Political revolutions are transformative moments marked by profound, rapid change in the political order achieved through the use of force rather than through consensus or legal process. Moral responses to revolutions are often ambivalent or deeply polarized. On the one hand, revolutions promise to be powerful engines of moral progress, allowing a community to abolish an oppressive social order and providing the opportunity to institute a better one. On the other hand, revolutions risk unravelling the fabric of political community and devolving into bloody, prolonged conflicts that only manage to reinstate a new oppressive regime. In this entry, we will clarify the concept of revolution and then go on survey the complex moral issues surrounding political revolutions.
Section 1 discusses conceptual issues, distinguishing between different understandings of revolution and between violent and nonviolent revolution; it also distinguishes revolution from resistance, rebellion, and secession. Section 2 outlines in broad relief some of the major historical views on the morality of revolution. Section 3 applies the moral framework developed by contemporary just war theory to examine complications facing the justification of resorting to revolutionary war (revolutionary jus ad bellum). Section 4 examines the justification of the conduct of revolutionaries in armed conflict (revolutionary jus in bello), with emphasis on the way in which revolutionaries employ irregular tactics. Section 5 surveys some contemporary exchanges concerning the justification of foreign intervention into revolutionary war. The Conclusion suggests directions for further philosophical work on revolution.
- 1. Conceptual Matters
- 2. Some Major Figures’ Views on the Morality of Revolution
- 3. Revolutionary Jus ad Bellum
- 4. Revolutionary Jus in Bello
- 5. Intervention
- 6. Implications for Further Research in the Philosophy of Revolution
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
1. Conceptual Matters
Several terms are used to denote extra-constitutional rejection of an existing government’s authority, either tout court or in some particular domain: resistance, rebellion, secession, revolution. Resistance need not be total; it can instead involve disobeying some particular law or laws or efforts to thwart only some of a government’s policies or the government’s attempt to perform particular actions; and resistance can take a number of forms, including acts of disobedience that are not only public but designed to achieve maximal publicity (as in the case of civil disobedience), as well as covert acts of noncompliance; and it may also be either peaceful or nonviolent and disruptive or not. Rebellion, usefully distinguished from resistance, involves a wholesale rejection of government’s authority. But the government’s authority could be rejected for quite different reasons: to do away with government altogether (the anarchist’s goal), to establish a new government with the same domain of territorial authority, to create a new territorial unit out of part of the territory ruled by the existing government (secession), or to sever part of the territory of the government and join it to another existing state (irredentist secession).
Revolution is commonly understood to have two components: rejection of the existing government’s authority and an attempt to replace it with another government, where both involve the use of forceful extra-constitutional means. On this reading, revolution and rebellion share a negative aim, the wholesale rejection of a government’s authority, but revolution includes in addition a positive aim, to institute a new government in place of the one it has destroyed. Note that on our use of the term, “constitution” is meant to refer to something broader than foundational legal principles or a foundational legal document. Rather, we understand a constitution to exist when there is coordination among a sufficient number of members of some group on some basic rules for collective decision-making. On our understanding, then, a bargain struck among military elites defining roles in a society run by a military junta counts as a constitution, and a popular militant uprising that aimed at displacing such a regime would thus count as a revolution.
Some important empirical work relevant to the morality of revolutionary war is to be found in studies of civil war. The latter is sometimes defined as a large-scale armed conflict between state forces and one or more nonstate parties. This definition may be too restrictive, however, since it would exclude a large-scale armed conflict between two or more nonstate parties under conditions in which the government had disintegrated entirely or still existed but was not capable of fielding forces. A broader understanding of civil war that would encompass that kind of case would be simply that of a large-scale intrastate armed conflict.
The preceding terms are not always used in this way in actual political discourse. For example, the government of the United States labeled the secession of the Southern states from the Union a rebellion, while many Confederates called their enterprise the Second American Revolution; and the American colonists who strove to secede from the British Empire tended to call themselves revolutionaries, not secessionists or rebels. (It may be that the Americans avoided the term “rebel” because they thought it had negative connotations). Similarly, the Algerian secession from France is often referred to as the Algerian Revolution and wars of colonial liberation are rarely called secessionist conflicts, though their goal is secession from a political order centered on a metropolitan state whose territory is not adjacent to the colony. In what follows, the term “revolution” will be reserved for extra-constitutional attempts to destroy an existing national government and replace it, to the full extent of its territorial authority, with a new government. On this way of sorting out the various terms, secessionists and revolutionaries are necessarily rebels, while rebels need be neither secessionists nor revolutionaries (they may be anarchists), and secessionists as such are not revolutionaries.
Sometimes the term “revolution” is used in a stronger sense, as denoting not just an extra-constitutional attempt to replace one government with another, but also to effect a fundamental change in the type of government, as in a revolution to replace an autocracy with a democracy. Thus some scholars on the Left have contended that the so-called American Revolution was not really a revolution, because it did not create or even aim at anything other than a new form of the bourgeois state—a state controlled by and in the interest of the class that controls the means of production (Zinn 1980, Jennings 2000). Many American historians have concluded otherwise, asserting that it was a revolution in the stronger sense because it replaced a monarchy with a republic (Nash 2005; Wood 1993). On this stronger understanding of revolution as involving a fundamental change in the type of government, secessionists would also be revolutionaries, if the new government they attempt to establish in part of the territory of the state would be of a fundamentally different type. For the remainder of the discussion, we will use “revolution” in the weaker sense, with the understanding that it can also encompass revolutions in the stronger sense. It is worth noting, however, that the morality of revolution in the stronger sense is, if anything, more complex than that of the weaker sense, because the former involves not only the extra-constitutional overthrow of the existing government but also the extra-constitutional establishment of a new type of government.
One more distinction is needed. Revolutions may be violent or nonviolent and may begin nonviolently and become violent. This distinction, though obviously important, is not so crisp as one might think, because what counts as violence may be disputed. For example, attempts to overthrow a government by disruptive techniques (for example conducting general strikes, disabling power grids, or blocking main transportation routes) are not violent in the way in which discharging firearms or detonating explosives is, but they may nonetheless cause lethal harms. The chief topic of this entry is violent revolution where “violence” is understood in the most robust way and as occurring on a large scale; in other words, the topic is revolutionary war as “war” is usually understood (Singer & Small 1994: 5).
It is well worth noting, however, that there is a position on revolution that obviates the need for a theory of just revolutionary war, namely, the view that large-scale revolutionary violence is never morally justified because the risks of such an endeavor are so great and because nonviolent revolution is more efficacious. Some empirical political scientists have argued that there is good evidence that nonviolent revolution is more likely to achieve its ends than revolutionary war (Chenoweth & Stephan 2011). Even if that is true as a generalization, the question remains as to whether there are exceptions—cases where nonviolence is not likely to achieve the aims of just revolution or would only achieve them with undue costs in terms of human well-being—and whether they can be identified ex ante. If there are any such cases, there is a need for a theory of just revolutionary war.
2. Some Major Figures’ Views on the Morality of Revolution
No attempt can be made here to conduct a survey of views on revolution across the history of Western Philosophy, much less one that encompasses other traditions. Instead, it must suffice to say that the typical attitude toward revolution of major figures in the Western tradition prior to the modern period was to condemn it or to acknowledge its moral permissibility only in very narrow circumstances (Morkevicius 2014). Augustine (City of God) and Aquinas (Summa theologiae), for example, both condemn rebellion and hence revolution, unambiguously urging obedience to the powers that be. Suárez (1609) held that only “lesser magistrates” had the authority to try to overthrow an existing government, with the implication that revolution by those who do not already occupy official roles is never justified. Hobbes (1651), explicitly denied that revolution could ever be justified, holding instead that a subject could only rightly resist government authority as a matter of self-defense and then only when the perpetration of lethal harm against her was imminent.
Perhaps the most famous condemnation of revolutions comes from Immanuel Kant. According to Kant, revolution is never justified, regardless of the extent to which political power is abused. He writes: “The reason a people has a duty to put up with even what is held to be an unbearable abuse of supreme authority is that its resistance to the highest legislator can never be regarded as other than contrary to law, and indeed as abolishing the entire legal constitution” (Ak 6:320). Kant’s unqualified rejection of the possibility of justified revolution is based in his understanding of individual rights as inherently relational. For Kant, the Universal Principle of Right dictates that constraints on individual freedom are to be such that they are compatible with the freedom of all under universal law (Ak 6:230–1). Rights are constituted by claims concerning the conduct of others, but individuals are not in a position to unilaterally enforce those claims. Individual enforcement of a rights claim amounts to an individual imposing his will and interpretation of the situation on another, and this kind of imposition is impermissible as a basic matter of justice. Consequently, a juridical, omnilateral will that is not party to rights relations is necessary to enforce rights claims in a way that is compatible with the Universal Principle of Right. The state is such a will. Hence, submission to the state is a necessary condition of achieving the juridical conditions of mutual freedom that are required on grounds of the Universal Principle of Right (for much more detailed discussions, see: Hill 2002, Korsgaard 2008, Flikschuh 2008). Revolution is never justified because it lacks rightful authority.
The anti-revolutionary arguments just surveyed can be summarized in the following terms. First is the Undue Risk Argument, according to which the prospect of violent anarchy that follows an attempted revolution is so great that it defeats any other reasons that purport to justify political revolution. Second is the Conceptual Argument offered by Kant, according to which acts that instigate revolution can never satisfy the requirement of rightful authority, and so are necessarily unjustified.
A number of figures in the history of political thought have opposed such anti-revolutionary positions. The monarchomachs in late 16th century France argued that their monarchy was unjustified and advocated for revolution and tyrannicide. Francois Hotman defended this claim by arguing that the French constitution was fundamentally based in an assembly of the nation, and the author of Vindicie contra Tyrannos, publishing under the pseudonym Stephanus Junius Brutus, argued that subjects are never bound to obey a prince that oversteps God’s law and that subjects are entitled to resist a King that deviates from his divine duties (for an overview of the monarchomachs, see Dunning 1904). In his work De Jure Regni apud Scotos, the Scottish thinker George Buchanan argues for an early conception of popular sovereignty according to which the people are entitled to resist and punish tyrants (Macmillan 2016  provides a comprehensive biography of Buchanan’s life and summary of his political thought).
The most prominent defense of revolution in the liberal tradition was offered by John Locke, according to which revolution is both justified and permissible when the state breaches its duty to protect the natural rights of persons (1689, chapter XIX). On Locke’s social contract theory, the state is formed to protect individual rights and resolve disputes between persons concerning their rights. The state thus acts as a trustee of the rights of individuals, and violation of those rights amounts to a breach of trust (Simmons 1993, pp. 157–8). If the trust is breached, the rights entrusted to the state are returned to civil society, members of which are then entitled to defend against violations of those rights through the use of force (Locke 1689, section 227, on rights returning to civil society see Simmons 1993, pp. 171–2). We can thus summarize the core of Locke’s view on revolution in terms of the Self-Defense Argument, according to which revolution is justified against some state S when S breaches its fiduciary obligation to protect individual natural rights, then the authority to protect these rights returns to the people (for a discussion contrasting Kant’s and Locke’s views of revolution, see Flikschuh 2008).
Locke took a more favorable stance toward revolution than Hobbes or his medieval predecessors because he did not believe that the risks of physical insecurity attendant upon the destruction of an existing government were as high as those thinkers did. That more optimistic view as grounded, in turn, in his belief that the destruction of the political order need not entail the destruction of society—that is, of social practices and habits that effectively control the most serious forms of violence (Simmons 1993, p. 171). It is a mistake, however, to conclude either that Hobbes was right and Locke was wrong or vice versa about the consequences for physical security of the destruction of government. A more reasonable view is that the risks of the destruction of government and hence of revolution vary, depending upon the circumstances. If that is so, and if the justifiability of revolution depends even in part on the severity of the risks of physical insecurity it involves, then it appears that the content of a moral theory of revolution must be shaped by empirical considerations. We return to this point in the subsequent section, where we introduce a distinction between the different kinds of social contexts within which revolutions take place.
Whereas liberal political philosophers have tended to frame the justification for revolution in terms of natural rights and justice, revolution in the Marxist tradition is understood quite differently. There is one strain of Marx interpretation according to which he rejects rights-talk altogether, either in favor of the discourse of conflicting interests or in favor of the vocabulary of self-realization or mankind’s overcoming of alienation from its “species being” (Buchanan 1982). On this interpretation, Marx held that the very concept of rights is an ideological construct that is fostered by and in turn reinforces the egoistic psychology of bourgeois society and will be discarded once the transition to developed communist society occurs. If the very concept of rights is thus both tainted and fated for obsolescence, then the question arises as to how else the justification for proletarian revolution might be framed (Finlay 2006). One answer that is consistent at least with the early writings of Marx is that proletarian revolution is needed to destroy the conditions of alienation and create the conditions for the full realization of man’s nature as a creative, communal being, the sort of being who will, through processes of scientifically informed collective decision-making, bring the natural and social world fully under deliberate human control for the good of all (Economic & Philosophical Manuscripts of 1844, in MER: 66–125).
Even if Marx thought that successful revolution could be correctly described as the overcoming of alienation or more positively as the realization of human “species being”, it is doubtful that he thought that proletarian revolution needed to be justified in this or any other way. There is, after all, a Marx who derides “moralistic” socialists and who seems to hold that successful proletarian revolution is a matter of the historically inevitable realization of the common interests of the proletariat, and that the revolution will be effectively motivated by those interests, not by a commitment to any moral principle (On the Division of Labor in Production in MER: 683–717). Such an interpretation fits well with Marx’s understanding of his theory of history as scientific and realistic. According to this account, the question of whether revolution is justified is idle; it will occur, because the revolution in the mode of production that marks the transition from capitalism to communism will produce a fundamental transformation of all social relationships that will carry human beings beyond the state and beyond politics (Critique of the Gotha Programme, Part IV, 1875 in MER: 525–541). On this reading, Marx does not offer a justification of revolution so much as he offers an explanation for why a certain kind of revolution must (on his view) occur (for a discussion comparing Kant and Marx’s views that argues against the amoralist reading of Marx, see Ypi 2014)
By way of summary and as a broad generalization, it is fair to say that at least since the time of Locke, the dominant view on revolution in Western Political Philosophy, both in the Liberal and Marxist traditions, and perhaps in popular political culture as well, has been considerably more permissive than that of Hobbes and Kant and their medieval predecessors. For the remainder of this entry, we will assess various morally relevant features of revolutions, drawing on insights developed in contemporary just war theory.
3. Revolutionary Jus ad Bellum
Contemporary just war theory provides a sophisticated framework for assessing the morality of political revolution (see the entry on war). Just war theory is relevant because revolutions typically involve the large-scale use of force, both by revolutionaries and by the regime that attempts to thwart their efforts. Locke’s argument in support of revolution has already illustrated this connection between revolution and just war because he conceives of revolution as an act of collective self-defense against usurpers of legitimate political power.
In this section, then, we will examine how the satisfaction of typical jus ad bellum standards faces complications in the case of revolutionary war. Before turning to this analysis, we must introduce a key distinction concerning the social context of revolutions. The social context that a revolution takes place in can lead to variation with respect to how violent a given revolution is, a crucial parameter for assessing whether the conditions of jus ad bellum obtain.
How bloody and protracted a revolution is and whether it will be successful will in part be a function of how well-organized and effective revolutionary leadership is. Accordingly, we will distinguish between what we call Hobbesian revolutionary contexts and Lockean revolutionary contexts. In Lockean contexts, revolutionaries have access to institutional structures, either formal or informal, that they can rely on to solve two basic problems: the cooperation problem (mobilizing a sufficient number of revolutionaries) and the coordination problem (organizing the revolutionaries in an effective manner). In Hobbesian contexts, by contrast, such institutional resources are absent.
Hobbesian and Lockean contexts thus described are ideal types, with most actual revolutions occurring in contexts that fall somewhere in between the ideal types. The American Revolution took place in a Lockean context, insofar as revolutionaries had access to colonial legislatures, through participation in which they had developed skills in organization and leadership. These institutional resources enabled American revolutionaries to solve the cooperation and coordination problems and to do so through relatively peaceful, democratic means. The early stages of the Russian Revolution, in contrast, took place under Hobbesian conditions, resulting in division and conflict among revolutionary factions and uncoordinated violence by relatively small groups (e.g. mutinying soldiers or striking laborers) acting independently. In the Russian case, as opposed to the American one, the process by which the cooperation and coordination problems were solved did not provide the group that eventually took control of the revolution, the Bolsheviks, with experience in non-coercive, relatively democratic leadership.
Crucially, the social context of a revolution is not fixed because, as Skopcol emphasizes, revolutions, to the extent that they are successful, involve the creation of new state structures (Skocpol 2015). Further, the context in which a revolution occurs can also change prior to the successful seizure of sufficient power to build a new state structure. One example of the latter kind is found in the Iranian Revolution. This revolution began with widespread but uncoordinated student protests which, following some student deaths, were transformed by Ayatollah Khomeini into an organized mass protest movement. The institutional resource Khomeini utilized was a network of pre-existing religious institutions.
It will be important to keep in mind the distinction between Hobbesian and Lockean revolutionary contexts in order to avoid over generalizing about the risks of revolution. If one assumes, if only implicitly, that revolutions occur in predominantly Lockean conditions, one will be predisposed to rate the risk of anarchy and extreme violence low and consequently take a more permissive stance on the justification of revolution. If one assumes that Hobbesian conditions are predominant, one will infer that the risks of revolution are great and be predisposed to regard revolutions as unjustified. Keeping in mind the need to avoid over-generalization, we now turn to a consideration of how standard jus ad bellum criteria apply to revolutions or at least to revolutions that are, like most revolutions, likely to involve large-scale collective violence.
Consider first the just cause requirement. Some causes for revolution we can set aside immediately, namely, those that are patently unjust. It is not a legitimate aim of revolution, for example, to displace a liberal state that is reasonably effective at protecting basic human rights in order to institute a theocracy that will violate basic human rights. Nor would a revolution to institute or preserve slavery be justified. More appropriate targets of revolution are Resolute Severe Tyrannies, defined as regimes that persistently violate some of the basic human rights of large segments of the population, are extremely authoritarian (that is, wholly undemocratic), and are utterly impervious to efforts to reform them (Buchanan 2013, p. 296).
The moral stakes of opposing a Resolute Severe Tyranny will depend on which human rights are being violated. When relatively basic rights such as rights to one’s life, body, or the conditions necessary for subsistence are being violated, then officials and agents of the regime are plausibly liable to immediate defensive harm in the individual cases where such violations arise and ending such systematic violation of basic rights is a just cause for armed resistance of the regime (Finlay 2015, pp. 78). Tyrannies can be less severe when the human rights they violate are relatively less urgent than these basic rights, which would include political rights or rights against discrimination.
While there might be cause for replacing a tyrannical regime, the justification of revolution encounters a complication when it comes to determining what kind of government or institutional arrangement ought to replace the regime if the revolution proves successful. This problem is especially acute under Hobbesian conditions because revolutionaries have repudiated or cannot avail themselves of existing political processes for determining political aims and have not yet developed new processes for performing that task (at least in the earlier stages of the struggle). There may be serious disagreement among revolutionaries as to what the goal of the revolution is, with no nonviolent, much less legitimate process for resolving it. If revolutionaries lack the institutional resources to determine a common understanding of what the new political order is to be, then the task of evaluating the justness of a revolutionary struggle becomes more difficult. It may be a mistake to say “X is the aim of the revolutionary war-makers” because there may be no one aim and the plurality of aims may be mutually inconsistent, with some being just and others being unjust. In certain contexts, then, the cause of a political revolution, its justifying aim, may be indeterminate.
Though the cause of revolution may be indeterminate or unjust, it does not follow that joining the fight, once it has started, is necessarily wrong or unjust (Buchanan 2013). Whether various individuals are morally justified in joining the war effort depends upon whether they have morally acceptable reasons for doing so, not upon the morality or immorality of the actions others took to initiate the conflict. The justification for initiating revolution will be different from the justification for joining a revolution. This point is not limited to revolutionary wars, but it may be more significant in the revolutionary case, if generally speaking the initiation of revolutionary wars is harder to justify than some interstate wars, especially wars of self-defense or defense of others against aggression.
Consider now to the proportionality criterion, applied to revolutionary war. Proportionality is satisfied when the moral significance of the goods achieved through revolution is greater than the significance of the “bads” or harms or rights-violations that will be brought about by revolutionary conflict. As Richard Norman and David Rodin argue, the moral urgency of political rights seems to be categorically inferior to the significance of rights to life and limb that will be violated and threatened by revolutionary war, thus making revolutionary war against tyrannies that only violate political rights unjustified (Norman 1995: 128; Rodin 2002: 48). In a similar vein, Jonathan Parry argues that revolutionaries are at a moral disadvantage when it comes to the satisfaction of proportionality. That is because, on Parry’s view, in order for some interests to count in the proportionality calculus, the persons to whom those interests are tied must consent to the use of force to protect those interests. And, since revolutionaries are generally less likely to receive consent, this means that there will be fewer interests that count in favor of revolutionary violence (Parry 2018).
There are a number of replies that one might offer in response to these challenges concerning proportionality. First, one can argue that the moral significance of the violation of relatively less urgent rights aggregates to a cost that is great enough to be proportionate to a relatively lesser number of harms to more urgent rights that will be suffered as a consequence of violent revolution (McMahan 2004). This aggregationist argument can also be bolstered by identifying further goods advanced by revolution. The effects of revolutionary war against “lesser tyranny” on valid norm compliance might also be included. Supposing that it is a valid norm that governments abstain from harming their citizens and respect the political liberties of citizens. If international institutions are so weak as to be unable to enforce this norm, then the best prospect for enforcing a norm of good government is the threat of revolution against governments that violate the norm. Under these conditions, it would be problematic to restrict proportionality assessments to immediate, direct harms, ignoring the effects on the enforcement of important norms of justice. Second, one could argue that a regime that violates relatively less urgent rights does so by virtue of issuing a conditional threat, explicit or implicit, and that therefore the regime is responsible for escalation in conflict that occurs because of an assertion of the relatively less urgent rights by individuals, and use of force in response to such escalation is justified (McMahan 1994; Finlay 2015: 63–76). Third, one could argue that proportionality is sensitive to responsibility, such that when one is responsible for some harm or rights violation then the threshold of proportionality is lessened to some extent. So, if a regime is responsible for violations of relatively less urgent human rights, then this fact may make members of the regime liable to a degree of force that would not have otherwise been proportionate (Kapelner 2019). Fourth, one could argue that revolutions respond to a distinctive kind of wrong that changes the proportionality calculus in favor of revolution. Mattias Iser argues that states that bring about widespread human rights violations thereby fail to recognize the equal basic moral status of citizens, and that this failure of recognition is a distinctive kind of wrong that weighs in favor of forceful replacement of prevailing regime (Iser 2017).
The preceding points concern proportionality in revolutionary war in general. Under relatively Hobbesian conditions, there is a further complication concerning proportionality. In such conditions, aspiring revolutionary leaders face a serious collective action problem that established states have already solved: they must mobilize a sufficient portion of the population to make war effectively, in spite of the fact that it will often be rational for any given individual to refrain from participating. As we shall discuss in the context of jus in bello criteria of just war, revolutionaries will often need to resort to coercing other members of the population in order to motivate cooperation in revolutionary activity. The regime is likely to respond in kind to such coercive tactics, producing an escalating spiral of violence.
The discussion so far helps explain a general feature of revolutions, namely, that they are often more violent than interstate wars, especially when undertaken in Hobbesian conditions. Revolutionary wars present a greater risk of literal anarchy, with all of the threats to human rights and well-being that this usually entails, because revolutionaries, even when they succeed in defeating the regime, may not yet have (and in some cases may never develop) the capacity to impose order. In that sense, the stakes are often higher in revolutionary wars and the traditional likelihood of success requirement of just war theory may be harder to satisfy. Revolutionary conflicts, like other intrastate wars, are often especially brutal, because the lines between combatants and noncombatants tend to be blurred, because of the spiral of coercion stemming from strategic interaction regarding revolutionary mobilization mentioned above, and because individuals and groups often use the general context of violence to settle private conflicts that have little or no connection to the issues for which revolution is supposedly undertaken (Kalyvas 2006: 14).
Similar complications to those encountered in the case of just cause also arise regarding satisfaction of the rightful authority requirement, especially under Hobbesian revolutionary contexts. It is typically held that in order for some agent to have the rightful authority to wage just war, she must in some significant way represent the persons whose interests the war is meant to protect or promote (Finlay 2015 ch. 6; Parry 2018). If “represents” means what it does in the context of ordinary democratic politics, namely, A represents B if and only if A is authorized to act on B’s behalf through some appropriate public political process (such as an election), then this is a non-starter, since an oppressive regime is unlikely to allow any such process.
This standard, institutionally-based understanding of representation would work as a criterion of rightful authority to initiate revolutionary war only if one of two conditions were satisfied. First, those who initiate revolutionary war were duly chosen as representatives prior to the advent of an oppressive regime (as when an authoritarian coup usurps an elected government). Second, the constitutional order included pre-authorization for revolution under certain specified conditions. It is worth noting that the French Declaration of the Rights of Man and the Citizen explicitly included a right (and indeed a duty) to resist tyranny and that the Inner Service Act of the Turkish Armed Forces (articles 35 and 85) goes farther, designating an agent of revolution by pre-authorizing the military to depose the government if it violates the constitutional requirement of secular government. Just as an advance directive for medical care enables a competent patient to pre-authorize agent to act on her behalf in the event of her losing the capacity to act, so a constitutional provision of this sort would enable a people under conditions of political freedom to pre-authorize some agent to initiate revolution on its behalf should the abuse of government authority undermine its ability to perform an act of authorization. Whereas under Lockean conditions there may be some residual institutional structures that can be relied on to choose genuinely representative revolutionary leaders, when facing a Resolute Severe Tyranny or occupying Hobbesian contexts it is far less likely that either conditions of representation can obtain. A Resolute Severe Tyranny is not likely to allow any institutional process for representation by those who may oppose it.
Here it is important to note that revolutionary conflict in such conditions typically begins when a relatively small minority undertakes armed struggle against the government and claims to do so in the name of the people. The problem is that it is difficult to see how, in Hobbesian contexts, they could be authorized to act on behalf of the people.
Another problem concerning rightful authority in Hobbesian contexts is that there are often two or more parties engaging in revolutionary violence that contend with one another (often violently) to be acknowledged, by the people and by other states and international organizations, as the sole legitimate revolutionary war-maker. Revolutions frequently are characterized by violent struggles for leadership, under conditions in which no contender for leadership can claim exclusive legitimacy if any legitimacy at all. So, in addition to the fact that Hobbesian conditions are characterized by a lack of social or institutional resources for the determination of rightful authority, there is the fact that rival revolutionary groups may resort to violence among themselves in a bid to claim such authority.
In the absence of any institutional provisions for choosing representatives during the struggle or for pre-authorizing some group to serve as representatives prior to it, one might offer a different understanding of representation that is easier to satisfy in contexts where political revolutions have some appeal. An agent represents the people, in a fashion that morally empowers her to initiate and lead revolutionary war, if she is committed to and acts appropriately to realize their shared interest or common good (Biggar 2013). It is worth noting just how distant this view is from any widely accepted notion of rightful authority to make war in other contexts or for that matter of rightful authority in any context, whether private or public. The fact that Jones is committed to Smith’s good and able to promote it effectively does nothing whatsoever to establish that Jones has rightful authority over Jones, much less that he has rightful authority to undertake actions supposedly on Jones’s behalf that pose a danger to Jones or others. This understanding of rightful authority is subject to all of the objections to paternalism toward competent adults.
At this point one might make a radical move: simply deny the rightful authority requirement applies to revolutionary wars or at least to revolutionary wars that occur in a Hobbesian context. This move could be qualified with the proviso that although a group attempting to exercise leadership in the revolutionary struggle lacks rightful authority, it is justified in assuming the leadership role only if it acts in such a way as to bring about conditions in which rightful authority can exist. Similarly, one might argue that rightful authority is not required in the case of a group that can help create the conditions for legitimacy out of a situation of violently anarchic state-breakdown, so long as that group acts in ways that facilitate the establishment of legitimacy. This response to the problem of rightful authority calls into question the assumption that a just recourse to war developed for application to interstate wars also applies in toto to revolutionary wars. Similarly, as we shall see in the next section, there is also the question of whether traditional jus in bello requirements apply without exception to the conduct of revolutionary wars.
Let us turn to the last criterion of jus ad bellum, necessity. The standard of necessity is satisfied when there is no less harmful means of achieving the cause for violence. For a revolution to be necessary, it must be the case that existing institutions are both so deeply morally flawed and recalcitrant to reform that nothing short of displacing them and starting anew would suffice to improve upon the existing state of affairs. This is why discussions about revolution generally take for granted that the target of revolution is something like a Resolute Severe Tyranny—only such regimes pose such a significant enough threat to the basic rights of persons while barring all prospects for reforming political institutions. Plausible candidates for revolution, then, are states that are so organized as to foreclose internal channels for reform. These channels need not be exclusively legal or constitutional. Even states that bar significant portions of the population from access to legal or political mechanisms for change might not make revolution necessary. Citizens of such states may still have access to options like protest, general strikes, civil disobedience, and uncivil disobedience as a means of forcing the relevant kind of changes, thus making revolution unnecessary. Hence, our discussion has followed most discussions of political revolution by focusing on the case of extremely repressive regimes like Resolute Severe Tyranny, because only under such conditions of complete and unrelenting oppression is it plausible that revolution is necessary to bring about change.
4. Revolutionary Jus in Bello
Principles of jus in bello specify what kinds of particular actions are permissible in making war. Two standards feature prominently in discussions of jus in bello. First is proportionality, which holds that the specific acts or tactics employed in war must promote the good to such a degree that it outweighs the “bads” or harms or rights-infringements of the act or tactic. Second is discrimination, which is typically understood in terms of non-combatant immunity—innocents are not liable to harms and so it is impermissible to target them. A much disputed question is whether all and only civilians qualify as innocents. Here it is worth noting that the original meaning of “innocent” is one who is incapable of inflicting harm. Some military personnel, namely those who lack access to weapons or have become incapable of using them may fit this description and some civilians, namely those who supply resources to the military, may not.
A key issue that a theory of the morality of revolutionary war ought to address is whether these widely accepted jus in bello norms apply without exception or modification to war-making by revolutionaries or whether, instead, revolutionaries are morally permitted to undertake acts of war that the military personnel of states are usually prohibited from performing. This is not a merely theoretical issue: revolutionary warriors have often engaged in various morally problematic forms of “irregular” warfare. They have assassinated civilian leaders and other civilians such as government bureaucrats and judges, attacked regime forces while wearing civilian attire (not wearing uniforms or insignia as required by the laws of war and not carrying weapons openly), and engaged in terrorism, deliberately killing individuals who had no discernible connection with the regime by detonating bombs in public places. Furthermore, in order to mobilize people to join the revolution or to deter them from aiding the regime in suppressing it, they have engaged in acts of terrorism against the oppressed.
These examples of irregular tactics fall into four different categories (Finlay 2015, pp. 206–8). First is civilian camouflage, which involves combatants retaining the appearance of civilians for the sole purpose of avoiding elimination prior to combat. Second is civilian disguise, which, like civilian camouflage, involves combatants appearing as civilians, but, unlike camouflage, this misleading appearance is used to mislead the enemy during combat. In an example of civilian disguise discussed by Michael Walzer, French partisans resisted German occupation by dressing as peasants and launching an ambush (Walzer 1977 p. 183). Third is human shields, a tactic where combatants deliberately locate military targets near civilians in order to deter attack (Schmitt 2009). Fourth, combatants can engage in non-combatant targeting, a tactic that deliberately places non-combatants, e.g. civilians, in harm’s way for the sake of some advantage. Examples of non-combatant targeting include: the concealment of civilians in a position close to military targets in the hopes that the enemy harms them with collateral damage, provocation of the regime with the intent of producing harms to civilians, or, of course, deliberate targeting of locations predominantly used or occupied by civilians. The aims of non-combatant targeting can range from motivating the populace to join the revolutionary effort, to coercing the populace into supporting the revolution, to instigating terror and disorder. These irregular tactics are clearly in tension if not outright contradiction with jus in bello standards of proportionality and discrimination as they expose civilians to greater risks of suffering collateral harm either by making it more difficult for the enemy to discriminate between combatants and non-combatants, or by directly exposing non-combatants to greater harms on account of using them as shields or deliberate targeting.
Revolutionaries are often under powerful incentives to employ such irregular tactics, because they are disadvantaged relative to their adversaries. First, they will generally have less military training and less disciplined organization than regime combatants, they will be fewer in number, will generally have lower quality arms, and will have inferior logistical and intelligence capacities. Secondly, revolutionaries face the challenge of mobilizing a people that has suffered oppression under an unjust regime. Entrenched tyrannical regimes typically use their control over education and the media to instill propaganda designed to prevent the people from recognizing just how rotten the regime is, how poorly the economy is performing, how inferior the quality of life is compared with that in better governed countries, and how widespread dissatisfaction with the regime actually is. Hence, effective revolutionary action may require the dissipation of false consciousness on the part of the people. The aspiring revolutionary leadership thus may be faced with the task of trying to dismantle the false consciousness of those they hope to enlist in the revolutionary struggle. In actual cases, aspiring leaders have often used violence and sometimes terrorism in an effort to overcome the epistemic obstacles to widespread participation in revolution. For example, they have attacked “soft targets”—policemen or government officials—to demonstrate to the people that “we have the power to hurt them”. Another tactic often used by revolutionaries to overcome epistemic obstacles is to provoke the regime to undertake brutal responses to relatively peaceful demonstrations, in order to reveal to all just how ruthless the regime is. Such actions, which are condemned by mainstream jus in bello thinking, are said to be necessary to instill the sense of agency that false consciousness has undermined.
While such “irregular” tactics are understandably attractive to revolutionaries, the claim that they are justified is generally regarded with a good deal of skepticism. We start by examining the use of civilian camouflage and civilian disguise. These tactics are clearly at odds with standard requirements of discrimination, according to which combatants must wear uniforms and openly carry their arms so that the enemy can distinguish them from non-combatants. The intuitive appeal of the standard account of discrimination thus leads some thinkers to argue that civilian camouflage and civilian disguise are impermissible because such tactics expose non-combatants to unjust and disproportionate risk of collateral harm (Meisels 2008; Chiu 2010).
Those who argue that civilian camouflage or disguise are permissible typically appeal to fairness. The idea is that, at least in the early stages of their struggle, revolutionaries are at a great disadvantage vis à vis government forces, that this disadvantage is something for which they are not responsible, and that the revolutionaries should not be expected to let it render unsuccessful their struggle against a seriously unjust regime (Gross 2010: 153–4). As noted earlier, revolutionaries typically have inferior arms and logistical capacities, they have no safe rear areas behind which they can regroup and resupply because there are no battle lines as in conventional wars. Finlay argues that for these reasons, civilian camouflage, but not disguise, is a tactic that revolutionaries may permissibly employ (Finlay 2015, pp. 211–12). Civilian camouflage is justified, according to Finlay, because this tactic serves only to enable revolutionaries to withdraw temporarily from fighting and enabling this both restores fairness to the distribution of rights and duties concerning warfare in asymmetric contexts and is not inconsistent with standard laws of war. The use of civilian disguise, on the other hand, is not permissible, because that tactic is not meant to restore fairness with respect to an ability normally protected by the laws of war (i.e. the ability to withdraw from combat), but rather to diminish the ability of regular combatants to defend themselves (Ibid., p. 213).
Whereas civilian camouflage and civilian disguise are tactics that only indirectly contribute to the risk of collateral harm for civilians by making discrimination between combatants and non-combatants more difficult, tactics like the use of human shields or non-combatant targeting directly expose non-combatants to significant risks of harm for the sake of some military advantage and so necessarily violate the principle of non-combatant immunity. Many theorists who study irregular conflicts like revolutionary war generally view such tactics as strictly impermissible.
It is important to note that critics of such irregular tactics do not generally claim that as a matter of principle irregular tactics can never be justified. In the face of a “supreme emergency,” where failure to displace the prevailing regime would be a moral catastrophe, such theorists often grant that irregular tactics that would facilitate resolving the emergency may in fact be justified as a lesser evil. The problem lies in allowing persons waging war to judge for themselves whether they occupy an exceptional, supreme emergency situation. The worry is that if participants in war know that such exceptions are in principle available to them, then there is a serious risk that their fallible judgments (perhaps shaped by various biases or motivated reasoning) lead them to make a wrongful exception and employ tactics that are not in fact justified and which come at a disproportionate harm to innocents and bystanders (Nathanson 2010, pp. 201–8; Nagel 1972; Coady 2002; Coady 2004). Relatedly, one might worry that once one belligerent has violated the principle of non-combatant immunity, opposing sides might respond by no longer complying with the norm in turn, leading to total breakdown of the rules of war (Waldron 2010: pp. 88–90).
Whether the tactics in question are at risk of being abused will naturally depend on the specific way in which they are employed, so it will be helpful to distinguish the different kinds of non-combatant targeting. First, and most extreme, is terrorism, by which we mean deliberate targeting of non-combatants (for a more detailed and extensive discussion of terrorism, see the entry on terrorism). An example is the targeting of public places where combat is not occurring. The aims of such acts can include those of instilling terror in the populace, weakening support for the regime, or sending a message to the regime or international actors.
Revolutionaries can employ tactics that target non-combatants which need not be indiscriminate. Rather, they can employ a second sort of irregular tactic which we will call expansive discriminate targeting. This tactic involves the deliberate targeting of non-combatants who are taken to be morally liable to suffer harms from revolutionary war. We will discuss the grounds of such liability shortly when we survey arguments given in defensive of irregular targeting.
Third, revolutionaries can rely on provocation of the enemy. The aim of this tactic is to provoke agents of the regime to harm non-combatants with the aim of securing greater popular support for the revolutionary movement. Provocation is distinct from the use of human shields in that the former is offensive whereas the latter is defensive. Combatants employ human shields in the hope that the presence of non-combatants dissuades the enemy from launching an attack, whereas the intent of provoking the enemy is to have them harm innocents. Fourth and last, combatants can employ coercion against non-combatants with the aim of forcing them to join the revolutionary effort.
The argument from risk of abuse and the risk of breakdown of the rules of war applies to some, but not all, of these irregular tactics. These arguments against irregular tactics are weaker when there are naturally occurring incentives in place that would motivate against abusing the irregular tactics or against reciprocating their use and when the dominant regime does not already engage in the abuse of the relevant sort of tactic. Such a situation is likely to obtain with regard to relatively less extreme forms of non-combatant targeting, namely, expansive discriminate targeting and coercing support. In all likelihood, a regime that can be the target of legitimate revolutionary war is likely already employing some kind of coercion to bolster its ranks, which makes worries about further abuse of the tactic moot. Expansive discriminate targeting is also unlikely to be worthwhile for a dominant regime to employ because of its asymmetric power vis a vis the revolutionaries.
Revolutionaries are unlikely to have access to established institutional structures that they can rely on to advance their war effort. The enemy of the regime consists of the specific members of the revolutionary movement that threatens it, whereas the enemy of revolutionaries is the regime as such, which is comprised not only of political officials and the combatants following orders issued by the officials, but also the institutions and structures that keep the regime operating, and this makes an expansive understanding of legitimate targets appealing for revolutionaries but not for the regime. By contrast, the arguments from risk of abuse and risk of breakdown of the rules of war seem to hold in the case of terrorism and the use of human shields. Dominant regimes have some interest in employing either of these tactics as the use of indiscriminate targeting would counteract the likely use of civilian camouflage and disguise that revolutionaries will by necessity employ, and the use of human shields would presumably be a deterrent against revolutionary attack (though, for a qualified defense of the use of human shields, see Fabre 2012, pp. 256–67).
Even if the arguments from risk of abuse and risk of breakdown of the rules of war do not hold in the case of coercing support and employment of an expansive understanding of legitimate targets, this does not mean that revolutionaries are justified in deploying such irregular tactics. The principle of non-combatant immunity still seems to offer a compelling prima facie reason for holding such tactics to be impermissible, and so some positive reason in support of their use must be offered.
In defense of coercing support, Buchanan 2013 argues that some forms of coercion may be permissible, as when revolutionary fighters are conscripted through the threat of penalties such as expropriation of property or even perhaps confinement or lesser restrictions on liberty. The most plausible justification for such methods of coerced mobilization would characterize the goals of the revolution as public goods of extraordinary moral importance and present coercion as a solution to the collective action problem. For such coercion to be justified, it must be the case that the cause of revolution is just, that the good gained by exercising coercion is proportionate to the bad of such coercion (i.e., one cannot use coercion to force persons to join a futile cause), the recruitment of further persons that can only be achieved by coercion must be necessary for success, and the exercise of coercion must satisfy further standard principles concerning the use of coercion to secure a morally significant public good, namely the costs of coercion and contributing to the revolution must be distributed fairly.
What if anything can justify the deliberate targeting of non-combatants by revolutionary forces? According to Fabre, “the act of killing an innocent person—which infringes his right not to be killed and thereby extinguishes all his other rights—cannot be justified unless as a way to avert the greater evil of far greater numbers of individuals suffering a similar loss, or a violation, of all rights. By implication, violations of the right to collective self-determination alone do not justify deliberately targeting innocent non-combatants” (Fabre 2012, p. 253).
Notice that Fabre’s conclusion takes for granted that non-combatants are also innocent. In defense of a more expansive ground for the deliberate targeting of non-combatants, Finlay argues that some non-combatants are not innocent and that because of this fact it can be fair to distribute some of the harms of war to them. Key to Finlay’s argument is the claim that there will be some, perhaps many, civilians whose conduct contributes to maintaining the oppressive regime such that they are to some extent responsible for, or at least complicit in allowing, the harms of oppression to obtain. On Finlay’s view, then, supposing that targeting non-combatants is necessary for advancing a just revolutionary war and that doing so is the most proportionate means available, then targeting non-combatants can be justified when the targets are to some extent complicit or responsible for oppression, which thereby grounds some degree of liability to harm (Finlay 2015, pp. 261–83). Complications face this kind of argument as what counts as significant contribution is both unclear and disputed. For example, a farmer who supplies food for a tyranny’s secret police or repairs the vehicles that they use to hunt down dissidents clearly makes a contribution to their depredations, but it is unclear whether that sort of contribution makes her liable to deliberate targeting in war (Fabre 2009, Frowe 2014).
Whether intervention in revolution can be justified is a question of great significance for the morality of political revolution. We will use the term “intervention” in a broad sense to refer to deliberate military contributions made by foreign actors. Intervention is thus understood to include acts like contributing combatants or weapons, as well as acts like instituting a no-fly zone, or providing intelligence or logistical support or training in the use of weapons. Given the asymmetrical nature of revolutionary war, military assistance from foreign actors may be crucial, perhaps even necessary, to the success of revolutionaries.
Though intervention may be of urgent importance for the success of a revolution, the justification of military intervention by foreign actors is subject to important moral limitations. Michael Walzer has famously argued that the right of collective self-determination sets stringent constraints on what foreign actors may do. On Walzer’s view, foreign actors can only initiate unrequested intervention when a people faces a supreme humanitarian emergency, such as genocide (Walzer 1977; Walzer 1980). Walzer’s argument results in an asymmetry between the justification of revolution and the justification of intervention; whereas the former can be justified in response to oppression that does not reach the threshold of supreme humanitarian emergency, the latter cannot (for discussion of the asymmetry position, see Dobos 2011).
Buchanan has argued that respect for self-determination entails quite different conclusions (Buchanan 2013). Buchanan rejects two common principles offered as constraints on intervention based in respect for self-determination. The first is Mill’s principle, which holds that popular support for revolution is necessary for intervention to be justified. The second is the consent principle, according to which the beneficiaries of intervention must consent to the intervention for it to be justified. Buchanan rejects both these principles because a populace that is oppressed by a Resolute Severe Tyranny faces considerable obstacles to expression of popular support for revolution and consent to intervention.
Without such constraints on intervention, Buchanan has offered two distinctive kinds of grounds for intervention in revolutions. First, he has argued on the basis of considerations of proportionality that foreign actors can justifiably intervene in revolutions that may not have even been instigated rightfully when such intervention serves to either a) preempt wrongdoing and the escalation of violence and coercion that tends to take place in revolutionary wars, or b) establish the conditions under which the oppressed are able to meaningfully convey their support for (or opposition to) revolution or consent (or lack thereof) to intervention (Buchanan 2013). Second, Buchanan has argued that considerations of self-determination may in fact weigh in favor of the justification of intervention (Buchanan 2016). He argues that respecting a peoples’ right to self-determination requires taking measures to protect the conditions of the exercise of a group’s self-determination and to promote the conditions under which the group is capable of being self-determining. Consequently, on Buchanan’s view respect for self-determination, considered by itself, entails a permission to intervene in revolutionary wars when doing so will protect or promote the people’s self-determination. This permission extends to considerations of future generations, such that foreign actors may also intervene in the formation of post-revolutionary government if the post-revolutionary regime was going to be such that the conditions of self-determination would not obtain for future persons. It is important to note that Buchanan’s argument is directed only against the view that respect for self-determination rules out intervention. He does not hold that the fact that an intervention would promote self-determination entails that intervention is permissible all things considered. There can be counter-vailing considerations.
Massimo Renzo offers the following critical reply to Buchanan’s argument (Renzo 2018). Renzo first argues that even if a person is temporarily incapable of exercising a right, this does not mean that others cannot violate the right. Accordingly, the fact that some group is unable to exercise its right to self-determination does not imply that others may act as though the group had no right to self-determination at all. Constraints based in self-determination may still obtain on the grounds of a) past exercises of self-determination, and b) available reasons concerning how the group would exercise their right to self-determination if they were able to do so (for a critical reply to Renzo, see Weltman 2019). Buchanan might reply that he acknowledges that the right of self-determination continues to exist under conditions in which the right-holders are incapable of exercising it but the right is violated only when it could be exercised, not by measures that enable its exercise. The idea would be that under conditions in which a tyranny prevents the people from developing the capacity for self-determination, the right is, latent or in reserve and that respecting self-determination can in some circumstances mean doing what is necessary to make the exercise of the right possible.
The exchange reviewed so far takes for granted that self-determination is relevant to some extent in determining the justification of intervention. A number of authors, however, deny that self-determination is of any import at all. On such views, if jus ad bellum principles are satisfied, then intervention is justified regardless of whether it is supported by beneficiaries (McMahan 2010; Altman and Wellman 2011: ch. 5; Teson 2017 ch. 3). Because these arguments reject that respect for self-determination sets constraints on intervention, they consequently entail a rejection of Walzer’s asymmetrical position, resulting in a symmetry between permissions to engage in revolutionary war and permissions for foreign actors to engage in military intervention.
Replying to such views, Renzo has argued that self-determination is indeed a value that sets constraints on the justification of intervention (Renzo 2020). Key to Renzo’s argument is the claim that self-determination is an independent value. In support of this claim, Renzo argues that appeal to self-determination is necessary to explain the wrongness of a certain kind of colonialism. Renzo holds that colonialism that does not involve the violation of the basic human rights of colonized is nevertheless wrong because it violates a people’s right to self-determination. Having established that self-determination is indeed an independent value, Renzo goes on to argue that respect for the value of self-determination sets a pro tanto constraint on the justification of intervention. This pro tanto constraint requires taking into consideration how a community would have exercised its right to self-determination if it were able to do so, and how it has exercised its self-determination in the past in order to determine whether the intervention would be accepted by the community. Renzo does not, however, conclude that on his account there is an asymmetry between revolution and intervention. Rather, he argues that there is a symmetry, because revolutions will tend to be instigated by a vanguard group that in effect bears the same relationship to the people as does a foreign actor. Accordingly, he argues that there is symmetry between the justification of intervention and the justification of revolution because both must take into consideration the right to self-determination of the people.
An alternative account of the relationship between revolution and intervention is offered by Christopher J. Finlay (Finlay 2020). Finlay argues that revolution and intervention are complementary. He holds that intervention is a supplement for revolution, such that the justification of intervention is a function of the justification of revolution. In order for intervention to be justified on Finlay’s view, it must be that, first, the beneficiaries of intervention are unable to secure their own rights, and second, that domestic leaders of a revolution would be unable to succeed on their own.
6. Implications for Further Research in the Philosophy of Revolution
Both the ethics of revolution and the ethics of intervention in revolution are heavily fact-dependent, because both are shaped by consideration of the likely consequences of engaging in revolution. More specifically, whether individuals or groups ought to or may permissibly attempt to overthrow the existing political order and replace it with a new one depends, inter alia, on whether the prospects for significant improvement are good, relative to the likely costs of trying to achieving it. And for third parties considering whether to intervene either in support of or in opposition to a revolution an estimate of the risks and benefits is also essential. We have seen that, except in the case of Kant’s Conceptual Argument, the division between philosophers who opt for a blanket prohibition on revolution (and by implication, on intervention in support of revolution) and those who hold that revolution is sometimes justified is best explained by the hypothesis that the opposing groups rely on different estimates of the risks of revolution. But we have also seen that the risks vary depending upon the context in which a revolution occurs. Consequently, a sound philosophical theory of revolution will be particularistic, in this sense: it will acknowledge that there is no correct answer to the question “Is revolution justified,” unless the context is specified and a defensible account of the relationship between different contexts and different likely outcomes of revolution is provided. Doing that requires an empirically grounded account of the relationship between particular contexts and outcomes. So far, no moral theory of revolution satisfies this requirement.
We conclude, accordingly, that a defensible theory of the morality of revolution must rely on a descriptive-explanatory theory of how large-scale political change is likely to occur, a theory that is context-sensitive. Further, since the question is when, if ever, revolutions are likely to produce a morally better political order, what is needed is nothing short of a descriptive-explanatory theory of morally progressive large-scale political change.
Another way to put this fundamental point is that theorizing the morality of revolution should be “naturalized,” not in the sense that normative issues should be reduced to factual ones, but rather in the sense that theorists should recognize the relevance of the facts about what actually happens in revolutions. Until they do so, perennial debates about whether revolution or reform is the best path to moral progress, debates of great importance for the justification of revolution, will remain unresolvable. That means that the normative theorizing about revolution, if it is to be concrete enough to be action-guiding, requires not just the traditional skills of the philosopher, but also recourse to relevant social scientific theories of how large-scale changes come about (a factual question), in combination with principled assessments of whether the likely outcomes of revolution in various contexts will be morally progressive.
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