Scientific Revolutions

First published Thu Mar 5, 2009; substantive revision Tue Nov 28, 2017

The topic of scientific revolutions has been philosophically important since Thomas Kuhn’s account in The Structure of Scientific Revolutions (1962, 1970). Kuhn’s death in 1996 and the fiftieth anniversary of Structure in 2012 have renewed attention to the issues raised by his work. It is controversial whether or not there have been any revolutions in the strictly Kuhnian sense. It is also controversial what exactly a Kuhnian revolution is, or would be. Although talk of revolution is often exaggerated, most analysts agree that there have been transformative scientific developments of various kinds, whether Kuhnian or not. However, there is considerable disagreement about their import. The existence and nature of scientific revolutions is a topic that raises a host of fundamental questions about the sciences and how to interpret them, a topic that intersects most of the major issues that have concerned philosophers of science and their colleagues in neighboring science and technology studies disciplines. Even if the so-called Scientific Revolution from Copernicus to Newton fits the attractive, Enlightenment picture of the transition from feudalism to modernity (a claim that is also contested), the putative revolutions in mature sciences (e.g., relativity and quantum mechanics) challenge this Enlightenment vision of permanent rational and methodological standards underlying objective sciences and technologies that lead society along the path of progress toward the truth about the world. Today’s scientific realists are the most visible heirs of this picture. Although many philosophers and philosophically or historically reflective scientists had commented on the dramatic developments in twentieth-century physics, it was not until Kuhn that such developments seemed so epistemologically and ontologically damaging as to seriously challenge traditional conceptions of science—and hence our understanding of knowledge acquisition generally. Why it was Kuhn’s work and its timing that made the major difference are themselves interesting questions for investigation, given that others (e.g., Wittgenstein, Fleck, Bachelard, Polanyi, Toulmin, and Hanson) had already broached important “Kuhnian” themes.

Was there a Scientific Revolution that replaced pre-scientific thinking about nature and society and thus marked the transition to modernity? Which later developments, if any, are truly revolutionary? Are attributions of revolution usually a sign of insufficient historiographical understanding? In any case, how are such episodes to be explained historically and epistemologically? Are they contingent, that is, historical accidents and thus perhaps avoidable; or are they somehow necessary to a “progressive” science? And, if so, why? Is there an overall pattern of scientific development? If so, is it basically one of creative displacement, as Kuhn claimed? Do all revolutions have the same structure and function, or are there diverse forms of rupture, discontinuity, or rapid change in science? Do they represent great leaps forward or, on the contrary, does their existence undercut the claim that science progresses? Does the existence of revolutions in mature sciences support a postmodern or “post-critical” (Polanyi) rather than a modern, neo-Enlightenment conception of science in relation to other human enterprises? Does their existence support a strongly constructionist versus a realist conception of scientific knowledge claims? Are revolutions an exercise in rationality or are they so excessive as to be labeled irrational? Do they invite epistemological relativism? What are the implications of revolution for science policy? This entry will survey some but not all of these issues.

1. The Problems of Revolution and Innovative Change

The difficulties in identifying and conceptualizing scientific revolutions involve many of the most challenging issues in epistemology, methodology, ontology, philosophy of language, and even value theory. With revolution we immediately confront the problem of deep, possibly noncumulative, conceptual and practical change, now in modern science itself, a locus that Enlightenment thinkers would have found surprising. And since revolution is typically driven by new results, or by a conceptual-cum-social reorganization of old ones, often highly unexpected, we also confront the hard problem of understanding creative innovation. Third, major revolutions supposedly change the normative landscape of research by altering the goals and methodological standards of the enterprise, so we face also the difficult problem of relating descriptive claims to normative claims and practices, and changes in the former to changes in the latter.

Comparing the world of business innovation and economic theory provides a perspective on the difficulty of these problems, for both the sciences and the industrial technologies change rapidly and sometimes deeply (in the aforementioned ways), thanks to what might be termed “innovation push”—both the pressure to innovate (to find and solve new problems, thereby creating new designs) and the pressure to accommodate innovation (see, e.g., Christensen 1997; Christensen and Raynor, 2003; Arthur 2009). In a market economy, as in science, there is a premium on change driven by innovation. Yet most economists have treated innovations as exogenous factors—as accidental, economically contingent events that come in from outside the economic system to work their effects. It is surprising that only recently has innovation become a central topic of economic theorists. Decades ago, the Austrian-American economist Joseph Schumpeter characterized economic innovation as

the process of industrial mutation—if I may use that biological term—that incessantly revolutionizes the economic structure from within, incessantly destroying the old one, incessantly creating a new one. This process of Creative Destruction is the essential fact about capitalism. [1942, chap. VII; Schumpeter’s emphasis]

Unfortunately, economists largely ignored this sort of claim (made also by a few others) until the recent development of economic growth theory (e.g., Robert Solow, Paul Romer, and W. Brian Arthur: see Beinhocker 2006 and Warsh 2006). The result was an inability of economic models to account for economic innovation endogenously and, thereby, to gain an adequate understanding of the generation of economic wealth.

The parallel observation holds for philosophy of science. Here, too, the leading philosophers of science until the 1960s—the logical empiricists and the Popperians—rejected innovation as a legitimate topic, even though it is the primary intellectual driver of scientific change and producer of the wealth of skilled knowledge that results. The general idea is that the so-called context of discovery, the context of creatively constructing new theories, experimental designs, etc., is only of historical and psychological interest, not epistemological interest, and that the latter resides in the epistemic status of the “final products” of investigation. On this view, convincing confirmation or refutation of a claim enables scientists to render an epistemic judgment that detaches it from its historical context. This judgment is based on the logical relations of theories and evidence rather than on history or psychology. According to this traditional view, there exists a logic of justification but not a logic of discovery. The distinction has nineteenth-century antecedents (Laudan 1980). Cohen and Nagel (1934) contended that to take historical path into account as part of the epistemic assessment was to confuse historical questions with logical questions and thereby to commit what they called a “genetic fallacy.” However, the context of discovery / context of justification distinction (or family of distinctions) is often attributed to Reichenbach (1938). (See the entry on Reichenbach. For recent discussion see Schickore and Steinle, 2006.)

Today there are entire academic industries devoted to various aspects of the topic of scientific revolutions, whether political or scientific, yet we have no adequate general theory or model of revolutions in either sphere. This article will focus on Thomas Kuhn’s conception of scientific revolutions, which relies partly on analogies to political revolution and to religious conversion. Kuhn’s is by far the most discussed account of scientific revolutions and did much to reshape the field of philosophy of science, given his controversial claims about incommensurability, rationality, objectivity, progress, and realism. For a general account of Kuhn’s work, see the entry on Kuhn. See also Hoyningen-Huene (1993), and Bird (2001).

2. History of the Concept of Scientific Revolution

What history lies behind the terms ‘revolution’ and ‘scientific revolution’? The answer is an intriguing mix of accounts of physical phenomena, political fortunes, and conceptions of chance, fate, and history. Originally a term applying to rotating wheels and including the revolution of the celestial bodies (as in Copernicus’ title: De Revolutionibus Orbium Coelestium) and, more metaphorically, the wheel of fortune, ‘revolution’ was eventually transferred to the political realm. The term later returned to science at the metalevel, to describe developments within science itself (e.g., “the Copernican Revolution”). Christopher Hill, historian of seventeenth-century Britain and of the so-called English Revolution in particular, writes:

Conventional wisdom has it that the word ‘revolution’ acquired its modern political meaning only after 1688. Previously it had been an astronomical and astrological term limited to the revolution of the heavens, or to any complete circular motion. [Hill 1990, 82]

Hill himself dates the shift to the governmental realm somewhat earlier, pointing out that the notion of overturning was also present in groups of reformers who aspired to return human society to an earlier, ideal state: overturning as returning. This conception of revolution as overturning was compatible with a cyclical view of history as a continuous process.

It was in the socio-political sphere that talk of revolution as a successful uprising and overturning became common. In this sense, a revolution is a successful revolt, ‘revolution’ being an achievement or product term, whereas ‘to revolt’ is a process verb. The fully modern conception of revolution as involving a break from the past—an abrupt, humanly-made overturning rather than a natural overturning—depended on the linear, progressive conception of history that perhaps originated in the Italian Renaissance, gained strength during the Protestant Reformation and the two later English revolutions, and became practically dogma among the champions of the scientific Enlightenment. The violent English Revolution of the 1640s gave political revolution a bad name, whereas the Glorious Revolution of 1688, a bloodless, negotiated compromise, reversed this reputation.

2.1 Scientific Revolution as a Topic for Historiography of Science

When did the term ‘revolution’ become a descriptor of specifically scientific developments? In the most thorough treatment of the history of the concept of scientific revolution, I. B. Cohen (1985) notes that the French word revolution was being used in early eighteenth-century France to mark significant developments. By mid-century it was pretty clear that Clairaut, D’Alembert, Diderot and others sometimes applied the term to scientific developments, including Newton’s achievement but also to Descartes’ rejection of Aristotelian philosophy. Cohen fails to note that Émilie Du Châtelet preceded them, in her Institutions de Physique of 1740, where she distinguished scientific from political revolutions (Châtelet and Zinnser 2009, p. 118). However, the definition of revolution in the Encyclopédie of the French philosophes was still political. Toward the end of the century, Condorcet could speak of Lavoisier as having brought about a revolution in chemistry; and, indeed, Lavoisier and his associates also applied the term to their work, as did Cuvier to his. Meanwhile, of course, Kant, in The Critique of Pure Reason (first edition 1781), spoke of his “Copernican Revolution” in philosophy. In fact, Cohen (1985) and Ian Hacking (2012) credit Kant with originating the idea of a scientific revolution, although Kant had read Du Châtelet. Interestingly, for Kant (1798) political revolutions are, by nature, unlawful, whereas Locke, in his social contract theory, had permitted them under special circumstances.

It was during the twentieth century that talk of scientific revolutions slowly gained currency. One can find scientists using the term occasionally. For example, young Einstein, in a letter to his friend Habicht, describes his new paper on light quanta as “very revolutionary” (Klein 1963, 59). The idea of radical breaks was foreign to such historians of science as Pierre Duhem and George Sarton, but Alexandre Koyré, in Études Galiléennes (1939), rejected inductivist history, interpreting the work of Galileo as a sort of Platonic intellectual transformation. (See Zambelli (2016) for a revealing account of Koyré’s own background.) In The Origins of Modern Science: 1300–1800 (1949 and later editions), widely used as a course text, Herbert Butterfield, a political historian working mainly from secondary sources, wrote a compact summary of the Scientific Revolution, one that emphasized the importance of conceptual transformation rather than the infusion of new empirical information. The anti-whiggism that he had advocated in his The Whig Interpretation of History (1931) became a major constraint on the new historiography of science, especially in the Anglophone world. In Origins, Butterfield applied the revolution label not only to the Scientific Revolution and to several of its components but also to “The Postponed Revolution in Chemistry” (a chapter title), as if it were a delayed component of the Scientific Revolution. His history ended there. A revolution for Butterfield is a major event that founds a scientific field. Taken together, these revolutions founded modern science. As the title of his book suggests, he was concerned with origins, not with what comes after the founding. In the Introduction he famously (or notoriously) stated that the Scientific Revolution

outshines everything since the rise of Christianity and reduces the Renaissance and Reformation to the rank of mere episodes, mere internal displacements, within the system of medieval Christendom.

For Butterfield, the Scientific Revolution was a watershed event on the scale of total human history, an event that, somewhat ironically and somewhat like Christianity according to its believers, enabled the sciences, to some degree, to escape from history and thereby to become exceptional among human endeavors. Subsequently, A. Rupert Hall, a full-fledged historian of science who worked from primary sources, published The Scientific Revolution: 1500–1800 (Hall 1954). Soon many other scholars spoke of the Scientific Revolution, the achievements of the period from Copernicus to Newton, including such luminaries as Kepler, Galileo, Bacon, Descartes, Huygens, Boyle, and Leibniz.

Then Thomas Kuhn and Paul Feyerabend challenged received views of science and made talk of revolutionary breaks and incommensurability central to the emerging new field of history and philosophy of science. They asserted that major conceptual changes lay in the future of mature, modern sciences as well as in their past. Kuhn (1962, ch. IX) contended that there will be no end to scientific revolutions as long as systematic scientific investigation continues, for they are a necessary vehicle of ongoing scientific progress–necessary to break out of dated conceptual frameworks. In other words, there are both founding revolutions, in something like Butterfield’s sense of threshold events to maturity, and a never-ending series of later revolutions within an ongoing field, no matter how mature it is. However, soon after Structure, Kuhn had second thoughts and eventually abandoned the Butterfield conception of revolution, on the ground that even his so-called preparadigm schools had their paradigms (Kuhn 1974, 460, note 4; details below). So multiple Kuhnian paradigms in long-term competition now became possible.

The Scientific Revolution was the topic around which the field of history of science itself came to maturity. Kuhn’s popularization of the idea that even the mature natural sciences undergo deep conceptual change stimulated much general intellectual interest in the history of science during the 1960s and 1970s. The revolution frame of reference was also a boon to historiographical narrative itself (see Cohen 1985 and Nickles 2006). And by challenging the received, quasi-foundational, Enlightenment conception of science, history of science and related philosophies of science gained great cultural significance for a time.

In recent decades, however, many historians have contested even the claim that there was a single, coherent development appropriately called “the Scientific Revolution.” Steven Shapin (1996, 1) captured the unease in his opening sentence: “There was no such thing as the Scientific Revolution, and this is a book about it.” Everyone agrees that a series of rapid developments of various kinds took place during the period in question, but the operative word here is ‘various’. One difficulty is that no one has succeeded in capturing a 150-year (or more) period of work in an insightful, widely accepted characterization that embraces the important changes in theory, method, practices, instrumentation, social organization, and social status ranging over such a wide variety of projects. The very attempt has come to seem reductionist. Older styles of historical writing were characterized by grand narratives such as “the mechanization of the world picture” (Dijksterhuis 1961; original, Dutch edition, 1950) and humanity’s passage from subjective superstition to objectivity and mathematical precision (Gillispie 1960). Philosophically oriented writers attempted to find unity and progress in terms of the discovery of a new, special scientific method. Today even most philosophers of science dismiss the claim that there exists a powerful, general, scientific method, the discovery of which explains the Scientific Revolution and the success of modern science. Quite the contrary: effective scientific methods are themselves the product of painstaking work at the frontier—scientific results methodized—and are hence typically laden with the technical content of the specialty in question. There is no content-neutral, thereby general and timeless method that magically explains how those results were achieved (Schuster and Yeo 1986, Nickles 2009).

Continuity theorists such as Pierre Duhem (1914), John Herman Randall (1940), A. C. Crombie (1959, 1994), and more recent historians such as Peter Dear (2001) have pointed out a second major difficulty in speaking of “the Scientific Revolution.” It is hard to locate the sharp break from medieval and Renaissance practices that discontinuity historians from Koyré to Kuhn have celebrated. When examined closely in their own cultural context, all the supposed revolutionaries are found to have had one foot in the old traditions and to have relied heavily on the work of predecessors. In this vein, J. M. Keynes famously remarked that Newton was “the last of the magicians,” not the first of the age of reason (Keynes 1947). Still, most historians and philosophers would agree that the rate of change of scientific development increased notably during this period. Hence, Shapin, despite his professional reservations, could still write an instructive, synthetic book about the Scientific Revolution. The most thorough appraisal of historiographical treatments of the Scientific Revolution is H. Floris Cohen’s (1994).

The Scientific Revolution supposedly encompassed all of science or natural philosophy, as it then existed, with major social implications, as opposed to more recent talk of revolutions within particular technical fields. Have there been other multidisciplinary revolutions? Some have claimed the existence of a “second scientific revolution” in the institutional structure of the sciences in the decades around 1800, especially in France, others (including Kuhn 1977a, ch. 3) of a multidisciplinary revolution in the “Baconian sciences” (chemistry, electricity, magnetism, heat, etc.) during roughly the same time period. Enrico Bellone 1980), Kuhn, and others Kuhn have focused on the tremendous increase in mathematical abstraction and sophistication during the early-to-mid nineteenth century that essentially created what we know as mathematical physics. Still others have claimed that there was a general revolution in the sciences in the decades around 1900. (See also Cohen 1985, chap. 6, for discussion of these claims.)

For many historians, ‘the Scientific Revolution’ now describes a topic area rather than a clearly demarcated event. They find it safer to divide the Scientific Revolution into several more topic- and project-specific developments. However, in their unusually comprehensive history of science textbook, Peter Bowler and Iwan Morus (2005) query of practically every major development they discuss whether or not it was a genuine revolution at all, at least by Kuhnian standards. More recently, David Wootton’s (2015) is a revisionist account that returns to a more heroic understanding of the Scientific Revolution.

2.2 Scientific Revolution as a Topic for Philosophy

Commitment to the existence of deep scientific change does not, for all experts, equate to a commitment to the existence of revolutions in Kuhn’s sense. Consider the historically–oriented philosopher Stephen Toulmin (1953, 1961, 1972), who wrote of “ideals of natural order,” principles so basic that they are normally taken for granted during an epoch but that are subject to eventual historical change. Such was the change from the Aristotelian to the Newtonian conception of inertia. Yet Toulmin remained critical of revolution talk. Although the three influential college course texts that he co-authored with June Goodfield recounted the major changes that resulted in the development of several modern sciences (Toulmin and Goodfield 1961, 1962, 1965), these authors could write, already about the so-called Copernican Revolution:

We must now look past the half-truths of this caricature, to what Copernicus attempted and what he in fact achieved. For in science, as in politics, the term ‘revolution’—with its implication that a whole elaborate structure is torn down and reconstructed overnight—can be extremely misleading. In the development of science, as we shall see, thorough-going revolutions are just about out of the question. [1961, 164]

The Toulmin and Goodfield quotation invites us to ask, When did talk of scientific revolutions enter philosophy of science in a significant way? And the answer seems to be: there is a sprinkling of uses of the term ‘scientific revolution’ and its cognates prior to Kuhn, but these were ordinary expressions that did not yet have the status of a technical term.

Given the prominence of the topic today, it is surprising that we do not find the term in Philipp Frank’s account of the positivist discussion group in Vienna in the early twentieth century. However, Frank (1957) does speak of their perception of a “crisis” in modern physics caused by the undermining of classical mechanics by special relativity and quantum mechanics, and it was common to speak of this or that worldview or world picture (Weltanschauung, Weltbild), e.g., the electromagnetic vs. the Einsteinian vs. the mechanical picture. Nor do we find talk of scientific revolutions in the later Vienna Circle, even after the diaspora following the rise of Hitler. The technical term does not appear in Karl Popper’s Logik der Forschung (1934) nor in his 1959 English expansion of that work as The Logic of Scientific Discovery, at least not important enough to be indexed. Hans Reichenbach (1951) speaks rather casually of the revolutions in physics. The technical term is not in Ernest Nagel’s The Structure of Science (1961). Nor is it in Stephen Pepper’s World Hypotheses (1942). It plays no significant role in N. R. Hanson’s Patterns in Discovery (1958), despite its talk of the theory-ladenness of observation and perceptual Gestalt switches. Meanwhile, there were, of course, a few widely-read works in the background that spoke of major ontological changes associated with the rise of modern science, especially E. A. Burtt’s Metaphysical Foundations of Modern Physical Science (1924). Burtt’s book influenced Koyré, who, in turn, influenced Kuhn.

In his retrospective autobiographical lecture at Cambridge in 1953, Popper did refer to the dramatic political and intellectual events of his youth as revolutionary:

[T]he air was full of revolutionary slogans and ideas, and new and often wild theories. Among the theories which interested me Einstein’s theory of relativity was no doubt by far the most important. The others were Marx’s theory of history, Freud’s psycho-analysis, and Alfred Adler’s so-called ‘individual psychology’. [Popper 1957]

And during the 1960s and 1970s, Popper indicated that, according to his “critical approach” to science and philosophy, all science should be revolutionary—revolution in permanence. But this was a tame conception of revolution compared to Kuhn’s, given Popper’s two logical criteria for a progressive new theory: (a) it must logically conflict with its predecessor and overthrow it; yet (b) “a new theory, however revolutionary, must always be able to explain fully the success of its predecessor” (Popper 1975). As we shall see, Kuhn’s model of revolution rejects both these constraints (depending on how one interprets his incommensurability claim) as well as the idea of progress toward final, big, theoretical truths about the universe. Kuhn dismissed Popper’s notion of revolution in perpetuity as a contradiction in terms, on the ground that a revolution is something that overthrows a long and well–established order, in violation of the rules of that order. Kuhn (1970) also vehemently rejected Popper’s doctrine of falsification, which implied that a theory could be rejected in isolation, without anything to replace it. According to Popper, at any time there may be several competing theories being proposed and subsequently refuted by failed empirical tests—rather like several balloons being launched, over time, and then being shot down, one by one. Popper’s view thus faces the difficulty, among others, of explaining the long-term coherence that historians find in scientific research.

Beginning in the 1960s, several philosophers and historians addressed this difficulty by proposing the existence of larger units (than theories) of and for analysis. Kuhn’s paradigms, Imre Lakatos’s research programmes, Larry Laudan’s research traditions (Lakatos 1970, Laudan 1977), and the widespread use of terms such as ‘conceptual scheme’, ‘conceptual framework’, ‘worldview’, and Weltanschauung (Suppe 1974) instanced this felt need for larger-sized units among Anglo-American writers, as had Toulmin’s old concept of ideals of natural order. These stable formations correspondingly raised the eventual prospect of larger-scale instabilities, for an abrupt change in such a formation would surely be more dramatic, more revolutionary, than a Popperian theory change. However, none of the other writers endorsed Kuhn’s radical conception of scientific revolution. Meanwhile, Michel Foucault 1963, 1966, 1969, 1975), working in a French tradition, was positing the existence of “discursive formations” or epistemes, sets of deep-structural cultural rules that define the limits of discourse during a period. Section 5 returns to this theme.

2.3 Criteria for Identifying Scientific Revolutions

I. B. Cohen (1985, chap. 2) lays down four historical tests, four necessary conditions, for the correct attribution of a revolution. First, the scientists involved in the development must perceive themselves as revolutionaries, and relevant contemporaries must agree that a revolution is underway. Second, documentary histories must count it as a revolution. Third, later historians and philosophers must agree with this attribution and, fourth, so must later scientists working in that field or its successors. By including both reports from the time of the alleged revolution and later historiographical judgments, Cohen excludes people who claimed in their day to be revolutionaries but who had insufficient impact on the field to sustain the judgment of history. He also guards against whiggish, post hoc attributions of revolution to people who had no idea that they were revolutionaries. His own four examples of big scientific revolutions all have an institutional dimension: The Scientific Revolution featured the rise of scientific societies and journals, the second was the aforementioned revolution in measurement from roughly 1800 to 1850 (which Kuhn, too, called “the second scientific revolution”; 1977, 220). Third is the rise of university graduate research toward the end of that century. Fourth is the post-World War II explosion in government funding of science and its institutions.

Cohen sets the bar high. Given Copernicus’ own conservatism and the fact that few people paid attention to his work for half a century, the Copernican achievement was not a revolution by Cohen’s lights. Or if there was a revolution, should it not be attributed to Kepler, Galileo, and Descartes? This thought further problematizes the notion of revolution, for science studies experts as well as scientists themselves know that scientific and technological innovation can be extremely nonlinear in the sense that a seemingly small, rather ordinary development may eventually open up an entire new domain of research problems or a powerful new approach. Consider Planck’s semi-classical derivation of the empirical blackbody radiation law in 1900, which, under successively deeper theoretical derivations by himself and (mainly) others over the next two and a half decades, became a pillar of the revolutionary quantum theory. As Kuhn (1978) shows, despite the flood of later attributions to Planck, it is surprisingly difficult, on historical and philosophical grounds, to justify the claim that he either was, or saw himself as, a revolutionary in 1900 and for many years thereafter. (Kuhn 2000b offers a short summary.) Augustine Brannigan (1981) and Robert Olby (1985) defend similar claims about Mendel’s alleged discovery of Mendelian inheritance.

These examples suggest that Cohen’s account of scientific revolution (and Kuhn’s) is tied too closely to the idea of political revolution in placing so much weight on the intentions of the generators. In the last analysis, many would agree, revolution, like speciation in biology, is a retrospective judgment, a judgment of eventual consequences, not something that is always directly observable as such in its initial phases, e.g., in the stated the intentions of its authors. On the other hand, a counterintuitive implication of this consequentialist view of revolutions is that there can be revolution without revolt (assuming that revolt is a deliberate course of action), revolutionary work without authors, so to speak, or at least revolutionary in eventual meaning despite the authors’ intentions. Then why not just speak of evolution rather than revolution in such cases? For, as we know by analogy from evolutionary biology, in the long run evolution can be equally transformative, even moreso (see below).

A related point is that, insofar as revolutions are highly nonlinear, it is difficult to ascribe to them any particular reason or cause; for, as indicated, the triggering events can be quite ordinary work, work that unexpectedly opens up new vistas for exploration. A small cause may have an enormous effect. To be sure, the state of the relevant scientific system must be such that the events do function as triggers, but we need not expect that such a system always be readily identifiable as one in crisis in Kuhn’s sense. Rather, the highly nonlinear revolutionary developments can be regarded as statistical fluctuations out of a “noisy” background of ordinary work. At any rate, on this view it is a mistake to think that explaining revolutions requires locating a momentous breakthrough (Nickles 2012a and b).

What of the common requirement that revolutions be rapid, event-like, unlike the century-and-a half-long Scientific Revolution? Brad Wray (2011, 42f) answers that there is no reason that a revolution need be an abrupt event. What is important is how thoroughgoing the change is and that it be change at the community level rather than a Gestalt switch experienced by certain individuals. (After the original publication of Structure, Kuhn acknowledged his confusion in attributing Gestalt switches to the community as a whole as well as to individuals.) On Wray’s view, evolution and revolution are not necessarily opposed categories. And with this understanding, the Toulmin and Goodfield comment quoted above becomes compatible with revolutionary transformation, which, not surprisingly, takes time to become thoroughgoing. Meanwhile, the Butterfield quotation suggests that what counts as a striking change is a matter of historical scale. By our lights today, 150 years is a long time; but, against the long sweep of total human history, a change of the magnitude of the Scientific Revolution was quite rapid. Perhaps today’s rapid pace of scientific and technological innovation makes us impatient with slower-scaled developments in the past. And it is surely the case the some of the slow, large-scale transformations now underway are scarcely visible to us.

Finally, what of Butterfield’s criterion of broader social impacts? Kuhn retained this criterion in The Copernican Revolution, but revolutions increasingly become changes in specialist communities in his later work, since those communities insulate themselves from the larger society. In the chapter on the invisibility of revolutions in Structure, Kuhn tells us that a tiny subspecialty can undergo a revolution that looks like a cumulative change even to neighboring fields of the same scientific discipline. In this respect Kuhn remained an internalist.

3. Kuhn’s Early Account of Scientific Revolutions

Although virtually no one in the science studies fields accepts Kuhn’s model in Structure as correct in detail, there has been a revival of interest in his views since his death and, more recently, in connection with the fiftieth anniversary in 2012 of the book’s original publication. Some examples are: the fiftieth anniversary edition of Structure itself, including a valuable introduction by Ian Hacking; Kuhn (2000a), a collection that records the later evolution of Kuhn’s thought; Sankey (1997); Bitbol (1997); Fuller (2000); Bird (2001); Friedman (2001); Andersen (2001); Sharrock and Read (2002); Nickles (2003a); González (2004); Soler et al. (2008); Agazzi (2008); Gattei (2008); Torres (2010); Wray (2011), Kindi and Arabatzis (2012), De Langhe (2013), Marcum (2015), and Richards and Daston (2016). Kuhn on revolutions has helped to shape many symposia on scientific realism and related matters, for example, Soler (2008) on contingency in the historical development of science and Rowbottom and Bueno (2011) on Bas van Fraassen’s (2002) treatment of stance, voluntarism, and the viability of empiricism. Since Kuhn’s work is discussed in some detail in other contributions to this Encyclopedia (see, especially, “Kuhn, Thomas”, and “The Incommensurability of Scientific Theories”), a brief account will suffice here. For a detailed reading guide to Structure, consult Preston (2008).

3.1 Kuhn’s Early Model of Scientific Development

According to Kuhn in Structure, a loosely characterized group of activities, often consisting of competing schools, becomes a mature science when a few concrete problem solutions provide models for what good research is (or can be) in that domain. These exemplary problems-cum-solutions become the basis of a “paradigm” that defines what it is to do “normal science.” As its name suggests, normal science is the default state of a mature science and of the community of researchers who constitute it. The paradigm informs investigators what their domain of the world is like and practically guarantees that all legitimate problems can be solved in its terms. Normal science is convergent rather than divergent: it actively discourages revolutionary initiatives and essentially novel (unexpected) discoveries, for these threaten the paradigm. However, normal research is so detailed and focused that it is bound to turn up anomalous experimental and theoretical results, some of which will long resist the best attempts to resolve them. Given the historical contingencies involved in the formation of guiding paradigms as well as the fallibility of all investigators, it would be incredibly improbable for everything to end up working perfectly. According to Kuhn, anomalies are therefore to be expected. Historically, all paradigms and theory complexes face anomalies at all times. If and when persistent efforts by the best researchers fail to resolve the anomalies, the community begins to lose confidence in the paradigm and a crisis period ensues in which serious alternatives can now be entertained. If one of these alternatives shows sufficient promise to attract a dominant group of leading researchers away from the old paradigm, a paradigm shift or paradigm change occurs—and that is a Kuhnian revolution. The radicals accomplish this by replacing the former set of routine problems and problem-solving techniques (exemplars) by a new set of exemplars, making the old practices seem defective, or at least old fashioned.

3.2 Revolution as Incommensurable Paradigm Change

The new paradigm overturns the old by displacing it as no longer a competent guide to future research. In the famous (or notorious)chapter X of Structure, Kuhn claims that the change is typically so radical that the two paradigms cannot be compared against the same goals and methodological standards and values. Moreover, the accompanying meaning shift of key terms, such as ‘simultaneous’, ‘mass’, and ‘force’ in physics, leads to communication breakdown. In effect, scientists on different sides of a paradigm debate “live in different worlds.” Kuhn speaks of scientists experiencing a kind of gestalt switch or religious conversion experience. The heated rhetoric of debate and the resulting social reorganization, he says, resemble those of a political revolution. “Like the choice between political institutions, that between competing paradigms proves to be a choice between incompatible modes of community life” (1970, 94). The comparison of scientific with political revolutions should not surprise, given the entangled history of the term ‘revolution’, but claiming such close similarity enraged philosophical and cultural critics of Kuhn.

The typical paradigm change does not involve a large infusion of new empirical results, Kuhn tells us (chs. IX and X). Rather, it is a conceptual reorganization of otherwise familiar materials, as in the relativity revolution. A paradigm change typically changes goals, standards, linguistic meaning, key scientific practices, the way both the technical content and the relevant specialist community are organized, and the way scientists perceive the world. (For the often neglected practices dimension in Kuhn’s account, see Rouse, 2003.) Nor can we retain the old, linear, cumulative conception of scientific progress characteristic of Enlightenment thinking; for, Kuhn insists, attempts to to show that the new paradigm contains the old, either logically or in some limit or under some approximation, will be guilty of a fallacy of equivocation. The meaning change reflects the radical change in the assumed ontology of the world. A second Kuhnian objection to cumulative progress is what has come to be called “Kuhn loss” (see Post 1971, 229, n. 38). Rarely does the new paradigm solve all of the problems that its predecessor apparently solved. So even in this sense the new paradigm fails completely to enclose the old. The consequence, according to Kuhn, is that attempts to defend continuous, cumulative scientific progress by means of theory reduction or even a correspondence relationship (e.g., a limiting relationship) between a theory and its predecessor must fail. Revolutions produce discontinuities.

Given all these changes, Kuhn claimed that the two competing paradigms are “incommensurable”, a technical term that he repeatedly attempted to clarify. Traditional appeals to empirical results and logical argument are insufficient to resolve the debate. For details of the incommensurability debate, see the entry “The Incommensurability of Scientific Theories.” as well as Hoyningen-Huene and Sankey (2001) as a sample of the large literature on incommensurability.

Naturally, many thinkers of a logical empiricist or Popperian bent, or simply of an Enlightenment persuasion, were shocked by these claims and responded with a barrage of criticism—as if Kuhn had committed a kind of sacrilege by defiling the only human institution that could be trusted to provide the objective truth about the world. Today there is fairly wide agreement that some of Kuhn’s claims no longer look so radical. Meanwhile, Kuhn himself was equally shocked by the vehemence of the attacks and (to his mind) the willful distortion of his views (see, e.g., Lakatos and Musgrave 1970). In later papers and talks, he both clarified his views and softened some of his more radical claims. Critics reacted to the radical views of Paul Feyerabend (1962, 1975) in a somewhat similar manner. (For details, see the entry “Feyerabend, Paul.”)

Given that cyclic theories of history have, for the most part, long given way to linear, progressive accounts, readers may be surprised at Kuhn critic, physicist Stephen Weinberg’s comment that Kuhn’s overall model is still, in a sense, cyclic (Weinberg 2001). In fact, Kuhn himself had already recognized this. After the founding paradigm in Kuhn’s account in Structure, we have normal science under a paradigm, then crisis, then revolution, then a new paradigm—a development that brings back a new period of normal science. At this abstract level of description, the model is indeed cyclic, but of course the new paradigm heads the science in question in a new direction rather than returning it to a previous state. Other commentators, including Marxists, have regarded Kuhn’s mechanism as dialectical, as illustrated by the succession of self-undermining developments in the theory of light, from a Newtonian particle theory to a wave theory to a new kind of wave-particle duality. (For the dialectical interpretation see especially Krajewski 1977 and Nowak 1980 on the idealizational approach to science, as originated by Karl Marx.)

Somewhat ironically, Kuhn’s attempt to revolutionize the epistemology of science has had a wider socio-cultural impact than many scientific revolutions themselves. While some of Kuhn’s doctrines step into the postmodern era, he still had a foot in the Enlightenment, which helps to explain his dismay at the critical reaction to his work and to radical developments in the new-wave sociology of science of the 1970s and ‘80s. For, unlike many postmodernists (some of whom make use of his work), Kuhn retained a scientific exceptionalism. He did not doubt that the sciences have been uniquely successful since the Scientific Revolution. For him, unlike for many of his critics, revolutions in his radical sense were great epistemological leaps forward rather than deep scientific failures. On the science policy front, he intended his work to help preserve the integrity of this socially valuable enterprise. It is on science policy issues that Steve Fuller is most critical of Kuhn (Fuller 2000).

The general problem presented by Kuhn’s critique of traditional philosophy of science is that, although the various sciences have been successful, we do not understand how they have accomplished this or even how to characterize this success. Enlightenment-style explanations have failed. For example, Kuhn and Feyerabend (1975), preceded by Popper, were among the first philosophers to expose the bankruptcy of the claim that it was the discovery of a special scientific method that explains that success, a view that is still widely taught in secondary schools today. And that conclusion (one that cheered those postmodernists who regard scientific progress as an illusion) left Kuhn and the science studies profession with the problem of how science really does work. To explain how and why it had been so successful became an urgent problem for him—again, a problem largely rejected as bogus by many science studies scholars other than philosophers.

Another of Kuhn’s declared tasks in Structure was to solve the problem of social order for mature science, that is, how cohesive modern science (especially normal science) is possible (Barnes 1982, 2003). Yet another was to bring scientific discovery back into philosophical discussion by endogenizing it in his model, while denying the existence of a logic of discovery. Whereas the logical empiricists and Popper had excluded discovery issues from philosophy of science in favor of theory of confirmation or corroboration, Kuhn was critical of confirmation theory and supportive of historical and philosophical work on discovery. He argued that discoveries are temporally and cognitively structured and that they are an essential component of an epistemology of science. In Kuhnian normal science the problems are so well structured and the solutions so nearly guaranteed in terms of the resources of the paradigm that the problems reduce to puzzles (Nickles 2003b). Kuhn kept things under control there by denying that normal scientists seek essential innovation, for, as indicated above, major, unexpected discoveries threaten the extant paradigm and hence threaten crisis and revolution. So, even in normal science, Kuhn had to admit that major discoveries are unexpected challenges to the reigning paradigm. They are anomalous, even exogenous in the sense that they come as shocks from outside the normal system.

But this is the working scientists’ point of view. As noted, normal science is bound to turn up difficulties that resist resolution, at least some of which are sooner or later recognized by the community. In Kuhn’s own view, as a historian and philosopher standing high above the fray, it is deliberate, systematic normal research that will most readily sow the seeds of revolution and hence of rapid scientific progress. According to the old musicians’ joke, the fastest way to Carnegie Hall is slow practice. For Kuhn the fastest way to revolutionary innovation is intensely detailed normal science.

When it comes to revolution on Kuhn’s account, the social order breaks down dramatically. And here his strategy of taming creative normal research so as to make room for articulated discovery (the reduction of research problems to puzzles) also breaks down. Kuhn had to acknowledge that he had no idea how the scientists in extraordinary research contexts manage to come up with brilliant new ideas and techniques. This failure exacerbated his problem of explaining what sort of continuity underlies the revolutionary break that enables us to identify the event as a revolution within an ongoing field of inquiry. As he later wrote:

Even those who have followed me this far will want to know how a value-based enterprise of the sort I have described can develop as a science does, repeatedly producing powerful new techniques for prediction and control. To that question, unfortunately, I have no answer at all…. [1977b, 332]

3.3 Progress through Revolutions

Kuhn’s work on scientific revolutions raises difficult questions about whether science progresses and, if so, in what that progress consists. Kuhn asks (p. 60), “Why is progress a perquisite reserved almost exclusively for the activities we call science” and not for art, political theory, or philosophy? Early critics took him to deny scientific progress, because he rejected the traditional correspondence theory of truth and the related idea of cumulative progress toward a representational truth waiting out there for science to find it. For Kuhn the internalist, the technical goals of science are endogenously generated and change over time, rapidly during revolutions. Yet, somewhat paradoxically, Kuhn regarded revolutions as the most progressive components of his model of science. Unfortunately, he was not able to articulate fully in what that progress consists, given the issues of truth, incommensurability and Kuhn loss, a problem that those who reject convergent scientific realism still face. However, problem-solving know-how and success, including predictive precision, are major components of his answer. “[T]he unit of scientific achievement is the solved problem....” (p. 169). In a retreat from his most radical statements, Kuhn responded to critics by saying that we do possess a general set of scientific values that enables us, usually pretty easily, to order scientific works in historical time according to the degree in which they realize these values. A new paradigm, he says, must always treat successfully a serious anomaly left by the old one as well as opening up new questions for fruitful investigation.

Kuhn’s emphasis on scientific practices, relative to the philosophical state of play in the 1960s, takes up some of the slack left by the rejection of strong realism. His emphasis on skilled practice may have been influenced by Michael Polanyi’s Personal Knowledge (1958), with its “tacit knowing” component, although Kuhn denied that he found Polanyi’s account appealing (see, e.g., Baltas et al., 2000, pp. 296f).

If there have been so many revolutions, then why did the world have to wait for Kuhn to see them? Because, he said, they are largely invisible. For, after a revolution, the winners rewrite the history of science to make it look as if the present paradigm is the brilliant but rational sequel to previous work. The implication is that only someone of Kuhn’s historical sensitivity could be expected to notice this. (Skeptical critics reply that Kuhn invented the problem for which he had a solution.) Indeed, in his large book on the history of the early quantum theory (Kuhn 1978), he moved the origin of the quantum theory revolution forward five years, from Planck in 1900 to Einstein and Ehrenfest in 1905. Revisionist historiography by whiggish scientists, he claimed, had smoothed out the actual history by crediting Planck with a solution that he actually rejected at the time to a problem that he did not then have—and by diminishing the truly radical contribution of Einstein. Kuhn’s move again raises the question whether the authors of a revolution must knowingly break from the received research tradition.

3.4 Revolution or Evolution?

At the end of Structure, Kuhn drew an analogy between the development of science and evolutionary biology. This was surprising, since ‘evolution’ is commonly employed as a contrast term to ‘revolution’. Kuhn’s main point was that evolution ramifies rather than progressing toward a final goal, yet its degree of specialization through speciation can be regarded as a sort of progress, a progress from a historically existing benchmark rather than a progress toward a preordained, speculative goal. So specialization is an indicator of progress. As for revolutions, they correspond to macromutations.

The process described in Section XII as the resolution of revolutions is the selection by conflict within the scientific community of the fittest way to practice future science. The net result of a sequence of such revolutionary selections, separated by periods of normal research, is the wonderfully adapted set of instruments we call modern scientific knowledge. Successive stages in that developmental process are marked by an increase in articulation and specialization. And the entire process may have occurred, as we now suppose biological evolution did, without benefit of a set goal… . [1970, 172f]

At the time, it was striking that Kuhn compared revolutionary transitions, rather than normal scientific developments, with evolutionary change. It seems clear that he did not consider revolution and evolution to be mutually incompatible. But keep in mind that, for him, normal science represents periods of stasis, whereas revolutions are short, highly creative periods that more closely resemble the exploration by random trial and error (p. 87) that we associate with biological evolution. Examined on a minute time scale, however, normal science arguably also involves a (more constrained) variation and selection process, as scientific practitioners search for ways to articulate the paradigm. So, given the inevitability of evolution under such conditions, Kuhn’s treatment of normal science would appear to be too static. The important point here is that, in Kuhn’s view revolution and evolution are compatible when considered on the correct time scales (see Wray 2011 and Kuukkanen 2012). Examined from afar, revolutions are simply the more noteworthy episodes in the evolution of the sciences. Examined up close, they (like discoveries in general for Kuhn) have a detailed structure that is evolutionary, even something as revolutionary as the quantum theory (Kuhn 1978).

But how, then, the reader is entitled to ask, can Kuhn accommodate the sharp discontinuities that he advertised in chapter X of the book? We cannot equate revolutions simply with speciation in Darwin’s own sense, given that Darwin’s favorite mechanism of speciation was anagenesis, not cladogenesis—just the long-term gradual evolution within a single line rather than the splitting of lines. Interestingly, the later Kuhn will opt for cladogenesis.

As many commentators have pointed out, the theory of punctuated equilibrium of Niles Eldredge and Stephen Jay Gould (1992) raises the question of evolution versus revolution, now precisely in the biological (paleontological) context. In fact, Gould and Eldredge were themselves influenced by Kuhn, whom Gould once described as “a dear friend”; but they denied that they had deliberately fashioned themselves as Kuhnian revolutionaries (Gould 1997). Gould and Eldredge end their later review article on punctuated equilibrium by remarking:

[C]ontemporary science has massively substituted notions of indeterminacy, historical contingency, chaos and punctuation for previous convictions about gradual, progressive, predictable determinism. These transitions have occurred in field after field; Kuhn’s celebrated notion of scientific revolutions is, for example, a punctuation theory for the history of scientific ideas. [1993, 227]

Here, as with Kuhn, those who resist Gould’s attempt to sound so revolutionary as to be contrary to Darwin’s phyletic gradualism note that it is only on a geological timescale that such developments as the Cambrian explosion appear to be episodic. When examined on the timescale of the biological generations of the life forms in question, the development is evolutionary—more rapid evolution than during other periods, to be sure, but still evolutionary.

Stuart Kauffman (1993) and Brian Goodwin (1994) defended reorganization in the form of self-organization as the primary macro-biological mechanism, with evolutionary adaptation adding only the finishing touches. Gould and Richard Lewontin had raised this possibility in their famous paper of 1979, “The Spandrels of San Marco and the Panglossian Paradigm.” Applied to the development of science, this view implies that revolutions determine the overall shape, while ordinary scientific work applies the adaptive microevolution. Meanwhile, Michael Ruse (1989) defended the view that the Darwinian paradigm (with its emphasis on function and adaptation) and the punctuated equilibrium paradigm (with its emphasis on Germanic ideas of form and internal constraints) are complementary.

David Hull ended his book, Science as a Process (1988), with the remark that the book can be regarded as an attempt to fulfill both Kuhn’s and Toulmin’s ambitions to provide a evolutionary account of scientific development. Hull’s is the most thoroughgoing attempt to date to provide an evolutionary account of scientific practice, at least in a specific field. However, nothing like Kuhnian paradigms, normal science, and revolutions are to be found in Hull’s book, and this was deliberate on his part. Whereas Kuhn originally said that paradigms correspond one-to-one with scientific communities, Hull rejected Kuhn’s idea of a scientific community as too loose. A scientific community, he said, does not consist of people who merely happen to agree on certain things (anymore than the members of a species are individuals who happen to share a set of traits). Mere consensus is not enough. Rather, communities are tightly causally linked in the right sorts of ways, just as species are. There is no community of biologists or even of evolutionary biologists but only a patchwork of cliques. It is here, locally, that the seeds of innovation are sown, most of which are weeded out in a selective process by the larger group of specialists. Hull’s is a story of the socio-cultural evolution of science without revolution.

4. Kuhn’s Later Account of Scientific Revolutions

In “The Road Since Structure,” his 1990 Presidential Address to the Philosophy of Science Association, Kuhn reported on a book in progress, a project that would remain unfinished at his death. (See also Kuhn 1993.) In this and other fragments of that work, he develops the biological metaphor broached at the end of Structure. He retains his old parallel to biological evolution, that science progresses or evolves away from its previous forms rather than toward a final truth about the world; but he now extends the biological analogy by regarding scientific specialties themselves as akin to biological species that carve out research and teaching niches for themselves. In the process, he significantly modifies his conception of scientific revolutions and attendant claims concerning crises and incommensurable breaks. No longer do we hear of revolutions as paradigm change, certainly not in the sense of large paradigms. In fact, Kuhn prefers to speak of “developmental episodes” instead of revolutions. However, he does retain something of his original idea of small paradigms, the concrete problem solutions that he had termed “exemplars” in the “Postscript-1969” to Structure. Most revolutions, he tells us, are not major discontinuities in which a successor theory overturns and replaces its predecessor. Rather, they are like (allopatric) biological speciation, in which a group of organisms becomes reproductively isolated from the main population.

[R]evolutions, which produce new divisions between fields in scientific development, are much like episodes of speciation in biological evolution. The biological parallel to revolutionary change is not mutation, as I thought for many years, but speciation. And the problems presented by speciation (e.g., the difficulty in identifying an episode of speciation until some time after it has occurred, and the impossibility even then, of dating the time of its occurrence) are very similar to those presented by revolutionary change and by the emergence and individuation of new scientific specialties. …

Though I greet the thought with mixed feelings, I am increasingly persuaded that the limited range of possible partners for fruitful intercourse is the essential precondition for what is known as progress in both biological development and the development of knowledge. When I suggested earlier that incommensurability, properly understood, could reveal the source of the cognitive bite and authority of the sciences, its role as an isolating mechanism was prerequisite to the topic I had principally in mind. … [Kuhn 2000, 98–99]

In short, specialization is speciation, a scientific progress heightens communication breakdown. Experts doing similar kinds of research come to realize that their use of key taxonomic terms no longer jibes with mainline usage, in the sense that what Kuhn calls “the no overlap principle” is violated: the group is using a taxonomic hierarchy for crucial kind terms and the associated categories that is incompatible with that of the established tradition. The group splits off and forms a distinct specialty with its own professional journals, conferences, etc., while leaving the rest of the field largely intact. The incommensurability is now a local, community-licensed, taxonomic one that creates something of a barrier to communication with neighboring specialties. One thinks, for example, of the way different biological specialties employ the species concept itself, and the concept of gene. This linguistic sensitivity as a group identifier permits the kind of fullness of communication, both linguistic and practical, within the group that Kuhn had stressed already in Structure and thus permits the group to progress more rapidly. This multiplication of specialties is the key to Kuhn’s new conception of scientific progress. Two recent books that directly engage these issues are Andersen et al. (2006) and Wray (2011), the first from a cognitive science point of view, the second with emphasis on Kuhn’s social epistemology. See also Nersessian (2003, 2008) and Kuukkanen (2012).

Another striking fact about Kuhn’s last project is the demotion to “a historical perspective” of the history of science as a detailed source of data or phenomena upon which philosophers of science should draw. While Structure was already a curious mix of an inductive, history-based, bottom-up approach to modeling scientific development and a more formal, top-down approach based on Kuhn’s Kantianism (see below), he now concludes that his core position follows from first principles alone.

With much reluctance I have increasingly come to feel that this process of specialization, with its consequent limitation on communication and community, is inescapable, a consequence of first principles. Specialization and the narrowing of the range of expertise now look to me like the necessary price of increasingly powerful cognitive tools. [2000, p. 98]

Thus Kuhn’s new emphasis is on synchronic revolutions, in which a field splits into subfields, rather than on the diachronic replacement of one paradigm complex by another that his early account featured. His conception of a science is therefore less monolithic. A vibrant field such as evolutionary biology can tolerate several distinct species concepts at the same time, a fact that contributes rather than detracts from its vibrancy. The overall result is a less tightly integrated, less dogmatic conception of normal science under an overarching paradigm, a view that has implications also for the necessity and size of future revolutions. For no longer need an esoteric discrepancy get the leverage to trigger a crisis that eventuates in the replacement of an entire, tightly integrated system. In this respect, Kuhn’s conception of physics becomes somewhat closer to Godfrey-Smith’s characterization of progress in biology as “a deluge” rather than a full-scale Kuhnian revolution (see below and Godfrey-Smith 2007). Given that progress in biological evolution is better regarded as the remarkable proliferation of intricate, useful design rather than movement toward a goal, the explicit parallels that Kuhn draws to biological evolution suggest that he is moving toward the same conception of scientific progress as some see in biological evolution—as the proliferation of adaptive design. We may know more about his final position once more of the book manuscript, left incomplete at his death, is published.

5. Larger Formations and Historical A Prioris: The Germanic and French Traditions

We pass now from the smaller-scale revolutions of Kuhn’s later work to large-scale movements that, in several cases, exceed the bounds of the early Kuhnian paradigms and the revolutionary transformations linking them. Other thinkers have gone even further than Kuhn, by positing the existence of cognitive formations that are both broader and deeper than his. One prominent line of thought here is the neo-Kantian one up through Reichenbach and Carnap, discussed and further developed by Michael Friedman (2001, 2003). Another, not entirely distinct, idea is that of a thought style or discursive formation found variously in such writers as Ludwik Fleck (1935), Alistair Crombie (1994), Michel Foucault (1969), and Ian Hacking (1990, 2002, 2012). Especially in the accounts of Foucault and Hacking, new conceptual spaces are constructed and may “crystallize” (Hacking) rapidly. Once they become canonical, they seem to be such obvious frameworks for making true or false claims that the corresponding categories of thought and action appear to be given as part of the nature of things, as written in the language of nature, so to speak, when they are in fact a product of the cultural conditioning of our socio-cognitive systems. In the limit we project our deeply ingrained cultural categories not only onto our world as we encounter it but also onto all (historically) conceivable worlds. The historical change in question, once called to our attention, seems revolutionary—in a manner that is both broader and deeper than the transition to a new paradigm within a particular scientific specialty. Once again, the magnitude of the change is practically invisible to all but the most sensitive archeologist of knowledge. Feyerabend was alive to this perspective in his work on Galileo. But, unlike his treatment of the Copernican Revolution (Kuhn 1957), Kuhn’s revolutions in Structure and beyond are more limited in scope, typically occurring more or less wholly within a single discipline. Nor is it obvious that the emergence of a new thought style must overturn a distinct predecessor. Of course, we should not regard social constructionist / deconstructionist projects (whether or not deliberately designed) as, automatically, ongoing, enlightened processes that “unfreeze” the stones inherited from the past; for it was these very processes that created essentialist constructions in the first place. The claim is that our constructions today are no different.

The four main characteristics of Hacking’s “big revolutions” are that they lead to whole new interdisciplinary complexes, replete with new social institutions and corresponding social changes, and they alter that period’s overall take on, or “feel” for, the universe. For critical discussion of Hacking on styles of reasoning, see Kusch (2010) and Scortino (2016). For more on Hacking, see section 5.3 below.

5.1 Thomas Kuhn: Kantian or Hegelian?

Kuhn several times described himself as “a Kantian with moveable categories.” Hoyningen-Huene (1993) provides a broadly Kantian interpretation of Kuhn (endorsed by Kuhn himself), as does Friedman (2001, 2003, 2010). Given the historical approach of Structure, other commentators have likened Kuhn to Hegel instead of Kant. And given the early Kuhn’s view that scientific reason is manifested more clearly in historical change as well as in normal scientific practices than in symbolic logical structures, Kuhn’s early theory of scientific change can be termed very broadly Hegelian. Also fitting the broadly Hegelian frame is Kuhn’s internalist account of normal scientific research as sowing the seeds of its own destruction through unintended innovation, resulting eventually in a kind of dialectical conflict that drives the enterprise forward. However, there is no Hegelian Spirit lurking within Kuhn’s model, nor a permanent logic of science as its replacement as there was for Lakatos (Lakatos 1970; Hoyningen-Hühne 1993; Bird 2008; Worrall 2003, 2008; Nickles 2009).

Kuhn disliked being compared to Hegel, whose work he found obscure and characterized by a non-naturalistic philosophy of history, but it is worth commenting further on the partial resemblance. Both Kant and Hegel rejected naïve empiricism, according to which all human knowledge arises, somehow, from the accumulative aggregation of individual sensations or perceptions. Kant argued that we need transcendental structures such as a system of processing rules in order to organize sensory input into something coherent and intelligible, e.g., as physical objects interacting causally in space and time. These were Kant’s forms of intuition (in space and time) and categories (substance, causality, etc.). They represent the human mind’s contribution to knowledge. (In this regard Kant can be regarded as a forerunner of cognitive psychology.) Thus, our experience of the world is shaped to fit a priori forms, and this is where the Kantian version of idealism enters the picture: the world of human experience is not the world of ultimate reality (Kant’s unknowable, noumenal world of things-in-themselves); rather, it is a world shaped by our own cognitive structures.

Hegel, one of the founders of the deep conception of historical change broadly characteristic of nineteenth-century German scholarship, proceeded to historicize Kant’s innovation, in effect by historicizing Kant’s categories. They are not inborn, permanent, and universal; on the contrary, they are socio-historically acquired or lost and hence differ from one historical epoch to another. People living in different epochs cognize the world differently. It is tempting to read the Kuhn of Structure as further relativizing and localizing Hegel to specific scientific domains and their paradigms. Kuhn’s model provides endogenous, dynamic mechanisms of (inadvertent) scientific innovations that sow the seeds of the paradigm’s eventual destruction in a vaguely Hegelian sort of dialectical process. It thus becomes possible to experience a change in categorical scheme within one’s own lifetime—the victory of the new paradigm being the small-scale scientific counterpart of Hegel watching Napoleon march in victory through the streets of Jena! Thus it is tempting to regard Kuhnian revolutions as Hegelian revolutions writ small.

Nonetheless, in terms of historical genealogy, Kuhn is better aligned with the Kantian tradition, especially the neo-Kantian relativization of Kant. Interestingly, some logical empiricists (especially Reichenbach) were influenced by the neo-Kantianism of the German Marburg School of philosophy to develop a historically relativized but constitutive a priori (see below and Friedman 2001.)

5.2 The German Neo-Kantian Tradition

There is a long historical gap between Kant/Hegel and Kuhn, and this space is not empty. Many other thinkers, especially those in the various nineteenth-century idealist traditions, were Kantian or Hegelian or neo-Hegelian or neo-Kantian opponents of empiricist positions that they considered naïve, such as that of John Stuart Mill. The neo-Kantian label applies even to prominent logical positivists of the Vienna Circle and logical empiricists of the Berlin Circle, who have too often been caricatured as simple, cumulative empiricists. As Friedman (2001) and others have shown, several founders of twentieth-century academic philosophy of science extended the neo-Kantian attack on simple empiricism. The basic idea here is that, just as Kant regarded any account of perception and knowledge as naïvely empiricist insofar as it left no room for underlying cognitive organizing principles, so any account of the sciences that provided no analogous underlying social-cognitive framework was a continuation of simple empiricism, i.e., a version of “positivism.” In this particular respect, W. V. Quine’s “Two Dogmas of Empiricism” and Word and Object (Quine 1951, 1960) were throwbacks to simple empiricism in their attempt to eliminate the Kantian formal component.

The German Marburg School of Hermann Cohen, Paul Natorp, and Ernst Cassirer was especially important in the emergence of modern philosophy of science in the form of the logical positivism and logical empiricism. Friedman (2001 and elsewhere) has explored its influence on young Reichenbach’s attempt to interpret the significance of the new relativity theory. Rudolf Carnap had been influenced by Ernst Cassirer, among others. (See the entries on logical empiricism, Reichenbach, Carnap, Cohen, Natorp, and Cassirer.) Cassirer’s central theme was the fundamental epistemological implications of the replacement of Aristotle’s subject-predicate logic and substance ontology by the new relational logic of the modern, mathematical-functional approach to nature. This could not be a priori in Kant’s original sense, since the emergence of non-Euclidean geometry had shown that there are alternative organizing principles. But the very fact that we still needed organizing structures that are constitutive or definitive of the cognitive enterprise in question meant that Kant was still basically correct. Like Moritz Schlick, the first leader of the Vienna Circle, Reichenbach of the Berlin school parlayed his engagement with relativity theory and non-Euclidean geometries into a conception of the “relativized a priori.” All of this by around 1920, with the younger Carnap’s views developing during the 1920s and ‘30s. In the USA, meanwhile, C. I. Lewis (1929) was defending his “pragmatic a priori.”

In his famous paper of 1950, “Empiricism, Semantics, and Ontology,” Carnap made his two-tiered view of inquiry quite explicit. Starting from the problem of the existence of abstract entities, Carnap distinguished internal questions, that is, questions that can arise and be answered within a particular logico-linguistic framework, from external questions, that is, meta-level questions about which framework to prefer. External questions cannot be answered in the same, disciplined manner as internal, for choice of framework is ultimately a pragmatic decision based on the expected fertility of using one framework rather than another. Although it is difficult to equate Carnap’s fruitfulness decisions with Kuhn’s revolutionary breaks (Kuhn 1993, 313f), Carnap regarded his vision of science as similar to Kuhn’s, and he liked the manuscript of Structure that Kuhn submitted to the International Encyclopedia of Unified Science, as George Reisch (1991) has shown. Thus the clash of Kuhn’s work with that of Carnap and the positivist movement has been exaggerated.

Although both defended two-tiered conceptions of inquiry, there are important differences between Kuhn and Carnap (as Friedman, 2001, 2003, 2010, among others, observes). For Carnap, as for Reichenbach, the choice of framework or coordinating definitions was conventional, a matter of convenience or heuristic fertility, whereas for committed Kuhnian normal scientists the foundational tenets of their paradigm are deep truths about the world, principles not subject to empirical test. (However, in a crisis situation, fertility becomes a key element in theory and paradigm choice.) In Carnap’s frameworks these were explicit systems of logical rules, whereas Kuhn’s account of normal science largely jettisoned rule-based knowledge in favor of a kind of case-based tacit knowledge, the cases being the concrete exemplars. Third, Kuhn himself emphasized that his approach was historical, whereas Carnap’s was not. Although a Carnapian change from one logical framework to another could, in principle, be quite revolutionary, Carnap himself never emphasized this point, suggested nothing of Kuhn’s radical discontinuity, and was simply not interested in the history of science.

Meanwhile, Friedman himself has extensively developed the idea of historically contingent but constitutive a prioris (e.g., 2001, 2003, 2008). He is sympathetic to Kuhn’s view that revolutions occur when the constitutive principles change. From the old point of view, there is disruptive and incommensurability, but defenders of the new viewpoint manages to establish a kind of continuity. Friedman goes well beyond Kuhn in stressing the role of philosophical ideas in establishing this continuity.

Since deep conceptual revolutions or paradigm-shifts are a fact of scientific life (and, I would argue, a necessity), we are never in a position to make our present constitutive principles as truly universal principles of human reason–as fixed once and for all throughout the evolution of science.
In recent work, Friedman devotes more attention to the social dimension, and he notes that even the standards of rationality may continue to change historically. (See the entry “Historical Theories of Rationality”. See also DiSalle 2002.)

Another development that appeals to Germanic themes in its criticism of naive empiricism is the idealization movement of the Poznań School in Poland, associated especially with Leszek Nowak. This group regards science as developing in an idealizational and dialectical manner, ideas that they trace back to Karl Marx’s analysis of economics, inspired by his own study of Galileo’s fruitful use of abstract, idealized models against the Aristotelians. The Poznań group regards idealization as the secret to modern science and finds it remarkable that virtually all previous analytic philosophy of science remains Aristotelian in treating proposed laws and theories not as ideal models but as true or false statements directly about the real world (Nowak 1980 and later writings; see also Krajewsky 1977). As models, these constructions must be concretized to some degree before they can be applied to the real world. While the idealizationists tend to reject Kuhnian revolutions as too discontinuous and irrational, they do see a resemblance to their internalistic, dialectical conception of scientific development. For them a revolution consists in a new theory or model that reveals a previously unnoticed idealizing assumption built into its predecessor, a change that alters scientists’ conception of what is essential versus peripheral to the domain of phenomena in question. Hence there can be a significant change of world-conception.

There is some affiliation of Poznań with the European structuralist account of theories, based on a set-theoretical analysis of theory structure and theory relations. Kuhn himself was much attracted to Joseph Sneed’s approach (Sneed 1971), soon extended by Wolfgang Stegmüller (1974/1976) and others. Given the informality of Kuhn’s own approach and his explicit shunning of rules and rational reconstructions, his attraction to the structuralist line was initially puzzling. However, the structuralists were and are interested in intertheory relations, and models are central to their non-sentential conception of theories. These are models in the formal sense, but Kuhn found insightful connections to his own use of models in the form of exemplars. For both Kuhn and the structuralists it is the collection of exemplars or models, not an abstract statement of a theory, that carries the weight in scientific inquiry.

Already the early Kuhn, especially in the postscript to the second edition of Structure, largely abandoned the traditional conception of theories as deductive systems, even in physics, and substituted informal collections of models of various, exemplary kinds, along with a toolbox of expert practices for constructing and applying them (Cartwright 1983, Giere 1988, Teller 2008). He always liked Margaret Masterson’s remark that “a paradigm [in the sense of preferred models or exemplars] is what you use when the theory is not there” (Baltas et al. 2000, 300). Such a view, like Nowak’s, anticipates the move from theory-centered to model-centered accounts of scientific work. However, Kuhn’s normal scientific practitioners presumably hold the models to be true in their original application, as is the grand theory incorporated in the paradigm, whereas today the emphasis is on modeling practices across the sciences, in which the models are almost always known in advance to be false because of their employment of idealizations, approximations, abstractions, etc.

5.3 The French Discontinuity Theorists

Meanwhile, important French thinkers had already taken a historical approach, one that explicitly characterizes science as a series of breaks or coupures. The principal genealogy includes Léon Brunschvicg, Gaston Bachelard and his student, Georges Canguilhem, and the latter’s student, Michel Foucault. Neither Kuhn’s historicism nor his talk of revolutionary breaks was news to the French (Gutting, 2001, 2003). The French tradition of science studies, going back to Auguste Comte and including later figures such as Pierre Duhem and Henri Poincaré, possessed a historical dimension that positivism lost after Ernst Mach, as it became logical positivism. However, the French and Germanic traditions have some roots in common. As Gutting points out, Brunschvicg, like Émile Meyerson, was a science-oriented idealist. For him the mind is not a passive wax tablet; rather, it actively forges internal links among ideas, yet it is also often surprised by the resistant exteriority of the natural world. Against traditional metaphysics, philosophy of science should limit itself to what the science of the time allows—but not dogmatically so. For dogmatic attempts to extract timeless principles and limitations (such as Kant’s denial of the possibility of non-Euclidean geometry) may soon be embarrassed by further scientific advances. Einstein’s general theory of relativity exemplifies the revolutionary nature of the most impressive developments.

Bachelard, French physicist and philosopher-historian of science, also believed that only by studying history of science can we gain an adequate understanding of human reason. He stressed the importance of epistemological breaks or discontinuities (coupures épistémologiques). In Le Nouvel Esprit Scientifique (1934), Bachelard argued that the worldview of classical physics, valuable in its own time, eventually became an obstacle to future progress in physics. Hence a break was needed. Here, then, we already find the idea that a successful theory can lose its luster by being considered exhausted of its resources and thus lacking in fertility. Like Brunschvicg, Bachelard held that a defensible, realist philosophy had to be based on the science of its day. Hence, scientific revolutions have (and ought to have) brought about epistemological revolutions. The reality we posit, he said, ought to be that of the best science but with the realization that our concepts are active constructs of our own minds, not imported from nature’s own language, as it were. Future mental activity as well as future empirical findings are likely to require another rupture. As Gutting points out, Bachelard’s account of discontinuity was not as radical as Kuhn’s. Bachelard was willing to speak of progress toward the truth. He made much of the fact that successor frameworks, such as non-Euclidean geometry or quantum physics, retain key predecessor results as special cases and, in effect, contextualize them.

Canguilhem was more interested in the biological and health sciences than Bachelard and gave great attention to the distinction between the normal and the pathological, a distinction that does not arise in physical science. For this and other reasons, in his view, we can expect no reduction of biology to physics. Canguilhem provided a more nuanced conception of obstacles and ruptures, noting, for example, that an approach such as vitalism that constitutes an obstacle in one domain of research can simultaneously play a positive role elsewhere, as in helping biological scientists to resist reductive thinking. Here we find context sensitivities and heuristic resources difficult to capture in terms of a context- and content-neutral logic of science such as the logical empiricists espoused.

Bachelard and Canguilhem also had less disruptive conceptions of scientific objectivity and scientific closure than Kuhn. Canguilhem criticized Kuhn’s (alleged) view that rational closure could not amount to more than group consensus. Both Frenchmen emphasized the importance of norms and denied that disciplinary agreement was as weak as Kuhnian consensus. Kuhn replied to this sort of objection (in “Postscript” and elsewhere) that his scientific communities do possess shared values, that their agreement is not something arbitrary, say, as whipped up by political ideologues.

Foucault’s archaeology of knowledge (Foucault 1966, 1969) posits a distinction between a superstructure of deliberately made observations, claims, and arguments and a deep structure, most elements of which we are probably unconscious. Once again we meet a two-level account. Writes Hacking:

Foucault used the French word connaissance to stand for such items of surface knowledge while savoir meant more than science; it was a frame, postulated by Foucault, within which surface hypotheses got their sense. Savoir is not knowledge in the sense of a bunch of solid propositions. This “depth” knowledge is more like a postulated set of rules that determine what kinds of sentences are going to count as true or false in some domain. The kinds of things to be said about the brain in 1780 are not the kinds of things to be said a quarter-century later. That is not because we have different beliefs about brains, but because “brain” denotes a new kind of object in the later discourse, and occurs in different sorts of sentences. [2002, 77]

Given the influence of Foucault, we may also locate our discussion of Hacking’s own work on historical ontology here (Hacking 2002). Hacking (1975, 1990, 1995, 2012) has studied in depth the emergence of probability theory and (later) of statistical thinking and the construction of the modern self as key examples of what he terms “historical ontology.” He acknowledges inspiration from both Foucault’s discursive formations and Crombie’s styles of thinking (Crombie 1994), with a dose of Feyerabend thrown into the mix. Like Kuhn (and Friedman), Hacking returns to Kant’s “how possible?” question, the answer to which sets out the necessary conditions for a logical space of reasons in which practitioners can make true or false claims about objects and pose research questions about them. Hacking, too, historicizes the Kantian conception. He likes the term ‘historical a priori’, which Canguilhem once applied to the work of his erstwhile student, Foucault.

The historical a priori points at conditions whose dominion is as inexorable, there and then, as Kant’s synthetic a priori. Yet they are at the same time conditioned and formed in history, and can be uprooted by later, radical, historical transformations. T. S. Kuhn’s paradigms have some of the character of a historical a priori. [Hacking 2002, 5]

[S]cientific styles of thinking & doing are not good because they find out the truth. They have become part of our standards for what it is, to find out the truth. They establish criteria of truthfulness. … Scientific reason, as manifested in Crombie’s six genres of inquiry, has no foundation. The styles are how we reason in the sciences. To say that these styles of thinking & doing are self-authenticating is to say that they are autonomous: they do not answer to some other, higher, or deeper, standard of truth and reason than their own. To repeat: No foundation. The style does not answer to some external canon of truth independent of itself. [2012, 605; Hacking’s emphasis]

Hacking describes changes in historical a prioris as “significant singularities during which the coordinates of ‘scientific objectivity’ are rearranged” (2002, 6).

Although reminiscent of Kuhn’s positions in some ways, there are striking differences. As noted above, Hacking’s constructed formations are much broader than Kuhn’s. Thus he feels free to employ telling bits of popular culture in laying out his claims, and he admits to being whiggish in starting from the present and working backward to find out how we got here. Moreover, in mature, modern science, unlike Kuhnian paradigms, several of Hacking’s styles of thinking and doing can exist side by side, e.g., the laboratory and hypothetical modeling traditions. Yet people living before and after the historical crystallization of a style would find each other mutually unintelligible. Hacking recognizes that Kuhnian problems of relativism (rather than subjectivism) lurk in such positions. “Just as statistical reasons had no force for the Greeks, so one imagines a people for whom none of our reasons for belief have force” (2002, 163). This sort of incommensurability is closer to Feyerabend’s extreme cases (as in the ancient Greek astronomers versus their Homeric predecessors) than to Kuhn’s “no common measure” (2002, chap. 11). This sort of unintelligibility runs deeper than a Kuhnian translation failure. It is not a question of determining which old style statements match presumed new style truths; rather, it is a question of the conditions for an utterance to make a claim that is either true or false at all. Writes Hacking,

Many of the recent but already classical philosophical discussions of such topics as incommensurability, indeterminacy of translation, and conceptual schemes seem to discuss truth where they ought to be considering truth-or-falsehood. [2002, 160]

By contrast, Kuhnian paradigms include a set of positive assertions about the world. Yet Kuhn himself was attracted by Hacking’s way of putting the point about truth-and-falsity (Kuhn 2000, p. 99).

5.4 Kuhn’s Relation to the Germanic and French Traditions

To what extent was Kuhn indebted to these thinkers? As noted above, he took Kant but not Hegel very seriously. He was largely self-taught in philosophy of science. Among his contemporaries, he was familiar with Popper but not in any detail with the various strains of logical positivism and logical empiricism, in particular the positions of Carnap and Reichenbach. Apparently, he was only slightly acquainted with the work of Bachelard while writing Structure, and they never engaged in a fruitful interchange (Baltas et al. 2000, 284f). Kuhn did acknowledge, in print and in his classes, the crucial influence on his historical and philosophical thinking of the two Russian émigrés, Émile Meyerson, author of Identité et Realité (1908) and Alexandre Koyré, especially his Études Galiléenes (1939), and that of Annaliese Maier, the German historian of medieval and early modern science. He had read Ludwik Fleck’s Genesis and Development of a Scientific Fact (originally published in German in 1935) and Michael Polanyi’s Personal Knowledge (1958) and had had some discussion with Polanyi (Baltas et al. 2000, 296). Kuhn was also indebted to Wittgenstein, early (“The limits of my language are the limits of my world,” 1922, 148) and late (on language games and forms of life). (See Sharrock and Read 2002, the introduction to Harris 2005, and Kindi 2010 for Kuhn’s relation to Wittgenstein and others.) He knew something of Toulmin’s work.

Kuhn more than anyone in the Anglo-American world pointed out the need for larger-sized units than individual theories in making sense of modern science. Nonetheless, as we have seen, others in the Teutonic and Francophone worlds had previously postulated even larger socio-intellectual units and correspondingly deeper changes than Kuhn’s, on somewhat different scales of intellectual space and time. If we think of authors such as the Annales historian Fernand Braudel, with his distinct time-scales, we recognize that the attribution of transformative change clearly depends heavily on the choice of time-scale and on how fine- or course-grained is our approach. Hacking (2002, 76) makes this point with reference to the French context:

There are two extremes in French historiography. The Annales school went in for long-term continuities or slow transitions—“the great silent motionless bases that traditional history has covered with a thick layer of events” (to quote from the first page of Foucault’s 1969 Archeology of Knowledge). Foucault takes the opposite tack, inherited from Gaston Bachelard, Georges Canguilhem, and Louis Althusser. He posits sharp discontinuities in the history of knowledge.

Although Kuhn emphasized the importance of skilled scientific practice, his paradigms remained closer to the articulate surface of scientific culture than Foucault’s discursive formations, which are better located in the unconscious than in the Kuhnian subconscious. Foucault does not speak of revolution.

6. Other Revolution Claims and Examples

Oliver Wendell Holmes, Jr. (1861) remarked that “Revolutions never follow precedents nor furnish them.” Given the unpredictability, the nonlinearity, the seeming uniqueness of revolutions, whether political or scientific, it is therefore surprising to find Thomas Kuhn attempting to provide a General Theory of Scientific Revolutions (Kindi 2005). Early Kuhn did seem to believe that there is a single, underlying pattern to the development of mature sciences that is key to their success, and late Kuhn a different pattern. Has either early or late Kuhn found such a pattern, or has he imposed his own philosophical structure on the vagaries and vicissitudes of history? Kuhn’s Kantianism always did live in tension with his historicism, and in his late work (e.g., 2000c) he surprisingly gave up the pretense of deriving his pattern of taxonomic change and speciation from history of science, on the ground that it largely followed “from first principles.”

Numerous philosophers, scientists, and other commentators have made claims about scientific change that differ from Kuhn’s. (For a recent selection see Soler et al. 2008.) Some, as we have seen, are skeptical of revolution talk altogether, others of Kuhn’s in particular. Still others accept that some revolutions are Kuhnian but deny that all of them are. One common criticism is that not all revolutionary advances are preceded by an acute crisis, that is, by major failures of preceding research. Kuhn himself allowed for exceptions already in Structure. Another is that revolutionary changes need not involve discontinuities in all of Kuhn’s levels at once (especially Laudan 1984). Yet another is that there need be little logical or linguistic discontinuity. A rapid, seemingly transformative change in research practices may involve simply a marked gain in data accessibility or accuracy or computational processing ability via new instrumentation or experimental design. And on the later Kuhn’s own view, revolution need not be a game of creative destruction. Only a few examples can be considered here.

6.1 Some Alternative Conceptions of Scientific Revolution

Do revolutions consist, according to Kuhn, of major new materials (experimental facts, theories, models, instruments, techniques) entering a scientific domain or, instead, of a major restructuring or rearrangement of materials, practices, and community affiliations already present? Kuhn states that the relativity revolution might serve as

a prototype for revolutionary reorientation in the sciences. Just because it did not involve the introduction of additional objects or concepts, the transition from Newtonian to Einsteinian mechanics illustrates with particular clarity the scientific revolution as a displacement of the conceptual network through which scientists view the world. [1970, 102]

The reader may find this claim confusing, however, because in the just-preceding paragraphs Kuhn had emphasized the ontological and conceptual changes of precisely this revolution, e.g., the radical change in the concept of mass. Einstein’s masses are not Newtonian masses, he insisted. They are newly introduced entities; hence, we may infer, new content. Yet Kuhn surely does have a point worth saving, in that relativity theory still deals with most of the same kinds of phenomena and problems as classical mechanics and employs immediate successors to the classical concepts. But, if so, then reorganization of familiar materials implies a disciplinary continuity through revolution that Kuhn minimized.

That reorganization dominates Kuhn’s conception of revolutions is apparent throughout his work. As a young scholar he had an epiphany when Aristotle’s seemingly radically false or unintelligible claims suddenly came together for him as a coherent, comprehensive worldview. This experience became Kuhn’s psychological model for revolutionary transformation from one paradigm to its successor and informed his later talk of Gestalt switches. But he also emphasized that revolution involves social reorganization of the field (not merely the cognitive reorganization of an individual), from one form of scientific life to another, incompatible with it. By implication, his structural or formal conception of revolution excluded the alternative idea of revolution as extraordinary bursts in substantive content.

In Conceptual Revolutions, Paul Thagard (1992) retains something of Kuhn’s idea of conceptual transformation and the more specific idea of taxonomic transformation. He distinguishes two kinds of reclassification, in terms of the language of tree structures used in computer science: branch jumping and tree switching. Branch jumping reclassifies or relocates something to another branch of the same tree, e.g., reclassifying the whale as a mammal rather than a fish, the earth as a planet, or Brownian motion as a physical rather than a biological phenomenon. New branches can appear and old branches can be eliminated. Meanwhile, tree switching replaces an entire classification tree by a different tree structure based on different principles of classification, as when Darwin replaced the static classification tree of Linnaeus by one based on evolutionary genealogy and when Mendeleev replaced alternative classification systems of the chemical elements by his own table. Taking a computational approach to philosophy of science, Thagard employs his computer program ECHO to reconstruct and evaluate several historical cases of alleged conceptual revolution and arrives at a tamer conception of revolutionary breaks than Kuhn’s.

The Cognitive Structure of Scientific Revolutions by Hanne Andersen, Peter Barker, and Xiang Chen (2006) also devotes a good deal of attention to cognition and categorization issues, in a defense of the later Kuhn’s approach. The work of cognitive psychologist Lawrence Barsalou and of philosopher-historian Nancy Nersessian (the founder of the “cognitive historical” approach to science) plays a significant role in their account. Nersessian herself (2003, 2008) emphasizes model-based reasoning. These are no longer static cases or exemplars, for they possess an internal dynamic.

Howard Margolis (1993) distinguishes two kinds of revolutions, depending on which kinds of problems they solve. Those revolutions that bridge gaps, he contends, differ from those that surmount or penetrate or somehow evade barriers. His focus is on barriers, a neglected topic even though it fits Kuhn’s account of cognition well. Margolis develops Kuhnian themes in terms of deeply ingrained “habits of mind.” While such habits are necessary for efficient scientific work within any specialty discipline, they constitute barriers to alternative conceptions. More broadly, deeply ingrained cultural habits of mind can close off opportunities that, according to the perspective of later generations, were staring them in the face. Margolis is struck by the apparent fact that all the materials for Copernicus’ new model of the solar system had been available, in scattered form, for centuries. No new gap-crossing developments were needed. He concludes that, rather than a gap to be bridged, the problem was a cognitive barrier that needed to be removed, a barrier that blocked expert mathematical astronomers from bringing together, as mutually relevant, what turned out to be the crucial premises, and then linking them in the tight way that Copernicus did. If Margolis’ account of the Copernican Revolution is correct, it provides an example of revolution as holistic reorganization of available materials, hence the non-piecemeal, noncumulative nature of revolutions. The developments that lead to a barrier’s removal can be minor and, as in the case of Copernicus, even quite peripheral to the primary subject matter that they ultimately help to transform. Here one thinks of a model popular with mystery writers, where an everyday observation leads to a sudden change in perspective.

Davis Baird (2004) contends that there can be revolutions in practice that are not conceptual revolutions. He emphasizes the knowledge embodied in skills and in instruments themselves. His central example is analytic chemistry.

There is little doubt that analytical chemistry has undergone a radical change. The practice of the analyst, who now deals with large, expensive equipment, is different than it was in 1930. Modern instrumental methods are by and large more sensitive and accurate, have lower limits of detection, and require smaller samples; different kinds of analyses can be performed. Analytical chemistry is much less a science of chemical separations and much more a science of determining and deploying the physical properties of substances. … The revolutionary phase of Thomas S. Kuhn’s Structure of Scientific Revolutions starts with a crisis, a problem that the established methods of normal science cannot solve (Kuhn [1962] 1970; 1996, ch. 5). There was no such crisis in analytical chemistry. While one might imagine that analytical chemistry underwent a change of paradigm, there was no crisis that provoked this change. Pre-1930 analytical chemists did not bemoan the inability of their chemistry to solve certain problems. Instead, new methods were developed that could solve established “solved” problems, but solve them better: more efficiently, with smaller samples, greater sensitivity, and lower limits of detection. These changes in analytical chemistry do not suffer from any kind of incommensurability: today, one can easily enough understand what analytical chemists were doing in 1900–although the idea that the analytical chemist is one who can quantitatively manufacture pure chemicals is startling on first encounter. … The transformation in analytical chemistry passes all of Cohen’s tests.

Recently, Rogier De Langhe (2012, 2014a and b, 2017) has been developing a broadly Kuhnian, two-process account of science from an economics standpoint. Instead of doing a series of historical cases, De Langhe and colleagues are developing algorithms to detect subtle patterns in the large citation databases now available. De Langhe employs economic arguments to illuminate such themes as the division of cognitive labor, models of scientific progress, and scientists’ decisions about whether to specialize or to innovate.

6.2 Some Biological Cases

The account of the dynamics of science in Structure ill fit the rapid splitting and recombining of fields in the post-World War II era of Big Science, as Kuhn recognized. So he excluded from his account the division and recombination of already mature fields such as happened with the emergence of biochemistry. (This exclusion is troubling, given the universal thrust of his account. It is as if Kuhn admitted that his account applies only to a particular historical period that is now largely past; yet he also wrote as if the normal-revolutionary model would apply to mature disciplines into the long future.) In his later work he did devote careful attention to the division of fields into specialties and subspecialties (see §5). However, he still gave little attention to the more-or-less reverse process of new fields coming into existence by combinations of previously distinct fields as well as to cross- and trans-disciplinary research, in which a variety of different specialists somehow succeed in working together (Galison 1997, Kellert 2008, Andersen 2013).

And what can we make, on Kuhn’s account, of the explosion of work in molecular biology following the Watson-Crick discovery, in 1953, of the chemical structure of DNA and the development of better laboratory equipment and techniques? Molecular genetics quickly grew into the very general field of molecular biology. Less than two decades after Watson and Crick, Gunther Stent could already write in his 1971 textbook:

How times have changed! Molecular genetics has … grown from the esoteric specialty of a small, tightly knit vanguard into an elephantine academic discipline whose basic doctrines today form part of the primary school science curriculum. [Stent 1971, ix]

There is something paradigmatic about molecular biology and also something revolutionary about its rapid progress and expansion. It is not clear how to characterize this and similar developments. Was this a Kuhnian revolution? It did involve major social and intellectual reorganization, one that conflicted with the previous ones in some respects but without undermining the Darwinian paradigm. Quite the contrary. Or is molecular biology more like a style of scientific practice than a paradigm? Such an explosive development as molecular biology hardly fits Kuhn’s description of steady, normal scientific articulation of the new paradigm by puzzle solving. Instead, it seems better to regard it as a large toolkit of methods or techniques applicable to several specialty fields rather than as an integrative theory-framework within one field.

Should we then focus on practices rather than on integrative theories in our interpretation of Kuhnian paradigms? The trouble with this move is that practices can also change so rapidly that it is tempting to speak of revolutionary transformations of scientific work even though there is little change in the overarching theoretical framework (see Part II of Soler et al. 2008). Moreover, as Baird (2004) points out, the rapid replacement of old practices by new is often a product of efficiency rather than intellectual incompatibility. Why continue to do gene sequencing by hand when automated processing in now available? Replacement can also be a product of change in research style, given that, as Kuhn already recognized, scientific communities are cultural communities.

Similar points can be made about the rise of statistical physics, mentioned above in relation to Hacking’s work. (See also Brush 1983 and Porter 1986.) This was an explosion of work within the classical mechanical paradigm rather than a slow, puzzle-by-puzzle articulation of precisely that paradigm in its own previous terms. Or was it? For Kuhn himself recognized that modern mathematical physics only came into existence starting around 1850 and that Maxwellian electrodynamics was a major departure from the strictly Newtonian paradigm. In any case, there was much resistance among physicists to the new style of reasoning. The kinetic theory of gases quickly grew into statistical mechanics, which leapt the boundaries of its initial specialty field. New genres as well as new styles of mathematical-physical thinking quickly replaced old—and displaced the old generation of practitioners. Yet on Kuhn’s official theory of science it was all just “classical mechanics.”

Furthermore, the biological and chemical sciences do not readily invite a Kuhnian analysis, given the usual, theory-centered interpretation of Kuhn. For biological fields rarely produce lawful theories of the kind supposedly found in physics. Indeed, it is controversial whether there exist distinctly biological laws at all. And yet the biological sciences have advanced so rapidly that their development cries out for the label ‘revolutionary’.

What of the emerging field of evolutionary-developmental biology (evo-devo)? It is too soon to know whether future work in this accelerating field will merely complete evolutionary biology rather than displacing it. It does seem unlikely that it will amount to a complete, revolutionary overturning of the Darwinian paradigm. (Kuhn might reply that the discovery of homeobox genes overturned a smaller paradigm based on the expectation that the genetic makeup of different orders of organisms would have little in common at the relevant level of description.) And if it complements the Darwinian paradigm, then evo-devo is, again, surely too big and too rapidly advancing to be considered a mere, piecemeal, puzzle-solving articulation of that paradigm. Based on work to date, evo-devo biologist Sean B. Carroll, for example, holds precisely the complement view—complementary yet revolutionary:

Evo-Devo constitutes the third major act in a continuing evolutionary synthesis. Evo-Devo has not just provided a critical missing piece of the Modern Synthesis—embryology—and integrated it with molecular genetics and traditional elements such as paleontology. The wholly unexpected nature of some of its key discoveries and the unprecedented quality and depth of evidence it has provided toward settling previously unresolved questions bestow it with a revolutionary character. [2005, 283]
Eva Jablonka and Marion Lamb (2005) make even stronger Kuhnian-revolutionary claims for evo-devo, which they see as a partial return to a Lamarckian perspective. It was in his review of their book that Godfrey-Smith (2007) suggested that recent biological progress is a deluge rather than a Kuhnian revolution.

6.3 Nonlinear Dynamics

Kuhn treated a scientific field (and perhaps science as a whole) as a system with a far more interesting internal dynamics than either Popper or the logical empiricists had proposed. The famous opening paragraphs of Structure read as though Kuhn had analyzed a historical time series and extracted a pattern from it inductively as the basis for his model of scientific development. The broadly cyclic nature of this pattern immediately jumps out at dynamical systems theorists. Yet despite this perhaps promising start as an early dynamical modeler of science, Kuhn apparently paid little attention to the explosion of work in nonlinear dynamics that began with “chaos” theory and widened into such areas as complex adaptive systems and network theory. This is unfortunate, since the new developments might have provided valuable tools for articulating his own ideas.

For example, it would appear that, as Kuhnian normal science becomes more robust in the sense of closing gaps, tightening connections, and thereby achieving multiple lines of derivation and hence mutual reinforcement of many results. However, that very fact makes normal science increasingly fragile, less resilient to shocks, and more vulnerable to cascading failure (Nickles 2008). Kuhn claimed, contrary to the expectations of scientific realists, that there would be no end to scientific revolutions in ongoing, mature sciences, with no reason to believe that such revolutions would gradually diminish in size as these sciences continued to mature. But it would seem to follow from his model that he could have made a still stronger point. For Kuhn’s position in Structure arguably implies that, when considering a single field over time, future revolutions can occasionally be even larger than before. The reason is that just mentioned: as research continues filling gaps and further articulating the paradigm, normal science becomes more tightly integrated but also forges tighter links to relevant neighboring fields. Taking these developments into account predicts that Kuhnian normal science should evolve toward an ever more critical state in which something that was once an innocuous anomaly can now trigger a cascade of failures (Nickles 2012a and b), sometimes rather quickly. For there will be little slack left to absorb such discrepancies. If so, then we have an important sort of dynamical nonlinearity even in normal science, which means that Kuhnian normal science itself is more dynamic, less static, than he made it out to be.

It seems clear that Kuhnian revolutions are bifurcations in the nonlinear dynamical sense, and it seems plausible to think that Kuhnian revolutions may have a fat-tailed or power-law distribution (or worse) when their size is plotted over time on an appropriate scale. Each of these features is a “hallmark of nonlinear dynamics” (Hooker 2011A, 5; 2011B, 850, 858). To elaborate a bit: one intriguing suggestion coming from work in nonlinear dynamics is that scientific changes may be like earthquakes and many other phenomena (perhaps including punctuated equilibrium events of the Gould-Eldredge sort as well as mass extinction events in biology) in following a power-law distribution in which there are exponentially fewer changes of a given magnitude than the number of changes in the next lower category. For example, there might be only one magnitude 5 change (or above) for every ten magnitude 4 changes (on average over time), as in the Gutenberg-Richter scale for earthquakes. If so, then scientific revolutions would be scale free, meaning that large revolutions in the future are more probable than a Gaussian normal distribution would predict. Such a conclusion would have important implications for the issue of scientific realism.

To be sure, working out such a timescale of revolutions and their sizes in the history of science would be difficult and controversial, but Nicholas Rescher (1978, 2006) has begun the task in terms of ranking scientific discoveries and studying their distribution over time. Derek Price (1963) had previously introduced quantitative historical considerations into history of science, pointing out, among many other things, the exponential increase in the number of scientists and quantity of their publications since the Scientific Revolution. Such an exponential increase, faster than world population increase, obviously cannot continue forever and, in fact, was already beginning to plateau in industrialized nations in the 1960s. Among philosophers, Rescher was probably the first to analyze aggregate data concerning scientific innovation, arguing that, as research progresses, discoveries of a given magnitude become more difficult. Rescher concludes that we must eventually expect a decrease in the rate of discovery of a given magnitude and hence, presumably, a similar decrease in the rate of scientific revolutions. Although he does not mention Schumpeter in this work, he expresses a similar view:

Scientific progress in large measure annihilates rather than enlarges what has gone before—it builds the new on the foundations of the ruins of the old. Scientific theorizing generally moves ahead not by addition and enlargement but by demolition and replacement. [1978, p. 82, Rescher’s emphasis]

This broadly Kuhnian position position on the number and magnitude of revolutions contrasts sharply with Butterfield’s, who saw revolutions only as founding revolutions, and also with that of those epistemological realists who grant that revolutionary conceptual and practical changes have occurred but who believe that they will become successively smaller in the future as science approaches the true theory. Kuhn’s own later position, in which specialties are insulated from one another by taxonomic incommensurability, presents us with a somewhat less integrated conception of science and thus one less subject to large-scale revolutionary disruption. Since we can regard scientific practices and organization as highly designed technological systems, the work of Charles Perrow and others on technological risk is relevant here. (See Perrow 1984 for entry into this approach.)

Margolis (1993) notes the importance of the phenomenon of “contagion,” in which new ideas or practices suddenly reach a kind of social tipping point and spread rapidly. Contagion is, of course, necessary for a revolt to succeed as a revolution. Today, contagion is a topic being studied carefully by network theorists and popularized by Malcolm Gladwell’s The Tipping Point (2000). Steven Strogatz, Duncan Watts, and Albert-László Barabási are among the new breed of network theorists who are developing technical accounts of “phase changes” resulting from the growth and reorganization of networks, including social networks of science—a topic dear to the early Kuhn’s heart as he struggled with the themes of Structure (see Strogatz, 2003, chap. 10; Watts 1999; Newman 2001; Barabási 2002; Buchanan 2002).

Does the emergence to prominence of “chaos theory” (nonlinear dynamics) itself constitute a scientific revolution and, if so, is it a distinctly Kuhnian revolution? In recent years several writers, including both scientists and science writers, have attempted to link Kuhn’s idea of revolutionary paradigm shifts to the emergence of chaos theory, complexity theory, and network theory (e.g., Gleick 1987, chap. 2, on the chaos theory revolution; Ruelle 1991, chap. 11; Jen in Cowan et al. 1999, 622f, on complexity theory; and Buchanan 2002, 47, on network theory). Interestingly, some authors reapply these ideas to Kuhn’s account itself, theoretically construing revolutionary paradigm shifts as phase changes or as nonlinear jumps from one strange attractor or one sort of network structure to another.

Steven Kellert (1993) considers and rejects the claim that chaos theory represents a Kuhnian revolution. Although it does provide a new set of research problems and standards and, to some degree, transforms our worldview, it does not overturn and replace an entrenched theory. Kellert argues that chaos theory does not even constitute the emergence of a new, mature science rather than an extension of standard mechanics, although it may constitute a new style of reasoning.

Kellert’s position hangs partly on how we construe theories. If a theory is just a toolbox of models, something like an integrated collection of Kuhnian exemplars (Giere 1988, Teller 2008), then the claim for a revolutionary theory development of some kind becomes more plausible. For nonlinear dynamics highlights a new set of models and the strange attractors that characterize their behaviors. In addition, complex systems theorists often stress the holistic, anti-reductive, emergent nature of the systems they study, by contrast with the linear, Newtonian paradigm. Kuhn wrote that one way in which normal science articulates its paradigm is by “permitting the solution of problems to which it had previously only drawn attention.” But had not classical dynamics suppressed rather than drawn attention to the problems of chaos theory and the various sorts of complexity theory and network theory that are much studied today? Still, it is easy to agree with Kellert that this case does not fit Kuhn’s account neatly. To some readers it suggests that a more pluralistic conception of scientific revolutions than Kuhn’s is needed.

Kellert also questions whether traditional dynamics was really in a special state of crisis prior to the recent emphasis on nonlinear dynamics, for difficulties in dealing with nonlinear phenomena have been apparent almost from the beginning. Since Kuhn himself emphasized, against Popper, that all theories face anomalies at all times, it is unfortunately all too easy, after an apparently revolutionary development, to point back and claim crisis.

6.4 The Essential Tension between Tradition and Innovation

Kuhn’s work called attention to what he called “the essential tension” between tradition and innovation (Kuhn 1959, 1977a). While he initially claimed that his model applied only to mature natural sciences such as physics, chemistry, and parts of biology, he believed that the essential tension point applies, in varying degrees, to all enterprises that place a premium on creative innovation. His work thereby raises interesting questions, such as which kinds of social structures make revolution necessary (by contrast with more continuous varieties of transformative change) and whether those that do experience revolutions tend to be more progressive by some standard.

Some analysts agree that casting the net more widely might shed comparative light on scientific change, and that Kuhn’s model is too restrictive even when applied only to the mature sciences. We have already met several alternative conceptions of transformative change in the sciences. Kuhn believed that innovation in the arts was often too divergent fully to express the essential tension. By contrast, the sciences, he claimed, do not seek innovation for its own sake, at least normal scientists do not.

But what about technological innovation (which is often closely related to mature science) and what about business enterprise more generally? There are, of course, important differences between the products of basic scientific research and commercial products and services, but there are enough similarities to make comparison worthwhile—the more so with today’s emphasis on translational science. And in the sciences as well as economic life there would seem to be other forms of displacement than the logical and epistemological forms commonly recognized by philosophers of science. Consider the familiar economic phenomenon of obsolescence, including cases that lead to major social reorganization as technological systems are improved. Think of algorithmic data mining and statistical computation, robotics, and the automation to be found in any modern biological laboratory. In The Innovator’s Dilemma (1997), economist Clayton Christensen denies that major technological breakthroughs are either necessary or sufficient for disruptive innovation. In that and later work he distinguishes sustaining technologies that make incremental improvements of a company’s sales leaders from two kinds of disruptive technologies. “New-market disruptions” appeal to a previously non-existent market, whereas “low-market” or “low-end disruptions” provide simpler and cheaper ways to do things than do the leading products and services. Such companies can sometimes scale up their more efficient processes to displace the major players, as did Japanese steel makers to the big U.S. corporations. There would seem to be parallels in the history of science.

Speaking of technological developments, philosophers, including Kuhn, have undervalued a major source of transformative developments, namely, material culture, specifically the development of new instruments. There is, however, a growing literature in history and sociology of science and technology. A good example is Andy Pickering’s discussion of the conception and construction of the large cloud chamber at Lawrence Berkeley Laboratory (Pickering 1995). Pickering’s Constructing Quarks (1984), Peter Galison’s How Experiments End (1987) and Image and Logic (1997), and Sharon Traweek’s Beamtimes and Lifetimes (1988) describe the cultures that grew up around the big machines and big theories of high-energy physics in the U.S., Europe, and Japan. As he himself recognized, Kuhn’s model of rapid change runs into increasing difficulty with the Big Science of the World War II era and beyond. But a similar point extends to smaller-scale material practices as documented by much recent research, as in Baird (2004), discussed above. One line of fruitful investigation has been that of the Social Construction of Technology (SCOT) program of Trevor Pinch and Wiebe Bijker (see Bijker et al. 1987 and a good deal of later work). Such work takes place on all scales.

In Structure and later writings, Kuhn locates revolutionary change both at the logico-semantical and methodological level (incompatibility between successor and predecessor paradigm) and at the level of form of community life and practice. But does the latter always require the former? Perhaps expressions such as “the problem of conceptual change” and “breaking out of the old conceptual framework” have led philosophers to over-intellectualize historical change. As we know from the history of economics and business, one form of life can replace another in various ways without being based directly upon a logical or semantic incompatibility. The old ways may be not wrong but simply obsolete, inefficient, out of fashion—destroyed by a process that requires more resources than simple logical relations to understand it. There can be massive displacement by non-logical means. Many have argued that Kuhn’s semantic holism, with its logical-relational underpinnings, led him to underappreciate how flexible scientists and technologists can be at the frontiers of research (Galison 1997). Having distinguished the working scientists’ point of view from those of the historian and the philosopher, looking down from above, he proceeded to confuse them. Retrospectively, as many commentators have noted, we can view Kuhn on scientific revolutions as a transitional figure, more indebted to logical empiricist conceptions of logic, language, and meaning than he could have recognized at the time, while departing sharply from the logical empiricists and Popper in other respects.


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Copyright © 2017 by
Thomas Nickles

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