As feminist scholars and activists turned their attention to the rapidly expanding field of bioethics, feminist bioethics began to emerge as a new area of academic interest. Utilizing the resources of feminist philosophy, social theory, and related fields, feminists critiqued and extended the prevailing bioethical framework. This article considers feminist criticism of mainstream bioethics and then chronicles the evolution and growth of feminist bioethics, considering: the areas of scholarship and activism that have informed it, its emergence as a distinctive academic sub-field, major focal issues, and contributions to the advancement of bioethics and feminism, both within and beyond the academy.
- 1. Origins of Feminist Bioethics
- 2. The Development of Feminist Bioethics
- 3. The Expanding Landscape
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
Bioethics and second wave feminism both gathered momentum in the 1960s, a pivotal era for social ferment. The bioethics movement was triggered by protest against such gross abuses of medical authority as the Nazi doctors' experiments on unconsenting concentration camp inmates and the Tuskegee Syphilis Study, a forty year “experiment” on poor black men who were misled into believing they were receiving therapy. Over succeeding decades bioethics has grown into a highly professionalized interdisciplinary field that borrows from a cluster of interrelated areas of scholarship including philosophy, law, medicine and the social and biological sciences. It has generated a massive literature ranging over a broad array of moral problems that arise within biomedical research, the health care professions, and the institutions that deliver health care services. Its reach extends to philosophical and legal issues from the beginning to the end of human life, to areas of biology and genetics on which medicine draws, and to research that seeks to expand the knowledge base of medicine. Bioethicists have gained considerable prestige among health care professionals, other academics, related industries, and the general public. Some now serve on public policy panels and medical school faculties and others have been engaged as consultants to industry. Frequent conferences introduce newcomers to the field and disseminate recent scholarship. Many professional medical and allied health organizations now require bioethics training for certification, and federal regulations in the U.S. and other countries now require medical schools to include research ethics in their curricula. A few bioethicists have become media celebrities.
As the field of bioethics has professionalized, questions have arisen about its direction and focus. Despite its early attention to exploited groups, some critics discern an increasingly cautious bent that slights the concerns of marginalized groups. They argue that with institutionalization, many bioethicists may be losing sight of the field's historical origins (Purdy 2001; Holmes 1999; Murray 2002; Eckenwiler and Cohn 2007). Problems that were at the forefront of bioethics in its formative years in the U.S. during the 1960s and ‘70s--particularly the healthcare needs of marginalized groups, children, the elderly, and the poor—have been relegated to the margins. Critics perceive a tendency to frame issues and formulate theory from the vantage point of privileged groups, giving too little attention to gender specific disparities in health care research and therapy and the effects of racial and class differences on quality of care. This tendency extends to developing regions of the globe as their local bioethicists seek a share in the prestige of high technology medicine (Salles and Bertomeu 2002; Luna 2006).
Feminist-friendly bioethicists who turn their attention to theory note systemic weaknesses in the explanatory framework that grounds analysis of research and clinical practices (e.g. J. Nelson 2003). Critics fault both the abstract character of much bioethical theory and inattention to such key components of morality as the contexts that frame health care and the relational networks that inform patient decision making (Sherwin, 1992, 1998). The tendency to ground theory in a set of abstract principles that are only subsequently applied to practical problems makes it easy to ignore such particulars as the unequal burden borne by women by virtue of their reproductive and nurturing roles and inequities among social and economic groups. Some feminist theorists are developing an alternative methodology to remedy the shortcomings of the dominant bioethical model of reasoning. Several strategies are employed including one that starts from specific contextual problems and then works toward increasing generalization.
These analyses have evolved out of recent work in feminist moral theory, increased interest in feminist bioethics, and the influence of the women's health movement. In the early years of second wave feminism, activist feminists directed attention to areas of health care where women's interests were most severely neglected: access to birth control and abortion, pregnancy, and representations of female sexuality. Their work kindled feminist scholarship that utilizes sex, gender, and other marginalizing characteristics as categories of analysis that are bound up with power relations across public and private life. This research called attention to the need for theoretical grounding to provide a framework for practical strategies to curtail oppressive practices.
By the early 1990s feminist bioethics had come to be recognized as a distinctive academic concentration offering a sustained critique of mainstream bioethics. The range of feminist bioethics now extends to pedagogy, the selection of topics addressed in major bioethics publications, and the explanatory grounding of clinical and research practices. Feminists working in bioethics speak in many different voices reflecting disparate social positioning and academic background. Nonetheless, they share significant commonalities, both in their criticisms of dominant structures and in their efforts to build a more adequate framework that is responsive to the many circumstances of women and other groups whose health care needs are inadequately met. They call attention to neglected voices that are seldom represented within mainstream bioethics discourse. An important theme in feminist discourse is hierarchical rankings that parcel people into groups based on categories such as sex, race, ethnicity, age, disability, and susceptibility to genetic disease. They have uncovered applications of these categories that perpetuate unjust practices. Some integrate cross-disciplinary analysis of structural and social frameworks that divide and marginalize people with insights from the women's health movement. Some concentrate their analysis on a specific axis of oppressive practice, but all recognize interrelationships among such practices. I now turn to more detailed discussion of the derivation and development of feminist bioethics.
Women have a long history of interest in healthcare issues predating the comparatively recent resurgence of feminism. Historians have traced this interest back to female practitioners of midwifery and nursing prior to their capture by the medical profession. Concern about sexist biases in medical research and practice was rekindled by the protest movements of the 1960s and increasing medicalization and commodification of women's bodily functions. Public notice of the widespread under-representation of women in clinical trials increased that momentum. Feminists campaigned for increased breast cancer research, more convenient and cheaper contraceptive methods, research into the physiology of menopause, and avoidance of unnecessary surgical interventions (e.g. hysterectomies, cesarean sections, radical mastectomies) where less radical alternatives are available. These campaigns were supported by several advocacy groups both within the U.S. and abroad including the Boston Women's Health Book Collective, the National Women's Health Network, the National Black Women's Health Initiative, and the Women's Health Action Trust in New Zealand. These groups struggled to raise public awareness of women's health issues, influence federal health policy, and act as a counter force to organized medicine and the pharmaceutical industry. Finally, in response to almost two decades of struggle, the U.S. National Institutes of Health (NIH) acknowledged the longstanding under-representation of women in clinical trials, the consequent dearth of research on diseases prevalent among women, and sex specific drug effects. Then in 1990 NIH established an Office of Research on Women's Health and launched the Women's Health Initiative to redress gender inequities in medical research (Mastroianni, Faden, and Federman 1994).
Since the early 1970s feminist scholars have been complementing the agendas of activists. Some straddle both scholarly and activist communities. They have documented the erosion of abortion access following the 1973 Roe v. Wade Supreme Court decision and critiqued childbirth practices that sacrifice the interests of the birthing woman to the convenience of her obstetrician and the allegedly independent "right" of her fetus. However, not all scholars who identify themselves as feminist look favorably on the Roe decision. Some think it didn't go far enough to protect women's decision-making authority; others think it went too far. Most feminists, both theorists and bioethicists, have come to favor a perspective that is more nuanced than either Roe or the popular slogans, “pro-life” and “pro-choice.” Susan Sherwin critiques the individualistic bias of this dichotomy (2008) and Catriona Mackenzie (1992, 1996) points to the complexities of pregnant women's experiences that are overlooked in such simplistic reductions. By the 1980s, feminist bioethics scholarship was being widely circulated in feminist publications (e.g., Holmes, Hoskins, and Gross 1980, 1981; Corea 1985).
Feminist commentary on innovative reproductive interventions was burgeoning (e.g. Arditti, Klein and Minden 1984; Corea 1985; Stanworth 1987). Bioethics courses were proliferating and increasing the market for bioethics texts, but marginalization of feminist perspectives persisted in both course texts and bioethics journals. Essays by feminists in the leading texts were limited primarily to treatment of reproductive issues such as abortion, maternal-fetal relations, and reproductive technologies. Less attention was given to interconnections among these issues and more pervasive bioethical concerns such as the limits of physician authority, conflicts between commercial interests and patient well being, and the conflation of moral and medical values. To bring attention to disregard of feminist perspectives relating to the latter issues, Susan Wolf undertook a project at The Hastings Center which led to the anthology: Feminism and Bioethics: Beyond Reproduction (1996). This collection incorporates feminist perspectives on many issues that had seldom been discussed in standard course texts including the under-representation of women subjects in medical research, the pervasive influence of the abstract individualistic conception of personal autonomy, and stigmatizing portrayals of HIV positive women. Through such efforts, feminist writings on an increasing diversity of topics began to appear in bioethics journals and anthologies. Feminist critiques of bioethical theory also gained some currency though they tended to be classified among "alternative" approaches (along with communitarianism, casuistry, and the ethics of care). The health care priorities of women and other underserved groups still received disproportionally little attention.
In 1993 the International Network on Feminist Approaches to Bioethics (FAB) was founded to provide a congenial home for feminists working in marginalized areas of bioethics, to encourage international cross-fertilization, and to influence the agenda of mainstream bioethics. FAB aims to foster development of a more inclusive theory of bioethics at both the academic and grassroots levels. Three goals have been central: extension of bioethical theory to integrate concerns about race, class, ethnicity and gender; reexamination of the principles of bioethics; and creation of new strategies and methodologies that include the standpoints of those who are socially marginalized. The articulation of these objectives represents an effort to systematize prevailing commonalities among feminists working in the field and stimulate further collaborative work. FAB's central focus includes adaptation of the theoretical grounding of bioethics to more fully reflect key components of moral life that structure physician/patient and researcher/subject relationships, power differences that mark these relationships, and cross-cultural perspectives on bioethical issues that reflect intersections between specific technologies and the social, political and economic structures within which they are embedded.
The founding of FAB coincided with the appearance of a critical mass of feminist bioethics scholarship. In 1992 a collection of articles previously published in the journal Hypatia was brought out as Feminist Perspectives in Medical Ethics (Holmes and Purdy, 1992). Susan Sherwin published No Longer Patient: Feminist Ethics and Health Care, the first book-length treatment of feminist bioethical theory (1992). In this work, Sherwin expands feminist bioethics in new directions that circumvent the prevalent theoretical approaches of the dominant bioethics framework and demonstrate its shortcomings. A major thread throughout her book is the ethical imperative that bioethicists recognize oppressive social practices and devise strategies to remedy them. At that time too Susan Bordo (1993) and Mary Mahowald (1993) published volumes critiquing medical and cultural attitudes toward women's bodies. Susan Wendell's The Rejected Body (1996) pressed this theme further integrating into discussions of bodily life the experiences of disabled people. She argues that cultural attitudes toward the body contribute to the stigma of disability and resistance to accepting the inevitable weaknesses of all our bodies, a theme carried forward more recently by care theorists.
Soon bioethics think tanks and journals began to recognize feminist approaches. Several journals featured special issues by feminist scholars spanning a cluster of topics including AIDS, reconfiguration of the principle of autonomy, gender issues in psychiatry, and global dimensions of feminist bioethics. As the diversity of reproductive innovations multiplied, feminists continued to monitor their social impact (Overall 1993; Holmes 1994; Callahan 1993, 1995; Murphy 1995; Purdy 1996). Bioethics conferences in a number of countries began to schedule sessions that explicitly addressed feminist bioethics and more feminists were included on the general program. In 1994 bioethicists in China held the first of a series of conferences featuring feminist approaches.
However, concerns persisted that feminists were under-represented on governmental panels formulating public policy. As an initial step in redressing this omission, a group of Canadian feminist scholars and practitioners were awarded governmental funding for a public policy project on women's health issues. They subsequently published a collection of essays that spelled out obstacles to reform of the medical model. They stressed two major impediments: disregard of patients' social condition in their medical interventions and concentration of health-promoting interventions solely on individuals (Sherwin et al 1998). In a subsequent article two participants in the original group underscore the strategic importance of feminist involvement at the policy-making level to redress injustices and promote more equitable policy choices (Sherwin and Baylis 2003). Other feminists have joined the call to revamp public policy to redress biases against women in medical research and practice. Wendy Rogers argues that evidence-based medicine and the research that underpins it ignore the social impact of gender and seek medical solutions for problems that are social and political in their genesis (2004).
The work of these bioethicists overlaps and is complemented by other recent feminist contributions to the bioethical literature. This work ranges over a broad array of issues including sex selection techniques, genetic ties to children, disabilities, genetic testing and screening, abortion, discrimination in health insurance and employment, stem cell research, and human cloning (e.g. Rothman 1998, 2001; Rapp 1999, Mahowald 2000; Davis 2001; Parker and Ankeny 2002; Tremain 2006). Assessment of the social and ethical implications of reproductive innovations persists, growing ever more complex as techniques to test and manipulate embryos in the laboratory proliferate (e.g. Gupta 2000; Shanley 2001; Kukla 2005; Mullin 2005; Harwood, 2007 and the issue of Bioethics on reproductive autonomy edited by Carolyn McLeod 2009). Two immediate concerns are paramount: the burdens genetic interventions impose on women to utilize prenatal techniques to produce only “perfect” children (Rothschild 2005) and the increased stigma imposed on future children who happen to be born with disabilities. Authors voice concern that development of genetic enhancement techniques will magnify these tendencies and pose even greater threats to social equality. In response to the rapid pace of genetic research some stress the need for careful and impartial information assessing benefits and risks to all affected parties--pregnant women, their future children, and society. Many of these issues overlap other worries such as the impact of caregiving responsibilities on the caregiver and the effect of economic policies on marginalized groups (such as blacks with sickle cell disease). Feminists have offered novel proposals to minimize the threat of intensified inequalities such as including within policy-making bodies representatives of affected groups, e.g. people living with disabilities and breast cancer survivors.
As the preceding discussion illustrates, feminists have participated in scholarly discussion of virtually all the major topics in bioethics. Their contributions are distinctive insofar as their treatment of these topics is grounded in feminist scholarship that draws on background norms and conditions that shape available health options. Their criticisms often question the adequacy of bioethical theory that emphasizes universal moral principles that are framed abstractly and individualistically. Though some feminists object to all attempts to formulate universal principles, most feminist criticisms are more circumscribed, directed principally to theoretical frameworks that presuppose a generic individual subject and that privilege the perspective of an elite, mostly male group. Feminist critics point out that this theoretical orientation tends to justify the prevailing status quo, thereby inhibiting consideration of social change. They also criticize the tendency of these frameworks to interpret harms suffered by oppressed groups as harms solely to individuals who have been stripped of all particularity. Susan Wolf notes that even when groups have been maltreated egregiously (e.g. impoverished black men in the Tuskegee syphilis study or Nazi concentration camp inmates) little notice has been paid to the particular social and economic conditions that controlled their lives (1996).
Search for a more satisfactory moral grounding for bioethics has led feminist scholars in several directions. A few favor dispensing with principles entirely and reconstituting bioethics through narrative case-specific interpretation along the lines pioneered by followers of Nel Noddings (1984). Some remain convinced that narrative approaches have useful applications in bioethics though they should not be the only tool in the methodological toolbox (e.g. Nelson 2001). Others have criticized the abstract universal approach to theory construction from the perspective of European theory (e.g. Mary Rawlinson (2001). Noting masculine markings of the allegedly generic human subject, they decry the failure of purported universalists to recognize women's disparate condition, a blunder that belies their claims to universality. Another group of feminists has ventured into post-structuralist and post-modern theory to discredit other claims of universality and build a more particularist feminist framework (Shildrick 1997; Shildrick and Mykitiuk, 2005). However, many feminists think a framework that incorporates universal principles should constitute one dimension of an adequate bioethical theory provided that these principles are formulated in non-exclusionary terms that reflect the relational context of individual lives.
Springing from the work of Carol Gilligan (1982) and the proliferation of scholarship stimulated by her insights, care theorists have emphasized patterns of reasoning allegedly characteristic of women--caring, relationships, and responsibilities--and contrasted them with modes of reasoning that privilege justice and rights which Gilligan and her followers have taken to be more characteristic of men. Care theorists distrust traditional moral principles and press for an ethic that stresses alternative values such as love, care, and responsibility. They emphasize the suitability of such values for capturing contextual subtleties and relational bonds that are overlooked within principle-oriented frameworks.
Others have voiced doubts about the adaptability of a care ethic to some of the concerns of feminist bioethics. The first anthology to address this controversy, Women and Moral Theory, juxtaposes some of the leading care theorists with critics who question the significance of a gender-differentiated morality and its relevance to political and legal issues (Kittay and Meyers 1987). Critics acknowledge that gendered social structures must be taken into account, but they take exception to the distinction between masculine and feminist “voices” imbedded in Gilligan's orientation. In her 1992 work, No Longer Patient: Feminist Ethics and Health Care, Susan Sherwin extends the critique of care ethics. Not only have its advocates too readily accommodated a tradition that views women's character as distinctively different from men's, but the care orientation lacks an overt political perspective toward patterns of domination and oppression that affect women. She integrates these reservations into a comprehensive critique of medicine and bioethics. Numerous other feminists have expressed reservations that overlap Sherwin's concerns. In “Feeding Egos and Tending Wounds” Sandra Bartky stresses the heavy price women pay for caregiving labors that reinforce their subordination (1990) and Hilde Lindemann Nelson (1992), Helga Kuhse (1995), and Carol Gould (1998) voice further objections to an ethic that focuses predominantly on gender difference.
In a 1996 article titled “Rehabilitating Care” Alisa Carse and Hilde Lindemann Nelson respond to leading criticisms of care ethics and argue that there are resources within the ethic of care for addressing each of the major problems noted by critics and developing the ethic more fully. Such reformulation has continued in recent years as feminists who support some dimensions of care theory integrate these features into a more comprehensive moral framework that gives serious attention to issues of justice. Noddings, herself a leading care theorist, has published a subsequent work that extends care theory to social policy issues (2002). Other major care theorists including Sara Ruddick (1989), Eva Kittay (1999, 2003), and Virginia Held (1993, 1995, 2006) have also had a notable influence on feminist bioethics. Their perspectives exemplify the tendency to extend care ethics beyond interpersonal problems to social and political issues that require more generalized treatment. Kittay and others call attention to universal dimensions of dependency. They focus on injustices to providers of care to the sick, young children, the elderly, and the disabled whose work is often unrecognized and undercompensated. They point out the disproportionate prestige afforded to high-tech medicine and the low status attached to more mundane work that provides necessary care to the sick and infirm. Though caring values count heavily in providing high caliber healthcare, the caring tasks of medicine are often demeaned as “housekeeping issues” that garner little interest and even less remuneration while “crisis issues” dominate attention and reward their practitioners handsomely (Warren 1992).
Recent work has sought to bring increased attention to this situation, particularly insofar as it affects those who require extended care. Both Jennifer Parks' No Place Like Home: Feminist Ethics and Home Health Care (2003) and Rosalind Ladd's anthology, Ethical Issues in Home Health Care (2002) address an issue with exceptional import to the welfare of the aging and home-bound. They bring to their task much recent feminist work on justice and care. Several others have joined the growing company of feminist disability scholars many of whom adapt features of care ethics conjoined with issues of justice to a range of themes intersecting disability (e.g., Silvers, Wasserman and Mahowald 1998; Parens and Asch 2000; Wong 2002, Tremain 2005, Scully 2008).
Related work branches off in a number of directions. The anthology Socializing Care builds on Joan Tronto's 1993 call for a political theory that integrates the practice of care into the qualities needed for democratic citizens to live well together in a pluralistic society (Hamington and Miller 2006). Authors in this anthology stress power imbalances embedded in recent tendencies to privatize care and the need for a public ethics of care. Others have applied care theory to nursing ethics (e.g. Kuhse 1997). Susan Dodds (2007) and Ruth Groenhout (2004) develop a version of feminist bioethics that combines a care perspective with virtue theory. Groenhout teases out structural similarities between the two orientations that support a more comprehensive feminist bioethics. Both Dodds and Groenhout emphasize the holistic nature of human persons, their particular social contexts, the centrality of emotional responses in ethical reasoning, and refusal to judge actions apart from lived narratives that confer meaning on them. Groenhout draws examples from several fields including uses of new reproductive technologies. She notes that adoption of care theory would require consideration of many factors beyond the desires of particular patients. These include costs and benefits to everyone affected by particular medical interventions, the impact of such services on other health care needs, and the tendency of technology to intensify the commodification of children and the bodily functions of the women who bear them.
Though the themes of care and justice continue to play a major role in feminist bioethical debate, feminist critics of prevailing healthcare institutions and practices have also tackled many other issues. One related stream of feminist theorizing stresses the need to build into bioethical theory a conception of autonomy that is more robust than that commonly favored in the bioethics literature. Several point out respects in which the standard conception fails to fit good medical practice. First, the traditional view of autonomy directs no attention to the contextual details of personal experience. Susan Sherwin's concerns are representative. She argues that “we need to move away from the familiar Western understanding of autonomy as self-defining, self-interested, and self-protecting, as if the self were simply some special kind of property to be preserved” (1998, 35). Susan Dodds emphasizes an interconnected concern: the tendency among some bioethicists and physicians to reduce autonomy to informed consent and restrict its exercise in medical practice to a patient's selection of choices from a restricted set of options (2000). That formulation of the principle ignores background conditions that patients bring to their medical experience, institutional power relationships that influence their options, and medical research priorities that shape them. Carolyn Ells expands on this critique. Adopting Michel Foucault's analysis of biopower she argues that informed choice must be understood in explicitly relational terms that construe power relations as diffused throughout society (2003). To these critiques which stress controlling influences such as physician authority, family hierarchies, and economic inequities, Ells adds a further factor. The standard conception of choice, she argues, relies on a false model of persons that situates them outside relations of power. In actuality, she argues, individual persons are inevitably enmeshed in power relationships. Once the influence of such misconceptions is recognized, the need for an understanding of autonomy that grapples with the complexities of power relations becomes obvious.
Other feminists have offered further proposals to reconfigure autonomy to give fuller consideration to patient agency. Virginia Warren suggests supplementing the standard conception with an ethics of empowerment so that, rather than relying on one's physician as the primary source of health care information, patients be given access to a broader network that includes the work of feminist activists (2001). Others favor overhauling the conception more extensively and tailoring other leading bioethical principles accordingly. They emphasize the importance of encouraging patient development of autonomy capacities to balance disparities in education and prestige that distort physician-patient communication. For autonomy should be viewed not solely as a proficiency possessed by all competent adults but also as an aspirational achievement that requires moral development, social cooperation, and supportive institutions. An adequate conception would make visible how social norms and pressures influence the choices offered to patients and emphasize the obligations of health care providers to actively support patient autonomy.
This perspective shares with care theory the conviction that human agents are not fundamentally single-minded, rational, self-interested choice-makers but social beings whose selfhood is constituted and maintained within overlapping relationships and communities. Recognizing the complexity of connection among individuals, their social milieu, their cultural matrix, and political position, some feminists are now calling for adoption of a relational model of autonomy that stresses the web of interconnected (and sometimes conflicting) relationships that affect individuality. Oppressive social environments, illness or trauma can easily impair autonomy. In her book, Aftermath: Violence and the Remaking of the Self, Susan Brison, drawing on her own rape experience, views the loss of connection experienced by trauma survivors as a serious threat to their autonomous selfhood (2001). Like trauma, serious illness endangers these interconnections and thwarts autonomous pursuits. The body one has trusted to pursue one's plans and projects is shown to be vulnerable, fragile, and unprotected (Donchin 2000).
This direction of inquiry has been extended by Carolyn McLeod (2002). She presents a conception of self-trust within a feminist theoretical framework, thereby adding a new dimension to projects that aim to reframe the dominant conception of personal autonomy to illumine its relational character. Drawing her illustrations principally from reproductive contexts including miscarriage, infertility treatment and prenatal diagnosis, she argues that encounters with health care providers can undermine a woman's self-trust, thereby threatening her autonomy. She urges providers to respect patient autonomy by attending to their power to influence patients' self-trust. Her analysis and case histories invite extension of her conceptual innovations to further health care contexts (e.g. Goering 2009).
Feminist bioethicists have also made significant contributions to the literature on global issues. Collaboration between feminists in more and less industrialized regions of the world has led to the publication of three anthologies based on papers from international FAB conferences (Donchin and Purdy 1999; Tong et al 2001, Tong, Donchin and Dodds 2004). A fourth is scheduled to appear in 2009 and another on postmodern approaches includes a selection of papers from the 2000 FAB conference (Shildrick and Mykitiuk 2005).
The initial 1999 volume calls attention to the traditional mind/body dualism, specifically its tendency to de-legitimate women's cognitive and emotional lives by focusing only on their symbolic links with the body. Included are political dimensions of this problem extending to formerly Socialist countries as they appropriate Western technological practices that view women's bodies as (often faulty) reproductive machines. Contributors to the second volume seek to transcend the usual dichotomies dividing the contemporary world into developed/developing economies and technological/nontechnological societies to address a broad array of concerns at the intersection of feminism and global issues. Several themes predominate. Some focus on the tendency of science to become a collective project of the international community. Others point to tensions between specific cultural practices and features of common humanity that override geographical, cultural, and racial differences, most conspicuously: childbirth, illness, disability, and death. Contributors also address human rights challenges confronting health policy-makers in the face of HIV/AIDS. Some caution that too exclusive a focus on global features of the human condition could obscure local operations of power relations that vary from locality to locality. The 2004 volume draws on and extends human rights discourse pertinent to health issues and amplifies debate about global ethics. It takes account of considerations infrequently addressed in the bioethics literature including the economic, social, and political effects of globalized capitalism and the need to negotiate tensions between cultural imperialism and cultural relativism, thereby extending analysis to the needs of marginalized people diversely situated within the global economy.
All of these volumes are the fruit of collaboration between feminist bioethicists in advanced industrialized countries and their colleagues in transitional areas of the world. They document the ways dominant Western technological practices are crossing geographical boundaries, influencing developing economies, and mimicking Western technological interventions, often diverting scarce resources from basic health care services that could lessen preventable morbidity and mortality. Of particular concern are moral consequences for the lives of those who lack the power to alter externally imposed conditions that control their lives.
To encourage more work in feminist bioethics and disseminate it more widely, FAB has now established its own journal: International Journal of Feminist Approaches to Bioethics (IJFAB). The initial issue appeared in Spring 2008. IJFAB carries forward and extends the themes developed in prior collections based on papers delivered at FAB conferences. The journal provides a new forum within bioethics for feminist thought and debate. IJFAB consider papers approaching any problem or topic in bioethics from the resources of feminist scholarship and encourages proposals for special thematic issues.
In recent years feminist activists have also turned increasing attention to health needs in developing regions and formation of international health policies. Several feminist advocacy groups including the Center for Reproductive Rights and the National Women's Health Network in the U.S. have extended their reach beyond the developed world to encourage recognition of universal health-related human rights. A FAB committee has contributed to revision of the Helsinki Declaration that specifies international standards for the ethical conduct of medical research. Many of the amendments to the Declaration approved in 2008 originated within that committee. Members of FAB have also participated in formulation of the UNESCO Declaration on Universal Norms on Bioethics (Rawlinson and Donchin 2005). Their work is complemented by non-governmental organizations in numerous developing countries. The work of public interest groups, such as the Council for Responsible Genetics which monitors the social impact of biotechnology, also overlap work in feminist bioethics.
Feminist bioethicists continue to bring new issues and fresh perspectives to bioethics. Some are expanding into interrelated fields such as public health ethics (Rogers 2006) and bioethics consultation (Nicholas 1999, Sherwin and Baylis 2003). They share feminism's common commitment to rectifying systemic injustices. They look toward a future when feminist theorizing has a more profound influence on bioethics, when the voices of the socially marginalized are fully recognized, and the needs of all social groups are incorporated into a comprehensive system of healthcare justice that is responsive to the diverse needs of humans across the globe. As work in feminist bioethics coalesces, several key objectives are becoming discernible.
- To open dialogue interjecting feminist concerns into the dominant discourses and practices that define the norms of medical research and health care.
- To devise new strategies for introducing feminist standpoints into policy-making processes.
- To catalyze movement toward feminist goals within both advanced industrialized and developing countries, empower people to identify indigenous problems, and extend justice and equality to marginalized people.
- To persuade powerful donor agencies to put their influence to work to rectify violations of human rights and minimize maternal death and morbidity in developing regions of the world.
In sum, the guiding vision of feminist bioethics is a nonhierarchical human community that optimizes the health and well-being of all.
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- Council for Responsible Genetics, a non-profit, non-governmental organization based in Cambridge, Massachusetts, which works through the media and concerned citizens to distribute accurate information and represent the public interest on emerging issues in biotechnology.
- The International Network on Feminist Approaches to Bioethics, non-profit organization which aims to develop a more inclusive theory of bioethics encompassing the standpoints and experiences of women and other marginalized social groups, to examine presuppositions embedded in the dominant bioethical discourse that privilege those already empowered, and to create new methodologies and strategies responsive to the disparate conditions of women's lives across the globe.
- ANIS: Institute of Bioethics, Human Rights and Gender, non-profit, non-governmental, Latin American organization devoted to bioethics research, advocacy and education.
- Women's Bioethics Project, an independent, non-profit, non-partisan, public-policy think tank devoted to research, analysis, education, and publication, headquartered in Seattle.