a predicative classification is
characterized by invariance*, i.e., that it cannot be affected by
the introduction of new elements; by contrast, impredicative notions
are subject to constant modification whenever new elements are
introduced.

In the light of contemporary logic, Poincaré is hinting at some
form of *absoluteness or invariance under extension* (that will
be made precise by Kreisel 1960 via model theory and recursion
theory): his ideas will inspire the non-ramified approach to the
foundations of predicative analysis.

In his last contribution to *Acta Mathematica* (1909) and in
his fifth Göttingen lecture (1910), he also gave a restatement of
Richard’s paradox, as a refinement of Cantor’s theorem, in
the form: “there is no definable enumeration of definable
reals”.

While mathematicians and Poincaré himself focused on the
problems raised by the contradictions insofar as they involved the
foundations of specific mathematical notions (the continuum, the
natural numbers, the theory of cardinal and ordinal numbers), Russell
directly attacked the *comprehension principle*, that is, the
assumption that certain propositional functions determine a class (see
also
2.3
above). The paradoxes prove that a propositional function may be
well-defined for every argument, and yet the collection of the values
for which it is defined need not be a class. So *the crucial
problem becomes logical*: to give a criterion for selecting those
propositional functions which give rise to classes (understood as
well-defined objects).

Under the influence of Poincaré, Russell (1906, p. 634)
accepted *the vicious circle principle*, for which he used a
formulation in the terminology and adopting the notions of formal
logic as formulated by Peano:

Whatever comprises an apparent variable should not be one among the possible values of that variable.

In logical terms, we are not allowed to quantify over a given class \(X\) when defining an element of \(X\) itself (see also the entry on definitions).

Of course, the vicious circle principle is not itself a theory, but a condition any adequate theory has to satisfy. Russell (1906, 1907) tentatively proposed three alternative approaches: the zigzag theory, the theory of limitation of size, and the no-classes theory. The zigzag theory attempts to capture the idea that the right functions ought to be ‘simple’, while according to the second view, ‘predicative’ would be characterized by a certain limitation of the size of classes which can be predicatively defined (e.g., the collection of all ordinals \(\mathbf{ON}\) is too large). In the no-classes theory, classes are not independent entities and anything said about them is to be regarded as an abbreviation of a statement about their members and the propositional functions defining them. This is not far from Poincaré’s idea that mathematical objects should be specified in finitely many words. However, Russell developed his own technical devices—such as the ‘substitution method’ (Landini 1998), and the contextual elimination of definite descriptions (see the entry Russell) – in order to implement his ideas.

In contrast to Poincaré, Russell 1906 did not consider the actual infinite as an essential component of the foundational malaise, and he stressed that contradictions arise even if the infinite is not involved. This is clearly shown by the Liar paradox in the form ‘I am lying’. As far as we know, it is exactly at this point in time that the (probably) most cited semantical puzzle in the history of logic regains a conspicuous position in logical analysis.

In his analysis of the Liar paradox, Russell assumed that there exists a true entity—the proposition—that is presupposed by a genuine statement (e.g., when I say that Socrates is mortal, there is a fact corresponding to my assertion and it is this fact that is called ‘proposition’). The same holds if the statement is false, but not in the case where the statement itself contains quantified variables.

The paradox is then solved by construing the Liar as ‘there is a
proposition that I state and that is false’; hence the statement
contains *a quantification (hence an apparent variable) over the
collection of all propositions*, and it is not a proposition in a
proper sense (Russell 1906, 642–644). So the conclusion is that
the Liar is false because it does not state a proposition.

Similar considerations apply to *the paradox suggested by
Berry*, which is briefly stated in Russell 1906 for the first time
in published form, and has the merit of not going beyond the domain of
finite numbers.

Consider the natural numbers that are definable by means of less than 18 syllables: this set is non-empty and finite. So there exist numbers which are not definable using less than 18 syllables. Consider the least such number: clearly, by definition, it is not definable with less than 18 syllables.

On the other hand such a number is definable with less than 18 syllables, since it is uniquely determined by the expression “the least number not definable with less than 18 syllables”, which itself has less than 18 syllables.

For the sake of historical accuracy, we should remark that Beppo Levi, who made an articulated contribution to the debate on the axiom of choice in the first two decades of the 1900s, outlined an antinomy which is essentially a variant of Berry’s paradox in the context of discussing Richard’s paradox (see Levi 1908, and also Lolli 2007 and Bruni 2013 for further comments about Levi’s approach to paradoxes).

### 3.2 Mathematical logic as based on the theory of types

The Russellian theory of types is widely known and investigated in the
literature (see the entries on
type theory
and
Bertrand Russell):
it is of current interest and has descendants in logic and its
applications. It was first developed by Russell in the fundamental
memoir *Mathematical Logic as based on the theory of types* of
1908.

The doctrine of types is based upon the observation that universal
quantification—understood as full generality, i.e., when \(x\)
ranges ‘over the whole universe’—does not make
sense: when we state that \(\forall x\phi(x)\) is true, we only claim
the function \(\phi(x)\) has the value ‘true’ for all
arguments \(x\) for which *it is meaningful*. The essential
point is that each propositional function has a range of significance,
i.e., *a type*, and *quantification is legitimate only over
types*. Formally speaking, each variable must have a preassigned
type. The paradoxes (or reflexive fallacies) prove that certain
collections, such as the totality of all propositions, of all classes
and so on, cannot be types. So we can quantify over the collection of
men, but we cannot properly state ‘all propositions of the form
\(p\vee \neg p\) are true’. Therefore, the logical entities
divide into types, and, in particular, *every propositional
function must have a higher type than its arguments*. Moreover, in
the light of the vicious circle principle, the notion of
*order* must also be introduced. No object can be defined by
quantifying over a totality which contains the object itself as
element; hence the order of every propositional function must be
greater than the order of propositional functions over which it
quantifies.

The main idea is clarified in Russell 1908 (pp. 163–164) by
considering how propositions can be arranged into a suitable
“ramified” hierarchy, according to their order and so as
to satisfy the vicious circle principle. First of all, there are
elementary propositions, i.e., those containing no bound variables at
all, while the lowest type consists of *individuals.*
Individuals are entities without logical structure and can be regarded
as the subjects of elementary propositions. The second logical type
embraces the *first order propositions*, i.e., those whose
quantifiers (if any) range only over individuals. Quantification over
first order propositions gives rise to a new type, consisting exactly
of *second order propositions*. In general, the \((n + 1)\)th
logical type comprises propositions of order \(n\), which contain
quantification only up to the \((n - 1)\)th order.

Since a propositional function can be obtained from a proposition
‘by treating one or more of its constituents as
variables’, the hierarchy of types and orders is naturally
lifted to propositional functions, and it makes sense to speak of
*order of a function,* its order being roughly the order of the
value (i.e., a proposition) which the function assumes when it is
applied to an argument for which it makes sense. So, for instance, a
function which applies to individuals and takes first-order
propositions as values is first-order.

Following the doctrine of types, we must replace ‘all propositions’ by ‘all propositions of order \(n\)’ for a given \(n\). Hence the Liar sentence becomes “it is not true of all propositions \(p\) of order \(n\), that if I affirm \(p, p\) is true”, which is a proposition of order \(n + 1\). Then the Liar is simply false rather than contradictory; and this solves the paradox. Similar arguments solve the other paradoxes.

In this theory, *predicative functions* of one argument, i.e.,
those having as order the successor of the order of their argument,
play a crucial role. For instance, a predicative function of an
individual variable must have order 1 (in current terminology, it is
elementarily definable and quantifies *only* over individuals).
The *axiom of reducibility* (AR) states that *every
propositional function is equivalent, for all its values, to a
predicative function of the same variables.* So, for instance, we
might have a definition of a property \(P(n)\) of natural numbers
(regarded as individuals) which quantifies over, say, second-order
propositions. But AR implies that there exists a function \(P^* (n)\)
which is satisfied by exactly the same numbers as \(P(n)\) and is
predicative, i.e., it involves quantification *only* on
numbers.

Thus, according to the axiom of reducibility, statements about arbitrary functions can be replaced by statements about predicative functions; and predicative functions play the role of classes, i.e., canonical representatives of arbitrary complex concepts (e.g., among the possible properties of different order which have the same extension as \(P(n)\), \(P^*(n)\) canonically represents the class of numbers satisfying \(P(n))\).

Besides the axiom of infinity, AR is an essential tool for
reconstructing classical mathematics, but it is a strong existential
principle, apparently in conflict with the philosophical idea that
logical and mathematical entities are to be constructively generated
according to the vicious circle principle. Nonetheless, it was adopted
in the (first edition of the) monumental *Principia
Mathematica*, written in collaboration with A.N. Whitehead and
published in 1910 (vol. 1), 1912 (vol. 2) and 1913 (vol. 3).

Interestingly, the basic idea underlying Russell’s ramified
hierarchy of types is a crucial ingredient in Gödel’s later
consistency proof of the continuum hypothesis via its inner model
\(L\) of constructible sets. Also, as already observed in Gödel
(1944), a form of AR becomes true in \(L\) in the sense that, roughly,
an *arbitrary* propositional function of natural numbers is
extensionally equivalent to some function of order \(\alpha\), for
some countable ordinal \(\alpha\) (see the entry
Kurt Gödel).
Other important applications of ramified hierarchies have been given
since the late fifties in different fields (from recursion theory to
proof theory; see the entry on
type theory).

### 3.3 Completing the picture

There is a sizeable literature on paradoxes already in the early years
of the 20^{th} century, which is not at all exhausted by the
previous discussion. Refinements and variations of foundational and
logical interest are to be found in the works of several authors,
including prominent mathematicians, among them Peano, Borel,
Schönflies, Brouwer, and Weyl. Some of the more stimulating and
original proposals are surveyed in the rest of this section.

#### 3.3.1 Peano, Schönflies, Brouwer, and Borel

Peano’s criticism (in *Additione a Super Theorema de
Cantor-Bernstein*) of Richard’s paradox is mainly known
because it points out that *“Richard’s example pertains
to linguistics, not to mathematics”* and this statement
opens up the distinction between set-theoretic or mathematical
antinomies and semantical antinomies: the weak point in
Richard’s definition is that to some extent it is symbolic and
formal, but it also makes use of the natural language
(“*lingua commune*”); this contains ideas that are
quite familiar but nevertheless are not sharply defined and are
ambiguous (Peano 1906, p. 357–358). For instance, there is no
precise criterion for deciding whether a given expression of the
natural language represents a rule uniquely defining a number.

In spite of that, Peano elaborated a formal solution. He tried to get rid of vagueness and reference to \(E\), the set of finitely definable reals in the unit interval, by fixing an explicit “Gödel-numbering”: given a natural number \(n\), write \(n\) in base \(B\), for sufficiently large \(B\) (so as to include the number of alphabet letters plus punctuation marks). Then each number is assigned a finite string of symbols in the natural language, and in certain cases the string will define a number, \(\Val(n) =\) “the decimal number which is determined by the expression encoded by \(n\) and interpreted according to the rules of the natural language”. Now, in order to get the paradox, one has to prove that there exists a unique number \(N\) in (0, 1), satisfying the condition given by Richard (see 2.5 above), but this condition, and hence \(N\) itself, depends on \(\Val\), which is possibly obscure and cannot be defined exactly according to the rules of mathematics (p. 352, p. 358). The conclusion is that no such a real can exist and Richard’s definition is defective in the same way that “the greatest prime number” is.

Schönflies and Brouwer, by contrast, reacted to the paradoxes while strongly opposing axiomatic and formal methods.

Schönflies (1906) stuck to a contentual, genetic conception of
sets. According to him, sets are generated and, once formed, are
conceptually invariant. When a new set is built up, it is added to
those that have been used in forming it, without altering their
pre-existent structure. So self-membership does not make sense, the
universal set does not exist and Russell’s paradox disappears.
His view can be seen as hinting at a sort of iterative conception of
sets. For Schönflies, the contradictions arise in logic, as
opposed to mathematics, and are due to the scholastic nature of logic.
He regarded logic as having an unhealthy influence
(“*unheilvollen Einflüss*”) on mathematics
(“*Für den Cantorismus, aber gegen den
Russellismus*” is the final motto of Schönflies
1911).

Brouwer’s approach to paradoxes was also based on a contentual conception of mathematics. It can be found in the dissertation of 1907, chapter III (cf. also van Dalen 1999, pp. 105). As to Russell’s contradiction, Brouwer noticed that the usual logical principles only hold for words with mathematical content, not for linguistic systems, like those of Peano or Russell. For instance, in order to decide whether a class falls under a propositional function, the class has to be a completed totality. The contradictions show that there are propositional functions which define complementary (disjoint) classes and yet do not satisfy the tertium non datur. Similar ideas can be found in the philosophical paper of 1908, “On the unreliability of tertium non datur” (see van Dalen 1999).

A positive by-product of Richard’s paradox in Brouwer’s
work (1907, p. 149) is the notion of *denumerably unfinished
set*, i.e., a set in which we can determine only denumerable
subsets of elements, but where these denumerable subsets do not
exhaust the given set, so that one can immediately produce new
elements of the set from any given denumerable such subset. Typical
examples of denumerably unfinished sets are the totality of countable
ordinals, the points of the continuum, and in particular, as could be
shown using Richard’s paradox, the set of all definable points
of the continuum (1907, p. 150). Brouwer considers
Burali-Forti’s contradiction not as a mathematical paradox,
since it concerns a logical structure (the collection of all
ordinals), which is not a well-defined mathematical object and has no
proper mathematical content. Mathematically speaking, the
contradiction can be avoided by denying that the largest well-ordered
type has a successor order type (p. 153; this is analogous to
Bernstein 1905b).

Among the French mathematicians, the semi-intuitionist Borel (1908)
introduced the distinction between *effectively enumerable*
sets and *denumerable* ones. The Richard paradox is then solved
by observing that Richard’s set \(E\) is certainly denumerable,
because one can only determine at most a denumerable set of reals by
finite means. Yet \(E\) is not effectively enumerable, i.e., one
cannot produce with finitely many words a procedure for assigning
unambiguously a rank (i.e., a position) to each element of the set. In
order to make the enumeration of \(E\) effective, one ought to have
solved all the mathematical problems which one could possibly state,
because there are expressions which become definitions of a real only
modulo a proof or solution of a certain problem. Borel has in mind a
particular example: consider the expression “the unique
transcendental number whose decimal expansion is obtained from that of
\(\pi\) by replacing everywhere 7 with 8, and 8 with 7”. Of
course, this is a good definition only if we have shown that the
number is not algebraic (see Borel 1908. p. 446).

Borel, like Poincaré, adheres to a point of
view—definability in finitely many words—which is an
extension of the algebraic, Kroneckerian point of view: only objects
constructible in finitely many steps are proper mathematical objects.
However, unlike Poincaré, he disregards the problem of
predicative definitions: for him all paradoxes of set theory derive
from viewing the proposition that every denumerable set is effectively
enumerable (“*Tout ensemble dénombrable est
effectivement énumérable*”) as evident, which
is false.

#### 3.3.2 Hessenberg, Grelling, Zermelo and Weyl

On the side of mathematical foundations, three chapters of Gerhard
Hessenberg’s *Bericht* (1906) on the fundamentals of set
theory are devoted to foundational questions. They contain interesting
ideas about the philosophy of mathematics, which unfortunately cannot
be discussed in detail here. For instance, Hessenberg underlines the
distinction between set theoretic definitions which give criteria for
*effectively* deciding membership in a given set, and
definitions which don’t. Concerning Kronecker’s
constructive criticism of the arithmetized continuum, he holds that,
although each irrational number determines an infinite fraction and
each infinite fraction possesses a formation rule
(“Bildungsgesetz”), it is not true that such a rule is
given by *explicit finite means.* For otherwise, we could
derive (a form of) *the paradox of finite denotation,* i.e.,
were formation laws to coincide with definable ones, they would be at
most denumerable and hence the reals would be denumerable, against
Cantor’s theorem.

In dealing with set theoretic contradictions, Hessenberg distinguishes the ‘ultrafinite’ (paragraphs 96–99) from the ‘transfinite’: this latter notion is an exclusive attribute of sets. By contrast, the collections involved in the paradoxes (such as the Russell set, the set of all sets, of all things, and of all ordinal numbers) are ultrafinite.

As to the proposed solutions of the paradoxes, Hessenberg was inspired by a Kantian idea. Just as in the natural sciences antinomies arise if Nature is conceived as a closed whole, similarly the collection \(\mathbf{ON}\) and the set of all sets cannot be conceived as completed totalities. Hence the distinction ‘ultrafinite’/‘transfinite’ is apparently in accord with a theoretical approach which is close to Russell’s limitation of size doctrine.

Close to the same philosophical inspiration, the influential paper of Grelling and Nelson (1908) provides an attempt to unify paradoxes and to isolate their underlying structure. The philosopher Leonard Nelson was a prominent figure in the Göttingen of the early twentieth century, who had Hilbert’s strong support (see Peckhaus 1990). The paper is part of a project to develop a philosophically minded “kritische Mathematik”. It contains a new paradox (credited to Grelling) with a semantical flavor (see also the entry self-reference):

To each word there corresponds a concept, that the very word designates, and which applies to it or does not apply; in the first case, we call the wordautological, elseheterological. Now the word ‘heterological’ itself is autological or heterological. Assuming that the word is autological, the concept that it designates applies, hence ‘heterological’ is heterological. But if the word is heterological, the designated concept does not apply, so ‘heterological’ is not heterological.

Zermelo’s axiomatization of set theory (1908; for more details
see entries on
set theory,
the early development of set theory,
alternative axiomatic set theories)
supplied a sensible tool for blocking contradictions. The main ideas
of the axiomatization can be summarized as follows: (i) naïve
comprehension is restricted to a separation axiom, i.e., to a
principle granting the existence of enough subsets of an already given
set of objects (numbers, points, functions on a given space);
‘enough subsets’ here refers to all the subsets
specifiable by means of *definite conditions* involving the
primitive notions (set equality and membership) and satisfying the
laws of classical logic; (ii) there are axioms ensuring that the basic
operations of forming singleton, union, pairing, and power set are
well defined and that there exist at least an infinite set and the
empty set; (iii) extensionality is assumed: two sets are equal if and
only if they have the same elements; (iv) an axiom of choice is
postulated, which allows selecting a choice set out of any family of
disjoint non-empty sets.

It is immediate to see that Burali-Forti’s antinomy cannot be derived in Zermelo’s system, since the collection of all order types does not exist as a set, and Russell’s paradox simply becomes the theorem that there does not exist a universal set.

However, one could raise at least two objections against the theory on
different grounds. First of all, Zermelo’s approach is actually
*highly impredicative* and impredicativity was regarded as
indispensable by him (else one would be forced to reject standard
mathematics, e.g., Zermelo believed this was the case even with the
Cauchy-Weierstrass proof of the fundamental theorem of algebra). But
impredicativity makes the construction of a model or of an
interpretation more difficult and less evident. The second point is
that Zermelo believed that the paradox of finite denotation (mentioned
by Hessenberg) and Richard’s are blocked in set theory, as the
separation axiom ought to yield clear criteria for defining sets. But
this is not the case, because Zermelo’s notion of definite
property (*definite Eigenschaft*) is given informally and is
ultimately vague.

The latter issue was taken up in Weyl’s “Habilitation” lecture (1910), where he addressed the general question: when is a relation explicitly definable from a set of given primitive concepts in mathematics? First of all, he considers, as a concrete case study, the problem of characterizing the explicitly definable concepts of elementary plane geometry: these can be inductively generated by means of five basic definition principles from two suitably chosen primitive concepts (e.g., the identity between points =, and the ternary relation \(E(a, b, c)\), ‘the distance of point \(a\) from point \(b\) is the same as the distance of point \(a\) from point \(c\)’).

The five definition principles correspond to a *finite
axiomatization of the elementary comprehension principle*, and
they imply the existence of exactly those sets (relations), which are
definable by formulas in the elementary language comprising two
predicate symbols for \(=, E\). More explicitly, one requires closure
under the logical operations of negation, conjunction, existential
quantification and suitable combinatorial operations of permutation
and expansion.

In the light of the geometric example, Weyl attacks the concept “defined by means of finitely many words” as not precise, and long before Fraenkel and Skolem, he succeeds in making the separation principle precise: he simply replaces Zermelo’s informal concept of definite property with the notion of ‘relation explicitly definable from extensional equality and membership by means of the basic elementary logical principles’ (we should simply say: first-order definable).

According to Weyl, Richard’s paradox teaches us the following distinction: on the one hand, we are able to characterize only denumerably many subsets of a given set by means of explicit definitions; but, on the other hand, new objects and (possibly uncountable) sets can be introduced by applying the remaining set theoretic operations, like power set or union.

Weyl addressed the problem of generating the admissible properties
over a given domain a few years later in *Das Kontinuum*
(1918). As in 1910, the set of sets of natural numbers that are
definable via admissible operations (to which now also a form of
*iteration* is added) is denumerable. By Cantor’s
argument there is no relation which parametrizes all subsets of
natural numbers (Weyl 1918, section 5). Weyl apparently followed a
relativistic attitude, according to which the extension of the
universe of sets and their properties depend on the operations which
are accepted to construct sets (see also the entry
Hermann Weyl).

It should be stressed that Weyl’s attitude towards Grelling’s antinomy is utterly negative: he considers it pure Scholasticism (Weyl 1918, section 1): there is no way, according to him, of assigning a meaning to ‘heterological’ and one should ultimately resolve these problems by appealing to philosophy.

It is interesting to observe that, in the light of recent developments, Weyl’s negative verdict ought to be weakened (see section 6).

## 4. Logical developments and paradoxes until 1930

In the period until 1930, the problem of paradoxes led naturally to
and was subsumed under the investigation of logical calculi (its final
by-product being the Hilbert-Ackermann textbook of
1928**).** This in turn opened the way to the
simplification of type theory, to important generalizations of the
notion of set, and to an almost final axiomatic elaboration of set
theory (along the Zermelian route, but also following the new path
opened up by Johann von Neumann). The basic logical tool is
essentially axiomatic formal analysis.

### 4.1 Set Theory and paradoxes: circular sets and other matters

Do circular objects exist in set theory? Zermelo’s view of sets
as axiomatized in 1908 did not in itself exclude the possibility of
self-membership. The problem was raised anew by Mirimanoff (1917a,
1917b, 1920; see also the entry
Zermelo’s axiomatization of set theory).
Once circular sets are allowed, *a strengthening of extensional
equality by means of a suitable isomorphism relation*
(bisimulation, in current terminology) is needed which essentially
corresponds to the isomorphism of the trees picturing the given sets.
Russell’s argument then suggests a distinction between sets
*of first kind*, which are not isomorphic with any of their own
elements, and sets *of second kind* which are indeed isomorphic
with at least one of their elements. In the light of this distinction,
*Russell’s contradiction shows that the collection R of sets
of first kind does not exist as a set.* Indeed, a set of second
kind always contains a set of second kind; hence a set of sets of
first kind must be of first kind. If \(R\) were a set, it should be of
first kind; but then it could not contain all sets of first kind.
Mirimanoff 1917a then introduced the fundamental distinction between
*ordinary* (well-founded) and *extraordinary*
(non-well-founded) sets: a set \(X\) is ordinary if every
\(\in\)-descending chain in \(X\) is finite; it is extraordinary,
otherwise (there exist infinite \(\in\)-descending chains). It follows
that all sets of the second kind are extraordinary, but the converse
is not true (for instance, consider the set \(E=\{e_1, E_1\}\), where
\(E_1 = \{e_1,e_2, E_2 \}\), \(E_2 =\{e_1, e_2, e_3, E_3\}\),
etc.).

For the history of paradoxes, it is important to emphasize that
Mirimanoff 1917a gave a generalization of the Burali-Forti antinomy,
*the paradox of grounded sets*. This paradox actually proves
that the collection \(\mathbf{W}\mathbf{F}\) of ordinary sets (on a
given set of atoms) is not itself a set. Indeed, let
\(\mathbf{W}\mathbf{F}\) be the set of grounded (= ordinary =
wellfounded) sets; then \(\mathbf{W}\mathbf{F}\) itself is grounded,
for were \(\mathbf{W}\mathbf{F} \ni x_0 \ni x_1 \ni x_2\ldots\), then
\(x_0\) would be an ungrounded member of \(\mathbf{W}\mathbf{F}\),
which is absurd. Hence \(\mathbf{W}\mathbf{F} \in
\mathbf{W}\mathbf{F}\), so \(\mathbf{W}\mathbf{F}\) is ungrounded,
contradiction (the same paradox will also appear in Shen-Yuting
1953).

Mirimanoff’s work is also important for the foundations of set
theory. He introduced the notion of ordinal rank for ordinary sets and
he noticed that ordinary sets can be arranged in a cumulative
hierarchy, indexed by their ranks. However, the existence of a
cumulative structure of ordinary sets is not considered as a ground
for excluding extraordinary sets. Mirimanoff (pp. 212–213)
explicitly points to the use of extraordinary sets for modelling
*mirror-like situations*. He mentions the case of a book \(B\)
whose covering is decorated with a picture \(J\) representing two
children glancing at the same book, i.e. to the picture \(J1\) of
\(B\). In \(J_1\) one could perceive again the two children and the
picture \(J_{11}\) of the book in perspective. Now \(J\) can be
regarded as a set including as elements the two children \(e_1\) and
\(e_2\), and the picture \(J_1\) of \(J\), which in turn decomposes
into the pictures \(e_{11}, e_{22}\) of \(e_1\) and \(e_2\), and the
picture \(J_{11}\) of \(J_1\), and so on ad infinitum, Now \(J\) is
isomorphic to one of its elements, i.e. \(J_1: J\) can be considered
as a set of second kind and hence extraordinary. This non-mathematical
example is suggestive of later developments, i.e., the theory of
non-well founded sets and its recent applications to semantics. A set
\(E\) of second kind is also assimilated to an impredicative
collection in the sense of Poincaré (Mirimanoff 1920, p. 34)
because of its circularity: indeed, \(E\) is given by a condition
\(E=(y, z,\ldots ,a, b, c,\ldots)\), where \(y, z,\ldots\) depend on
\(E\).

On the other hand, in Mirimanoff’s 1917a there is a remarkable use of Burali-Forti’s paradox which suggests a necessary condition for set-hood in terms of size, viz., if a collection is in bijection with the set of all ordinals, then it does not exist as a set. In Mirimanoff 1917a,b, one can also find the idea of von Neumann ordinal (von Neumann 1923, 1925) and a form of the replacement axiom is present.

Von Neumann’s system of 1925 deals with an alternative axiomatic
foundation of set theory. There are two sorts of objects: objects of
type II (functions, corresponding to classes) and objects of type I
(arguments), linked by the application operation of a function to its
arguments. The two domains partly overlap and there are objects of
type I–II, corresponding to sets (as functions which can also be
arguments). The fundamental axiom IV-2 then states that an object
\(a\) is a proper class (i.e., it is not type I–II) if and only
if the totality of its members can be mapped onto the totality of all
arguments. The Burali-Forti antinomy shows that the class
\(\mathbf{ON}\) of all ordinals is not a set, which implies with axiom
IV-2 that there is an application of \(\mathbf{ON}\) onto the universe
of all sets, and hence that *the universe of sets is
well-ordered*. Conceptually, the system settles the problem of
making Cantor’s distinction between inconsistent and consistent
precise and applicable (against Hilbert’s early criticism); it
also shows that global choice becomes a theorem on a suitable view of
sets. Though circular objects cannot live in von Neumann’s
hierarchical model of set theory, they can be found in the
investigations of other mathematicians and logicians, e.g., Finsler.
According to Finsler, paradoxes hinge upon circular notions, but
circularity does not necessarily lead to contradictions. In
particular, Finsler regards Cantor’s notion of set as
intrinsically circular: sets depend on sets or on general things
depending also on sets and *the associated dependence graph*
can drive us back in a circle. For the contemporary reader, it is
worth mentioning that an original intuition of Finsler 1926b is the
*use of graph theory for representing circular structures*. So
arrows are used for interpreting membership, and it is not difficult
to imagine a set that has itself as unique element and more
complicated circular situations (for more on Finsler’s set
theory see Holmes 1996 in Other Internet Resources). Finsler 1926
applies Richard’s paradox in order to produce metamathematical
results, in particular ‘formally undecidable
propositions’. However, Finsler’s arguments are not
conclusive and cannot be considered a proper anticipation of the
Gödel incompleteness theorems (on the limit of his ideas, see the
discussion in van Heijenoort, 438–440); but they show that an
attentive reading of the paradox might have unexpected
applications.

### 4.2 Type-theoretic developments and the paradoxes

Concerning the subsequent developments in connection with logic, the
process of streamlining the tools of logic steadily continued in
Göttingen through the work of Hilbert and his school. This is
especially clear from his unpublished lecture notes (e.g., those of
Winter-Semester course 1917–1918 *Prinzipien der
Mathematik*), which are in many respects close to the textbook of
Hilbert-Ackermann of 1928 and which contain formulations of first and
second order logic, together with ramified type theory and the axiom
of reducibility. Paradoxes are derived by allowing a suitable form of
unrestricted comprehension; the problematic assumption is located in
the admissibility of *predicates and propositions as objects*,
i.e., formally in the expressions \(X(Y), P(P)\). Variants of the
traditional Liar and of the Berry antinomy are introduced.
Interestingly, Hilbert sticks essentially to type theory (he does not
lecture upon Zermelo’s system); he defines the ramified theory
of types with the axiom of reducibility, proving that certain parts of
mathematics can be carried out in the system (on Russell’s
influence, see Mancosu 2003).

That type theory and Russell’s work had a central place not only
in Hilbert’s Göttingen is further attested to by the work
of Chwistek and Ramsey, who attempted a revision of *Principia
Mathematica* (PM) from opposite stand-points. Both authors
rejected ramified type theory (RTT, in short) and the axiom of
reducibility. Their work can be considered a typical outcome of the
process that was to yield streamlined versions of logical formalisms.
Insofar as paradoxes are concerned, the main problem is to show that
RTT is not required for solving the paradoxes.

The solution proposed by Chwistek was prompted by a
constructivistic/predicativistic conception. His position in 1921 was
that *Principia Mathematica* were not enough to avoid
Richard’s classical antinomy. On the other hand, Chwistek
proposed a version of the Liar that can be reconstructed in the simple
theory of types without the axiom of reducibility, once we are allowed
to quantify over all propositions. On his side, Chwistek adhered to a
kind of nominalistic position, and tried to develop a theory of
constructive types for the foundations of analysis (his attempt of
founding mathematics without the axiom of reducibility was called
“heroic” in the introduction to the second edition of the
*Principia Mathematica*, 1925, see Linsky 2004).

Ramsey 1926 introduced the by-now standard distinction between
*logical and epistemological contradictions* (but see already
Peano 1906, and section 3.3.1 of this entry). While logical
contradictions involve mathematical or logical terms, like class,
number, and hence show that our logic or mathematics is problematic,
semantical contradictions involve, besides purely logical terms,
notions like “thought”, “language”,
“symbolism”, which, according to Ramsey, are empirical
(not formal) terms. Hence these contradictions are due to faulty ideas
about thought or language and they properly belong to
“epistemology”.

According to Ramsey, the antinomies of the first group (such as
Russell’s, or Burali-Forti’s) can be avoided by referring
to a universe of mathematical objects which is structured into types
of individuals, functions of individuals, functions of functions of
individuals, etc. Quantification over arbitrary types is legitimate
and hence types are closed under impredicative comprehension, which is
considered necessary for mathematics. Types are intrinsic to logical
and mathematical objects and the logical paradoxes are exactly those
which require type distinctions to be solved (e.g., self-membership is
blocked for objects in the type-theoretic hierarchy). In order to
solve the semantical antinomies (e.g., the Liar, Berry’s),
Ramsey proposes to distinguish several notions of meaning. In light of
later developments, it is interesting to note that for him
*semantics is not a viable universal notion*: in particular, it
is impossible to obtain “an all-inclusive relation of meaning
for propositional functions. Whatever one we take there is still a way
of constructing a symbol to mean in a way not included in our
relation. The meanings of meaning form an illegitimate totality”
(Ramsey 1926, p. 372). This yields the clue to the solution of
Grelling’s paradox (see 3.3.2). Let \(R\) be the meaning
relation linking an adjective \(f\) to the corresponding propositional
function denoted by \(F\) (so that \(f R F\) holds). In the definition
of “heterological” we do use the relation \(R: x\) is
heterological iff there exists \(F\) such that \(F\) does not apply to
\(x\) and \(x R F\). Now, there exists a propositional function, say
\(H\), which is the meaning of the adjective
“heterological”. Ramsey’s point is that this sense
of meaning cannot be the same as that given by \(R\) and this blocks
the contradiction, when we apply \(H\) to “heterological”
(ibid.,p. 370). So one needs a new meaning relation depending on the
given fixed \(R\). These ideas foreshadow those of Tarski. (For an
analysis of semantical antinomies in a ramified context, compare also
the later contribution of Church 1976, also reconsidered and
criticized in Martino 2001.).

## 5. Paradoxes: between metamathematics and type-free foundations (1930–1945)

With the work of Gödel and Tarski, paradoxical arguments were
reshaped into fixed point results, while the semantic conception of
truth, the formalization of semantics and the arithmetization of
syntax yielded firm grounds for systematic metamathematical
investigations. In addition, an effort was made to elaborate new grand
logics as a reaction to the logic of *Principia Mathematica.*
Conceptually, the notions of (self-applicable)
function-in-intension/operation and property/ predicate were accepted
as primitive, and the very mechanism of definition/combination of
concepts was studied. This line of thought gave impulse to the
elaboration of syntactical methods within combinatory logic and to the
rise of recursion theory. The diagnosis of the paradoxes was further
enriched by a subtler analysis of purely logical features of
paradoxical reasoning: this is especially true for negation and the
crucial role of contraction and duplication properties built into the
laws of standard implication. Three valued logic was applied to
naïve comprehension.

### 5.1 Paradoxes and diagonalization

The heuristic role of paradoxes is witnessed by Gödel himself,
when he intuitively and explicitly relates his construction of
formally undecidable sentences to epistemological paradoxes
(“the analogy with the Richard antinomy leaps to the eye”,
Gödel 1931, van Heijenoort 1967, p. 599). However,
self-referential constructions attained an adequate degree of
mathematical rigor and became genuine mathematical tools only when non
trivial number-theoretic techniques were put to work (see the entry
recursive functions),
for instance in the analysis of syntactical substitution and in
providing arithmetical models of formal provability (the crucial role
of substitution for producing contradictions was already noticed by
Russell, although he did not publish this; see Pelham and Urquhart
1994). Conceptually, it is clear from Gödelian constructions that
self-reference by itself is innocuous if it is understood in the
*indirect sense*: one can have formulas \(\phi(x)\), expressing
properties of their own “name” \(\ulcorner \phi
\urcorner\), but no dangerous circularity arises.

Gödel’s construction was soon given a general form, as a general diagonalization lemma, which refers to arbitrary definable properties. This is to be found in Carnap 1934b, p. 91, Carnap 1934a, p. 270, and in Rosser 1939, p. 57, Lemma 1:

For every formula \(\psi(v)\) with only \(v\) free, there exists a sentence \(\phi\) such that

\[ \phi \leftrightarrow \psi(\ulcorner \phi \urcorner) \]

is provable(see also the entry on Gödel’s incompleteness theorems).

As a matter of fact the lemma has become the standard tool for
producing self-referential statements and for *transforming the
semantical paradoxes into indefinability and (formal) undecidability
results* (see the entry on
self-reference).
The algebra underlying the Gödelian constructions will be
grasped only much later during the 1970’s. It is also important
to stress that a few years later (1938) an analog of the
diagonalization lemma (the so-called second recursion theorem) was
discovered by Kleene and was soon to become a basic tool in the
foundations of recursion theory and computability theory.

### 5.2 Paradoxes and the foundations of semantics

It is evident from the work done in the twenties surveyed above that the problem of finding a formal solution to the semantical paradoxes, such as the Liar and the Richard paradox, remained essentially open. Type-theoretic solutions had not been pursued to the extent of providing a systematic formal analysis of semantical notions (like truth or definability). But why would this problem be worth studying from a logical and mathematical point of view? As a matter of fact, semantical notions—in particular the notion of definability—were more or less explicitly used in certain parts of set theory (descriptive set theory) and in more “set theoretically inclined” parts of function theory, which were cultivated by Polish mathematics in the twenties. At the same time, the project of a formal methodology and of a scientific semantics was developed by prominent Polish philosophers and logicians working in Lvov (now Lviv) and Warsaw (Lesniewski, Łukasiewicz, Chwistek; see Wolenski 1995 and the entries on Lesniewski, on Łukasiewicz and on the Lvov-Warsaw school). For instance, Chwistek attempted an elementary semantics on the ground of a nominalistic foundational program, where sets are identified with propositional functions, extensionality is rejected and the fundamental notion of semantics is the substitution relation “\(H\) is the result of the substitution of \(G\) for \(F\) in \(E\)” (Chwistek 1933, p. 374). In this stimulating environment, Tarski developed his fundamental analysis of semantical paradoxes, first dating back to 1929 and 1930, reported by Łukasiewicz to the Polish Society of Sciences in Warsaw in 1931 and then detailed in the long memoir of 1935 (see the entries on Tarski and on Tarski’s truth definition).

First of all, the analysis of the Liar paradox starts out by
specifying a formal requirement to be met in the semantical
investigation of truth, i.e. “a materially adequate
(*sachlich zutreffende*) definition” of the term
“true sentence ” (*wahre Aussage*). This amounts to
the celebrated schema (T), which can be roughly stated in simplified
form as:

where \(p\) stands for a sentence and \(x\) is a name of \(p\) (the idea being in accord to the classical correspondence intuition). The result that Tarski draws from the Liar is that there cannot be any interpreted language which is free from contradictions, obeys the classical laws of logic, and meets the requirements (I)–(III), where

- the language has names available for all of its sentences;
- any expression obtained from (T) by substituting \(p\) with an arbitrary sentence of the language and \(x\) with a corresponding name of \(p\) is accepted as true in the language;
- there exist self-referential sentences, i.e., it is legitimate that a sentence comprises its own name as constituent (so that we can legitimately stipulate that the name \(c\) denotes a sentence \(\alpha(\ldots c\ldots))\).

Given these essential obstacles, Tarski provides a *structural
definition* of the basic semantical notions, i.e., one that relies
only on the logical form of an expression and the fact that
expressions are recursively defined. But this route is only viable for
a language which is structurally described, e.g., a formalized
language. For such languages, which are usually closed under
quantification and contain formulas with free variables, Tarski
elaborates an appropriate *notion of satisfaction*, which
allows him to introduce the notions of *definability, denotation,
truth, logical consequence.* It is then possible to give a precise
version and a proof of the adequacy condition (T) in a meta-science,
whose principles comprise: (i) general logical axioms, (ii) special
axioms that depend upon the object theory we consider, and (iii)
axioms for dealing with the fundamental properties of the structural
notions, i.e., *principles* *of proof and definition by
induction*. Given this semantical machinery, Tarski can solve in
the negative the problem of the existence of (a formal counterpart of)
*a universal language,* i.e., one where it is possible to
define an adequate notion of truth for the same language. Although the
theory of simple types, (where the type 0 is the type of individuals;
the type \(n+1\) is the collection of all classes of type \(n\)
objects) with the axiom of infinity and extensionality is apparently a
good candidate as a general metatheory, it is shown that whichever
definition we choose in the theory of types for the term
“true”, then it is possible to deduce in the same theory
the negation of some instance of the adequacy schema (T). In the proof
of this theorem, Tarski applies arithmetization and diagonalization,
hence following the Gödelian pattern. On the positive side, the
concept of truth can be adequately defined for any formalized language
L in a language (the so-called metalanguage), provided it is of higher
order than L. Also, Tarski’s semantics makes precise
Gödel’s remark (1931, footnote 48) that “the true
reason of the incompleteness is that the formation of ever higher
types can be continued into the transfinite[…], while in any
formal system at most denumerably many of them are available”.
Tarskian semantical notions play the role of the higher types hinted
at by Gödel. To sum up, the outcome of Tarski’s work is
that the semantical notions are eliminated in favor of the
(extensional) notions of type or set, and a theoretical explanation of
semantical paradoxes is finally achieved.

### 5.3 “The inconsistency of certain formal logics”

In the twenties and in the early thirties, the orthodox view of logic
among mathematical logicians was more or less type- or set theoretic.
However, there was an effort to develop new grand logics as
substitutes for the logic of *Principia Mathematica*. These
frameworks arose both as attempts to recover the simplicity of the
type-free approach, as derived from the so-called naive comprehension
principle, as well as in order to satisfy metamathematical needs, such
as the clarification of fundamental concepts underlying the notions of
“formal system,” “formalism,”
“rule,” etc. In particular, Church and Curry proposed
theories which (i) assume as primitive the notions of self-applicable
function-in-intension (operation), and (ii) stress the very mechanism
of definition/combination of concepts. If one looks closely at the
development of these systems, one can see *that paradoxical
constructions have become essential tools for defining objects and
proving non-trivial logical mathematical facts.* Following ideas
of Schönfinkel and aiming at a mathematical analysis of the
substitution process, Curry’s 1930 thesis introduced a formal
language based on basic general operators, the so-called
*combinators* \(B\) (composition), \(C\) (permutation), \(W\)
(duplication), \(K\) (cancellation), \(Q\) (equality), and logical
constants like the universal quantifier and implication. Expressions
are then inductively generated by application from constants;
intuitively, a term \(M\) stands for a function, and the applicative
term \(MN\) (juxtaposition plays the role of application and
parentheses are associated to the left) denotes the value of the term
obtained by replacing the first variable of \(M\) with \(N\).
Self-application \(MM\) is admissible and this feature tells us that
*the objects of combinatory logic cannot be simply interpreted as
set-theoretic functions*. The formal system consists of standard
equations on combinators (e.g, \(Bxyz=x(yz), Wxy=xyy\), or
\(Cxyz=xzy)\), rules for equality and the logical constants; its main
goal is to derive equalities \(X=Y\) and to make assertions of the
form \(\vdash X (= X\) is provable). Combinatory logic is a theory
which analyzes the modes of combinations of formal objects,
substitution, and the notions of proposition and propositional
function (see the entry on
combinatory logic
for a proper introduction to variants of the formalism and an
overview of the properties of related calculi). For Curry, the root of
the paradoxes is found in assuming that *combinations of concepts
are always propositions*. The notion of proposition becomes a
*theoretical concept,* which is decided by the theory. Types
are not assigned to the expressions of the formal system at the
outset, but are instead inferred by means of the system itself, which
has a dual nature: it can derive identities, but also truths. In
particular, if \(\vdash MN\) is derived, this can be read as
“\(N\) is of type \(M\)” or “\(N\) is an element of
\(M\)”. These ideas foreshadow fundamental developments such as
the so-called *formulas-as types interpretation* (see Howard
1968).

Church’s formalism—originally introduced in Church 1932,
1933 as a set of postulates for the foundation of formal
logic—includes conversion (i.e., computational) rules, which
allow the replacement of terms with intensionally equivalent ones, and
rules for asserting certain terms as “true”. The syntax
yields a general notation system for functions, based on an
applicative language, where there is one basic category of terms
(well-formed formulas in his terminology). Some terms are formally
provable (or assertable) and are classified as true. Terms are
inductively defined from a set of basic constants and variables by
means of application and the characteristic *lambda abstraction
operator*: if \(M\) is a term containing the variable \(x, \lambda
x.M\) is a term, naming the function defined by \(M\). The basic
constants designate logical operations: (a kind of restricted) formal
implication; existential quantifier, conjunction, negation,
description operation, and generalized abstraction (i.e., if \(F\) is
formal logical equivalence, \(A(F, M)\) is “what \(M\) has in
common with any \(N\) formally equivalent to \(M\)”). It turns
out that Church’s logic can interpret naive class theory and
hence the system is suspiciously strong and expressive (strength and
expressivity are inherited by the formalism which was devised out of
Church’s: see the entry on
the lambda calculus).
Church’s hope was that contradictions could be avoided by
ensuring the possibility that a propositional function be
*undefined* for some argument.

However, the theories of Curry and Church were almost immediately
shown inconsistent in 1934, by Kleene and Rosser, who (essentially)
proved a version of the Richard paradox (both systems can *provably
enumerate* their own provably total definable number theoretic
functions). The result was triggered by Church himself in 1934, when
he used the Richard paradox to prove a kind of incompleteness theorem
(with respect to statements asserting the totality of number theoretic
functions).

The reason for the inconsistencies was eventually clarified by
Curry’s 1941 essay. There he distinguishes two basic
completeness notions: a system \(S\) is *deductively complete*,
if, whenever it derives a proposition \(B\) from the hypothesis \(A\),
then it also derives the implication \(A \rightarrow B\) (deduction
theorem or introduction rule for implication); \(S\) is
*combinatorially complete* (Curry 1941, p. 455.) if, whenever
\(M\) is a term of the system possibly containing an indeterminate
\(x\), there exists a term (Church’s \(\lambda x.M)\) naming the
function of \(x\) defined by \(M\). Curry then remarks that the
paradox of Kleene-Rosser arises because Church’s and
Curry’s systems satisfy both kinds of completeness, thus showing
that *the two properties are incompatible*. In the more
technical part of the paper, Curry carefully axiomatizes the main
ingredients exploited by Kleene and Rosser and carries out a lot of
non-trivial work both on the logical side and the mathematical side
(e.g, to develop a portion of recursive arithmetic, to define the
existence of an enumerator, i.e., a term \(T\) such that, if \(a\) is
the Gödel number of a closed term \(M\) and \(Z_a\) is the term
formally representing \(a\), then \(TZ_a =M\) is provable in \(S\),
etc.). Curry’s proof of the inconsistencies of combinatory
systems is unsatisfactory because it heavily uses a detour through
number theory and Gödelization, which, as a matter of fact, is
unnecessary as Curry himself soon discovered and presented in a paper
with the same title as the one by Kleene and Rosser, “in
deference to the original discoverers of the contradiction”
(Curry 1942). The main result in it is the following theorem
(Curry’s paradox, see the entry
Curry’s Paradox):

- assume that we have a combinatorially complete system, i.e., essentially a system of combinatory logic which contains the standard properties of equality and the basic axioms ensuring the definability of Church’s lambda with the corresponding axioms defining \(B, C, I, W\);
- assume also that the system contains an implication operator \(\supset\) satisfying, for arbitrary terms \(M, N\) \[\begin{align*} & \vdash M \supset M \\ & \vdash M \supset( M\supset N) \Rightarrow \vdash M \supset N \\ & \vdash M \text{ and } \vdash M\supset N\Rightarrow \vdash N. \\ & \text{Then } S \vdash M, \text{ for every term } M. \end{align*}\]

For the proof, it is enough to find, for any given term B, a term A
such that \(A=A\supset B\). Curry notes that a twofold construction is
possible. By direct self-reference, we can choose: \(A = HH\), where
\(H=\lambda Y (N(YY))\) and \(N = \lambda X (X\supset B)\). On the
other hand, one can apply indirect self-reference and exploit the
machinery of Curry 1941 and Kleene-Rosser: using an enumerator \(T\),
one sets \(U = \lambda X (TXX \supset B)\) and \(A=UZ_u\), being \(u\)
the Gödel number of \(U\). Curry suggests that these two routes
are akin, respectively, to Russell’s paradox and to the Liar. It
is interesting to note that the two ways correspond to by-now standard
tools, the so-called *first fixed point theorem* and *second
fixed point theorem* of combinatory logic and lambda calculus
(Barendregt 1984, p. 131 and p. 143; see also the distinction between
the first recursion theorem and the second recursion theorem of
classical recursion theory, in this SEP, entry
recursive functions).

Curry’s analysis of the solutions to the paradox would lead us into the realm of the theory of functionality, the history of combinatory logic and proof theory. Here it is enough to recall that according to him, a remedy would be to formulate within the system the very notion of proposition, and a way to avoid the contradictions would lead to a hierarchy of canonical propositions (or to a theory of levels of implication, already adumbrated by Church). Related ideas have been developed since the seventies by Scott 1975, Aczel 1980, Flagg and Myhill 1987, and others.

### 5.4 Criticizing standard implication and negation

In the 1930s, an alternative route to solve the antinomies emerged. This approach exploits the duplication (contraction) combinator \(W\) which satisfies \(Wfx=fxx\); if \(N\) represents negation and \(Babc=a(bc)\), then \(W(BN)(W(BN))\) is a fixed point of negation, and it is a functional analogue of the Russell class. On the logical level, assigning a type to \(W\) leads to the essential inference applied in the derivation of Curry’s paradox, i.e., the contraction rule \(A\rightarrow(A\rightarrow B) \Rightarrow(A\rightarrow B)\). The role of contraction was noticed by Fitch 1936, who observed that, in order to derive the Russell paradox one considers a function of two variables, then one diagonalizes and regards such an object as a new unary propositional function. But this step only works if \(W\) is accepted. Fitch then proposed a “non-contractive” logic, but his paper did not go beyond a brief sketch of a fragment of classical logic with predicates. One has to wait until the mid eighties to see contraction-free logics used systematically in proof theory and in theoretical computer science (see the entry linear logic).

Fitch 1942 proposed a new approach to the problem of finding
consistent combinatory logic systems, which were progressively
expanded and refined over many years (until 1980). Fitch’s
method to avoid paradoxes consists of *the construction of suitable
syntactical models, endowed with self-referential notions of class,
membership and truth.* Truth and membership are inductively
generated by iterating rules that correspond to natural logical
closure conditions and can be formalized by means of *positive*
(i.e. negation- and implication-free) clauses. This fact implies that
the generation process is cumulative and becomes saturated at a
certain point, thus yielding consistent non-trivial interpretations
for truth and membership. Mathematically, a collection of positive
clauses always gives rise to an operator, say \(G\), mapping sets of
expressions into sets of expressions and preserving the inclusion
relation (i.e., monotone); the saturated sets then correspond to fixed
points of the monotone operator \(G\) (i.e., to sets \(X\) satisfying
\(G(X)=X)\), which exist according to a classical theorem about
complete lattices (see Birkhoff 1967).

In the early 1940s, Fitch explored a purely positive (negationless)
combinatory system \(K\) with the explicit aim of defining a sort of
*universal formal system*, where *every system of logic*
could be represented. Later he was able to strengthen his approach to
include forms of negation and implication, insofar as he provided
*a simultaneous generation of truth and falsehood*, and this
actually amounts to conceive truth as a *partial predicate*.
Fitch’s approach is radically intensional: classes are always
classes of expressions \(M\) in some language (say, of the basic
logic) and they are identified with attributes, while membership is
essentially reduced to truth in the sense of \(K\). Thus, that \(M\in
T\) holds, essentially means that \(M\) truly falls under the property
specified (or expressed) by \(T\) (see also the entry on
combinatory logic).
Logical systems, along similar lines, were also proposed and proved
consistent via proof theoretic methods by Schütte in the early
fifties (see Schütte 1960 for a comprehensive treatment).

To a certain extent, the ideas of Fitch can be regarded as introducing
the view that the basic predicates of truth and membership have to be
*partial* or, if you like, *three-valued*. Bochvar
(1937) outlines a proposal based on the introduction of a three-valued
logic, where, besides the standard truth values T (truth) and F
(false), there exists a third value N, to be interpreted as
“meaningless”. His logical analysis leads to the
conclusion that the paradoxes involve meaningless statements. A
characteristic feature of Bochvar’s formalism is that it
distinguishes two types of connectives, roughly corresponding to two
different modes of assertion. A statement \(A\) in itself assumes
exactly one among the prescribed values (true, false or meaningless);
but the *internal* three-valued logical operations are also
equipped with *external* logical operations, which correspond
to statements on the metalevel and allow the use of classical logic in
dealing with non-classical statements. Formally, he described three
valued truth tables for the main propositional internal connectives
& (and), \(\sim\) (negation), \(\vee\) (or), \(\rightarrow\)
(implication), \(\leftrightarrow\) (logical equivalence). The truth
values of \(\sim A, A \amp B\), etc., coincide with their classical
values if \(A, B\) assume classical values; they are meaningless
(assume value N) if one among \(A, B\) has value N (strictness). No
formula built up with the standard connectives can be valid (or a
tautology, i.e., is true under all possible assignments), as \(A
\rightarrow A\) has value N, if \(A\) is meaningless. But there are
connectives allowing the formation of *metatheorical
statements* such as \(\vdash A, \neg A, \downarrow A\), to be read
as “\(A\) is true”, “\(A\) is false”, “A
is meaningless” (in the given order). The value of \(\vdash A
(\neg A)\) is true if \(A\) is true (false), false (true) otherwise.
Bochvar describes a version of the extended type-free logical calculus
of Hilbert-Ackermann (1928), and, in order to dispose of the
paradoxes, he restricts substitution and hence the comprehension
schema of the form

\(\exists F\forall x(F(x) \leftrightarrow \phi)\), where \(\phi\) is any formula in which \(F\) is not free and which may or may not have \(x\) free.

to conditions \(\phi\) with only *internal* logical operations.
Apparently, Bochvar’s solution is not simply a *gap
solution*, where the logic is weakened; instead, he formalizes the
distinction between object *level* and *metalevel* in
the logic itself. This makes his theory quite expressive (e.g., it can
handle the very notion of “non-sensical”,
“meaningless”).

### 5.5 Non-terminating processes, cycles and typical ambiguity

Behmann’s paper 1931 (presented in 1929) locates the source of the paradoxes in the definitional machinery. The paper begins with an analysis of Russell’s contradiction in the form of predicate application. There he observes that, once the Russell predicate \(F\) is defined by the stipulation

\[ F(\phi) =_{df} \neg \phi(\phi), \]it must be possible to eliminate \(F\) from any argument involving it. But, if we try to replace \(F\) by its definiens, we obtain \(F(F) \equiv \neg F(F)\), and we are trapped in an infinite regress, as there is no \(F\)-free expression that could replace \(F(F)\). So the contradiction is ascribed to an error in the theory of definitions, namely to the use of definitions that give rise to an infinite chain of substitutions, without converging to a result. Behmann’s technical proposal consists in a reformed logic without types but with an added operator ! which, when given a predicate \(\chi\), singles out exactly those arguments \(x\) to which \(\chi\) meaningfully applies. For instance, the syllogism Barbara, usually stated in the form

\[ (\forall x)(A(x) \rightarrow B(x)) \amp(\forall x)(B(x) \rightarrow C(x)) \rightarrow(\forall x)(A(x) \rightarrow C(x)), \]is corrected to

\[ (\forall x)(A(x) \rightarrow B(x)) \amp(\forall x)(B(x) \rightarrow C(x)) \rightarrow (\forall x)(C(x))! \rightarrow (A(x) \rightarrow C(x))), \]where the range of the final quantifier is restricted to those \(x\) for which it does make sense. Behmann did not develop a systematic theory until much later and it is unclear how to interpret his special operator \(!\). Nevertheless, his work has inspired work by Aczel and Feferman (1980).

Lewis and Langford (1932) are led to conclusions which are not
dissimilar to those of Behmann. According to them, the paradoxes show
that certain expressions *do not express propositions*. They
adopt the notation \(p : \alpha\) to mean that \(p\) is a name whose
meaning is the proposition \(\alpha\) (so \(p\) and
“\(\alpha\)” denote the same entity and can replace each
other); typically the Liar amounts to “\(p: p\) is false”,
but we can also imagine more complex self-referential situations, for
instance:

In this case, there is no contradiction, but we become entangled in a
vicious regress (p. 440), and hence *no proposition* arises. In
general, one can create arbitrary complicated cycles and check that
they can lead either to contradictions or to infinite regress; but in
either case, the expression fails to converge to a definite
proposition.

Even after the logics developed by Russell, Zermelo and Tarski had
created the theoretical means to get rid of difficulties involved in
the notions of class, set, truth, definability, the paradoxes have
remained alive. This probably is due to a persistent interest in
alternative formal paradigms, to the controversial features and axioms
of *Principia Mathematica,* and to the problematic place that
self-reference occupies in mathematical logic. In this context, it is
worth mentioning Quine’s paper of 1937 on the system NF (see the
entry
Quine’s New Foundations),
which takes inspiration from the Russellian notion of *typical
ambiguity*, that is, from the systematic device of suppressing the
order indices of propositional functions and their arguments, leaving
them to be restored at will, when needed, according to the discipline
of type theory (see 3.2 above). The idea is to restrict naive
comprehension to those instances that are *stratified*, where
in general a formula \(\phi\) is *stratified* iff it is
possible to assign a natural number (type in short) to each term
occurrence in such a way that the resulting formula is well-formed in
the sense of type theory, e.g., if \(t \in\) s is a subformula of
\(\phi\), the type of \(s\) is one greater than the type of \(t\),
etc.. Clearly, stratification blocks set formation when formulas of
the form \(x\in x, \neg x\in x\) are present. Moreover, in NF the
universal set exists. The consistency problem for NF is still open
(though partial results are known concerning fragments with bounds on
stratification or restriction to extensionality). Remarkably, NF
refutes the axiom of choice by a classical theorem of Specker. Again,
a classical result of Specker establishes the existence of a model of
NF in a suitable version of simple type theory with a formal
counterpart of typical ambiguity. Paradoxes are not that far from NF.
In 1942 Rosser (and independently Lyndon) published a form of
Burali-Forti’s antinomy in a seemingly natural extension (named
ML) of the system NF, obtained by adding “ultimate
classes”. ML was defined to avoid certain weaknesses of NF
(e.g., with respect to number theoretic induction). Once more, the
Lyndon-Rosser result brought about the unexpected presence of a
paradox in set theory and the foundations of mathematical logic.

## 6. A glance at present-day investigations

### 6.1 From paradoxes to theorems

As noticed many years ago by Kreisel and quite aptly recalled by Dean
2020, p. 541, the right question to deal with is not how *to get
rid of paradoxes* or to solve them: instead, the *fruitful*
problem is *to get something out of them*. Indeed, paradoxes
can be converted into plain undecidability/undefinability theorems,
and this is the consequence of a systematic methodology: with the work
of Gödel and Tarski, paradoxical arguments are reshaped into
fixed point results, while the semantic conception of truth gives rise
*to a formalization of semantics itself*, yielding firm grounds
for systematic metamathematical investigations, as can be seen from
several early contributions by a number of logicians, e.g. Kreisel
1950, Wang 1955. For instance, arithmetizing semantics yields a
refinement of the completeness theorem, the so-called *arithmetized
completeness theorem* ART: every recursive consistent theory has a
model in which the function symbols are replaced by primitive
recursive functions and the predicate symbols are replaced by
predicates which are definable *with just 2 quantifiers* in a
version of formal number theory (cf. Hilbert and Bernays 1939, p. 293
and Feferman 1960). By adding an arithmetic sentence Con(S) expressing
the consistency of a *set* theory S as a new axiom to
elementary number theory, one can prove in the resulting system
*arithmetic translations* of all theorems of S. A by-product of
this metamathematical formalization is a *de facto* unification
of set theoretic and semantic theoretic paradoxes, in the sense that
paradoxes of either sort become tools for proving incompleteness and
undecidability. Typically, a given paradoxical notion is formalized as
a predicate in a language of a theory interpreting (at least a
fragment of) number theory Z; one then applies diagonalization,
self-reference, etc., in order to get statements which correspond to
number theoretic sentences that becomes undecidable or unprovable
given a consistency assumption.

### 6.2 Foundational frameworks and paradoxes

Philosophical motivations are strongly influential in contemporary logical investigation of paradoxes and hence it is natural to wonder what is surviving of the initial Fregean theory of concepts, as based upon an inconsistent principle of abstraction and the logicistic outlook. Well, the answer is that a non-trivial legacy is still alive: this is especially clear from the Neo-Fregean approach based on Hume’s principle and variations thereof. Consistent subsystems of Frege’s Grundgesetze have been isolated and are currently studied: see Burgess 2005, also for a comprehensive reference list to preceding work by Boolos, Wright and Hale, Heck, Wehmeier, Ferreira, Antonelli and May (see the essays contained in Reck and Cook 2016, and also the entry logicism and neologicism). In addition, work in the Neo-Fregean tradition has shown that the inconsistency of the principle of extensional abstraction (Basic Law V) in Grundgesetze is only an instance of a more general result on the inconsistency in second order logic (extended with a symbol for a function f from concepts to objects) of any abstraction principles that satisfy a condition called “part-whole”: if A is strictly included in B then f(A)≠f(B) (see Mancosu and Siskind 2019).

On the other hand, once we set apart the ideological inspiration of logicism, we might believe that the development of logic and set theory in the 20th century has fully sterilized paradoxes, and that contradictions in logical systems are phenomena of the years of foundational crisis only. But this is not true: paradoxes have been discovered in logical systems related to computer science. For instance, half a century ago, Girard showed that a constructive theory of types, due to Per Martin-Löf 1971, and based on the Curry-Howard correspondence, is inconsistent with the existence of a type of all types; the contradiction follows by means of a type-theoretic reconstruction of an argument related to the Burali-Forti antinomy and the Mirimanoff paradox of grounded sets. Later, Coquand 1986 proved that certain extensions of the calculus C of constructions are inconsistent. Very roughly, C is a higher order impredicative type theory, extending Girard’s system F, a powerful second-order typed lambda calculus with abstraction on types which is suitable for representing proofs of impredicative intuitionistic second-order logic. Coquand 1994 offered a new paradox affecting type theory, which refines Reynold’s result that there is no classical set-theoretic model of polymorphism (read: Girard’s system F, see the entries Type Theory, set theory: constructive and intuitionistic ZF). On the other side, a general type-free development of the theory of constructions as a foundation for constructive provability in logic and mathematics was originally proposed by Kreisel and Goodman, but it turned out to be affected by an antinomy, which has been recently reconsidered by Dean and Kurokawa 2016.

On the borderline between foundational issues and applications in
computer science, arguments with typical paradoxical flavor occur in
the investigation of Feferman’s *explicit mathematics*
(EM), a theory of (self-applicable) operations and non-extensional
classifications. For instance, the existence of a strong power type
construction leads to inconsistency in the so-called “theories
of types and names”, a development of EM introduced by
Jäger 1997. Paradoxical arguments are also useful for assessing
the role of universes and *refuting non-extensionality* in EM,
in presence of forms of *uniform* naïve comprehension (see
Cantini and Minari 1999). Indeed, the role of uniformity is essential
in previous investigations. Concerning naïve comprehension, it is
known since the seventies (Malitz 1976) and the eighties (Weydert
1988, Forti and Hinnion 1989) that there exist nice topological models
of *extensionality* and *non-uniform* naïve
comprehension restricted to *generalized positivity
conditions*. This has led to the study of so-called
*hyperuniverses*. Additional consistency/inconsistency results
about the relationship between extensionality and uniform vs.
non-uniform comprehension principles can be found, e.g., in Hinnion
and Libert 2003, Libert and Esser 2005. In a similar direction, recent
theoretical proposals combine anew ideas from combinatory logic and
lambda calculus with “inductive” reinterpretations of
naïve comprehension and unrestricted truth schema, along a path
already opened by Fitch in the late forties (see Scott 1975, Flagg and
Myhill 1987, Aczel 1980, and Feferman 1984). Beginning with 1992,
there was an attempt, due to K. Grue, to resurrect Church’s
lambda calculus as a foundation of mathematics. Grue 2002 presents a
very strong extension of lambda calculus, the so-called *map
theory*, in which standard axiomatic set theory becomes
interpretable, and which can be used to shed light on the difference
between Russell’s and Burali-Forti’s paradoxes.

### 6.3 Circularity and self-reference

Since Mirimanoff, Finsler and others, logicians have studied universes of set theory where circular sets exist. However, it is only since the early Eighties that a genuine mathematics of non-well-founded sets (see | set theory: non-wellfounded) is being developed. Using the axiom AFA of anti-foundation, direct self-reference is allowed in set theory, and there exist plenty of sets solving general self-referential equations (AFA was introduced by Forti and Honsell in 1983; for systematic development and history, see Aczel 1988). In particular, non-wellfounded sets are applied to the analysis of the paradoxes, to the semantics of natural languages and to theoretical computer science (see Barwise and Etchemendy 1984, Barwise and Moss 1996).

Concerning the issue whether self-reference can be avoided in deriving paradoxes, and hence whether there are genuine contradictions arising from ungroundedness, a positive answer has been given by the semantical paradox of Yablo 1993: there are infinitely many agents , etc., each one claiming the same sentence: “at least one agent following me is lying”; but this yields a contradiction – see also the entries on self-reference and liar paradox. The issue this construction raises, namely whether circularity and self-reference are necessary and sufficient conditions to the appearance of paradoxes, has been further considered in Yablo 2006 (see Cook 2014 for a comprehensive study on this matter, and Halbach and Zhang 2017 for a proof without diagonal lemma). Moreover, the connection between the incompleteness phenomena and paradoxes has been extended up to include Yablo’s paradox, as a special case of Liar-type paradoxes (Kurahashi 2014, Kikuchi and Kurahashi 2016).

The analysis of self-reference and diagonalization has motivated the application of algebraic and topological techniques: consider Scott’s models for extensional lambda calculus (Scott 1972) and their subsequent categorical understanding. On the other hand, category theory has been used for new approaches to paradoxes since Lawvere 1969. A mathematical approach to the general issue of “self-reference vs. unfoundedness” can be found in Bernardi 2001, 2009. Besides Yablo’s paradox and a game theoretic version of Mirimanoff’s paradox, several classical results (existence of a non-r.e. set, Cantor’s theorems on the nondenumerability of the reals) can be transformed into existence theorems for suitable unfounded chains (and formally, unfounded chains are regarded as generalized fixed points).

### 6.4 From paradoxes to incompleteness

In standard metamathematics, an important role for a thorough
understanding of the second incompleteness theorem is played by
*Löb’s theorem* (Löb 1955). The proof of the
theorem is related to *Curry’s paradox* (see this entry,
and
Curry’s Paradox)
and to an informal argument due to Geach 1955. Furthermore,
Löb’s theorem is essential for defining mathematical
structures, which are adequate for providing versions of
self-reference and incompleteness (see the so-called *Magari
algebras* and the modal analysis of formal provability, Boolos
1993). In the same direction, there are applications of
*Berry’s paradox*. For instance, in 1966 Vopenka proved
the second incompleteness theorem for the Bernays-Gödel theory of
sets and classes using a form of the same paradox. Boolos 1989
exploits a Berry-type argument to prove incompleteness in the form
“*there is no algorithm whose output contains all true
statements of arithmetic and no false ones*” without
appealing to diagonalization. The Berry paradox has been related to
the incompleteness phenomena also because of work (going back to the
sixties and the seventies) in the so-called Kolmogorov complexity and
*algorithmic information theory*. In particular, Chaitin has
shown in a number of papers how to exploit randomness to prove certain
limitations of formal systems (see Chaitin 1995). In connection with
Chaitin’s results, Kritchman and Raz 2011 gives a proof of the
second incompleteness theorem, which is based on an argument
resembling the *surprise-test paradox* (see
epistemic paradoxes).
In turn, this paradox can be explicitly related to Solovay’s
completeness theorem of *provability logic* (see Montagna
1994), and more recently Egré 2005, De Voos, Kooj and Verbrugge
2018 applied provability logic to solving *the Knower’s
paradox*. It is worth recalling that – again on the side of
epistemic logic – self-reference is applicable in order to prove
*incompleteness in belief models*. Brandenburger and Keisler
(2006) identified a paradox of self-reference in beliefs in games,
which yields a *game-theoretic impossibility* theorem akin to
Russell’s Paradox. An informal version of the paradox is that
the following configuration of beliefs is impossible: Ann believes
that Bob assumes that Ann believes that Bob’s assumption is
wrong. This is formalized to show that any belief model of a certain
kind must have a ’hole’. An interpretation of the result
is that “if the analyst’s tools are available to the
players in a game, *then there are statements that the players can
think about but cannot assume*.” Also, the mere fact of
paradoxes like this one, with a distinct logical
“flavour”, but arising out of treatments involving
epistemic notions, is notable, as it can be regarded as an indication
for a direction of work that, hinging upon the many examples already
available in the literature, is likely to expand and become systematic
in the future thanks to the application of formal methods (see also
this entry, §6.5 on this). Although not directly connected with
the incompleteness phenomenon, there are indeed several accounts of
antinomies affecting what appear to be sets of apparently legitimate,
natural postulates involving certain epistemic notions. Let Leitgeb
2021 work as an ultimate example of sources of this sort, presenting a
solution to the lottery paradox (see Kyburg 1961 and
epistemic paradoxes)
that affects principles relating categorical belief to graded belief
(see also Douven 2021 that contains the former source).

### 6.5 On the foundations of semantics, again

In the final quarter of the last century a host of logical papers
arise from the discussion of the foundations of semantics, with a
number of proposals which generalize or modify Tarski’s
semantical conception of truth. Tarski notwithstanding, since 1975 the
hierarchical approach has been somewhat superseded by new ideas that
have rendered the ideal of logical and semantical closure in many
respect accessible (especially by means of the fixed point methods
used by Kripke 1975 and Martin-Woodruff; see Martin 1984). We also
mention the approach stemming from Herzberger, Gupta and Belnap 1993
(see the entry
revision theory of truth),
that has connections with non-elementary parts of definability
theory, set theory and higher recursion theory (Welch 2001, 2009,
2011, 2019). This has led to the general axiomatic study of
*revision-theoretic definitions* and theories of *circular
definitions* (see Bruni 2009, 2013b, 2015, 2019). In Standefer
2015 a connection is established between Solovay type theorem and
circular definitions of revision theory and a particular modal logic
RT (revision theory): a completeness theorem for this logic, analogous
to Solovay’s completeness theorem for GL, is proven. The modal
logic in question is built upon an operator that is naturally
connected with revision-theoretic construction (hence, the name), as
explained in Gupta and Standefer 2017. The proof theory of this system
is studied in Standefer 2018.

Recent advances on revision theory, have contributed to prove the fertility of the approach (in a direction related to the last part of §6.4 of this entry): Gupta 2011 presents an application to the concept of strategic rationality in a certain type of finite games that is connected to a common way of understanding rational choice in strategic contexts. Although developed independently, Gupta’s stance is reminiscent of previous work by H. Gaifman about rationality being affected by paradoxes resembling the truth theoretic paradoxes like the liar paradox (see Gaifman 1999). An extension of this approach to the class of all finite games is presented in Bruni and Sillari 2018. The notable aspect of Gupta’s application is that it makes use of only the finite part of revision theory (i.e., it does not need the transfinite iteration of this construction), and it gets rid of the rule for dealing with stages corresponding to limit ordinals. This limit rule, which is essential to address the concept of truth, turned out to be the most critical aspect of the revision-theoretic approach to circular concepts from both the complexity, and the conceptual point of view (see Campbell-Moore 2019 for a recent, new approach to the topic).

The wealth and variety of semantical tools has triggered a sort of
experimenting with a number of *mixed* proposals. Refinements
of revision theory and generalizations thereof can be found in Rivello
2019a e 2019b where a new approach to a formal theory of truth is
developed, which implements features of Kripke’s fixed point
theory with the Herzberger-Gupta revision theory. An analogous
combination, studied from a more proof-theoretic angle, was considered
in Standefer 2017. Similarly, combinations of the possible worlds
semantics for the necessity predicate with Kripke’s
supervaluational partial models for the truth predicate are also
studied by Nicolai 2018.

Field (2003, 2008) has proposed influential solutions of the
semantical paradoxes which combine Kripkean and revision theoretic
techniques. According to him, the present solutions to the paradoxes
are not satisfactory because of the following points: (i) the lack of
a decent conditional (and biconditional); (ii) the failure of (some
instances of) the T-schema (A ↔ T(⌈A⌉); (iii) the
failure of intersubstitutivity between A and T(⌈A⌉); (iv)
the impossibility of providing an internal analysis of the
defectiveness of the paradoxical sentences. Field (2008) has
consequently developed a theory of truth with *a non-classical
conditional operator*, which allows to express a notion of
*determinate truth* and to state that the Liar is not
determinately true. Analysis of Field’s construction requires
sophisticated *set-theoretic and recursion theoretic
developments* (see Welch 2008, 2009, 2011). Moreover, the
possibility of logically enriching Kripke’s theory of truth with
*novel conditionals* has opened up new routes: e.g. Rossi
(2016) provides an interesting method of incorporating a conditional
conforming to Łukasiewicz three-valued logic in a fixed-point
construction for truth. In the same direction, a considerable
attention has been directed in recent literature to the so called
*revenge problem*: typical solutions, say, of the Liar paradox,
rely on notions that, if expressible in the object language, give rise
to new versions of the paradox. So, the solution is only an illusion.
The revenge problem can be instantiated by the so-called Strengthened
Liar: informally, once we have a model which makes *the Liar
sentence L* itself neither true nor false, and we can express this
very fact, L is after all not true. But this is the claim made by L,
and hence L is true. So the paradox seems to show up again (for more
details, see the entry
liar paradox and
the collection of essays contained in Beall 2007).

“Indexical” solutions of the Liar have been developed in
several contributions, e.g., by Burge, Gaifman, Simmons. The idea is
that the Liar paradox does not involve sentences, but *specific
occurrences of sentences*, i.e., sentence tokens (this idea is to
be found already in scholastic solutions). For the sake of historical
accuracy, let us mention that in 1913 Lesniewski, later Tarski’s
dissertation advisor, had already advanced an indexical
nominalistically inspired solution of the Liar in his paper *A
Critique of the Logical Principle of the Excluded Middle* (see
Betti 2004).

Besides the model-theoretic side, *axiomatic investigations of
truth* and related paradoxes have become increasingly important
since the seminal papers of Friedman and Sheard 1987, Feferman 1991.
Since the year 2000, this research thread has been intensively studied
with various aims, from *proof-theoretic analysis* to
philosophical discussion of *minimalism* (for a survey of the
varieties of truth theoretic systems and appropriate references, see
the entry on
axiomatic theories of truth and
the recent monographs of Halbach 2011, Horsten 2011; see also the
papers Feferman 2008, Fujimoto 2010, Leigh and Rathjen 2010).

Last but not least, the axiomatic study of epistemic notions has
greatly benefited from application of techniques used for proving
incompleteness and indefinability results since the early sixties:
they have yielded negative results (Kaplan and Montague 1960, Montague
1963, Thomason 1980) and established an interesting link with the
surprise test paradox. The situation may have also been changed by the
study of possible world semantics for modal notions, conceived as
*predicates* in Halbach, Leitgeb and Welch 2003. However this
is open to debate and experimentation: for instance it is argued in
Halbach and Welch 2009 that the predicate approach to necessity is a
viable route — insofar as the expressive power is considered
— provided one resorts to languages that involve both a
*truth predicate* and the *necessity operator*.

### 6.6 Staying non-classical

A number of solutions have been proposed, which rely on the use of paraconsistent logics (Priest) or substructural logics (see the entry logic: paraconsistent, as well as the entry substructural logics and Mares and Paoli 2014).

The investigation of semantical and set-theoretic paradoxes in
infinite-valued logic—which was pioneered by Mow Shaw-Kwei 1954
and Skolem in 1957 — has received a new impulse by contributions
by Hajek, Shepherdson and Paris 2000, and Hajek 2005, 2010. Typically,
in these papers basic results from *mathematical analysis* are
applied (e.g. Brouwer’s fixed point theorem). It is worth
mentioning that Leitgeb 2008 has given a consistency proof for a
*probabilistic theory of truth* with unrestricted T-schema by
making use of the Hahn-Banach Theorem. A follow-up of the latter
source that connects with researches related to the revision theory
(see §6.5), is Campbell-Moore, Horsten and Leitgeb 2019.

Theories of naive truth—as based on the unrestricted biconditional and on a logic without contraction—are to be found in the literature, e.g see Cantini 2002, Zardini 2011, Bacon 2013, Standefer 2016. Ripley 2012, instead, presents an alternative approach based on a non-transitive logical system (see also Cobreros et al. 2012, as well as Cobreros et al. 2015, which attempts at extending the approach to the paradoxes of vagueness).

Grišin 1981 proved that the system based upon the paradoxical
principle *par excellence*—the uniform naïve
comprehension schema—and (some form of) non-contractive logic
enjoys cut elimination, and hence is consistent. On the other hand,
the consistency of the system is ruined by extensionality and this
could be counted as an additional paradox! Of course
‘uniform’ here means that a variable-binding abstraction
operator {*x* | φ(*x*,*a*)} for naming the
set defined by φ, depending on a list of given parameters
*a*, is available. Interestingly, it has been shown that
closely related systems have unexpected applications to the
characterization of complexity classes (Girard 1998, Terui 2004); on
the other hand, the system is *computationally complete* (it
can interpret combinatory logic, Cantini 2003).

### 6.7 Towards a “geometric” approach

Besides tools from algebra and analysis, logical investigations about
paradoxes have recently applied graph theory (see Cook 2004, Rabern,
Rabern and Macauley 2013, Beringer and Schindler 2017, Hsiung 2017): a
basic idea is the attempt to grasp in geometric terms *the patterns
of paradox*, *their structural features*. For instance, one
can assign a *reference graph* (rfg) to sentences of the
language of arithmetic with truth via Leitgeb’s notion of
dependence (Leitgeb 2005). It is further conjectured that a solution
to the characterization problem for dangerous rfgs amounts to the
claim that *basically the Liar- and the Yablo graph are the only
paradoxical rfgs*. This route is independently developed in Rossi
2019 by exploring the wide range of semantic behaviours displayed by
paradoxical sentences, and providing a unified theory of truth and
paradox. The result is a theory of truth that yields a threefold
classification of paradoxical sentences (liar-like sentences,
truth-teller-like sentences, and revenge sentences), and proposes a
way of interpreting all three kinds, as well as paradox-free
sentences, within a single model, where the basic tool is a notion of
“semantic graph”. In Hsiung 2020, instead, Leitgeb’s
approach is combined with the one of Beringer and Schindler 2017 to
study a type of paradoxes of finitary characteristic, which is defined
in terms of Leitgeb’s dependence relation itself.

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### Recent Sources

This list contains (i) items cited in the final section; (ii) items related to developments of paradoxes after the Second World War; (iii) critical historical papers.

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*Studia Logica*, 101: 1–9. - Barendregt, H., 1984,
*The Lambda Calculus. Its Syntax and Semantics*(Studies in Logic and the Foundations of Mathematics, vol. 103), Amsterdam: Elsevier. - Barwise, J. and Etchemendy, J., 1984.
*The Liar*, New York: Oxford University Press. - Barwise J. and Moss, L., 1996,
*Vicious Circles. On the Mathematics of Non-Wellfounded Phenomena*, Stanford: CSLI, 1996. - Beall, JC (ed.), 2003,
*Liars and Heaps*, Oxford: Clarendon Press. - –––, 2007,
*Revenge of the Liar. New Essays on the Paradox*, New York: Oxford University Press. - Beringer, T. and Schindler, T., 2017, “A graph-theoretic
analysis of the semantic paradoxes”,
*Bull. Symb. Log.*, 23: 442–492. - Bernardi, C., 2001, “Fixed points and unfounded
chains”,
*Annals of Pure and Applied Logic*, 109: 163–178. - –––, 2009, “A topological approach to
Yablo’s paradox”,
*Notre Dame Journal of Formal Logic*, 50: 331–338. - Betti, A., 2004, “Lesniewski’s early Liar, Tarski and
natural language”,
*Annals of pure and applied logic*, 127: 267–287 - Birkhoff, G., 1967,
*Lattice Theory*, Providence, RI: American Mathematical Society, 3^{rd}edition. - Boolos, G., 1989, “A new proof of the Gödel
incompleteness theorem”,
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*The logic of provability*, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. - Brandenburger, A. and Keisler, H. J., 2006, “An
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*Studia Logica,*84: 211–240. - Bruni, R., 2009 “A note on theories for quasi-inductive
definitions”,
*Review of Symbolic Logic*, 2: 684–699. - –––, 2013, “Beppo Levi’s analysis of
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*Logica Universalis*, 7: 211–231. - –––, 2013b, “Analytic calculi for circular
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*Journal of Philosophical Logic*, 47: 419–448. - Bueno, O., Menzel, C., and Zalta, E.N., 2014, “Worlds and
Propositions Set Free”,
*Erkenntnis*, 79: 797–820. - Burgess, A.G. and Burgess, J.P., 2011,
*Truth*, Princeton: Princeton University Press. - Burgess, J., 2005,
*Fixing Frege*, Princeton: Princeton University Press. - Campbell-Moore, C., 2019, “Limits in the Revision Theory:
More Than Just Definite Verdicts”,
*Journal of Philosophical Logic*, 48: 11–35. - Campbell-Moore C., Horsten, L. and Leitgeb, H., 2019,
“Probability for the Revision Theory of Truth”,
*Journal of Philosophical Logic*, 48: 87–112. - Cantini, A. and Minari, P., 1999, “Uniform inseparability in
explicit mathematics”,
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Grišin’s set theory”,
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*Complexity*, 1: 26–30. - Church, A., 1976,“A Comparison of Russell’s Resolution
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*Journal of Symbolic Logic*, 41: 747–760. - Cobreros, P., Egré, P., Ripley, D. and van Rooij, R., 2012,
“Tolerant, classical, strict”,
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consequence”, in K. Fujimoto, J. Martínez
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*Unifying the Philosophy of Truth*, Springer Verlag, 409–430. - Cook, R.T., 2004, “Patterns of Paradox”,
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*Proceedings of the IEEE Symposium on Logic in Computer Science*, pp. 227–236. - –––, 1994, “A new paradox in type
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*Logic, Methodology and Philosophy of Science IX*, Studies in Logic and the Foundations of Mathematics, vol. 134, Amsterdam: North-Holland, 555–570. - Dean, W., 2020, “Incompleteness via Paradox”,
*Review of Symbolic Logic*, 13(3): 541–592. - Dean, W. and Kurokawa, H., 2016, “Kreisel’s Theory of
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*Unifying the Philosophy of Truth*, Dordrecht: Springer, 153–167. - Égré, P., 2005, “The Knower Paradox in the
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for positive comprehension principles”,
*Journal of Symbolic Logic*, 54: 1401–1418. - Friedman, H. and Sheard, M., 1987, “An Axiomatic Approach to
Self-Referential Truth”,
*Annals of Pure and Applied Logic*, 33: 1–21. - Fujimoto, K, 2010, “Relative truth and definability of
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*Bulletin of Symbolic Logic*, 16: 33: 305–344. - –––, 2011, “Autonomous progression and
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*Journal of Symbolic Logic*, 76: 914–945. - –––, 2012, “Classes and truths in set
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*Annals of Pure and Applied Logic*, 163: 1484–1523. - Gaifman, H., 1988. “Operational pointer semantics: Solution
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*Proceedings of the Second Conference on Theoretical Aspects of Reasoning about Knowledge*, San Francisco: Morgan Kaufmann, 43–59. - –––, 1999, “Self-Reference and the
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*Annals of Pure and Applied Logic*, 96: 117–140. - Garciadiego, A., 1992,
*Bertrand Russell and the Origins of Set-theoretic “Paradoxes”*, Basel: Birkhäuser. - Geach, P., 1955, “On Insolubilia”,
*Analysis*, 15: 71–72. - Girard, J. Y., 1998, “Light linear logic”,
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*Mind*, 118: 71–100. - Halbach, V. and Zhang, S., 2017, “Yablo without
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*Mind*, 126: 195–232. - Hsiung, M., 2017, “Boolean paradoxes and revision
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*Studia Logica*, 105: 881–914. - –––, 2020, “What paradoxes depend
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*Journal of Symbolic Logic*, 62: 1142–1146. - Kahle, R., 2004, “David Hilbert über Paradoxien”, Preprint Number 06–17, Departamento de Matemática, Universidade de Coimbra, 2006, 1–42.
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### Acknowledgments

For this edition of the entry, the authors were supported by the Italian Ministry of Education, University and Research through the PRIN 2017 program “The Manifest Image and the Scientific Image” prot. 2017ZNWW7F_004.