Sex and Sexuality

First published Thu Jul 5, 2018

Sex has received little attention in the history of western philosophy, and what it did receive was not good: Plato denigrated it, arguing that it should lead to something higher or better (Phaedrus, Symposium), Aristotle barely mentioned it, and Christian philosophers condemned it: Augustine argued that its pleasures are dangerous in mastering us, and allowed sex only for procreation (City of God, bk 14; On Marriage and Concupiscence), while Aquinas confined its permissibility to conjugal, procreative acts (Summa contra gentiles III.2; Summa theologia IIa-IIae). Immanuel Kant (Lectures on Ethics) considered it the only inclination that cannot satisfy the Categorical Imperative, and Jean-Paul Sartre claimed that sexual desire aims to capture the other’s freedom (1943: pt. III, ch. 3]). The Marquis de Sade (a philosopher of sorts) went to the opposite extreme, celebrating all types of sexual acts, including rape (1785; 1791; 1795). Only during contemporary times do philosophers, beginning with Bertrand Russell (1929) and including Sigmund Freud (1905), think of sex as generally good (see Soble 2006 and 2008: ch. 2 for a brief yet excellent chapters on this history; see also Belliotti 1993: Pt. I).

Sex raises fascinating issues. Rooted in our biology, pervaded by our intentionality, and (normally) directed at other human beings, sexual desire is complex and not confined to specific mating seasons. Its pleasures are powerful and have ruined many lives. Men and women seem to exhibit, desire, and experience sex differently (e.g., men, much more than women, consume pornography, have sex with prostitutes, frequent strip clubs, and have fetishes [Buss 2016, esp. chs. 2 and 3; Laumann et al. 1994, esp. pt. II; Margolis 2004, esp. ch. 1–3; Symons 1979, esp. chs. 1 and 7]). Why this is so, is debatable (Soble 2008: ch. 10; Wertheimer 2003: ch. 3) but these issues make it crucial to understand sexual desire, pleasure, activity, and preferences, and to explore the moral aspects of sex.

1. Conceptual Issues

1.1 Sexual Desire

Four broad lines of thought are prominent regarding sexual desire: (1) whether it is merely a biological drive or an intentional mental state; (2) how it should be defined; (3) whether it is benign or malignant; and (4) whether it admits of perverted forms. (I discuss (4) in the third section.)

Definitions of sexual desire in terms of sexual pleasure seem to understand sexual desire as basically an appetite. “Sexual desire” is “desire for contact with another person’s body and for the pleasure which such contact produces” (Goldman 1977: 268) or “sexual desire” is “the desire for certain bodily pleasures” (Primoratz 1999: 46; see also Soble 1991: 139–151; 1996: 83). On the first, if X feels sexual desire, then X desires the touch of another person’s (Y) body and the sexual pleasure derived through that touch. The second definition avoids the conceptual involvement of another person, understanding sexual desire instead as desire for sexual pleasures, period. This accommodates cases in which the desire is not for the touch of another’s body: some cases of masturbation, voyeurism, and exhibitionism, for example.

These views have in common the idea that sexual desire is desire for brute bodily pleasures, possibly implying that sexual desire is merely a biological appetite. If so, they face the objection that they mischaracterize the nature of sexual desire, which should instead be understood as intentional through and through (Morgan 2003b). So whenever X sexually desires someone or something, X does so under a description: X desires Y because something about Y appeals to X. Even when X desires anonymous sex, X desires “the pleasure of anonymous sex” (Morgan 2003b). On the intentional view, sexual desire is no mere appetite but thoroughly infused with meaning.

Although the intentional view need not insist on the conceptual requirement of another person, its most common instantiation is the idea that sexual desire is interpersonal—that the agent’s sexual desire always seeks fulfillment with another person. Being a normal human being means having interpersonal attitudes, and sexual desire is no exception; it must have a proper direction and involve the “marshalling and directing of animal urges toward an interpersonal aim, and an interpersonal fulfillment” (Scruton 1986: 289). On one version, sexual desire involves multiple levels of awareness: X desires Y, desires that Y desire X, desires to be aroused by Y’s desire of X, and so on (Nagel 1969). On another version, sexual desire should be directed to love (Scruton 1986: 339; cf. Giles 2008: ch. 3). Both these variations might raise doubts, however, because they layer a normative view of sexual desire, dictating its aim (e.g., towards love), atop a descriptive one as an interpersonal attitude, whereas the trick is to articulate a normatively neutral interpersonal view. Other such views burden sexual desire with too much inter-personality (Russon 2017).

Is the pleasure view of sexual desire committed to understanding sexual desire as mere appetite? Perhaps not. For example, if X wants to masturbate, X is not being led by blind instinct like a cat in heat; X can be thinking, “I look forward to enjoying the sensations of rubbing my clitoris with my favorite vibrator as I fantasize about having sex with my neighbor. ” In other words, “sexual desire can be focused or selective at the same time as being physical” (Goldman 1977: 279).

The intentional view is plausible in that sexual desire can be quite complex and that its complexity is not captured well (or at all) by the pleasure view, given that human mentality infuses our most basic urges and appetites. But whether the intentional view is at odds with the pleasure view depends on our goals. If the latter is meant to capture the “essence” of the phenomenon, the two are compatible with each other; if our goal is a detailed description of the depth, complexity, and variety of the phenomenon, the pleasure view falls short. Given that definitions are not usually meant to convey the complexity of what they define, we should not expect a definition of sexual desire to be a full-blown theory sexual desire, while agreeing that it is a complex phenomenon.

This does not mean that the pleasure view of sexual desire is correct, only that its aim or strategy need not be misguided. Indeed, depending on how it is stated it might be wrong. For example, if the pleasure view conceptually ties sexual desire to sexual pleasure obtained through the touch of another person, it would be dualistic and might implausibly render many sexual desires as nonsexual, such as some masturbatory desires, voyeurism, and exhibitionism. Furthermore, the touch of another person’s body implies that zoophiliac desires are nonsexual. Necrophiliac desires would also be nonsexual if “person” refers to a living person. A non-dualistic definition—“for bodily pleasures, period”—avoids such implications (Soble 1991 and later editions of the essay, the last being 2013a; Halwani 2018b: ch. 5).

Even a non-dualistic pleasure view might face difficulties stemming from understanding desire in terms of what it seeks (sexual pleasure). One problem is the difficulty of defining “sexual pleasure” (see below), which this view needs to do to be complete. But there might be additional problems. First, not all sexual desires are for sexual pleasure: a couple might have sex to have a baby, even though the act is pleasurable (Jacobsen 2017: 33; see also 1993). Second, our sexual partners would in principle be dispensable if there are other ways to attain the pleasure. This objection is not moral—that we use our sexual partners as mere instruments—but ontological: sexual pleasure cannot be the only or common goal to all sexual desires for otherwise our hands can substitute for sexual partners. Since people generally prefer sex with another to masturbation, sexual desire is not solely for sexual pleasure (Jacobsen 2017: 33).

Given that the pleasure view understands sexual desire in terms of an object (pleasure), we can describe it as “object-based”. An alternative is the “feature-based” approach, which defines “sexual desire” in terms of “sexual arousal” (Jacobsen 2017). Sexual arousal is a state we find ourselves in—it is basically the state of being turned on or horny, manifested in erections, lubricated vaginas, flushed faces, and “tingling earlobes” (Jacobsen 2017: 35; cf. Shaffer 1978). Because this state is enjoyable, we often induce it in ourselves: we think about sex in order to be sexually aroused (Jacobsen 2017: 34–35). “Sexual desire” is then

a subject’s desire for something—some activity, person, or object—in virtue of the effect that it is expected to have on the subject’s own states of sexual arousal. (Jacobsen 2017: 36)

This is a feature-based account in that at point t in time, I desire someone in virtue of, say, the pleasure that his voice brings me, but at point t+1 I desire him in virtue of the sexual pleasure his body brings me. This allows the feature-based view to avoid being confined to the false binary of my desire for someone being either sexual or not, a problem that the object-based approach might face.

The feature-based view, however, might pass the buck: either “sexual arousal” means what we usually mean by “sexual desire” (the examples of sexual arousal—erections, lubricated vaginas—might serve equally well as examples of sexual desire), or it does not. If the former, we would still need a definition of “sexual arousal”, much like we needed a definition of “sexual desire”. If the latter, we would need an account of what “sexual arousal” is, because now it does not mean what we thought it meant: if it is not the same as sexual desire, what exactly is it? Referring back to erections and lubricated vaginas will not do, because we may ask, “Why aren’t they states of sexual desire?” So defining “sexual desire” in terms of sexual arousal might be convincing only if we can understand “sexual arousal” independently of “sexual desire” (Halwani 2018b: 170–171).

The objections to the object-based views merit scrutiny. First, even if the goal of sexual desire is sexual pleasure, unless we assume that sexual pleasure is uniform across different contexts (an assumption with which the feature-based view saddles the object-based one), one’s hand might not be a substitute for sex with another person. Second, although the couple in the example want to have sex from procreative motives, this might not show that their sexual desire (if it exists in this case) is not for pleasure. People can have sex from nonsexual motives (most prostitutes), but once we postulate the motive of sexual desire, the motive of pleasure is present. People’s intentions for nonsexual goals in a sex act cannot wave away the desire for pleasure; sexual desire has an independence that cannot be (metaphysically) wiped away by intentions or nonsexual motives (see Dent 1984: ch. 2; see also Hamilton 2001: ch. 9; Webber 2009).

This independence lends support to pessimist views of sexual desire, which consider it morally dangerous and threatening to our rationality (including Christian philosophers such as Augustine and Thomas Aquinas, Plato, Kant, and Schopenhauer [1859: ch. 44], and, among contemporary philosophers of sex Alan Soble, whose views in “Sexual Use” [2013b; 2017b] imply with some certainty that he is also a pessimist). Pessimism is opposed by optimism, which views sexual desire as generally benign and as bringing people together (it commands a large majority of the philosophers of sex, including Bertrand Russell 1929: passim; Irving Singer 2001: passim; and Martha Nussbaum 1995, 1998), though it recognizes that it can be morally problematic (Morgan 2003a). The issue, then, between the pessimists and the optimists concerns not whether sexual desire can be morally problematic, but whether it is so by its nature (Soble, with Halwani 2017: 5–8).

Sexual pessimism can be deep. One version is that sexual desire is for another’s body “as an organic totality in situation with consciousness at the horizon” (Sartre 1943 [ 1956: 502]). Sexual desire aims to capture a person in their entirety through their body. To do so, the agent must also make him or herself pure flesh by allowing sexual desire to “clog” his or her consciousness (Sartre 1943 [1956: 504]). Thus, “I make myself flesh in the presence of the Other in order to appropriate the Other’s flesh” (Sartre 1943 [1956: 506]). Another version of deep pessimism considers sexual desire to be for the sexual parts or body of another person, not the person’s “work and services” (Kant 1930 [1963: 163]; see also 1797: 6:424–6:427; I discuss below the moral implications of this view). Sexual desire sets aside another’s humanity and targets their flesh. This does not mean that in desiring Y, X would be as happy with Y’s corpse or with Y unconscious as with Y alive (as Shrage and Stewart [2015: 6] claim); for X, Y-dead is not at all a substitute for Y-alive. It also does not mean that during sex X treats Y as an object with no desires or interests of Y’s own. Instead, X treats those interests as merely instrumental to the satisfaction of X’s sexual desires (Halwani 2018b: ch. 8, Soble 2013b, 2017b; see also Herman 1993; O’Neill 1985; Papadaki 2007). A phenomenology of sexual desire seems to support the above views, according to which in sexually desiring Y, X is attracted to the bodily, physical attributes of Y.

Sexual optimism claims that although sexual desire can be morally dangerous, it need not be and is usually not. They agree that its focus is on the body but do not see this as a problem. Sex intimately and pleasurably brings two (or more) people together. It is a force for good, establishing trust and strengthening human bonds. Unlike appetites,

sexual interest … [is] … an interpersonal sensitivity, one that enables us to delight in the mind and character of other persons as well as in their flesh… [S]ex may be seen as an instinctual agency by which persons respond to one anotherthrough their bodies. (Singer 1984: 382; see also Goldman 1977: 282–283; Russell 1929 [1970: passim])

1.2 Sexual Activity

It is difficult to define “sexual act”, especially when closely related concepts (e.g., “sexual activity” and “having sex”) do not have the same extension: two people, fully clothed, kissing and rubbing against each other engage in sexual activity, but it is unclear that they have sex or engage in a sexual act. Solo masturbation counts as sexual activity and as a sexual act, but not as having sex. Two people chatting on-line to the point of orgasm engage in sexual activity yet not obviously have sex or a sexual act. There are a few criteria to define “sexual act”, including “sexual behavior”, “sexual intention”, “sexual desire”, and “sexual pleasure” (Soble 1996: ch. 3).

Relying only on behavior fails because the same behavior is sometimes sexual, sometimes not. Sometimes behavior does tell us whether an act is sexual: if two people engage in sexual intercourse on stage, for an audience, their act is sexual even if they don’t desire it because intercourse is a standard sexual act. But sometimes behavior by itself tells us little: a doctor inserting insert his finger into another man’s anus does not tell us whether the act is sexual. Indeed, we might need to know first whether the act is sexual to know whether the behavior is sexual. Behavior cannot be the only way to define “sexual act”; similarly for the criterion of contact with genitals (Soble 1996: ch. 3).

The criterion of sexual pleasure is another candidate (Gray 1978). Perhaps an act is sexual if it involves or produces sexual pleasure. If two people who, without taking off their clothes, kiss, rub, and tug at each other, all the while feeling sexual pleasure, their act is sexual. But sexual pleasure is not necessary for an act to be sexual (many sexual acts do not produce sexual pleasure), and it might not be sufficient. Consider the example of a man who sees someone on the street and “as a result feels a twinge of sexual pleasure” (Soble 1996: 130). The presence of sexual pleasure in this case does not suffice for the man’s experience to be a sexual act (perhaps if the man continues to look the experience becomes a sexual act because of the man’s intention to keep looking; Soble 1996: 130).

Another criterion is intention, though we need to figure out what the intention is for. One reasonable candidate is “the intention to produce sexual pleasure in oneself or in another”. But this is not necessary: two people who have sexual intercourse to procreate engage in a sexual act. The experience, if any, of sexual pleasure is a by-product of the action (Soble 1996: 132). This criterion is also not sufficient. Suppose that X sexually teases Y by stripping in front of Y. Then X seems to intend to produce sexual pleasure in Y but what they do is not a sexual act (Soble 1996: 132).

An obvious criterion for defining “sexual act” is sexual desire:

sexual desire is desire for contact with another person’s body and for the pleasure which such contact produces; sexual activity is activity which tends to fulfill such desire of the agent. (Goldman 1977: 268)

A “sexual act” (or “activity”, in Goldman’s terms) is activity “which tends to fulfill” sexual desire.

The definition sounds right: what else is a sexual act if not one that satisfies or “tends to” satisfy sexual desire? But it faces counter-examples. A prostitute performing fellatio on a man does it (typically) not to satisfy or fulfill her sexual desire, but to make money. Nor does the act tend to fulfill her desire, for she might have none to be fulfilled. Thus satisfying sexual desire is not necessary for an activity to be sexual. Whether it is sufficient depends on what we mean by “satisfaction” or “fulfillment”. If it means “the desire is no longer felt for the time being” or “the desire is gone”, satisfying sexual desire would not be sufficient. Taking a cold shower, a powerful sleeping pill, or even just focusing on something else might get rid of the sexual desire, yet these activities are not sexual. If “satisfying sexual desire” means, “the desire achieves its goal” (which is sexual fulfillment), satisfying sexual desire by a particular activity would be sufficient for that activity to be sexual, but the definition becomes circular (Soble 2013a). It would be something like this: “sexual activity is that activity which satisfies sexual desire by means of a sexual activity”. The criterion of sexual desire, then, does not succeed in defining “sexual act”.

By the above criteria, a definition of “sex act” is hard to find. One crucial reason might be that what we commonly think is a sexual act does not depend on one criterion: behavior, intentions, contact with body parts, etc., play a role depending on the context. Another reason might be that there are many concepts closely related to each other that nonetheless commonly mean different things. “To have sex” or “to engage in sex” almost always refer to sexual activity with at least one more person, whereas “engaging in a sexual act (or activity)” and “having a sexual experience” do not have this reference, and they are not common expressions. Thus, defining these concepts is tricky if we want the definitions to agree with common linguistic usage, or if we rely on such usage to formulate these definitions. More worrisome, if we need to define these concepts for help with practical, moral, and legal issues, the rift between them and common language should give us pause.

1.3 Sexual Pleasure

“Pleasure” is ambiguous: it can mean “physical sensation” or “enjoyment”. The first has a bodily location (e.g., scratching an itch). The second does not, as when one takes pleasure in solving a jigsaw puzzle or lying under the sun (it could be enjoying a pleasure-as-sensation, such as enjoying the pleasure of scratching an itch). “Pleasure” can also refer to a feeling that is felt all over but has no specific bodily location, such as being sad or elated. It can also refer to an attitude, to “be pleased at”—the belief that what one is pleased at is good (Goldman 2016: 83–90).

We thus have four types of pleasure: pleasure-as-sensation, pleasure-as-enjoyment, pleasure-as-feeling, and pleasure-as-pro-attitude. All four concepts can be relevant to sex, but it is the first three that are important, one reason being that each can be a type of sexual pleasure, whereas the fourth is about the sexual. The pleasure of orgasm is an obvious example of the first, enjoying sexual activity is a usual experience that people undergo, and one can be elated because of having had great sex. Moreover, one or more parties to the act might experience pleasure-as-sensation, yet not enjoy the activity itself. One can experience the pleasurable sensations of sex and enjoy the act, yet feel repulsion later. We can thus see how each pleasure has its opposite: one can feel painful sensations during a sexual act (e.g., at being anally penetrated), one can endure a sexual act (not enjoy it), and one can feel nausea at what one has done sexually.

Although orgasm does not exhaust the pleasures of sex, there is something to the idea that the pleasure of orgasm is unique. As a sensation, it is unique in the way it feels and in its intensity. Moreover, it contrasts with other sensation-pleasures in that it feels the same way across various contexts whereas the others do not. For example, the sensation of having one’s ear licked is not as such a pleasure and depends on who one thinks is licking it. But the sensation of orgasm is not like this, which makes orgasm a pleasure that cuts across social layers, a bodily sensation unmediated by social meanings or concepts; “the trait of female orgasm [is] a physiological trait or reflex, not a social trait” (Lloyd 2005: 48). Of course its significance can culturally differ. This feature of orgasm might explain how we can speak of sexual desire across times and cultures as a unified phenomenon, even though sexual desires and bodily sensations are socially and linguistically mediated.

If the pleasure of orgasm is unique, why do people usually prefer sex with someone else to masturbating, given that masturbating produces orgasms, often more intense than partnered sex? This shows that orgasm is not the only pleasure sought in sexual activity, not that its pleasure is not unique. Touching, smelling, kissing, and licking, for example, are other goals of sexual desire (Soble 1996: 85–86). We can even claim that people prefer the pleasure of orgasm through these other goals.

The discussion of sexual pleasure is important in itself and for defining “sexual desire” and “sexual activity”:

Sexual activity can … be defined as activity that tends to fulfill sexual desire, while sexual desire is sufficiently defined as the desire for certain bodily pleasures, period. (Primoratz 1999: 46)

“Sexual activity” is ultimately defined in terms of “sexual pleasure” via that of “sexual desire”. But which bodily pleasures? One answer is pleasure-as-sensation: those “experienced in the sexual parts of the body, i.e., the genitals and other parts that differentiate the sexes” (Primoratz 1999: 46). More generally, and accounting for sexual pleasures not located in the genitals, sexual pleasure

is the sort of bodily pleasure experienced in the sexual parts of the body, or at least related to those parts in that if it is associated with arousal, the arousal occurs in those parts. (Primoratz 1999: 46)

To distinguish a sexual from a nonsexual kiss, we ask which of the two is associated with arousal, and we understand the notion of arousal as essentially linked to the sexual body parts.

Because the above view relies solely on sexual pleasure-as-sensation, it would have to understand the other two types ultimately in terms of pleasure-as-sensation. That is, what makes sexual pleasure-as-enjoyment sexual is its connection to arousal. This implies that “sensory pleasure is more fundamental when it comes to sex” (Goldman 2016: 95). Although in nonsexual contexts we do not pursue activities because of their sensual pleasures, we pursue sex for sexual pleasure-as-sensation.

In most activities, the pleasure and the activity are intertwined—we do not watch a movie and then feel the pleasure. Instead, we enjoy the movie as we watch it. The pleasures here are pleasures-as-enjoyment. Things are different with sex because of pleasure-as-sensation, specifically, orgasm. Sexual pleasure-as-enjoyment supervenes on sexual pleasure-as-sensation, and it often culminates in orgasm, a result that comes at the end of the activity (though the orgasm as an end differs between men and women). We can then see why some prominent philosophers have considered temperance and intemperance to be about bodily appetites satisfied especially through touch (Aristotle, Nicomachean Ethics 1118a–1118b).

Moreover, sexual pleasure seems to be the primary motive for sexual activity: although sexual activity has other goals (Meston and Buss 2007), few people would have sex just to exercise, to boost their self-image, or for revenge, and although many people would have sex just to procreate, procreation would plummet were sex to not be enjoyable. It then seems that sexual pleasure provides a basic motive for sexual activity that underlies multiple other motives.

Sexual pleasures-as-enjoyment and as-feeling might thus be parasitic on sexual pleasures-as-sensations. The butterflies one feels in one’s stomach at the prospect of sex exist because of the expectation of sensual pleasure, and so does enjoying a sexual act. Sexual pleasure, especially as-sensation, stands out as the main motivation for having sex, and its concept supplies us with a good way of defining “sexual activity” and “sexual desire”.

It is a contentious question in the philosophy of sex of how the triumvirate concepts of “sexual desire”, “sexual activity”, and “sexual pleasure” are ordered when it comes to their conceptual analysis. Which concept is prior? (Jacobsen 2006).

1.4 Sexual Preferences and Orientation

Sexual orientation is commonly understood as a person’s standing sexual preference for men, women, or both. It is a basic preference, unlike, say, the preference for blondness or buttock size. It is also an organizing preference: other sexual preferences are built upon it (Stein 1999: ch. 2). A foot fetishist is either gay, straight or bisexual, before he is a foot fetishist, though it is an empirical question whether there can be sexual orientations for body parts (or objects) regardless of the gender or sex of the person’s body part (Stein 1999: ch. 2; Wilkerson 2013).

Mere sexual preferences vary tremendously, targeting people, objects, activities, and sexual positions, probably because they are a function of the person’s individual history and the available social and cultural options (on this variety, see Love 1992). Given their variety, it is inevitable that some preferences are considered perverted (e.g., coprophilia), some immoral (e.g., pedophilia), and some both. Yet with others it is not so obvious, such as sexual preferences for members of particular races or ethnic groups. Perhaps X’s preference for Asian women is innocent, on a par with the preference for tall people. But it might also indicate an ethical fault if, say, racially ugly stereotypes inform it (Halwani 2017b; Zheng 2016).

Returning to sexual orientation, its popular conception relies on dubious assumptions (Corvino 2006a; Dembroff 2017). (1) It assumes three basic orientations: homosexual, heterosexual, and bisexual. (2) It includes the gender or sex of the person who has the orientation as an essential element of the orientation; X’s being gay means that X has the same sex/gender as the target of the orientation. (3) It is ambiguous between sex and gender: is a straight man attracted to the gender or the sex of women? (The same question arises regarding the person with the orientation.) (4) It assumes a binary of gender/sex for both parties, excluding people who exist outside the binary. (5) It is ambiguous between sexual and emotional attraction: if a man is emotionally attracted to other men, does that mean that he is gay or something else? (6) It is silent on what counts as the basic components of the orientation: is it behavior, desires, or fantasies? Finally, (7) it assumes the cross-temporal and cross-cultural existence of the three sexual orientations: there were gay men and gay women in 15th century Russia just as there were in 21st century North America, albeit with adjustment for cultural variances.

(1) There is no good reason to believe that there are only three sexual orientations. Many men are attracted to people with female features from the waist up but male features from the waist down (a penis). What is their orientation? Many men are also attracted to both young boys and women—this is true of many cultures around the world, past and present. Are they all bisexuals? It is also possible that some men are attracted to young people, both girls and boys. Is there a sexual orientation, then, for young people? And zoophilia threatens to expand the number of sexual orientations with no limit: genuine zoophiles—people who have long-standing desires to have sex with nonhuman animals—will have as many sexual orientations as there are different types of animals to which they are attracted (Wilkerson 2013).

(2) It is unclear why the gender/sex of the person with the orientation should be a component of the conception of sexual orientation. Under the poplar conception, if a formerly straight man is currently a woman (after transitioning), they would now be a lesbian (assuming that their sexual desires for women does not change). But if we omit the person’s own gender from the conception, the person’s sexual orientation remains the same. Perhaps this would be politically and morally better (Dembroff 2017).

(3) The lack of distinction between sex and gender makes it hard to classify cases such as this: X is attracted to Y who is anatomically male (sex) but who presents herself as a woman (gender). Assume that X’s own gender and sex are male. Then, whether we claim that X is gay or is straight, we face obstacles: if X gay, X would not be attracted to someone who appears as a woman. If X straight, X would not be attracted to someone who is anatomically male. The popular concept of orientation leaves such cases unclassified (Corvino 2006a; Wilkerson 2013).

(4) Connected to the previous point is that the popular understanding of sexual orientation assumes a binary conception of sex/gender, albeit one that can include trans people. A straight woman is a woman, cis or trans, who is attracted to men (cis or trans). Thus, there is no room for people who are gender fluid or whose gender or sex identification exists outside the binary (Dembroff 2017).

(5) Both the American Psychological Association and the Human Rights Campaign understand “sexual orientation” as including emotional attraction. The former’s definition states,

Sexual orientation refers to an enduring pattern of emotional, romantic, and/or sexual attractions to men, women, or both sexes. (American Psychological Association, Introduction to “Sexual Orientation and Homosexuality”, Other Internet Resources)

Thus, the APA believes that a man would be straight were he to be emotionally (even if neither romantically nor sexually) attracted to a woman. Yet it is possible that he is nonetheless sexually attracted to men, a result that leads to conceptual trouble. Perhaps keeping the conception of sexual orientation limited to sexual attraction so as to avoid such muddles is better (though adding romantic attractions is plausible, given that they include a sexual dimension) (Dembroff 2017).

(6) The popular conception of sexual orientation is not so crude as to rely solely on behavior, but it is silent on what we should rely. Desires and fantasies are obvious candidates. But occurrent desires are not a good guide to sexual orientation: a shepherd can sexually desire sex with a sheep, but he need not be a zoophile, even were his desire for it to recur. David—a straight guy—might desire oral sex from another man (Tom) or other men. Recourse to “enduring desires”, as in the APA’s definition, might not do the trick if the conditions under which David desires oral sex from other men recur. Other information, such as counter-factual information as to what the person would do under such-and-such conditions (e.g., Stein’s “ideal conditions”; 1999: ch. 2), is needed—if David prefers a woman’s mouth under ideal conditions, then he is straight. But stating these conditions is tough. What if David prefers the way that Tom performs oral sex? David might, under some conditions, still opt for Tom (Corvino 2006a; cf. Díaz-León, forthcoming).

Perhaps fantasies are a better guide if we have a good way of distinguishing between fantasies that indicate the person’s sexual orientation and those that don’t (after all, David’s desire for Tom is a fantasy of sorts; Storms 1980). This might push us to ideal conditions again, to distinguish between someone’s real and “fake” fantasies. Or we might rely on initial sexual impulses: what sexually catches the eye of someone, without much thought: David does desire Tom’s oral skills, but what captures David’s sexual eye are women, not men.

(7) Philosophers and historians of sex are roughly divided into social constructionists and essentialists. Weak social constructionism claims that the concepts of “homosexuality”, “heterosexuality”, “natural sexuality”, and similar concepts are limited to a specific time period and geographical region. This version is weak because it is only concerned with how sexuality is conceptualized: there might have been homosexuals in ancient Greece, but the ancient Greeks did not think about them using the concept “homosexual”. Strong social constructionism—more in line with Michel Foucault’s views (1976)—claims that the very existence of homosexual and heterosexual orientations is geographically and temporally limited; our concepts of “homosexual” and “heterosexual” do not refer to anything when used to refer to other times and regions. Essentialists claim that homosexuals, heterosexuals, and bisexuals have existed in various times and cultures (see Card 1995: ch. 3; Corvino 1997: pt. III; Corvino 2006b; De Cecco 1981; Mohr 1992: ch. 7; Stein 1992, 1999: ch. 4; Wilkerson 2013).

Essentialism does not appear to be correct. It has difficulty accounting for the historical and cultural evidence: Were all the ancient Athenians who had sex with boys and women bisexuals? Possibly, but then why, in such social configurations, do we find a preponderance of bisexual men? If they were not all bisexuals, what were they? Neither “homosexual” nor “heterosexual” is adequate. Perhaps then such men had an altogether different sexual orientation. Related to this, essentialism has to be universally true for it to be true at all, for if it excludes some cultures and times, it concedes the truth of social constructionism. But if true of every single culture, it would be a very strong thesis, and the need for evidence becomes more urgent. Perhaps, then, some version of social constructionism is true. Our sexual desires are biologically rigid enough to target mostly members of our species, but not so rigid as to reflect only our three basic sexual orientations, though social constructionism would have to properly accommodate evolutionary biology’s “designing” us for procreation (Halperin 1990: ch.1).

1.5 Sexual Identity

The concept of “identity” is a philosophical minefield: identity can be descriptive or normative; public or personal; with explanatory power or inert. The distinction between first person and third person attributions of identity helps us see this. When Amy asserts that she is gay, she could be describing herself (informing someone of who she is); she could be asserting a political or cultural position, especially if the identity in question is threatened by the powers that be (“I am gay”, uttered as a way of resisting oppression); or she could be making sense of herself, either to herself or to others: “I am gay” helps Amy see herself or others see her more coherently. Third parties can make the same assertion about Amy in any of these ways.

The second and third ways are interesting because they allow choice with respect to the identity, and disagreement about its assertion. Amy can choose to adopt, be indifferent to, or reject the identity of being gay, and she can choose to use it (or not) to make sense of herself. She might fail to identify with her homosexuality because it is not important to her, because she does not find gay cultural ways appealing, because she does not think highly of gays, because she is ashamed, because she is religious, etc. This allows for healthy disagreements with Amy’s decisions. And Marcia, a straight woman, might be wrong to assert her straight identity in a climate in which gay people are oppressed, much like a person might be wrong to assert his white identity in a racist society, also allowing for disagreements with her (see Alcoff 2006, esp. pt. I; Appiah 2005: ch. 3; Halwani 2006; Lance & Tanesini 2000; Ozturk 2017; Wilkerson 2007).

2. Normative Issues

2.1 Good and Bad Sex

“Good sex” and “bad sex” can refer to moral, pleasurable, aesthetic, practical, legal, and, especially with sex, naturalness (Soble, with Halwani 2017: 8–16). It is unclear what aesthetic sex is (this is in need of philosophical exploration), but applying some common aesthetic concepts, such as “unity”, “coherence”, and “completeness”—concepts used in defining the aesthetic experience (Beardsley 1982: chs. 1, 5, 16; cf. Levine 2006; Singer 2001: ch. 5)—might be useful: a sexual act can be complete, coherent, and unified. Assuming these three are the only components of aesthetic experiences, sexual activity can provide an aesthetic experience to its participants. Other concepts, such as “beauty” and its opposites (e.g., “dullness”, “monotony”, “the disgusting”, “the insipid”) can also be relevant, though whether they retain their aesthetic sense when applied to sex is the question. This last point is as true, if not more, of “pleasure”: Is there such a thing as aesthetic pleasure, and can it be a property of sexual acts?

Sex can also be practically or pragmatically good or bad: a “sexting” politician can ruin his career, unprotected anal sex risks contracting HIV, sex without contraception risks pregnancy (if undesired), and public sex risks arrest. Practically good sex does not lead to bad results or has positive outcomes: a sense of rejuvenation, loss of calories, or a wanted pregnancy. I set aside aesthetic, practical, and legal considerations, though many issues that go under them are also moral (e.g., pregnancy and STDs).

“Good sex” most obviously refers to pleasurable sex. A sex act can be good or bad depending on the amount and intensity of the pleasure or pain it provides (Vannoy 1980: ch. 3). We must keep in mind the different senses of “pleasure” that can come into play, though pleasure-as-sensation and pleasure-as-enjoyment are crucial because they are the point of sex and because their opposite pains can be pretty bad. Imagine the sexual experience of a woman forced into marrying someone she finds undesirable, even revolting. Such negative emotions provide the crucial reason why consent is necessary. Note also how negative evaluations border on the moral: a disgusting sexual experience is both painful and, perhaps because of this, leaves a bad moral taste in one’s mouth.

2.2 Sex and Morality

Sexual activity is either morally permissible or impermissible. There is consensus among philosophers that informed and voluntary consent is necessary for the moral permissibility of sex though there are dissenters, and consent’s sufficiency is debatable (see below).

We think of sexual activity as neither obligatory nor supererogatory, but as permissible in that if the participants agree to the act, this is the end of the story. Yet there are interesting questions. (1) Are there sexual acts that are good in some more positive sense? (2) Are there sexual obligations—moral obligations to engage in sexual activity? and (3) Are there sexual supererogatory actions?

The answer to (1) seems positive, and the virtues help us see this: a sexual act can be caring, courageous, kind, generous, compassionate, or fair. Each is compatible with the act being nothing but a “cold fuck”, and each is done from a motive that is additional to, or in place of, that of sexual desire, and neither possibility subtracts from the goodness of the act. Actually, acting from sexual desire might diminish its goodness if sexual desire objectifies (see below). Thus, sexual acts can be morally evaluated as good beyond permissibility because of participant consent. Further questions concern sexual desire’s connections to the virtues and the vices (especially temperance and intemperance) and how a virtuous (and vicious) agent relates to sex, including how they sexually act and what motivates such actions (Halwani 2003: ch. 3, 2018a, 2018b: ch. 7; Morgan 2003a).

(2) Clear cases of sexual obligations exist in relationships (though the obligations are likely imperfect) because sexual activity is an expected and crucial aspect of (especially monogamous) relationships. Note that ordinarily threatening harm to someone unless they have sex is morally wrong, but threats to end a relationship unless the other party has sex (“Have sex with me or I will break up with you”) are not obviously wrong, further indicating that sexual obligations exist (Anderson 2013; Soble 2017a; Wertheimer 2003: ch. 12).

The difficult question is whether there are sexual obligations outside such relationships. If having sex is a basic need, perhaps plausible cases involve a health caretaker alleviating the sexual needs of a patient. Even if not a duty, such actions might be classified as supererogatory (Soble 2017a: 453–54; see below). These cases are plausible only if sexual needs are basic and if certain professionals have duties to meet them. One can argue that although under the usual conception of “health care professional” (e.g., a nurse) there are no such duties, society should create a category of such professionals to meet these needs—if they are indeed basic.

Still, sexual obligations might exist outside professional roles, based in general duties of benevolence—attending to someone’s sexual needs would be similar to attending to someone’s hunger (Soble 2017a: 454–55). But who is to fulfill these obligations? What would their fulfillment amount to (is masturbating the beneficiary of the duty enough)? Do the gender and sexual orientation of the parties matter? These are tough questions, but they have their parallels in nonsexual domains—Who has to fulfill the obligation to feed the starving? Is a plate of boiled rice enough or more sophisticated dishes are required?

But they might not be exactly parallel. The extent to which someone’s sexual needs are properly met does somewhat depend on their sexual desires and preferences: a straight man’s needs might not be met by a gay one, and straight women meeting men’s sexual needs is troubling given sexism and gender-based oppression. Moreover, if X’s sexual need cannot be alleviated by X masturbating, the question of how the needs are to be met is pressing. There is also the question of how to determine the depth of a sexual need to see whether it gives rise to an obligation.

Even if such sexual obligations do not exist, obligations to ourselves to develop or dampen certain sexual preferences might, assuming there are general moral obligations to ourselves. Pedophiles, for example, might have an obligation to change their preferences, not merely to refrain from acting on them. Other examples include obligations to change one’s preferences (or their lack) for, say, members of a particular race, ethnic group, age group, body type, etc. These are more controversial, however, because it is not clear that such preferences are bad to begin with (Halwani 2017b; Zheng 2016), and some might not be under our control as others are (preference for skin color vs. age group).

(3) A supererogatory action is permissible but not obligatory, is intended to benefit the recipient, involves, or probably involves, “a significant reduction in the interests or good of the agent, [o]r the act is risky, significantly, not trivially”, and is such that the agent knows or truly believes this in advance (Soble 2017a: 452; the agent’s belief has to be true; falsely believing that the act is risky might disqualify the act from being supererogatory). There can easily be permissible, non-obligatory sexual actions intended to benefit the recipient. So everything hinges on the criterion of serious risk to the agent.

Although the inclusion of risk is controversial—one can imagine actions that greatly benefit another without risk to the agent that are not obligatory—it is plausible to assume it because it explains why the agent, not only the act, is admirable (Heyd 2015). What are the risks to the agent in the case of sexual supererogation? Risk of pregnancy is one, risk of contracting serious (or not so serious) diseases is another. But consider: X is attracted to and wants to have sex with Z, whom X meets in a bar. For some reason, having sex is a crucial need for Z, and X knows this. X also knows that were X to have sex with Z, there’s a serious risk that Y, X’s partner, will find out and dissolve the relationship with X, a relationship that X values. X nonetheless has sex with Z (and enjoys it). This satisfies the conditions for a supererogatory act, but it is doubtful that X performs one. The presence of sexual desire and the prospect of sexual pleasure lower the degree of the supererogation, if not entirely nullifying it. This is not parallel to other cases of supererogation, in which no additional motive to wanting to help someone exists. In X’s case, X intends to benefit Z but also to derive pleasure from the sexual act. This might affect its supererogatory status.

Thus, risk to the agent might not be sufficient; perhaps the agent must also lack the sexual desire for the action or find it undesirable. The degree of supererogation increases in direct proportion to that of undesirability. As awful as it sounds, this fits with the type of cases that would come to mind in thinking of supererogation: sex with the least physically desirable. But there is room for subjectivity: a young gay man not attracted to other young men would find sex with them undesirable, so having sex with one out of kindness would be supererogatory in his case.

Is sexual activity like any other activity in that the same moral rules apply to it?

[N]o conduct otherwise immoral should be excused because it is sexual conduct, and nothing in sex is immoral unless condemned by rules which apply elsewhere as well. (Goldman 1977: 280)

This is true at a general level because the same general moral features (e.g., harm) affect sexual acts. But it might be false at more specific levels: sexual violation of the body by a penis or an object makes the violation distinct. This has to do with how one experiences sexual bodily violations, thereby making sexual consent a crucial moral aspect of sexual relations (Wertheimer 2003: 107–112). Moreover, if Kant is right, the objectifying nature of sexual desire makes it unique. If virtue ethicists are right, actions can be right and wrong because they are sexually temperate and intemperate: seducing the ex-boss’s husband is vengeful or intemperate, depending on the motive (Carr 2007; Halwani 2018a, 2018b; Piers 1999). The specialness of sex might be explained by sexual desire’s rootedness in biology and its being directed at the bodies of other human beings (Dent 1984: ch. 2 and passim).

2.2.1 Consent

Consent is crucial because (a) it transforms an otherwise wrong act into a permissible one (though not necessarily to a good act); (b) in heterosexual sex, men and women might importantly differ when it comes to sex; and (c) sexual violation is typically experienced as very harmful (Wertheimer 2003: passim).

There is general consensus among philosophers that valid or genuine consent (henceforth “consent”) by all the parties to a sex act is necessary and sufficient for the moral permissibility of the sex act (Archard 1998; Mappes 1987; Miller & Wertheimer 2010; Primoratz 2001; Wertheimer 2003; but see Pateman 1988), though what valid consent consists of is an intricate issue (to which Wertheimer 2003 is dedicated). Yet the sufficiency of consent can be questioned. If, for example, sexual desire by nature objectifies, as the Kantian view has it, then the consent of the parties is insufficient—they consent to a wrong action (see below).

Another reason to reject consent’s sufficiency stems from some conceptions of what marital sex is. The theory of New Natural Law considers only marital sex—which it understands as referring to sex acts between married partners who do it from the specific motive of the good of marriage (what this means, though, is unclear)—is morally permissible (even good). The main reasons are the theory’s view of marriage, which, following Thomas Aquinas, is understood as a basic good, and the view of marital sexual acts as reproductive and unitive, as two-in-one flesh communions. Thus, although consent to the sexual act is necessary, it is not sufficient: the sex has to be done from the motive of the good of marriage (Finnis 1993; George 2003; George & Bradley 1995; Lee & George 1997).

Two prominent objections to the New Natural Law view are (1) that the view of marriage is both undefended and implausible: the connection between reproduction or biological two-in-one union and the morality of sex is unclear, and (2) that it is unclear why other goods (sexual pleasure) are ruled out as basic (Koppelman 2008; see also Biggar & Black 2000).

New Natural Law is a version of any type of view that limits the morality of sexual acts to specific domains. In addition to marriage, love is another such domain. A view confining sex to love need not insist also on marriage, on only two love partners, or that they be of different sex/gender. It requires only the presence of love. Other versions require only affection or a mutually respectful relationship (Hampton 1999; Nussbaum 1995). On such views, consensual casual sex between two strangers is impermissible.

But why must such factors be present for the permissibility of sex? One prominent reason is that sex is somehow morally dangerous, so something is needed to minimize from or erode this danger. Sex might make us treat our sexual partners as objects, and the power of sex might make us engage in sex with the wrong people, in the wrong circumstances, etc. Love or a respectful relationship minimizes these risks (Nussbaum 1995).

But if sex is objectifying, love or a respectful relationship might not prevent this objectification; lovers or partners to a relationship end up objectifying each other (Soble 2017b). Moreover, if sex is so powerful or mind-numbing, being in a relationship might not make this power any less effective: partners soon start eyeing people outside the relationship. The argument must assume that being in a relationship turns off sexual desire for other people. This is implausible, however, given that in long-term relationships “bedroom death” might eventually set in. There is also the thought that relationships do not escape the power of desire: people often have sex with each other prior to initiating a relationship.

A second type of reason against the sufficiency of consent is harm. Setting aside harm to third parties, if a sexual act leads to harm to one or more of the parties to it, then consent is not sufficient. This view might be plausible especially when it comes to women, given that many women engage in consensual sex but motivated by nonsexual desires, such as not wanting to put their partner in a foul mood. The harm is psychological, especially to their autonomy (West 1995). This implies that prostitutes are harmed women because of their consent to undesired sex, an implausible implication. However, even if specific formulations of the view are implausible (such as West’s; see Soble 1996: 37–39, Wertheimer 2003: passim), this does not negate the claim that if sexual activity harms one or more of the consenting parties, the activity is wrong. Put this way, the argument sounds plausible: there is no good reason to deny that harmful sexual acts are wrong in that respect. One might object that this argument is paternalistic, telling people not to engage in sex when the sex is harmful (Soble 1996: 37–39). This objection is true in that harmful sex gives the participants a reason to not engage in it, although it cannot be used to argue that social or legal forces should prevent this action.

A third type of reason relies on virtues and vices. Consider the following examples.

  • (1) A student offers their teacher sex for a high grade (the teacher consents).
  • (2) A guy has sex with another guy during a wake (neither is directly related to the dead person).
  • (3) Lisa hates yet desires Nancy; she wants to sexually humiliate her; Nancy knows this but desires Lisa, and she does not care. They have sex during which Lisa heaps verbal abuse on the trembling-with-desire Nancy.
  • (4) Omar is a handsome gay man who loves having sex with many guys to feed his ego. At the end of the day, all spent, he agrees to a seventh hookup because the guy is a catch. He tells the guy, “You are my seventh today, so I might not be very energetic”. The guy says, “This is actually a turn-on”.
  • (5) Isabel has undesired sex with her boyfriend so as not to deal with his foul mood (he is not abusive, but accustomed to getting his way), even though she knows that she need not agree to sex every time he wants it.

Each case has universal participant consent, yet each sexual act is wrong in some aspect (though not all are seriously wrong) because it exhibits a vice: unprofessional, intemperate, malicious (and possibly cruel and demeaning; cf. Morgan 2003a), vain, and cowardly, respectively. Once again consent is not sufficient for the act’s goodness, though perhaps it is for its permissibility (depending on the seriousness of the harm or vice).

The necessity of consent is often taken for granted by philosophers. But this can be questioned. For instance, viewing sexual activity and pleasure as casual might render consent unnecessary in some cases (Benatar 2002). On the “casual view” of sexual pleasure, sexual pleasure is like other pleasures and may be enjoyed like them, subject to the usual moral constraints. If so, liberals are correct to defend promiscuity and casual sex as morally permissible, but might be unable to explain the wrongness of pedophilia or the special wrongness of rape, because if sexual pleasure is casual it would be difficult to see why pedophilia is wrong, and why the wrongness of rape is as bad as we think it is; perhaps it would be as bad as forcing “somebody to eat something” (Benatar 2002: 196). Arguing that children cannot consent to sex, so pedophilia is wrong, assumes that sexual pleasure is serious, otherwise children’s consent would not be necessary. Indeed, a parent might want to instill in their child the ability to be sexually experienced, so might coerce the child into sex on occasion, much like parents coerce their children into activities deemed good for them (Benatar 2002: 195–196). Thus, consent might not always be necessary. Briefly put, if sexual activity is trivial, sexual consent would not be important (or as important as we think).

Since we do consider sex to be important (imagine claiming that incest or sex with animals is “cool” because sex is trivial), the casual view of sex must be wrong. But then promiscuity and casual sex cannot be easily defended on liberal grounds, and a significance view of sex—that sex is a serious matter—is correct (Benatar 2002: 191–192). Thus, if the liberal is to accept the significance view of sex, she must shield casual sex and promiscuity from moral censor.

One strategy is to argue that sex is significant in that it involves one’s most important private space: one’s body. Suppose that X is a social person, always happy to have guests over at X’s house. One day, X discovers that some people have entered her apartment and used it to entertain themselves. X feels justifiably violated, indicating that the violation of private spaces is a serious wrong. If this is true of an apartment, it is truer of one’s body, especially since sexual violation usually involves the insertion of something in the body. This explains why sexual violations are experienced as deeply traumatic (Wertheimer 2003: ch.5). Sex is significant because it involves the involvement one’s most important and private space (cf. Brogaard 2015: 188–190).

Another strategy is to reject a single view of sexual pleasure as either casual or significant and argue that, depending on between whom the pleasure occurs, it might or might not be casual.

But even if (or when) sex is significant, it does not follow that it must be experienced only in the context of love, deep affection, etc. What follows instead is that consent is necessary. Thus, sex may be casual or promiscuous, as long as consent is secured.

2.2.2 Objectification

Objectification is a perennial issue in the philosophy of sex. It originates in Kant’s moral philosophy, and many feminists have adopted its language to criticize, for example, pornography, though whereas Kant was concerned with the objectifying nature of sexual desire, feminists do not target sex as such, but only in the context of patriarchy, claiming that it involves the sexual objectification of women by men in certain contexts (see below; some claim that all heterosexual sex is poison under patriarchy, e.g., Dworkin 1987). Indeed, sexual desire might not be necessary for the claim that a woman is sexually objectified under patriarchy: a man need not sexually desire a woman to catcall her.

Sexual objectification is treating or considering a person only as a sex object. Casual sex, watching pornography, catcalling, ogling, and other examples all allegedly involve sexual objectification. The “only” is important because otherwise there is no basis for moral complaint given that we frequently treat each other as objects. It is unclear whether objectification can consist of mere mental regard or whether it must have a treatment component (ogling someone is interesting because it is unclear whether it is treatment or mere regard). Some philosophers (Papadaki 2017; Langton 2009; Nussbaum 1995) define “sexual objectification” broadly enough to include mere regard (others, e.g., LeMoncheck [1985: ch. 1] do not). The inclusion of regard is wise because objectification seems to involve mere attitudes and perceptions (e.g., ogling, the regard found in watching pornography). X then sexually objectifies Y if, and only if, X treats or regards Y only as a sexual object.

The importance of objectification stems from a view of human beings as more than objects (LeMoncheck 1985: ch. 1; Papadaki 2017). If human beings, regardless of individual merit, have elevated moral status in virtue of having rationality, dignity, autonomy, or some such property, reducing someone to a lower level is wrong. But how common the actual occurrence of sexual objectification and how serious it is, are additional questions. It seems rare to treat our sexual partners as mere objects in any obvious and troubling ways: not only are we aware of their humanity, we are also attentive to it. Indeed, among the various ways of objectification—instrumentality, denial of autonomy, inertness, fungibility, violability, ownership, and denial of subjectivity (this is Nussbaum’s list [1995: 257]; cf. Langton 2009: 228–229)—only instrumentality is common. Others, such ownership and denial of subjectivity, seem rare (Halwani 2017a). Clear cases of sexual objectification include sexually-motivated rape and catcalling.

The Kantian view is that sexual desire objectifies by its nature and makes it impossible for the sexual partners to satisfy the Categorical Imperative. Equally problematic on this view is X objectifying him or herself—more accurately, allowing him or herself to be objectified by Y (Soble 2017b: 294–296). Indeed, self-objectification is what makes the view Kantian (Soble 2017b). It also marks another difference with feminists’ understanding of objectification.

Sexual desire objectifies by its nature because when X sexually desires Y, X desires Y’s body and body parts, especially the sexual ones, making it hard, if not impossible, to treat the humanity in Y as an end (Kant 1930 [1963: 164]). Only sexual desire among our inclinations is directed at human beings as such, not “their work and services” (Kant 1930 [1963: 163]). Although it is morally permissible to use each other for all sorts of purposes as long as they involve our “work and services”, sexual interactions are different. In almost every interaction with each other, we are interested in some ability, talent, or service that another can perform, an aspect intimately connected to their rationality. In these cases, either X does not desire Y’s body (but Y’s abilities, talents, or services) or X desires it but in service to Y’s abilities. Only with sexual desire (and, Kant says, in the rare case of cannibalism; 1930 [1963: 162–63]) does X desire Y as a body, as an object. X wants to enjoy Y herself, not her beautiful voice, her massaging abilities, etc. And if X desires Y’s abilities, it is in service to Y’s physicality. Sexual desire renders people objects by reversing our normal relationship with their bodies. Their bodies become the objects, not the instruments, of our attention. Kant thought that only marriage can make objectification tolerable, though his argument is implausible (Kant 1930 [1963: 163]; see Soble 2013b, 2017b; Denis 2001; Wertheimer 2003: 130–135).

Consent is thus not sufficient for permissible sex because consenting to sex is consenting to objectification, to something wrong (Soble 2017b: 303–304). Kant’s view indicates also why including regard in a definition of “sexual objectification” is plausible: even though X and Y treat each other well during sex, they still regard each other as mere sex objects.

The phenomenology of sexual desire seems to confirm Kant’s point: The “other’s body, his or her lips, thighs, buttocks, and toes, are desired as the arousing parts they are, distinct from the person” (Soble 2013b: 302). During a good sexual act, even with one’s lover, at some point they focus on ass, cock, pussy, tits, etc. (Vannoy 1980: 14). Kant’s view that sexual desire and activity are different—perhaps even unique—from other ways we view and interact with other people seems correct, providing support for the conclusion that sexual desire objectifies.

Sexual desire seems also powerful: its pull is strong and its voice loud, insisting, and persistent, so much so that people do irrational and immoral things to satisfy it. This might be a gendered feature of sexual desire, truer more of men than of women, though throughout history, and in today’s popular culture especially, women have often been portrayed as sexually insatiable (see Anderson & Struckman-Johnson 1998; Soble 2008: ch. 10). Of course, sexual partners normally observe limits on how they treat each other: they do not violate each other, treat each other literally as objects, and so on, exactly because they understand that they may not treat people in such ways. Thus, sexual desire operates within moral red lines.

The Kantian problem of objectification cannot be easily solved. Arguing that objectification is not a problem (Soble 2002: ch. 2) does not resolve the issue but simply disagrees with Kant. Claiming that parties to the sexual act normally consent to it (Mappes 1987), that objectification is okay as long as the relationship is respectful (Nussbaum 1995), or that sexual partners attend to each other’s sexual needs (Goldman 1977; Singer 1984: 382) also do not solve the problem because none addresses the nature of sexual desire (Soble 2017b).

Two other options are to accept the problem as a problem (but perhaps minimize it; Halwani 2017a) or to argue that sexual desire among human beings is not always objectifying. This is not merely the idea, insisted on by the intentional view, that sexual desire in human beings is complex, because a Kantian view of sex can accommodate this point, but that

there is far more to sex than the desire to use another’s body in a degrading manner for your selfish pleasure. Even the elements in sexual desire closest to this are combined, at least in healthy people, with other elements of human emotion that radically transform their meaning. (Wood 2008: 227)

Kant’s view, however, can also accommodate this insight. For example, X might sexually desire Y because Y is, among other things, a kind person, such that X would not have desired Y otherwise. But once X desires Y, X desires Y’s body and body parts. Sexual desire can be selfish while layered in other elements of human emotions, and the Kantian view need not be confined to a simplistic view of sexual desire such that it is crassly selfish or always acted on in a degrading “manner”; Kantian sex can be attentive to the other’s needs.

Nonetheless, the above idea that sexual desire can be combined with healthy emotions makes it possible that sexual desire is not always toxic, though how remains unclear. To succeed, sexual desire needs to be injected with healthy emotions, and not merely added to them, so that its nature changes on particular occasions.

On the Kantian view, not all sexual activity is objectifying: any sexual activity not stemming from sexual desire might not be objectifying. Even in those cases when sexual activity is objectifying, its seriousness varies: in consensual encounters it is drowned by other moral factors, whereas in (sexually motivated) rape it is very serious as sexual desire is the primary motive. (The motive is not to sexually objectify someone, as this is rare; instead, X regards Y in a way that is sexually objectifying.)

Moreover, it is unclear how sexual objectification differs between men and women, especially if men and women experience sex differently. Men experience sexual desire more frequently and insistently than women, though both are similar in their enjoyment of sexual activity (Symons 1979: 179). Thus men might engage in more sexual objectification than do women given that men think about sex more, ogle others more, and are more easily turned on visually. Since during sexual activity both would sexually objectify each other roughly equally, men would sexually objectify women overall more than women would men. Men also consume pornography (straight and gay) far more than women do, so would engage in much more sexual objectification than do women (by viewing people on-screen, by viewing people as mere sexual objects, etc.). It is perhaps in this sense that pornography allows women (and men, as objects of other men’s desire) to be objectified, not so much in the feminist sense, as I’ll explain next.

Some feminists have argued that pornography objectifies women by dehumanizing them, and it dehumanizes them by depicting them as mere sexual instruments for men (Hill 1987), by depicting their pleasure as only for the men’s (Longino 1980), by endorsing this treatment (Longino 1980; Eaton 2007), or by sending the message that all women are like this (Garry 1978). But these claims seem unconvincing. Pornography shows both men and women sexually enjoying each other, and it is difficult to prove that women’s pleasure is depicted as merely for the men’s (one might as well argue for the reverse) because the scenes themselves do not tell us anything. Nor does pornography seem to send messages about the status of women, whether about the depicted women or women in general. Doing so disables the viewer’s ability to imagine the scenes as he wants, thereby undermining its own purposes of titillating him (Soble 2002: ch. 1 and passim). But pornography enables the sexual objectification of women by displaying them to the gaze of the male viewer (ditto for men in pornography, albeit the gay gaze). This form of objectification seems innocuous, as long as it is not implicated in harm towards women, either individually or as a class (see Coleman & Held 2014: Pt. I; Soble 1999).

A deeper form of objectification is found in the view that pornography constructs women’s sexuality in a bad way (MacKinnon 1993; Dworkin 1974, 1979). It eroticizes patriarchal ways of viewing women, so that sexual desire becomes infused with dominance (cf. Morgan 2003a). The sexual desires of young men who routinely consume pornography become desires for the sexual domination of women. Women become socially constructed sexual beings for men, such that men desire them as pornography depicts them—as non-real beings: “objectification comes to define femininity, and one-sidedness comes to define mutuality” (MacKinnon 1993: 26; see Mason-Grant 2004). This view, however, implausibly neglects sexual desire’s biology, assuming that sexual desire can be fully socially constructed. Moreover, insofar as it is an empirical view, no proper evidence has been marshalled in its support (Diorio 2006; Tarrant 2014).

Sexual desire, as we have seen, is sufficient for objectification. However, it is not necessary. The guy catcalling a woman to feel part of the group is an example, and so are pornography directors and editors, who, by choosing the angle of the camera and the footage cuts, help sexually objectify the performers by presenting them to the viewer in particular ways; similar reasoning applies to, say, brothel owners. Indeed, women themselves might have few options other than to sexually objectify themselves, in a society that values women mostly through their sexuality (Jütten 2016). This might be the most pernicious form of sexual objectification in that social forces direct or pressure (not necessarily force) women to adopt such self-identifications or self-presentations to lead better lives, though whether they are actually flourishing is harder to gauge.

Recently, the concept of “derivatization” has been used to examine sex and sexual practices (Parker 2017; Wolf 2016).

To derivatize something is to portray, render, understand, or approach a being solely or primarily as the reflection, projection, or expression of another being’s identity, desires, fears, etc. The derivatized subject becomes reducible in all relevant ways to the derivatizing subject’s existence. (Cahill 2011: 32; see also 2013)

This view might capture some central feminist problems with pornography, namely, the depiction of women’s sexuality as reflecting men’s sexual desires of women. “Derivatization” might also be a more accurate concept than “objectification” because the latter relies on a mistaken view of human beings (that we are autonomous and non-bodily), whereas the former is based on a relational view of human beings (Cahill 2013).

The importance of “derivatization” notwithstanding, the above reasons do not clinch the case for its replacement of “objectification” because “objectification” need not assume that human beings are non-bodily and autonomous; it can accept them as enmeshed in this world as they are (with varying degrees of autonomy). Moreover, “derivatization” seems not to cover all cases (or all cases well). Consider a closeted gay man who catcalls a woman only to impress his peers. He objectifies her but does not seem derivatize her. If the reply is that he catcalls that particular woman because she represents not his desires but, say, society’s desires of what women should look like, then, given that for any sexual situation one can attribute derivatization to some party or other, “derivatization” stands in danger of being empty or too broad to be explanatory.

2.3 Sexual Perversion

The most famous contemporary philosophical account is Thomas Nagel’s psychologically-based view of sexual perversion. “Natural” sexual desire involves a multi-leveled mutual awareness by two people of each other: X perceives sexual excitement in Y, Y perceives excitement in X, X perceives that Y is excited by X, and so on (1969: 10–12). Sexual desire is complex in that it includes X’s sexual arousal by Y and X’s feeling sexual because of Y’s arousal by X, and so on with higher levels. Sexual perversions are then standing preferences for sexual activity that does not involve such multi-levels of sexual arousal. Since this view locates naturalness and perversion in the agent’s preferences, the sexual act itself need not mirror this structure; only the desires need have this complexity. Thus, it is inaccurate to accuse it of being sexless (Solomon 1974: 336) or to evaluate it by giving examples of non-complex sexual acts (Kupfer 2016: 333).

Although this view accommodates some perversions, such as zoophilia, pedophilia, and “intercourse with … inanimate objects” because they “seem to be stuck at some primitive version of the first stage of sexual feeling” (Nagel 1969: 14), it yields counter-intuitive results: masturbation does not fare well on this view, depending on whether it insists on the perception of the actual (not imaginative) embodiment of desire in another person (Soble 2013a: 85–87). It also misunderstands how perversions usually work: a coprophiliac does not normally desire sex with feces, but to incorporate feces in his sexual act with another, which could involve multi-levels of perception. Moreover, the account does not capture common intuitions about natural and perverted sex: it goes beyond the plausible idea that the arousal of one partner increases the other’s, to that of multi-layered arousal—an unintuitive idea. Similar views rely on the idea that natural sexual desire is interpersonal, such as that it culminates in love (Scruton 1986: ch. 10) and that it communicates attitudes and feelings (Solomon 1974; see Halwani 2018b: ch. 9 for discussion).

A non-psychological account of sexual perversion, one closer to folk biology, claims that only reproduction allows us to distinguish perversions from non-perversions (Ruddick 1984: 287; cf. Gray 1978). This does not mean that every act has to be reproductive, only that natural sexual desires “could lead to reproduction in normal physiological circumstances” (Ruddick 1984: 288). Thus, a heterosexual couple having intercourse but not intending to procreate are not engaging in perverted sex: their desire is of the kind that, under “normal physiological circumstances”, could lead to reproduction (1984: 288).

The account might have implausible implications, however. Anyone who prefers (heterosexual) oral sex to intercourse would be perverted. Moreover, any heterosexual couple that incorporate fetish objects, urine, feces, and so on, in their sexual intercourse would be sexually natural (Primoratz 1999: ch. 6; Shaffer 1978). Indeed, coprophilia can sink all the above accounts: two people who exhibit inter-personal attitudes in the form of multi-level perceptions, and who have sexual intercourse of the reproductive type, communicating healthy emotions sincerely, yet use feces in their activity would counter-intuitively not be perverted on any of the above accounts.

Even though explaining perversion in terms of biology seems obvious, “perversion” is opposed not only to “natural”, but also to “normal”, and the natural and the normal do not fully overlap. Moreover, the concept of “perversion” could refer to many things: the immoral, disgusting, bizarre, and biologically abnormal, among others. Using only one of these to define “perversion” will probably fail. It might also be that the methodology of discussing this concept is flawed, failing to account for the concept’s social function (Miller 2010). Thus, some philosophers have proposed to get rid of the concept altogether (Priest 1997; Primoratz 1999: ch. 6; Ruse 1988: 197–201). Recently, however, a new account of it in terms of its inhibiting “shared joy, mutual exploration, self-affirmation, and union” was offered (Kupfer 2016: 351). But this view seems to set the bar too high for what counts as non-perverted.

A good account of perversion might have to be prescriptive, capturing the core of perversion but not necessarily capturing all our beliefs about it (it should explain why our beliefs are mistaken when they are). Furthermore, it will likely be a psychological account, a preference to have sex with or involving certain types of object that are anti-life, such as bodily waste and corpses, and that are biologically odd, such as inter-species sexual intercourse. Evolutionary biology and evolutionary psychology would have to play crucial roles.

3. The Value of Sex

What is the value of sex? How important (or valuable!) is this value? Procreation, love, and pleasure (as types, not tokens) are obvious answers to the first question. Sex is usually the way to procreate, so sex is valuable insofar as procreation is valuable. But this value is instrumental, and it is contingent given technology’s ability to separate procreation from sex. There is also anti-natalism (Schopenhauer 1851, 1859: ch. 46; Benatar 2006, 2015), which implies that sex has negative value in its procreative aspect. The value of sex in regards to procreation is thus precarious.

Another instrumental value of sex is that X’s sexual desire for Y can (help) cause X to love Y (Bertocci 1949: ch. 2). Here, sex’s value is contingent on love’s, and, despite sounding strange, the value of romantic love, especially in its early, passionate stages, is not obvious given its negative effects on the lover and others. Still, if sex leads to the settled stage of love (via the passionate one), it is valuable for that. Sex can also express love and affection for one’s partner and cement their relationship (McKeever 2017, but see Vannoy 1980: ch. 1). But even if true, all this still makes sex’s value depend on and instrumental to love’s, especially since the two are very different (Goldman 1977; Soble 2008: ch. 9; Vannoy 1980: esp. ch. 1).

Does sex have intrinsic value? If it does, it is probably sexual pleasure, as-sensation or as-enjoyment, a pleasure that provides people with the main motive for having sex, often with drastic consequences. So then how valuable is the pleasure of sex? Perhaps we should regard our appetite for sex like we do that for food to avoid obsessing about it (Russell 1929 [1970: 289]). But can we go further?

People spend much time pursuing projects and activities they enjoy or consider worthwhile. Some do only when time, work, or family time permit, and some do much of the time (they are, say, independently wealthy). Writing, pursuing Hollywood or Bollywood stardom, playing chess, swimming, traveling, and, of course, building a family are examples. Other than philosophical far-fetched examples of worthless pursuits (counting blades of grass, collecting bottle caps), most projects and activities have some worth. Perhaps some projects are more worthwhile than others (though how to argue for this is not easy), but almost all have some worth, and an intellectual one at that, including watching reality television or reading junk fiction (Carroll 1998: esp. ch. 1 and 2).

Now consider X, whose life project is the pursuit of sexual pleasures. X says,

I am young, moderately good-looking, and, with current technology (e.g., phone apps), I can easily sexually hook up with others. I enjoy sex, and it makes me feel good. In between bouts of sex, I can see friends, go to the gym, movies, whatever. But my deepest enjoyment—my life-plan, to use philosophical jargon—is to pursue the pleasures of sex.

Is there something we can say to prove X wrong, especially if X has the talent for something considered more important? Perhaps we can claim that pursuing sex is not as worthy as reading Russian literature, but even here we are on insecure ground.

One can argue that X is not using X’s intellectual powers. But this drastically underestimates the reliance on intellect in sexual pursuits. Alternatively, one can argue that X is not using X’s intellectual powers to the utmost or in a theoretical way. But this would rule out many a life as good. One can argue that there are more important things in life than pursuing sexual pleasure. But X need not live without friends, family, and other important things present in normal lives. One can argue that sex objectifies, so it is wrong to make it central to one’s life. But unless one were a die-hard Kantian, the objectification involved in sex can be redeemed by other factors.

One can argue that sexual sensory pleasure “will not be at the center of a rational life plan”, and that these pleasures are “intermittent and short-lived”, their value ultimately depending “entirely on the interpersonal relationships into which they fit and which constitute their context” (Goldman 2016: 98). But it is not clear why the pleasures’ brevity and intermittency are problems. One can argue that someone who prefers masturbation to sex with others “could reflect a failure to understand the importance and value of sex and sexual pleasure” (Scanlon 1998: 175) because the importance of sex is its expression in relations with other people (Scanlon seems not to have in mind casual or promiscuous sex). But X can have affectionate sexual relationships with others, and friendships, etc., with different others. Even casual hookups have their bonding aspects. Finally, one can argue that sex “achieves a level of passion” with “no equal in other forms of interaction”, and such that when it occurs between lovers

it defines a most significant moment of goodness between two people, where each achieves a most profound moment of affirmation and satisfaction that is inextricably tied to the endeavor to please the other. (Thomas 1999: 59)

But note how the affirmation and satisfaction here can as easily apply to passionate yet love-less sex.

Thus, even if pursuing sexual pleasure is not as intellectually stimulating as reading classical Arabic poetry, it is not worthless, whether intellectually or non-intellectually, and it is on a par with many other pursuits that people undertake that are far from having intellectual depth. Moreover,

[I]sn’t being a provider of sexual pleasure an important and valuable attribute, one to be cherished? Maybe we should construct a theory of human dignity based on our sexual capacities … instead of looking for something ‘finer’ beyond or above the sexual. (Soble 2002: 58–59)

If X conducts X’s life morally, and if X develops some talents or hobbies for those rainy days (sure to come) when X is no longer sexually desirable and X’s friends are busy with other things, we can say to X, “Enjoy!”

Bibliography

The following anthologies are crucial resources for someone studying the field of the philosophy of sex. I give them abbreviations that I use in the rest of the bibliography.

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