Spinoza’s Epistemology and Philosophy of Mind

First published Mon Jan 10, 2022

Spinoza’s epistemology and philosophy of mind are governed by some rather unintuitive commitments: first, a commitment to universal intelligibility, often described as Spinoza’s version of what, with Leibniz, came to be known as the Principle of Sufficient Reason (PSR); second, a commitment to the explanatory closure of the mental and the physical; third, a commitment to the explanatory and ontological priority of an infinite thinker over any finite mind. The entry discusses these commitments before diving into the details of Spinoza’s theories of cognition and mindedness. (In line with Spinoza’s own practice, what follows treats “conceive”, “understand”, “think”, “explain”, and “cognize” as roughly interchangeable [cf. Wilson 1999: ch.10; Della Rocca 1996].)

1. Guiding commitments

1.1 Universal intelligibility

One of Spinoza’s most fundamental epistemological and methodological commitments is a commitment to universal intelligibility. In his most influential treatise, the Ethics, Spinoza expresses this commitment in two ways: first, as the axiom that there is nothing that cannot be “conceived”, either “through itself” or through “another thing” (Ethics [= E] 1ax2); second, as the claim that there is a “reason or [i.e.] cause” for the “existence or nonexistence” of every thing (E1p11atld1).

These formulations immediately raise several questions. What does it mean for something to be conceived “through itself”, i.e., in some sense be self-explanatory? Does the equivalence of causes and reasons suggested by E1p11altd1 mean that only appeals to causes can furnish reasons? Indeed, what counts as a “reason” (cf. Lin 2018)? It’s often assumed that in Spinoza’s view to give a “reason” for something requires engaging in the sort of apriori deductions that fill large swathes of the Ethics. The opening definition of the treatise, according to which something is a “cause of itself” if its existence is implied by its essence (E1def1), suggests that at least some of the relevant “reasons” will indeed be accessible apriori. But could sense experience also furnish us with reasons? Is seeing my dog play with a stick enough of a “reason” to “conceive” of her as existing, or must I deduce her necessary existence from the infinitely long series of prior causes (E1p28), a task Spinoza admits is impossible for finite minds like ours (Treatise on the Emendation of the Intellect [= TIE] §100)?

Controversially but influentially, Michael Della Rocca 2008 has argued that Spinoza’s philosophy as a whole can be derived from his commitment to intelligibility. (For criticisms see e.g. Laerke 2011, Newlands 2018, Renz 2018.)

1.2 Attribute barrier

A second guiding but unintuitive commitment of Spinoza’s epistemology has come to be known as the “attribute barrier”. A Spinozistic “attribute” is a descendant of the Cartesian “principal attribute” (AT 8a.25): roughly, it is the most basic qualitative kind under which something can fall. For example, to say that something is a mental thing or a physical thing – or, in Spinoza’s and Descartes’s terminology, “thinking” or “extended” – is to understand it in terms of its particular “attribute”.

Most commentators take Spinoza to uphold a total explanatory closure of mental and physical realms: pace Descartes, no physical thing can enter into conceptual or explanatory relations with anything mental, and vice versa. For example, regardless of how we might experience things, no physical occurrence, such as shaking a fist at someone, can be made intelligible by appealing to anything mental, like a menacing intention. Analogously, no bodily injury can make intelligible the feeling of pain.

This prohibition on any “explanatory flow” (Bennett 1984) between mental and physical realms is the core meaning of Spinoza’s attribute barrier doctrine. Given Spinoza’s commitment to universal intelligibility (see 1.1), derivatively, the impossibility of conceptual relations between minds and bodies implies the impossibility of causal relations between them (E3p2s). For if something is in principle unintelligible (as any purported causal relation between minds and bodies would be), it is also metaphysically impossible. This prohibition on causal interactions between mental and physical things is the key secondary meaning of the barrier doctrine.

Given that ordinarily we do appeal to intentions in explaining our physical actions and to bodily states in explaining sensations, what would lead Spinoza to such a prima facie implausible doctrine? The reason ultimately has to do with how Spinoza understands the nature of the most fundamental entity in his metaphysics, “substance”. Building on philosophical tradition that goes back to Aristotle, Spinoza associates being a “substance” with existential and explanatory self-sufficiency or independence (E1def3). Each essential quality or “attribute” of substance also must, Spinoza believes, manifest this independence proper to substance: “Each attribute of a substance must be conceived through itself” (E1p10). As a result, we cannot look for an explanation of the fact that substance thinks, or of how it thinks, anywhere else but in substance’s thinking nature (for example, we cannot appeal to the fact that it is also a material thing, i.e., a substance with the attribute of “extension”). In this sense substance as thinking is “conceived through itself”. The same reasoning will be true of any other substantial attribute.

This gives us the basic application of the barrier doctrine: the fact that God is a physical thing cannot explain God’s nature as a thinking thing; nor is explanation possible in the other direction. But the barrier doctrine also extends to creaturely intentions, sensations, and movements. Ontologically, all the things familiar to us from ordinary experience – animals, plants, inanimate objects – are for Spinoza merely modifications or “modes” of the single substance, “ways [modis]” that God is, just as (to borrow examples from Lin 2018) a wrinkle in a rug is one way a rug can be, and a fist one way a hand can be. Spinoza explicitly applies the barrier doctrine also to modes, stating that no modification of the thinking substance can require for its explanation the concept extension, and no modification of the extended substance can require for its explanation the concept thought:

each attribute is conceived through itself without any other (by 1p10). So the modes of each attribute involve the concept of their own attribute, but not of another one. (E2p6d)

(On attributes, see e.g. Gueroult 1958, Deleuze 1968, Shein 2009, Lin 2019.)

1.3 The priority of an infinite thinker

As we just saw, Spinoza derives his prohibition of mental explanations of physical actions from what he takes to be true of the relation between the mental and the physical in the case of God. This is an instance of a more general methodological and epistemological principle Spinoza holds dear, that of the explanatory priority of claims about substance (God) to claims about modes (creatures) (E1p1, E1p15). To return to our toy analogy, we can only understand what it is to be a wrinkle in a rug if we first understand what it is to be a rug. For Spinoza, philosophizing in proper order always requires us to start with God (E2p10s).

Given this explanatory priority of substance, to understand what it means to think or to have a mind we also cannot simply extrapolate from our own case (for example, from introspection, or from observing the behavior of fellow humans). Rather, to understand thought and mindedness we first have to understand the nature of divine thought, i.e., what it means to be an “infinite” – unlimited and self-sufficient – thinker. This is the fundamental case of thinking for Spinoza.

What does this infinite thought amount to? In one sense, it is simply an endorsement of the traditional doctrine of divine omniscience. In Spinoza’s framework, this doctrine becomes the claim that, as a thinking thing (i.e., a substance with the attribute of thought) God necessarily produces an “infinite idea”, that is, an infinite modification of God’s nature as a thinking thing (E2p1, E2p3, E2p7c). This infinite idea is a complete and veridical representation of everything that is, every bit of reality (E2p32). (Spinoza also calls this infinite mode an “infinite intellect” [E2p11c], seemingly without distinguishing the two terms.)

It’s worth keeping in mind that Spinoza is making here two distinct claims: to say that God is a substance with the attribute of thought (that is, a thing whose essential nature it is to think) is ontologically and explanatorily prior to the claim that this thinking substance also produces an actual representation or idea of everything (which is a claim about the existence of a certain kind of infinite mode). So although Spinoza faithfully follows tradition in endorsing the claims that God thinks and is omniscient, he also ends up with a quite nontraditional result: the divine “infinite intellect” is not part of, or identical with, divine nature or essence. In terms of its ontological status, the divine intellect is on par with finite minds insofar as these too are merely modes.

The belief that the metaphysically basic instance of thinking is the thinking done by an infallible and omniscient thinker goes some way toward explaining why Spinoza seems unconcerned about the threat of skepticism, so salient for Descartes (see also 3.1). For Spinoza thought in its fundamental instance is necessarily true; it “agrees” (E1ax6) with how things really are. So global skepticism is simply a metaphysical impossibility; all that remains of the skeptical threat is to be on guard against local instances of confusion and error that become possible in the derivative case of finite thought. Moreover, all such confusion and error need some further cause beyond the intrinsic nature of thought. (Indeed, one might worry that Spinoza lets the pendulum swing too far in the opposite direction: global skepticism might no longer be possible, but it might now be hard to see how error could be possible, if, in Spinoza’s substance-monistic framework, all ideas are ultimately God’s own [see 3.2.2].)

(On Spinoza’s understanding of thinking, see e.g. Melamed 2013, Newlands 2018, Renz 2018; on his two proofs that God thinks, e.g. Della Rocca 1996, Gueroult 1974; on skepticism, e.g. Carriero 2020, Perler 2018, Primus 2017.)

1.4 Philosophy as a way of life

Last but not least, we should not forget that Spinoza’s magnum opus carries the title Ethics. For him knowledge is not merely a theoretical achievement, as if we were solving conceptual puzzles for their own sake. For Spinoza, what is at stake in understanding anything, including thinking and knowledge, is a whole slew of practical goods: freedom, virtue, blessedness. Of the infinity of knowable things, Spinoza writes, he wants to write only about “those that can lead us, by the hand, as it were, to the knowledge of the human Mind and its highest blessedness” (E2pref).

2. Philosophy of mind

2.1 Minds

2.1.1 Minds as bundles

One reason why Spinoza might not care about distinguishing between calling something God’s “idea” and calling it God’s “intellect” (see 1.3) is that, like Hume, he appears to endorse what we today would call the “bundle theory” of mind. On this theory, there is nothing more to “minds” and “intellects” than collections of ideas of various complexity. (For example, the “idea that constitutes the formal being of the human mind is…composed of a great many ideas” [E2p15].) In particular, minds do not contain any specialized “faculties”, such as will or intellect (E2p48). If notions of such faculties are to have any validity at all, they must be understood as mere abstractions from particular ideas and particular volitions (E2p48s; G/II/130).

For Spinoza, what individuates one bundle of ideas from another seem to be their intentional objects, i.e., what they represent (E2p13s; see 2.1.3–4). For example, the aforementioned highly composite idea that is the “human mind” has a certain “actually existing body” as its essential object (see 2.2).

(On Spinoza’s bundle view of the mind, see e.g. Della Rocca 1996; Hübner 2019; Renz 2018. On abstraction, see 3.2.4; on the relation between ideas and affirmations, see 2.4; on the human mind specifically see 2.2.)

2.1.2 Minds as parts

Spinoza’s ground-floor commitment to substance monism (i.e., to the metaphysical possibility of only one “substance”, or existentially and explanatorily independent thing) leaves him with the problem of how to understand the ontological status of finite thought. If only one substance exists, what are we to make of human minds? These cannot be thinking substances as they are, say, for Descartes or Leibniz. Short of condemning all finite thinking as illusory, Spinoza seems to have only one option left: to identify certain instances of God’s own thoughts with finite thinking. And this is exactly what Spinoza does: he proposes that we regard all finite ideas, and all the finite “minds” these ideas compose (see 2.1.1), as “parts” of the divine “infinite intellect”:

the human mind is a part [pars] of the infinite intellect of God. Therefore, when we say that the human mind perceives this or that, we are saying nothing but that God, not insofar as he is infinite, but insofar as he is explained through the nature of the human mind, or insofar as he constitutes the essence of the human mind, has this or that idea. (E2p11c)

Finite minds are thus for Spinoza both modes of a thinking substance and parts of an infinite mode that is God’s own “intellect”.

The claim that finite minds are parts of the divine intellect may answer the question of the ontological status of finite thought, but it creates another puzzle: in what sense can a non-extended mind or intellect be a “part”, or have “parts”, moreover parts that are themselves “minds”?

2.1.3 Panpsychism

As we just saw, Spinoza accommodates human minds within his substance-monistic framework by carving up God’s “infinite intellect” into “parts”. But he isn’t concerned solely with making room in his metaphysics for human minds:

the things we have shown so far are completely general and do not pertain more to man than to other individuals, all of which, though in different degrees, are nevertheless animate [animata]. For of each thing there is necessarily an idea in God, of which God is the cause in the same way as he is of the [human mind] (E2p13s)

This is Spinoza’s thesis of panpsychism, or universal mindedness (more precisely, universal at least for all “individuals” or composite entities [E2def; G/II/100]). Panpsychism follows because all it takes for there to be a finite “mind” in Spinoza’s view is that there be some “part” of the omniscient divine intellect – some component idea of it – that represents some discernible bit of being. So not only is there nothing more to minds than ideas (2.1.1), there is nothing more to creaturely minds than God’s ideas.

Spinoza’s panpsychism may certainly seem more morally appealing than the vivisection-friendly Cartesian view that animals are just more complex versions of tables and clocks. Yet one may also wonder whether an account that can explain how human mindedness is possible only by instituting a general principle – namely, the divisibility of an omniscient infinite intellect into component ideas – that ushers in also plant and mineral minds has diluted the meaning of “mind” beyond recognition or usefulness. Can an account that sees mindedness everywhere explain phenomena that, to all appearances, are particular to human rationality and self-consciousness? And is Spinoza not guilty here simply of a profound confusion of categories: how can my mind just be God’s idea of something? Margaret Wilson expressed the classic version of these worries, pessimistically judging against Spinoza (1999: ch.9).

(On Spinozistic minds, see e.g. Alanen 2011, Koistinen 2018, Lin 2017, Newlands 2012; on mind-relativity of representing, see e.g. Matheron 1969, Donagan 1988, Della Rocca 1996; on individuation of subjects, Renz 2018.)

2.2 Human minds

2.2.1 Ideas of bodies

Any plausible panpsychism will have to say something about how human minds differ from all other minds that populate reality. Spinoza accounts for the distinctiveness of the human mind in two ways. First, as already noted, he underscores its complexity as a mental operation or act of thinking. Using the Scholastic term “formal being” to pick out this aspect of thinking, he writes, “the idea that constitutes the formal being of the human mind is…composed of a great many ideas” (E2p15). Second, Spinoza proposes that human minds are also distinct by virtue of what they essentially represent: the essential intentional object of the human mind is an actually existing body:

The object of the idea constituting the human mind is the body, or a certain mode of Extension which actually exists, and nothing else (E2p13)

the essence of the mind consists in this…that it affirms the actual existence of its body (E3GenDefAff [G/II/204]; cf. E2p11, E2p17s [G/II/105/32])

In other words, a certain (itself complex) “part” of the divine infinite intellect will count as a “human mind” iff it essentially represents a certain physical existent. It is in this intentional or representationalrelation (and not for example, per impossibile, in some causal relation [see 1.2]) that the mind-body “union” consists in Spinoza’s view: “We have shown that the Mind is united to the Body from the fact that the Body is the object of the Mind” (E2p21d) (cf. Renz 2018).

A few clarifications are in order. First, on hearing of Spinoza’s view we might be inclined to protest that human minds represent all sorts of things other than our own bodies: ideas, abstractions, other bodies, etc. (Wilson 1999: ch. 9). But, to be clear, Spinoza isn’t proposing here, rather implausibly, that we represent nothing but our own bodies. His claim is rather about what constitutes the essential intentional object of the human mind: other ideas composing my mind may come and go, but to remain the same mind across time, and distinct from other equally complex bundles of ideas, my mind must continue to represent a particular physical entity. Moreover, Spinoza holds that we are able to represent all the other things we represent only because we first conceive of our own body (for details, see 3.2 and 4).

Second, that my mind has some actually existing body for its essential intentional object also doesn’t mean that I know this body adequately. Far from it: “we have only completely confused cognition of our body” (E2p13s; cf. E2p27). There are several reasons Spinoza is led to this pessimistic verdict. For one, as we saw, the human mind is essentially an idea of some existing body and of “nothing else” (E2p13). In particular, the human is not essentially an idea of the many causes responsible for that body’s composition and continued functioning. But, on Spinoza’s conception of knowledge, understanding these causes would be necessary for a complete knowledge of that body (E1ax4; cf. Donagan 1988: 129).

Here is another reason why the idea that makes our minds our minds is “completely confused”. According to Spinoza, the only way I can cognize my own body as a particular thing existing in time (as opposed to knowing its atemporal “essence”, or knowing the general properties of all bodies) is through its modes or “affections” – that is, through the changes or determinations that this body undergoes, mostly under the influence of external causes (E2p19). “We feel that a certain body is affected in many ways” (E2ax4): we stub our toes, hear a voice, are warmed by the sun, etc. But what we grasp in such experiences is, according to Spinoza, only a “confused” amalgam of the nature of our own body and the nature of the external causes affecting it (for details, see 3.2.2). But, however confused, my first-personal “feeling” of what happens to my body suffices for distinguishing my “mind” from my ideas of other bodies: I don’t “feel” in the same way what happens to my sister’s equally complex body (her mind does), even if I can observe it (and even imitate it empathetically; see E3p27).

(See 4 for continuation of this account; on sense experience and error, see 3.1.2, 3.2.3.)

2.2.2 Knowing your pancreas and other problems

Recognition that the idea of the body that essentially constitutes a human mind is “completely confused” (E2p13s) goes some way toward defusing Spinoza’s otherwise baffling assertion that we “perceive” “[w]hatever happens in” that body (E2p12, emphasis added). Prima facie this proposition ascribes, implausibly, a godlike omniscience to human minds. But experience clearly tells against such a proposal: we certainly aren’t aware of all of the affections of our bodies (i.e., of all that “happens in” them), down to the cellular (and even quantum) level of each organ. It’s much more plausible to take Spinoza’s claim to be that we have such perceptions, but their utter confusedness or lack of clarity and distinctness makes them indiscernible to us.

The initial implausible appearance of E2p12 dissolves even further once we make note of Spinoza’s functional understanding of bodies: not everything that we might ordinarily consider a “part” of a body falls under this concept for Spinoza (cf. Donagan 1988:123):

parts composing the human Body pertain to the essence of the Body itself only insofar as they communicate their motions to one another in a certain fixed manner…and not insofar as they can be considered as Individuals, without relation to the human Body. (E2p24d)

Accordingly, Spinoza will have a suitably narrower understanding of the scope of “whatever happens in” the parts of our own bodies: we will “perceive” only those affections of the pancreas, say (to use Della Rocca’s example [2018]), that bear on the whole body’s ability to function as an integrated organism (cf. Garrett 2018: ch.14).

Even if we manage to make sense of the apparent ascription of omniscience to human minds, at least two other problems for Spinoza’s account of the mind-body relation remain.

First, although tying the individuation of certain “parts” of the infinite intellect to certain bits of reality that these parts essentially represent may well solve the problem of individuating finite minds in a substance-monistic framework (see 2.1.2), it also seems to generate a new problem. This is that to explain the nature of the human mind we must now appeal to the existence of bodies:

to determine what is the difference between the human Mind and the others, and how it surpasses them, it is necessary for us, as we have said, to know the nature of its object, i.e., of the human body (E2p13s)

The problem is that, as we know (1.2), Spinoza prohibits cross-attribute explanations: no physical thing can explain anything mental, and vice versa. Yet Spinoza’s own account of the essential constitution of human minds seems not just to allow for such cross-attribute explanations, but to require them.

Here is another interpretative problem that seems to plague Spinoza’s account of the human mind. How should we understand the relation between 1) the intentional or representational relation that human minds essentially bear to bodies, and 2) Spinoza’s claim that minds and bodies are “one and the same thing” (E2p7s)? The doctrine of mind-body identity seems to follow directly for Spinoza from substance’s identity under different attributes: since thinking substance and extended substance are in fact just a single substance considered or described in two different ways, so also all of substance’s modifications will be subject to that same sort of multiplicity of descriptions. Accordingly, the human mind and the human body are numerically “one and the same thing” (namely, a certain finite mode) but this mode can be veridically described as a mind or as a body. But when we pair this doctrine of mind-body identity with the thesis of an essential representational relation between the mind and the body, we are faced with the question, Why should a mind represent what it is numerically identical with, or be identical with what it represents? How do we make this twofold nature of the mind-body relation intelligible?

(On mind-body identity, see e.g. Delahunty 1985; Della Rocca 1996; Jarrett 1991; C. Marshall 2009; on its relation to mind-body intentionality, Garrett 2018: ch.15; Hübner forthcoming; for solutions to the barrier violation, e.g. Della Rocca 1996, Hübner forthcoming, 2019.)

2.3 Consciousness and ideas of ideas

Given the importance of the concept of consciousness to contemporary philosophy of mind, it is perhaps unsurprising that Spinoza’s readers have tried to extract a full-blown theory of consciousness also from the rare appearances of terms such as conscius and conscientia in his writings. Such efforts are also unsurprising given Spinoza’s historical placement between Descartes (often taken to define thought in terms of consciousness) and Leibniz (who distinguishes thinking as a perfectly general property from consciousness as a property of higher minds alone) (cf. LeBuffe 2010). Interpreters return again and again to certain questions: did Spinoza even have a theory of consciousness in a recognizable sense? If he did, was it an internally consistent and adequately defended theory? Was it meant to distinguish conscious and unconscious ideas (and so also conscious and unconscious minds [see 2.1.1])? Did Spinoza posit universal (but perhaps scalar or graded) consciousness, just as he posited universal (but scalar or graded) mindedness (see 2.1.3)?

The existing array of interpretations ranges widely, from Curley’s 1969 conclusion that for Spinoza “consciousness” picks out higher order ideas (that is, ideas of ideas); through proposals that the term is intended to track the complexity (Nadler 2008) or the power (D. Garrett 2018: ch.14, E. Marshall 2013) of ideas; to the claim that Spinoza uses conscius and conscientia in several different senses (LeBuffe 2010b).

The ideas-of-ideas reading of consciousness gets going because of passages like E4p8d, where Spinoza characterizes “cognition” of good and evil as “consciousness” of certain emotions (given that Spinozistic emotions or “affects” are already themselves constituted in part by “ideas” [E3def3]) and E3p9s, where Spinoza characterizes “desire” as “appetite together with consciousness of appetite” (given that “appetite” is already “related to the mind” [E3p9s]). In both cases the implication seems to be that consciousness is or involves higher order ideas.

Of course, this interpretation of consciousness is of no use to someone looking to Spinoza for a theory of selective consciousness, on which consciousness distinguishes some mental states from others. This is because in Spinoza’s framework there is no idea of which there is no higher order idea. This follows, first, from divine omniscience (an all-knowing God has ideas of all things, including all ideas) and, second, from Spinoza’s understanding of ideas of ideas as ways of regarding the first-order ideas, not numerically distinct from them. More precisely, for Spinoza, an idea of idea A is just A considered only as an act of thinking (leaving aside its representational content) – or, to use his Scholastic terminology, it is the original idea considered in its “formal reality” alone: it is “the form of the idea…considered as a mode of thinking without relation to the object” (E2p21s).

Interpretations on which consciousness is a scalar property tracking complexity or power fare much better in accounting for texts in which Spinoza depicts consciousness as a matter of selective causal and cognitive achievement, as in the following:

He who, like an infant or child, has a body capable of very few things and very heavily dependent on external causes, has a mind which considered solely in itself is conscious of almost nothing of itself, or of God, or of things. On the other hand, he who has a body capable of a great many things, has a mind which considered only in itself is very much conscious of itself, and of God, and of things (E5p39s)

(On consciousness see also Miller 2007.)

2.4 Willing or affirming

Spinoza’s account of willing is developed in opposition to Descartes’s account, on several fronts. First, and perhaps most famously, Spinoza denies that human beings have a free (undetermined) will (E1app; G/II/78). The freedom that Descartes finds undeniable in introspection is for Spinoza only a manifestation of the depths of our ignorance about how we actually have been determined to act. Second, Descartes had proposed that we distinguish intellect as a faculty for forming representations, from will as a faculty for judging the truth value of these representations. Spinoza rejects both the idea that there are any faculties over and above particular ideas and volitions (cf. 2.1.1), and the separation of the representational and volitional elements. Instead he proposes that we see the volitional element as intrinsic to representation, such that we “affirm insofar as [we] perceiv[e]” (E2p49s [III.B(ii)]; G/II/134). In consequence Spinozistic ideas are belief-like: they “affirm” – posit the existence of – the things they represent. On this picture, in thinking of my dog, for example, I thereby affirm her existence.

One obvious objection a Cartesian might make to this account is that it seems incapable of explaining the familiar experience of merely entertaining (imagining, hypothesizing, exploring, etc.) some idea without committing ourselves to its truth or falsity. As Spinoza puts the objection in the mouth of an imaginary opponent,

someone who feigns a winged horse does not on that account grant that there is a winged horse, i.e., he is not on that account deceived…Therefore, experience seems to teach…that the will, or faculty of assenting, is free, and different from the faculty of understanding. (E2p49s [III.A.(ii)])

To fend off this objection Spinoza must find a way of explaining the possibility of representing something (such as a winged horse) without committing to its existence, while drawing solely on the resources of particular, intrinsically affirmative ideas. His proposal focuses on countervailing ideas: ideas that affirm or posit something that negates or “excludes [tollere]” the existence of an object represented by other ideas. For example, a child “imagining a winged horse, and not perceiving anything else…that excludes the existence of the horse….will necessarily regard the horse as present” (E2p49s [III.B.(ii)]; G/II/134). But, with some schooling, the child’s original idea of a winged horse can be offset by another idea (say, by the rational representation of equine bones as, in general, too heavy to be lifted by feathers). Spinoza’s proposal explains not only how the ordinary experience of mere entertainment of ideas is possible, but, more significantly, it arguably offers a genealogy of negation as a basic mental operation derived from affirmation (cf. Donagan 1988:46).

The obvious question Spinoza’s account raises is why, in such cases of mental conflict, in which certain ideas “exclude” one another, should one of these ideas prevail? As Diane Steinberg notes, Spinoza cannot have in mind purely logical inconsistency or contradiction between ideas, since this doesn’t yet give us a reason to nonarbitrarily prefer one idea over another (2003). The psychology of “exclusion” must involve not merely such logical incompatibility of contents, but something that would asymmetrically tip the scales in favor of one idea. Commentators have proposed that greater causal power as the best candidate for this role: the winning idea is the idea with more power to continue existing and to produce further ideas (in short, greater power to “strive” [E3p7]), or greater power to determine the mind’s activity or causal power as a whole (e.g. Della Rocca 2003; J. Steinberg 2018b).

(On affirmation, will and excluding ideas see also 3.2.2. On “fictions”, see e.g. D. Garrett 2018: ch. 5, J. Steinberg 2018b; on striving, see e.g. Carriero 2011, Kisner 2011, LeBuffe 2010, Viljanen 2011, Youpa 2020 and entry on Spinoza’s psychological theory.)

3. Epistemology

3.1 Truth and adequacy

Spinoza is often taken to endorse the correspondence theory of truth, that is, roughly, the view that truth consists in some sort of conformity of thought to reality. Spinoza himself puts the point in terms of “agreement”: “A true idea must agree with [convenire] its object” (E1ax6).

However, this relational property of “agreement” is not the only way Spinoza characterizes truth. True Spinozistic ideas also have an intrinsic and, arguably, introspectable (cf. Garrett 2018: ch.5) property which distinguishes them as true without requiring us to look beyond the ideas themselves. An “adequate” idea is one with this intrinsic property:

By adequate idea I understand an idea which, insofar as it is considered in itself, without relation to an object, has all the properties, or intrinsic denominations of a true idea. Exp.: say intrinsic to exclude what is extrinsic, viz. the agreement of the idea with its object. (E2def4)

Consequently, truth can be “its own standard”, such that “he who has a true idea at the same time knows that he has a true idea, and cannot doubt the truth of the thing” (E2p43, cf. TIE §36).

The view is surely puzzling: How is it that just by considering an idea on its own, we can be certain that it in fact conforms to what it represents? What might these intrinsic signs of truth be?

One plausible answer is that Spinoza has in mind here something like clarity and distinctness (cf. e.g. E2p38c), and so is in broad agreement with Descartes’s “rule” that true ideas can appear to us as clear and distinct. Don Garrett has suggested that, in addition to clarity and distinctness, we should understand adequacy as the “logical consistency of the represented object” (2018: ch.6). On this reading, true ideas are self-evidently true insofar as we can clearly and distinctly perceive the logical consistency of what they represent. This proposal has the virtue of tying together Spinoza’s two characterizations of truth – the extrinsic and the intrinsic one – into one neat package: given Spinoza’s commitment to necessitarianism (E1p33, E1p35), any logically consistent idea will represent not just a possible object but a necessary and actual one; hence we can know from the logical consistency of an idea alone that it in fact corresponds to its object.

The above definition of adequate idea in terms of a true idea’s intrinsic or nonrelational properties is, however, not the only way Spinoza characterizes mental “adequacy”. He also gives what we could call a mind-relative account of adequacy. It is made possible by his belief that finite minds are “parts” of the omniscient “infinite intellect” (see 2.1.2). As he explains, “there are no inadequate or confused ideas except insofar as they are related to the singular mind of someone” (E2p36d):

when we say that God has this or that idea, not only insofar as he constitutes the nature of the human Mind, but insofar as he also has the idea of another thing together with the human Mind, then we say that the human Mind perceives the thing only partially, or inadequately (E2p11c)

In other words, if ideas constituting a given finite mind suffice for representing x in the same way that a perfect intellect would represent x, the mind in question represents x “adequately”. Eugene Marshall has usefully expressed this point in terms of part-whole “containment”: ideas are adequate iff they are entirely a part of, i.e., contained in, the relevant finite mind (2013:26).

Here is an example of how this might work. Consider once again Spinoza’s claim that the idea of the body that essentially constitutes a human mind is “completely confused” (see 2.2.1). We can put this point in terms of inadequacy: a human mind knows its body as a particular in duration only by perceiving how it is “affected” or changed. This idea of the body is “inadequate” in Spinoza’s technical sense because God’s conception of that body includes many components that are not also part of the human mind’s conception of it: God conceives of all the many bodies that go into composing, preserving, and “regenerating” the affected human body, as well as of all the affecting external bodies, and of the infinite series of causes on which these bodies in turn depend (E2p19d).

Confronted with Spinoza’s account of mental adequacy, we might wonder how his two characterizations of this concept are supposed to hang together: why should an idea entirely contained in a mind also have certain intrinsic markings of truth, such as clarity and distinctness? One way to reconcile these two claims is to infer that for Spinoza only ideas whose “premises”, so to speak, are wholly contained in a given mind can also appear as manifestly or self-evidently true. (One might also wonder if finite minds like ours can ever manage to think anything truly “adequately”, if this requires that all of the “premises” of a given idea be contained in our minds [cf. Della Rocca 1996]. We come back to this question in 3.2.1.)

Finally, some commentators have concluded, further, that an “adequate” idea must be contained in a mind insofar as it must also have been “adequately caused” – i.e., self-sufficiently or autonomously caused – by the mind in question, and as such counts as a true “action” of that mind, in Spinoza’s technical sense of these terms (E3def1–2). If that’s right, then adequate ideas must all be innate (LeBuffe 2010, E. Marshall 2013, J. Steinberg 2018a: ch.8). For having a cause external to the mind – for example, arising from experience – would be incompatible by definition with having been “adequately caused”. On such readings, what we might experience as an acquisition of an adequate idea (say, in a philosophy class) is in fact only a matter of becoming more conscious of it (J. Steinberg 2018a: ch.8; see 2.3).

(See also Kisner 2011.)

3.2 Knowledge (cognitio)

The common English translation of Spinoza’s cognitio as “knowledge” does not do justice to his understanding of the term, which includes not just true and adequate ideas, but also inadequate and false ones.

3.2.1 Cognition and causation

Perhaps the most important epistemological principle standardly ascribed to Spinoza is that to conceive of or cognize x, one must conceive of or cognize its causes. The text cited most frequently in support of this causal interpretation of Spinozistic cognition is E1ax4: “Cognition of an effect depends on, and involves, cognition of its cause” (transl. altered). The interpretation finds further support in what has come to be known as Spinoza’s “parallelism doctrine”, the proposition stating that “The order and connection of ideas is the same as the order and connection of things” (E2p7). Spinoza’s appeal to E1ax4 in the demonstration of this proposition makes clear that the “order and connection of things” he has in mind in E2p7 is a causal order and connection (cf. E2p9d). The idea that at least for the omniscient “infinite intellect” the connections between ideas perfectly mirror the causal connections between things in nature further supports the thought that for Spinoza cognizing something requires tracking its causes.

Despite the fact that commentators often appeal to E1ax4, the meaning of this important axiom is far from clear. There are two main interpretive problems (leaving aside the question of what sorts of causes, out of the rich panoply envisioned by the Aristotelians, Spinoza might allow in his metaphysics). The first problem concerns the kind of cognition at stake in E1ax4. Some readers (e.g. Bennett 1984; Gueroult 1969) have proposed that the axiom governs adequate cognition alone. So understood, the axiom expresses a version of the traditional view that truly “scientific” knowledge requires a knowledge of causes – the knowledge why something happened, not merely that it happened. But, as Margaret Wilson points out (1999: ch.10), this restricted reading of the scope of the axiom can’t be correct, since in Spinoza’s view even inadequate ideas formed in sense experience “involve” their causes. (For example, the inadequate knowledge I have of any bodily change “involves” the inadequate knowledge of its external cause [E2ax1’, E2p25, E2p28].)

A second interpretive problem concerns the meaning of the two terms – “dependence” and “involvement” – used by Spinoza to characterize the relation between causes and cognitions in E1ax4. “Involvement” is most often glossed as “implication”. But Wilson has argued that in key passages (e.g. E2p45) involvere stands more specifically for the relation of implication between an attribute concept (e.g. extension, thought) and cognition of a mode (1999: ch.10). On this reading of “involvement”, Spinoza’s claim in E1ax4 that cognition of effects “involves” a cognition of causes amounts to the relatively intuitive claim that conceiving of extension or thought is necessary for conceiving of any particular mind or body. So understood, the axiom doesn’t direct us to discover the causes of things so that we may have truly scientific knowledge of them, but instead merely describes what is entailed by even the most minimal and inadequate conception of anything whatsoever.

In addition to E1ax4 and E2p7, the claim that for Spinoza all cognition is cognition of causes also fits with his definition of “adequate cause” as one “whose effect can be clearly and distinctly perceived through it” (E3def1), which suggests that causes are at least sufficient for adequately conceiving of a thing. Likewise, in E1p11altd1, Spinoza appears to identify the “causes” of a thing’s existence or nonexistence with “reasons [ratio]” for that existence or nonexistence by means of the conjunction sive.

Nonetheless, the claim that for Spinoza to conceive of x, one must conceive of its causes, faces at least two problems. First, it’s not clear how to reconcile this position with Spinoza’s account of the human mind. As we saw (2.2), cognition of the essence of human minds requires reference to actually existing bodies; yet, given Spinoza’s commitment to the attribute barrier (1.2), bodies cannot stand in a causal relation to anything mental. So either Spinoza’s account of the human mind is invalid by his own lights or (more likely) Spinoza allows for cognitions that do not depend on a thing’s causes. Second, since each finite thing depends on an “infinite” series of prior finite causes (E1p28), if cognition of a thing (or at least adequate cognition of it) requires a grasp of all its causes, this would put an implausible, “stratospherically high” (Bennett 1984) requirement on cognition. Indeed it would put such cognition outside the reach of minds like ours, since, as Spinoza admits, we simply cannot know the entire infinite series of finite things responsible for any given state of affairs in nature (TIE §100). Here Wilson’s insight about how Spinoza uses “involvement” is helpful: we can have adequate causal cognition of particular things, as long as we look to God (the first and universal cause of all things) and not to the infinite series of prior finite things as the relevant cause, and as long as we attempt to explain the essence of the particular, not its durational states. Spinoza’s doctrine of “common notions” (see 3.2.3) guarantees that we have adequate ideas of God under the attributes of extension and thought. And to know God as the cause of the essence of a particular thing is just to have what Spinoza calls “intuitive cognition” (see 3.2.5.)

(On causal cognition, see e.g. Koistinen 1996, Morrison 2013, 2015; on reconciling it with mind-body account, Della Rocca 1996, Hübner 2020; on possibility of adequate cognition, e.g. Marshall 2013.)

3.2.2 Kinds of cognition I: Imagination and falsity

Spinoza divides cognition into three kinds: imagination; reason [ratio]; and intuition [scientia intuitiva]. This section focuses on the first of these.

First, a terminological warning: what Spinoza calls “imagination” shouldn’t be confused with what we are likely to mean by that term today. By imaginatio Spinoza understands sense experience (including cognition from signs and testimony) and derivative mental processes (including memory and the sort of manipulation of mental imagery we indeed might call “imagination”). Spinozistic imaginatio is distinct in virtue of both its content and its causes. First, it is cognition of external bodies as present; secondly, it is cognition acquired through ideas of affections, i.e., changes, of our own body, caused by other bodies:

affections of the human body whose ideas present external bodies as present to us, we shall call images of things, even if they do not reproduce the [NS: external] figures of things. And when the mind regards bodies in this way, we shall say that it imagines (E2p17s; G/II/106)

(NB: “image” is another potential terminological trap for today’s readers: it’s Spinoza’s label for something physical, a modification of the body. In contrast, “imagination” names something mental: the act or operation of representing, or forming ideas of, these physical “images”.)

One of the most important claims Spinoza makes about imaginative cognition is that it comprises “all those ideas which are inadequate and confused and so…is the only cause of falsity” (E2p41d). That is, only ideas derived from sense experience alone can give rise to false beliefs. The list of objects of which, Spinoza thinks, we have only such inadequate and confused cognition is staggering: it includes our own bodies; external bodies; the affections, parts, and durations of both; finally, even our minds (E2p19–31) (cf. 2.2.1). As Spinoza concludes pessimistically, “all the notions by which ordinary people are accustomed to explain nature are only modes of imagining, and do not indicate the nature of anything” (E1app; G/II/83).

What sort of “confusion” does Spinoza have in mind in E2p41d? Recall that imaginative cognition consists in ideas of affections of, or changes in, our own bodies that also present us, indirectly, with the external causes of these changes. (As Spinoza puts it, all our ideas of our own, externally-caused bodily affections “involve” the nature of the external cause [E2p16].) So the “confusion” inherent to imaginative cognition seems to do, first, with the fact that imaginative ideas have a content that is an amalgam of two distinct things: the current condition of some part of my body and the properties of the external cause (E2p16, E2p25; cf. Della Rocca 1996). For example, when I’m warmed by the sun, the nature of that bodily change depends on the nature of the sun together with the nature and current state of my own body. My perception of the bodily affection – of the increased warmth – tells me something about my own body and something about the sun; I have some insight into the relative properties of both things. But it doesn’t tell me about the intrinsic or fundamental nature either of my own body or the sun. It also doesn’t allow me to clearly separate out the relative contributions of the external cause and of my own body. (Indeed, Spinoza goes so far as to propose that that such ideas “indicate the condition of our own body more than the nature of the external bodies” [E2p16c2; emphasis added].)

What about Spinoza’s characterization of imaginative ideas as “inadequate” (E2p41d)? Recall that “adequate” ideas are manifestly true ideas fully explained by the mind they help constitute (3.1). So, first, a lack of adequacy is a lack of an intrinsic marker of truth, and hence of certainty that we are dealing with true ideas. Hence when dealing with imaginative ideas we’re not yet able to “distinguish” with certainty “between the true and the false” (E2p402). Of course, we may stumble on the right result (as when we correctly apply a memorized mathematical rule accepted on authority [cf. E2p40s2]). But we cannot yet be sure that our ideas manage to “agree” with, or correspond to, reality.

Second, as inadequate, imaginative ideas won’t fully explain what they purport to be about. Arguably, the mind thinking them won’t possess all of the “premises” that necessarily conclude in the idea in question. Instead, that idea will have been produced by, and so will “involve”, the natures of the external causes that brought about the relevant affection of the body. Instead of being orderly connected to all their premises in the mind (according to what Spinoza calls the “order of the intellect”), imaginative ideas will be connected to one another according to the “common order of Nature” (E2p29s), that is in a way that reflects the order of our happenstance encounters with other bodies, and the idiosyncratic psychological associations such encounters generate:

For example, a soldier, having seen traces of a horse in the sand, will immediately pass from the thought of a horse to the thought of a horseman, and from that to the thought of war, etc. But a Farmer will pass from the thought of a horse to the thought of a plow, and then to that of a field, etc. And so each one, according as he has been accustomed to join and connect the images of things in this or that way, will pass from one thought to another. (E2p18s)

It is fairly easy to see how ideas whose premises are only partially grasped, and which are haphazardly connected together, could become a “cause of falsity” – that is, could easily generate erroneous inferences and associations, as long as we have not yet grasped ideas that would be needed to offset or “exclude” (see 2.4) such erroneous inferences and associations:

the mind does not err from the fact that it imagines, but only insofar as it is considered to lack an idea which excludes the existence of those things which it imagines to be present to it (E2p17s)

To take an example important for the history of philosophy, our belief in free will, on Spinoza’s analysis, is precisely a false belief that follows from sense experience not offset by countervailing ideas: it arises because “we are conscious of [our] actions and ignorant of [their] causes” (E2p35s). Any perception of my own action will be “inadequate” (i.e., merely partial or “mutilated” by comparison to God’s infallible idea of that same action) if the ideas of all the necessitating causes of that action are not also part of my mind. Such a “mutilated” and “inadequate” idea of my own action can generate a false belief in free will as long as I lack potentially offsetting ideas – say, of the general necessity of all actions in nature (e.g. E1p33), together with an understanding of myself as subject to the very same laws as any other natural thing (E3pref; G/II/138).

This picture of falsehood as the result of the confusion and mutilation of ideas generated by sense experience, combined with the absence of countervailing ideas, is behind Spinoza’s claim that “falsity” is “nothing positive”, only a relative “privation of knowledge” (E2p35) about the matter at hand. (Falsity so understood must also be distinguished from an “absolute” “ignorance” of something [E2p35d].)

The lack of ideas that could exclude or offset false conclusions carries another epistemic danger, and contributes to the loss of our “power” to think in yet another way: any ideas we have failed to exclude lie in the mind ready to be combined with any adequate ideas we’ve managed to secure, thereby undermining the epistemic good that the latter bring with them. For example, if we have not yet excluded the ideas of divine goodness or divine purposiveness from our minds (see E1app), we can easily “join” such inadequate ideas to the concept God.

3.2.3 Kinds of cognition II: Intellect, common notions and reason

Spinoza contrasts confused and falsehood-inviting imagination with “intellect”, which he subdivides further into “reason” and “intuition”. Given Spinoza’s bundle-theoretic approach to minds (2.1.1), talk of “intellect” is not intended to conjure up here some sort of mental “faculty” over and above particular ideas. “Intellect” is instead Spinoza’s name for a certain type of cognition, namely cognition that is “necessarily true” (E2p41). That is, intellectual ideas necessarily “agree” with, or correspond to, represented objects (E1ax6; see 3.1). This “agreement” with how things really are in the world allows intellectual ideas to both be “the same in all men” (E2p18s), and to reflect the actual causal order of things in nature. Hence Spinoza can also describe intellect as cognition of things “through their first causes” (E2p18s, cf. E2p7), that is, ultimately through the all-necessitating divine essence that determines the causal order of things (E1p15, E1p16). Intellectual ideas are also “adequate” (E2p41d), that is, manifestly true and fully explained by the mind they help constitute (3.1). Because intellectual ideas of truth and falsity in particular are manifestly true, intellectual cognition enables us to “distinguish the true from the false” with certainty (E2p42).

So how do we get our hands on this cornucopia of epistemic goods? Spinoza warns that “ideas which are clear and distinct in us” (i.e., “adequate”, or manifestly true, ideas) “cannot follow from mutilated and confused ideas” (E5p28d; emphasis added). This would seem to preclude any possibility of progressing from imagination to intellect. Fortunately Spinoza leaves an escape hatch in the form of “common notions”, which he calls, appropriately, the “foundations” of reason, i.e., of the first of two kinds of intellectual cognition (E2p40s1). We may not be able to generate clear and distinct ideas from confused ideas, but not all is yet lost, because according to Spinoza even brute sense experience furnishes us with some necessarily true and adequate ideas (or, on innatist readings [see 3.1], triggers or activates such ideas).

More precisely, in Spinoza’s view, in every encounter with another thing, not matter how confused my ideas of both my own body and the external body (3.2.2), I also form necessarily adequate ideas of any properties that are both 1) “common” to the interacting bodies and 2) “equally in the part and in the whole” (E2p38). That is, I form necessarily adequate ideas of any properties wholly and without distinction present in each particular thing. For example, the property of being extended is one such property: extension is extension is extension, whether it belongs to me or to a mosquito biting me; I am neither more nor less of a physical thing than a mosquito is. Likewise, every body possesses the property of having a capacity for “motion and rest” (“all bodies agree…in that they can move now more slowly, now more quickly, and that now they move, now they are at rest” [E2Ld]). For Spinoza, all such properties that are both universally instantiated (“common” to all things) and non scalar (“equally in the part and in the whole”) are necessarily grasped correctly by any mind. And all ideas of such properties – all “common notions” – are necessarily adequate.

What is Spinoza’s argument for this rather implausible claim, that we simply cannot get certain properties (such as extension, thought, motion and rest) wrong? As we have seen, a lot hinges on this doctrine: nothing less than the very possibility of intellectual emendation, of transcending the confusion and inadequacy of mere imagination. The answer has to do with how Spinoza thinks about what is responsible for the absence of adequacy. As we saw above (3.2.2), in his view, any ideas of external bodies that I form through mere sense experience will in fact be ideas of how those bodies affect me. (For example, my empirical idea of the sun in fact only represents one way the sun can affect my body in its current state.) But common properties like extension are “equally in the part and in the whole”: wholly and without distinction in each thing. So for the adequacy of my idea of the sun as extended it does not matter if I’m representing extension as it is in the sun, or as it is in my body, or as it is in the “confused” amalgam of the two. Extension is extension is extension. Because common notions are insulated against error in this way, and because no idea inferable from an adequate idea can itself be inadequate (E2p40), these notions can indeed form a “foundation” of reasoning, and so be our entry point into the realm of the intellect.

What is sometimes overlooked in discussions of common notions is that Spinoza allows for two kinds of common notions: what we could call 1) universal common notions, notions of truly universally instantiated non-scalar properties, such as extension; and 2) relative common notions, ideas of properties “common to, and peculiar to [proprium], the human body and certain external bodies by which the human Body is usually affected [affici solet], and is equally in the part and in the whole of each of them” (E2p39). It’s not obvious what to make of this characterization of the second type of common notion. What counts as being “peculiar” to what “usually” affects us? For example, are the general ideas Spinoza relies on in his account of the human mind and human emotions (“affects”) common notions in this more circumscribed sense? We could pose the same question of universal common notions: what should we include in that list, beyond the fairly uncontroversial examples of extension, thought, motion-and-rest?

One interesting upshot of Spinoza allowing for this second, relative type of common notion is that our ability to transcend mere sense experience into the realm of reason is not simply a function of the invariable ontological make-up of the world, of there being only so many truly universal on/off properties. We can also do something to increase the number of common notions that it is possible for beings like us to have given our “usual” environments. The more we can make it the case that we have something in common with things around us – and in part this means, the more diverse we ourselves are (cf. Sharp 2011: 98–9) – the broader the epistemic “foundation” on which we can rely in reasoning.

Finally, once again, the fact that no common notion on its own can be a cause of falsity doesn’t mean that we cannot put common notions, of either kind, to bad use: we can still “join” adequate ideas to ideas of more dubious value, producing more complex inadequate representations (cf. 3.2.2). Hence even if we necessarily adequately conceive of God as a thinking thing, we still are in danger of joining this adequate idea to that of a benign or vengeful ruler as the referent of the name God.

(On reason, see e.g. Kisner 2011; LeBuffe 2017, Malinowski-Charles 2010; on common notions, Donagan 1988; Primus 2017.)

3.2.4 Generality and abstraction

Spinoza’s doctrine of common notions is inseparable from a larger interpretative puzzle. This puzzle concerns Spinoza’s stance on the validity of general concepts more broadly – in particular, of concepts of kinds, such as horse, animal, or being.

Certain things are fairly clear. For example, it’s clear that in his ontology, Spinoza is committed to the existence of particulars alone (that is, roughly, things that cannot exist in many places at the same time). It is also clear that, in his view, conceptual generality – and in particular the operation of abstracting from particulars – are rife with the possibility of error. (For example, we can be led to overlook differences among particulars [TIE §76], or mistake the products of our own abstraction for “real beings”, when in fact the resulting ideas present only mind-dependent “beings of reason” [Metaphysical Thoughts [= CM] 1.1; TIE §93]). Finally, it’s also clear that for Spinoza ideas of universals and abstractions often have lower epistemic value than ideas of particulars (e.g. TIE §93).

These considerations have led some readers to take Spinoza to reject all general and abstract ideas as inadequate (e.g. Curley 1973; Savan 1958). Such readings have trouble explaining Spinoza’s own reliance on words that seem to refer to general concepts (such as mode, idea, body, etc.). In particular, many of Spinoza’s moral and socio-political doctrines – and so the whole enterprise of the Ethics (see 1.4) – seem to hinge on the validity of the general idea of “human nature”. Spinoza seems to believe that human beings share an essential nature, even if they realize it to different degrees, and hence also a common good. Here is a representative passage:

the greatest good of those who seek virtue is to know God, i.e.…a good that is common to all men, and can be possessed equally by all men insofar as they are of the same nature (E4p36d; cf. E4p35, E4AppIX)

One interpretative option here is to conclude that for Spinoza general and abstract ideas such as “human nature” have only some pragmatic value (cf. Carriero 2005). Spinoza clearly recognizes usefulness as an epistemic good (for example, he describes Aristotelian ideas of genera and species as handy mnemonic devices [CM1.1]). On such a reading, it might not be strictly speaking true that there is a common human nature, instantiated by each particular human being; nonetheless, for ethical or political ends it might be useful to invoke such an idea. But even this reading will have trouble explaining how Spinoza can nonetheless insist that the “true knowledge we have of good and evil” – again, hardly a minor issue for an Ethics – is “abstract, or universal” (E4p62s; G/II/257).

It helps to be precise about the nature of Spinoza’s criticisms of general and abstract ideas: falling short of an epistemic ideal is not the same as utter inadequacy. Likewise, mind-dependence is not the same as illusion or error. (Neither Leibniz nor Kant, for example, would want to say that the idea or form of space is an error or an illusion.) Finally, Spinoza’s most extensive criticism of general ideas, in E2p40s2, is not a criticism of general ideas simpliciter, but only of most general ideas derived from sense experience (cf. Bennett 1984). In Spinoza’s view, as finite and embodied beings whose minds are essentially ideas of what happens to our bodies (2.2.1), we can’t avoid thinking in general terms. When our bodies interact with other bodies – when we smell roses, or stub our toes – these encounters leave impressions (“images”) on our bodies; the finitude of our bodies allows them to retain only a limited number of distinct “images” since over time they get overlaid and confused. The ideas we form by thinking the resulting composite “images”, and then predicate of indefinitely many other entities – ideas such as horse, animal, or being – represent distinctly only what the bodies we happen to come across have in common insofar as they can affect a human body. General ideas formed in this way are just as “confused”, inadequate and idiosyncratic, as any other imaginative idea (see 3.2.2). So, contrary to what the Aristotelians held, sense experience doesn’t suffice for true ideas of the essences of things. (Rather it gives rise to unending philosophical controversies, as each one of us fashions general types according to what we have experienced.)

Moreover, we also can’t forget that, as we know from our discussion of common notions (3.2.3), Spinoza doesn’t think that all general ideas grounded in sense experience alone result in confused representations. Indeed, beyond this foundational sphere of common notions, Spinoza seems to think of “reason” on the whole as a necessarily adequate way of forming general ideas:

it is clear that we perceive many things and form universal notions: I. from singular things which have been represented to us through the senses… II. from signs… These two ways of regarding things I shall henceforth call knowledge of the first kind, opinion or imagination. III. Finally, from the fact that we have common notions and adequate ideas of the properties of things…This I shall call reason and the second kind of knowledge (E2p40s2; emphases added)

In other words, for Spinoza both (confused and inadequate) imagination and (necessarily adequate) reason are ways of forming general ideas; what distinguishes reason and imagination is in part the epistemic value of their respective “universal notions”. The general ideas that belong to imagination are, as we have seen, confused and inadequate and can lead us into error (3.2.2). The general ideas that belong to reason – in particular, common notions and their derivatives – are, like all ideas of reason, necessarily adequate (3.2.3). The question that remains is whether Spinoza recognizes any other rational and general “adequate ideas of properties” beyond those implied by common notions.

(See also e.g. Newlands 2015, Hübner 2016.)

3.2.5 Kinds of cognition III: Intuition

Spinoza characterizes scientia intuitiva as the kind of cognition that “proceeds from an adequate idea of the formal essence of certain attributes of God to the adequate knowledge of the [NS: formal] essence of things” (E2p40s2). Given Spinoza’s claim that only infinite things can follow from infinite things (E1p21–23), it seems that the “formal essences” of particular things that intuition infers from the essences of divine attributes must themselves be infinite (D. Garrett 2018:ch.7).

As noted above (3.2.3), Spinoza classifies intuition, alongside reason, as intellectual rather than imaginative cognition. As such, intuition is “necessarily true” (E2p41); allows us to “distinguish the true from the false” (E2p42); is “the same in all men” (E2p18s); and is cognition of things “through their first causes” (E2p18s). Yet intuition also clearly exceeds reason as an epistemic achievement in Spinoza’s eyes: it is intuition and not reason that he describes as “the greatest virtue of the mind” (E5p25) and the “greatest human perfection” (E5p27d), capable of affecting the mind with a unique degree of force (E5p36s). Intuition is also the only cognition on which Spinoza bestows the traditional honorific of “scientia” (D. Garrett 2018:ch.7).

What is responsible for this singular place of intuition? Commentators are divided. Some (e.g. Soyarslan 2016) propose that it allows us to know truths that reason doesn’t. Others (e.g. Nadler 2003) think intuition is superior to reason as an epistemic method alone. This latter interpretation is a natural way to understand Spinoza’s own mathematical illustration of the ways all kinds of cognition, from imagination to intuition, can achieve the same correct result (E2p40s2). Likewise, as many of Spinoza’s predecessors have also held, intuition is an immediate knowledge, an insight “in one glance” (E2p40s2) into essences. The principal superiority of intuition seems to stem from the fact that it is in the business of cognizing essences directly, without the mediation of ideas of mere properties of things, whether “common” properties or other “adequate ideas of properties”, which form, as we have seen, the foundations of reason (3.2.3).

(See also e.g. Carriero 2020, Primus 2017, Wilson 1999: ch.11.)

4. Eternity of the mind

Spinoza’s doctrine of the eternity of the mind, one of last subjects of the Ethics, has occasioned some of the most impatient and uncharitable comments on the part of his readers (most famously perhaps, Bennett 1984 describes it as “rubbish” leading others to write rubbish). The cause for this impatience is Spinoza’s declaration that in Part 5 he will discuss “the mind’s duration without relation to the body” (E5p20s), a declaration some see as a blatant violation of his commitment to mind-body identity in Part 2 (E2p7s). But of course an identity of one thing with another doesn’t rule out the possibility of discussing one but not the other, a procedure in which Spinoza engages again and again (for example, in introducing the possibility of ideas of ideas [see 2.3]). Spinoza is moreover quite explicit that there is no eternity of human minds without a corresponding eternity of bodies, and, far from contradicting any commitments about mind-body relations made in Part 2, the doctrine of the eternity of the mind in Part 5 arguably brings to light the full meaning of those earlier commitments.

To recall (2.2.1), in Part 2 Spinoza proposes that the “first thing” that constitutes this “actual being” of a human mind is an idea of an “actually exist[ing]” body (E2p11–13). Only in Part 5 does Spinoza clarify that “actual” being or existence can be understood in two ways: first, in the temporal or durational sense key to the claims made in Part 2, and second, in an atemporal or purely ontological sense of simply having being or reality at all (as opposed to, for example, being merely possible):

We conceive things as actual in two ways: either insofar as we conceive them to exist in relation to a certain time and place, or insofar as we conceive them to be contained in God and to follow from the necessity of the divine nature. But the things we conceive in this second way as true, or real, we conceive under a species of eternity (E5p29s)

Given these two senses of “actuality”, Spinoza’s original claim in Part 2 that the “actual being” of the human mind is an idea of an “actually exist[ing]” body can also be understood in two ways. First, it can be understood as a claim about what it takes for a human mind to begin existing in time, as we have done in 2.2.1: any human mind starts to actually exist in a durational sense when the nexus of bodily causes in nature generates a new body, which then begins to be variously affected or changed by external causes. The infinite intellect, in its indefatigable omniscience, begins to represent these affections or changes. The relevant “part” of God’s omniscient idea (see 2.1.2) is a new, temporally existing human mind. More plainly put, a human “infant” is born, with “a body capable of very few things, and…a mind…conscious of almost nothing” (E5p39s).

This is the first, more intuitive sense in which human minds can be said to “actually exist”, the sense in which your mind exists now when processing these words. But however much we may be attached to our temporal selves and all that they feel, for Spinoza there is another sense of “actual existence”. In that second sense, a human mind is still essentially an “actually existing” idea of a certain “actually existing” bit of extension. But the relevant bit of extension is not the living human body, but its eternal essence – a certain eternally possible way that divine extension can modify itself to take on a certain ratio of motion and rest (cf. E2def[8]; G/II/100), i.e., a certain determinate functional pattern of physical activity. In its omniscience, the divine substance eternally understands itself as being capable of being modified in such more determinate ways – that is, of manifesting its own physical being as this or that snail or sunflower or human infant. Ideas of these eternal bodily essences are eternal “parts” of substance’s infinite intellect (E2p8). That is, for each bodily essence there is a divine idea that “expresses the essence of the body under a species of eternity” (E5p23s), as an eternal part of the infinite intellect.

The eternal idea of a bodily essence is not only a part of God’s intellect (as all ideas are), it is also an eternal “part” of the relevant human mind, a “part” that “remains” (E5p23) even after the body’s demise, when there are no more ideas of bodily affections to be “felt”. This then is all there is also to human immortality, in Spinoza’s view: the eternal existence of the essences of our bodies, and of ideas of those bodies. As Nadler emphasizes (2002), we are far here from any traditional doctrine of personal immortality: nothing that does not belong to us essentially, and nothing that depends on sense experience, such as memories, persists beyond death.

Spinoza attaches an epistemic challenge to this ontological picture. He writes that we always “understand” and “feel” “that we are eternal” (E5p23s): presumably this means that we have some joyful, i.e., empowering (E3p11d), intellectual grasp of our own eternity (even if we often join these adequate ideas with inadequate ones [see 3.2.2], such as reward or punishment). But he also suggests, prima facie puzzlingly, that we can increase the degree of our own eternity: “the more the mind understands things by the second and third kind of cognition, the greater the part [maxima pars] of it that remains” after the destruction of the body (E5p38d). This suggestion might seem puzzling if we assume that the “eternal part” of my mind is just the eternal idea of the eternal essence of my own body. For then there seems to be nothing that would be subject to improvement or enlargement: my eternal essence just is my eternal essence.

But arguably this is not how Spinoza understands the eternal part of the mind. The idea of the eternal essence of the body is just the “first thing [primum]” (cf. E2p11) that grounds my mind’s eternal existence: it is the foundation of eternal ideas of other things, just as the durational idea of this body as changing is the foundation of imaginative ideas of other things. “[T]he Mind is eternal, insofar as it conceives things under a species of eternity” (E5p31s). Since for Spinoza any human mind is essentially an idea of a certain “actually existing” body, cognition of that body is the foundation of all cognition whatsoever. This is true whether we are talking about imaginative cognition of the external bodies we bump up against in duration; or about intellectual cognition of eternally existing essences: “Whatever the mind understands under a species of eternity, it understands…from the fact that it conceives the body’s essence under a species of eternity” (E5p29). In short, for Spinoza all cognition of eternal truths rests on a cognition of our own body as an eternal essence. We can thus understand the idea of enlarging or maximizing the eternal “part” of our minds in terms of the number of eternal truths, intuitive and rational, that we can acquire in the course of our existence – or, as on innatist readings (see 3.1), the number of eternal truths that we can make into powerful “parts” of our minds.

(On consciousness, see 2.3; on imaginative cognition of the body see 2.2 and 3.2.2. On eternity of the mind, see also e.g. Garrett 2018: ch.9. On Spinoza’s debt to medieval Jewish views about mind’s eternity, see e.g. Klein 2014, Nadler 2002, Ravven and Goodman 2002.)


Spinoza’s Works

  • Spinoza Opera [G], edited by Carl Gebhardt, 5 volumes, Heidelberg: Carl Winters, 1925, 1972, 1987.
  • Spinoza, Benedictus, The Collected Writings of Spinoza, 2 vols., Edwin Curley, translator, Princeton: Princeton University Press, vol. 1: 1985; vol. 2: 2016.

All references to Spinoza’s Ethics start with E and Part number, followed by one or more of the following: ‘p’ for proposition, ‘alt’ for alternative, ‘app’ for appendix, ‘ax’ for axiom, ‘c’ for corollary, ‘d’ for demonstration, ‘def’ for definition, ‘L’ for lemma, and ‘s’ for scholium. Where useful, reference is added to the Latin Gebhardt edition as G followed by volume and page numbers. ‘NS’ refers to De Nagelate Schriften van B. D. S., a 1677 Dutch edition of Spinoza's writings.

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Other Internet Resources

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