# Platonism in the Philosophy of Mathematics

*First published Sat Jul 18, 2009; substantive revision Tue Mar 28, 2023*

Platonism about mathematics (or *mathematical platonism*) is
the metaphysical view that there are abstract mathematical objects
whose existence is independent of us and our language, thought, and
practices. Just as electrons and planets exist independently of us, so
do numbers and sets. And just as statements about electrons and
planets are made true or false by the objects with which they are
concerned and these objects’ perfectly objective properties, so
are statements about numbers and sets. Mathematical truths are
therefore discovered, not invented.

The most important argument for the existence of abstract mathematical objects derives from Gottlob Frege and goes as follows (Frege 1953). The language of mathematics purports to refer to and quantify over abstract mathematical objects. And a great number of mathematical theorems are true. But a sentence cannot be true unless its sub-expressions succeed in doing what they purport to do. So there exist abstract mathematical objects that these expressions refer to and quantify over.

Frege’s argument notwithstanding, philosophers have developed a variety of objections to mathematical platonism. Thus, abstract mathematical objects are claimed to be epistemologically inaccessible and metaphysically problematic. Mathematical platonism has been among the most hotly debated topics in the philosophy of mathematics over the past few decades.

- 1. What is Mathematical Platonism?
- 2. The Fregean Argument for Existence
- 3. Objections to Mathematical Platonism
- 4. Between object realism and mathematical platonism
- Bibliography
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

## 1. What is Mathematical Platonism?

Mathematical platonism can be defined as the conjunction of the following three theses:

**Existence**.- There are mathematical objects.
**Abstractness**.- Mathematical objects are abstract.
**Independence**.- Mathematical objects are independent of intelligent agents and their language, thought, and practices.

Some representative definitions of ‘mathematical platonism’ are listed in the supplement

and document that the above definition is fairly standard.

Platonism in general (as opposed to platonism about mathematics specifically) is any view that arises from the above three claims by replacing the adjective ‘mathematical’ by any other adjective.

The first two claims are tolerably clear for present purposes.
**Existence** can be formalized as ‘\(\exists
xMx\)’, where ‘\(Mx\)’ abbreviates the predicate
‘\(x\) is a mathematical object’ which is true of all and
only the objects studied by pure mathematics, such as numbers, sets,
and functions. **Abstractness** says that every
mathematical object is abstract, where an object is said to be
abstract just in case it is non-spatiotemporal and (therefore)
causally inefficacious. (For further discussion, see the entry on
abstract objects.)

**Independence** is less clear than the other two claims.
What does it mean to ascribe this sort of independence to an object?
The most obvious gloss is probably the counterfactual conditional
that, had there not been any intelligent agents, or had their
language, thought, or practices been different, there would still have
been mathematical objects. However, it is doubtful that this gloss
will do all the work that **Independence** is supposed to
do (see Section
4.1).
For now, **Independence** will be left somewhat
schematic.

### 1.1 Historical remarks

Platonism must be distinguished from the view of the historical Plato. Few parties to the contemporary debate about platonism make strong exegetical claims about Plato’s view, much less defend it. Although the view that we are calling ‘platonism’ is inspired by Plato’s famous theory of abstract and eternal Forms (see the entry on Plato’s metaphysics and epistemology), platonism is now defined and debated independently of its original historical inspiration.

Not only is the platonism under discussion not Plato’s,
platonism as characterized above is a purely metaphysical view: it
should be distinguished from other views that have substantive
epistemological content. Many older characterizations of platonism add
strong epistemological claims to the effect that we have some
immediate grasp of, or insight into, the realm of abstract objects.
(See e.g., Rees 1967.) But it is useful (and nowadays fairly standard)
to reserve the term ‘platonism’ for the purely
metaphysical view described above. Many philosophers who defend
platonism in this purely metaphysical sense would reject the
additional epistemological claims. Examples include Quine and other
philosophers attracted to the so-called *indispensability
argument*, which seeks to give a broadly empirical defense of
mathematical platonism. (See the entry on
indispensability arguments in the philosophy of mathematics.)

Finally, the above definition of ‘mathematical platonism’ excludes the claim that all truths of pure mathematics are necessary, although this claim has traditionally been made by most platonists. Again, this exclusion is justified by the fact that some philosophers who are generally regarded as platonists (for instance, Quine and some adherents of the aforementioned indispensability argument) reject this additional modal claim .

### 1.2 The philosophical significance of mathematical platonism

Mathematical platonism has considerable philosophical significance. If
the view is true, it will put great pressure on the physicalist idea
that reality is exhausted by the physical. For platonism entails that
reality extends far beyond the physical world and includes objects
that aren’t part of the causal and spatiotemporal order studied
by the physical
sciences.^{[1]}
Mathematical platonism, if true, will also put great pressure on many
naturalistic theories of knowledge. For there is little doubt that we
possess mathematical knowledge. The truth of mathematical platonism
would therefore establish that we have knowledge of abstract (and thus
causally inefficacious) objects. This would be an important discovery,
which many naturalistic theories of knowledge would struggle to
accommodate.

Although these philosophical consequences are not unique to
*mathematical* platonism, this particular form of platonism is
unusually well suited to support such consequences. For mathematics is
a remarkably successful discipline, both in its own right and as a
tool for other
sciences.^{[2]}
Few contemporary analytic philosophers are willing to contradict any
of the core claims of a discipline whose scientific credentials are as
strong as those of mathematics (Lewis 1991, pp. 57–9). So if
philosophical analysis revealed mathematics to have some strange and
surprising consequences, it would be unattractive simply to reject
mathematics.^{[3]}
A form of platonism based on a discipline whose scientific
credentials are less impressive than those of mathematics would not be
in this fortunate situation. For instance, when theology turns out to
have some strange and surprising philosophical consequences, many
philosophers do not hesitate to reject the relevant parts of
theology.

### 1.3 Object realism

Let *object realism* be the view that there exist abstract
mathematical objects. Object realism is thus just the conjunction of
**Existence** and
**Abstractness**.^{[4]}
Object realism stands opposed to *nominalism*, which in
contemporary philosophy is typically defined as the view that there
are no abstract objects. (In more traditional philosophical usage the
word ‘nominalism’ refers instead to the view that there
are no universals. See Burgess & Rosen 1997, pp. 13–25 and
the entry on
abstract objects.)

Because object realism leaves out **Independence**, this
view is logically weaker than mathematical platonism. The
philosophical consequences of object realism are thus not as strong as
those of platonism. Many physicalists would accept non-physical
objects provided that these are dependent on or reducible to physical
objects. They may for instance accept objects such as corporations,
laws, and poems, provided that these are suitably dependent or
reducible to physical objects. Moreover, there appears to be no
mystery about epistemic access to non-physical objects that we have
somehow made or ‘constituted’. If corporations, laws, and
poems are made or ‘constituted’ by us, presumably we gain
knowledge of them in the process of making or
‘constituting’ them.

Some views in the philosophy of mathematics are object realist without
being platonist. One example are traditional intuitionist views, which
affirm the existence of mathematical objects but maintain that these
objects depend on or are constituted by mathematicians and their
activities.^{[5]}
Some further examples of views that are object realist without being
platonist will be discussed in Section
4.

### 1.4 Truth-value realism

*Truth-value realism* is the view that every well-formed
mathematical statement has a unique and objective truth-value that is
independent of whether it can be known by us and whether it follows
logically from our current mathematical theories. The view also holds
that most mathematical statements that are deemed to be true are in
fact true. So truth-value realism is clearly a *metaphysical*
view. But unlike platonism it is not an *ontological* view. For
although truth-value realism claims that mathematical statements have
unique and objective truth-values, it is not committed to the
distinctively platonist idea that these truth-values are to be
explained in terms of an ontology of mathematical objects.

Mathematical platonism clearly motivates truth-value realism by
providing an account of how mathematical statements get their
truth-values. But the former view does not entail the latter unless
further premises are added. For even if there are mathematical
objects, referential and quantificational indeterminacy may deprive
mathematical statements of a unique and objective truth-value.
Conversely, truth-value realism does not by itself entail
**Existence** and thus implies neither object realism nor
platonism. For there are various accounts of how mathematical
statements can come to possess unique and objective truth-values which
do not posit a realm of mathematical
objects.^{[6]}

In fact, many nominalists endorse truth-value realism, at least about more basic branches of mathematics, such as arithmetic. Nominalists of this type are committed to the slightly odd-sounding view that, although the ordinary mathematical statement

- (1)
- There are primes numbers between 10 and 20.

is true, there are in fact no mathematical objects and thus in particular no numbers. But there is no contradiction here. We must distinguish between the language \(L_M\) in which mathematicians make their claims and the language \(L_P\) in which nominalists and other philosophers make theirs. The statement (1) is made in \(L_M\). But the nominalist’s assertion that (1) is true but that there are no abstract objects is made in \(L_P\). The nominalist’s assertion is thus perfectly coherent provided that (1) is translated non-homophonically from \(L_M\) into \(L_P\). And indeed, when the nominalist claims that the truth-values of sentences of \(L_M\) are fixed in a way that doesn’t appeal to mathematical objects, it is precisely this sort of non-homophonic translation she has in mind. The view mentioned in the previous note provides an example.

This shows that for the claim **Existence** to have its
intended effect, it must be expressed in the language \(L_P\) used by
us philosophers. If the claim was expressed in the language \(L_M\)
used by mathematicians, then nominalists could accept the claim while
still denying that there are mathematical objects, contrary to the
purpose of the claim.

A small but important tradition of philosophers urge that the debate
about platonism should be replaced by, or at least transformed into, a
debate about truth-value realism. One reason offered in support of
this view is that the former debate is hopelessly unclear, while the
latter is more tractable (Dummett 1978a, pp. 228–232 and Dummett
1991b, pp. 10–15). Another reason offered is that the debate
about truth-value realism is of greater importance to both philosophy
and mathematics than the one about
platonism.^{[7]}

### 1.5 The mathematical significance of platonism

*Working realism* is the methodological view that mathematics
should be practiced *as if* platonism was true (Bernays 1935,
Shapiro 1997, pp. 21–27 and 38–44). This requires some
explanation. In debates about the foundations of mathematics platonism
has often been used to defend certain mathematical methods, such as
the following:

- Classical first-order (or stronger) languages whose singular terms and quantifiers appear to be referring to and ranging over mathematical objects. (This contrasts with the languages that dominated earlier in the history of mathematics, which relied more heavily on constructive and modal vocabulary.)
- Classical rather than intuitionistic logic.
- Non-constructive methods (such as non-constructive existence proofs) and non-constructive axioms (such as the Axiom of Choice).
- Impredicative definitions (that is, definitions that quantify over a totality to which the object being defined would belong).
- ‘Hilbertian optimism’, that is, the belief that every
mathematical problem is in principle
solvable.
^{[8]}

According to working realism, these and other classical methods are acceptable and available in all mathematical reasoning. But working realism does not take a stand on whether these methods require any philosophical defense, and if so, whether this defense must be based on platonism. In short, where platonism is an explicitly philosophical view, working realism is first and foremost a view within mathematics itself about the correct methodology of this discipline. Platonism and working realism are therefore distinct views.

However, there may of course be logical relations between the two
views. Given the origin of working realism, it is not surprising that
the view receives strong support from mathematical platonism. Assume
that mathematical platonism is true. Then clearly the language of
mathematics ought to be as described in (i). Secondly, provided it is
legitimate to reason classically about any independently existing part
of reality, (ii) would also follow. Thirdly, since platonism ensures
that mathematics is discovered rather than invented, there would be no
need for mathematicians to restrict themselves to constructive methods
and axioms, which establishes (iii). Fourth, there is a powerful and
influential argument due to Gödel (1944) that impredicative
definitions are legitimate whenever the objects being defined exist
independently of our definitions. (For instance, ‘the tallest
boy in the class’ appears unproblematic despite being
impredicative.) If this is correct, then (iv) would follow. Finally,
if mathematics is about some independently existing reality, then
every mathematical problem has a unique and determinate answer, which
provides at least some motivation for Hilbertian optimism. (See,
however, the discussion of *plenitudinous platonism* in Section
4.2.)

The truth of mathematical platonism would therefore have important consequences within mathematics itself. It would justify the classical methods associated with working realism and encourage the search for new axioms to settle questions (such as the Continuum Hypothesis) which are left open by our current mathematical theories.

However, working realism does not in any obvious way imply platonism.
Although working realism says that we are justified in using the
platonistic language of contemporary mathematics, this falls short of
platonism in at least two ways. As the above discussion of truth-value
realism showed, the platonistic language of mathematics can be
analysed in such a way as to avoid reference to and quantification
over mathematical objects. Moreover, even if a face-value analysis of
the language of mathematics could be justified, this would support
object realism but not platonism. An additional argument would be
needed for the third component of platonism, namely,
**Independence**. The prospects for such an argument are
discussed in Section
4.1.

## 2. The Fregean Argument for Existence

We now describe a template of an argument for the existence of
mathematical objects. Since the first philosopher who developed an
argument of this general form was Frege, it will be referred to as
*the Fregean argument*. But the template is general and
abstracts away from most specific aspects of Frege’s own defense
of the existence of mathematical objects, such as his view that
arithmetic is reducible to logic. Fregean logicism is just one way in
which this template can be developed; some other ways will be
mentioned below.

### 2.1 The structure of the argument

The Fregean argument is based on two premises, the first of which concerns the semantics of the language of mathematics:

**Classical Semantics**.- The singular terms of the language of mathematics purport to refer to mathematical objects, and its first-order quantifiers purport to range over such objects.

The word ‘purport’ needs to be explained. When a sentence \(S\) purports to refer or quantify in a certain way, this means that for \(S\) to be true, \(S\) must succeed in referring or quantifying in this way.

The second premise does not require much explanation:

**Truth**.- Most sentences accepted as mathematical theorems are true (regardless of their syntactic and semantic structure).

Consider sentences that are accepted as mathematical theorems and that
contain one or more mathematical singular terms. By
**Truth**, most of these sentences are
true.^{[9]}
Let \(S\) be one such sentence. By **Classical
Semantics**, the truth of \(S\) requires that its singular
terms succeed in referring to mathematical objects. Hence there must
be mathematical objects, as asserted by
**Existence**.^{[10]}

### 2.2 Defending Classical Semantics

**Classical Semantics** claims that the language of
mathematics functions semantically much like language in general
functions (or at least has traditionally been assumed to function):
the semantic functions of singular terms and quantifiers are to refer
to objects and to range over objects, respectively. This is a broadly
empirical claim about the workings of a semi-formal language used by
the community of professional mathematicians. (In the widely adopted
terminology of Burgess & Rosen 1997, pp. 6–7,
**Classical Semantics** is a *hermeneutic* claim;
that is, it is a descriptive claim about how a certain language is
actually used, not a normative claim about how this language ought to
be used.) Note also that **Classical Semantics** is
compatible with most traditional views on semantics; in particular, it
is compatible with all the standard views on the meanings of
sentences, namely that they are truth-values, propositions, or sets of
possible worlds.

**Classical Semantics** enjoys strong *prima
facie* plausibility. For the language of mathematics strongly
appears to have the same semantic structure as ordinary
non-mathematical language. As Burgess (1999) observes, the following
two sentences appear to have the same simple semantic structure of a
predicate being ascribed to a subject (p. 288):

- Evelyn is prim.
- Eleven is prime.

This appearance is also borne out by the standard semantic analyses proposed by linguists and semanticists.

**Classical Semantics** has nevertheless been challenged,
for instance by nominalists such as Hellman (1989) and by Hofweber
(2005 and 2016). (See also Moltmann (2013) for some challenges
concerned with arithmetical vocabulary in natural language, as well as
Snyder (2017) for discussion.) This is not the place for an extended
discussion of such challenges. Let me just note that a lot of work is
needed to substantiate this sort of challenge. The challenger will
have to argue that the apparent semantic similarities between
mathematical and non-mathematical language are deceptive. And these
arguments will have to be of the sort that linguists and
semanticists—with no vested interest in the philosophy of
mathematics—could come to recognize as
significant.^{[11]}

### 2.3 Defending Truth

**Truth** can be defended in a variety of different ways.
Common to all defenses is that they first identify some standard by
which the truth-values of mathematical statements can be assessed and
then argue that mathematical theorems meet this standard.

One option is to appeal to a standard that is more fundamental than that of mathematics itself. Logicism provides an example. Frege and other logicists first claim that any theorem of pure logic is true. Then they attempt to show that the theorems of certain branches of mathematics can be proved from pure logic and definitions alone.

Another option is to appeal to the standards of empirical science. The
Quine-Putnam indispensability argument provides an example. First it
is argued that any indispensable part of empirical science is likely
to be true and therefore something we are justified in believing. Then
it is argued that large amounts of mathematics are indispensable to
empirical science. If both claims are correct, it follows that
**Truth** is likely to be true and that belief in
**Truth** therefore is justified. (See the entry on
indispensability arguments in the philosophy of mathematics.)

A third option is to appeal to the standards of mathematics itself.
Why should one have to appeal to non-mathematical standards, such as
those of logic or empirical science, in order to defend the truth of
mathematical theorems? When we defend the truth of the claims of logic
and physics, we do not need to appeal to standards outside of
respectively logic and physics. Rather we assume that logic and
physics provide their own *sui generis* standards of
justification. Why should mathematics be any different? This third
strategy has received a lot of attention in recent years, often under
the heading of ‘naturalism’ or ‘mathematical
naturalism’. (See Burgess & Rosen 1997, Maddy 1997, and, for
critical discussion, see the entry on
naturalism in the philosophy of mathematics.)

Here is an example of how a naturalistic strategy can be developed. Call the attitude that mathematicians take to the theorems of mathematics ‘acceptance’. Then the following claims seem plausible:

- (2)
- Mathematicians are justified in accepting the theorems of mathematics.
- (3)
- Accepting a mathematical statement \(S\) involves taking \(S\) to be true.
- (4)
- When a mathematician accepts a mathematical statement \(S\), the content of this attitude is in general the literal meaning of \(S\).

From these three claims it follows that mathematical experts are
justified in taking the theorems of mathematics to be literal truths.
By extension the rest of us too are justified in believing
**Truth**. Note that the experts with whom (2) is
concerned need not themselves believe (3) and (4), let alone be
justified in any such belief. What matters is that the three claims
are true. The task of establishing the truth of (3) and (4) may fall
to linguists, psychologists, sociologists, or philosophers, but
certainly not to mathematicians themselves.

Admittedly, fictionalists about mathematics will try to resist (3) or (4). See Field (1982), Yablo (2005), Leng (2010), as well as the entry on fictionalism in the philosophy of mathematics.

### 2.4 The notion of ontological commitment

Versions of the Fregean argument are sometimes stated in terms of the notion of ontological commitment. Suppose we operate with the standard Quinean criterion of ontological commitment:

**Quine’s Criterion**.- A first-order sentence (or collection of such sentences) is ontologically committed to such objects as must be assumed to be in the range of the variables for the sentence (or collection of sentences) to be true.

Then it follows from **Classical Semantics** that many
sentences of mathematics are ontologically committed to mathematical
objects. To see this, consider a typical mathematical theorem \(S\),
which involves some normal extensional occurrence of either singular
terms or first-order quantifiers. By **Classical
Semantics**, these expressions purport to refer to or range
over mathematical objects. For \(S\) to be true, these expressions
must succeed in doing what they purport to do. Consequently, for \(S\)
to be true, there must be mathematical objects in the range of the
variables. By **Quine’s Criterion** this means that
\(S\) is ontologically committed to mathematical objects.

Quine and many others take **Quine’s Criterion** to
be little more than a definition of the term ‘ontological
commitment’ (Quine 1969 and Burgess 2004). But the criterion has
nevertheless been challenged. Some philosophers deny that singular
terms and first-order quantifiers automatically give rise to
ontological commitments. Perhaps what is “required of the
world” for the sentence to be true involves the existence of
some but not all of the objects in the range of the quantifiers (Rayo
2008). Or perhaps we should sever the link between the first-order
existential quantifier and the notion of ontological commitment
(Azzouni 2004, Hofweber 2000 and 2016).

One response to these challenges is to observe that the Fregean
argument was developed above without any use of the term
‘ontological commitment’. Any challenge to the definition
of ‘ontological commitment’ provided by
**Quine’s Criterion** therefore appears irrelevant
to the version of the Fregean argument developed above. However, this
response is unlikely to satisfy the challengers, who will respond that
the conclusion of the argument developed above is too weak to have its
intended effect. Recall that the conclusion,
**Existence**, is formalized in our philosophical
meta-language \(L_P\) as ‘\(\exists xMx\)’. So this
formalization will fail to have its intended effect unless this
meta-language sentence is of the sort that incurs ontological
commitment. But that is precisely what the challengers dispute. This
controversy cannot be pursued further here. For now, we simply observe
that the challengers need to provide an account of why their
non-standard notion of ontological commitment is better and
theoretically more interesting than the standard Quinean notion.

### 2.5 From Existence to Mathematical Platonism?

Suppose we accept **Existence**, perhaps based on the
Fregean argument. As we have seen, this is not yet to accept
mathematical platonism, which is the result of adding to
**Existence** the two further claims
**Abstractness** and **Independence**. Are
these two further claims defensible?

By the standards of philosophy, **Abstractness** has
remained relatively uncontroversial. Among the few philosophers to
have challenged it are Maddy (1990) (concerning impure sets) and
Bigelow (1988) (concerning sets and various kinds of numbers). This
relative lack of controversy means that few explicit defenses of
**Abstractness** have been developed. But it is not hard
to see how such a defense might go. Here is one idea. It is a
plausible *prima facie* constraint on any philosophical
interpretation of mathematical practice that it should avoid ascribing
to mathematics any features that would render actual mathematical
practice misguided or inadequate. This constraint makes it hard to
deny that the objects of pure mathematics are abstract. For if these
objects had spatiotemporal locations, then actual mathematical
practice would be misguided and inadequate, since pure mathematicians
ought then to take an interest in the locations of their objects, just
as zoologists take an interest in the locations of animals. The fact
that pure mathematicians take no interest in this question suggests
that their objects are abstract.

**Independence** says that mathematical objects, if there
are any, are independent of intelligent agents and their language,
thought, and practices. We will discuss what this thesis might amount
to, and how it might be defended, in Section
4.

## 3. Objections to Mathematical Platonism

A variety of objections to mathematical platonism have been developed. Here are the most important ones.

### 3.1 Epistemological access

The most influential objection is probably the one inspired by
Benacerraf (1973). What follows is an improved version of
Benacerraf’s objection due to Field
(1989).^{[12]}
This version relies on the following three premises.

Premise 1. | Mathematicians are reliable, in the sense that for almost every mathematical sentence \(S\), if mathematicians accept \(S\), then \(S\) is true. |

Premise 2. | For belief in mathematics to be justified, it must at least in principle be possible to explain the reliability described in Premise 1. |

Premise 3. | If mathematical platonism is true, then this reliability cannot be explained even in principle. |

If these three premises are correct, it will follow that mathematical platonism undercuts our justification for believing in mathematics.

But are the premises correct? The first two premises are relatively uncontroversial. Most platonists are already committed to Premise 1. And Premise 2 seems fairly secure. If the reliability of some belief formation procedure could not even in principle be explained, then the procedure would seem to work purely by chance, thus undercutting any justification we have for the beliefs produced in this way.

Premise 3 is far more controversial. Field defends this premise by
observing that “the truth-values of our mathematical assertions
depend on facts involving platonic entities that reside in a realm
outside of space-time” (Field 1989, p. 68) and thus are causally
isolated from us even in principle. However, this defense assumes that
any adequate explanation of the reliability in question must involve
some causal correlation. This has been challenged by a variety of
philosophers who have proposed more minimal explanations of the
reliability claim. (See Burgess & Rosen 1997, pp. 41–49 and
Lewis 1991, pp. 111–112; cf. also Clarke-Doane 2016. See Linnebo
2006 for a
critique.)^{[13]}

### 3.2 A metaphysical objection

Another famous article by Benacerraf develops a metaphysical objection to mathematical platonism (Benacerraf 1965, cf. also Kitcher 1978). Although Benacerraf focuses on arithmetic, the objection naturally generalizes to most pure mathematical objects.

Benacerraf opens by defending what is now known as a structuralist view of the natural numbers, according to which the natural numbers have no properties other than those they have in virtue of being positions in an \(\omega\)-sequence. For instance, there is nothing more to being the number 3 than having certain intrastructurally defined relational properties, such as succeeding 2, being half of 6, and being prime. No matter how hard we study arithmetic and set theory, we will never know whether 3 is identical with the fourth von Neumann ordinal, or with the corresponding Zermelo ordinal, or perhaps, as Frege suggested, with the class of all three-membered classes (in some system that allows such classes to exist).

Benacerraf now draws the following conclusion:

Therefore, numbers are not objects at all, because in giving the properties …of numbers you merely characterize an abstract structure—and the distinction lies in the fact that the “elements” of the structure have no properties other than those relating them to other “elements” of the same structure. (Benacerraf 1965, p. 291)

In other words, Benacerraf claims that there can be no objects which have nothing but structural properties. All objects must have some non-structural properties as well. (See Benacerraf 1996 for some later reflections on this argument.)

Both of the steps of Benacerraf’s argument are controversial. The first step—that natural numbers have only structural properties—has been defended by a variety of mathematical structuralists (Parsons 1990, Resnik 1997, and Shapiro 1997, as well as Schiemer & Wigglesworth 2019 for the notion of a structural property). But this step is denied by logicists and neo-logicists, who claim that the natural numbers are intrinsically tied to the cardinalities of the collections that they number (Wright 2000). And the second step—that there can be no objects with only structural properties—is explicitly rejected by all of the structuralists who defend the first step. (For some voices sympathetic to the second step, see Hellman 2001 and MacBride 2005. See also Linnebo 2008 for discussion.)

### 3.3 Other metaphysical objections

In addition to Benacerraf’s, a variety of metaphysical
objections to mathematical platonism have been developed. One of the
more famous examples is an argument of Nelson Goodman’s against
set theory. Goodman (1956) defends the *Principle of
Nominalism*, which states that whenever two entities have the same
basic constituents, they are identical. This principle can be regarded
as a strengthening of the familiar set theoretic axiom of
extensionality. The axiom of extensionality states that if two sets
\(x\) and \(y\) have the same elements—that is, if \(\forall u(u
\in x \leftrightarrow u \in y)\)—then they are identical. The
Principle of Nominalism is obtained by replacing the membership
relation with its transitive
closure.^{[14]}
The principle thus states that if \(x\) and \(y\) are borne \(\in^*\)
by the same individuals—that is, if \(\forall u(u \in^*\) \(x
\leftrightarrow u \in^*\) \(y)\)—then \(x\) and \(y\) are
identical. By endorsing this principle, Goodman disallows the
formation of sets and classes, allowing only the formation of
mereological sums and the application to the standard mereological
operations (as described by his “calculus of
individuals”).

However, Goodman’s defense of the Principle of Nominalism is now widely held to be unconvincing, as witnessed by the widespread acceptance by philosophers and mathematicians of set theory as a legitimate and valuable branch of mathematics.

## 4. Between object realism and mathematical platonism

Object realism says there exist abstract mathematical objects, whereas
platonism adds **Independence**, which says that
mathematical objects are independent of intelligent agents and their
language, thought, and practices. This final section surveys some
lightweight forms of object realism that stop short of full-fledged
platonism. Such intermediate views are attracting an increasing amount
of interest.

### 4.1 How To Understand Independence

A natural gloss on **Independence** is the following
counterfactual conditional:

**Counterfactual Independence**.- Had there not been any intelligent agents, or had their language, thought, or practices been suitably different, there would still have been mathematical objects.

This counterfactual conditional is accepted by most analytic philosophers. To see why, consider the role that mathematics plays in our reasoning. We often reason about scenarios that aren’t actual. Were we to build a bridge across this canyon, say, how strong would it have to be to withstand the powerful gusts of wind? Sadly, the previous bridge collapsed. Would it have done so had the steel girders been twice as thick? This form of reasoning about counterfactual scenarios is indispensable both to our everyday deliberations and to science. The permissibility of such reasoning has an important consequence. Since the truths of pure mathematics can freely be appealed to throughout our counterfactual reasoning, it follows that these truths are counterfactually independent of us humans, and all other intelligent life for that matter. That is, had been there been no intelligent life, these truths would still have remained the same.

Pure mathematics is in this respect very different from ordinary empirical truths. Had intelligent life never existed, this article would not have been written. More interestingly, pure mathematics also contrasts with various social conventions and constructions, with which it is sometimes compared (Hersh 1997, Feferman 2009, Cole 2013). Had intelligent life never existed, there would have been no laws, contracts, or marriages—yet the mathematical truths would have remained the same.

Thus, if **Independence** is understood merely as
counterfactual independence, then anyone who accepts object realism
should also accept platonism.

It is doubtful, however, that this understanding of
**Independence** fully captures the intended content of
the thesis. For **Independence** is meant to substantiate
an analogy between mathematical objects and ordinary physical objects.
Just as electrons and planets exist independently of us, so do numbers
and sets. And just as statements about electrons and planets are made
true or false by the objects with which they are concerned and these
objects’ perfectly objective properties, so are statements about
numbers and sets. (See the quotes from Dummett 1978b and Maddy 1990 in
the supplement.)
In short, we have the following thesis:

**Robust Independence**.

Mathematical objects are metaphysically on a par with ordinary
physical objects.

Let us now consider some views that reject the stronger thesis of Robust Independence. These views are thus lightweight forms of object realism, which stop short of full-blown platonism.

### 4.2 Plenitudious platonism

One lightweight form of object realism is the “full-blooded
platonism” of Balaguer 1998. This view is characterized by a
*plenitude principle* to the effect that any mathematical
objects that could exist actually do exist. For instance, since the
Continuum Hypothesis is independent of the standard axiomatization of
set theory, there is a universe of sets in which the hypothesis is
true and another in which it is false. And neither universe is
metaphysically privileged (Hamkins 2012). By contrast, traditional
platonism asserts that there is a unique universe of sets in which the
Continuum Hypothesis is either determinately true or determinately
false.^{[15]}

One alleged benefit of this plenitudinous view is in the epistemology of mathematics. If every consistent mathematical theory is true of some universe of mathematical objects, then mathematical knowledge will, in some sense, be easy to obtain: provided that our mathematical theories are consistent, they are guaranteed to be true of some universe of mathematical objects.

However, “full-blooded platonism” has received much criticism. Colyvan and Zalta 1999 criticize it for undermining the possibility of reference to mathematical objects, and Restall 2003, for lacking a precise and coherent formulation of the plenitude principle on which the view is based. Martin (2001) proposes that different universes of sets be amalgamated to yield a single maximal universe, which will be privileged by fitting our conception of set better than any other universe of sets.

A different version of plenitudinous platonism is developed in Linsky
& Zalta 1995 and a series of further articles. (See, for instance,
Linsky & Zalta 2006 and other articles cited therein.) Traditional
platonism goes wrong by “conceiv[ing] of abstract objects on the
model of physical objects” (Linsky & Zalta 1995, p. 533),
including in particular the idea that such objects are
“sparse” rather than plenitudinous. Linsky & Zalta
develop an alternative approach on the basis of the second
author’s “object theory”. The main feature of object
theory is a very general comprehension principle which asserts the
existence of a plenitude of abstract objects: for any collection of
properties, there is an abstract object which “encodes”
precisely these properties. In object theory, moreover, two abstract
objects are identical just in case they encode precisely the same
properties. Object theory’s comprehension principle and identity
criterion are said to “provide the link between our cognitive
faculty of understanding and abstract objects” (*ibid*.,
p. 547). (See Ebert & Rossberg 2007 for critical discussion.)

### 4.3 Lightweight semantic values

Assume that object realism is true. For convenience, assume also
**Classical Semantics**. These assumptions ensure that
the singular terms and quantifiers of mathematical language refer to
and range over abstract objects. Given these assumptions, should one
also be a mathematical platonist? In other words, do the objects that
mathematical sentences refer to and quantify over satisfy either
version of the independence thesis?

It will be useful to restate our assumptions in more neutral terms. We
can do this by invoking the notion of a *semantic value*, which
plays an important role in semantics and the philosophy of language.
In these fields it is widely assumed that each expression makes some
definite contribution to the truth-value of sentences in which the
expression occurs. This contribution is known as the *semantic
value* of the expression. It is widely assumed that (at least in
extensional contexts) the semantic value of a singular term is just
its referent.

Our assumptions can now be stated neutrally as the claim that
mathematical singular terms have abstract semantic values and that its
quantifiers range over the kinds of item that serve as semantic
values. Let’s focus on the claim about singular terms. What is
the philosophical significance of this claim? In particular, does it
support some version of **Independence**? The answer will
depend on what is required for a mathematical singular term to have a
semantic value.

Some philosophers argue that not very much is required (Frege 1953, Dummett 1981, Dummett 1991a, Wright 1983, Hale & Wright 2000, Rayo 2013, and Linnebo 2012 and 2018). It suffices for the term \(t\) to make some definite contribution to the truth-values of sentences in which it occurs. The whole purpose of the notion of a semantic value was to represent such contributions. It therefore suffices for a singular term to possess a semantic value that it makes some such suitable contribution.

This may even open the way for a form of non-eliminative reductionism about mathematical objects (Dummett 1991a, Linnebo 2018). Although it is perfectly true that the mathematical singular term \(t\) has an abstract object as its semantic value, this truth may obtain in virtue of more basic facts which do not mention or involve the relevant abstract object. For example, a singular term may refer to a direction in virtue of being associated with an appropriately oriented line and subject to the criterion of identity stating that two lines specify one and the same direction just in case they are parallel. Thus, although it is perfectly true that the term refers to an abstract object, this truth obtains in virtue of some more basic facts that do not mention or involve that abstract object. Linnebo (2018, ch. 11) argues that this approach to mathematical objects nevertheless validates Counterfactual Independence.

There is no reason, however, why an approach of this sort should be committed to Robust Independence. On the contrary, such approaches entail some important disanalogies between mathematical and physical objects. For a direction to exist, for example, it suffices that there exists an appropriate oriented line that specifies that the direction. Since this line can be located anywhere, the existence of the direction does not impose any constraints on any particular region of spacetime. By contrast, the existence of a physical object imposes substantial constraints on the particular region of spacetime where the object is located.

In short, if some lightweight account of semantic values is
defensible, we can accept object realism and **Counterfactual
Independence** without committing ourselves to a more robust
form of platonism.

### 4.4 Inspiration from Aristotle

We conclude by describing two further examples of lightweight forms of object realism that reject the platonistic analogy between mathematical objects and ordinary physical objects. Both examples are inspired by Aristotle.

First, perhaps mathematical objects exist only in a potential manner,
which contrasts with the actual mode of existence of ordinary physical
objects. This idea is at the heart of the ancient notion of potential
infinity (Lear 1980, Linnebo & Shapiro 2019). According to
Aristotle, the natural numbers are *potentially* infinite in
the sense that, however large a number we have produced (by
instantiating it in the physical world), it is possible to produce an
even larger number. But Aristotle denies that the natural numbers are
*actually* infinite: this would require the physical world to
be infinite, which he argues is impossible.

Following Cantor, most mathematicians and philosophers now defend the actual infinity of the natural numbers. This is made possible in part by denying the Aristotelian requirement that every number needs to be instantiated in the physical world. When this is denied, the actual infinity of the natural numbers no longer entails the actual infinity of the physical world.

However, a form of potentialism about the hierarchy of sets continues
to enjoy considerable support, especially in connection with the
iterative conception of sets (Parsons 1977, Jané 2010, Linnebo
2013, Studd 2013). No matter how many sets have been formed, it is
possible to form even more. If true, this would mean that sets have a
potential form of existence which distinguishes them sharply from
ordinary physical
objects.^{[16]}

Second, perhaps mathematical objects are ontologically dependent or derivative in a way that distinguishes them from independently existing physical objects. According to what Rosen (2011) calls “qualified realism”, mathematical facts are grounded in other facts that do not involve mathematical objects. For example, the natural numbers exist, but their existence and their properties and relations are grounded in facts more fundamental than the arithmetical ones, e.g., in facts about provability or about structural possibilities. The view can also be given a more Aristotelian spin by taking simple arithmetical truths to be grounded in facts about appropriately numerous pluralities that instantiate the relevant numbers (Schwartzkopff 2011, Donaldson 2017). For example, \(2+2=4\) is grounded in any fact about a pair and a disjoint pair making a quadruple. There are other versions of the view as well. For example, Kit Fine (1995) and others argue that a set is ontologically dependent on its elements. (This view is also closely related to the set-theoretic potentialism mentioned above.)

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### Acknowledgments

Thanks to Philip Ebert, Leon Horsten, James Ladyman, Hannes Leitgeb, David Liggins, Alexander Paseau, and Philip Welch for comments and discussion. Thanks also to an audience at the ECAP6 in Krakow, where parts of this material were presented. This article was written during a period of leave funded by an AHRC Research Leave Grant (number AH/E003753/1). I gratefully acknowledge their support.