First published Thu Feb 17, 2011; substantive revision Wed Feb 28, 2024

The philosophical discourse on progress, both moral and political, has a long history. It first rose to prominence in the Age of Enlightenment as a particular view of history as progressive (see entries on Enlightenment and philosophy of history). Contrary to the view that history is a sequence of random events with no particular trajectory or meaning, the Enlightenment view holds that history has a tendency toward freedom. There are two major ways to account for this tendency: one teleological and the other non-teleological. Crudely, the teleological account argues that world history has its own end, and progress toward human freedom is its manifestation. This account leaves little room for human agency in advancing or obstructing progress, for progress is inevitable by dint of the “law of history.” By contrast, the non-teleological account argues that even though history is open-ended, there is still a tendency toward freedom because of the interplay of causal forces including human nature, rationality, and institutions. On this account, progress is possible. Section 1 of this entry gives an overview of these two Enlightenment accounts of progress.

The Enlightenment view of progress became less prominent in the 20th century. As evolutionary sciences have matured, the teleological account of human development has lost much of its appeal. But even the non-teleological account has not stood the test of time. The climate of optimism that shaped much of the Enlightenment thought was replaced by a climate of despair. The belief that progress is possible, let alone inevitable, came to seem naïve and false in the face of world wars, colonial conquests, and environmental degradation. New intellectual traditions such as critical theory, moral relativism, postcolonialism, and postmodernism arose, critiquing the metaphysical, epistemological, and empirical assumptions of the Enlightenment view of progress as well as its normative risks (see entries on critical theory and postmodernism). Common to this critical literature is an alternative picture of history that is contingent, if not tragic. This informs the belief about the future that is at best indeterminate. Section 3 of the entry summarizes these critiques of progress.

Interestingly, the last decade has seen something of a revival of the discourse of progress, especially in moral and political philosophy. Much like its rise and fall, the ongoing resurgence of the discourse of progress is prompted largely by the political currents of its time. The 21st century is widely felt to be another epoch of social change. On the brighter side, social movements are winning battles in human rights for previously marginalized groups and individuals (e.g., people racialized as black, members of the LGBTQ2+ communities); on the darker side, illiberal populism is destabilizing democracy and peace across the globe. If these patterns are not just random shifts in states of affairs but instead are seen as constituting either genuine moral improvements that need to be secured and expanded or examples of moral decline that should be scrutinized and halted, then in order to describe and evaluate these trends, it would seem that we need a concept of progress after all. The philosophical challenge is to avoid the pitfalls of the naïve optimism of the Enlightenment and the undue skepticism of postmodernism. Much of the new literature on progress is dedicated to rescuing an idea of progress from the contingent view of human development and carve out a meaningful, albeit limited, role for reason, human agency, and institutional design to enable progress. Section 2 of this entry summarizes recent philosophical efforts to reconcile evolutionary sciences and empirical history with human progress (moral and political), vindicating, refining, and challenging the Enlightenment view of progress. An emerging consensus from the contemporary discourse is a much more modest idea of progress that is merely possible, open-ended, local, and non-linear.

1. The Enlightenment Discourse on Progress

Today, the label “the Enlightenment conception of progress” is often used to refer to the view of historical progress that is teleological, linear, global, and rationalistic. This view is commonly attributed to Immanuel Kant, G.W.F. Hegel, and Karl Marx. But as we will see, these philosophers do not share one and the same conception of progress; indeed, they differ fundamentally on the nature and conditions of historical progress. What they really share is the optimism of European Enlightenment about the upward development of humanity as a whole. To understand “Enlightenment conceptions of progress,” it is helpful to first take a brief look at the historical context that shaped them.

1.1 Historical Context: The Rise of Modern Science

European Enlightenment was an intellectual and political development that took place in the 17th and 18th centuries. This was an era of progress, marked by major scientific revolutions (see entry on scientific progress), technological innovations, economic growth, and the fall of absolute monarchy and feudalism. Intellectuals at the time shared a sense of optimism for the upward development of humanity as well as the conviction that scientific inquiry was the driving force behind this development.

Enlightenment thinkers almost uniformly rejected supernatural explanations of historical phenomena, which were rather common prior to the Enlightenment. For example, Plato (Statesman) and Aristotle (Meteorology, 352a29–32; Metaphysics, 1074b9–13) appealed to myths to explain the occurrences of natural disasters and the destruction of civilizations by gods’ wills. Similarly, St. Augustine of Hippo, in The City of God against the Pagans, advanced a Christian version of history, according to which progress is predestined for God’s elect whereas the rest of humanity’s fate is damnation. But as we will see shortly, notwithstanding the rejection of supernaturalism, some Enlightenment thinkers brought in their own teleology.

Two thinkers of the French Enlightenment, Anne-Robert-Jacques Turgot, Baron de l’Aulne (1727–1781) and Marie-Jean-Antoine-Nicolas de Caritat, Marquis de Condorcet (1743–1794), integrated reflections on scientific discoveries into their writings on progress. Turgot, a minister to Louis XVI, produced two influential works, A Philosophical Review of the Successive Advances of the Human Mind and On Universal History. Condorcet was inspired by Turgot to write Outlines of an Historical View of the Progress of the Human Mind, a piece that echoes many of Turgot’s convictions. Although Condorcet wrote his essay in prison during the Terror, his work, like Turgot, evinces optimism about the future of France and of humanity as a whole.

Both authors suggest that philosophical progress is the deepest condition of scientific progress. Influenced by British empiricism, Turgot and Condorcet assert that all human knowledge is grounded in experience. According to Turgot, the renaissance of science first required an empiricist turn, that is, an abandoning of explanations appealing to faculties and essences. The scientific experiment then found its place as the centerpiece of the scientific method and as the vehicle of further progress (Turgot 1750, 45; 1751, 100–01). Condorcet reiterates these points and provides a wealth of examples of recent scientific discoveries (1795, 168–70). Turgot and Condorcet agree that scientific progress is dependent on mathematical and technological progress, and vice versa (Turgot 1750, 45; Condorcet 1795, 231).

Although neither author rigorously defines human well-being, both believe that, over the long term, scientific discoveries and political freedom reinforce each other and together support the betterment of humanity. Turgot considers the role that political institutions play in advancing science. He thinks that individual genius moves science forward. Political institutions are important to scientific progress insofar as they allow geniuses to flourish. Variation in scientific achievement is to be explained not by the concentration of genius but by the institutions that either suppress or encourage it (Turgot 1751, 88). Despotic government is bad for genius, while republics nurture it. Condorcet also remarks that free institutions are the native environment of scientific discovery (1795, 129). In turn, the growth of scientific knowledge will advance political freedom (Turgot 1750, 43).

Turgot and Condorcet also hold that short-term decline can be part of a pattern of long-term improvement. In the intellectual realm, the path to truth is rocky, and errors are frequently the first result of reflection (Turgot 1750, 44; Condorcet 1795, 37–38). For instance, the false scientific philosophy of faculties and essences is born of reflection on phenomena. In the realm of action, devastating events like war and conquest can ultimately unite scattered groups of people and facilitate political organization (Turgot 1751, 71–72; Condorcet 1795, 51). Moreover, Turgot argues that individuals and groups that contribute to progress are often motivated by emotion or personal interest (1751, 69–70). The second observation is related to the first, since Turgot thinks that the agents of creative destruction are usually narrowly self-interested or driven by emotion.

1.2 Metaphysics of History and Teleological Conceptions of Progress

Though the Enlightenment rejected supernaturalism, some Enlightenment thinkers introduced their own teleology. Hegel offers the most developed—and the most criticized—teleological account of historical progress (1824a, 1824b, 1857). In his view, there is a logic underlying world history which determines its course and displays its meaning. That logic is “Geist,” also known as “Spirit.” The essence of Spirit is Freedom (Hegel 1821), and this Idea is manifested in political structures. The myriad events in history, including wars, conflicts, and the development of the (modern) State, are the gradual manifestation of Spirit in human life. In Hegel’s own words, “History is the process whereby the Spirit discovers itself and its own concept” (1857, 62). Two controversial implications follow from this philosophy of history. The first one is forward-looking. If we can discover this logic of history, we can basically predict the future of humanity. The other is backward-looking. If all historical phenomena are the working of the “cunning of reason,” we should view human tragedies and conflicts as inevitable for the realization of Freedom. Every event just provides further grist to the mill of progress.

But even more controversial is Hegel’s own interpretation of empirical history (1857). According to his speculation, Spirit unfolds itself in world history over four stages of freedom. It began thousands of years ago with the “Oriental despotism” of the East (consisting of China, India, and Persia). Spirit then advanced through two qualitatively higher stages in the Greek and the Roman worlds, in which Freedom was partially instituted through city-states and republican systems. The fourth stage took place in the German world marked by the Protestant Reformation. Hegel ends his narrative of progress at his own time and place, Prussia, where Spirit had at last fully objectified its Freedom in the form of constitutional monarchy. Few philosophers of progress today endorse Hegel’s metaphysics of history (see section 2), while many continue to criticize Hegel’s Eurocentric interpretation of history (see section 3), independently of his metaphysics.

Hegel’s teleological conception of historical progress was adopted and adapted by Karl Marx (1845, 1873). Similar to Hegel, Marx believes that history has its own goal and operates outside the casual chain. But unlike Hegel, he does not believe that the goal is the manifestation of Spirit through liberating the individual consciousness of human beings. Quite the opposite, Marx believes that the goal is the liberation of human capacities through the development of material forces. This view is widely known as historical materialism. The fundamental fact about a society at any given moment is not its ideological orientation but rather its “productive forces” (Marx 1845, 150), by which Marx means its material and technological resources. In the long run, the productive forces determine other aspects of a society, starting with the relations of production, the informal and formal rules that define and regulate property (1845, 151). Marx builds on these assumptions to define capitalism and communism and to predict the former’s eventual transformation into the latter. Marx’s insights on the role of material forces in determining history continue to influence contemporary discussions on social change (see section 2.3).

Even though different teleological accounts of progress diverge on how progress comes about and where it ends, being a teleological account, they converge on the nature of progress, with three definitive features. The first is that progress is predetermined and inevitable. Laws of history, whatever they are, operate independently of causal chains of events in the natural world. Human agency or institutional design cannot change the arc of history. The second is that progress is global. Laws of history govern the world and humanity as a whole. Local regressions are temporary or mere aberrations. Finally, progress is linear. The world is advancing toward freedom constantly, marching from one epoch to the next. In other words, the idea of progress as inevitable, global, and linear is informed by teleological understandings of history. As noted earlier, nowadays many refer to this as “the” Enlightenment idea of progress only to dismiss it out of hand. But this is misleading. As the following section shows, there is another Enlightenment idea of progress, which is open-ended and non-linear, informed by a naturalistic understanding of history.

1.3 Anthropology and Non-teleological Conceptions of Progress

Kant is among the few exceptions during the Enlightenment to articulate a non-teleological conception of progress, although this reading is contentious (see Allen 2016; Gray 2004; Koselleck 2002). The contention arises from Kant’s ambiguous remarks in Idea for a Universal History with a Cosmopolitan Aim. For example, he writes, “One can regard the history of the human species in the large as the completion of a hidden plan of nature to bring about an inwardly and, to this end, also an externally perfect state constitution, as the only condition in which it can fully develop all its predispositions in humanity” (the eighth proposition, Wood 1991, 19). While the idea that nature has a progressive plan sounds teleological, it is best read as a “heuristic assumption” or a “regulative principle” (Kleingeld 1999; Wood 1991; Møller 2021; Ypi 2010). That is, we should believe as if progress were nature’s plan so that hope and responsible human action are possible. Put differently, a more accurate understanding of Kant’s philosophy of progress is not metaphysical but anthropological. Contrary to Hegel, Kant is not trying to discover meaning or a specific trajectory from the actual course of history; rather, he wants to consider how human nature and agency have made possible the progressive trends in his own time. This naturalistic and practical project of progress, as we will see in section 2, is still being actively developed today. To understand the contemporary responses, we need to take a closer look at Kant’s own naturalistic account.

In Kant’s view, progress is not predetermined but conditioned by nature—two features of human nature to be exact, viz. our capacity to reason and our “unsocial sociability” (the third and fourth propositions, Wood 1991, 13). Kant argues that the human species is unique in its capacity for setting its own ends. This sets us apart from non-human animals who are only governed by instincts and lack a sense of self and “self-esteem.” This sense of self-esteem, as it was first developed, did not give rise to a sense of equal human worth but a craving in each of us to dominate one another. But such “unsocial” tendencies came into tension with our “social” tendencies, including love, sympathy, humanity, and the need for friendship (Kant 1798). These conflicting tendencies provided the condition for the further development of reason to discipline our unruly passions and live in union as free and equal citizens.

Kant also argues for the role of institutions in enabling progress. The capacity for reasoning can only reach its fullest expression in free and peaceful circumstances. In Perpetual Peace, Kant (1795) argues that a federation of republics is most conducive to peace. Each republic is governed by the rule of law whose members are free and equal citizens. A federation of republics is a group of nations who have agreed to observe rules of peaceful conduct in their mutual relations. The domestic and international features of this institutional constellation will reinforce each other. Republics will not go to war with each other because a declaration of war requires the consent of the public who are reluctant to suffer the costs of war. In turn, domestic conditions will be improved in the absence of a state’s constant involvement in wars. Viewed this way, contra Hegel, political institutions and peace are not the inevitable manifestation of the end of history; rather, they merely provide the most favorable conditions conducive to freedom.

Informed by this non-teleological understanding of history, contra Hegel and Marx, Kant has a markedly different, and arguably more plausible, idea of progress. Progress is neither linear nor inevitable; it is merely possible. Kant does not think that humanity will necessarily achieve emancipation. He merely thinks that if we reason responsibly and well, under favorable institutional design, then over time we will become free. The future of human history remains open. As we will see in the next section, each of the three core conditions of progress identified by Kant—human nature, reason, and institutions—continue to be subjected to empirical scrutiny and philosophical elaboration.

2. Contemporary Views on Progress

The Enlightenment discourse on progress has sparked two contemporary discourses, one that salvages and revives it, and another that ends it. Section 2 offers an overview on the former and section 3 discusses the latter. As the analysis in section 1 has shown, the Enlightenment discourse tends to take for granted both the fact and the end of progress. The central question is how to account for it. Today, while philosophers continue to share the age-old ambition to account for and advance progress, few defend the sweeping claim that there is, or will be, progress, at least not in a global and linear fashion. Nor do they understand the end of progress so narrowly in terms of freedom. As noted in the introduction, this shift is due in large part to the change in political climate from the 18th to the 20th century. Having witnessed regressions as well as abuses of the idea of progress, contemporary defenders of progress are cautious of the naïve optimism as well as the Eurocentrism of the Enlightenment (see Buchanan and Powell 2018; Moody-Adams 1999, 2017; Forst 2017). The challenges facing “Enlightenment 2.0,” to use Joseph Heath’s (2014) term, are therefore to reconceptualize an idea of progress that is compatible with natural sciences and empirical history (section 2.1), to redefine measures of progress that acknowledge value pluralism and risks of human error (section 2.2), and to vindicate, refine, or rebut some of the Enlightenment assumptions about conditions of progress (section 2.3).

2.1 Evolution and Non-teleological Conceptions of Progress

If the Enlightenment discourse of progress was the first stage of naturalizing progress, the contemporary discourse marks its completion. As evolutionary sciences have matured, both supernaturalism and teleology have lost their explanatory power (however, moral teleology still enjoys some respectable defenders; see 2.2 for details). Many contemporary philosophers of progress believe that laws of evolution can adequately explain the existence of historical phenomena, without violating the laws of physics and without appealing to purposes (Jamieson 2002a; Hayek 2011; Kitcher 2011; Kitcher et al. 2021; Kumar and Campbell 2022). From an evolutionary perspective, widely considered features of progress, including norms of fairness, institutions of peace, and human rights instruments, are products of the causal interplay between nature and human agency over deep evolutionary time. More specifically, they are diverse, highly complex forms of social technology developed by our ancestors to resolve practical problems arising from associated living over a cumulative process of adaptation and learning. Progress as such is natural because it is reconciled with a Darwinian story of life, i.e., an adaptation evolving through natural selection in order to enhance reproductive fitness. There is no appeal to a telos of history or to facts of rationality (cf. Buchanan and Powell 2018) or objective values to which human mind and conduct are supposed to conform.

Different philosophers understand “problems” differently. In an influential evolutionary account of progress, pragmatist Philip Kitcher (2011, 2021) characterizes problems as “altruism failures”—situations in which members of a group do not act in ways that acknowledge the interests or desires of co-members. Altruism failures put our ancestors at risk in the environment of evolutionary adaptation (EEA). EEA, which occurred between 1.8 million and 10,000 years ago, presented extremely harsh conditions for groups to survive, sustain, and pass on their social arrangements. Humans lived in small, scattered groups. They were thrown into severe competition for scarce resources. Altruism failures impeded the cooperation needed and, in some cases, led to destructive conflicts between group members. Groups that developed the “capacity for normative guidance” allowed them to better adapt to EEA. In its original and simplest form, the capacity consists in “an ability to transform a situation that would otherwise have been an altruism failure, by means of a commitment to following a rule: you obey the command to give weight to the wishes of the other” (Kitcher 2011, 74). Rule-recognition is the surrogate for “psychological altruism,” issuing in “behavioural altruism.” As the ecological conditions changed and the scale of the groups grew, this normative capacity allowed groups to devise more complex rules of fairness, conceptions of the good, norms of punishment, and systems of rule-interpretation and transmission to regulate cooperation. Naturalistic progress consists in the functional refinement of these norms, conceptions of the good, and institutions of enforcement and interpretation to solve problems of altruism failures.

Others define problems more generally in terms of a deficiency in well-being. For example, according to F.A. von Hayek’s “common sense” account of progress, progress consists in the functional refinement of any social technology that better satisfies human desires or achieves goals more effectively (2011). An important instance of progress, in Hayek’s view, is the institution of trade. Contra feudalism and a planned economy, free market exchange improves human welfare, chiefly our material conditions, through the division of labor, specialization, and the exchange of goods and services, which in turn increases productivity, creativity, and economic growth.

As explained in section 1.2, the teleological account of progress informs an idea of progress that is predetermined, global, and linear. By contrast, this naturalistic understanding of how progress comes about importantly reshapes what progress is. First of all, progress is no longer predetermined; it is open-ended. In Kitcher’s words, naturalistic progress is a kind of “progress from” as opposed to “progress to” (2011, 228; 2021, 25). There is no end of history to which humanity can aspire. In the absence of any fixed goal, the sequence of transitions consists in identifying new problems and finding better solutions that overcome existing problems. In a similar vein, Hayek argues that while human intellect enables us to make progress by solving problems and satisfying desires, our desires and aims also constantly change, presenting new room for growth. He writes, “As progress consists in the discovery of the not yet known, its consequences must be unpredictable…Human reason can neither predict nor deliberately shape its own future. Its advances consist in finding out where it has been wrong” (2011, 94). While Kitcher accounts for the open-endedness in terms of the evolving nature of problematic situations and Hayek the evolving nature of desires, Buchanan and Powell explain the open-ended nature of progress in terms of our “capacity to reflect on and revise our moral norms and modify our behaviour accordingly” (2018, 180; see also Kumar and Campbell 2022). The reason why we can see problems as problems or develop new desires beyond the confines of our biological nature and immediate culture is because we can engage in critical reasoning. It is debatable whether the appeal to this innate capacity for critical reasoning smuggles teleology back into the naturalistic picture of progress.

Another feature of naturalistic progress is that it is local (Moody-Adams 1999; Kitcher et al. 2021; Buchanan and Powell 2018) as opposed to global. Enlightenment thinkers tend to take humanity as a whole as the subject of history. However, from an evolutionary perspective, this does not make sense. Even if, as members of the human species, we share certain universal biological and psychological traits, as individuals and groups, we all adapt to our own local ecological conditions, with specific tools inherited from our ancestors and cultural traditions. In other words, there is little causal connection between the states of affairs of one group and another whose ecological conditions are drastically different. As such, the language of progress is inapplicable on a cross-cultural scale. But even intra-cultural assessments of progress are increasingly thought to be challenging since within a single cultural system, there are various domains, from political to economic to moral. As Hayek argues, trade advances material progress but arguably at the cost of moral progress, because it exacerbates inequalities in wealth and status. These gains and losses in various domains are often incommensurable, making all-things-considered assessments of progress, even within a single culture, difficult. The tendency to localize progress does not even stop at particular domains. Buchanan and Powell (2018, 53–58) argue that even within a single domain such as morality, there are also different types. Their non-exhaustive list includes: (1) better compliance with valid moral norms, (2) better moral concepts, (3) better understandings of the virtues, (4) better moral motivation, (5) better moral reasoning, (6) proper demoralization, (7) proper moralization, (8) better understandings of moral standing and moral statuses, (9) improvements in understandings of the nature of morality. To illustrate how moral progress can occur at the level of type, consider our relations with non-human animals. Compared to decades ago, Western societies tend to understand that animals have intrinsic moral status and that their interests and preferences should be given weight in our deliberation. Many find factory farming hard to justify on moral grounds. Yet, the majority population continues to consume factory-farmed products, indicating the lack of improvement in moral motivation in this regard.

Finally, naturalistic progress is non-linear. While critics of progress see the world wars, the Holocaust, and the new wave of illiberal populism as the strongest evidence that progress is a delusion, defenders argue that progress, properly conceived, is fully compatible with major regressions. From a naturalistic perspective, progress is not the stages of development through which societies or civilizations predictably and inevitably pass, as Hegel and Marx argue. Rather, progress is the process of adaptation and learning via the modification of the human intellect. It may succeed, but it may fail too. Many contemporary philosophers of progress readily admit that the path to progress has been haphazard, empirically speaking. The normative goal of the project of progress is to render it “more systematic, more frequent, and more secure” (Kitcher et al. 2021, 30). Conceived in this way, the research program of progress is far from obsolete.

2.2 Moral Realism and Teleological Conceptions of Progress

Not every contemporary defender of progress endorses the Darwinian story of human development, at least not in the moral domain. These anti-Darwinians are often called “moral realists.” Moral realism (see entry on moral realism), as the label suggests, is committed to the metaphysical claim that morality is real. That is to say, there are objective moral truths, which are irreducible to subjective sentiments or contingent social norms developed in evolutionary history. For the realist, moral progress consists in the discovery of such objective moral truths. The realist’s discovery model of moral progress contrasts sharply with the pragmatist’s problem-solving model of moral progress (section 2.1). As seen, pragmatists tend to deflate morality into a system of social technology that is used to resolve coordination and cooperative problems arising from lived experience. For the pragmatist, there is no fixed, practice-independent standards of rightness and wrongness to discover; there are only ever-changing, practice-dependent problems to be identified and solved. And pragmatist progress consist in the increased efficiency in identifying and solving such problems. Care should be taken not to conflate the realist’s teleological conception of progress with the Enlightenment teleological conception of progress. As seen in section 1.2, the latter explains progress by way of the “law of history,” which in turn informs a conception of progress as predetermined beyond the control of human agency. By contrast, the realist’s metaphysical commitment is narrower in scope, namely that laws of morality are outside of the causal chain and set fixed goals for right action. How individuals and societies discover and obey these moral laws is within the control of human agency, leaving room for reasoning and institutional design (Sauer 2023).

An important issue in the realist account of moral progress is whether subjective experience is always an obstacle to moral discovery. Peter Singer (2011) argues that it is. In contrast to the naturalistic account, Singer claims that moral progress does not happen because of blind forces of evolutionary history, but in spite of them. As a utilitarian, Singer believes that the objective moral truth consists in maximizing overall well-being as guided by the principle of equal consideration. This objective moral truth of impartial benevolence is discoverable via reasoning. Once human agents exercise their innate rational capacity, abstract themselves from biasing elements in experience (e.g., social norms, unruly sentiments, subjective desires, ingroup bias), they would be able to arrive at an objective viewpoint, articulate universally valid moral principles in conformity with rules of logic and norms of consistency. He attributes much of actual moral progress, that is, the move away from tribal morality (e.g., feudalism, ethnocentrism, racism, sexism) to impartial morality (e.g., humanitarian aid to the global poor, greater concern for animals), to this form of pure reasoning. It is pure reasoning that has helped us humans to overcome our selfish desires and arbitrary conventions inherited from our ancestors and discover the truth of moral equality.

Thomas Nagel (2023) has recently defended a more nuanced realist account, recognizing the positive role of subjective experience in advancing moral progress. Contrary to Singer, Nagel does not think that moral progress consists in the gradual recognition and application of a single, timeless, normative principle such as impartial benevolence. Indeed, he thinks this would be a moral loss. Nagel identifies two models of moral progress: one involving the recognition of objective and timeless reasons for right action that have existed unrecognized for a long time (the discovery model); the other involving the gradual development of moral norms and values in subjective historical experience. His examples of the first type include the end of slavery and the suppression of homosexuality. As Nagel argues, the idea that pain is bad, the moral requirement of equal treatment, the wrongness of absolute domination are accessible through exercising the human capacities for reasoning. The latter include: to “recognize [that] reasons for action apply equally to oneself and others”; to “object or feel indignation when others do not act in accordance with those reasons”; to “recognize the objections of others when one fails to act in accordance with them oneself”; and to “acknowledge such failure on one’s own part with something like guilt”. His examples of the second type of moral progress include the conceptions of freedom of expression and freedom of religion. In Nagel’s view, the reasons for endorsing the principles that underpin political liberalism are inaccessible to inhabitants of feudalism. Unless and until one has arrived at a modern understanding of the conditions of political legitimacy and the autonomy of the individual in relation to the state, no amount of good reasoning, not even with the aid of imagination, can grasp these concepts. Arguably, Nagel’s move to recognize the role of normative and institutional developments in lived experience blurs the distinction between the teleological and non-teleological conceptions of moral progress.

2.3 Value Pluralism and Measures of Progress

So far, we have looked at contemporary efforts to make plausible the idea of progress in light of evolutionary sciences. Supposing that the open-ended, pluralistic, local, and non-linear idea of progress is plausible, how can we use it to evaluate states of affairs? Or, to put it another way, how do we derive particular normative judgments of progress for instances of attitudinal or behavioral pattern shifts from this dynamic but potentially empty idea of progress? How do we know whether the end of factory farming, the demoralization of homosexuality, and the degrowth movement are instances of progress, if there are multiple and evolving goalposts?

The pluralistic nature of the idea of progress rules out what Dale Jamieson (2002b) calls the “naïve conception.” According to the naïve conception, “moral progress occurs when a subsequent state of affairs is better than a preceding one, or when right acts become increasingly prevalent”. As he explains, this works well if there is a single fixed principle of right action (e.g., impartial benevolence) or a stable set of virtues. Yet, few today believe that deontology, consequentialism, or virtue ethics on their own are necessary or sufficient for measuring the status quo. The reason is that value pluralism is an endemic feature of modern society. This may be one of the most painful but important lessons to draw from the Enlightenment project. In the Enlightenment discourse, there is little discussion of the criteria of progress. Freedom is taken for granted as the ultimate and singular standard of good by which all human civilizations should be measured. Civilizations that did not institute freedom or organized themselves around other values (e.g., honor, loyalty) were judged to be backward. As many have rightly noted, this Enlightenment ideal of progress is Eurocentric and has been used to rationalize colonialism (for a more detailed discussion, see section 3).

While one should resist the temptation to prescribe the fixed and universal measures of progress, giving into cultural relativism seems equally dangerous. Without any normative measure of progress, it becomes impossible to guide social change away from an unjust status quo, or to evaluate certain states of affairs as better, not even the abolition of chattel slavery or the demoralization of homosexuality (Buchanan and Powell 2018; Forst 2017).

The challenge becomes how to develop measures of progress that acknowledge both the risks of human error and the fact of value pluralism (Buchanan and Powell 2018; Richardson et al. 2018). Three solutions are on offer. The first is to begin from paradigmatic cases. Dale Jamieson (2002b and 2017) argues that any plausible index of progress must at least recognize “the abolition of war and slavery, the reduction of poverty and class privilege, the extension of liberty, the empowerment of marginalized groups, and respect for animals and nature” as cases of moral progress. He further notes that a wide range of normative theories, including utilitarianism, virtue ethics, deontology, and capabilities approaches, can account for the values expressed in these cases. But as he concedes, the belief that the above are paradigmatic cases may still be a product of ethnocentric bias, namely bias toward the liberal culture of Jamieson’s own time. For example, illiberal cultures that are hierarchical, paternalistic, or practice warrior ways of life are backward by his index.

One way to get around first-order normative theorizing and the potential parochial bias (Larmore 2008) that afflicts it is to devise reliable methods of inquiry that update norms and practices. This solution is proposed by pragmatists such as Philip Kitcher and Elizabeth Anderson (Kitcher et al. 2021; Anderson 2014, 2015, 2016). As explained, pragmatists see progress in terms of problem-solving. The first step to advancing progress is to identify problems or “problematic situations” (Kitcher et al. 2021, 33–35). Kitcher defines a prima facie morally problematic situation as one where an individual or a group “resents” the situation. To reliably identify problems, “ideal conversation” or “democratic contractualism” is typically necessary (35–37). That is where all the affected are included to discuss the challenged practice or norm under the conditions of full information and mutual sympathy. The justified solution would be one which all the affected in this ideal conservation would endorse. Anderson also sees the epistemic value in democratic discussion but offers a non-ideal version of it. In her view, “moral blindness” is a major obstacle to problem identification. Moral blindness is usually rooted in unaccountable power and operates via cognitive biases. The force of a better argument is rarely sufficient to correct it. Instead, she proposes contentious politics in the form of social movements or even violent resistance as a method. Drawing on historical cases such as British abolitionism and the Civil Rights Movement, Anderson argues that contentious politics has the tendency to destabilize norms and initiate a genuine collective reflection rather than rationalization.

The third solution is to defend moral realism (Sauer 2023; FitzPatrick 2019; Huemer 2016, 2019) and acknowledge that there are mind-independent moral facts or truths in the world. For example, Michael Huemer suggests that over the past decades and centuries, there has been a sharp decline in torture, murder, rape, war, slavery, capital punishment, and colonialism. This is a markedly recent and coherent shift to liberal morality. By inference to the best explanation, liberal values such as the moral equality of persons, respect for the dignity of individuals, and an objection to gratuitous coercion and violence are true. While critics of moral realism might argue that these liberal values are subject to intense disagreement and fly in the face of value pluralism, realists might reply by arguing that realism is compatible with disagreement or that all cultures share the same moral foundations and differ only in their instantiation (Sauer 2023).

2.4 The Role of Human Nature

As seen in Kant’s naturalistic account, human psychology, reason, and institutions are conjectured as three core conditions of progress. In the contemporary literature, each of these three conditions is still being elaborated and contested in light of new empirical findings.

Kant’s discussion of “unsocial sociability” continues today under the label of “tribalism.” Drawing on evolutionary biology, psychology, and cultural evolution, philosophers are debating whether tribal nature constrains inclusive-type moral progress. According to the view of “evo-conservatism”—a term coined by Buchanan and Powell (2018)—it does. In its strongest version, evo-conservatism consists of two core empirical claims, namely that (a) the ecological challenges under EEA that our ancestors faced generated selection pressures for evaluative tendencies (e.g., parochial altruism, group-mindedness, partiality) that limited effective moral commitments to members of one’s own kin, group, tribe, or nation; furthermore, (b) these tendencies are “hard-wired” into our brain and as such unalterable. Some political conservatives (Posner and Singer 2001; Goldsmith and Posner 2005; Fukuyama 2002) draw the normative conclusion from this empirical fact that the moral circle cannot, and should not, be indefinitely expanded to include “others” who are physically, biologically, or culturally distant from “us.” In this view, projects like global justice and animal rights are doomed to fail.

It must be noted that one can be an evo-conservative without being a political conservative. For example, bioethicists Ingmar Persson and Julian Savulescu (2019) argue that precisely because our nature is exclusionary, we should enhance our cognition for a more inclusive future. The most sustained objection to evo-conservatism comes from Buchanan and Powell (2018). They reject both of its empirical claims. First, even in EEA, there was inter-group cooperation, in the forms of trade, exogamy, military alliances, and so forth. In other words, EEA was not always a war between “us” and “them.” Selection pressures in fact generated “adaptatively plastic” traits rather than rigid groupishness. Next, drawing on theories of cultural evolution, they further argue that tribal tendencies are not biologically determined but culturally conditioned. Cultural innovations in the forms of new moral norms, more sophisticated moral reasoning, and new techniques for perspective-taking, coupled with actual and perceived material comfort and physical security to a reasonable degree, mean that inclusive traits can develop. The “Two Great Expansions,” i.e., expanding human rights to all humans in virtue of their inherent humanity and expanding moral consideration to animals in virtue of their inherent moral status, for Buchanan and Powell, are the best evidence that inclusive traits have developed, under favorable socio-economic and cultural conditions (Buchanan 2020, 23).

2.5 The Role of Reason

Turning now to the role of reason, the Enlightenment faith in reason’s ability to elevate humanity by improving moral belief and action has been both challenged and vindicated (Kumar and May forthcoming). Sentimentalists argue that emotions, not reasoning or reasons, are the major engines of change. One strand of support comes from experimental psychology (Nichols 2004, 2021; Prinz 2007). For example, research shows that the emotion of disgust makes people’s moral evaluations harsher, even though the object of disgust (e.g., foul smell) is irrelevant (cf. May 2014; Landy and Goodwin 2015). Another source of support comes from empirical history. Anthony Appiah (2010) argues that long prior to the occurrence of many cases of moral progress, including the British abolition of the slave trade and the end of footbinding in Imperial China, the belief that those relevant practices were immoral was already widely held. What ultimately garnered momentum in those cases of progress was emotion—in particular, emotions of collective shame and honor. Not only is reason’s power in motivating right action challenged; its epistemic potential in correcting biases and falsehoods is undermined, too. A relevant area of research is post-hoc rationalization (Haidt 2001). Researchers find that people do reason, but they often reason in search of evidence and arguments to defend their pre-existing judgments. To put it metaphorically, reason is not an impartial judge but a passionate lawyer. To the extent that our pre-existing judgments are flawed, the more we reason, the more entrenched we become in the problematic status quo.

In response to these sentimentalist challenges, some rationalists argue that the problems lie not in rationality itself but in the overly individualistic model of rationality of the Enlightenment. While it is generally true that individuals cannot resist unruly passions or introspect their own biases, collectives can. Different forms of collective reasoning have been proposed. For example, Joseph Heath (2014) suggests institutionalizing the “head” over the “heart.” In his view, parliamentary democracy entrenches “demagoguery, short-termism, simple-minded populism, the excessive influence of money and the role played by special interests” and would be better replaced by technocracy and “slow politics.” Similarly, drawing on argumentation theory, Hugo Mercier (2011) claims that post-hoc rationalization is not irrational; quite the contrary, it is a useful cognitive mechanism for individuals to form, exchange, and evaluate arguments when others disagree with us. Evidence suggests that in small-group, well-controlled settings, when individuals recognize that their decisions are unjustifiable, they change their mind. Others reject the dichotomy between rationalism and sentimentalism as false. Developing upon the dual-process model of cognition, Kumar and Campbell (2022) claim that moral judgments consist of both emotions and beliefs. More importantly, reasoning can change moral judgments when it recognizes inconsistency between emotions and beliefs. And the change is typically diachronic rather than synchronic. This form of “moral consistency reasoning,” they argue, played a crucial role in facilitating the gay rights revolution, among others.

Another way to vindicate the role of reason in progress is to not focus on the form of reasoning but rather its object. In the philosophy of social science literature, theorists argue that reasoning can be effective in facilitating progressive change if it is leveraged against social norms (Bicchieri 2016; Tam 2020). On Cristina Bicchieri’s influential account, social norms are recurrent patterns of behavior motivated by shared empirical and normative expectations of conditional conformity in a relevant network. What is unique about social norms as a kind of social practice is their “expectation and membership dependent” justificatory structure. In the mind of the followers, they think they ought to conform primarily because their members think they should, even if they privately do not value it or outsiders object to it. As experimental and field studies have shown, many problematic social practices such as female genital cutting, honor killing, corruption, and physical punishment turn out to be social norms. In an important case study, Bicchieri finds that informational campaigns about the harm to health or moral argumentation about bodily autonomy and gender equality were ineffective in ending female genital cutting in Sudan. The individuals involved in such practices were not gripped by these prudential and moral considerations but something fundamentally social, namely Sudanese shared expectations about chastity, beauty, and parental love. In this case, even though reasoning about prudential and moral considerations was ineffective, reasoning about the relevant social considerations and redefining them was.

Some philosophers argue that social norms operative with their own distinct logic. As such, identifying, evaluating, and reinterpreting these social norms demands a new form of reasoning, in contrast to standard impartialist and argumentative accounts of moral reasoning. For example, Alison Jaggar and Theresa Tobin (2013) argue that changing local cultural norms requires a collaborative form of reasoning guided by trust and deference to authorities. In a similar spirit, Agnes Tam (2020) advances an account of “we”-reasoning to change social norms, distinguished by its communitarian (as opposed to democratic) structure, and its respect for the conformist and parochial tendencies of the “we” that is constitutive of social norms. Even though the power of social norms is fast gaining attention from social change theorists, some contend that social norms, reified in social structures, are not reason-responsive (Haslanger 2017, 2018). This takes us to the last core condition of progress: political institutions and activism.

2.6 The Role of Institutions

To a large extent, one’s view on the role of institutions in progress follows from that of the role of human nature and reason. For those who think that our evolved nature forecloses the possibility of progress, no amount of institutional design can reopen it. By contrast, for those who think that progress is a matter of nurture, institutions of the right kind are an important vehicle of progress. To some, the right kind of institutions are liberal. A liberal state can bring about physical security and peace, conditions under which inclusive tendencies develop (Buchanan and Powell 2018; Buchanan 2020). A free market fosters material progress (Hayek 2011) and mutually beneficial group relations and inter-group trust, which in turn fosters moral progress (Buchanan and Powell 2018). Freedom of information and expression enables critical reflection, such that authority and customs can be challenged, resentment and dissent heard, and prejudices and biases corrected (Heath 2014; Huemer 2016). British abolitionism is a case in point (Buchanan and Powell 2018). In the late 18th and early 19th centuries, British society was materially better-off and physically more secure. The invention of the free press at the time also enhanced levels of literacy and facilitated expression of and responsiveness to the wrongness of slavery.

In contrast to the liberal tradition, the Marxist tradition tends to locate progress outside of institutions and in political struggles (Jaeggi 2018). This is due to Marxists’ sociological understanding of the function of the state as well as their standpoint epistemology. According to Louis Althusser (2014/1971), there are two kinds of state apparatuses: repressive and ideological. Repressive state apparatuses include the government, administration, and courts, and they function coercively. Ideological state apparatuses include education, the political system, communication, and culture, and these apparatuses function non-coercively. Both serve the interests of the ruling class and enforce the unjust status quo. For example, in a capitalist society, institutions function to protect and rationalize the interests of the bourgeoisie. In other words, far from facilitating freedom and collective learning, institutions are tools of oppression and the perpetuation of false consciousness. Progress begins when these institutions are subverted. Political struggles are the form that such subversion takes.

Political struggles come in many forms, including revolution, resistance, and social movements. One form that has received a lot of attention from theorists of progress, Marxists and pragmatists alike, is the social movement (Young 1990; Haslanger 2021; Anderson 2014; Moody-Adams 2022). Anderson (2014) singles out the social movement as a “particularly apt vehicle of progressive moral transformation.” Likewise, Moody-Adams (2022, 13) views social movements as potentially “vital sources of moral enlightenment and advances in collective rationality.” Social movements are often defined as a form of contentious politics which marginalized groups use to make claims against the authorities, outside of formal institutions, by organizing sustained campaigns and using repeated performances that advertise the claims (Tilly and Tarrow 2015, 11). There are three ways to account for the aptness of social movements in facilitating progress. The first way is epistemic. As discussed above, reasoning, even in good faith, is prone to post-hoc rationalization and reinforcement of an unjust status quo. By contrast, practical contention is better able to hold “affected ignorance” accountable (Moody-Adams 2022). It also leverages the privileged standpoint of the socially oppressed to destabilize and counteract the bias suffered by the socially privileged (Anderson 2014) and to disrupt ideologies and unmask reality (Haslanger 2017), raising collective consciousness. The second way is motivational. The display of “worthiness,” “unity,” “numbers,” and “commitment” in social movements has been identified as powerful in mobilizing public support, much more so than the unforced force of a better argument (Anderson 2014). The third way is normative. In contrast to the “assimilationist and universalist” logic of formal democratic institutions, social movements have far fewer constraints on claim-making. Not only can social movements avoid erasing group identities and silencing identity-based injustices (Young 1991; Moody-Adams 2022), through story-telling and emotional expressions, the subaltern can truly realize their agency and emancipation.

3. Critiques of Progress

The preceding discussion has shown the various ways in which the practical version of the Enlightenment project of progress has been actively revived. But as noted in the introduction, many philosophers, predominately in the Frankfurt School, postmodern, and postcolonial traditions, remain convinced that neither the metaphysical nor the practical versions should be resuscitated. In what follows, we will examine the key metaphysical and normative critiques of the Enlightenment discourse of progress.

3.1 Metaphysical Critiques from Critical Theory and Moral Relativism

Some of the deepest criticisms of progress were produced during and after the catastrophes and upheavals of the 20th century. A uniting theme of these diverse criticisms is an alternative view of history that is contingent, if not tragic. In an oft-quoted passage, Walter Benjamin (1940 [1969]) uses the metaphor of a storm to conceive of progress:

A Klee painting named “Angelus Novus” shows an angel looking as though he is about to move away from something he is fixedly contemplating. His eyes are staring, his mouth is open, his wings are spread. This is how one pictures the angel of history. His face is turned toward the past. Where we perceive a chain of events, he sees one single catastrophe which keeps piling wreckage upon wreckage and hurls it in front of his feet. The angel would like to stay, awaken the dead, and make whole what has been smashed. But a storm is blowing from Paradise; it has caught in his wings with such violence that the angel can no longer close them. This storm irresistibly propels him into the future to which his back is turned, while the pile of debris before him grows skyward. This storm is what we call progress.

On this alternative picture, history has no upward trajectory; in fact, there is no trajectory at all. Humans cannot control the course of history. We cannot fix past wrongs nor secure a just future. The lack of human agency is symbolized by the angel who is helplessly hurled forward by the storm that is history.

This metaphysical view of history informs a very different idea of progress, one that is fictive. If there are no facts of progress, what we call progress are just narratives, written by those who are incapable of looking horrors in the face. In Charles Larmore’s view, narratives of progress are nothing more than instruments of “self-congratulation” (2008, 20). Put differently, progress is an illusion that we see when we view historical events through our parochial lens. If we were ever able to survey human affairs from afar, taking the stance of a neutral spectator, suspending all our interests and commitments, history would just be a series of random events.

Theodor Adorno, a leading member of the Frankfurt School, writes one of the most searching critiques of the Enlightenment narrative of progress. The critique is part metaphysical, part empirical, and part methodological. As a German and a Jew in exile, Adorno is deeply critical of the tendency in Hegel’s philosophy of history to reconcile with the past and justify the status quo. For Adorno, the philosophical task is to reveal the contingencies and the fractures in history so as to subvert it. As he famously puts it, “progress begins where it ends” (Adorno 2005, 150). Genuine progress and emancipation are only possible when the hegemonic interpretations of history written by the powerful are contested. In Minima Moralia (1974), Adorno first proposes an alternative method of examining the meaning of history. Instead of moving past human evils and individual fates in a cursory fashion, as Hegel tends to do, Adorno suggests that we dwell on individual experience and catastrophe. In Dialectic of Enlightenment (2002), Adorno and Max Horkheimer apply this method and provide an alternative narrative of modern Europe, according to which the rise of modernity, science, technology, and capitalism are not products of progress but regressions. The bourgeois morality and the cultural industries are not products of moral and artistic progress but mechanisms to blind the people to capitalistic ideologies as well as placate the oppressed majority. Since history is by nature contingent and since events have been tragic, Adorno concludes that there is no rational basis for the belief that progress is possible, let alone inevitable. As he puts it bleakly, “We can find nothing in reality that might help to redeem the promise inherent in the word ‘progress’” (2006, 143).

But as we have seen in section 2, few contemporary philosophers explain moral and political progress by making metaphysical claims about history. Indeed, many are aware of the regressions that critical theorists have correctly highlighted. As detailed in sections 2.1 and 2.2, most of the contemporary teleological and non-teleological accounts of progress accommodate the fact and the possibility of regressions by attributing various roles to human agency. Consequently, tragedies by themselves do not undermine the possibility of progress; rather, what they reveal the dark side of human nature, the lapse of judgment, or the fragility of institutions. Does this mean that the contemporary idea of progress—one that is naturalistic, open-ended, local, and non-linear—is not vulnerable to the metaphysical critique? Not entirely. There is another form of metaphysical critique to which even the more modest idea of progress may be subjected. This is the critique from moral relativism.

Moral relativism takes many forms (see entry on Moral Relativism) but at its core is the idea that there are no objective moral truths. What is right or wrong, good or evil, is indexed to response-dependent properties. It is worth noting that unlike nihilism, moral relativism does not commit to the idea that all moral systems are empty and, as such, morality is an illusion. To the contrary, moral relativism holds that there are too many true moral claims. If moral claims are indexed to culturally inculcated systems of values, then the same moral claim can be true in some cultures but not others. For example, it might be true that female genital mutilation is evil in liberal culture but good in another. The implication for moral progress, as Jesse Prinz (2007) argues, is that “‘moral progress’ cannot be interpreted as a transition from one set of values to a morally better set of values.” This does not just rule out inter-cultural comparison (which the contemporary local idea of progress does not allow anyway); it also rules out intra-cultural comparison. “Moral progress,” even within a cultural community, is nothing more than “moral conversion” (Prinz 2007, 295). We fool ourselves into thinking that moral conversion is moral progress because moral values are self-affirming. Does this mean that moral relativists have no resources to claim that the abolition of slavery is an instance of moral progress? Not exactly. Prinz’s response is that such cases are better understood as examples of “extramoral” improvement. He identifies “consistency,” “stability,” “well-being,” “conformity to biological norms” as things people value in an extramoral sense (2007, 292). Extramoral because they are pragmatic, prudential, and hedonic in nature. By this light, the abolition of slavery could be an extramoral improvement if slavery were not prudentially valuable. But to call it moral progress is all but an illusion.

3.2 Normative Critiques from Postmodernism and Postcolonialism

Critics working within postmodern and postcolonial traditions shift the focus away from the metaphysics of history to the undesirability of the normative ideal of progress. They argue that the ideal of progress celebrated by the Enlightenment thinkers is politically dangerous. It evaluates non-Western societies as “backward” according to a Eurocentric understanding of the good, human nature, reason, and sound institutions. This serves as a rationale for the so-called civilizing mission of the West, falsely legitimating racism, colonialism, and imperialism (McCarthy 2009). In Eurocentrism, Samir Amin (1989) criticizes the Enlightenment ideal of progress as a product of Eurocentric bias, for three reasons. Firstly, the ideals of freedom, rationality, and objectivity characterize all major historical innovations as European. Secondly, the Enlightenment discourse also views capitalist democracy as the ideal social system and colonialism as instrumental in spreading it throughout the world. Finally, it views current global economic inequality as being caused by internal features of individual countries and is in principle eliminable.

Other postcolonial scholars are keen to point out the inconsistencies in the Eurocentric narratives of progress. Specifically, while Enlightenment thinkers see the norms and institutions of European modernity as the outcome of a cumulative process of collective learning, postcolonial scholars argue that they are in fact shaped by the material and ideological relations between Europe and its colonies. As Anibal Quijano (2000) notes, Europe was built with the free labor of the American Indians, blacks, and mestizos, with their advanced technology in mining and agriculture, and with their products such as gold, silver, potatoes, tomatoes, and tobacco (see also Fanon 2005). In addition to material dependence, Europe was also ideologically dependent on its colonies. In Orientalism, Edward Said (1978) argues that Western scholars have created a binary distinction between the civilized West and the barbaric East. This discourse of Orientalism constructs and silences the colonialized and racialized subjects.

Recently, there have been attempts to decolonize the discourse of progress. The motivation is that the moral imperative of progress (improvement of the human condition) can be severed from both metaphysical overtones and Eurocentric ideologies. Drawing inspiration from Adorno and Michel Foucault, Amy Allen (2016) sees promise not so much in the power of reasoning or learning; reason, while not necessarily a form a madness, is always entangled with power. Progress begins therefore not from learning how to utilize the capacity to reason but in unlearning, which Allen defines as “a critical problematization of our own, historically sedimented point of view that frees us up in relation to it” (2016, 202). It cultivates in us a capacity to understand what we do not already understand and to be humble and modest toward our own moral certainties.

Catherine Lu (2023) offers yet another interesting proposal. She rejects the undefended assumption that narratives of progress are essential for moral and political agency. To the contrary, she suggests that in the postcolonial world, tragic narratives are not just empirically grounded or rationally warranted; they are also morally empowering. As a genre, tragedies reveal the “indeterminacy of human agency” rather than its “futility or irrelevance.” Both the powerful and the weak may be vulnerable to tragic instability in any social structure. More specifically, tragic narratives can stir “moments of recognition” of vulnerability in the powerful when they show that no amount of power—material, intellectual or moral—can shield one from tragedies. On the other hand, tragic narratives show the powerless that no tyrant or oppressor is indestructible and that they can rage, despair, seek vengeance, resist injustice, and even strive for reconciliation. These are the overlooked functions of tragic narratives. They provide the public with a space for critical reflection and also for generating and sustaining communal solidarity and accountability practices. Paradoxically, perhaps what progress needs is not more optimistic progress narratives, which have so preoccupied philosophers and troubled humanity for centuries, but rather more tragic narratives. In other words, while the contemporary defenders of progress are still carrying the torch of their Enlightenment predecessors in explaining the possibility of progress in its limited forms and developing sophisticated causal roles for reasoning in advancing it, the contemporary critics of progress decline to so due to the grave moral risk. As the critics see it, the most intellectually and politically responsible task is to highlight the indeterminacy of human development and unlearn all the false narratives of progress, including the Enlightenment ones.


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