Obligations to Oneself
Moral philosophy is often said to be about what we owe to each other. Do we owe anything to ourselves?
Philosophers are torn. On the one hand, obligations to self are a mainstay of moral theories – most famously Kant’s – as well as ordinary thinking. It is not just academic Kantians who believe in making something of our lives and standing up for ourselves. And yet, the idea of literally owing things to oneself can sound paradoxical. When I owe you $5, I am bound to pay. When you owe me $5, I can waive the debt away. Now suppose I owe myself $5. Don’t I then have the power to waive my own obligation? But then how could it bind me? An obligation I can escape at will is like a prison with an open gate, a speed limit with no penalty. Such an obligation seems powerless, toothless, imperceptible – in other words, it seems like no obligation at all.
This paradox has cast a long shadow. In the 20th century, obligations to oneself “largely disappeared from the radar of academic philosophers” (Cholbi 2015, 852), as the traditional question of what we owe to ourselves gave way to doubts about whether such obligations are even coherent.
But in the new century, the topic has enjoyed a renaissance, with fresh theories cropping up for the first time in decades and applications arising across a range of fascinating issues: privacy and promises, self-respect and supererogation, tech-addiction and tattoos. Some have even wondered, echoing Kant, if the topic might lie at the very heart of ethics.
We begin with the question of what obligations to oneself are supposed to be (§1). From there we lay out the “paradox” and its history (§2), along with the three theories that have arisen in response (§§3–5). We conclude (§7) after a survey of applied issues (§6), focusing on topics of broad interest, but sprinkling in a few specifics – like Kant’s qualms about haircuts – for the sake of spice.
- 1. What is an obligation to oneself?
- 2. The Paradox of Self-Release
- 3. Denying obligations to oneself
- 4. Unwaivable obligations to oneself
- 5. Waivable obligations to oneself
- 6. Applications
- 7. Conclusion
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
1. What is an obligation to oneself?
The traditional examples of obligations to oneself are a hodgepodge, but they basically come in two kinds: self-care and self-respect (Allen 2013, 854). Self-care is a matter of promoting our own interests – pursuing our dreams, minding our health, preserving our lives. Self-respect, meanwhile, is less about what is good for us, and more about what is proper or dignified; think of prohibitions on safe and profitable sex work, or taboos around painless suicide even in the shadow of an agonizing terminal disease. As these examples show, self-care and self-respect can be in tension. “Disrespecting” oneself might be the best way to escape a miserable death or a life in poverty.
The tension here is so deep that many philosophers claim to only believe in one of these two kinds of duty, while totally rejecting the other. At one point in his Lectures on Ethics [LE], Kant suggests that we only owe ourselves respect: “self-regarding duties…have nothing to do with well-being and our temporal happiness” (LE 27:341). Utilitarians, who think morality is all about well-being, are open at most to duties of self-care; they do not share the Kantians’ concerns about ending one’s life or selling access to one’s body when the result is greater well-being overall (see, e.g., Meiland 1963).
With such stark disagreement, it is natural to wonder if the debate here is really focused on a single concept of “obligations to oneself.” In fact, it is often not. The variety in the examples reflects a more basic variety in concepts. The most crucial distinction here – essential to everything ever written on duties to oneself – is between an obligation owed to oneself, and one merely regarding oneself.
Suppose you promise your friend to stop wearing tacky hats. As a result of the promise, you owe it to your friend to dress better; in this sense, the obligation is “to” your friend, not to you. But this is still an obligation regarding you, in the sense that it concerns what you do to yourself. You are the one whose headgear is at issue. (This sort of example is common in the literature; see, e.g., Mavrodes 1964, 165–66; Timmermann 2006, 506.)
It is an open question what an obligation to someone consists in, if it is something over and above mere regard (see Thompson 2004 on “bipolar normativity,” Darwall 2006 on “second-personal” address, and Schofield 2022 [Other Internet Resources]). “Interest theories” say that an obligation to you is somehow linked to what is good for you (see, e.g., Raz 1986, chap. 5). “Standing theories,” which are more popular in writings on obligations to oneself, say that obligations to you put you in control. For Gilbert (2018) and Darwall (2006, 18), the distinctive thing is that you have the standing to demand what is owed to you. For Schofield (2021, 52), the key is that you get “a rightful say.” For Steiner (2013), you have the power to waive the obligation via your powers of consent.
Suffice it to say, the exact essence of an obligation to oneself is still up for debate. By contrast, everyone knows what self-regarding obligations are, and everyone agrees that we might have them – duties to maintain one’s health so as to take care of one’s family; to wear a mask to avoid spreading contagion; and so on. Indeed, it is hard to imagine an obligation that isn’t somehow self-regarding.
It is far more controversial to say we have bona fide obligations to ourselves – that is, owed to ourselves, strictly speaking, just as you might owe it to your friend to keep your promise. The idea of literally owing something to oneself seems to imply that we have rights against ourselves, along with the power to release ourselves from duties (see §2, below). To avoid this paradox, many traditional “obligations to oneself” have been recast as, or replaced with, obligations merely regarding oneself. Aristotle argues that suicide is not an “injustice towards oneself,” but only towards the state that one is supposed to serve (1138a 4–1138b 11). Some argue that self-care is not owed to oneself, or even to others; it is obligatory only in the sense that we have to do it. (It is an “undirected” rather than a “directed” obligation.) And the duty to develop one’s talents might be seen as part of a duty to promote the good of others: think of a lifeguard swimming laps or a surgeon doing hand exercises.
Another way around the paradox is to say that obligations to oneself don’t imply any quixotic power of self-release. To make this view work, we need some way of interpreting “obligations to oneself” so that they aren’t quite like the legalistic obligations we get from promises and contracts. Some say “obligations” to oneself are in some sense non-legal; others say one can owe things “to” oneself only in an attenuated sense; and some even consider shifting the referent of “oneself” – perhaps we only owe things to our future selves, or one aspect of our psyche owes it to another.
Much as the Liar Paradox shaped modern theories of truth, the threat of paradox has profoundly shaped our theories of obligations to oneself. Let’s take a closer look at the paradox before tracing its influence on contemporary work.
2. The Paradox of Self-Release
What’s so weird about obligations to oneself?
One thing to note – not quite our topic, but important to clear up – is that many moral wrongs can be done only to other people. You cannot steal your own lunch money, deceive yourself with lying promises, or bop yourself on the head against your own will. Who could be duped by a promise they know to be false? (See Hill, Jr. 1991, 144.) How can one “steal” what one already owns? (See Haase 2014, 365.) How can one will things against one’s own will?
This familiar fact – that some wrongs can be done to others but not to ourselves – is called the asymmetry of possibilities (Muñoz and Baron-Schmitt 2022 [Other Internet Resources]). This asymmetry constrains the scope of self-wronging; some naughty interactions are impossible in the one-person case. But this does not rule out all possible obligations to oneself. There are still plenty of problematic things one can do to oneself: bodily harm, property damage, and so on. Could we wrong ourselves by doing such things, or is there something fishy about the very idea of an obligation to oneself?
Now the real paradox. The tension arises from the dual nature of obligations: they are supposed to be both binding and waivable. Your obligations “bind” you in the sense that you have to comply, other things equal, or else you wrong the person to whom you are obliged. But this person can, if they like, waive the obligation, releasing you from your duty. This duality is perfectly intelligible in the two-person case. If you owe your friend $5 for a fancy coffee, you are bound to pay – you cannot simply opt out, as you might opt out of a mailing list or a volunteer trip. And if your friend wants to unbind you, they can do so unmysteriously, simply by saying “My treat.”
What if you owe something to yourself? Then the “binding” seems to vanish. Since you can willy-nilly waive any obligation owed to you, you can willy-nilly waive any obligation to yourself. Any such obligation is therefore purely optional – which sounds incoherent, like an obligatory hobby or a mercenary passion project.
The modern version of the paradox is due to Marcus Singer (1959, 203), who frames it as an argument with three premises:
- If A has a duty to B, then B has a right against A.
- If B has a right against A, he [or she] can give it up and release A from the obligation.
- No one can release himself [or herself] from an obligation.
Together, these ensure that one cannot have duties to oneself. (“Duties” are just “obligations” with fewer syllables.) It’s a punchy argument. Duties entail rights; rights entail powers of release; but one cannot release oneself from a duty. The conclusion, for Singer, is that one cannot have a duty to oneself; the very idea of such a duty is “self-contradictory” (1958, 203).
Singer’s spin on the paradox is clear and forceful. It also crucially involves the concept of a right, which is used to link duties to the power of release. But otherwise, the puzzle merely echoes several historical sources, which Singer does not cite or engage with (see Cholbi 2015). For example, here is Immanuel Kant.
If the I that imposes obligation is taken in the same sense as the I that is put under obligation, a duty to oneself is a self-contradictory concept. … [O]ne imposing obligation (auctor obligationis) could always release the one put under obligation (subjectum obligationis) from the obligation (terminus obligationis), so that (if both are one and the same subject) he would not be bound at all to a duty he lays upon himself. This involves a contradiction. (Metaphysics of Morals [MM] 6:417)
Notice the same emphasis on “self-contradiction.” And here is Thomas Hobbes, discussing legal rather than moral obligations:
The sovereign of a commonwealth, be it an assembly, or one man, is not subject to the civil laws. For having power to make, and repeal laws, he may, when he pleaseth, free himself from that subjection by repealing those laws that trouble him and making of new; and consequently he was free before. For he is free, that can be free when he will; nor is it possible for any person to be bound to himself, because he that can bind can release; and therefore, he that is bound to himself only is not bound. (1651 [1994, 174])
“He is free, that can be free when he will” is just another way of saying that one cannot release oneself from a genuine obligation. When self-release is an option, one is never really bound.
What’s the solution?
We have three options. The first is to follow the argument where it leads – namely, to Singer’s nihilism, on which there is no such thing as a duty to self. The next option, which is the most popular among ethicists, is to defend unwaivable duties to oneself. Finally, some argue that self-release is not as incoherent as it sounds, and that we really do have waivable duties to, and maybe even rights against, ourselves.
The choice between these three options is a crossroads in moral philosophy; in effect, we are choosing the place of the self within moral theory. Singer says there is no place for the self in morality. The Kantians – the chief defenders of unwaivable duties to self – are more likely to place the self at the privileged center. And those who believe in self-release see the self as just one moral person among others, denying or downplay the specialness of one’s relation to oneself.
On what grounds have philosophers chosen one road over the others? Where have their choices led them?
3. Denying obligations to oneself
Let’s start with Singer’s view, which is that, as shown by the paradox, there can be no obligations to oneself. There may be self-regarding obligations owed to other people; there may be decisive reasons to be prudent. But no one ever literally owes anything to oneself, morally speaking. On the extreme version of this view, no one even has a moral reason to promote their own interests as such (see, e.g., Finlay 2007).
Singer gets points for dispensing with the paradox. He doesn’t posit duties to self, and he has a principled reason for not doing so: given the possibility of self-release, a duty to oneself would not be binding – which means it would lack the core property of any duty that deserves the name.
The challenge for Singer’s view is that it is revisionary, obliterating half of the classic distinction between duties to self and duties to others – a distinction that “seems well embedded both in traditional moral philosophy and in ordinary moral thinking” (Singer 1958, 202).
Perhaps it is all right for Singer to dispute traditional wisdom. It would not be the first time a tradition got something wrong. Besides, as we have noted, there is an equally distinguished tradition of skepticism about obligations to oneself. Even Kant, the chief defender of duties to self, has wary moments (see §2, 4). Deference to the past isn’t decisive here.
What about ordinary thought? If duties to self are really “embedded” in common sense, that is certainly some reason to reject Singer’s argument, or at least to look for ways out.
Singer himself suggests that we should not take our ordinary moral discourse too seriously. When we talk of duties to oneself, our language “must be metaphorical” (1958, 203). He explains:
To say that someone has a duty to (or owes it to) himself to do something is an emphatic way of asserting that he has a right to do it – that there are no moral considerations against it – and that it would be foolish or imprudent for him not to. (1958, 203)
Similarly, Singer thinks, when you “promise yourself” to do something, you must really be expressing your resolve to do it (see also Haase 2014, 364; Hills 2003, 131–33).
There are three questions we might ask about Singer’s interpretation of ordinary talk. First, Anita Allen questions why we shouldn’t take people literally in these contexts:
Figures of speech abound in language. But in the case of statements about duties to oneself, why suppose we do not mean exactly what we say? A moral theory should explain rather than discount inconvenient moral discourse (2013, 859)
Second, and related, we could ask if Singer’s position does justice to the thoughts behind the talk. Consider a few basic questions: is it morally all right to risk dire injuries to oneself for a cheap thrill? To debase oneself for a few bucks? To accept humiliation from peers for the sake of fitting in? One might well say no, even if these actions are certain to harm nobody but oneself. This is more than a linguistic habit that philosophers should be able to explain. These are considerable – though still contestable – moral intuitions, and the appeal to metaphors may not be enough to overturn them.
Finally, Singer’s view seems to suggest that we should be happy to talk, at least metaphorically, of rights against oneself – which, in fact, we are not. For Singer, “promises to oneself” are just statements of resolve, and “duties to oneself” are exaggerated ‘oughts’. Presumably, “rights against oneself” would be understood metaphorically, as well. And yet, no one is willing to talk of rights against oneself. Why? The answer cannot just be that these rights are “surely nonsense” (Singer 1958, 202). For Singer, duties to oneself by definition entail rights against oneself, so the duties should be at least as nonsensical. This is a fact about ordinary talk that Singer seems unable to account for.
Stepping back from Singer for a moment, there does seem to be something distinctive about the realm of rights, as opposed to other parts of morality. Rights are waived by consent and created by contracts. Rights imply authority. If you rightfully own a bicycle, then when it comes to who gets to ride it, you are the boss. (This is especially clear on “standing theories.” See §1 above.)
We now turn to the most popular response to the paradox, which is to rescue obligations to oneself by airlifting them out of the realm of rights. We can owe things to ourselves precisely because owing does not imply rights or the authority to waive. Even if self-release is impossible, there could still be unwaivable obligations to oneself.
4. Unwaivable obligations to oneself
The most popular response to the paradox is to insist that duties to oneself exist while denying that they imply waivable rights against oneself. This means rejecting either the first or second premise of Singer’s argument:
- If A has a duty to B, then B has a right against A.
- If B has a right against A, he [or she] can give it up and release A from the obligation.
- No one can release himself [or herself] from an obligation.
Either duties don’t entail rights, or rights don’t always grant the power of release.
One of Singer’s first critics, Daniel Kading (1959), defends rights without release. Kading says we only have rights against people with whom we have struck some kind of agreement – like a promise or contract – and sometimes, these people aren’t around to release us. They might, for example, be dead. There is no hope of release in such a scenario, and yet the right remains. But even if this correct, it won’t do anything to establish duties to oneself (as Kading seems to admit). There is something fishy about the idea of “agreements” with oneself, and, as Muñoz (2020, 694) points out, the deathbed promise has no one-person analogue. (See Singer 1963, 133–35, for further objections.)
Kading next tries a different maneuver, which has become a classic. He distinguishes two kinds of “obligations-to.” One typically springs from promises and contracts (the “agreement-sense”), and the other has to do with affecting people’s interests (the “benefits-sense”). Kading agrees with Singer that we can’t have obligations to ourselves in the first way, but insists that we can in the second. We are “morally obligated” to “maximize goodness” even when that just means making ourselves happy (Kading 1959, 156).
This same move shows up all over, particularly in the work of Kantian ethicists, who draw not on Kading but on Kant’s distinction between “juridical” and “non-juridical” duties (see MM 6:383, LE 29:117, 632). Juridical duties are external, concerning acts rather than motives, and enforceable by coercion and demands. For example, if you threaten not to pay me the money you contractually owe me, I can demand that you fork over the cash, and I can sue you if you don’t. But I can’t demand that you pay me out of the love of your heart. I can demand only the external act – the forking-over. A non-juridical duty, by contrast, requires the right mindset as well as the right action. Non-juridical duty is, basically, a matter of caring about important things for the right reasons – for example, loving and respecting your neighbors because they matter. Now the key point. For Kant, only juridical duties involve powers of release. If I offer to void the contract, you can get out of your duty to pay me. But there is no way to get release from your duty to love your neighbors because they matter – it is not as if your neighbors can stop mattering at will! (See MM 6:219.)
So here is the Kantian move. We say Singer is right about juridical duties, which really do come with rights and powers of release. There is no such thing as a juridical duty to oneself. But we insist there can still be non-juridical duties to oneself, since these do not imply rights and powers of release.
This move is extremely popular, though not everyone uses the term “juridical.” Wick (1960, 1961) and Knight (1961) distinguish legal from non-legal duties (see also Mothersill’s 1960 reply to Wick, which emphasizes that Wick doesn’t defend “duties” to self in the ordinary sense). Eisenberg (1968) discusses “social contractual” duties. Paton (1990, 225–26) defends “non-contractual” duties to oneself. Hills (2005) rejects the “‘juridical’ model” of duties and defends an unwaivable, non-juridical duty to promote one’s own well-being. Kahn, in 2018, argues that Kant himself should have endorsed a duty to promote one’s own happiness, despite his arguments to the contrary. For a bit more discussion on what Kant thinks we owe to ourselves, see the supplementary document:
The result is a certain humanistic, rather than legalistic, picture of duties to oneself: they do not have to do with rights and agreements, but instead with caring and valuing; they are not under voluntary control, but instead spring from unchangeable features of our personality, like our capacity to make free choices (in Kant’s case) or our susceptibility to pain (in Hills’ and Kahn’s) – basic things about our psychology that make us human. We can waive our rights at will and go on with our day; we cannot so easily take a break from our humanity.
On this view, there is something called a “duty to oneself” that slips through the jaws of Paradox – definitely a victory. But some object that the victory is hollow: the Kantians have carved out a space for “non-juridical” duties to oneself while totally surrendering to Singer when it comes to the juridical. This objection may have bite if “duties,” as ordinarily conceived, are juridical at heart. It is worth asking: what kind of “duty” doesn’t come with any rights, waivers, or enforcement? Aren’t these the very things that make a duty distinct from a mere value or virtue? Many writers – following the legal theorist Wesley Hohfeld (1913, 1917) – would even say that A’s duty to B just is the flipside of B’s right against A (this sort of right is also called a claim; see e.g., Gilbert 2018; Johnson 2010; Muñoz 2021; Thomson 1990, chap. 1). We might hesitate to go as far as Hohfeld in equating duties with rights. Still, some might wonder what is left after we subtract from a duty its rights-related upshots (Muñoz 2020, 693). Are non-juridical duties really duties at all?
Paul Schofield (2015) defends something closer to an unwaivable juridical duty to oneself. Schofield argues that you owe it to yourself not to cause yourself harm in the future – as you might by smoking heavily in your youth and giving yourself lung cancer. You also owe it to yourself not to hamstring your future choices, as in Derek Parfit’s (1984, 327–28) example of the Russian nobleman, who arranges as a young socialist to prevent his future self from funding conservative causes. Schofield’s picture is this. You owe a certain action to someone when they can legitimately demand that you do it. But you can also imagine demands made by yourself of yourself, from different perspectives within your life. When you smoke, causing yourself to suffer in the future, you can look upon this either from the perspective of the future sufferer or the present smoker. The future smoker – that is, you from your future perspective – could justifiably demand less smoking from you in the present, generating a duty not to smoke. Moreover, you cannot presently waive this duty, since you do not now occupy the right perspective (Schofield 2015, 17; see also Schofield 2019).
This proposal is enormously creative – a leap forward in philosophical thinking about obligations to oneself. No doubt the link between duties, demands, and perspectives will play an important role in future work on the subject. That said, there have been some objections to this form of Schofield’s view. In particular, some worry that it makes our relation to our future selves too chilly and antagonistic, like our relation to a non-consenting other (Kanygina forthcoming; Muñoz 2020, 694–95). If we cannot now waive our duties not to harm ourselves in the future, it seems to follow that we may not impose costs on our future selves, even for our own greater good. This seems too stringent; there is nothing wrong with taking a medication that cures a severe ailment today while causing moderately bad side-effects in the future. Harming oneself can be justified when it makes one’s life better on the whole. In this respect, self-harm is much like doing harm to a consenting other.
5. Waivable obligations to oneself
Our discussion so far has assumed, following Singer, Kant, and Hobbes, that self-release is fishy – that one cannot wiggle out of one’s ethical duties. That is the basic reason why Singer gives up on duties to oneself, and it is the basic reason why Kantians insist on decoupling them from waivable rights.
But what if the assumption is wrong? What if you can release yourself from obligations? This brings us to the third and final family of theories, those that allow waivable obligations to oneself. Such theories confront the Paradox of Self-Release head on. Self-release, after all, certainly seems paradoxical. How can we find a way to resist Hobbes’ dictum – “he is free, that can be free when he will” – and how might we clear the air of paradox?
The basic problem, as a reminder, is that a waivable duty to oneself would not be binding, because it would not be possible to violate. One could simply waive the duty “when one pleaseth” to avoid transgression, as Hobbes’ sovereign might suspend your property rights when he wants your stuff.
To meet this challenge, we need some way to show that such duties, despite appearances, could actually be binding.
The trailblazer here is G.A. Cohen. He imagines himself in the sovereign’s predicament, passing a law that he might later want to waive away:
Suppose…that the law is indeed universal, or that it includes me within its scope by virtue of some other semantic or pragmatic feature of it. Then, if I had the authority to legislate it, it indeed binds me, as long as I do not repeal it. (1996, 170)
In other words, even if you can be free at will, that doesn’t mean you are free already. You are free when, and only when, you go through the motions to free yourself. Until then you are bound – in this case, by virtue of your power to make laws that apply to you.
Cohen’s remarks on the subject, though valuable, are brief. Muñoz (2020, 2021) develops the idea into a bigger picture of duties, rights, and waivers. The starting point is a view known as the Self-Other Symmetry: you have the same basic rights against yourself as you have against anybody else. But it is uniquely difficult to violate your own rights, Muñoz says, because the very choice to do what they forbid doubles as an authorization to do it. By choosing to bop yourself on the head, for example, you make yourself into a willing party to the bopping, and thereby waive your right, a bit like if you had consenting to being bopped by someone else. The result is that rights against oneself are real but “finkish” – waived by the very things that normally lead to violations. (The analogy is with finkish dispositions, which are real but hidden by the very things that normally cause them to manifest; imagine a fragile glass that turns to stone whenever something is about to strike it (see Lewis 1997; Martin 1994).)
But if a right is finkish, it is hard to see why it should matter. For all intents and purposes, it is as good as absent. This challenge is pressed forcefully by Schofield:
Traditionally understood, a duty binds a person, irrespective of what she herself decides. The powerlessness to escape it through a mere act of will is, in fact, part of what it is to be duty-bound. So insofar as a person has the power to release herself, the purported duty lacks its characteristic ability to place her in the very condition that we associate with duty. (2021, 47)
And while some might say finkish rights and duties are merely “feeble,” rather than impossible, Schofield (2021, 48) replies that he can see “no reason why we cannot simply deny altogether that they are duties.” Finkish duties “bind” only in the sense that they count as duties; they do not constrain our actions. (But see §6.2 below on rights against oneself as prerogatives.)
Could a waivable duty to oneself have any normative bite, anything to constrain how we may act? For there to be a constraint here, waivers would have to be less than automatic, so that the mere choice to bop myself on the head might not waive my duty not to bop myself.
Schaab (2021) argues that a decision might fail to waive a duty to oneself if the duty and motive come from different perspectives within the agent – as when someone qua philosopher decides to skip the gym to work on a paper even though, qua athlete, they could legitimately demand more exercise. Kanygina (forthcoming) argues that self-release must be autonomous. If my decisions are “akratic, negligent, or confused,” they will not validly waive my duties to myself, and while sometimes my state of mind will double as an excuse, at other times I may be genuinely culpable. Kanygina illustrates with a case:
Linda, a diabetic craving a cake, might tell herself ‘What harm is there in my eating a piece or two?’ Linda is aware of the risks. Being both weak-willed and negligent of her health, she acts frivolously. When she later feels guilty, her guilt seems appropriate. (forthcoming, §3.1)
Indeed, any version of the Self-Other Symmetry will be committed to a version of Kanygina’s view. It is a truism that interpersonal consent can waive rights only when it is informed, voluntary, and competent. A breezy “yes” might not cut it. Given Symmetry, the same should hold in the one-person case. To authorize oneself to act in high-stakes cases – sharing private information, donating a spare kidney, devoting one’s efforts to a cause – the decision must be made carefully in light of the available facts. Even if self-release is possible, that doesn’t mean it’s easy.
In modern moral philosophy, duties to oneself are often treated as an isolated, antiquated topic. Paul Schofield (2021, 6) remarks that “self-directed duties find themselves largely absent from the contemporary philosophical scene,” as attested by the fact that – as of the time of his writing – there was “no standalone entry for duties to self” in the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
As readers of this entry will note, such lacunas in the literature are filling up fast. More and more links are being uncovered between duties to self and far-flung moral questions – how we should use our smartphones (Aylsworth and Castro 2021); whether to let companies mine our data (Allen 2013); whether we should “suck it up” in the face of injustice or instead go out and protest (Boxill 1976; Hill, Jr 1991d; Straumanis 1984).
Here we will survey some particularly interesting issues that intersect with obligations to oneself.
The topic of suicide – as studied by moral and political philosophers – is complex and multifaceted. (See the entry on suicide.) People have many different things to live for, as well as tribulations to escape from. In dark moments it may well seem reasonable to wish for a release from suffering; other times, the attempt to end one’s own life may strike others – and oneself, if one survives – as rash and tragic. One extreme case would be martyrs, praised for giving their lives to a higher cause. At the other end might be those who, at least on some views, have a very clear duty to stay alive. Even in such cases, however, it may be inapt or counterproductive to castigate someone for actions taken out of distraught desperation, abandoned by their sense of self-worth; to defend a duty of self-care here is not simply to advocate blaming and shaming.
There are also many people to whom one might owe the duty not to kill oneself, as Kant observes:
[Suicide] can…be regarded as a violation of one’s duty to other people (the duty of spouses to each other, of parents to their children, of a subject to his superior or to his fellow citizens, and finally even a violation of duty to God, as his abandoning the post assigned him in the world without having been called away from it). (MM 6:422)
Our question, however, must be separated out from that of duties to others, from blame, and from the rationality of choosing death. The question is whether we owe it to ourselves not to prematurely end our lives. To get a clear look, it helps to focus on the effects of suicide on the individual, not their spouse and dog and so on; and it may be helpful to consider both the case where one has a bright future and the case of foreseen grimness.
Since ancient Greece, philosophers have been skeptical of a duty to oneself not to commit suicide, however bright one’s future. Aristotle (1138a 4–1138b 11) argues that suicide cannot in principle be an injustice against oneself – where “injustice” roughly means a violation of rights – because the suicidal person “suffers voluntarily,” and “nobody suffers injustice voluntarily.” This last claim, clearly, is too strong. People might freely choose to suffer injustice when prevention is costly, as when someone declines to invest in an elaborate home security system. Other times the alternative involves even graver injustice; voting for “the lesser of two evils” is still voluntary even if one wishes for a better slate of candidates. Still, there is something to Aristotle’s point. He is foreshadowing the Paradox of Self-Release. If the suicidal person willingly opts to die, how could their choice possibly infringe their own duties? Wouldn’t those duties count as fully waived?
This line of thought directly leads to a libertarian view of suicide: your life, your choice – at least, when it comes to what you owe yourself. (See, e.g., Szasz 2002.) This is the sort of view that Singer and other skeptics hold across the board.
A well-known challenge to such laissez-faire views comes from David Velleman, who argues in a Kantian spirit that those who defend the “right to die” are missing something important: “the sense of a value in us that makes a claim on us – a value that we must live up to” (1999, 612). Velleman here is referring to our value as persons, a value that should be cherished as an end in itself rather than exploited as a mere means to a good time. Frances Kamm (1997) would reply that, when people have good reasons for choosing death – as when their life is consumed by “unbearable pain” – they should be free to “decline the honor of being a person.”
More recently, Schofield (2021, 137–38) argues that Velleman does not go far enough in recognizing obligations to oneself. One’s own value is not something “that just happens to reside within a person,” but instead, one stands in a “special relationship” to any affront to that value. To put it another way, Velleman defends a self-regarding obligation not to commit suicide, but no such obligation to oneself. Hill similarly doesn’t go so far as to call suicide a violation of duty, much less of rights, though he thinks it may in some cases express a lack of proper value for one’s own humanity (Hill, Jr 1991b). (By contrast, Muñoz (2020, 695) thinks we owe it to everyone not to pointlessly, tragically kill them – self included – and that this obligation is “too important” to waive for trivial reasons; for a similar claim see Schofield 2021, 68n7.)
How should we think about the possibility of an obligation to oneself not to commit suicide? On Schofield’s framework, the key question is that of what we can legitimately demand of ourselves from different possible perspectives. From the perspective of yourself in the future, when you will be feeling the brunt of your decisions in the present, you may find yourself with good reasons for resenting your past choices – frittered savings, thoughtless smoking, and so on. From that perspective you could legitimately demand of yourself, in your present perspective, that you take care better care of your future interests. If so, Schofield thinks, you owe that care to yourself.
It is not altogether obvious, however, how this is supposed to work when the harm involves death. If you end your life, your future perspective never exists. There will be no actual perspective from which you can imagine issuing a legitimate demand. (You can conjure up the perspective in your imagination, but that is not the same thing.) For this reason, it may be misleading to say, as Cíbik (2020, 196) does, that “the victim” of a suicide is one’s “future self.” The future self is not adversely affected; they are never even effected. (For a highly original and illuminating discussion, see Kanygina forthcoming, §2.)
So much for the case of missing out on a valuable future. What if your future looks bleak, and there’s no way to fix it – only to avoid it? Schofield considers such cases in an open-minded way.
Imagine a person who knows she will soon lose control of her rational capacities, her ability to reason, her ability to understand things as they are, and so on. Imagine that this is because her capacities degrade, or because her pain will be so overwhelming that reason is impossible. In such a case, we might wonder whether the rational standpoint demands at all that one refrain from self-termination. And if it does, one might wonder why one would not be able to waive the demand. (2021, 138)
Here Schofield’s emphasis is on the individual’s interests and standing, not the raw moral value of her rationality. The image is not that of a guardian assigned to a post, but of a person with some authority to make decisions about her own life.
A supererogatory action is a “good deed beyond the call of duty” (see the entry on supererogation). More precisely, it is a permissible action that is better than a permissible alternative. Think of friendly favors, saintly sacrifices, and heroic rescues.
Nowadays, there is not much work on the link between supererogation and duties to self. The standard view since the late 1970s is that supererogation emerges from a clash between the greater good of others and raw self-interest – where self-interest is seen as a reasonable thing to pursue, but not as a moral obligation to oneself (Archer 2016a; Hurka and Shubert 2012; Parfit 1978; Scheffler 1994; Slote 1984).
But in earlier work, many writers see obligations to self as fundamental to understanding supererogation – especially self-sacrifice. Jack Meiland argues that one doesn’t have to heroically dive into the choppy waters to save others from drowning, thanks to a duty to oneself not to do harm; he later remarks that this paradox – a duty not to be a hero? – calls for a “thorough reexamination” of our views of supererogation (Meiland 1964, 171). In response to Pybus (1982, 199), who argues for a moral requirement to “be heroic,” McGoldrick objects that
such a requirement would come into conflict with our obvious duty to recognize our own intrinsic worth, and judge our own aspirations, goals, and interests as no less endowed with value than the aspirations and interests of others. (1984, 527)
“The heart of the matter,” as she puts it, “is the Kantian argument that we have duties to ourselves as well as others” (McGoldrick 1984, 527). Kant himself says “our esteem” for daring acts – like trying to “rescue people from a shipwreck” – will be “greatly weakened by the concept of duty to himself” (CPrR 5:158). The problem for Kant’s view, as well as Meiland’s, is that it seems to underrate self-sacrifice. If we owe it to ourselves not to be the hero, won’t heroism be morally wrong? This is an instance of the “Wrongness Problem” for theories of supererogation – the problem of showing why deeds that seem “beyond the call” aren’t wrong. This is the shadowy twin of the familiar “Obligation Problem,” which is to explain why they aren’t obligatory. (For early versions of the Wrongness Problem, see Mavrodes 1964 and Narveson 1964; see also Postow 2005).
In light of the Wrongness Problem – and with Singer’s paradox still looming overhead – it is no surprise that some philosophers began searching for something new, beyond obligations to oneself, to be the source of the limits on moral obligations. Others would give up the hunt altogether, as does Bernard Williams, a famous skeptic about “the morality system” in general. Williams calls duties to self “fraudulent items,” conjured up by philosophers suckered in by the belief that “only an obligation can beat an obligation” (Williams 1985, 182).
Not everyone has been deterred. Some heterodox writers, working outside of the Kantian tradition, continue searching for a way to ground supererogation in obligations to oneself. A notable example is Shelly Kagan (1989, 206–16) and his pioneering “Self-Constraint Argument.” Suppose – a big “suppose” – that you have the same waivable obligations to yourself as you do to others. Let’s consider one such right; the right against yourself not to do yourself harm. From this, we try to show that harming yourself for the greater good of others – for example, by giving a spare kidney – will be purely optional. It is permissible to make the sacrifice because you can just waive your obligation; the act would then be like performing a kidney transplant on a willing donor. It is permissible not to self-sacrifice because you can just refuse to waive your obligation, which makes it wrong to self-harm; the act would then be like stealing a kidney from an unwilling “donor.” The result is that giving your spare kidney is optional even if it’s for the greater good: you can give yourself consent to do it, or refuse consent and rightfully keep the kidney. Kagan ultimately rejects this argument for a panoply of reasons. The other key proposal is due to Paul Hurley (1995), who derives the optionality of self-harm from “patient-protecting reasons,” which are like unwaivable obligations – in this case, obligations to oneself. These reasons open a “protected sphere” of actions. Muñoz (2021) objects that Hurley’s and Kagan’s arguments both struggle with the Wrongness Problem. For Hurley, the problem is that a patient-protecting reason not to harm yourself would make it wrong to give your kidney. For Kagan, the same appears to follow if you decline to “self-consent.”
Despite these challenges, philosophers are still searching for links between duties to self and supererogation. Muñoz (2021), for example, tries to revive Kagan’s argument, arguing that a waivable duty to oneself is a prerogative: it can be cited in defense of one’s actions, but since it can be waived at will, it isn’t a “binding” reason to comply. On this view, duties to self help to unify the two main concepts in deontological ethics: restrictions, which make it wrong to harm non-consenting others even for the greater good, and prerogatives, which permit us not to self-harm. Restrictions come from what we owe to others, and prerogatives come from what we owe to ourselves.
Suppose it’s New Year’s Day, and you – sick of your own bad habits – decide to make a change. You say to yourself: “I promise to cut down on screen time this year.” Do you now owe it to yourself to follow through? Does your resolution even count as a bona fide promise?
The possibility of self-promises – and their possible import – has drawn the attention a number of philosophers. Some are skeptical (e.g., Downie 1985); others, less so (Fruh 2014; Habib 2009; Hill, Jr 1991a; Raz 1972, 97; Rosati 2011).
On the one hand, promises to oneself can seem not just possible but downright useful. When we struggle to commit our wills in the ordinary ways – focusing on attractive aspects, “psyching ourselves up” – we often reach for other devices of commitment (Schelling 1985). A promise to oneself may be just such a device. By saying things like “I promise to cut down on screen time,” we are not saying, “Boy, I’d better cut down,” or “Gee, wouldn’t it be nice if I cut down?” We are moralizing. We are staking our self-respect on a decision in order to get ourselves to carry it out (see Hill, Jr 1991a), or as Rosati (2011, 143–44) puts it, we try to “maintain our self-governance…by putting our authority on the line” – that is, our authority over ourselves, our authority to “effectively determine what we shall do, and to command respect in virtue of that very authority.” It is like vowing “on my honor.” It is a distinctive means of self-motivation.
On the other hand, promises to oneself do have a funny smell. If you promise me something, I have the power to release you. If you promise yourself, then it seems you can release yourself at will, which sounds paradoxical – and familiar. In Singer’s view, this is just a special instance of the Paradox of Self-Release, which afflicts any kind of duty to oneself. He asks:
Can one promise oneself to do something? Such language is frequently used. People say “I have promised myself to…” But a promise to oneself would be a promise from which one could release oneself at will, and thus not a genuine promise at all. (1958, 203)
Others have raised similar worries. Atiyah writes:
It is very odd to regard a secret vow to oneself as creating an obligation of any kind. If it does, [it] is one without a corresponding right … [and] which can be violated without risk of legal, moral or social censure. (1981, 54)
Here Atiyah echoes Singer’s skepticism about duties without rights, as well as raising other worries.
A “promise to oneself,” Singer concludes, can only be a resolution in disguise. A genuine promise generates a duty, owed by the promisor to the promisee. A self-promise, however, just expresses a “settled determination” to act. It is a figurative use of moral language, or else it is nonsense.
But as we have seen, there are replies to the Paradox of Self-Release, and so it should come as no surprise that there are arguments in favor of genuine self-promises – which may not be as funny as they seemed at first whiff.
To start, self-promising is not some strange contortion only performed by characters in thought experiments. As Rosati (2011, 124–25) observes, we at least seem to make self-promises about a “broad array” of things – self-care, self-respect, moral rectitude, choice of lifestyle – and in a wide variety of ways, from silent vows to showy announcements. Self-promising is, in a word, normal. But this by itself is not a decisive point, as Rosati herself would agree, since Singer could reinterpret our ordinary talk of self-promises as merely figurative, a way of steeling one’s will rather than conjuring a moral obligation.
Second, we might return to Allen’s reply to Singer: we shouldn’t be so quick to dismiss ordinary talk. Why think that self-promises must be figures of speech?
Third, we could try to find special cases where Singer’s skepticism is harder to believe. Allen Habib (2009) gives the example of a contest in which a sales manager promises her team – self included – that she will give $100 to next week’s top seller; another of his examples is a drinker who backslides on a self-promise to go sober. Hill (1991a, 147) explores cases where a promise to oneself must be reconsidered “in the light of unanticipated new information” that tells in favor of annulment – on Hill’s view, this kind of release is not problematic, because it is not done willy-nilly. Janis Schaab presents a similar case:
Suppose that I want to buy a new laptop, and so I promise myself to save some money. A few days later, I am informed that my salary will be raised. I can now afford to buy the new laptop rightaway [sic]. It seems that now, if not before, I can release myself from my promise to save money. It is not obvious that the mere possibility of self-release nullifies my obligation to save money. (2021, 177)
Finally, we might defend the coherence of willy-nilly waivers. Certainly this is a bit easier if we already believe in the possibility of releasing oneself from other duties to self, like the duty not to harm (see §5, above). The trick is the same either way: we say that the person is bound until the moment of release. The pioneer of this move in the promising literature is Connie Rosati, who writes:
We would not be tempted to say that because the promisee can release the promisor at will, the promisor is not really obligated. So long as the promisee has not released the promisor, she is indeed bound. But then we should say the same thing about self-promises: although an agent, as promisee, can release herself, as promisor, at will, so long as she does not release herself, she is indeed bound. (2011, 134–35; see also Muñoz 2020, 697)
This view raises its own puzzle, analogous to Schofield’s challenge to Muñoz (see again §5). If a self-promise can be waived at will, so that there is no real danger of violating it, why should it matter?
One possible answer is the one we started with: self-promising is a way of staking our respect to add some moral oomph to an intention. This still leaves us wondering where the oomph comes from, if not the threat of a broken promise. Here the friends of self-promising need to find some way that release might be non-trivial even if it is possible – just as Kanygina (forthcoming) argues that self-release requires us to make decisions autonomously, and Schaab (2021) argues that the power of self-release does not fully protect us against the possibility of violation. Fruh (2014, 170) goes some way towards an answer; he argues that, just because one can dissolve an obligation easily, that doesn’t make the act morally meaningless; the dissolution might express something undesirable, such as a deficiency of “moral fiber.” A lack of fiber probably won’t strike fear into evildoers’ hearts. But it is a defect nonetheless.
6.4 Body modification and self-expression
“Your body is a temple,” the saying goes. A temple to whom? If it’s yours, then clearly you should get to decide the rules – haircuts, tattoos, piercings, sex hormones, giving and taking blood. All else equal, no one can tell you what to do with your body. But if it’s a temple to someone else – say, God – then the choice is not really yours to make. You’re the custodian, not the caller of shots, and you should treat your body with the same kind of gingerly respect that you would show as a guest in someone else’s home. Their temple, their rules.
Nowadays, few Western ethicists would argue that you should treat your body in such-and-such a way purely because of divine authority (“God abhors tattoos!”) or natural teleology (“Your blood belongs in your own body!”). But the history of philosophy teems with prim pronouncements on the proper way to treat one’s body, and philosophers continue to debate whether certain kinds of bodily modification are immoral as a matter of duty to oneself, as well as whether certain kinds of self-enhancement are permissible or even obligatory.
“Body modification,” in this context, means a change to one’s body that needn’t be intrinsically harmful, all things considered. We are interested in the modifying itself, not just in the obvious harms it might involve. Decapitation “modifies” the body, but has little in common, morally speaking, with nail-clipping, haircuts, pierced ears, and the removal of teeth.
On Kant’s view, however, decapitation and tooth-removal seem to differ only by a matter of degree. He writes:
To deprive oneself of an integral part or organ (to maim oneself) – for example, to give away or sell a tooth to be transplanted into another’s mouth, or to have oneself castrated in order to get an easier livelihood as a singer, and so forth – are ways of partially murdering oneself. (MM 6:423)
Clearly, Kant has in mind an unwaivable duty not to take out one’s body parts. Donating or selling a tooth is immoral – even, apparently, when the transaction is consensual and mutually beneficial. Kant then qualifies:
But to have a dead or diseased organ amputated when it endangers one’s life, or to have something cut off that is a part but not an organ of the body, for example, one’s hair, cannot be counted as a crime against one’s own person – although cutting one’s hair in order to sell it is not altogether free from blame. (MM 6:423)
For Kant, an appendectomy isn’t partial murder, but there is something wrong with haircuts for paychecks. It is hard to see this as anything but natural teleology: it is not up to you what your organs are meant to do, and you may not make unnatural changes to your body except to correct for defects – a version of “your body is a temple,” where the holiness comes from the value of being a person: “disposing of oneself as a mere means to some discretionary end is debasing humanity in one’s person (homo noumenon), to which the human being (homo phaenomenon) was nevertheless entrusted for preservation” (MM 6:423). Here Kant sounds less like an Enlightenment thinker and more like a natural lawyer (see, e.g., the discussion of self-love and suicide in St. Thomas Aquinas’s Summa Theologica, part II, Q64, A5, as cited in Cholbi 2017, sec. 2.2).
Suffice it to say, Kant’s view has problems. First, it doesn’t take bodily autonomy seriously. If you like spa days more than long hair, why shouldn’t you get to sell your hair and treat yourself to a getaway? Second, the view doesn’t generalize very well. If it’s wrong to sell one’s body parts, shouldn’t it also be wrong to sell one’s labor, since labor involves moving and using one’s body, sometimes in unnatural ways? (Think of the nurse who takes caffeine pills to work the night shift in a pandemic.) Finally, we might wonder why the profit motive should be uniquely dubious. It’s fine to cut one’s hair because one likes the look – why is this any nobler than trying to make a buck?
A more promising prohibition can be found in Matej Cíbik’s (2020) recent work on tattoos. A tattoo typically expresses something about the bearer’s personality. That’s fine, Cíbik thinks, if the tattoo is discreet and the risk of regret is negligible, as when the tattoo represents an enduring aspect of the bearer’s identity. The problem is that tattoos may outlive their inspiration, staying frozen even as identities evolve. Removing tattoos can be painful, expensive, or impossible.
Consider Cíbik’s example of Amy, an 18-year-old girl who “desperately falls in love” with a trendy musician named Justin:
Amy listens to his music all the time, he is all that she ever reads about, and his face is the main decoration of her room. Now she decides to go further and get a series of tattoos with his image and his name on the most prominent parts of her body including her face, shoulders, neck and hands. With these tattoos, she will be instantly recognizable as his biggest fan, signaling her deep affection towards her idol – something that her (present) identity is build upon [sic]. (2020, 202)
Cíbik thinks Amy acts wrongly. Her tattoos are “inconsiderate” towards her future self and “a definition of recklessness,” since she is “binding [herself] forever to publicly exhibit devotion to a fleeting pop-culture phenomenon” (2020, 204).
This diagnosis dovetails with Schofield on obligations to oneself in the future. Schofield thinks there is something dangerous about actions that “jeopardize a person’s ability to make use of her practical powers later in life by harming or altering her body in the present” (2021, 167), since it one can reasonably demand from their own future perspective that such harms not be inflicted. Schofield illustrates with an analogy:
Just as Beast, through his superior strength, can impose his will on Belle by picking her up and locking her in the tower, a person is able to impose her present will on herself in the future by affecting her own body – only in this latter case, it is the way she is temporally situated, and not her superior strength, that explains her power and her dominance. (2021, 168)
The thing about tattoos, and body modification in general, is that the act itself is not particularly harmful; what matters is the restriction on future freedom. A Justin Bieber face tattoo might not hurt much, but it makes it a lot harder to work in sales or run for public office.
We should also note some of the points that could be made in defense of tattoo art, and self-expression more generally. First, whenever one “seizes the day” – putting down the books to go to a party, moving countries to pursue a romance – one is sacrificing future options for the sake of savoring the present. Such trade-offs are part of any human life worth living. Second, even if you sometimes owe it to yourself to keep your options open, it might matter how they are closed. Consider the gay man who refuses to hide his sexuality to get ahead in the office, or the black woman who wears her curly natural hair in interviews even though some potential employers see it as “unprofessional.” Here self-respect seems to tell in favor of acting in ways that foreclose one’s options, because the closing is achieved not by one’s choice, but through others’ bigoted reactions. This may be closer to how some people (especially those from cultures with traditional tattoos, as in Samoan culture) think of being denied a job on the basis of body art: the problem isn’t teenage recklessness, but arbitrary discrimination.
Still, when it comes to thoughtless, permanent changes to one’s own appearance, Cíbik and Schofield are definitely on to something. What remains to be seen is how we might reconcile the value of spontaneous expression with a chilly concern for future freedom. A blanket ban on body modification is surely too strict – but that doesn’t mean anything goes.
Next is a topic that Kant calls “the first command of all duties to oneself” – namely, self-knowledge. Kant is concerned here not with knowing one’s personality type, personal history, or potential talents. His concern is moral purity:
This command is know (scrutinize, fathom) yourself, not in terms of your natural perfection (your fitness or unfitness for all sorts of discretionary or even commanded ends) but rather in terms of your moral perfection in relation to your duty. That is, know your heart – whether it is good or evil, whether the source of your actions is pure or impure, and what can be imputed to you as belonging originally to the substance of a human being or as derived (acquired or developed) and belonging to your moral condition (MM 6:441; see also LE 27:42, 348)
Owen Ware detects a puzzle here. How could Kant see self-knowledge as obligatory given his “opacity thesis,” according to which our own moral perfection is unknowable to us? “I cannot know, for example, whether my particular actions arise from conformity with the moral law or from some hidden self-interest” (Ware 2009, 673) (For a more sanguine take on the conditions for self-knowledge, see Bransen 2015 on self-love.)
Jordan MacKenzie (2018) explores the duty to know oneself outside of the Kantian framework, decoupling self-knowledge from moral progress, and singling out two separate reasons for seeking self-knowledge. Since you owe yourself respect, you need to know yourself – you can’t respect a complete unknown. And since you are a valuable entity – respectability aside – that by itself makes you worth getting to know. These points are notably not tailored to the case of self-knowledge; they just take basic facts about respect and value and turn them inward. (Readers interested in the duty of self-knowledge may also be interested in the duty not to self-deceive; see, e.g., MacKenzie forthcoming.)
The classic treatment of self-respect is Thomas Hill’s “Servility and Self-Respect,” first published in 1971. Hill argues that there is a moral problem with servile people – by which he means those who are overly deferential, self-loathing, or self-abnegating. He gives three case studies: the Uncle Tom, a Black man who “displays the symbols of deference to whites, and of contempt to blacks;” the Self-Deprecator, whose “sense of shame and self-contempt make him content to be the instrument of others;” and the Deferential Wife, who is “utterly devoted to serving her husband” because of her belief that “the proper role for a woman is to serve her family” (1991c, 4–5). The problem, Hill thinks, is not that these people are making anyone miserable. They might be “Wise enough to Love their Chains,” to borrow Mary Astell’s description of the dutiful wife (1996, 29), and those around them might enjoy the benefits of their eager self-denial. For Hill, the problem is more intrinsic. The servile agent does not appreciate their own rights, either because they misunderstand them – like the wife who is brainwashed into thinking that she isn’t really allowed to say “no” – or else they just don’t value their own rights as much as others’ whims.
Hill’s paper has sparked, or at least foreshadowed, several interesting discussions. One concerns whether Hill got the cases right – particularly the Deferential Wife (see, e.g., Baron 1985; Friedman 1985; Superson 2010). Another debate centers on the duty to resist one’s own oppression; Carol Hay (2011) argues that this is a duty to oneself, whereas Straumanis (1984) argues that a woman owes it to other women, not oneself, to enhance herself and resist her own oppression. Bernard Boxill (1976) asks what should happen after one’s rights are violated, when there is no hope of rectification. Should one protest, as W.E.B. Dubois (1966, 48) advocates, as an expression of self-respect? Or would it be servile, as Booker T. Washington (1966, 514) argues, to make pleas for the “sympathy” of others rather than waiting until one can fix the problem by oneself? Boxill ultimately sides with Dubois, insisting, like Hill, on the need to value one’s own rights.
Finally, Anita Allen (2013) argues that one’s digital privacy is not just a personal good but a duty to oneself. She gives examples what of this duty might entail: securing information about one’s bank account and genome, not constantly broadcasting one’s location and beliefs, not aiming “sexy pictures” of oneself “at minors or the general public” (2013, 850). Allen then draws implications for reform: we should not just judge companies and governments by how much they invade our privacy, but also by how well they help us protect ourselves from invasive third parties (2013, 851).
On this basis, Allen advocates paternalistic privacy laws in certain cases, foreshadowing Schofield’s case for liberal paternalism (2018, 2021, chaps. 5 & 6). If Allen and Schofield are right, obligations to oneself are not just relevant to how we treat ourselves, but to how we should treat each other (see also Kanygina 2020), and how we ought to live together in civil and political society.
The question of what we owe to ourselves has, after decades in the doldrums, surged back to life. So what’s next? We now have a sense of where the action has been – the spectre of paradox, the search for unwaivable duties, the clash between self-concern and the needs of others. What open questions might be the focus of the next big insight, the next chapter in the story?
One question is whether duties to self are in any sense “foundational” – either as much as or more so than duties to other people. The idea is associated with Kant’s ethics (see Reath 2002, sec. II). The basic idea is a moralized version of RuPaul’s “If you can’t love yourself / How in the hell you gonna love somebody else?” The question, Kantified, is that of how you could owe anything to other people if you can’t owe things to yourself. Margaret Gilbert’s (2018) theory of rights also brings in rights against oneself at the ground floor. For Gilbert, rights are the product of joint decisions, and they give each party to the decision a right against each that the decision be carried through. That includes the right of each against himself or herself. This view has the amazing consequence that, whenever I violate your right against me, I also violate a right against myself – a consequence that Gilbert doesn’t stress, but which she does accept. She even gives a partial defense at one point, arguing that we can sensibly demand of ourselves that we carry out our joint decisions with other people (2018, 177–78).
Another issue is that of the “Self-Other Symmetry.” If we do have duties to ourselves, are they essentially similar to duties to others, or fundamentally different? Most writers who take up the topic argue against Symmetry (Slote 1984; Stocker 1976), but some are sympathetic (Muñoz 2020, 2021; Schaab 2021).
A final question, shared by many writers, is whether “obligation” is the only concept that we need here. No doubt, it’s useful. But there is a vast and variegated range of things that we do with other people that we also turn inwards in an intriguing way. Consider the virtues of patience, forgiveness, compassion, kindness, and appreciation. It is not so obvious that the right theory of “obligations” is going to tell us how these things work in general, much less in the solo case.
The deeper reason for wanting to understand self-obligation is to make sense of the seemingly special character of how we relate to ourselves. To focus only on the bossiest aspects of self-relation – duties and demands, claims and commands – is to risk missing out on the full moral richness of our inner lives.
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