Quantum Gravity

First published Mon Dec 26, 2005; substantive revision Mon Feb 26, 2024

Quantum Gravity, broadly construed, is a physical theory (still ‘under construction’ after over 100 years) incorporating both the principles of general relativity and quantum theory. Such a theory is expected to be able to provide a satisfactory description of the microstructure of spacetime at the so-called Planck scale, at which all fundamental constants of the ingredient theories, \(c\) (the velocity of light in vacuo), \(\hslash\) (the reduced Planck’s constant), and G (Newton’s constant), come together to form units of mass, length, and time. This scale is so remote from current experimental capabilities that the empirical testing of quantum gravity proposals along standard lines is rendered near-impossible, though there have been some recent developments that suggest the outlook might be more optimistic than previously surmised (see Carney, Stamp, and Taylor, 2022, for a review; Huggett, Linnemann, and Schneider, 2023, provides a pioneering philosophical examination of so-called “laboratory quantum gravity”).

In most, though not all, theories of quantum gravity, the gravitational field itself is also quantized. Since the contemporary theory of gravity, general relativity, describes gravitation as the curvature of spacetime by matter and energy, a quantization of gravity seemingly implies some sort of quantization of spacetime geometry: quantum spacetime. Insofar as all extant physical theories rely on a classical (non-quantum) spacetime background, this presents not only extreme technical difficulties, but also profound methodological and ontological challenges for the philosopher and the physicist. Though quantum gravity has been the subject of investigation by physicists for almost a century (see Rickles 2020), philosophers have only just begun to investigate its philosophical implications.

1. Introduction

Dutch artist M.C. Escher’s elegant pictorial paradoxes are prized by many, not least by philosophers, physicists, and mathematicians. Some of his work, for example Ascending and Descending, relies on optical illusion to depict what is actually an impossible situation. Other works are paradoxical in the broad sense, but not impossible: Relativity depicts a coherent arrangement of objects, albeit an arrangement in which the force of gravity operates in an unfamiliar fashion. (See the Other Internet Resources section below for images.) Quantum gravity itself may be like this: an unfamiliar yet coherent arrangement of familiar elements. Or it may be more like Ascending and Descending, an impossible construction which looks sensible in its local details but does not fit together into a coherent whole when using presently existing building materials. If the latter is true, then the construction of a quantum theory of gravity may demand entirely unfamiliar elements. Whatever the final outcome, the situation at present is one of flux, with a great many competing approaches vying for the prize. However, it is also important to note that the prize is not always the same: string theorists seek a unified theory of all four interactions that has the power of explaining such things as the numbers of generations of elementary particles and other previous inexplicable properties. Other approaches are more modest, and seek only to bring general relativity in line with quantum theory, without necessarily invoking the other interactions. Hence, the problem of quantum gravity can mean very different things to different researchers and what constitutes a possible solution to one group might not qualify as such to another.

Given that quantum gravity does not yet exist as a working physical theory, one might legitimately question whether philosophers have any business being involved at this stage. Certainly the philosopher’s task will be somewhat different from that faced when dealing with a more-or-less settled body of theory such as classical Newtonian mechanics, general relativity, or quantum mechanics. In such cases, one typically proceeds by assuming the physical soundness of the theory or theoretical framework and drawing out the ontological and perhaps epistemological consequences of the theory, trying to understand what it is that the theory is telling us about the nature of space, time, matter, causation, and so on. Theories of quantum gravity, on the other hand, are bedeviled by a host of technical and conceptual problems, questions, and issues that make them largely unsuited to this kind of interpretive approach. In the case of string theory, there isn’t even really a ‘theory’ to speak of, so much as several clues pointing to what many hope will some day be an applicable, consistent physical theory. However, philosophers who have a taste for a broader and more open-ended form of inquiry will find much to think about, and it is entirely possible that future philosophers of physics will be faced with problems of a very different flavour as a result of the peculiar nature of quantum gravity. Indeed, Tian Cao argues that quantum gravity offers up a unique opportunity for philosophers of physics, leaving them “with a good chance to make some positive contributions, rather than just analysing philosophically what physicists have already established” (Cao, 2001, p. 138). This sentiment has in fact been echoed by several physicists, not least by Carlo Rovelli (a central architect of the approach known as loop quantum gravity), who complains that he wishes philosophers would not restrict themselves to “commenting and polishing the present fragmentary physical theories, but would take the risk of trying to look ahead” (Rovelli, 1997, p. 182). This raises an important point: though we think of general relativity and quantum theory as ‘nice’ theories from the point of view of philosophical investigation, in a very real sense they are not the whole story and break down at extreme scales. That is: we cannot ignore the problem of quantum gravity.

2. Gravity Meets Quantum Theory

The difficulties in reconciling quantum theory and gravity into some form of quantum gravity come from the prima facie incompatibility of general relativity, Einstein’s relativistic theory of gravitation, and quantum field theory, the framework for the description of the other three forces (electromagnetism and the strong and weak nuclear interactions). Whence the incompatibility? General relativity is described by Einstein’s equations, which amount to constraints on the curvature of spacetime (the Einstein tensor on the left-hand side) due to the presence of mass and other forms of energy, such as electromagnetic radiation (the stress-energy-momentum tensor on the right-hand side). (See John Baez’s webpages in Other Internet Resources for an excellent introduction.) In doing so, they manage to encompass traditional, Newtonian gravitational phenomena such as the mutual attraction of two or more massive objects, while also predicting new phenomena such as the bending and red-shifting of light by these objects (which have been observed) and the existence of gravitational radiation (until very recently, with the direct detection of gravitational waves by LIGO, this was, of course, only indirectly observed via the decrease in the period of binary pulsars-see the 1993 Physics Nobel Prize presentation speech by Carl Nordling.)

In general relativity, mass and energy are treated in a purely classical manner, where ‘classical’ means that physical quantities such as the strengths and directions of various fields and the positions and velocities of particles have definite values. These quantities are represented by tensor fields, sets of (real) numbers associated with each spacetime point. For example, the stress, energy, and momentum \(T_{ab}(\boldsymbol{x},t)\) of the electromagnetic field at some point \((\boldsymbol{x},t)\), are functions of the three components \(E_i, E_j, E_k, B_i, B_j, B_k\) of the electric and magnetic fields \(\boldsymbol{E}\) and \(\boldsymbol{B}\) at that point. These quantities in turn determine, via Einstein’s equations, an aspect of the ‘curvature’ of spacetime, a set of numbers \(G_{ab}(\boldsymbol{x},t)\) which is in turn a function of the spacetime metric. The metric \(g_{ab}(\boldsymbol{x},t)\) is a set of numbers associated with each point which gives the distance to neighboring points. A model of the world according to general relativity consists of a spacetime manifold with a metric, the curvature of which is constrained by the stress-energy-momentum of the matter distribution. All physical quantities — the value of the \(x\)-component of the electric field at some point, the scalar curvature of spacetime at some point, and so on — have definite values, given by real (as opposed to complex or imaginary) numbers. Thus general relativity is a classical theory in the sense given above.

The problem is that our fundamental theories of matter and energy, the theories describing the interactions of various particles via the electromagnetic force and the strong and weak nuclear forces, are all quantum theories. In quantum theories, these physical quantities do not in general have definite values. For example, in quantum mechanics, the position of an electron may be specified with arbitrarily high accuracy only at the cost of a loss of specificity in the description of its momentum, hence its velocity. At the same time, in the quantum theory of the electromagnetic field known as quantum electrodynamics (QED), the electric and magnetic fields associated with the electron suffer an associated uncertainty. In general, physical quantities are described by a quantum state which gives a probability distribution over many different values, and increased specificity (narrowing of the distribution) of one property (e.g., position, electric field) gives rise to decreased specificity of its canonically conjugate property (e.g., momentum, magnetic field). This is an expression of Heisenberg’s Uncertainty Principle. In the context of quantum gravity the fluctuating geometry is known as “spacetime foam”. Likewise, if one focusses in on the spatial geometry, it will not have a definite trajectory.

On the surface, the incompatibility between general relativity and quantum theory might seem rather trivial. Why not just follow the model of QED and quantize the gravitational field, similar to the way in which the electromagnetic field was quantized? This is more or less the path that was taken, but it encounters extraordinary difficulties. Some physicists consider these to be ‘merely’ technical difficulties, having to do with the non-renormalizability of the gravitational interaction and the consequent failure of the perturbative methods which have proven effective in ordinary quantum field theories. However, these technical problems are closely related to a set of daunting conceptual difficulties, of interest to both physicists and philosophers.

The conceptual difficulties basically follow from the nature of the gravitational interaction, in particular the equivalence of gravitational and inertial mass, which allows one to represent gravity as a property of spacetime itself, rather than as a field propagating \(in\) a (passive) spacetime background. When one attempts to quantize gravity, one is subjecting some of the properties of spacetime to quantum fluctuations. For example, in canonical quantizations of gravity one isolates and then quantizes geometrical quantities (roughly the intrinsic and extrinsic curvature of three dimensional space) functioning as the position and momentum variables. Given the uncertainty principle and the probabilistic nature of quantum theory, one has a picture involving fluctuations of the geometry of space, much as the electric and magnetic fields fluctuate in QED. But ordinary quantum theory presupposes a well-defined classical background against which to define these fluctuations (Weinstein, 2001a, b), and so one runs into trouble not only in giving a mathematical characterization of the quantization procedure (how to take into account these fluctuations in the effective spacetime structure?) but also in giving a conceptual and physical account of the theory that results, should one succeed. For example, a fluctuating metric would seem to imply a fluctuating causal structure and spatiotemporal ordering of events, in which case, how is one to define equal-time commutation relations in the quantum theory? (See the section on the Lagrangian formulation in the entry on quantum field theory.)

Cao (2001) believes that the conceptual nature of the problem demands a conceptual resolution. He advocates what he calls ‘ontological synthesis’. This approach asks for an analysis of the ontological pictures of the two ingredient theories of quantum gravity, so that their consistency (the consistency of the resulting synthesis) can be properly assessed. Ontology for Cao refers to the primary, autonomous structures from which all other properties and relations in a theory are constructed. A fairly simple inspection of the respective ontological constraints imposed by general relativity and quantum field theory reveals serious tension: general relativity discards the fixed kinematical structure of spacetime, so that localization is rendered relational, but in quantum field theory a fixed flat background is part of its ontological basis, from which the standard features of the theory are derived. On the other hand, as we have seen, quantum field theory involves quantum fluctuations in the vicinity of a point, while general relativity involves the use of a smooth point neighbourhood. Either way, in order to bring the two ontological bases together, some piece of either edifice must be demolished. Cao proposes that the tension can best be resolved by focussing firmly on those sine qua non principles of the respective theories. Cao views the gravitational property of universal coupling as essential, but notes that this does not require continuity, so that the former could be retained while discarding the latter, without rendering the framework inconsistent, thus allowing for quantum theory’s violent fluctuations (Cao’s prime candidate for an essential quantum field theoretic concept). Likewise, he argues that quantum field theory requires a fixed background in order to localize quantum fields and set up causal structure. But he notes that a relational account of localization could perform such a function, with fields localized relative to each other. In so doing, one could envisage a diffeomorphism covariant quantum field theory (i.e. one that does not involve reference to fields localized at points of the spacetime manifold). The resulting synthesized entity (a violently fluctuating, universally coupled quantum gravitational field) would then be what a quantum theory of gravity ought to describe.

While such an approach sounds sensible enough on the surface, to actually put it into practice in the constructive stages of theory-building (rather than a retrospective analysis of a completed theory) is not going to be easy—though it has to be said, the method Cao describes bears close resemblance to the way loop quantum gravity has developed. Lucien Hardy (2007) has developed a novel approach to quantum gravity that shares features of Cao’s suggestion, though the principles isolated are different from Cao’s. The causaloid approach is intended to provide a framework for quantum gravity theories, where idea is to develop a general formalism that respects the key features of both general relativity, which he takes to be the dynamical (non-probabilistic) causal structure, and quantum theory, which he takes to be the probabilistic (nondynamical) dynamics. The causaloid (of some theory) is an entity that encodes all that can be calculated in the theory. Part of the problem here is that Cao’s (and Hardy’s) approach assumes that the ontological principles hold at the Planck scale. However, it is perfectly possible that both of the input theories break down at higher energies. Not only that, the technical difficulties of setting up the kind of (physically realistic) diffeomorphism-invariant quantum field theory he suggests have so far proven to be an insurmountable challenge. One crucial aspect that is missing from Cao’s framework is a notion of what the observables might be. Of course, they must be relational, but this still leaves the problem very much open. (The idea of making progress by isolating appropriate principles of quantum gravity forms the basis of a special issue: Crowther and Rickles, eds, 2014.)

We will look in more detail at how various conceptual and methodological problems arise in two different research programs below. But first, we introduce some key features of the leading research programs.

3. Theoretical Frameworks

All approaches to the problem of quantum gravity agree that something must be said about the relationship between gravitation and quantized matter. These various approaches can be catalogued in various ways, depending on the relative weight assigned to general relativity and quantum field theory. Some approaches view general relativity as in need of correction and quantum field theory as generally applicable, while others view quantum field theory as problematic and general relativity as having a more universal status. Still others view the theories in a more even-handed manner, perhaps with both simply amounting to distinct limits of a deeper theory. It has often been suggested, since the earliest days of quantum gravity research, that bringing quantum field theory and general relativity together might serve to cure their respective singularity problems (the former resulting from bad high frequency behaviour of fields; the latter resulting from certain kinds of gravitational collapse). This hope does seem to have been borne out in many of the current approaches. Roger Penrose has even argued that the joint consideration of gravitation and quantum theory could resolve the infamous quantum measurement problem (see Penrose 2001; see also the section on the measurement problem in the entry on philosophical issues in quantum theory). The basic idea of Penrose’s proposal is fairly simple to grasp: when there is wave-packet spreading of the centre of mass of some body, there results a greater imprecision in the spacetime structure associated with the spreading wave-packet, and this destroys the coherence of the distant parts of the wave-function. There are difficulties in distinguishing the gravitationally induced collapse that Penrose proposes from the effective collapse induced by quantum theory itself, thanks to decoherence—Joy Christian (2005) has suggested that by observing oscillations in the flavor ratios of neutrinos originating at cosmological distances one could eliminate the confounding effects of environmental decoherence.

The two most popular approaches remain string theory and loop quantum gravity. The former is an example of an approach to quantum gravity in which the gravitational field is not quantized; rather, a distinct theory is quantized which happens to coincide with general relativity (as well as the other interactions) at low energies. The latter is an approach involving (constrained) canonical quantization, albeit of a version of general relativity based on a different choice of variables than the usual geometrodynamical, metric-based variables. We cover the basic details of each of these in the following subsections.

3.1 String Theory

Known variously as string theory, superstring theory, and M-theory, this program (qua theory of quantum gravity) has its roots, indirectly, in the observation, dating back to at least the 1930s, that classical general relativity looks in many ways like the theory of a massless ‘spin-two’ field propagating on the flat Minkowski spacetime of special relativity. [See Cappelli et al. (eds.) 2012, and Gasperini and Maharana (eds.) 2008, for collections of essays covering the early history of string theory; Rickles 2014 offers a conceptually-oriented history of the earlier days of string theory; Rovelli 2001b (Other Internet Resources section below) and 2006 offer a capsule history, and Greene 2000 provides a popular account.] This observation led to early attempts to formulate a quantum theory of gravity by “quantizing” this spin-two theory. However, it turned out that the theory is not perturbatively renormalizable, meaning that there are ineliminable infinities. Attempts to modify the classical theory to eliminate this problem led to a different problem, non-unitarity, and so this general approach was moribund until the mid-1970s, when it was discovered that a theory of one-dimensional “strings” developed around 1970 to account for the strong interaction, actually provided a framework for a unified theory which included gravity, because one of the modes of oscillation of the string corresponded to a massless spin-two particle (the ‘graviton’).

The original and still prominent idea behind string theory was to replace the point particles of ordinary quantum field theory (particles like photons, electrons, etc) with one-dimensional extended objects called strings. (See Weingard, 2001 and Witten, 2001 for overviews of the conceptual framework.) In the early development of the theory, it was recognized that construction of a consistent quantum theory of strings required that the strings “live” in a larger number of spatial dimensions than the observed three. String theories containing fermions as well as bosons must be formulated in nine space dimensions and one time dimension. Strings can be open or closed, and have a characteristic tension and hence vibrational spectrum. The various modes of vibration correspond to various particles, one of which is the graviton (the hypothetical massless, spin-2 particle responsible for mediating gravitational interactions). The resulting theories have the advantage of being perturbatively renormalizable. This means that perturbative calculations are at least mathematically tractable. Since perturbation theory is an almost indispensable tool for physicists, this is deemed a good thing.

String theory has undergone several mini-revolutions over the last several years, one of which involved the discovery of various duality relations, mathematical transformations connecting, in this case, what appear to be physically distinct string theories — type I, type IIA, type IIB, (heterotic) SO(32) and (heterotic) \(\mathrm{E}_8\times\mathrm{E}_8\) — to one another and to eleven-dimensional supergravity (a particle theory). The discovery of these connections led to the conjecture that all of the string theories are really aspects of a single underlying theory, which was given the name ‘M-theory’ (though M-theory is also used more specifically to describe the unknown theory of which eleven-dimensional supergravity is the low energy limit). The rationale, according to one kind of duality (S-duality), is that one theory at strong coupling (high energy description) is physically equivalent (in terms of physical symmetries, correlation functions and all observable content) to another theory at weak coupling (where a lower energy means a more tractable description), and that if all the theories are related to one another by dualities such as this, then they must all be aspects of some more fundamental theory. Though attempts have been made, there has been no successful formulation of this theory: its very existence, much less its nature, is still largely a matter of conjecture.

There has been some recent interest in dualities by philosophers, given their clear links to standard philosophical issues such as underdetermination, conventionalism, and emergence/reduction. The link comes about because in a dual pair (of theories) one has a observable equivalence combined with what appears to be radical physical (and mathematical) differences. These differences can be as extreme as describing spacetimes of apparently different topological structures, including different numbers of dimensions. This has led some physicists to speak of spacetime emerging, depending on such things as the coupling strength governing physical interactions. This can be seen most clearly in the context of the AdS/CFT duality in which a ten dimensional string theory is found to be observationally equivalent (again covering physical symmetries, observables and their correlation functions) to a four dimensional gauge theory — this is sometimes called a ‘gauge/gravity’ duality since the string theory contains gravity (all string theories contain gravitons) while the gauge theory does not. Since there is an equivalence between these descriptions, it makes sense to say that neither is fundamental, and so (elements of) the spacetimes they apparently describe are also not fundamental; thus implying that the spacetime we observe at low-energies is an emergent phenomenon — Vistarini 2013 is a recent discussion of spacetime emergence in string theory. One way to view such dual pairs is in terms of the two theories (the gauge theory and a gravitational theory) being distinct classical limits of a more all-encompassing quantum theory. In this case, the classical emergent structures also include the specific gauge symmetries and degrees of freedom of the limiting theories. A problem remains of making sense of the more fundamental theory (and the associated physical structure it describes) from which these spacetimes and gauge symmetries emerge.

Philosophically speaking, there is a large question mark over whether the dual pair should be seen as genuinely distinct in a physical sense or as mere notational variants of the same theory — talk of a “dictionary” relating the theories makes the latter more palatable and suggests that the choice of physical interpretation might be conventional. However, if we view the theories as notational variants, then our sense of theory-individuation is seemingly compromised, since the dual pairs involve different dynamics and degrees of freedom. (See Joseph Polchinski 2014, for a thorough account of the various kinds of dualities along with some of their interpretive quirks; Rickles 2011 provides an early philosophical examination of string dualities; a useful, simplified guide is le Bihan and Read, 2018; a more exhaustive study is de Haro and Butterfield, forthcoming).

A further problem of string theory is that it appears to amount to many distinct theories (albeit with dualities linking some of them, and so with the question of whether they are the same theory under different representations) that form a ‘landscape’ of theories. The problem faced is how we get from a vast space of possible string theories to the string theory that represents our world. This brings in issues of ‘anthropics,’ since it seems essential to include our own essential properties, as observers of the world, to narrow down the possibility space (see Kane 2021 for recent developments in accessing our world from the landscape).

3.2 Canonical and Loop Quantum Gravity

Whereas (perturbative) string theory and other so-called ‘covariant’ approaches view the curved spacetime of general relativity as an effective modification of a flat (or other fixed) background geometry by a massless spin-two field, the canonical quantum gravity program treats the full spacetime metric itself as a kind of field, and attempts to quantize it directly without splitting it apart into a flat part and a perturbation. However, spacetime itself is split apart into a stack of three dimensional slices (a foliation) on which is defined a spatial geometry. Technically, work in this camp proceeds by writing down general relativity in so-called ‘canonical’ or ‘Hamiltonian’ form, since there is a more-or-less clearcut way to quantize theories once they are put in this form (Kuchar, 1993; Belot & Earman, 2001). In a canonical description, one chooses a particular set of configuration variables \(x_i\) and canonically conjugate momentum variables \(p_i\) which describe the state of a system at some time, and can be encoded in a phase space. Then, one obtains the time-evolution of these variables from the Hamiltonian \(H(x_i,p_i)\), which provides the physically possible motions in the phase space a family of curves. Quantization proceeds by treating the configuration and momentum variables as operators on a quantum state space (a Hilbert space) obeying certain commutation relations analogous to the classical Poisson-bracket relations, which effectively encode the quantum fuzziness associated with Heisenberg’s uncertainty principle. The Hamiltonian operator, acting on quantum states, would then generate the dynamical evolution.

When one attempts to write general relativity down in this way, one has to contend with the existence of constraints on the canonical variables that are inherited from the diffeomorphism invariance of the spacetime formulation of the theory. The single tensorial equation that we see in standard presentations of the Einstein field equations is translated into 10 scalar equations in the canonical formulation, with constraints accounting for four of these equations (the remaining six are genuine evolutionary equations). Three of the constraints (known as the momentum or diffeomorphism constraints) are responsible for shifting data tangential to the initial surface and, thus, are related to the shift vector field. The remaining constraint, known as the Hamiltonian (or scalar) constraint, is responsible for pushing data off the initial surface, and thus is related to the lapse function. If the constraints are not satisfied by the canonical initial data then the development of the data with respect to the evolution equations, will not generate a physically possible spacetime for choices of lapse and shift. However, when the constraints are satisfied then the various choices of lapse and shift will always grow the same 4D spacetime (that it, the same spacetime metric). However, to extract a notion of time from this formulation demands that one first solve for the spacetime metric, followed by a singling out of a specific solution. This is a kind of classical problem of time in that since the spacetime geometry is a dynamical variable, time is something that also must be solved for. Further, there is arbitrariness in the time variable as a result of the arbitrariness encoded in the constraints, stemming from the fact that time is essentially a freely chosen label of the three dimensional slices and so is not a physical parameter. However, one can extract a time for each solution to the Einstein equations by ‘deparametrizing’ the theory (i.e. isolating a variable from within the phase space that is to play the role of time). Below we see that things become more problematic in the shift to quantum theory.

Although advocates of the canonical approach often accuse string theorists of relying too heavily on classical background spacetime, the canonical approach does something which is arguably quite similar, in that one begins with a theory that conceives time-evolution in terms of evolving some data specified on an a priori given spacelike surface, and then quantizing the theory. However, this does not imply any breaking of spacetime diffeomorphism invariance (or general covariance) since the constraints that must be satisfied by the data on the slice mean that the physical observables of the theory will be independent of whatever foliation one chooses. However, the problem is that if spacetime is quantized along these lines, the assumption (of evolving then quantizing) does not make sense in anything but an approximate way. That is, the evolution does not generate a classical spacetime! Rather, solutions will be wave-functions (solutions of some Schrödinger-type equation). This issue in particular is decidedly neglected in both the physical and philosophical literature (but see Isham, 1993), and there is more that might be said. We return to the issue of time in quantum gravity below.

3.2.1 Geometric variables

Early attempts at quantizing general relativity by Bergmann, Dirac, Peres, Wheeler, DeWitt and others in the 1950s and 1960s worked with a seemingly natural choice for configuration variables, namely geometric variables \(g_{ij}\) corresponding to the various components of the ‘three-metric’ describing the intrinsic geometry of the given spatial slice of spacetime. One can think about arriving at this via an arbitrary slicing of a 4-dimensional “block” universe by 3-dimensional spacelike hypersurfaces. The conjugate momenta \(\pi_{ij}\) then effectively encode the time rate-of-change of the metric, which, from the 4-dimensional perspective, is directly related to the extrinsic curvature of the slice (meaning the curvature relative to the spacetime in which the slice is embedded). This approach is known as ‘geometrodynamics’ since it views general relativity as describing the dynamics of spatial geometry.

As mentioned above, in these geometric variables, as in any other canonical formulation of general relativity, one is faced with constraints, which encode the fact that the canonical variables cannot be specified independently. A familiar example of a constraint is Gauss’s law from ordinary electromagnetism, which states that, in the absence of charges, \(\nabla \cdot \boldsymbol{E}(\boldsymbol{x}) - 4\pi \varrho = 0\) at every point \(\boldsymbol{x}\). It means that the three components of the electric field at every point must be chosen so as to satisfy this constraint, which in turn means that there are only two “true” degrees of freedom possessed by the electric field at any given point in space. (Specifying two components of the electric field at every point dictates the third component.) Thus, not all components of the Maxwell equations propagate the fields in a physical sense.

The constraints in electromagnetism may be viewed as stemming from the \(U(1)\) gauge invariance of Maxwell’s theory, while the constraints of general relativity stem from the diffeomorphism invariance of the theory. Diffeomorphism invariance means, informally, that one can take a solution of Einstein’s equations and drag it (meaning the metric and the matter fields) around on the spacetime manifold and obtain a mathematically distinct but physically equivalent solution. The three ‘supermomentum’ constraints in the canonical theory reflect the freedom to drag the metric and matter fields around in various directions on a given three-dimensional spacelike hypersurface, while the ‘super-Hamiltonian’ constraint reflects the freedom to drag the fields in the “time” direction, and so to the “next” hypersurface. (Each constraint applies at each point of the given spacelike hypersurface, so that there are actually \(4 \times \infty^3\) constraints: four for each point.) In the classical (unquantized) canonical formulation of general relativity, the constraints do not pose any particular conceptual problems (though one does face a problem in defining suitable observables that commute with the constraints, and this certainly has a conceptual flavour). One effectively chooses a background space and time (via a choice of the lapse and shift functions) “on the fly”, and one can be confident that the spacetime that results is independent of the particular choice. Effectively, different choices of these functions give rise to different choices of background against which to evolve the foreground. However, the constraints pose a serious problem (as much conceptual as technical) when one moves to quantum theory.

3.2.2 Problem of time

All approaches to canonical quantum gravity face the so-called “problem of time” in one form or another (Kuchař (1992) and Isham (1993) are still excellent reviews; Rickles, 2006, offers a more philosophical guide). The problem stems from the fact that in preserving the diffeomorphism-invariance of general relativity — depriving the coordinates of the background manifold of any physical meaning — the “slices” of spacetime one is considering inevitably include time, just as they include space. In the canonical formulation, the diffeomorphism invariance is reflected in the constraints, and the inclusion of what would ordinarily be a ‘time’ variable in the data is reflected in the existence of the super-Hamiltonian constraint. The difficulties presented by this latter constraint constitute the problem of time.

Attempts to quantize general relativity in the canonical framework proceed by turning the canonical variables into operators on an appropriate state space (e.g., the space of square-integrable functions over three-metrics), and dealing somehow with the constraints. When quantizing a theory with constraints, there are two possible approaches. The approach usually adopted in gauge theories is to deal with the constraints before quantization, so that only true degrees of freedom are promoted to operators when passing to the quantum theory. There are a variety of ways of doing this so-called ‘gauge fixing’, but they all involve removing the extra degrees of freedom by imposing some special conditions. In general relativity, fixing a gauge is tantamount to specifying a particular coordinate system with respect to which the “physical” data is described (spatial coordinates) and with respect to which it evolves (time coordinate). This is difficult already at the classical level, since the utility and, moreover, the very tractability of any particular gauge generally depends on the properties of the solution to the equations, which of course is what one is trying to find in the first place. But in the quantum theory, one is faced with the additional concern that the resulting theory may well not be independent of the choice of gauge. This is closely related to the problem of identifying true, gauge-invariant observables in the classical theory (Torre 2005, in the Other Internet Resources section).

The preferred approach in canonical quantum gravity is to impose the constraints after quantizing. In this ‘constraint quantization’ approach, due to Dirac, one treats the constraints themselves as operators \(A\), and demands that “physical” states \(\psi\) be those which are solutions to the resulting equations \(A \psi = 0\). The problem of time is associated with the super-Hamiltonian constraint, as mentioned above. The super-Hamiltonian \(H\) is responsible for describing time-evolution in the classical theory, yet its counterpart in the constraint-quantized theory, \(H \psi = 0\), would prima facie seem to indicate that the true physical states of the system do not evolve at all: there is no \(t\). Trying to understand how, and in what sense, the quantum theory describes the time-evolution of something, be it states or observables, is the essence of the problem of time (on which, more below).

3.2.3 Ashtekar, loop, and other variables

In geometrodynamics, all of the constraint equations are difficult to solve (though the super-Hamiltonian constraint, known as the Wheeler-DeWitt equation, is especially difficult), even in the absence of particular boundary conditions. Lacking solutions, one does not have a grip on what the true, physical states of the theory are, and one cannot hope to make much progress in the way of predictions. The difficulties associated with geometric variables are addressed by the program initiated by Ashtekar and developed by his collaborators (for a review and further references see Rovelli 2001b (Other Internet Resources), 2001a). Ashtekar used a different set of variables, a complexified ‘connection’ (rather than a three-metric) and its canonical conjugate, which made it simpler to solve the constraints. This change of variables introduces an additional constraint into the theory (the Gauss law constraint generating SO(3) transformations) on account of the freedom to rotate the vectors without disturbing the metric. The program underwent further refinements with the introduction of the loop transform, and further refinements still when it was understood that equivalence classes of loops could be identified with spin networks. One is able to recover all the standard geometrical features of general relativity from this formulation. (See Smolin (2001, 2004) for a popular introduction; Rovelli, 2004, offers a physically intuitive account; Thiemann, 2008, provides the mathematical underpinnings; Rickles, 2005, offers a philosophically-oriented review.) Note that the problems of time and observables afflict the loop approach just as they did the earlier geometrodynamical approach. The difference is that one has more (mathematical) control over the theory (and its quantization), in terms of a definable inner product, a separable state space, and more. There is still a question mark over the construction of the full physical Hilbert space, since the solution of the Hamiltonian constraint remains a problem. However, some progress is being made in various directions, e.g. Thomas Thiemann’s master constraint programme (see Thiemann, 2006).

3.3 Other Approaches

Though the impression often painted of the research landscape in quantum gravity is an either/or situation between string theory and loop quantum gravity, in reality there are very many more options on the table. Some (e.g., Callender and Huggett 2001, Wüthrich 2004 (Other Internet Resources section); J. Mattingly 2005) have argued that semiclassical gravity, a theory in which matter is quantized but spacetime is classical, is at least coherent, though not quite an empirically viable option (we discuss this below). Other approaches include twistor theory (currently enjoying a revival in conjunction with string theory), Bohmian approaches (Goldstein & Teufel, 2001), causal sets (see Sorkin 2003, in the Other Internet Resources section) in which the universe is described as a set of discrete events along with a stipulation of their causal relations, and other discrete approaches (see Loll 1998). Causal set theory has begun to stimulate some philosophical interest on account of the claims, by physicists, to the effect that the theory embodies a notion of objective becoming or temporal passage based on the notion of the ‘birth’ of spacetime atoms (see, e.g., Dowker 2014; for a skeptical response, see Huggett 2014; Wüthrich, 2012, pursues instead the structuralist leanings of causal set theory).

Also of interest are arguments to the effect that gravity itself may play a role in quantum state reduction (Christian, 2001; Penrose, 2001; also briefly discussed below). A fairly comprehensive overview of the current approaches to quantum gravity can be found in Oriti (2009). In this entry we have chosen to focus upon those approaches that are both the most actively pursued and that have received most attention from philosophers. Let us now turn to several methodological and philosophical issues that arise quantum gravity research.

4. Methodology

Research in quantum gravity has always had a rather peculiar flavor, owing to both the technical and conceptual difficulty of the field and the remoteness from experiment. Yoichiro Nambu (1985) wryly labels research on quantum gravity “postmodern physics” on account of its experimental remoteness. Thus conventional notions of the close relationship between theory and experiment have but a tenuous foothold, at best, in quantum gravity. However, since there is a rudimentary ‘pecking order’ amongst the various approaches to quantum gravity, and since the history of quantum gravity contains various fatalities, there clearly are some methods of theory evaluation in operation, there are constraints functioning in something like the way experiment and observation function. Investigating these methods and constraints constitutes an open research problem for philosophers of science—for initial investigations along these lines, see James Mattingly (2005a and 2009) and Rickles (2011). Audretsch (1981) argues that quantum gravity research conflicts with Kuhn’s account of scientific development since it stems from the desire to unify (for reasons not based on any empirical tension) multiple paradigms, both of which are well-confirmed and both of which make claims to universality. One might easily question Audretsch’s focus on direct empirical tensions here. Given, as he admits, both general relativity and quantum theory claim to be universal theories, any conceptual or formal tension that can be found to hold between them must point to either or both theories being in error in their claims to universality—this is an empirical claim of sorts. In the context of string theory, Peter Galison (1995) argues that mathematical constraints take the place of standard empirical constraints. James Cushing (1990) also considers some of the potential methodological implications of string theory (though he deals with string theory in its earliest days, when it underwent a transition from the dual resonance model of hadrons into a theory of quantum gravity). Dawid (2014) focuses in more detail on methodological issues in string theory and defends the idea that string theory is characterised by a uniqueness claim (the no-alternatives argument) according to which string theory is the only way to unify gravity and the other fundamental interactions, thus grounding physicists’ strong belief in the theory; however, that is a rather different problem (that of constructing a theory of everything) than the more restricted problem of quantum gravity — quantum gravity researchers from other approaches might simply reject the need for such a unified theory (e.g., as opposed to a theory that is compatible with the inclusion of other interactions).

4.1 Theory

As remarked in the introduction, there is no single, generally agreed-upon body of theory in quantum gravity. The majority of the physicists working in the field focus their attention on string theory, an ambitious program which aims at providing a unified theory of all four interactions. A non-negligible minority work on what is now called loop quantum gravity, the goal of which is simply to provide a quantum theory of the gravitational interaction simpliciter. There is also significant work in other areas, including approaches that don’t really involve the quantization of a theory at all. [Good recent reviews of the theoretical landscape include Carlip 2001, Smolin 2001 (Other Internet Resources section below), 2003, Penrose 2004, and Oriti, ed, 2009.] But there is no real consensus, for at least two reasons.

The first reason is that it is extremely difficult to make any concrete predictions in these theories. String theory, in particular, is plagued by a lack of experimentally testable predictions because of the tremendous number of distinct ground or vacuum states in the theory, with an absence of guiding principles for singling out the physically significant ones (including our own). Though the string community prides itself on the dearth of free parameters in the theory (in contrast to the nineteen or so free parameters found in the standard model of particle physics), the problem arguably resurfaces in the huge number of vacua associated with different compactifications of the nine space dimensions to the three we observe. These vacua are either viewed as distinct string theories, or else as solutions of one and the same theory (though some deeper, unknown theory, as mentioned above). Attempts to explain why we live in the particular vacuum that we do have recently given rise to appeals to the infamous anthropic principle (Susskind, 2003), whereby the existence of humans (or observers) is invoked to, in some sense, “explain” the fact that we find ourselves in a particular world by restricting the possible ground states to those that could support such creatures in which we should expect our universe’s observed features to be typical. (See Weinstein, 2006, for a philosophical discussion of the usage of anthropic reasoning in string theory, including an ambiguity in the meaning of ‘typicality’ in this context; Azhar, 2013, further develops this discussion.)

Loop quantum gravity is seemingly less plagued by a lack of predictions, and indeed it is often claimed that the discreteness of area and volume operators are concrete predictions of the theory, with potentially testable consequences. Proponents of this approach argue that this makes the theory more susceptible to falsification, and thus more scientific (in the sense of Popper; see the entry on Karl Popper) than string theory (see Smolin 2006 for this line of argument). However, it is still quite unclear, in practice and even in principle, how one might actually observe these quantities. There have been recent suggestions that in order to probe the effects of the Planck scale (discreteness, or minimal length in particular) one needs to look to the cosmological level for tiny violations of Lorentz invariance. Rovelli and Speziale (2003) have argued that, in fact, the existence of a minimal length does not imply a violation of the Lorentz symmetry (a conclusion seconded by the proponents of the causal set programme). Their argument turns on the fact that in the context of quantum theory, symmetries act on states (and so on mean values) rather than eigenvalues (representing the discrete quantities in the theory). However, in any case, there remains a question mark over the theoretical status of the discreteness result which has been shown to hold only for operators on the kinematical Hilbert space, that is, for gauge-variant quantities. It is still an open question whether this result transfers to genuine observables (i.e. operators that satisfy all of the constraints and are defined on the physical Hilbert space: that gauge-invariant quantities). See Dittrich and Thiemann (2009) for a detailed investigation of the problem and a possible resolution employing suitably gauge-fixed (by matter) Dirac observables. Even if one overcomes this problem, and could observe evidence of the discreteness of space, so many approaches involve such discreteness that one would face a further problem in using this new data to decide between the discrete approaches. For a philosophical discussion of this and related issues (including the question of whether the proposed discreteness breaks Lorentz invariance), see Hagar (2009) — Hagar (2014) considers these and related issues in a book-length treatment.

4.2 Experiment

The second reason for the absence of consensus is that there are no experiments in quantum gravity, and little in the way of observations that might qualify as direct or indirect data or empirical evidence. This stems in part from the lack of theoretical predictions, since it is difficult to design an observational test of a theory if one does not know where to look or what to look at. But it also stems from the fact that most theories of quantum gravity appear to predict departures from classical relativity only at energy scales on the order of \(10^{19}\) GeV. (By way of comparison, the proton-proton collisions at Fermilab have an energy on the order of \(10^3\) GeV.) Whereas research in particle physics proceeds in large part by examining the data collected in large particle accelerators, which are able to smash particles together at sufficiently high energies to probe the properties of atomic nuclei in the fallout, gravity is so weak that there is no physically realistic way to do a comparable experiment that would reveal properties at the energy scales at which quantum gravitational effects are expected to be important—it would take a particle accelerator of galactic size to even approach the required energies. (In a little more detail, the weakness of gravity can be compared to the strength of the electromagnetic interaction — cf. Callender and Huggett (eds.) 2001, p. 4. An electron couples to the electromagnetic field with a strength of \(10^{-2}\), while the coupling of a mass to the gravitational field is \(10^{-22}\). Feynman (1963, p. 697) gives an example that highlights this difference in magnitudes more dramatically by showing how the gravitational coupling between a proton and an electron in a hydrogen atom would shift the wave-function of an electron by just 43 arcseconds over a time period of 100 times the age of the Universe! Hence, quantum gravity is more of a theorist’s problem.)

Though progress is being made in trying to at least draw observational consequences of loop quantum gravity, a theory of quantum gravity which arguably does make predictions (Amelino-Camelia, 2003, in the Other Internet Resources section below; D. Mattingly, 2005), it is remarkable that the most notable “test” of quantum theories of gravity imposed by the community to date involves a phenomenon which has never been observed, the so-called Hawking radiation from black holes. Based on earlier work of Bekenstein (1973) and others, Hawking (1974) predicted that black holes would radiate energy, and would do so in proportion to their gravitational “temperature,” which was in turn understood to be proportional to their mass, angular momentum, and charge. Associated with this temperature is an entropy (see the entry on the philosophy of statistical mechanics), and one would expect a theory of quantum gravity to allow one to calculate the entropy associated with a black hole of given mass, angular momentum, and charge, the entropy corresponding to the number of quantum (micro-)states of the gravitational field having the same mass, charge, and angular momentum. (See Unruh, 2001, and references therein.) In their own ways, string theory and loop quantum gravity have both passed the test of predicting an entropy for black holes which accords with Hawking’s calculation, using very different microscopic degrees of freedom. String theory gets the number right for a not-particularly-physically-realistic subset of black holes called near-extremal black holes, while loop quantum gravity gets it right for generic black holes, but only up to an overall constant. More recently, the causal set approach has also managed to derive the correct value. If the Hawking effect is real, then this consonance could be counted as evidence in favor of either or both/all theories.

Erik Curiel (2001) has argued against the manner in which the ability to derive the Bekenstein-Hawking result as a theorem of an approach is used as evidence for that approach in much the same way that empirical evidence is used to justify a theory in normal circumstances, say predicting the value of a well-confirmed experimental result. It is true that black hole physics is used as testing ground for quantum gravity and the Bekenstein-Hawking result does not have the status of an empirical fact. However, it is a strong deduction from a framework that is fairly mature, namely quantum field theory on a curved spacetime background. In this sense, although it does not provide a constraint as strong as an experimentally observed phenomenon, it might legitimately function as a constraint on possible theories. Constraints on theory construction come in a variety of shapes and sizes, and not all take the form of empirical data — thought experiments are a case in point. In the context of quantum gravity it is especially important that one have some agreed upon constraints to guide the construction. Without them, work would halt. It also seems reasonable to insist that a full theory of quantum gravity be able to reproduce predictions of the semi-classical theory of gravity, since this will be one of its possible limits. Still, Curiel is right that researchers ought to be rather more wary of attributing too much evidential weight to such features that remain empirically unconfirmed.

Curiel goes on to question, more generally, the ranking of approaches to quantum gravity given what he views as the absence of demonstrated scientific merit in any of them: elegance and consistency might well be merits of a scientific theory, but they do not count as scientific. (ibid, p. S437). However, this claim hinges on the direct alignment of scientific merit and empirical clout; but this requires an argument, for it is far from obvious: from whence this prescription? Surely if a theory is mathematically inconsistent that says something about its physical status too? Moreover, the relationship between experimental and observational data and theories is not a simple matter. Finally, it is perhaps too quick to say that approaches do not have empirical consequences. Already known empirical data can confirm the predictions of a theory; therefore, it is clear that we can judge the extent to which the various contenders satisfy this old evidence, and how they do so. For example, string theory at least has the potential of explaining why there are three generations of elementary particles by invoking the Euler characteristic of the compact spaces it employs—the Euler characteristic is equal to twice the number of generations (see Seifert, 2004, for details). Whatever one might think about string theory’s relationship with anthropic reasoning, we do have here a potential explanation of a previously inexplicable piece of old empirical data, which ought to lend some credence to the theory. There is also the not inconsiderable fact that string theory is able to derive general relativity (and all the physically observed facts that are associated with this theory) as a low energy feature. This is not a novel fact, but it is an physical, empirical consequence of the theory nonetheless.

However, it should be noted, finally, that to date neither of the main research programs has been shown to properly reproduce the world we see at low energies. Indeed, it is a major challenge of loop quantum gravity to show that it indeed has general relativity as a low-energy limit, and a major challenge of string theory to show that it has the standard model of particle physics plus general relativity as a low-energy limit. There are promising indications that both theories might be able to overcome this challenge (see Thiemann for the loop quantum gravity case; for the string theoretic case, see Graña, 2006). A similar problem faces causal set theory in the form of the ‘inverse problem’, which roughly amounts to the difficulty of getting continuous manifolds (with their corresponding symmetries) from a fundamentally discrete theory (see Wallden, 2010, for a good recent review of causal sets, including a discussion of this problem, on which progress has also been made).

5. Philosophical Issues

Quantum gravity raises a number of difficult philosophical questions. To date, it is the ontological aspects of quantum gravity that have attracted the most interest from philosophers, and it is these we will discuss in the first five sections below. In the final section, though, we will briefly discuss some further methodological and epistemological issues which arise.

First, however, let us discuss the extent to which ontological questions are tied to a particular theoretical framework. In its current stage of development, string theory unfortunately provides little indication of the more fundamental nature of space, time, and matter. Despite the consideration of ever more exotic objects — strings, \(p\)-branes, D-branes, etc. — these objects are still understood as propagating in a background spacetime. Since string theory is supposed to describe the emergence of classical spacetime from some underlying quantum structure, these objects are not to be regarded as truly fundamental. Rather, their status in string theory is analogous to the status of particles in quantum field theory (Witten, 2001), which is to say that they are relevant descriptions of the fundamental physics only in situations in which there is a background spacetime with appropriate symmetries. While this suggests tantalising links to issues of emergence, it is difficult to pursue them without knowing the details of the more fundamental theory. As already mentioned, the duality relations between the various string theories suggest that they are all perturbative expansions of some more fundamental, non-perturbative theory known as ‘M-theory’ (Polchinski, 2002, see the Other Internet Resources section below). This, presumably, is the most fundamental level, and understanding the theoretical framework at that level is central to understanding the underlying ontology of the theory (and so the manner in which any other structures might emerge from it). ‘Matrix theory’ is an attempt to do just this, to provide a mathematical formulation of M-theory, but it remains highly speculative. Thus although string theory purports to be a fundamental theory, the ontological implications of the theory are still very obscure — though this could be viewed as a challenge rather than a reason to ignore the theory.

Canonical quantum gravity, in its loop formulation or otherwise, has to date been of greater interest to philosophers because it appears to confront fundamental questions in a way that string theory, at least in its perturbative guise, does not — certainly, it does so more explicitly and in language more amenable to philosophers. Whereas perturbative string theory treats spacetime in an essentially classical way, canonical quantum gravity treats it as quantum-mechanical entity, at least to the extent of treating the geometric structure (as opposed to, say, the topological or differential structure) as quantum-mechanical. Furthermore, many of the issues facing canonical quantum gravity are also firmly rooted in conceptual difficulties facing the classical theory, which philosophers are already well acquainted with (e.g. via the hole argument).

5.1 Time

As noted in Section 3.2.2 above, the treatment of time presents special difficulties in canonical quantum gravity, though they easily generalise to many other approaches to quantum gravity. These difficulties are connected with the special role time plays in physics, and in quantum theory in particular. Physical laws are, in general, laws of motion, of change from one time to another. They represent change in the form of differential equations for the evolution of, as the case may be, classical or quantum states; the state represents the way the system is at some time, and the laws allow one to predict how it will be in the future (or retrodict how it was in the past). It is not surprising, then, that a theory of quantum spacetime would have a problem of time, because there is no classical time against which to evolve the “state”. The problem is not so much that the spacetime is dynamical; there is no problem of time in classical general relativity (in the sense that a time variable is present). Rather, the problem is roughly that in quantizing the structure of spacetime itself, the notion of a quantum state, representing the structure of spacetime at some instant, and the notion of the evolution of the state, do not get any traction, since there are no real “instants”. (In some approaches to canonical gravity, one fixes a time before quantizing, and quantizes the spatial portions of the metric only. This approach is not without its problems, however; see Isham (1993) for discussion and further references.)

One can ask whether the problem of time arising from the canonical program tells us something deep and important about the nature of time. Julian Barbour (2001a,b), for one, thinks that it tells us that time is illusory (see also Earman, 2002, in this connection). It is argued that the fact that quantum states do not evolve under the super-Hamiltonian means that there is no change. However, it can also be argued (Weinstein, 1999a,b) that the super-Hamiltonian itself should not be expected to generate time-evolution; rather, one or more “true” Hamiltonians should play this role, though uncovering such Hamiltonians is no easy matter. (See Butterfield & Isham (1999) and Rovelli (2006) for further discussion.)

Bradley Monton (2006) has argued that a specific version of canonical quantum gravity – that with a so-called constant mean extrinsic curvature [CMC] (or fixed) foliation – has the necessary resources to render presentism (the view that all and only presently existing things exist) a live possibility (see the section on Presentism, Eternalism, and The Growing Universe Theory in the entry on time for more on presentism). The reason is that with such a fixed foliation one has at one’s disposal some spacelike hypersurface that contains a set of well-defined events that can be viewed through the lens of presentism, such that this set of events at this particular instant (or ‘thin-sandwich’) changes over time. Though he readily admits that CMC formulations are outmoded in the contemporary theoretical landscape, he nonetheless insists that given the lack of experimental evidence one way or the other, it stands as a viable route to quantum gravity, and therefore presentism remains as a possible theory of time that is compatible with frontier theoretical physics. Christian Wüthrich (2010) takes Monton to task on a variety of both technical and non-technical grounds. He rightly questions Monton’s claim that the CMC approach really is an approach to quantum gravity, in the same sense as string theory and loop quantum gravity. It is more of a piece of machinery that is used within a pre-existing approach (namely, the canonical approach). He also questions Monton’s claim, inasmuch as it does constitute an approach of sorts, that it is viable. Simply not being ruled out on experimental grounds does not thereby render an approach viable. Besides, if anything has the prospect of saving presentism, then surely it is Julian Barbour’s position mentioned above. This at least has the added benefit of being a research programme that is being actively pursued.

A common claim that appears in many discussions of the problem of time (especially amongst philosophers) is that it is restricted to canonical formulations of general relativity, and has something to do with the Hamiltonian formalism (see Rickles 2008a, pp. 340–1 for more details). The confusion lies in the apparently very different ways that time is treated in general relativity as standardly formulated, and as it appears in a canonical, Hamiltonian formulation. In the former there is no preferred temporal frame, whereas the latter appears to demand such a frame in order to get off the ground (cf. Curiel, 2009, p. 59; Tim Maudlin (2004) tells a broadly similar story).

However, this encodes several pieces of misinformation making it hard to make sense of the claim that general relativity and canonical theories cannot be “reconciled”. The canonical framework is simply a tool for constructing theories, and one that makes quantization an easier prospect. As a matter of historical fact the canonical formulation of general relativity is a completed project, and has been carried out in a variety of ways, using compact spaces and non-compact spaces, and with a range of canonical variables. Of course, general relativity, like Maxwell’s theory of electromagnetism, possesses gauge symmetries, so it is a constrained theory that results, and one must employ the method of constrained Hamiltonian systems. However, there is no question that general relativity is compatible with the canonical analysis of theories, and the fact that time looks a little strange in this context is simply because the formalism is attempting to capture the dynamics of general relativity. In any case, the peculiar nature of general relativity and quantum gravity, with respect to the treatment of time, resurfaces in arguably the most covariant of approaches, the Feynman path-integral approach. In this case that central task is to compute the amplitude for going from an initial state to a final state (where these states will be given in terms of boundary data on a pair of initial and final hypersurfaces). The computation of this propagator proceeds à la sum-over-histories: one counts to the number of possible spacetimes that might interpolate between the initial and final hypersurfaces. However, one cannot get around the fact that general relativity is a theory with gauge freedom, and so whenever one has diffeomorphic initial and final hypersurfaces, the propagator will be trivial.

A similar confusion can be found in discussions of the related problem of defining observables in canonical general relativity. The claim gets its traction from the fact that it is very difficult to construct observables in canonical general relativity, while (apparently) it is relatively straightforward in the standard Lagrangian description. (See, e.g., Curiel, 2009, pp. 59–60, for an explicit statement of this claim. Curiel cites a theorem of Torre, 1993, to the effect that there can be no local observables in compact spacetimes, to argue that the canonical formulation is defective somehow.) Again, this rests on a misunderstanding over what the canonical formalism is and how it is related to the standard spacetime formulation of general relativity. That there are no local observables is not an artefact of canonical general relativity. The notion that observables have to be non-local (in this case, relational) is a generic feature that results precisely from the full spacetime diffeomorphism invariance of general relativity (and is, in fact, implicit in the theorem of Torre mentioned earlier). It receives a particularly transparent description in the context of the canonical approach because one can define observables as quantities that commute with all of the constraints. The same condition will hold for the four-dimensional versions, only they will have to be spacetime diffeomorphism invariant in that case. This will still rule out local observables since any quantities defined at points or regions of the spacetime manifold will clearly fail to be diffeomorphism invariant. Hence, the problems of observables (and the result that they must be either global or relational in general relativity) is not a special feature of the canonical formulation, but a generic feature of theories possessing diffeomorphism invariance. As Ashtekar and Geroch point out, “[s]ince time is essentially a geometrical concept [in general relativity], its definition must be in terms of the metric. But the metric is also the dynamical variable, so the flow of time becomes intertwined with the flow of the dynamics of the system” (1974, p. 1215). A recent philosophical deep dive into the problem of time, which situates the quantum gravity specific version in a wider framework, is Gryb and Thébault, 2023.

5.2 Ontology

The problem of time is closely connected with a general puzzle about the ontology associated with “quantum spacetime”. Quantum theory in general resists any straightforward ontological reading, and this goes double for quantum gravity. In quantum mechanics, one has particles, albeit with indefinite properties. In quantum field theory, one again has particles (at least in suitably symmetric spacetimes), but these are secondary to the fields, which again are things, albeit with indefinite properties. On the face of it, the only difference in quantum gravity is that spacetime itself becomes a kind of quantum field, and one would perhaps be inclined to say that the properties of spacetime become indefinite. But space and time traditionally play important roles in individuating objects and their properties—in fact a field is in some sense a set of properties of spacetime points — and so the quantization of such raises real problems for ontology.

One area that philosophers might profit from is in the investigation of the relational observables that appear to be necessitated by diffeomorphism invariance. For example, since symmetries (such as the gauge symmetries associated with the constraints) come with quite a lot of metaphysical baggage attached (as philosophers of physics know from the hole argument), such a move involves philosophically weighty assumptions. For example, the presence of symmetries in a theory would appear to allow for more possibilities than one without, so eradicating the symmetries (by solving the constraints and going to the reduced, physical phase space) means eradicating a chunk of possibility space: in particular, one is eradicating states that are deemed to be physically equivalent, despite having some formal differences in terms of representaton. Hence, imposing the constraints involves some serious modal assumptions. Belot and Earman (2001) have argued that since the traditional positions on the ontology of spacetime (relationalism and substantivalism) involve a commitment to a certain way of counting possibilities, the decision to eliminate symmetries can have serious implications for the ontology one can then adopt. Further, if some particular method (out of retaining or eliminating symmetries) were shown to be successful in the quest for quantizing gravity, then, they argue, one could have good scientific reasons for favouring one of substantivalism or relationalism. (See Belot, 2011a, for more on this argument; Rickles, 2008c, explicitly argues against the idea that possibility spaces have any relevance for spacetime ontology.)

In the loop quantum gravity program, the area and volume operators have discrete spectra. Thus, like electron spins, they can only take certain values. This suggests (but does not imply) that space itself has a discrete nature, and perhaps time as well (depending on how one resolves the problem of time). This in turn suggests that space does not have the structure of a differential manifold, but rather that it only approximates such a manifold on large scales, or at low energies. A similar idea, that classical spacetime is an emergent entity, can be found in several approaches to quantum gravity (see Butterfield and Isham, 1999 and 2001, for a discussion of emergence in quantum gravity). The possibility that a continuous structure (with continuous symmetries) could emerge from a fundamentally discrete structure is a problem with a clear philosophical flavour —Huggett and Wüthrich, eds., 2013; Huggett, Matsubara, K., and Wüthrich, 2020; and Wüthrich, Le Bihan, B., and Huggett, 2021 contain a wide variety of papers investigating this issue, with their own contributions tending to focus on the notion of recovering ‘local beables’ from such emergent theories.

5.3 Status of quantum theory

Whether or not spacetime is discrete, the quantization of spacetime entails that our ordinary notion of the physical world, that of matter distributed in space and time, is at best an approximation. This in turn implies that ordinary quantum theory, in which one calculates probabilities for events to occur in a given world, is inadequate as a fundamental theory. As suggested in the Introduction, this may present us with a vicious circle. At the very least, one must almost certainly generalize the framework of quantum theory. This is an important driving force behind much of the effort in quantum cosmology to provide a well-defined version of the many-worlds or relative-state interpretations. Much work in this area has adopted the so-called ‘decoherent histories’ or ‘consistent histories’ formalism, whereby quantum theories are understood to make probabilistic predictions about entire (coarse-grained) ‘histories’. Almost all of this work to date construes histories to be histories of spatiotemporal events, and thus presupposes a background spacetime; however, the incorporation of a dynamical, quantized spacetime clearly drives much of the cosmology-inspired work in this area.

More generally, one might step outside the framework of canonical, loop quantum gravity, and ask why one should only quantize the metric. As pointed out by Isham (1994, 2002), it may well be that the extension of quantum theory to general relativity requires one to quantize, in some sense, not only the metric but also the underlying differential structure and topology. This is somewhat unnatural from the standpoint where one begins with classical, canonical general relativity and proceeds to “quantize” (since the topological structure, unlike the metric structure, is not represented by a classical variable). But one might well think that one should start with the more fundamental, quantum theory, and then investigate under which circumstances one gets something that looks like a classical spacetime.

One final issue we might mention here is whether there is a conflict between the superposition principle and general relativity. Curiel claims that “[t]here exists no physical phenomenon well characterized by experiment that cannot be accurately described by one of the two theories, and no physical phenomenon that suggests that one of the two is correct to the detriment of the other’s accuracy” (2001, p. S432). However, Roger Penrose (2004, Chapter 30) has forcefully argued that the superposition principle can, in some circumstances, threaten the principle of general covariance, surely a core principle of general relativity! The idea is that if we prepare a lump of matter in a superposition of two position states (stationary in their ambient spacetime), \(\chi\) and \(\phi\), a state Penrose labels a “Schrödinger’s Lump” state, then the superposition is represented by: \(|\Psi \rangle = w|\chi \rangle + z|\phi \rangle\). Penrose then shows that a stationary gravitational field does nothing to affect the fact that any superposition of the (stationary) position states \(\chi\) and \(\phi\) will also be stationary. But then introducing the gravitational field of the lump itself raises a problem. By themselves, the components of the superposition would not seem to raise problems, and we can simply think of the field around the location associated with the lump’s states individually as being nearly classical. Given the stationarity of the states \(\chi\) and \(\phi\), there will be a distinct Killing vector (i.e. a metric preserving vector field) associated with each them. The problem then arises: what of superpositions of these lump states? Are they stationary? Since the Killing vector fields of the two component stationary states live on different spacetimes, with different structures, it seems we don’t have the invariant spatiotemporal structure needed to answer the question. To try and say that the spacetime is really the same (the obvious answer) would conflict with general covariance since then one would be supposing a robust notion of spacetime points which enables one to match up the two spacetimes. As we have seen above, Penrose’s proposed solution is to consider such superpositions as generating a kind of geometric instability which causes the collapse of the superposition.

Of course, one might question various moves in Penrose’s reasoning here (especially as regards the nature of the gravitational fields of stationary quantum states), so there is clearly more to be said. But there is potentially a conflict (and a measurable one at that: see Penrose, 2002) between the superposition principle and principles of general relativity. Those with experience of the standard quantum measurement problem will find much to interest them in this problem.

5.4 The Planck Scale

It is almost Gospel that quantum gravity is what happens when you reach the Planck scale. The standard refrain is that ‘something peculiar’ happens to our concepts of space, time, and causality at such such scales requiring radical revisions that must be described by the quantum theory of gravity (see, e.g., Rovelli, 2007, p. 1287). However, the arguments underlying this orthodoxy have not been rigorously examined. The usual motivation involves a dimensional analysis argument. The scales at which theories make their mark are set by the values of the fundamental constants. In this way the constants demarcate the domains of applicability of theories: \(c\) tells us when specially relativistic effects will become apparent, \(\hslash\) tells us when quantum effects will become apparent, and G tells us when gravitational effects will become apparent. As Planck was able to demonstrate in 1899, these constants can be combined so as to uniquely determine a natural, absolute family of units that are independent of all human and terrestrial baggage. The Planck length can be written as \((G\hslash/c^3)^{\frac{1}{2}}\) and has the value \(10^{-33}\) in centimeters. Planck was not aware of the relevance of the scale set by the constants to the applicability of general relativity, of course, but Arthur Eddington seems to have been aware (though getting a different value as a result of using Osborn Reynold’s determination for the finest grain believed possible), writing in the March edition of Nature in 1918:

From the combination of the fundamental constants, \(G, c\), and \(h\) it is possible to form a new fundamental unit of length \(\mathrm{L}_{\textit{min}} = 7 \times 10^{-28}\)cm. It seems to be inevitable that this length must play some role in any complete interpretation of gravitation. ... In recent years great progress has been made in knowledge of the excessively minute; but until we can appreciate details of structure down to the quadrillionth or quintillionth of a centimetre, the most sublime of all the forces of Nature remains outside the purview of the theories of physics. (Eddington, 1918, p. 36)

The idea that the Planck length amounts to a minimal length in nature follows from the argument that if distances smaller than this length are resolved (say in the measurement of the position of a mass), then it would require energies concentrated in a region so small that a mini-black hole would form, taking the observed system with it – see Rovelli (2007, p. 1289) for this argument. Meschini (2007) is not convinced by such arguments, and doesn’t see that the case for the relevance of the Planck scale to quantum gravity research has been properly made. He is suspicious of the claims made on behalf of dimensional analysis. There is something to Meschini’s claims, for if the dimensional argument were true then, without realising it, Planck would have stumbled upon the beginnings of quantum gravity before either quantum field theory or general relativity were devised! However, Meschini speculates that the final theory of quantum gravity “has nothing to do with one or more of the above-mentioned constants” (p. 278). This seems too strong a statement, since a core condition on a theory of quantum gravity will be to reduce to general relativity and quantum field theory as we know it, according to limits involving these constants. Nonetheless, Meschini is surely right that the details of these dimensional arguments, and the role of the Planck scale are calling out for a closer analysis.

5.5 Background Structure

In non-generally relativistic theories the spacetime metric is frozen to a single value assignment for all times and all solutions: it is model independent. Of course, in general relativity the metric is what one solves for: the metric is a dynamical variable, which implies that the geometry of spacetime is dynamical. This intuitive notion is bundled into the concept of background freedom, or background independence. In general, background independence is understood to be the freedom of a theory from background structures, where the latter amount to some kind of absolute, non-dynamical objects in a theory. The extent to which their respective theories incorporate background structures has recently proven to be a divisive subject amongst string theorists and loop quantum gravity theorists and others. It is often claimed that the central principle that distinguishes general relativity from other theories is its (manifest) background independence. But background independence is a slippery notion meaning different things to different people. We face a series of questions when considering background independence: What, exactly, is it (beyond the simple intuitive notion)? Why is it considered to be such an important principle? What theories incorporate it? To what extent do they incorporate it?

The debate between strings and loops on this matter is severely hampered by the fact that there is no firm definition of background independence on the table and, therefore, the two camps are almost certainly talking past each other when discussing this issue. It seems prima facie reasonable to think that in order to reproduce a manifestly background independent theory like general relativity, a quantum theory of gravity should be background independent too, and so background independence has begun to function as a constraint on quantum gravity theories, in much the same way that renormalizability used to constrain the construction of quantum field theories. Advocates of loop quantum gravity often highlight the background independence of their theory as a virtue that it has over string theory. However, there is no proof of this implication, and aspects of the so-called ‘holographic principle’ seem to suggest that a background independent theory could be dual to a background dependent theory (see the contributions to Biquard, ed., 2005). Furthermore, depending on how we define the intuitive notion of background independence, and if ‘clues’ from the duality symmetries of M-theory are anything to go by, it looks like string theory might even be more background independent than loop quantum gravity, for the dimensionality of spacetime becomes a dynamical variable too (cf. Stelle, 2000, p. 7).

Indeed, various string theorists claim that their theory is background independent. In many cases it seems that they have a different understanding of what this entails than loop quantum gravity researchers—this takes us to the first, definitional, question. In particular some seem to think that the ability to place a general metric in the Lagrangian amounts to background independence. This falls short of the mark for how the majority of physicists understand it, namely as a reactive dynamical coupling between spacetime and matter. Though one can indeed place a variety of metrics in the stringy Lagrangian, one does not then vary the metric in the action. There is no interaction between the strings and the ambient spacetime. Indeed, this is not really distinct from quantum field theory of point particles in curved spacetimes: the same freedom to insert a general metric appears there too.

There is an alternative argument for the background independence of string theory that comes from the field theoretic formulation of the theory: string field theory. The idea is that classical spacetime emerges from the two dimensional conformal field theory on the strings worldsheet. However, in this case one surely has to say something about the target space, for the worldsheet metric takes on a metric induced from the ambient target spacetime. Yet another argument for the background independence of string theory might point to the fact that the dimensionality of spacetime in string theory has to satisfy an equation of motion (a consistency condition): this is how the dimensionality comes out (as 26 or 10, depending on whether one imposes supersymmetry). One contender for the definition of background independence is a structure that is dynamical in the sense that one has to solve equations of motion to get at its values. In this case we would have extreme background independence stretching to the structure of the manifold itself. However, the problem with this is that this structure is the same in all models of the theory; yet we intuitively expect background independent theories to be about structures that can vary across a theory’s models.

The issues here are clearly subtle and complex, and philosophers have only just begun to consider them. The central problem faced, as a philosopher, when trying to make sense of claims such as these is that there is no solid, unproblematic definition of background structure (and therefore background independence and dependence) on the table. Without this, one simply cannot decide who is right; one cannot decide which theories are background independent and which are not. Hence, an urgent issue in both physics and the philosophy of physics is to work out exactly what is meant by ‘background independence’ in a way that satisfies all parties, that is formally correct, and that satisfies our intuitive notions of the concept. Until this is achieved, background independence cannot be helpfully used to distinguish the approaches, nor can we profitably discuss its merits. A serious attempt to define background independence in such a way as to make these tasks possible has been made by Domenico Giulini (2007). But Giulini admits that a general definition still eludes us. The stumbling block might be that background independence simply isn’t a formal property of theories at all. Gordon Belot (2011b) has recently argued that background independence is partly an interpretive matter, and that one can have varying levels of background independence (the latter notion is also defended by Lee Smolin, 2006). Rickles (2008b) argues that the place to seek a notion of background independence that can be put to use in the quantum gravitational context is by focusing on the kinds of observables that an approach employs, rather than squarely on properties of the equations of motion. A recent, highly systematic approach to the problem of background independence, circling through the various definitions of background structure and comparing them to the various spacetime theories, is Read, 2023.

5.6 Necessity of Quantization

In earlier research on quantum gravity it was often supposed that if there was at least one quantum field in the world together with the gravitational field, then given the universal coupling of the gravitational field, it must follow that the quantization of the one field somehow infects the gravitational field, implying that it must necessarily have quantum properties too. The arguments basically involve the consideration of a mass prepared in a superposition of position eigenstates. If the gravitational field remained classical (and, therefore, not constrained by the uncertainty relations) then one could violate the uncertainty relations by simply making measurements of the gravitational field, discovering the properties of the quantized matter to which it was coupled. However, all attempts at making this argument stick have so far failed, meaning that there is no logical necessity demanding that we quantize the gravitational field. Given that we also seemingly lack experimental reasons for quantization of the gravitational field (since we have not observed evidence of its quantum properties), several physicists (and philosophers) have questioned the programme as it stands. It is, they argue, a matter for experiment to decide, not logic. Note, however, that this does not mean that the project of quantum gravity itself rests on unsteady ground: if there are quantum fields and gravitational fields in the world, then given the nature of gravity, we need to say something about the manner in which they interact. What is being questioned is whether this means that gravity cannot itself remain fundamentally classical while interacting with quantum fields. After all, as far as all our experiments show: gravity is classical and matter is quantum. This pessimistic argument is usually traced back to Rosenfeld, though he wavered somewhat on the matter (see DeWitt and Rickles, 2011, p. 164 and p. 170, for Rosenfeld’s original arguments).

If it is to remain fundamentally classical, then there is the simple question of what such a classical gravitational field would couple to. The quantum properties? That seems problematic for the reasons given above. Moreover, given the form of the Einstein field equations, with a classical c-number on the left hand side, that would mean equating a c-number with a q-number (i.e. a quantum operator). The standard way out of this problem is to couple the gravitational field instead to the expectation value of the stress-energy tensor of some quantized matter field. The expectation value is a c-number. There have been a variety of arguments and no-go theorems against this so-called semi-classical gravitational theory, most of which replay the kind of argument invoking violations of the uncertainty relations sketched above (see Eppley and Hannah 1977, and Page and Geilker 1981). Basically, the upshot of the Eppley and Hannah paper is that, given the coexistence of classical gravity and quantum fields, two things can happen upon a gravitational field measurement: on the one hand the quantum wavefunction could collapse, in which case there is momentum non-conservation. On the other hand, the measurement could leave the quantum wavefunction in a coherent state, in which case signals can be sent faster than light. Mattingly (2006) argues that, when properly analyzed, the thought experiments employed by Eppley and Hannah violate basic physical principles involving the construction of the equipment that would be needed to make the necessary field measurements — however, while not viewing the original semi-classical approach as a viable option, Mattingly argues that an extension of the approach has the potential to reveal a viable theory of micro-gravity (see Mattingly 2010 and 2014). Adrian Kent has recently argued that general hybrid classical/quantum theories (including those involving gravity) need not allow superluminal signalling or violate relativity (Kent 2018).

A batch of new approaches based on analogies with condensed matter physics and hydrodynamics point to another way in which gravity can escape quantization, though not in a truly fundamental sense. According to such approaches, gravity is emergent in the sense that the metric (or connection) variables, and other variables representing gravitational features, are collective variables that only appear at energies away from the Planck scale. In other words, gravity is a purely macroscopic, low energy phenomenon and general relativity is an effective field theory. This leaves the task of actually filling in the details of the microscopic structure of spacetime (the ‘atoms of spacetime’) out of which the low energy collective variables emerge (see Hu, 2009, for a conceptually oriented review of such approaches; Crowther 2014 provides a detailed philosophical analysis). As Rovelli notes (2007, p. 1304), the mere fact that the gravitational field is an emergent, collective variable does not thereby imply an absence of quantum effects, and it is possible that collective variables too are governed by quantum theory.

Wüthrich (2005, pp. 779–80) has argued that the very existence of approaches to quantum gravity that do not involve the quantization of the gravitational field means that quantization of the gravitational field has to be a contingent matter. However, this seems to rest on a mistake. It might still be the case that there are reasons of logical consistency forbidding the union of a classical and quantum field even though there are entirely distinct non-quantization approaches. For example, string theory does not quantize the gravitational field; however, it is clearly wrong to say that the existence of this position would be ruled out if the various no-go theorems outlawing hybrid classical-quantum theories were true. The fact that one can isolate states corresponding to gravitons in the string spectrum stands quite independent from issues over the interaction of classical and quantum field. The question of the necessity of quantization (as a result of coupling a classical gravitational field to quantum fields) should be held separate from the prospect of producing a quantum theory of gravity that does not involve gravitational field quantization, for both input theories, for describing the classical and quantum fields, could be fundamentally wrong at high energies, requiring entirely new principles. However, a stronger argument against the impossibility hybrids is provided by James Mattingly, who points out that since there are satisfiable axioms for semiclassical theories, inconsistency cannot be established in general (2009, p. 381).

A recent proposal (Marletto and Vedral, 2017) has emerged showing how putting physical theories on entirely different information-theoretic foundations (in this case constructor theory) might radically transform how we conceptualise the relationships between different theories, including hybrid classical and quantum systems. The implication in this case would be that the debate in question would have to be re-considered in a more general light, independently of specific dynamical models.

6. Conclusion

Research on quantum gravity is beset by a combination of formal, experimental, and conceptual difficulties. It is inevitable that the quest for a quantum theory of gravity will continue – whether for reasons of necessity or not – and it seems that the resolution of the problem will require an equivalent combination of formal, experimental, and conceptual expertise. Given this, and given the central position quantum gravity research occupies in theoretical physics, it makes good sense for philosophers of physics (and general philosophers of science) to do their best to acquaint themselves with the central details of the problem of quantum gravity and the main approaches that are seeking to crack the problem. Beyond this, quantum gravity research has the potential to invigorate several standard areas of philosophical inquiry, including our standard notions of theory construction, selection and justification; the nature of space, time, matter, and causality, and it also introduces a new case study in emergence, with entirely novel features.


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Other Internet Resources

Unpublished, Online Manuscripts

Useful Web Resources

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Dean Rickles <dean.rickles@sydney.edu.au>

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