Notes to Scientific Method

1. For further reading we recommend Larry Laudan's (1968) biographical essay which provides a detailed history and references up until the end of the 19th century (while arguing for the history of scientific method as “perhaps the most important bridge between the history of science and its philosophy” (1968: 2)). For contemporary developments, Nola and Sankey (2007, 2000a) assesses the prospects for scientific method. For a historical overview with samples from the primary literature, see Gimbel (2011).

2. At the same time, a rich and more critical commentary tradition was going on in the near east. Islamic commentary was far less beholden to the authority of Aristotle, Plato, Galen (ca. 130-ca. 210 B.C.E.), Claudius Ptolemy (90-168), or any other of the classic scholars whose works they read. Through the critical reflections of figures such as Al-Kindi (ca. 800–870), Alhazen (965–1040), and Averroës (1126–1198), several explanatory advances were made. Notable is the critique of observational astronomy by Alhazen (the Latinized name for Ibn al-Haytham ) and the 13th and 14th century Maragha astronomers. They cited the lack of a plausible mechanical underpinning of the Ptolemaic system and its failure to even aim at providing true causes. Importantly, through their influence, skepticism was revitalized as a method in natural philosophy. See the entries on medieval skepticism; influence of Arabic and Islamic philosophy on the Latin West; Arabic and Islamic natural philosophy and natural science; Greek sources in Arabic and Islamic philosophy.

3. Whether Newton’s Philosophiae Naturalis Principia Mathematica follows his own Regulae is a separate question. See the entry Newton’s philosophy, especially §10 as well as Smith 2002 and Harper 2011.

4. Positivism was, of course, far more than a methodology for science. In general, the philosophical differences among those figures later identified as positivists were often as great as the similarities. In particular, not all philosophers of science of the period worked solely on the pure logic of science. Moritz Schlick, Otto Neurath, and Philipp Frank all saw in the method of science a tool and an opportunity for addressing social issues. Neurath and Frank, in particular, emphasized the historical and sociological dimensions of method.

5. There is a wide variation from country to country in educational practices and ideologies and it is obviously difficult, if not impossible, to provide a concise summary of how the scientific method has been treated in science education over the last century internationally. Focus here will be on the development in the US for which detailed expositions have been provided by Rudolph (e.g., 2005).

6. These lectures can be found in multiple version at youtube, but also at to be found as video, e.g., at Microsoft's (Project Tuva webpages).

Copyright © 2015 by
Hanne Andersen <>
Brian Hepburn <>

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