Molecular Biology

First published Sat Feb 19, 2005; substantive revision Tue Feb 20, 2024

The field of molecular biology studies macromolecules and the macromolecular mechanisms found in living things, such as the molecular nature of the gene and its mechanisms of gene replication, mutation, and expression. Given the fundamental importance of a mechanistic and macromolecular mode of explanation in many biological disciplines, the widespread reliance on molecular techniques such as gel electrophoresis, sequencing, and PCR, as well as the involvement of molecular biology in recent technological breakthroughs such as CRISPR, mRNA vaccines and optogenetics, the history and concepts of molecular biology constitute a focal point of contemporary philosophy of science and biology.

1. History of Molecular Biology

Despite its prominence in the contemporary life sciences, molecular biology is a relatively young discipline, originating in the 1930s and 1940s, and becoming institutionalized in the 1950s and 1960s. It should not be surprising, then, that many of the philosophical issues in molecular biology are closely intertwined with this recent history. This section covers the development of molecular biology: its origins, its classical period, its subsequent migration into other biological domains, the turn to genomics and post-genomics, and some of the more recent developments. The rich historiography of molecular biology can only be briefly utilized in this shortened history (see, for example, Abir-Am 1985, 1987, 1994, 2006; Burian 1993a; Canguillhem 1989; de Chadarevian 2002, 2003; de Chadarevian and Gaudilliere 1996; de Chadarevian and Strasser 2002; Deichmann 2002; Fisher 2010; Hausmann 2002; Holmes 2001; Judson 1980, 1996; Kay 1993; Marcum 2002; Morange 1997a, 2020; Olby 1979, 1990, 1994, 2003; Powell et al. 2007; Rheinberger 1997; Sapp 1992; Sarkar 1996a; Stegenga 2011; Summers 2023; van Holde and Zlatanova 2018; Witkowski 2005; Zallen 1996. Also see autobiographical accounts by biologists, such as Brenner 2001; Cohen 1984; Crick 1988; Echols 2001; Jacob 1988; Kornberg 1989; Luria 1984; Watson 1968, 2002, 2007; Wilkins 2003).

1.1 Origins

The field of molecular biology arose from the convergence of work by geneticists, physicists, and structural chemists on a common problem: the nature of inheritance. In the early twentieth century, although the nascent field of genetics was guided by Mendel’s laws of segregation and independent assortment, the actual mechanisms of gene reproduction, mutation and expression remained unknown. Thomas Hunt Morgan and his colleagues utilized the fruit fly, Drosophila melanogaster, as a model organism to study the relationship between the gene and the chromosomes in the hereditary process (Morgan 1926; discussed in Darden 1991; Darden and Maull 1977; Kohler 1994; Roll-Hanson 1978; Wimsatt 1992). A former student of Morgan’s, Hermann J. Muller, recognized the “gene as a basis of life”, and so set out to investigate its structure (Muller 1926). Muller discovered the mutagenic effect of x-rays on Drosophila, and utilized this phenomenon as a tool to explore the size and nature of the gene (Carlson 1966, 1971, 1981, 2011; Crow 1992; Muller 1927). But despite the power of mutagenesis, Muller recognized that, as a geneticist, he was limited in the extent to which he could explicate the more fundamental properties of genes and their actions. He concluded a 1936 essay:

The geneticist himself is helpless to analyse these properties further. Here the physicist, as well as the chemist, must step in. Who will volunteer to do so? (Muller 1936: 214)

Muller’s request did not go unanswered. The next decade saw several famous physicists turn their attention to the nature of inheritance (Keller 1990; Kendrew 1967). In What is Life, the physicist Erwin Schroedinger (1944) proposed ways in which the principles of quantum physics might account for the stability, yet mutability, of the gene (see the entry on life; see also Elitzur 1995; Moore 1989; Olby 1994; Sarkar 1991; for a reinterpretation see Kay 2000). Max Delbrueck also became interested in the physical basis of heredity after hearing a lecture by his teacher, quantum physicist Niels Bohr (1933), which expounded a principle of complementarity between physics and biology (McKaughan 2005; Roll-Hansen 2000). In contrast to Schroedinger, Bohr (and subsequently Delbrueck) did not seek to reduce biology to physics; instead, the goal was to understand how each discipline complemented the other (Delbrueck 1949; Sloan and Fogel 2011). To investigate the self-reproductive characteristics of life, Delbrueck used bacteriophage, viruses that infect bacteria and then multiply very rapidly. The establishment of “The Phage Group” in the early 1940s by Delbrueck and another physicist-turned-biologist Salvador Luria marked a critical point in the rise of molecular biology (Brock 1990; Cairns et al. 1966; Fischer and Lipson 1988; Fleming 1968; Lewontin 1968; Luria 1984; Morange 2020: Ch. 4; Stent 1968). Delbrueck’s colleague at Cal Tech, Linus Pauling, utilized his knowledge of structural chemistry to study macromolecular structure. Pauling contributed both theoretical work on the nature of chemical bonds and experimental work using x-ray crystallography to discover the physical structure of macromolecular compounds (Pauling 1939, 1970; Olby 1979; Hager 1995; Crick 1996; Sarkar 1998).

As suggested in the brief history above, experimentation figured prominently in the rise of molecular biology (see the entry on experiment in biology). X-ray crystallography allowed molecular biologists to investigate the structure of macromolecules. Alfred Hershey and Martha Chase (1952) used phage viruses to confirm that the genetic material transmitted from generation to generation was DNA and not proteins (see Hershey-Chase Experiment in Other Internet Resources). Muller (1927) used x-rays to intervene on and alter gene function, thus revealing the application of methods from physics to a biological domain (see Elof Carlson on Muller’s Research in Other Internet Resources).

Recognizing quite early the importance of these new physical and structural chemical approaches to biology, Warren Weaver, then the director of the Natural Sciences section of the Rockefeller Foundation, introduced the term “molecular biology” in a 1938 report to the Foundation. Weaver wrote,

And gradually there is coming into being a new branch of science—molecular biology—which is beginning to uncover many secrets concerning the ultimate units of the living cell….in which delicate modern techniques are being used to investigate ever more minute details of certain life processes (quoted in Olby 1994: 442).

But perhaps a more telling account of the term’s origin came from Francis Crick, who said he started calling himself a molecular biologist because:

when inquiring clergymen asked me what I did, I got tired of explaining that I was a mixture of crystallographer, biophysicist, biochemist, and geneticist, an explanation which in any case they found too hard to grasp. (quoted in Stent 1969: 36)

This brief recapitulation of the origins of molecular biology reflects themes addressed by philosophers, such as reduction (see Section 3.1), the concept of the gene (see Section 2.3), and experimentation (see Section 3.4). For Schroedinger, biology was to be reduced to the more fundamental principles of physics, while Delbrueck instead resisted such a reduction and sought what made biology unique. Muller’s shift from Mendelian genetics to the study of gene structure raises the question of the relation between the gene concepts found in those separate fields of genetics. And the import of experimental methods from physics to biology raised the question of the relation between those disciplines.

1.2 Classical Period

Molecular biology’s classical period began in 1953, with James Watson and Francis Crick’s discovery of the double helical structure of DNA (Watson and Crick 1953a,b). Watson and Crick’s scientific relationship unified the various disciplinary approaches discussed above: Watson, a student of Luria and the phage group, recognized the need to utilize crystallography to elucidate the structure of DNA; Crick, a physicist enticed by Schroedinger’s What is Life? to turn to biology, became trained in, and contributed to the theory of x-ray crystallography. At Cambridge University, Watson and Crick found that they shared an interest in genes and the structure of DNA.

Watson and Crick collaborated to build a model of the double helical structure of DNA, with its two helical strands held together by hydrogen-bonded base pairs (Olby 1994). They made extensive use of data from x-ray crystallography work on DNA by Maurice Wilkins and Rosalind Franklin at King’s College, London, appallingly without Franklin’s permission or even knowledge (Maddox 2002), Crick’s theoretical work on crystallography (Crick 1988), and the model building techniques pioneered by Pauling (de Chadarevian 2002; Judson 1996; Olby 1970, 1994, 2009).

With the structure of DNA in hand, molecular biology shifted its focus to how the double helical structure aided elucidation of the mechanisms of genetic replication and function, the keys to understanding the role of genes in heredity (see the entries on replication and reproduction and inheritance systems). This subsequent research was guided by the notion that the gene was an informational molecule. According to Lily Kay,

Up until around 1950 molecular biologists…described genetic mechanisms without ever using the term information. (Kay 2000: 328)

“Information” replaced earlier talk of biological “specificity”. Watson and Crick’s second paper of 1953, which discussed the genetical implications of their recently discovered (Watson and Crick 1953a) double-helical structure of DNA, used both “code” and “information”:

…it therefore seems likely that the precise sequence of the bases is the code which carries the genetical information…. (Watson and Crick 1953b: 244, emphasis added)

In 1958, Francis Crick used and characterized the concept of information in the context of stating the “central dogma” of molecular biology. Crick characterized the central dogma as follows:

This states that once “information” has passed into protein it cannot get out again. In more detail, the transfer of information from nucleic acid to nucleic acid, or from nucleic acid to protein may be possible, but transfer from protein to protein, or from protein to nucleic acid is impossible. Information here means the precise determination of sequence, either of bases in the nucleic acid or of amino acid residues in the protein. (Crick 1958: 152–153, emphasis in original)

It is important not to confuse the genetic code and genetic information. The genetic code refers to the relation between three bases of DNA, called a “codon”, and one amino acid. Tables available in molecular biology textbooks (e.g., Watson et al. 1988: frontispiece) show the relation between 64 codons and 20 amino acids. For example, CAC codes for histidine. Only a few exceptions for these coding relations have been found, in a few anomalous cases (see the list in a small table in Alberts et al. 2002: 814). In contrast, genetic information refers to the linear sequence of codons along the DNA, which (in the simplest case) are transcribed to messenger RNA, which are translated to linearly order the amino acids in a protein.

With the genetic code elucidated and the relationship between genes and their molecular products traced, it seemed in the late 1960s that the concept of the gene was secure in its connection between gene structure and gene function. The machinery of protein synthesis translated the coded information in the linear order of nucleic acid bases into the linear order of amino acids in a protein. However, such “colinear” simplicity did not persist. In the late 1970s, a series of discoveries by molecular biologists complicated the straightforward relationship between a single, continuous DNA sequence and its protein product. Overlapping genes were discovered (Barrell et al. 1976); such genes were considered “overlapping” because two different amino acid chains might be read from the same stretch of nucleic acids by starting from different points on the DNA sequence. And split genes were found (Berget et al. 1977; Chow et al. 1977). In contrast to the colinearity hypothesis that a continuous nucleic acid sequence generated an amino acid chain, it became apparent that stretches of DNA were often split between coding regions (exons) and non-coding regions (introns). Moreover, the exons might be separated by vast portions of this non-coding, supposedly “junk DNA”. The distinction between exons and introns became even more complicated when alternative splicing was discovered the following year (Berk and Sharp 1978). A series of exons could be spliced together in a variety of ways, thus generating a variety of molecular products. Discoveries such as overlapping genes, split genes, and alternative splicing forced molecular biologists to rethink their understanding of what actually made a gene…a gene (Portin 1993; for a survey of such complications see Gerstein et al. 2007: Table 1).

In parallel with the elucidation of the mechanisms of replication, transcription and translation, DNA cloning techniques allowing researchers to isolate and amplify specific genes from the rest of the cell’s genome were developed. In the 1960s, the study of the molecular mechanisms through which bacteria restricted the growth of bacteriophages led to the discovery of restriction endonucleases (enzymes that cleave DNA at specific sequences) by Werner Arber, Daniel Nathans and Hamilton O. Smith. The subsequent discovery of DNA ligase made it possible to insert fragments generated by restriction enzymes into vectors, such as bacteriophages or plasmids, and produce large quantities of recombinant DNA molecules in bacterial cultures. In turn, the sequencing of recombinant DNA provided the first clues about possible protein products and their biological function.

With the advent of genetic engineering techniques in the 1970s and 80s, it further became possible to directly test hypotheses about the biological function of genes and their products. When mutated versions of genes are introduced into cells and multicellular organisms, changes in specific biological activities are often observed (Craver and Darden 2013). Loss-of-function (knockout) mutations demonstrate that a DNA sequence and the protein or RNA products associated with that sequence are necessary for biological activity. Gain-of-function (over-expression) mutations further demonstrate that the genomic sequence and its products not only contribute to biological activity but are also rate-limiting. Evidence for biological relevance from genetic engineering experiments played an important role in establishing a molecular biology of the cell distinct from both genetics and biochemistry. Classical genetics could only show that specific genetic loci are associated with specific phenotypes, while molecular genetics further elucidated the molecular basis of the gene and the general mechanisms through which the genetic material is expressed as biochemically active products. Biochemical analysis of genes and gene products revealed that DNA, RNA and proteins display specific patterns of chemical activity, such as affinity for other molecules, without necessarily showing that chemical activity, as demonstrated in a test tube, has a biological function. The molecular biology of the cell combined genetics and biochemistry, providing evidence that DNA sequences and molecular interactions make a difference to biological activity in the context of the living organism (Bechtel 2006; Matlin 2022).

These developments in molecular biology have received philosophical scrutiny. Molecular biologists sought to discover mechanisms (see Section 2.1), drawing the attention of philosophers to this concept. Also, conceptualizing DNA as an informational molecule (see Section 2.2) was a move that philosophers have subjected to critical scrutiny. Finally, the concept of the gene (see Section 2.3) itself has intrigued philosophers. Complex molecular mechanisms, such as alternative splicing, have obligated philosophers to consider to what the term “gene” actually refers. Experimentation also figured prominently in the classical period (see Section 3.4); Matthew Meselson and Frank Stahl utilized bacteria grown with different weights combined with centrifugation to determine how DNA, as modeled by Watson and Crick, was replicated (Meselson and Stahl 1958; see also The Semi-Conservative Replication of DNA in Other Internet Resources).

1.3 Going Molecular

In a 1963 letter to Max Perutz, molecular biologist Sydney Brenner foreshadowed what would be molecular biology’s next intellectual migration:

It is now widely realized that nearly all the “classical” problems of molecular biology have either been solved or will be solved in the next decade…. Because of this, I have long felt that the future of molecular biology lies in the extension of research to other fields of biology, notably development and the nervous system. (Brenner, letter to Perutz, 1963)

Along with Brenner, in the late 1960s and early 1970s, many of the leading molecular biologists from the classical period redirected their research agendas, utilizing the newly developed molecular techniques to investigate unsolved problems in other fields. Francois Jacob, Jacques Monod and their colleagues used the bacteria Escherichia coli to investigate how environmental conditions impact gene expression and regulation (Jacob and Monod 1961; discussed in Craver and Darden 2013; Morange 1998: Ch. 14; Schaffner 1974a; Weber 2005; see also the entries on developmental biology and theories of biological development [link here to entries “developmental biology” and “theories of biological development”). The study of behavior and the nervous system also lured some molecular biologists. Finding appropriate model organisms that could be subjected to molecular genetic analyses proved challenging. Returning to the fruit flies used in Mendelian genetics, Seymour Benzer induced behavioral mutations in Drosophila as a “genetic scalpel” to investigate the pathways from genes to behavior (Benzer 1968; Weiner 1999). And at Cambridge, Sydney Brenner developed the nematode worm, Caenorhabditis elegans, to study the nervous system, as well as the genetics of behavior (Brenner 1973, 2001; Ankeny 2000; Brown 2003). In subsequent decades, the study of cells was transformed from descriptive cytology into molecular cell biology (Alberts et al. 1983; Alberts et al. 2002; Alberts et al. 2022; Bechtel 2006; Matlin 2022; see also the entry on philosophy of cell biology [link here to entry “philosophy of cell biology”). The immunological relationship between antibodies and antigens was recharacterized at the molecular level (Podolsky and Tauber 1997; Schaffner 1993; see also the entry on the philosophy of immunology). And the study of oncogenes in cancer research as well as the molecular bases of mental illness were examples of advances in molecular medicine (Morange 1997b; see also the entry on philosophy of psychiatry).

While some authors deplored the disconnect between molecular and evolutionary biology throughout much of the 20th century (Mayr 1985), the past three decades have been marked by a growing interdisciplinary collaboration which proved beneficial for both branches of biology. Molecular genomics supplied new phylogenetic methods for the comparison of DNA sequences and whole genomes, while molecular systematics sought to research the evolution of the genetic code as well as the rates of that evolutionary process by comparing similarities and differences between molecules (Dietrich 1998; see also the entries on .evolution, evolution and development [link here to entry “evolution and development”], heritability, and adaptationism). In turn, comparative phylogenetic studies corroborated a key assumption guiding research in molecular biology, namely the belief that, despite an astonishing phenotypic diversity, living things are similar at a molecular level, such that by studying a handful of model organisms sampling the main branches of the evolutionary ‘tree of life’ it is possible to gain generally applicable knowledge. Evolutionary evidence in favor of the molecular unity of life assumption has addressed some of the earlier criticisms of extrapolative practices based on the belief that many species are fundamentally similar (Logan 2002; Würbel 2002). Evolutionary biology has also had an important impact on cancer research, prompting a shift in paradigm from “cancer as a genetic disease,” which was largely motivated by the discovery of oncogenes and tumor suppressor genes, to a broader “cancer as a microevolutionary process” conceptual framework (Okasha 2021; Plutynski 2018; Pradeu et al. 2023; see also entry on cancer [link here to entry “cancer”].

This process of “going molecular” thus generally amounted to using experimental methods from molecular biology to examine complex phenomena (be it gene regulation, behavior, or evolution) at the molecular level. The molecularization of many fields introduced a range of issues of interest to philosophers. The practice of generalizing findings from model organisms raised questions about the validation, limits and potential pitfalls of extrapolative inferences in both basic science and clinical research (see Section 3.3). And the reductive techniques of molecular biology raised questions about whether scientific investigations should always strive to reduce to lower and lower levels (see Section 3.1).

1.4 Going Genomic and Post-Genomic

In the 1970s, as many of the leading molecular biologists were migrating into other fields, molecular biology itself was going genomic (see the entry on genomics and postgenomics). The genome is a collection of nucleic acid base pairs within an organism’s cells (adenine (A) pairs with thymine (T) and cytosine (C) with guanine (G)). The number of base pairs varies widely among species. For example, the infection-causing Haemophilus influenzae (the first bacterial genome to be sequenced) has roughly 1.9 million base pairs in its genome (Fleischmann et al. 1995), while the infection-catching Homo sapiens carries more than 3 billion base pairs in its genome (International Human Genome Sequencing Consortium 2001, Venter et al. 2001). The history of genomics is the history of the development and use of new experimental and computational methods for producing, storing, and interpreting such sequence data (Ankeny 2003; Stevens 2013).

Frederick Sanger played a seminal role in initiating such developments, creating influential DNA sequencing techniques in the 1950s and 1960s (Saiki et al. 1985; for historical treatments see Sanger 1988; Judson 1992; Culp 1995; Rabinow 1996; Morange 1998; de Chadarevian 2002; Little 2003; Garcia-Sancho 2012; Sanger Method of DNA Sequencing in Other Internet Resources). Equally important was Edwin Southern’s development of a method to detect specific sequences of DNA in DNA samples (Southern 1975). The Southern Blot, as it came to be known, starts by digesting a strand of DNA into many small DNA fragments; those fragments are then separated (in a process called gel electrophoresis) based on size, placed on filter paper which “blots” the DNA fragments on to a new medium, and then chemically labeled with DNA probes; the probes then allow for identification and visualization of the DNA fragments (see also The Southern Blot in Other Internet Resources). Playing off the “southern” homonym, subsequent blotting techniques that detect RNA and proteins came to be called Northern blotting and Western blotting.

In the mid-1980s, after the development of sequencing techniques, the United States Department of Energy (DoE) originated a project to sequence the human genome (initially as part of a larger plan to determine the impact of radiation on the human genome induced by the Hiroshima and Nagasaki bombings). The resulting Human Genome Project (HGP) managed jointly by the DoE and the United States National Institutes of Health (NIH), utilized both existent sequencing methodologies and introduced new ones (Kevles and Hood 1992, see also the entry on the human genome project). While the human genome project received most of the public attention, thousands of genomes have been sequenced to date, including the cat (Pontius et al. 2007), the mouse (Waterson et al. 2002), rice (Goff et al. 2002) and a flock of bird genomes (Zhang et al. 2014). The increased attention to sequencing genomes encouraged several disciplines to “go genomic”, including behavioral genetics (Plomin et al. 2003), developmental biology (Srinivasan and Sommer 2002), cell biology (Taniguchi et al. 2002), and evolutionary biology (Ohta and Kuroiwa 2002). What’s more, genomics was institutionalized with textbooks (Cantor and Smith 1999) and journals, such as Genome Biology and Genome Research. And the human genome project itself turned its attention from a standardized human genome to variation between genomes in the form of the Human Genome Diversity Initiative (Gannett 2003), the HapMap Project (International HapMap Consortium 2003), and the 1000 Genomes Project (Siva 2008).

One of the most surprising results of genome sequencing projects was the total number of genes (defined in this context as stretches of DNA that code for a protein product) found in the organisms. The human genome contains 20,000 to 25,000 genes, the cat contains 20,285 genes, the mouse 24,174, and rice 32,000 to 50,000. In contrast to early assumptions, it turned out that neither organismal complexity nor even position on the food chain was predictive of gene-number (Baedke 2018; Brigandt, Green, and O’Malley 2017; Green 2017) (see the entry on genomics and postgenomics). A related challenge was making sense of the genetic similarity claims. For example, how to interpret the finding that human and pumpkin genomes are 75% similar? Does this finding tell us anything substantive about our overall similarity to pumpkins (Piotrowska 2009)? These challenges led many researchers to focus more closely on non-coding regulatory sequences and genome expression regulation as an alternative explanation of organismal complexity (Morange 2006). This “post-genomic” approach utilizes the sequence information provided by genomics but then situates it in an analysis of all the other entities and activities involved in the mechanisms of transcription (transcriptomics), regulation (regulomics), metabolism (metabolomics), and expression (proteomics). (See ENCODE Project Consortium 2012; Germain et al. 2014; (see also the entry on philosophy of systems and synthetic biology).

In addition to DNA-binding proteins, RNA molecules that are not transcribed into protein products play an important role in both the regulation of protein-coding genes and in protecting the genome from viruses and transposons. RNA interference (RNAi) are short single-stranded RNAs that selectively bind other RNA molecules, inhibiting their translation into proteins. Similar small noncoding RNAs are part of a defense mechanism, known as CRISPR, which protects bacteria against invading viruses. Non-coding RNA has become an extremely powerful experimental tool that allows researchers to specifically and reversibly inactivate any gene of interest. In particular, CRISPR systems have been adapted for use in eukaryotic cells, where they have become the method of choice for genome manipulation (Doudna and Charpentier 2014). On a conceptual level, the fact that developmental complexity correlates with an increase in non-coding sequences, as opposed to protein-coding sequences, led some authors to conclude that “the original conception of genetic information was deficient and that most genes in complex organisms specify regulatory RNAs” (Mattick 2023).

Advances in genomics were largely dependent on the development of new techniques, some of which capitalized on discoveries generated within molecular biology, while others imported knowledge from other disciplines. The discovery of viral reverse transcriptases converting RNA into DNA by Howard M. Temin, Renato Dulbecco and David Baltimore in the 1970s paved the way to the development of complementary DNA, or cDNA, libraries containing only DNA sequences that are transcribed into mRNA. Not only did this technique revolutionize the study of genomes, but it also provided a first insight into what was later to become RNomics, or the study of global transcription profiles of cells. Polymerase chain reaction (PCR), developed by Kary B. Mullis in 1983, made use of heat-stable DNA polymerases from thermophilic bacteria to clone DNA in vitro, greatly simplifying and accelerating the cloning process. Reverse transcription polymerase chain reaction (RT-PCR) combines the two techniques and is currently used to monitor gene expression, cloning, diagnosis, and forensics. Second generation sequencing technologies combining fluorescent tagging with traditional dideoxy sequencing were likewise instrumental in the proliferation of genome projects. These new techniques reduced cost and time significantly, propelling molecular biology into the realm of “big data” (Leonelli 2016). Finally, with an increase in the number of sequenced genomes came an increased need and interest in bioinformatics and the development of genome annotation techniques (Griffiths and Stotz 2013).

Developments in genomics and post-genomics have sparked a number of philosophical questions about molecular biology. Since the genome requires a vast array of other mechanisms to facilitate the generation of a protein product, can DNA really be causally prioritized (see Section 2.3)? Similarly, in the face of such interdependent mechanisms involved in transcription, regulation, and expression, can DNA alone be privileged as the bearer of hereditary information, or is information distributed across all such entities and activities (see Section 2.2)? And is it appropriate to extrapolate from information about other species’ genomes to how the human genome operates (see Section 3.3)?

1.5 Recent Experimental and Conceptual Developments

In addition to the experimental and computational techniques that made possible large scale “omics” projects, many other innovations shaped recent research in molecular biology. Unlike x-ray crystallography, which requires crystalline samples, newly developed nuclear magnetic resonance spectroscopy (NMR) and cryo-electron microscopy (cryo-EM) techniques allow researchers to elucidate the three-dimensional structure of molecules in solution. The plurality of methods used to investigate the structure of biomolecules, along with the occasional disagreements between results yielded by different methods, provided an interesting case study for exploring the question pluralism vs. monism in science (Mitchell and Gronenborn 2017; Mitchell 2009; Bolinska 2022; Vallejos-Baccelliere and Vecchi 2024; see also entry on pluralism [link here to entry “pluralism”). These new techniques also revealed that many proteins contain relatively large unstructured or low-complexity domains. The fact that many such domains are evolutionarily conserved suggests that they have biologically relevant functions, such as providing flexible scaffolds for binding and concentrating biomolecules in specific areas of the cell. Some scaffolding structures can form membraneless organelles, or biomolecular condensates, which, unlike macromolecular machines with a fixed stoichiometry and geometry (Alberts 1998), behave more like liquids with a dynamic and variable composition and geometry (Banani et al. 2017).

Stem cell research was marked by major breakthroughs that received extensive coverage in the media. In 1958, John Gurdon successfully cloned a frog using a nuclear transplantation technique. The fact that nuclei extracted from differentiated cells and transplanted into enucleated eggs develop into apparently normal organisms led scientists to conclude that cell differentiation is not irreversible, as once thought, but differentiated cells can be “reprogrammed” into totipotent and pluripotent stem cells. Unlike “genetic programming,” “cell programming” does not involve the alteration of coding sequences, but rather the overexpression of transcription factors responsible for the activation of the embryonic stem critical genes (Fagan 2013, 2021).

Although it has long been suspected that cellular behaviors must be inherently probabilistic due to the stochastic nature of the molecular mechanisms underpinning them, it was generally assumed that cells manage to minimize molecular noise in order to reliably generate the deterministic behaviors typically observed by studying large populations of cells. This assumption is, however, challenged by an increasing number of studies demonstrating that even isogenic populations of cells grown in the same environment can display phenotypic differences. For example, the expression levels of genes coding for ion channels in neurons of the same type can vary drastically between cells and between individuals, resulting in measurable differences in the values of synaptic and membrane conductances (Marder and Taylor 2011). This, and other similar phenomena are relevant to the problem of extrapolation, albeit this time it concerns inferences about individual or singular behaviors given knowledge of population-level statistics. For example, while studies on cell populations support the conclusion that cells respond in a graded fashion to stimuli, it is possible that, in reality, each cell adopts a categorical, “on” or “off” response phenotype.

Finally, while many branches of biology have “gone molecular,” molecular biology itself embraced mathematical modelling. Mathematical modelling is a common practice in many branches of biology, including classical and clinical genetics, ecology, epidemiology, systems biology, as well as in chemistry and biochemistry. In contrast, molecular biology traditionally relies on qualitative descriptions that have inspired various philosophical characterizations of mechanisms (see Section 2.1). This changed over the past two decades and the latest edition of the widely used Molecular Biology of the Cell textbook (Alberts et al. 2022, Ch. 8) has a substantive section dedicated to the mathematical analysis of biological function meant to complement biochemical and molecular methods of analysis. The dynamic properties of molecular mechanisms are often investigated by mathematical modelling approaches borrowed from chemistry, cybernetics, mechanical engineering and computer science. Likewise, in vitro reconstitution experiments [for a discussion of in vitro reconstitution experiments, see (Weber 2005; Matlin 2022)] are supplemented by in silico experiments used to generate evidence that, in principle, a proposed mechanism suffices to produce a phenomenon of interest (Bechtel 2011; Braillard & Malaterre 2015) [although such simulations cannot demonstrate that the proposed mechanism is actually responsible for the phenomenon (Craver 2006)].

The mathematization and subtle shifts in explanatory approaches in molecular biology and related fields, the development of new experimental techniques, as well as the experimental and theoretical exchanges with other disciplines within and outside biology introduce new problems of interest for philosophers of science and biology. These include the questions concerning the nature of mechanisms (Section 2.1) and the completeness of mechanistic explanations (Section 3.2), reduction and integration (Section 3.1), extrapolations to individual biological systems (Section 3.3) and experimentation (Section 3.4).

2. Concepts in Molecular Biology

The concepts of mechanism, information, and gene all figured quite prominently in the history of molecular biology. Philosophers, in turn, have focused a great deal of attention on these concepts to understand how they have been, are, and should be used.

2.1 Mechanism

Traditionally, philosophers of science took successful scientific explanations to result from derivation from laws of nature (Hempel and Oppenheim 1948; see the entries on laws of nature and scientific explanation). Philosophers of biology have criticized this traditional analysis as inapplicable to biology, and especially molecular biology. (For further discussion, see Beatty 1995; Brandon 1997; Lange 2000; Mitchell 1997; Smart 1963; Sober 1997; Waters 1998; Weber 2005).

Working in the causal-mechanical tradition pioneered by Wesley Salmon (1984, 1998), philosophers turned to understanding mechanism elucidation as the avenue to scientific explanation in biology (Bechtel and Abrahamsen 2005; Bechtel and Richardson 1993; Craver 2007; Darden 2006a; Glennan 2017; Machamer, Darden, and Craver 2000; Sarkar 1998; Schaffner 1993; Woodward 2002, 2010). Several characterizations of what a mechanism is have emerged over the years (Bechtel and Abrahamsen 2005; Glennan 2002; Machamer, Darden, and Craver 2000). Stuart Glannan summarizes the essential features of mechanisms as follows:

A mechanism for a phenomenon consists of entities (or parts) whose activities and interactions are organized so as to be responsible for the phenomenon. (Glennan 2017: 17) [for a similar characterization see (Illari and Williamson 2012: 120)]

As an example, consider the phenomenon of DNA replication. The double helix of DNA (an entity with an organization) unwinds (an activity) and new component parts (entities) bond (an activity) to both parts of the unwound DNA helix. DNA is a nucleic acid composed of several subparts: a sugar-phosphate backbone and nucleic acid bases. When DNA unwinds, the bases exhibit weak charges, properties that result from slight asymmetries in the molecules. These weak charges allow a DNA base and its complement to engage in the activity of forming hydrogen (weak polar) chemical bonds; the specificity of this activity is due to the topological arrangements of the weak polar charges in the subparts of the base. Ultimately, entities with polar charges enable the activity of hydrogen bond formation. After the complementary bases align, then the backbone forms via stronger covalent bonding. The mechanism proceeds with unwinding and bonding together (activities) new parts, to produce two helices (newly formed entities) that are (more or less faithful) copies of the parent helix. (This process of “semi-conservative replication” and the Meselson-Stahl experiment that confirmed it are discussed in more detail in Section 3.4.)

There are several virtues of the causal-mechanical approach to understanding scientific explanation in molecular biology. For one, it is truest to molecular biologists’ own language when engaging in biological explanation. Molecular biologists rarely describe their practice and achievements as the development of new theories; rather, they describe their practice and achievements as the elucidation of molecular mechanisms (Baetu 2019; Craver 2001; Machamer, Darden, Craver 2000; [link here to entry “mechanisms in science”). Second, knowledge of a mechanism shows how something works: elucidated mechanisms provide understanding. Third, the causal-mechanical approach captures biological explanations of both regularity and variation. Unlike in physics, where a scientist assumes that an electron is an electron is an electron, a biologist is often interested in precisely what makes one individual different from another, one population different from another, or one species different from another (Calcott 2009; Tabery 2009, 2014). Finally, knowledge of mechanisms potentially allows one to intervene to change what the mechanism produces, to manipulate its parts to construct experimental tools, or to repair a broken, diseased mechanism. In short, knowledge of elucidated mechanisms provides understanding, prediction, and control.

2.2 Information

The language of information appears often in molecular biology. Genes as linear DNA sequences of bases are said to carry “information” to produce proteins. During protein synthesis, the information is “transcribed” from DNA to messenger RNA and then “translated” from RNA to protein. With respect to inheritance, it is often said that what is passed from one generation to the next is the “information” in the genes, namely the linear ordering of bases along complementary DNA strands. Historians of biology have tracked the entrenchment of information-talk in molecular biology (Kay 2000) since its introduction.

The question for philosophers of biology is whether an analysis of the concept of information can capture the various ways in which the concept is used in molecular biology (e.g., Maynard Smith 2000). The usage of “information” in the mathematical theory of communication is too impoverished to capture the molecular biological usage, since the coded sequences in the DNA are more than just a signal with some number of bits that may or may not be accurately transmitted (Sarkar 1996b,c; Sterelny and Griffiths 1999; Shannon and Weaver 1949). Conversely, the usage in cognitive neuroscience, with its talk of “representations” (e.g., Crick 1988) may be said to be too rich, since the coded sequences in the DNA are also not said to have within them a representation of the whole-organism (Kölv 2020) or even of the structure of the protein (Darden 2006b). No definition of “information” as it is used in molecular biology has yet received wide support among philosophers of biology.

Stephen Downes (2006) helpfully distinguishes three positions on the relation between information and the natural world:

  1. Information is present in DNA and other nucleotide sequences. Other cellular mechanisms contain no information.
  2. Information is present in DNA, in other nucleotide sequences and other cellular mechanisms, for example cytoplasmic or extra-cellular proteins; and in many other media, for example, the embryonic environment or components of an organism’s wider environment.
  3. DNA and other nucleotide sequences do not contain information, nor do any other cellular mechanisms.

These options may be read either ontologically or heuristically. A heuristic reading of (1), for instance, views the talk of information in molecular biology as useful in providing a way of talking and in guiding research. And so the heuristic benefit of the information concept can be defended without making any commitment to the ontological status (Sarkar 2000). Indeed, one might argue that a vague and open-ended use of information is valuable for heuristic purposes, especially during early discovery phases in the development of a field.

Philosophers’ discussions of the concept of information in biology have also focused on its ontological reading. Three different philosophical accounts of information serve as exemplars of Downes’ three categories. Ulrich Stegmann (2005) provides an example of Downes’ first category with his analysis of template-directed synthesis. (Stegmann does explicitly allow that components other than nucleotide sequences might contain what he calls instructional information. However, his only example is a thought experiment involving enzymes linearly ordered along a membrane; nothing of the sort is known to exist or even seems very likely to exist.) Stegmann calls this the sequentialization view. Stegmann’s instructional account of genetic information requires that the component carrying the information satisfy the following conditions: an advance specification of the kind and order of steps that yield a determinate outcome if the steps are carried out. On his account, DNA qualifies as an instructional information carrier for replication, transcription and translation. The sequence of bases provides the order. The hydrogen bonding between specific bases and the genetic code provides the specific kinds of steps. And the mechanisms of replication, transcription, and translation yield certain outcomes: a copy of the DNA double helix, an mRNA, and a linear order of amino acids. Also, because DNA carries information for a specific outcome, an error can occur as the mechanism operates to produce that outcome; hence Stegmann’s account allows for errors and error-correcting mechanisms (such as proof-reading mechanisms that correct DNA mutations). For more on this topic, see the entry on biological information.

Eva Jablonka (2002) offers an example of Downes’ second category. She argues that information is ubiquitous. She defines information as follows: a source becomes an informational input when an interpreting receiver can react to the form of the source (and variations in this form) in a functional manner. She claims a broad applicability of this definition. The definition, she says, accommodates information stemming from environmental cues as well as from evolved signals, and calls for a comparison between information-transmission in different types of inheritance systems — the genetic, the epigenetic, the behavioral, and the cultural-symbolic. On this view, genes have no theoretically privileged informational status (Jablonka 2002: 583).

In line with Downes’ third category, C. Kenneth Waters argues that information is a useful term in rhetorical contexts, such as seeking funding for DNA sequencing by claiming that DNA carries information. However, from an ontological perspective, Waters claims that explication of DNA’s causal role has no need for the concept of information. Genes, he argues, should not be viewed as “immaterial units of information” (Waters 2000: 541). As discussed in Section 2.3 below, Waters’ focus is on stretches of DNA whose causal roles are as actual specific difference makers in genetic mechanisms (Waters 2007). Talk of information is not needed; causal role function talk is sufficient. (For more on Waters’ view see the entry on molecular genetics; for others who make similar points, see Morange 2020; Sustar 2007; Weber 2005, 2006.) More generally, Oliver Lean (2020) argues that the notion of binding specificity characteristic of many molecular interactions (including those between enzymes and substrates, transcription factors and DNA binding sites, antibodies and antigens, DNA and RNA) is intimately linked to “the issue of causal selection – the practice of singling out one or more causes of an outcome as being ”the“ cause, or of particular relevance or importance” and may provide the equivalent of an ideal intervention.

2.3 Gene

The question of whether classical, Mendelian genetics could be (or already has been) reduced to molecular biology (to be taken up in Section 3.1 below) motivated philosophers to consider the connectability of the term they shared: the gene. Investigations of reduction and scientific change raised the question of how the concept of the gene evolved, figuring prominently in C. Kenneth Waters’ (1990, 1994, 2007, see entry on molecular genetics), Philip Kitcher’s (1982, 1984) and Raphael Falk’s (1986) work. Over time, however, philosophical discussions of the gene concept took on a life of their own, as philosophers raised questions independent of the reduction debate: What is a gene? And is there anything causally distinct about DNA? (see the entry on the gene)

Falk (1986) explicitly asked philosophers and historians of biology, “What is a Gene?” Discoveries such as overlapping genes, split genes, and alternative splicing (discussed in Section 1.2) made it clear that simply equating a gene with an uninterrupted stretch of DNA would no longer capture the complicated molecular-developmental details of mechanisms such as gene expression (Downes 2004; Luc-Germain, Ratti and Boem 2015). In an effort to answer Falk’s question, two general trends have emerged in the philosophical literature: first, distinguish multiple gene concepts to capture the complex structural and functional features separately, or second, rethink a unified gene concept to incorporate such complexity. (For a survey of gene concepts defended by philosophers, see Griffiths and Stotz 2007, 2013; Rheinberger and Muller-Wille 2018. In contrast, for an argument as to why philosophers should stop investigating the question, “What is a gene?” see Boem et al. 2016.)

An example of the first line came from Evelyn Fox Keller’s distinction between the gene as a structural and functional entity (Keller 2000). A structural gene concept picks out an ordered sequence of DNA, usually one that corresponds to a single protein or a single structural, catalytic, or regulatory RNA molecule. In contrast, a functional gene concept picks out entities that give rise to phenotypes, which include other parts of the genome. For example, stretches of regulatory DNA, which do not code for proteins, dictate when and where proteins are made. Since they play a causal role in phenotypic expression, they are included under a functional gene concept. (Lenny Moss (2001, 2002) offers another example of a gene-concept divider.)

A second philosophical approach for conceptualizing the gene involved rethinking a single, unified gene concept that captured the molecular-developmental complexities. For example, Eva Neumann-Held (Neumann-Held 1999, 2001; Griffiths and Neumann-Held 1999) claimed that a “process molecular gene concept” (PMG) embraced complicated developmental intricacies. On her unified view, the term “gene” referred to “the recurring process that leads to the temporally and spatially regulated expression of a particular polypeptide product” (Neumann-Held 1999). More recently, Francesca Bellazzi (2022) has argued for an even more flexible and context dependent gene concept. According to Bellazzi, genes are weakly emergent entities that are both relational and temporal. Specifically, genes emerge from precise segments of DNA during the process of transcription, which occurs when intricate mechanisms operate within the surrounding context. (Falk (2001) offers another example of a gene-concept unifier.)

Relatedly, philosophers have also debated the causal distinctiveness of DNA. Although there is wide agreement that phenotypes are caused by stretches of DNA and by all the other developmental resources involved in gene expression, there is disagreement about how to weigh the importance of the causal contribution of all the factors involved. Proponents of the “causal parity thesis” argue that all developmental resources involved in the generation of a phenotype should be treated as being on par (Griffiths and Knight 1998; Griffiths and Stotz 2013; Robert 2004; Stotz 2006). In contrast, proponents of the “causal specificity” of genetic material argue that the ability to exercise more precise control over its effects sets genetic material apart from other biological causes (Griffiths et al. 2015; Waters 2007; Weber 2017). Waters was the first to offer an influential response to the causal parity thesis, based on his distinction between “potential” and “actual difference makers.” According to Waters, DNA is causally distinctive because it fulfills the conditions of being an actual difference maker (see the entry on molecular genetics [link here to entry “molecular genetics”] for more on this distinction).

Related to the debate about the causal distinctiveness of DNA has been the question of how to classify so-called junk DNA. Most biologists and philosophers of biology do not consider junk-DNA to be on causal par with coding DNA, because mutations in junk-DNA do not affect function (although for an alternate account of junk-DNA’s non-coding function see Doolittle 2013). However, Joyce Havstad and Alexander Palazzo (2022) have argued that despite its paradigmatically non-functional role, junk DNA meets the criteria of being an actual difference maker. But since junk-DNA is not considered to be on causal par with coding DNA, this suggests that Waters’ account of what makes coding DNA causally distinctive is incomplete. According to Havstad and Palazzo, the missing components are ‘causal reach’ and ‘causal efficacy.’ While junk DNA can indeed produce causally specific proximate effects, its causal specificity has limited reach and efficacy, which is why it is not considered to be on par with coding DNA in terms of causality. Nonetheless, Havstad and Palazzo maintain that the diminished causal status of junk-DNA in relation to coding DNA does not diminish its significance within the cell.

3. Molecular Biology and General Philosophy of Science

In addition to analyzing key concepts in the field, philosophers have employed case studies from molecular biology to address more general issues in the philosophy of science, such as reduction, explanation, extrapolation, and experimentation. For each of these philosophical issues, evidence from molecular biology directs philosophical attention toward understanding the concept of a mechanism for addressing the topic.

3.1 Reduction

Reduction may be understood in multiple ways depending on what it is that is being reduced (see the entry on scientific reduction). Theory reduction pertains to whether theories from one scientific field can be reduced to theories from another scientific field. In contrast, explanatory reduction (often united with methodological reduction) pertains to whether or not explanations that come from lower levels (often united with methodologies that investigate those lower levels) are better than explanations that come from higher levels. Philosophical attention to molecular biology has contributed to debates about both of these senses of reduction (see the entry on reductionism in biology).

Philosophy of biology first came to prominence as a subspecialty of philosophy of science in the 1970s when it offered an apparent case study by which to judge how theories from one field may reduce to theories from another field. The specific question was: might classic, Mendelian genetics reduce to molecular genetics (see the entry on molecular genetics)? Kenneth Schaffner used and developed Ernst Nagel’s (1961) analysis of derivational theory reduction to argue for the reduction of classical Mendelian genetics (T2) to molecular biology (T1) and refined it over many years (summarized in Schaffner 1993). The goal of formal reduction was to logically deduce the laws of classical genetics (or its improved successor, “modern transmission genetics” T2*) from the laws of molecular biology. Such a derivation required that all the terms of T2* not in T1 had to be connected to terms in T1 via correspondence rules. Hence, Schaffner endeavored to find molecular equivalents of such terms as “gene,” as well as predicate terms, such as “is dominant.” David Hull (1974) criticized formal reduction, argued against Schaffner’s claims, and suggested, instead, that perhaps molecular biology replaced classical genetics. However, the absence of explicit laws in most fields of biology raised doubts about the relevance of intertheoretical reduction in biology, prompting a shift of attention to explanation and methodology. William Wimsatt (1976) highlighted the importance of decompositional explanation via mechanisms, while Lindley Darden and Nancy Maull (1977) focused attention on the bridges between fields formed by part-whole relations, structure-function relations, and cause-effect relations.

With the emergence of the new mechanistic philosophy (Glennan and Illari 2017; Machamer et al. 2000), the question of the relationship between molecular biology and other biological disciplines has been analyzed through the lens of mechanisms. The decomposition of biological systems often reveals a hierarchical organization, which led some authors to propose that lower-level components are organized as mechanisms underlying higher-level components (Bechtel 2006; Bechtel and Richardson 2010; Craver 2007; Craver and Povich, 2017; Craver et al. 2021). The notion that explanations in biology can occur at different levels of description fueled a new reductionism debate concerning whether lower-level molecular explanations (often united with methodologies that investigate those lower levels) are better or more complete than higher-level explanations. On the reductionist side, it has been argued that higher-level explanations involving biological or functional kinds such as organism, cell, and gene ultimately need to be completed, and occasionally replaced, by molecular biology explanations and, in more general terms, by explanations in terms of chemical and physical entities and interactions (Bickle 1998, Rosenberg 2020). In response to reductionistic proposals, critics highlighted the fact that biologically relevant information is coded not only in the specificity of molecular interactions, but also in a variety of organizational and contextual features not captured by molecular biological principles, such as spatial, regulatory, and dynamical properties of developing systems (Delehanty 2005; Frost-Arnold 2004; Keller 1999; Laubichler and Wagner 2001; Love et al. 2008; Robert 2001, 2004).

Eschewing the traditional reductionism-antireductionism dichotomy, Darden (2005) argued that classical genetics and molecular biology elucidated sequentially operating chromosomal and molecular mechanisms, each involving different working entities operating at different spatiotemporal scales. This suggested that an integrative account should replace talk of reduction or replacement. Molecular biology was born by integrating approaches from physics, chemistry and biology (Section 1.1) and similar interdisciplinary and integrative tendencies are illustrated by recent exchanges between molecular biology and evolutionary biology in comparative phylogenetics, developmental biology, and cancer research (Section 1.5). Integrative approaches have also been proposed in an attempt to reconcile mechanistic explanations with other types of explanation that may be relevant to molecular biology (Section 3.2 below). For example, it has been argued that, while essential to the understanding of life (as well as gaining experimental control and developing new treatments and technologies), molecular explanations are incomplete or insufficient, and need to be complemented by mathematical models in order to account for dynamical and quantitative aspects of biological phenomena (Bechtel and Abrahamsen 2010; Braillard et Malaterre 2015; Brigandt 2013). This particular debate can be understood as an instance of a more general debate about the relationship between molecular and systems biology (Bechtel 2020; Bechtel and Abrahamsen 2010; De Backer, De Waele, and Van Speybroeck 2010; Huettemann and Love 2011; Marco 2012; Morange 2008; Pigliucci 2013; Powell and Dupre 2009; see also section 3.2 below and the entries on feminist philosophy of biology, philosophy of systems and synthetic biology, and multiple realizability).

3.2 Explanation

In addition to mechanistic approaches (Section 2.1), other accounts of explanation in molecular biology have been proposed (Braillard and Malaterre 2015). Philip Kitcher (1989, 1993) developed a unificationist account of explanation, and he and Sylvia Culp explicitly applied it to molecular biology (Culp and Kitcher 1989). Among the premises of the “Watson-Crick” argument schema were “transcription, post-transcriptional modification and translation for the alleles in question”, along with details of cell biology and embryology for the organisms in question (Kitcher 1989). An explanation of a particular pattern of distribution of progeny phenotypes in a genetic cross resulted from instantiating the appropriate deductive argument schema: the variables were filled with the details from the particular case and the conclusion derived from the premises.

Several authors have raised the possibility that explanations in terms of pathways are distinct from mechanistic explanations (Boniolo and Campaner 2018; Brigandt 2018), most notably on the grounds that “a single pathway can be instantiated by different mechanisms, that distinct pathways can have similar mechanisms, and that pathways can be discovered without any knowledge of the mechanisms that underlie them” (Ross 2018: 132). While Lauren Ross argued for drawing a sharper distinction between mechanistic and pathway explanations, Stavros Ioannidis and Stathis Psillos (2017) proposed to revise the concept of mechanism along the lines of a causal pathway or structure, arguing for a minimalist mechanistic ontology committed solely to the existence of causal dependencies between measured or manipulated variables. The realization that unstructured proteins can have biologically relevant functions and the discovery of biomolecular condensates (Section 1.5), contributed to a renewed philosophical interest in process ontologies. Proponents of processual approaches (Bapteste and Dupre 2013; Bickhard 2011; Campbell 2015; Dupre 2012; Jaeger and Monk 2015; Jaeger et al. 2012; Meincke 2018; Nicholson and Dupre 2018) argue that processes are ontologically primary and that mechanistic accounts mistakenly assume that parts composing a biological mechanism can be identified independently of the activities or processes in which they are involved. However, other authors challenged the idea that processual explanations can be sufficiently grounded “without the metaphysical underpinning of the very mechanisms which processes purport to replace” (Austin 2016: 639).

Finally, the concept of mechanistic explanation itself evolved in response to recent trends in molecular biology. Traditionally, mechanistic explanations in molecular biology are construed as qualitative representations consisting of narratives or diagrams. These representations, which may be called “models of a mechanism” (see the entry on models in science), are meant to convey an intuitive understanding by simulating the working of mechanisms in our imagination (Bechtel and Abrahamsen 2005) or by analogy with more common types of activities (Machamer 2004). While qualitative representations play an important role in scientific practice, they remain heavily idealized (Baetu 2017; Love and Nathan 2015). Quantitative and dynamic aspects are absent or highly simplified, while known facts are distorted in order to outline a deterministic sequence of events tracking the fate of single molecules (a more accurate biochemical description would be that of a series of back and forth equilibria involving populations of colliding molecules), each assumed to be rigidly structured (ignoring the fact that molecules vibrate and cycle through various configurations), as they modify one another in order to bring about a change from an initial to a final state (thus masking an underlying variety of chemical pathways that contribute to the same final state and alternate pathways where mechanisms fail to contribute to the output). Mathematical modelling aims to circumvent these shortcomings by formally describing quantitative, dynamic and stochastic aspects of molecular mechanisms that are not adequately represented by narratives and diagrammatic representations. The use of formal methods for understanding molecular mechanisms attracted the attention of philosophers, who explored the extent to which mathematical modelling and computer simulations complement and extend mechanistic explanations (Bechtel and Abrahamsen 2010; Brigandt 2013; Braillard and Malaterre 2015) or constitute a significant departure from a strictly mechanistic mode of explanation (Braillard 2010; Silberstein and Chemero 2013).

The fact that many biological mechanisms are stochastic contributed to a general debate about the extent to which regularity is an essential characteristic of mechanisms (Andersen 2012; Darden 2008), with some authors emphasizing the highly irregular of some mechanisms (Bogen 2005). In the case of molecular biology, the intrinsically stochastic nature of molecular mechanisms further led scientists and philosophers to question the hegemony of the traditional “order-from-order” paradigm of molecular biology initially suggested by Schroedinger (1944) and reinforced by the specificity of molecular interactions [for a discussion of the concept of specificity, see (Lean 2020)], and introduce an alternative, “order-from-disorder” explanatory approach (Ilan 2020; Kupiec et al. 2011). For example, probabilistic biases in the distribution of adhesion proteins suffice to generate the right amount of twisting in the developing gut, while stochastic gene expression is responsible for generating blue- to ultraviolet-sensitive cells ratios in the Drosophila eye. Another interesting example is that of molecular ratchet mechanisms exploiting thermal noise to do mechanical work (Astumian 2001), which led Bechtel and Bollhagen (2021: 12705) to argue that the traditional mechanistic ontology of mechanisms “should be expanded to include constraints and energetics.”

3.3 Extrapolation

As discussed earlier in the historical sections, molecular biologists have relied heavily on model organisms (see the entry on models in science). For example, research on E. coli and yeast provided the foundation needed to understand genetic mechanisms in various cells, but the advent of recombinant DNA technology in the 1970s enabled researchers to modify model organisms to fit their needs. The fruit fly was often used in the early recombinant DNA experiments. According to Marcel Weber “The molecular Drosophilists genetically engineered their favorite lab animal until it became a highly productive system for identifying and isolating DNA regions that interested them” (Weber 2005, 169). The latest CRISPR technology has made the modification of model organisms even more precise and affordable. Today, researchers often “humanize” laboratory mice by inserting human genes or cells into the animal to model some aspect of human physiology (Piotrowska 2013). However, humanized animals are not human, which means that researchers must still justify their beliefs that these mice are similar enough to their human counterparts to mimic human physiology. Relatedly, when a therapy tested on humanized mice shows promising results, researchers must still justify any inference about the likelihood of the therapy being effective in humans despite causally relevant differences between the model and the target.

This difficulty, of “transferring causal generalizations from one context to another when homogeneity cannot be presumed” (Steel 2008: 3) is known as the problem of extrapolation. A number of philosophers have explored this problem in the context of molecular biology (see, for example, Ankeny 2001; Baetu 2016; Bechtel and Abrahamsen 2005; Bolker 1995, 2009, 2017; Burian 1993b; Darden 2007; LaFollette and Shanks 1996; Love 2009; Nelson 2018; Piotrowska 2013; Schaffner 1986; Steel 2008; Weber 2005; Wimsatt 1998). Solving the problem of extrapolation has proven difficult because determining whether the model and its target are similar enough in causally relevant respects often leads to a trap—what Daniel Steel (2008) calls the “extrapolator’s circle.” One way to escape the extrapolator’s circle is to black box the mechanisms being compared and instead treat the problem of extrapolation as a statistical problem (cf. Cook and Campbell 1979). This method hinges on demonstrating statistically significant outcomes from the same intervention, sidestepping the need to establish mechanism similarity. One problem with relying merely on statistics to solve the problem of extrapolation, however, is that it cannot show that an observed correlation between model and target is the result of intervention and not a confounder. A more promising formal approach to the problem of extrapolation exploits the fact that certain probability distributions and patterns of statistical dependency are insensitive to changes in causal structure (Hernán and Vanderweele 2011; Pearl and Bareinboim 2014).

A different strategy for avoiding the extrapolator’s circle is to remove the black box and compare the two mechanisms but argue that they do not have to be causally similar at every stage for extrapolation to be justified. This approach avoids the circle because the suitability of a model can be established given only partial information about the target. For example, Steel argues that only the stages downstream from the point where the mechanisms in the model and target are likely to differ need to be compared, since the point where differences are likely will serve as a bottleneck through which the eventual outcome must be produced. Despite its promise, criticisms have emerged. Jeremy Howick et al. (2013) express concern that identifying bottlenecks and downstream differences requires more target information than Steel acknowledges, potentially reintroducing the extrapolator’s circle. Another critique, raised by Julian Reiss (2010), Federica Russo (2010), and Brendan Clarke et al. (2014), is that Steel’s approach doesn’t address the masking problem, leaving open the possibility of multiple paths linking X to Y. For example, there may be an upstream difference that affects the outcome but does not pass through the downstream stages of the mechanism. (This problem is taken up again below in Section 3.4.) A third concern, voiced by Baetu (2016), is that mechanistic accounts often combine data from various experimental setups, creating a theoretical chimera unsupported by a consistent mechanism present in any cell or organism. Instead, as several authors have also pointed out (Huber and Keuck 2013; Lemoine 2017; Nelson 2013, 2018), the mechanism of interest is often stipulated first and then verified piecemeal in many different experimental organisms. The result is what Mael Lemoine (2017) has called a “theoretical chimera”, a hypothesis supported by heterogeneous partial models. On the chimera view of extrapolation, it’s possible that all one-to-one analogies work, and yet the aggregate theoretical chimera model fails.

3.4 Experimentation

The history of molecular biology is in part the history of experimental techniques designed to probe the macromolecular mechanisms found in living things. Philosophers in turn have looked to molecular biology as a case study for understanding how experimentation works in science—how it contributes to scientific discovery, distinguishes correlation from causal and constitutive relevance, and decides between competing hypotheses (Marcum 2007; Baetu 2019; Barwich and Baschir 2017; Craver and Darden 2013; Rheinberger 1997; Weber 2009, 2008, 2005; see also Experiment in Biology [link here to entry “Experiment in Biology”]).

Lindley Darden has focused on the strategies that scientists employ to construct, evaluate, and revise mechanical explanations of phenomena; on her view, discovery is a piecemeal, incremental, and iterative process of mechanism elucidation. In the 1950s and 1960s, for example, scientists from both molecular biology and biochemistry employed their own experimental strategies to elucidate the mechanisms of protein synthesis that linked DNA to the production of proteins. Molecular biologists moved forward from DNA using experimental techniques such as x-ray crystallography and model building to understand how the structure of DNA dictated what molecules it could interact with; biochemists simultaneously moved backward from the protein products using in vitro experimental systems to understand the chemical reactions and chemical bonding necessary to build a protein. They met in the middle at RNA, ultimately leading to Watson’s famous mechanism schema DNA → RNA → protein. Far from being philosophically inscrutable, Darden points out that the molecular biologists were “forward chaining” while the biochemists were “backward chaining”, using information about the working entities and activities that they knew about to infer what could come next or before in the mechanism of protein synthesis (Darden 2006a: chapters 3, 12; Craver and Darden 2013: chapter 10).

Tudor Baetu (2019) has attempted a reconstruction of the discovery process in molecular biology using the mechanisms of inflammatory responses as a case study. Following Bechtel and Richardson (1993), he argues research in molecular biology typically involves the development of standardized experimental models in the context of which phenomena can be systematically replicated. For example, an experimental model of inflammation specifies a replicable and recognizable physical object of investigation, namely the experimental setup likely to contain within its spatiotemporal boundaries all the causal ingredients required for producing an inflammatory response of the skin. Putative mechanistic components are identified by systematically targeting variables describing the experimental setup in the hope of demonstrating that specific changes in the experimental setup and the physical systems of which it is composed result in changes in the phenomenon under investigation (Craver and Darden 2013). However, in contrast to “levelled” mutual manipulability accounts proposed in the mechanistic literature (Craver, Glennan, and Povich 2021; Craver 2007; entry on mechanisms in science), Baetu argues that experiments in molecular biology can only generate evidence for causal mediation, which only allows for the reconstruction of “flat” mechanisms in which levels of decomposition are replaced by levels of graininess of causal descriptions [For similar views see (Fazekas 2022; Harinen 2014).] Finally, a mechanism must be “recomposed” to show how it generates the phenomenon (Bechtel 2011). In practice, a mechanism’s recomposition often relies on in vitro reconstitution experiments (Weber 2005; Matlin 2022) or mathematical models (Braillard and Malaterre 2015) aiming to demonstrate that components organized, acting, and having the properties described in the mechanistic explanation can, and ideally are sufficient to produce the phenomenon under investigation. A physical interpretation of the variables measured and manipulated in experiments, based on a theoretical commitment of molecular biology to the ontology of chemistry or an understanding of how experimental techniques work (Weber 2009), is also an important ingredient in the recomposition of mechanisms.

Experiments from molecular biology have also figured into philosophical discussions about the possibility of “crucial experiments”. An experiment is taken to be a crucial experiment if it is devised so as to result in the confirmation of one hypothesis by way of refuting other competing hypotheses. But the very idea of a crucial experiment, Pierre Duhem pointed out, assumes that the set of known competing hypotheses contains all possible explanations of a given phenomenon such that the refutation of all but one of the hypotheses deductively ensures the confirmation of the hypothesis left standing. However, if there are in fact unknown alternatives that weren’t considered in the set of competing hypotheses, Duhem warned, then the refutation cannot guarantee the confirmation of the last hypothesis standing (also see the entry on Pierre Duhem [link here to entry “Pierre Duhem”). (Duhem raised two problems for crucial experiments—the problem mentioned above, as well as the problem of auxiliary assumptions, which any hypothesis brings with it; for reasons of space, we will only discuss the former here.) Marcel Weber has analyzed two famous discovery episodes in molecular biology, Peter Mitchell’s elucidation of the mechanism for oxidative phosphorylation (Weber 2009) and the Meselson-Stahl experiment corroborating the semiconservative DNA replication mechanism proposed by Watson and Crick (Weber 2005: Chapter 4) to offer a different vision of how crucial experiments work. He concludes that, in both cases, experiments generated strong evidence favoring one mechanistic hypothesis while ruling out the most important rival explanations proposed at the time, thus approximating the ideal of a crucial experiment. However, Weber argues that we should understand the quick uptake of Meselson and Stahl’s experimental result (Meselson and Stahl 1958; Holmes 2001) as an instance of inference to the best explanation (as opposed to Duhem’s deductive characterization). Meselson and Stahl, Weber claims, took the physiological mechanism of DNA replication and then embedded it in an “experimental mechanism”; that experimental mechanism then generated the observed data pattern of heavy-vs-light DNA. Moreover, any hypothesis of DNA replication had to satisfy mechanistic constraints imposed by what was already known about the physiological mechanism—that DNA was a double helix, and that the sequence of nucleotides in the DNA needed to be preserved in subsequent generations. So Duhem’s concern about unknown alternatives was alleviated because known mechanistic constraints limited the set of possible hypotheses that could generate the phenomenon. On Weber’s reading, the mechanistic constraints culled the set of possible hypotheses for DNA replication to semi-conservative replication, conservative replication, and dispersive replication; then, among that set, Meselson and Stahl devised an experimental mechanism such that semi-conservative replication was the best explanation of the data pattern they found.

4. Conclusion

An overview of the history of molecular biology revealed the original convergence of geneticists, physicists, and structural chemists on a common problem: the nature of inheritance. Conceptual and methodological frameworks from each of these disciplinary strands united in the ultimate determination of the double helical structure of DNA (conceived of as an informational molecule) along with the mechanisms of gene replication, mutation, and expression. With this recent history in mind, philosophers of molecular biology have examined the key concepts of the field: mechanism, information, and gene. Moreover, molecular biology has provided cases for addressing more general issues in the philosophy of science, such as reduction, explanation, extrapolation, and experimentation.


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