Atheism and Agnosticism

First published Tue Mar 9, 2004; substantive revision Mon Aug 8, 2011

The main purpose of this article is to explore the differences between atheism and agnosticism, and the relations between them. The task is made more difficult because each of these words are what Wittgenstein called ‘family resemblance’ words. That is, we cannot expect to find a set of necessary and sufficient conditions  for their use. Their use is appropriate if a fair number of the conditions are satisfied. Moreover even particular members of the families are often imprecise, and sometimes almost completely obscure. Sometimes a person who is really an atheist may describe herself, even passionately, as an agnostic because of unreasonable generalised philosophical scepticism which would preclude us from saying that we know anything whatever except perhaps the truths of mathematics and formal logic.

1. Atheism

‘Atheism’ means the negation of theism, the denial of the existence of God. I shall here assume that the God in question is that of a sophisticated monotheism. The tribal gods of the early inhabitants of Palestine are of little or no philosophical interest. They were essentially finite beings, and the god of one tribe or collection of tribes was regarded as good in that it enabled victory in war against tribes with less powerful gods. Similarly the Greek and Roman gods were more like mythical heroes and heroines than like the omnipotent, omniscient and good God postulated in mediaeval and modern philosophy. As the Romans used the word, ‘atheist’ could be used to refer to theists of another religion, notably the Christians, and so merely to signify disbelief in their own mythical heroes.

The word ‘theism’ exhibits family resemblance in another direction. For example should a pantheist call herself an atheist? Or again should belief in Plato's Form of the Good or in John Leslie's idea of God as an abstract principle that brings value into existence count as theism (Leslie 1979)? Let us consider pantheism.

At its simplest, pantheism can be ontologically indistinguishable from atheism. Such a pantheism would be belief in nothing beyond the physical universe, but associated with emotions of wonder and awe similar to those that we find in religious belief. I shall not consider this as theism. Probably the theologian Paul Tillich was a pantheist in little more than this minimal sense and his characterising God as the ground of being has no clear meaning. The unanswerable question ‘Why is there anything at all?’ may give us mystical or at any rate dizzy feelings but such feelings do not differentiate the pantheist from the atheist. However there are stronger forms of pantheism which do differentiate the pantheist from the atheist (Levine, 1994). For example the pantheist may think that the universe as a whole has strongly emergent and also mind-like qualities. Not emergent merely in the weak sense that a radio receiver's ability to receive signals from distant stations might be said to be emergent because it is not a mere jumble of components (Smart 1981). The components have to be wired together in a certain way, and indeed the workings of the individual components can be explained by the laws of physics. Contrast this with a concept of emergence that I shall call ‘strong emergence’. C. D. Broad in his Scientific Thought (Broad 1923) held that the chemical properties of common salt could not even in principle be deduced from those of sodium and chlorine separately, at the very time at which the quantum theory of the chemical bond was beginning to be developed. Though the mind has seemed to some to be strongly emergent from its physical basis, it can be argued that developments in the philosophy of mind, cognitive science and neuroscience favour weak emergence only.

One strong form of pantheism ascribes mental properties to the cosmos. If the weak sense of emergence was adopted we would be faced with the question of whether the universe looks like a giant brain. Patently it does not. Samuel Alexander asserted, rather than argued, that mentality strongly emerged from space-time, and then that at some future time there will emerge a new and at present hardly imaginable level which he called ‘deity’ (Alexander 1927). It is hard to tell whether such an implausible metaphysics should be classified as as pantheism or as theism. Certainly such a deity would not be the infinite creator God of orthodox theism. A. N. Whitehead, too, had a theory of an emergent deity, though with affinities to Platonism, which he saw as the realm of potentiality and therefore he connected the atemporal with the contingent temporal deity (Whitehead 1929). Such views will not deliver, however implausibly, more than a finite deity, not the God of core theism. God would be just one more thing in the universe, however awesome and admirable.

The weak form of pantheism accepts that the physical universe is all and eschews strong emergence. Sometimes the weak form of pantheism is rhetorically disguised as theism, with God characterised as ‘absolute depth’ or some equally baffling expression, as by Paul Tillich. At any rate, whether or not we accept pantheism as a sort of theism, what we mean by ‘atheism’ will vary according to what in the dialectical situation we count as theism.

2. An Adequate Concept of God

This brings us naturally to the question of what we might consider to be an adequate concept of God, whether or not we wish to argue for the existence of such a being. Some profound remarks were made on this by J. N. Findlay in his article (‘Can God's Existence be Disproved?’ (Findlay 1949). The heathen may worship stocks and stones but does not see them as merely stocks and stones. More and more adequate conceptions of God still portray God as limited in various respects. A fully adequate conception of God, Findlay said, would see God as not only unlimited in various admirable properties but also as a necessarily existing being. Thus ‘There is one and only one God’ would have to be a logically necessary truth. Now logic, he held, is tautologous and without ontological commitment. So God's necessary existence would have to be something different from logical necessity. The trouble is how to see what this could be.

It might be replied that there are non-trivial necessary existential propositions in mathematics, such as ‘There are infinitely many primes’ which implies of course ‘the number 7 exists’. (We can ignore the unhelpful ‘Something exists’ which is allowed by standard first order logic purely for convenience as few would need to apply logic to discourse about an empty universe for which in any case there are separate rules for determining validity or otherwise.) It is well known that Frege in his Foundations of Arithmetic claimed to reduce arithmetic to logic. However in effect he was using a free logic without ontological commitment. Claims to reduce set theory (and so analysis) to logic are of course even more problematic. Would it help towards an adequate conception of God if we said that God has the sort of existence or non-existence that prime numbers have? One might say ‘not much’. In any case it is dangerous to talk of types of existence because it treats existence as though it was a property. At the time that he wrote his article Findlay was following the logical positivist line that logic and mathematics are alike tautologous. In the case of mathematics this can be seriously questioned. Also most theists would say that prime numbers are too abstract to be compared to God, though perhaps not John Leslie who has argued that God is a principle that brings value into existence (Leslie 1979 and 1989). We are still left with Findlay's challenge as to what a conception of God as a necessary being could be.

One thing that will not differentiate the theist from the atheist is to say that God, if he exists, is necessary in the sense of not being dependent on anything else for his existence. The atheist will say that the universe fits this bill because the universe contains everything that there is and so is not caused by anything else. It is indeed hard to see what an adequate conception of God and his necessary existence could be. For the purposes of this article, let us explore what the relations and lack of relations between atheism and agnosticism could be. Here we shall neglect the requirement of necessary existence and in a later section we shall consider the case of a posteriori arguments for the existence of a mind-like creator of the universe. Of course without the requirement of necessity it raises the intelligent child's question ‘Who made God?’ Still, this might be regarded as inevitable but excusable in an a posteriori argument in which the hypothesis of a purposive creator is put forward and claimed to be justified much in the manner of any scientific hypothesis.

3. Agnosticism

Though there are a couple of references in The Oxford English Dictionary to earlier occurrences of the word ‘agnostic’, it seems (perhaps independently) to have been introduced by T. H. Huxley at a party in London to found the Metaphysical Society, which flourished for over a decade and to which belonged notable thinkers and leaders of opinion. Huxley thought that as many of these people liked to describe themselves as adherents of various ‘isms’ he would invent one for himself. He took it from a description in Acts 17:23 of an altar inscribed ‘to an unknown God’. Huxley thought that we would never be able to know about the ultimate origin and causes of the universe. Thus he seems to have been more like a Kantian believer in unknowable noumena than like a Vienna Circle proponent of the view that talk of God is not even meaningful. Perhaps such a logical positivist should be classified as neither a theist nor an atheist, but her view would be just as objectionable to a theist. ‘Agnostic’ is more contextual than is ‘atheist’, as it can be used in a non-theological way, as when a cosmologist might say that she is agnostic about string theory, neither believing nor disbelieving it. In this article I confine myself to the use of ‘agnostic’ in a theological context.

Huxley's agnosticism seems nevertheless to go with an extreme empiricism, nearer to Mill's methods of induction than to recent discussions of the hypothetico-deductive and partly holistic aspect of testing of theories. Though we might not be able to prove the existence of God might we be able to disprove it? Many philosophers hold that the existence of an omnipotent, omniscient and good God is empirically refuted by the existence of evil and suffering, and so would be happy to be called atheists rather than agnostics.Of course the existence of a non-benevolent creator God would not be so refutable and atheism would have to depend on arguments other than that of the mere existence of evil. More commonly the theist will continue to include benevolence in the concept of God and attempt to deal with the problem of evil with the help of various auxiliary or even ad hoc hypotheses or considerations, much as a scientist may attempt, often successfully, to shore up against empirical refutation a previously well tested theory. Bayesian considerations may determine rationally, though roughly, the appropriate degree of belief or unbelief.

4. The Ethics of Belief

It is therefore useful, at this point of the discussion, to consider some contentions brought forward by the mathematician W. K. Clifford in his well known paper ‘The Ethics of Belief’ first published in 1877 (Clifford 1999). It might be said that beliefs are not actions and so are not subject to our will, but Clifford gave good examples of how we can induce expedient or comforting beliefs in ourselves. Of course we might also think of the argument of Pascal's wager where he advises the doubter in the Christian religion to frequent the company of priests and other committed Catholics, to avoid reading sceptical books, and to use holy water and other psychological expedients, so as to induce in himself belief in the Catholic faith. Clifford gives some telling examples of how we can induce in ourselves beliefs which run counter to the evidence before us. One is of a ship owner who makes a fortune by transporting emigrants in old and unseaworthy ships. He toys with the idea that he should not allow one such ship to sail, and instead to have it overhauled and refitted. He talks himself into allowing the ship to sail. He reflects that up to the present the ship has survived bad storms. If religious he may turn to Providence. Spurred on by greed and self-interest he induces in himself the comfortable conviction that all will be well, but in fact the ship and all aboard are lost. We can agree that the ship owner's action in inducing the optimistic belief was morally highly reprehensible. Clifford makes the further remark that even if by good luck the ship did reach port we should still regard his optimistic belief as morally reprehensible. In fact, Clifford urges, it is always reprehensible to believe on insufficient grounds.

Clifford was not a philosophical sceptic about induction . He was an empiricist who assumed the uniformity of nature, belief in which was justified by the success of science and so, as he thought, not contrary to his own prohibition. Philosophers may think this too quick. However he rightly was not inclined to say, as a naïve follower of K. R. Popper might, that scientific theories can only be refuted, never established. It would surely be absurd to say that we now know no more than Galileo did. Alan Musgrave has astutely remarked that even if we agree that the fact that a theory has so far survived severe tests does not provide a reason for the hypothesis, nevertheless it does provide a reason for believing the hypothesis (Musgrave 1974). Philosophers of science now put more stress on the hypothetico-deductive method, in the partially holistic nature of theories, and the way in which justification of theories depends on the coherence of our beliefs. Science can even improve its own methodology, so that the nature of science is well captured by Neurath's simile of scientists as like sailors on a boat which they build and repair while still at sea. Clifford's contention about the reprehensibility of believing without or against the evidence still stands. Thus there are people who believe the Old Testament literally and with whom it is impossible to talk about biological evolution or modern cosmology. They often say explicitly that they will read and believe only what they find it comforting to read and believe.

To give a correct and fully general account of the nature of justified belief is difficult and inevitably controversial. Furthermore, though the notion of knowledge as justified true belief runs up against ingenious counterexamples proposed by Edmund Gettier (Gettier 1963) , nevertheless for the present purpose of distinguishing atheism from agnosticism it is good enough to treat knowledge as at least justified true belief. Clifford was of course concerned with the ethics of belief, not of knowledge, and indeed the latter does not make much sense, since ‘know’ is a success word. Later we shall look at the question of whether we should say that an atheist is someone who claims to know that there is no God or someone who at any rate believes this.

Clifford goes on to say that even if the ship in his example had by good fortune not foundered in the storms and high seas, or perhaps by good fortune encountered only calm seas and pleasant winds, the ship owner's cultivation of his unreasonable and dishonest belief would still have been dishonourable and reprehensible. Here he speaks like a virtue ethicist but the view can be consequentialist, since Clifford stresses that although some may derive comfort from their credulity, this credulity would tend to spread or be reinforced and so would in general have unfortunate consequences. Of course that there is no evidence for God's existence is not necessarily evidence for God's nonexistence, though it might be if we had reason for thinking that if God existed there would be evidence for this. However this may be, Clifford was adamant in describing the consequential evils of believing without evidence. Indeed he cast his net widely when he said that it is not only the leaders of men who have the duty of proportioning belief to evidence. ‘Every rustic’, he says, ‘who delivers in the village alehouse his slow, infrequent sentences, may help to kill or keep alive the fatal superstitions which clog his race’.

It is undeniable that many, perhaps most, theists do not even attempt to reconcile their belief in God or in the tenets of a particular religion with philosophical arguments or with plausibility in the light of total science. On the other hand many scientists, especially some physicists and cosmologists, and some philosophers, do claim to believe in God because of evidence, namely, because of the fact that there are simple laws of nature and even more so on the apparent so-called ‘fine tuning’ of the fundamental physical constants which will be discussed shortly. Perhaps, however, most theists believe in God simply because their parents and teachers have told them that he exists. And perhaps the parents and teachers believe in God because of what their parents and teachers told them. Must we always refuse to believe because of authority? Obviously not. Science is an interactive social phenomenon and depends heavily on testimony, as indeed does our commonsense and historical knowledge. We can think of the scientific community as a vast interconnected brain. Bits of scientific testimony can be checked and experiments repeated. Clifford gives the example of a chemical fact for which, being no chemist himself, he relies on the testimony of a chemist. He knows nothing against the chemist's character and he knows the professional training of the chemist. Though he has never himself verified the chemical proposition or even seen an experiment which verified it, nevertheless , Clifford says, the proposition is never beyond the reach of experimental checking. Also the experiment may have been actually performed by his informant, though the informant may just have relied on other well credentialled chemists.

It could be contended that Clifford was too verificationist here. Beliefs can be very conjectural but arguably plausible in the light of our more directly tested scientific hypotheses. There is perhaps a grey area between well tested or testable science and purely transcendent theology and metaphysics. Let us turn to consider an already mentioned example of this.

5. The Grey Area: Example of the So-called Fine Tuning of the Fundamental Constants of Nature

The fundamental physical and cosmological constants seem to be finely tuned (in a sense that does not immediately imply the existence of a fine tuner) so that if they were even quite slightly different in relation to one another a universe such as ours with galaxies, stars, planets, life and minds could not have existed. Not only is the range of suitable variation very small in the case of individual pairs of constants, but this is so for many such pairs, and so the a priori probability of a universe like ours is (to speak loosely) almost infinitesimal. Some philosophers, theologians, and (in their less professional moments) physicists and cosmologists have seen this fact of the very small prior probability of a universe like ours as indicating a use of scientific method as a route to theism. (See some of the articles, pro and con in Manson 2003.) The probability of the fine tuning is raised by the hypothesis of a creator God arranging the constants so as to permit the evolution of life and consciousness in which it is assumed that God has an interest.

Suppose that we judge hypothesis h to provide the best explanation (supposing it true) of empirical or already accepted facts e . If so we think it rational to believe h or at least to take it very seriously. In mainstream science if an hypothesis is accepted as the best explanation (where ‘best’ can include various virtues such as simplicity and comprehensiveness as well as a certain empirical adequacy) there is a good hope that in the future fresh independent tests of the hypothesis may be possible so that the hypothesis may become part of mainstream science. The fine tuning argument for theism seems to be one that must be left as without prospect of becoming part of mainstream science. Nevertheless it is not clear that a philosopher or theologian who supported her belief in theism by such an argument to the best explanation would be ipso facto reprehensible or dishonourable in the way that Clifford thought. She does think that she is arguing from evidence, namely the fine tuning. A follower of Clifford might object if there was no philosophical discussion of rival explanations or of the application here of Bayes' theorem in the theory of probability. But as with most philosophical disputes the issues are complex and there may be trading off of rival plausibilities and implausibilities.

This is no place to try adequately to discuss the fine tuning argument but let us consider two questions. One is about the type of argument that is put forward. The other is the issue of partial belief. The fine tuning argument has the merit of having the form of a perfectly normal pattern of scientific argument. Thus to some extent it may appeal to those who think of plausibility in the light of total science as a main pointer to metaphysical truth. After all, it will be contended, scientific method is the only reliable and indubitably successful and self-correcting method of attaining knowledge (pure mathematics perhaps excepted). In the fine tuning argument God is postulated to explain the fine tuning. It is asked how else a universe like ours (suitable for life and consciousness) could have arisen. Various objections could be made. The Bayesian argument is from the very easily proved equation which says that if h is a hypothesis, e the evidence, and k the relevant background information, then the probability of h given e & k is equal to the probability of e given h & k divided by the probability of e given k. The ‘e given k’ in the denominator reflects the fact that antecedently surprising evidence is best, as is the case with the fine tuning argument, and the ‘given h & k’ in the numerator reflects the fact that the antecedent probability of e given the hypothesis and the background assumptions should be high or near one, as is usually the case in argument to the best explanation. Should such an argument make us espouse theism? Not necessarily, because h, the theistic hypothesis might be so initially implausible that though e, the fine tuning, increases the probability of h, it increases it to only a small value.

In assessing the plausibilities it is worth recalling that the fine tuning appeals to God's purposes, should he exist, and to his supposed interest in minds and particularly in consciousness. This might strike some of us as anthropocentric, or in view of the probability of life and consciousness elsewhere in the universe, perhaps psychocentric. Of course science has got less and less anthropocentric and perhaps psychocentricity might have lost its attractions also. In prescientific ages we appealed to the purposes of ancestors or gods, and small children seem naturally to be satisfied with explanations in terms of purpose. Similarly a saddle between hills has been said to be a tribal ancestor's fish weir, though perhaps this is not believed too literally. Yet a neuroscientific account of a particular purpose must be extraordinarily complex involving of millions or tens of millions of neurons and their multiple interconnections. Appeal to God's purposes might well conceal even more complexity. Thus the contemporary form of the teleological argument, from the fine tuning, though unaffected by the Darwinian theory as Paley's was, makes a departure from scientific methodology. Perhaps Plato's Socrates in the Phaedo may have to some extent set science off on the wrong track when he extolled purposive explanations at the expense of physical ones. Still the fine tuning argument with its argument to the best explanation and with its holism is in some ways closer to scientific method than the very restrictive though salutary empiricism of Mill and Huxley and probably Clifford.

In the light of these considerations let us consider the appropriateness or otherwise of someone (call him ‘Philo’) describing himself as a theist, atheist or agnostic. I would suggest that if Philo estimates the various plausibilities to be such that on the evidence before him the probability of theism comes out near to one he should describe himself as a theist and if it comes out near zero he should call himself an atheist, and if it comes out somewhere in the middle he should call himself an agnostic. There are no strict rules about this classification because the borderlines are vague. If need be, like a middle-aged man who is not sure whether to call himself bald or not bald, he should explain himself more fully. This of course assumes that, unlike Huxley, he does not wish to use ‘ism’ words at all. Gilbert Ryle once wrote an article against, though not absolutely against, ‘ism’ words (Ryle 1935), but here he was mainly objecting to schools of philosophy as were common in Germany, so that people would attach themselves too blindly to some great figure in the past, or to some influential contemporary professor. Sometimes , at least in social contexts, it can be misleading not to say ‘yes’ or ‘no’ if some believer asks ‘Are you an atheist?’ Forthrightness can override a too precious concern for complete accuracy.

Here it has been assumed that Philo regards ‘God exists’ (vagueness apart) as an intelligible sentence to which truth or falsity can be ascribed. If he thinks that the conception of deity is so obscure or so permissive that no truth value can be ascribed to ‘God exists’, perhaps he should extend the notion of ‘atheist’ to cover his position also. ‘Agnostic’ might suggest that there is something to be agnostic about.

In the above discussion I have used the argument from the fine tuning as an example of something in the grey area between science and metaphysics. There may be other plausible arguments for theism that Philo could consider, and together with further applications of the Bayesian formula the plausibility might be increased in every case. Nevertheless it still might be quite small even in toto. I am assuming that all the arguments are from plausibility considerations and so can reinforce one another. Of course if the arguments fail because of faults in pure logic, then they do not reinforce one another. The conjunction of several logically bad arguments is indeed no better than one logically bad argument.

Even if various philosophers or theologians use the word ‘God’ in different ways and are such that their words are quite unintelligible then they can hardly be said to defend theism. As I have suggested, a logical positivist such as the young A. J. Ayer (Ayer 1936) would have at least been less misleading if he called himself an atheist rather than an agnostic. He neither believes nor disbelieves in God, like the agnostic, but he does not think, as I take it that someone who called himself an agnostic would, that God either exists or does not exist but he does not know which.

6. Philosophical vs. Pragmatic Reasons for Preferring the Term ‘Agnostic’

As was hinted earlier, a person may call herself an agnostic, as Huxley did, because of questionable philosophical motives. Huxley thought that propositions about the transcendent, though possibly meaningful, were empirically untestable. We have seen that it is unclear that the conclusion of the fine tuning argument is untestable. One can at least compare it with other and non-theistic hypotheses. Thus there are conjectures that there are many universes, so many of them that is not surprising that there should be some among them in which the constants of physics allow for the possibility of life, and if so our universe must be one of them. Some cosmologists give independent grounds for thinking that new universes are spawned out of the back of black holes. Others think that there are independent grounds for thinking of a single huge Universe that has crystallised out into various universe sized regions each with randomly different values for the fundamental constants. Some such speculations get some support (it has been suggested) from string theory. Though such speculations are at present untestable and should be taken with a grain of salt, one or another may well one day be absorbed into a testable theory. It must be left to cosmologists and mathematical physicists to go into the pros and cons here, but they are mentioned here to indicate a grey area between the testable and the untestable.

Some scientists when canvassing these issues of philosophical theology may prefer to call themselves ‘agnostics’ rather than ‘atheists’ because they have been over impressed by a generalised philosophical scepticism or by a too simple understanding of Popper's dictum that we can never verify a theory but only refute it. Such a view would preclude us from saying quite reasonably that we know that the Sun consists largely of hydrogen and helium. When we say ‘I know’ we are saying something defeasible. If later we discover that though what we said was at the time justified, it nevertheless turned out to be false, we would say ‘I thought I knew but I now see that I didn't know’. Never or hardly ever to say ‘I know’ would be to deprive these words of their usefulness, just as the fact that some promises have to be broken does not deprive the institution of promising of its legitimacy.

Another motive whereby an atheist might describe herself as an agnostic is purely pragmatic. In discussion with a committed theist this might occur out of mere politeness or in some circumstances from fear of giving even more offence. Samuel Butler, though a complete unbeliever in the doctrines of Christianity, in the preface to one of his books Erewhon Revisited (Butler 1932) described himself as the broadest of broad churchmen. That is, I take it that broad churchmen often were unbelievers, but treated the doctrine as mere myth suitable for literal consumption by the local yokels in the interests of social stability. It is unclear to me whether or not Butler was sympathetic to a very abstract sort of theism. Some may call themselves ‘agnostics’ rather than ‘atheists’ merely because they are equally repelled by the fanaticism associated with some forms of theism and by the boring obsessiveness of what Hilary Putnam has called ‘the village atheist’. (Contrast, however, Clifford's view of the matter and also the example of the radical and intellectual tinker, Mr. Shaw, in Butler's powerful novel The Way of All Flesh.) Still, these considerations are perhaps more a matter for sociologists than for philosophers.

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