Kant's View of the Mind and Consciousness of Self
Even though Kant himself held that his view of the mind and consciousness were inessential to his main purpose, some of his ideas came to have an enormous influence on his successors. Ideas central to his view are now central to cognitive science. Other ideas equally central to his point of view had almost no influence on subsequent work, however. In this article, first we survey Kant's model as a whole and the claims that have been influential. Then we examine his claims about consciousness of self specifically. Many of his ideas about the consciousness of self and related issues have not been influential. Indeed, even though he achieved remarkable insights into consciousness of self, they next appeared only 200 years later, in the 1960s and 1970s.
- 1. A Sketch of Kant's View of the Mind
- 2. Kant's Critical Project and How the Mind Fits Into It
- 3. Kant's View of the mind
- 4. Consciousness of Self and Knowledge of Self
- 4.1 Thesis 1: Two Kinds of Consciousness of Self
- 4.2 Thesis 2: Representational Base of Consciousness of Self
- 4.3 Thesis 3: Conscious Only of How One Appears to Oneself
- 4.4 Thesis 4: Referential Machinery of Consciousness of Self
- 4.5 Thesis 5: No Manifold in Consciousness of Self
- 4.6 Thesis 6: Consciousness of Self is not Knowledge of Self
- 4.7 Thesis 7: Conscious of Self as Single, Common Subject of Experience
- 5. Knowledge of the Mind
- 6. Where Kant Has and Has Not Influenced Contemporary Cognitive Research
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
In this article, we will focus on Immanuel Kant's (1724–1804) work on the mind and consciousness of self and related issues.
Some commentators believe that Kant's views on the mind are dependent on his idealism (he called it transcendental idealism). For the most part, that is not so. At worst, most of what he said about the mind and consciousness can be detached from his idealism. Though often viewed as a quintessentially German philosopher, Kant is said to have been one-quarter Scottish. Some philosophers (often Scottish) hold that ‘Kant’ is a Germanization of the Scottish name ‘Candt’, though many scholars now reject the idea. It is noteworthy, however, that his work on epistemology, which led him to his ideas about the mind, was a response to Hume as much as to any other philosopher.
In general structure, Kant's model of the mind was the dominant model in the empirical psychology that flowed from his work and then again, after a hiatus during which behaviourism reigned supreme (roughly 1910 to 1965), toward the end of the 20th century, especially in cognitive science. Central elements of the models of the mind of thinkers otherwise as different as Sigmund Freud and Jerry Fodor are broadly Kantian, for example.
Three ideas define the basic shape (‘cognitive architecture’) of Kant's model and one its dominant method. They have all become part of the foundation of cognitive science.
- The mind is complex set of abilities (functions). (As Meerbote 1989 and many others have observed, Kant held a functionalist view of the mind almost 200 years before functionalism was officially articulated in the 1960s by Hilary Putnam and others.)
- The functions crucial for mental, knowledge-generating activity are spatio-temporal processing of, and application of concepts to, sensory inputs. Cognition requires concepts as well as percepts.
- These functions are forms of what Kant called synthesis. Synthesis (and the unity in consciousness required for synthesis) are central to cognition.
These three ideas are fundamental to most thinking about cognition now. Kant's most important method, the transcendental method, is also at the heart of contemporary cognitive science.
- To study the mind, infer the conditions necessary for experience. Arguments having this structure are called transcendental arguments.
Translated into contemporary terms, the core of this method is inference to the best explanation, the method of postulating unobservable mental mechanisms in order to explain observed behaviour.
To be sure, Kant thought that he could get more out of his transcendental arguments than just ‘best explanations’. He thought that he could get a priori (experience independent) knowledge out of them. Kant had a tripartite doctrine of the a priori. He held that some features of the mind and its knowledge had a priori origins, i.e., must be in the mind prior to experience (because using them is necessary to have experience). That mind and knowledge have these features are a priori truths, i.e., necessary and universal (B3/4). And we can come to know these truths, or that they are a priori at any rate, only by using a priori methods, i.e., we cannot learn these things from experience (B3) (Brook 1993). Kant thought that transcendental arguments were a priori or yielded the a priori in all three ways. Nonetheless, at the heart of this method is inference to the best explanation. When introspection fell out of favour about 100 years ago, the alternative approach adopted was exactly this approach. Its nonempirical roots in Kant notwithstanding, it is now the major method used by experimental cognitive scientists.
Other things equally central to Kant's approach to the mind have not been taken up by cognitive science, as we will see near the end, a key part of his doctrine of synthesis and most of what he had to say about consciousness of self in particular. Far from his model having been superseded by cognitive science, some important things have not even been assimilated by it.
The major works so far as Kant's views on the mind are concerned are the monumental Critique of Pure Reason (CPR) and his little, late Anthropology from a Pragmatic Point of View, first published in 1798 only six years before his death. Since the Anthropology was worked up from notes for popular lectures, it is often superficial compared to CPR. Kant's view of the mind arose from his general philosophical project in CPR the following way. Kant aimed among other things to,
- Justify our conviction that physics, like mathematics, is a body of necessary and universal truth.
- Insulate religion, including belief in immortality, and free will from the corrosive effects of this very same science.
Kant accepted without reservation that “God, freedom and immortality” (1781/7, Bxxx) exist but feared that, if science were relevant to their existence at all, it would provide reasons to doubt that they exist. As he saw it and very fortunately, science cannot touch these questions. “I have found it necessary to deny knowledge, … in order to make room for faith.” (Bxxx, his italics).
Laying the foundation for pursuit of the first aim, which as he saw it was no less than the aim of showing why physics is a science, was what led Kant to his views about how the mind works. He approached the grounding of physics by asking: What are the necessary conditions of experience (A96)? Put simply, he held that for our experience, and therefore our minds, to be as they are, the way that our experience is tied together must reflect the way that physics says that objects in the world must be tied together. Seeing this connection also tells us a lot about what our minds must be like.
His pursuit of the second aim, and specifically his critique of some arguments of his predecessors that entailed that we can know more about the mind's consciousness of itself than Kant could also, led him to some extraordinarily penetrating ideas about our consciousness of ourselves.
In CPR, Kant discussed the mind only in connection with his main projects, never in its own right, so his treatment is remarkably scattered and sketchy. As he put it, “Enquiry … [into] the pure understanding itself, its possibility and the cognitive faculties upon which it rests … is of great importance for my chief purpose, … [but] does not form an essential part of it” (Axvii). Indeed, Kant offers no sustained, focussed discussion of the mind anywhere in his work except the popular Anthropology, which, as we just said, is quite superficial.
In addition, the two chapters of CPR in which most of Kant's remarks on the mind occur, the chapter on the Transcendental Deduction (TD) and the chapter on what he called Paralogisms (faulty arguments about the mind mounted by his predecessors) were the two chapters that gave him the greatest difficulty. (They contain some of the most impenetrable prose ever written.) Kant completely rewrote the main body of both chapters for the second edition (though not the introductions, interestingly).
In the two editions of CPR, there are seven main discussions of the mind. The first is in the Transcendental Aesthetic, the second is in what is usually called the Metaphysical Deduction (for this term, see below). Then there are two discussions of it in the first-edition TD, in parts 1 to 3 of Section 2 (A98 up to A110) and in the whole of Section 3 (A115-A127) and two more in the second-edition TD, from B129 to B140 and from B153 to B159, the latter seemingly added as a kind of supplement. The seventh and last is found in the first edition version of Kant's attack on the Paralogisms, in the course of which he says things of the utmost interest about consciousness of and reference to self. (What little was retained of these remarks in the second edition was moved to the completely rewritten TD.) For understanding Kant on the mind and self-knowledge, the first edition of CPR is far more valuable than the second edition. Kant's discussion proceeds through the following stages.
Kant calls the first stage the Transcendental Aesthetic. It is about what space and time must be like, and how we must handle them, if our experience is to have the spatial and temporal properties that it has. This question about the necessary conditions of experience is for Kant a ‘transcendental’ question and the strategy of proceeding by trying to find answers to such questions is, as we said, the strategy of transcendental argument.
Here Kant advances one of his most notorious views: that whatever it is that impinges on us from the mind-independent world does not come located in a spatial or a temporal matrix, not even a temporal one (A37=B54fn.). Rather, it is the mind that organizes this ‘manifold of raw intuition’, as he called it, spatially and temporally. The mind has two pure forms of intuition, space and time, built into it to allow it to do so. (‘Pure’ means ‘not derived from experience’.)
These claims are very problematic. For example, they invite the question, in virtue of what is the mind constrained to locate a bit of information at one spatial or temporal location rather than another? Kant seems to have had no answer to this question (Falkenstein 1995; Brook 1998). Most commentators have found Kant's claim that space and time are only in the mind, not at all in the mind-independent world, to be implausible.
The activity of locating items in the ‘forms of intuition’, space and time, is one of the three kinds of what Kant called synthesis and discussed in the chapter on the Transcendental Deduction. It is not entirely clear how the two discussions relate.
The Aesthetic is about the conditions of experience, Kant's official project. The chapter leading up to the Transcendental Deduction, The Clue to the Discovery of All Pure Concepts of the Understanding (but generally called the Metaphysical Deduction because of a remark that Kant once made, B159) is totally unlike this.
Starting from and taking for granted the logic of Aristotelian syllogisms and the Aristotelian categories, Kant proceeds by analysis to draw out the implications of this logic for the conceptual structure within which all thought and experience must take place. The structure in question is the system of the forms of judgment; the resulting theory is the theory of what Kant called the Categories. Kant seems to have thought that he could deduce the conceptual structure of experience from the components of the Aristotelian system.
Thus, in Kant's thought about the mind early in CPR, there is not one central movement but two, one in the Transcendental Aesthetic and the other in the Metaphysical Deduction. The first is a move up from experience (of objects) to the necessary conditions of such experience. The second is a move down from the Aristotelian forms of judgment to the concepts that we have to use in judging, namely, the Categories. One is inference up from experience, the other deduction down from conceptual structures of the most abstract kind.
Then we get to the second chapter of the Transcendental Logic, the brilliant and baffling Transcendental Deduction (TD). Recall the two movements just discussed, the one from experience to its conditions and the one from the forms of valid inference to the concepts that we must use in all judging (the Categories). This duality led Kant to his famous question of right (quid juris) (A84=B116): with what right do we apply the Categories, which are not acquired from experience, to the contents of experience? (A85=B117). Kant's problem here is not as arcane as it might seem. It reflects an important question: How is it that the world as we experience it conforms to our logic? In briefest form, Kant thought that the trick to showing how it is possible for the Categories to apply to experience is to show that it is necessary that they apply (A97).
TD has two sides, though Kant never treats them separately. He once called them the objective and the subjective deductions (Axvii). The objective deduction is about the conceptual and other cognitive conditions of having representations of objects. It is Kant's answer to the quid juris question. Exactly how the objective deduction goes is highly controversial, a controversy that we will sidestep here. The subjective deduction is about what the mind, the “subjective sources” of understanding (A97), must as a consequence be like. The subjective deduction is what mainly interests us.
Kant argues as follows. Our experiences have objects, are about something. The objects of our experiences are discrete, unified particulars. To have such particulars available to it, the mind must construct them based on sensible input. To construct them, the mind must do three kinds of synthesis. It must generate temporal and spatial structure (Synthesis of Apprehension in Intuition). It must associate spatio-temporally structured items with other spatio-temporally structured items (Synthesis of Reproduction in the Imagination). And it must recognize items using concepts, the Categories in particular (Synthesis of Recognition in a Concept). This threefold doctrine of synthesis is one of the cornerstones of Kant's model of the mind. We will consider it in more detail in the next Section.
The ‘deduction of the categories’ should now be complete. Strangely enough, the chapter has only nicely got started. In the first edition version, for example, we have only reached A106, about one-third of the way through the chapter. At this point, Kant introduces the notion of transcendental apperception for the first time and the unity of such apperception, the unity of consciousness. Evidently, something is happening (something, moreover, not at all well heralded in the text). We will see what when we discuss Kant's doctrine of synthesis below.
We can now understand in more detail why Kant said that the subjective deduction is inessential (Axvii). Since the objective deduction is about the conditions of representations having objects, a better name for it might have been ‘deduction of the object’. Similarly, a better name for the subjective deduction might have been ‘the deduction of the subject’ or ‘the deduction of the subject's nature’. The latter enquiry was inessential to Kant's main critical project because the main project was to defend the synthetic a priori credentials of physics in the objective deduction. From this point of view, anything uncovered about the nature and functioning of the mind was a happy accident.
The chapter on the Paralogisms, the first of the three parts of Kant's second project, contains Kant's most original insights into the nature of consciousness of the self. In the first edition, he seems to have achieved a stable position on self-consciousness only as late as this chapter. Certainly his position was not stable in TD. Even his famous term for consciousness of self, ‘I think’, occurs for the first time only in the introduction to the chapter on the Paralogisms. His target is claims that we know what the mind is like. Whatever the merits of Kant's attack on these claims, in the course of mounting it, he made some very deep-running observations about consciousness and knowledge of self.
To summarize: in the first edition, TD contains most of what Kant had to say about synthesis and unity, but little on the nature of consciousness of self. The chapter on the Paralogisms contains most of what he has to say about consciousness of self.
As we said, Kant rewrote both TD and the chapter on the Paralogisms for the second edition of CPR, leaving only their introductions intact. In the course of doing so, he moved the topic of consciousness of self from the chapter on the Paralogisms to the second discussion of the mind in the new TD. The new version of the Paralogisms chapter is then built around a different and, so far as theory of mind is concerned, much less interesting strategy. The relationship of the old and new versions of the chapters is complicated (Brook 1994, Ch. 9). Here we will just note that the underlying doctrine of the mind does not seem to change very much.
CPR contains other discussions of the mind, discussions that remained the same in both editions. The appendix on what Kant called Leibniz’ Amphiboly contains the first explicit discussion of an important general metaphysical notion, numerical identity (being one object at and over time), and contains the first argument in CPR for the proposition that sensible input is needed for knowledge. (Kant asserts this many times earlier but assertion is not argument.) In the Antinomies, the discussion of the Second Antinomy contains some interesting remarks about the simplicity of the soul and there is a discussion of free will in the Solution to the Third Antinomy. The mind also appears a few times in the Doctrine of Method, particularly in a couple of glosses of the attack mounted against the Paralogisms. (A784=B812ff is perhaps the most interesting.)
In other new material prepared for the second edition, we find a first gloss on the topic of self-consciousness as early as the Aesthetic (B68). The mind also appears in a new passage called the Refutation of Idealism, where Kant attempts to tie the possibility of one sort of consciousness of self to consciousness of permanence in something other than ourselves, in a way he thought to be inconsistent with Berkeleian idealism. This new Refutation of Idealism has often been viewed as a replacement for the argument against the Fourth Paralogism of the first edition. There are problems with this view, the most important of which is that the second edition still has a separate fourth Paralogism (B409). Whatever, though the new passage utilizes self-consciousness in a highly original way, it says little that is new about it.
Elsewhere in his work, the only sustained discussion of the mind and consciousness is, as we said, his little, late Anthropology from a Pragmatic Point of View. By ‘anthropology’ Kant meant the study of human beings from the point of view of their (psychologically-controlled) behaviour, especially their behaviour toward one another, and of the things revealed in behaviour such as character. Though Kant sometimes contrasted anthropology as a legitimate study with what he understood empirical psychology to be, namely, psychology based on introspective observation, he meant by anthropology something fairly close to what we now mean by behavioural or experimental psychology.
Turning now to Kant's view of the mind, we will start with a point about method: Kant held surprisingly strong and not entirely consistent views on the empirical study of the mind. The empirical method for doing psychology that Kant discussed was introspection.
Sometimes he held such study to be hopeless. The key text on psychology is in The Metaphysical Foundations of Natural Science. There Kant tell us that “the empirical doctrine of the soul … must remain even further removed than chemistry from the rank of what may be called a natural science proper” (Ak. IV:471). (In Kant's defence, there was nothing resembling a single unified theory of chemical reactions in his time.) The contents of introspection, in his terms inner sense, cannot be studied scientifically for at least five reasons.
First, having only one universal dimension and one that they are only represented to have at that, namely, distribution in time, the contents of inner sense cannot be quantified; thus no mathematical model of them is possible. Second, “the manifold of internal observation is separated only by mere thought”. That is to say, only the introspective observer distinguishes the items one from another; there are no real distinctions among the items themselves. Third, these items “cannot be kept separate” in a way that would allow us to connect them again “at will”, by which Kant presumably means, according to the dictates of our developing theory. Fourth, “another thinking subject [does not] submit to our investigations in such a way as to be conformable to our purposes” – the only thinking subject whose inner sense one can investigate is oneself. Finally and most damningly, “even the observation itself alters and distorts the state of the object observed” (1786, Ak. IV:471). Indeed, introspection can be bad for the health: it is a road to “mental illness” (‘Illuminism and Terrorism’, 1798, Ak. VII:133; see 161).
In these critical passages, it is not clear why he didn't respect what he called anthropology more highly as an empirical study of the mind, given that he himself did it. He did so elsewhere. In the Anthropology, for example, he links 'self-observation' and observation of others and calls them both sources of anthropology (Ak. VII:142–3).
Whatever, no kind of empirical psychology can yield necessary truths about the mind. In the light of this limitation, how should we study the mind? Kant's answer was: transcendental method using transcendental arguments (notions introduced earlier). If we cannot observe the connections among the denizens of inner sense to any purpose, we can study what the mind must be like and what capacities and structures (in Kant's jargon, faculties) it must have if it is to represent things as it does. With this method we can find universally true, that is to say, ‘transcendental’ psychological propositions. We have already seen what some of them are: minds must be able to synthesize and minds must have a distinctive unity, for example. Let us turn now to these substantive claims.
We have already discussed Kant's view of the mind's handling of space and time, so we can proceed directly to his doctrine of synthesis. As Kant put it in one of his most famous passages, “Concepts without intuitions are empty, intuitions without concepts are blind” (A51=B75). Experience requires both percepts and concepts. As we might say now, to discriminate, we need information; but for information to be of any use to us, we must organize the information. This organization is provided by acts of synthesis.
By synthesis, in its most general sense, I understand the act of putting different representations together, and of grasping what is manifold in them in one knowledge [A77=B103]
If the doctrine of space and time is the first major part of his model of the mind, the doctrine of synthesis is the second. Kant claimed, as we saw earlier, that three kinds of synthesis are required to organize information, namely apprehending in intuition, reproducing in imagination, and recognizing in concepts (A97-A105). Each of the three kinds of synthesis relates to a different aspect of Kant's fundamental duality of intuition and concept. Synthesis of apprehension concerns raw perceptual input, synthesis of recognition concerns concepts, and synthesis of reproduction in imagination allows the mind to go from the one to the other.
They also relate to three fundamental faculties of the mind. One is the province of Sensibility, one is the province of Understanding, and the one in the middle is the province of a faculty that has a far less settled position than the other two, namely, Imagination (see A120).
The first two, apprehension and reproduction, are inseparable; one cannot occur without the other (A102). The third, recognition, requires the other two but is not required by them. It seems that only the third requires the use of concepts; this problem of non-concept-using syntheses and their relationship to use of the categories becomes a substantial issue in the second edition (see B150ff.), where Kant tries to save the universality of the objective deduction by arguing that all three kinds of syntheses are required to represent objects.
Acts of synthesis are performed on that to which we are passive in experience, namely intuitions (Anschauungen). Intuitions are quite different from sense-data as classically understood; we can become conscious of intuitions only after acts of synthesis and only by inference from these acts, not directly. Thus they are something more like theoretical entities (better, events) postulated to explain something in what we do recognize. What they explain is the non-conceptual element in representations, an element over which we have no control. Intuitions determine how our representations will serve to confirm or refute theories, aid or impede our efforts to reach various goals.
The synthesis of apprehension is somewhat more shadowy than the other two. In the second edition, the idea does not even appear until §26, i.e., late in TD. At A120, Kant tells us that apprehending impressions is taking them up into the activity of imagination, i.e., into the faculty of the mind that becomes conscious of images. He tells us that we can achieve the kind of differentiation we need to take them up only “in so far as the mind distinguishes the time in the sequence of one impression upon another” (A99). Kant uses the term ‘impression’ (Eindrucke) rarely; it seems to be in the same camp as ‘appearance’ (Erscheinung) and ‘intuition’ (Anschauung).
The idea behind the strange saying just quoted seems to be this. Kant seems to have believed that we can become conscious of only one new item at a time. Thus a group of simultaneous ‘impressions’ all arriving at the same time would be indistinguishable, “for each representation [Vorstellung], in so far as it is contained in a single moment, can never be anything but absolute unity” (A99). Kant's use of Vorstellung, with its suggestion of synthesized, conceptualized organization, may have been unfortunate, but what I think he meant is this. Prior to synthesis and conceptual organization, a manifold of intuitions would be an undifferentiated unit, a seamless, buzzing confusion. Thus, to distinguish one impression from another, we must give them separate locations. Kant speaks only of temporal location but he may very well have had spatial location in mind, too.
The synthesis of apprehension is closely related to the Transcendental Aesthetic. Indeed, it is the doing of what the Aesthetic tells us that the mind has to be able to do with respect to locating items in time and space (time anyway).
The synthesis of reproduction in imagination has two elements, a synthesis proper and associations necessary for performing that synthesis. (Kant explicitly treats them as separate on A125: “recognition, reproduction, association, apprehension”.) Both start from the appearances, as Kant now calls them, which the synthesis of apprehension has located in time. At first glance, the synthesis of reproduction looks very much like memory; however, it is actually quite different from memory. It is a matter of retaining earlier intuitions in such a way that certain other representations can “bring about a transition of the mind” to these earlier representations, even in the absence of any current representation of them (A100). Such transitions are the result of the setting up of associations (which, moreover, need not be conscious) and do not require memory. Likewise, no recognition of any sort need be involved; that the earlier representations have become associated with later ones is not something that we need recognize. Memory and recognition are the jobs of synthesis of recognition, yet to come.
To our ears now, it is a little strange to find Kant calling this activity of reproduction and the activity of apprehension acts of imagination. Kant describes the function he had in mind as “a blind but indispensable function of the soul” (A78=B103), so he meant something rather different from what we now mean by the term ‘imagination’ (A120 and fn.). For Kant, imagination is a connecting of elements by forming an image: “… imagination has to bring the manifold of intuitions into the form of an image” (A120). If ‘imagination’ is understood in its root sense of image-making and we see imagination not as opposed to but as part of perception, then Kant's choice of term becomes less peculiar.
The third kind of synthesis is synthesis of recognition in a concept. To experience objects for Kant, first I have to relate the materials out of which they are constructed to one another temporally and spatially. They may not require use of concepts. Then I have to apply at least the following kinds of concepts: concepts of number, of quality, and of modality (I am experiencing something real or fictitious). These are three of the four kinds of concepts that Kant had identified as Categories. Note that we have so far not mentioned the fourth, relational concepts.
In Kant's view, recognition requires memory; reproduction is not memory but memory does enter now. The argument goes as follows.
[A merely reproduced] manifold of representation would never … form a whole, since it would lack that unity which only consciousness can impart to it. If, in counting, I forget that the units, which now hover before me, have been added to one another in succession, I should never know that a total is being produced through this successive addition of unit to unit … [A103; see A78=B104].
In fact, as this passage tells us, synthesis into an object by an act of recognition requires two things. One is memory. The other is that something in the past representations must be recognized as related to present ones. And to recognize that earlier and later representations are both representing a single object, we must use a concept, a rule (A121, A126). In fact, we must use a number of concepts: number, quality, modality, and, of course, the specific empirical concept of the object we are recognizing.
Immediately after introducing recognition, Kant brings apperception and the unity of apperception into the discussion. The acts by which we achieve recognition under concepts are acts of apperception. By ‘apperception’, Kant means the faculty or capacity for judging in accord with a rule, for applying concepts. Apperceiving is an activity necessary for and parallel to perceiving (A120). This is one of the senses in which Leibniz used the term, too. To achieve recognition of a unified object, the mind must perform an act of judgment; it must find how various represented elements are connected to one another. This judgment is an act of apperception. Apperception is the faculty that performs syntheses of recognition (A115). Note that we are not yet dealing with transcendental apperception.
To sum up: For experiences to have objects, acts of recognition that apply concepts to spatio-temporally ordered material are required. Representation requires recognition. Moreover, objects of representation share a general structure. They are all some number of something, they all have qualities, and they all have an existence-status. (Put this way, Kant's claim that the categories are required for knowledge looks quite plausible.)
With the synthesis of recognition, TD should be close to complete. Kant merely needs to argue that these concepts must include the categories, which he does at A111, and that should be that.
But that is not that. In fact, as we said earlier, we are only about one-third of the way through the chapter. The syntheses of apprehension, reproduction, and recognition of single objects march in a single temporal/object-generational line. Suddenly at A106 Kant makes a kind of 90o turn. From the generation of a representation of individual objects of experience over time, he suddenly turns to a form of recognition that requires the unification and recognition of multiple objects existing at the same time. He moves from acts of recognition of individual objects to unified acts of recognition of multiple objects which “stand along side one another in one experience” (A108). This 90o turn is a pivotal moment in TD and has received less attention than it deserves.
The move that Kant makes next is interesting. He argues that the mind could not use concepts so as to have unified objects of representation if its consciousness were not itself unified (A107–108). Why does consciousness and its unity appear here? We have been exploring what is necessary to have experience. Why would it matter if, in addition, unified consciousness were necessary? As Walker (1978, p. 77) and Guyer (1987, pp. 94–5) have shown, Kant did not need to start from anything about the mind to deduce the Categories. (A famous footnote in The Metaphysical Foundations of Natural Science [Ak. IV:474fn.] is Kant's best-known comment on this issue.) So why does he suddenly introduce unified consciousness?
So far Kant has ‘deduced’ only three of the four kinds of categorical concepts, number, quality, and modality. He has said nothing about the relational categories. For Kant, this would have been a crucial gap. One of his keenest overall objectives in CPR is to show that physics is a real science. To do this, he thinks that he needs to show that we must use the concept of causality in experience. Thus, causality is likely the category that he cared more about than all the other categories put together. Yet up to A106, Kant has said nothing about the relational categories in general or causality in particular. By A111, however, Kant is talking about the use of the relational categories and by A112 causality is front and centre. So it is natural to suppose that, in Kant's view at least, the material between A106 and A111 contains an argument for the necessity of applying the relational categories, even though he never says so.
Up to A106, Kant has talked about nothing but normal individual objects: a triangle and its three sides, a body and its shape and impenetrability. At A107, he suddenly begins to talk about tying together multiple represented objects, indeed “all possible appearances, which can stand alongside one another in one experience” (A108). The solution to the problem of showing that we have to use the category of causality must lie somewhere in this activity of tying multiple objects together.
The passage between A106 and A111 is blindingly difficult. It takes up transcendental apperception, the unity and identity of the mind, and the mind's consciousness of itself as the subject of all its representations (A106–108). I think that this passage introduces either a new stage or even a new starting point for TD. Here many commentators (Strawson, Henrich, Guyer) would think immediately of self-consciousness. Kant did use consciousness of self as a starting point for deductions, at B130 in the B-edition for example. But that is not what appears here, not in the initial paragraphs anyway.
What Kant does say is this. Our experience is “one experience”; “all possible appearances … stand alongside one another in one experience” (A108). We have “one and the same general experience” of “all … the various perceptions” (A110), “a connected whole of human knowledge” (A121). Let us call this general experience a global representation.
Transcendental apperception (hereafter TA) now enters. It is the ability to tie ‘all appearances’ together into ‘one experience’.
This transcendental unity of apperception forms out of all possible appearances, which can stand alongside one another in one experience, a connection of all these representations according to laws. [A108]
It performs a “synthesis of all appearances according to concepts”, “whereby it subordinates all synthesis of apprehension … to a transcendental unity” (A108). This, he thought, requires unified consciousness. Unified consciousness is required for another reason, too. Representations
can [so much as] represent something to me only in so far as they belong with all others to one consciousness. Therefore, they must at least be capable of being so connected [A116].
The introduction of unified consciousness opens up an important new opportunity. Kant can now explore the necessary conditions of conscious content being unified in this way. To make a long story short, Kant now argues that conscious content could have the unity that it does only if the contents themselves are tied together causally.
With this, his deduction of the relational categories is complete and his defence of the necessity of physics is under way. The notion of unified consciousness to which Kant is appealing here is interesting in its own right, so let us turn to it next.
For Kant, consciousness being unified is a central feature of the mind, our kind of mind at any rate. In fact, being a single integrated group of experiences (roughly, one person's experiences) requires two kinds of unity.
- The experiences must have a single common subject (A350);
- The consciousness that this subject has of represented objects and/or representations must be unified.
The first requirement may look trivial but it is not. For Hume, for example, what makes a group of experiences one person's experiences is that they are associated with one another in an appropriate way (the so-called bundle theory), not that they have a common subject. The need for a subject arises from two straight-forward considerations: representations not only represent something, they represent it to someone; and, representations are not given to us – to become a representation, sensory inputs must be processed by an integrated cognitive system. Kant may have been conscious of both these points, but beyond identifying the need, he had little to say about what the subject of experience might be like, so we will say no more about it. (We will, however, say something about what its consciousness of itself is like later.)
Kant called the unity of consciousness both the unity of consciousness (A103) and the unity of apperception (A105, A108). The well-known argument at the beginning of the first edition attack on the second paralogism (A352) focuses on the unity of consciousness at a given time (among other things) and what can (or rather, cannot) be inferred from it about the nature of the mind (a topic to which we will return below). The attack on the third paralogism focuses on what can be inferred from unified consciousness over time. These are all from the first edition of CPR. In the second edition, Kant makes remarks about unity unlike anything in the first edition, for example, “this unity … is not the category of unity” (B131). The unity of consciousness and Kant's views on it are complicated issues but some of the most important points include the following.
By ‘unity of consciousness’, Kant seems to have the following in mind: I am conscious not only of single experiences but of a great many experiences at the same time. The same is true of actions; I can do and be conscious of doing a number of actions at the same time. In addition to such synchronic unity, many global representations, as we called them, display temporal unity: current representation is combined with retained earlier representation. (Temporal unity is often a feature of synthesis of recognition.) Any representation that we acquire in a series of temporal steps, such as hearing a sentence, will have unity across time (A104; A352).
Kant himself did not explicate his notion of unified consciousness but here is one plausible articulation of the notion at work in his writings.
The unity of consciousness =df. (i) a single act of consciousness, which (ii) makes one conscious of a number of representations and/or objects of representation in such a way that to be conscious by having any members of this group is also to be conscious by having others in the group and of at least some of them as a group.
As this definition makes clear, consciousness being unified is more than just being one state of consciousness. Unified consciousness is not just singular, it is unified.
Kant placed great emphasis on the unity of consciousness, both positively and negatively. Positively, he held that conceptualized representation has to be unified both at and across time. Negatively, from a mind having unified consciousness, he held that nothing follows concerning its composition, its identity, especially its identity across time, nor its materiality or immateriality. He argued these points in his attacks on the second, third and fourth Paralogisms.
Many commentators hold that consciousness of self is central to the Critical philosophy. There is reason to question this: unified consciousness is central, but consciousness of self? That is not so clear. Whatever, the topic is intrinsically interesting and Kant achieved some remarkable insights into it. Strangely, none of his immediate successors took them up after his death and they next appeared at the earliest in Wittgenstein (1934–5) and perhaps not until Shoemaker (1968). Kant never discussed consciousness of self in its own right, only in the context of pursuing other objectives, and his remarks on the topic are extremely scattered. When we pull his various remarks together, we can see that Kant advanced at least seven major theses about consciousness of and knowledge of self. We will consider them one-by-one.
The first thesis:
- There are two kinds of consciousness of self: consciousness of oneself and one's psychological states in inner sense and consciousness of oneself and one's states via performing acts of apperception.
Kant's term for the former was ‘empirical self-consciousness’. A leading term for the latter was ‘transcendental apperception’ (TA). (Kant used the term ‘TA’ in two very different ways, as the name for a faculty of synthesis and as the name for what he also referred to as the ‘I think’, namely, one's consciousness of oneself as subject.) Here is a passage from the Anthropology in which Kant distinguishes the two kinds of consciousness of self very clearly:
… the “I” of reflection contains no manifold and is always the same in every judgment … Inner experience, on the other hand, contains the matter of consciousness and a manifold of empirical inner intuition: … [1798, Ak. VII:141–2, emphases in the original].
The two kinds of consciousness of self have very different sources.
The source of empirical self-consciousness is what Kant called inner sense. He did not work out his notion of inner sense at all well. Here are just a few of the problems. Kant insists that all representational states are in inner sense, including those representing the objects of outer sense (i.e., spatially located objects):
Whatever the origins of our representations, whether they are due to the influence of outer things, or are produced through inner causes, whether they arise a priori, or being appearances have an empirical origin, they must all, as modifications of the mind, belong to inner sense. [A98–9]
However, he also says that the object of inner sense is the soul, the object of outer sense the body (including one's own). He comes close to denying that we can be conscious of the denizens of inner sense—they do not represent inner objects and have no manifold of their own. Yet he also says that we can be conscious of them — representations can themselves be objects of representations, indeed, representations can make us conscious of themselves. In its role as a form of or means to consciousness of self, apperception ought to be part of inner sense. Yet Kant regularly contrasted apperception, a means to consciousness of oneself and one's acts of thinking, with inner sense as a means to consciousness of—what? Presumably, particular representations: perceptions, imaginings, memories, etc. Here is another passage from the Anthropology:
§24. Inner sense is not pure apperception, consciousness of what we are doing; for this belongs to the power of thinking. It is, rather, consciousness of what we undergo as we are affected by the play of our own thoughts. This consciousness rests on inner intuition, and so on the relation of ideas (as they are either simultaneous or successive). [1798, Ak. VII:161]
Kant makes the same distinction in CPR:
… the I that I think is distinct from the I that it, itself, intuits …; I am given to myself beyond that which is given in intuition, and yet know myself, like other phenomena, only as I appear to myself, not as I am … [B155].
Since most of Kant's most interesting remarks about consciousness of and knowledge of self concern consciousness of oneself, the ‘I of reflection’ via acts of apperception, we will focus on it, thought empirical consciousness of self will appear again briefly from time to time.
How does apperception give rise to consciousness of oneself and one's states? In the passage just quoted from the Anthropology, notice the phrase “consciousness of what we are doing” — doing. The way in which one becomes conscious of an act of representing is not by receiving intuitions but by doing it: “synthesis …, as an act, … is conscious to itself, even without sensibility” (B153); “… this representation is an act of spontaneity, that is, it cannot be regarded as belonging to sensibility” (B132).
Equally, we can be conscious of ourselves as subject merely by doing acts of representing. No further representation is needed.
Man, … who knows the rest of nature solely through the senses, knows himself also through pure apperception; and this, indeed, in acts and inner determinations which he cannot regard as impressions of the senses [A546=B574].
How does one's consciousness of oneself in one's acts of representing work? Consider the sentence:
I am looking at the words on the screen in front of me.
Kant's claim seems to be that the representation of the words on the screen is all the experience I need to be conscious not just of the words and the screen but also of the act of seeing them and of who is seeing them, namely, me. A single representation can do all three jobs. Let us call an act of representing that can make one conscious of its object, itself and oneself as its subject the representational base of consciousness of these three items. Kant's second major thesis is,
- Most ordinary representations generated by most ordinary acts of synthesis provide the representational base of consciousness of oneself and one's states.
Note that this representational base is the base not only of consciousness of one's representational states. It is also the base of consciousness of oneself as the subject of those states—as the thing that has and does them. Though it is hard to know for sure, Kant would probably have denied that consciousness of oneself in inner sense can make one conscious of oneself as subject, of oneself as oneself, in this way.
For Kant, this distinction between consciousness of oneself and one's states by doing acts of synthesis and consciousness of oneself and one's states as the objects of particular representations is of fundamental importance. When one is conscious of oneself and one's states by doing cognitive and perceptual acts, one is conscious of oneself as spontaneous, rational, self-legislating, free—as the doer of deeds, not just as a passive receptacle for representations: “I exist as an intelligence which is conscious solely of its power of combination” (B158–159), of “the activity of the self” (B68) (Sellars, 1970–1; Pippin, 1987).
So far we have focussed on individual representations. For Kant, however, the representations that serve as the representational base of consciousness of oneself as subject are usually much ‘bigger’ than that, i.e., contain multiple objects and often multiple representations of them tied together into what Kant called ‘general experience’.
When we speak of different experiences, we can refer only to the various perceptions, all of which belong to one and the same general experience. This thoroughgoing synthetic unity of perceptions is the form of experience; it is nothing less than the synthetic unity of appearances in accordance with concepts [A110].
This general experience is the global representation introduced earlier. When I am conscious of many objects and/or representations of them as the single object of a single global representation, the latter representation is all the representation I need to be conscious not just of the global object but also of myself as the common subject of all the constituent representations.
The mind could never think its identity in the manifoldness of its representations… if it did not have before its eyes the identity of its act, whereby it subordinates all [the manifold] … to a transcendental unity… [A108].
I am conscious of myself as the single common subject of a certain group of experiences by being conscious of “the identity of the consciousness in … conjoined … representations” (B133).
Neither consciousness of self by doing apperceptive acts nor empirical consciousness of self as the object of particular representations yields knowledge of oneself as one is. On pain of putting his right to believe in immortality as an article of faith at risk, Kant absolutely had to claim this. As he put it,
it would be a great stumbling block, or rather would be the one unanswerable objection, to our whole critique if it were possible to prove a priori that all thinking beings are in themselves simple substances. [B409]
The same would hold for all other properties of thinking beings. Since Kant also sometimes viewed immortality, i.e., personal continuity beyond death, as a foundation of morality, morality could also be at risk. So Kant had powerful motives to maintain that one does not know oneself as one is. Yet, according to him, we seem to know at least some things about ourselves, namely, how we must function, and it would be implausible to maintain that one never conscious of one's real self at all. Kant's response to these pressures is ingenious.
First, he treats inner sense: When we know ourselves as the object of a representation in inner sense, we “know even ourselves only .. as appearance …” (A278).
Inner sense … represents to consciousness even our own selves only as we appear to ourselves, not as we are in ourselves. For we intuit ourselves only as we are inwardly affected [by ourselves] (B153)?
This is the third thesis:
- In inner sense, one is conscious of oneself only as one appears to oneself, not as one is.
So when we seem to be directly conscious of features of ourselves, we in fact have the same kind of consciousness of them as we have of features of things in general—we appear to ourselves to be like this, that or the other, in just the way that we know of any object only as it appears to us.
Then he turns to consciousness of oneself and one's states by doing apperceptive acts. This is a knottier problem. Here we will consider only consciousness of oneself as subject. Certainly by the second edition, Kant had come to see how implausible it would be to maintain that one has no consciousness of oneself, one's real self, at all when one is conscious of oneself as the subject of one's experience, agent of one's acts, by having these experiences and doing those acts. In the 2nd edition, he reflects this sensitivity as early as B68; at B153, he goes so far as to say that an apparent contradiction is involved.
Furthermore, when we are conscious of ourselves as subject and agent by doing acts of apperceiving, we do appear to ourselves to be substantial, simple and continuing. He had to explain these appearances away; doing so was one of his aims, indeed, in his attacks on the second and third Paralogisms. Thus, Kant had strong motives to give consciousness of self as subject special treatment. Let us sneak up on the way he did so via a couple of intermediate theses. His treatment of the issue and attendant critique of the inflated views on it of his rationalist predecessors led him to some remarkable insights into reference to and consciousness of self.
Kant generated the special treatment he needed by focussing first on reference to self. Here are some of the things that he said about reference to oneself as subject. It is a consciousness of self in which “nothing manifold is given.” (B135). In the kind of reference in which we gain this consciousness of self, we “denote” but do not “represent” ourselves (A382). We designate ourselves without noting “any quality whatsoever” in ourselves (A355). This yields his fourth thesis about consciousness of and knowledge of self.
- The referential machinery used to obtain consciousness of self as subject requires no identifying (or other) ascription of properties to oneself.
This is a remarkably penetrating claim; remember, the study of reference and semantics generally is usually thought to have begun only with Frege. Kant is anticipating two important theses about reference to self that next saw the light of day only 200 years later.
- In certain kinds of consciousness of self, one can be conscious of
something as oneself without identifying it (or anything) as oneself
via properties that one has ascribed to the thing (self-reference
without identification) (Shoemaker
- In such cases, first-person indexicals (I, me, my, mine) cannot be analysed out in favour of anything else, in particular anything descriptionlike (the essential indexical) (Perry 1979).
Was Kant actually aware of (1) and/or (2) or had he just stumbled across something that later philosophers recognized as significant?
One standard argument for (1) goes as follows:
My use of the word ‘I’ as the subject of [statements such as ‘I feel pain’ or ‘I see a canary’] is not due to my having identified as myself something [otherwise recognized] of which I know, or believe, or wish to say, that the predicate of my statement applies to it [Shoemaker 1968, pp.558].
A standard argument for (2), that certain indexicals are essential, goes as follows. To know that I wrote a certain book a few years ago, it is not enough to know that someone over six feet tall wrote that book, or that someone who teaches philosophy at a particular university wrote that book, or … or … or … , for I could know all these things without knowing that it was me who has these properties (and I could know that it was me who wrote that book and not know that any of these things are properties of me). As Shoemaker puts it,
… no matter how detailed a token-reflexive-free description of a person is, … it cannot possibly entail that I am that person [1968, pp. 560].
Kant unquestionably articulated the argument for (1):
In attaching ‘I’ to our thoughts, we designate the subject only transcendentally … without noting in it any quality whatsoever—in fact, without knowing anything of it either directly or by inference [A355].
This transcendental designation, i.e., referring to oneself using ‘I’ without ‘noting any quality’ in oneself, has some unusual features. One can refer to oneself in a variety of ways, of course: as the person in the mirror, as the person born on such and such a date in such and such a place, as the first person to do X, and so on, but one way of referring to oneself is special: it does not require identifying or indeed any ascription to oneself. So Kant tells us.
The question is more complicated with respect to (2). We cannot go into the complexities here (see Brook 2001). Here we will just note three passages in which Kant may be referring to the essential indexical or something like it.
The subject of the categories cannot by thinking the categories [i.e. applying them to objects] acquire a concept of itself as an object of the categories. For in order to think them, its pure self-consciousness, which is what was to be explained, must itself be presupposed. [B422]
The phrase ‘its pure self-consciousness’ seems to refer to consciousness of oneself as subject. If so, the passage may be saying that judgments about oneself, i.e., ascriptions of properties to oneself, ‘presuppose … pure self-consciousness’, i.e., consciousness of oneself via an act of ascription-free transcendental designation.
Now compare this, “it is … very evident that I cannot know as an object that which I must presuppose to know any object … .” (A402), and this,
Through this I or he or it (the thing) which thinks, nothing further is represented than a transcendental subject of the thoughts = X. It is known only through the thoughts which are its predicates, and of it, apart from them, we cannot have any concept whatsoever, but can only revolve in a perpetual circle, since any judgment upon it has always already made use of its representation. [A346=B404]
The last clause is the key one: “any judgment upon it has always already made use of its representation”. Kant seems to be saying that to know that anything is true of me, I must first know that it is me of whom it is true. This is something very like the essential indexical claim.
If reference to self takes place without ‘noting any properties’ of oneself, the consciousness that results will also have some special features.
The most important special feature is that, in this kind of consciousness of self, one is not, or need not be, conscious of any properties of oneself, certainly not any particular properties. One has the same consciousness of self no matter what else one is conscious of — thinking, perceiving, laughing, being miserable, or whatever. Kant expressed the thought this way,
through the ‘I’, as simple representation, nothing manifold is given. [B135]
the I that I think is distinct from the I that it … intuits …; I am given to myself beyond that which is given in intuition. [B155]
We now have the fifth thesis to be found in Kant:
- When one is conscious of oneself as subject, one has a bare consciousness of self in which “nothing manifold is given.”
Since, on Kant's view, it is not just identifying properties but any properties of oneself whatsoever that one does not need to know in order to refer to oneself as oneself, ‘non-ascriptive reference to self’ might capture what is special about this form of consciousness of self better than Shoemaker's ‘self-reference without identification’.
Transcendental designation immediately yields the distinction that Kant needs to allow that one is conscious of oneself as one is, not just of an appearance of self, and yet deny knowledge of oneself as one is. If consciousness of self ascribes nothing to the self, it can be a “bare … consciousness of self [as one is]” and yet yield no knowledge of self—it is “very far from being a knowledge of the self” (B158). This thesis returns us to consciousness of self as subject:
- When one is conscious of oneself as subject, one's bare consciousness of self yields no knowledge of self.
In Kant's own work, he then put the idea of transcendental designation to work to explain how one can appear to oneself to be substantial, simple and persisting without these appearances reflecting how one actually is. The reason that one appears in these ways is not that the self is some strange, indefinable being. It is because of the kind of referring that we do to become conscious of onself as subject. Given how long ago he worked, Kant's insights into this kind of referring are nothing short of amazing.
The last of Kant's seven theses about consciousness of self is an idea that we already met when we discussed the unity of consciousness:
- When we are conscious of ourselves as subject, we are conscious of ourselves as the “single common subject” [CPR, A350] of a number of representations.
What Kant likely had in mind is nicely captured in a remark of Bennett's (1974, p. 83): to think of myself as a plurality of things is to think of my being conscious of this plurality, “and that pre-requires an undivided me.” Unlike one anything else, it is not optional that I think of myself as one subject across a variety of experiences (A107).
The remarks just noted about ‘bare consciousness’ and so on by no means exhaust the concerns that can be raised about Kant and what we can know about the mind. His official view has to be: nothing — about the mind's structure and what it is composed of, at any rate, we can know nothing. As we have seen, Kant not only maintained this but did some ingenious wiggling to account for the apparent counter-evidence. But that is not the end of the story, for two reasons.
First, whatever the commitments of his philosophy, Kant the person believed that the soul is simple and persists beyond death; he found materialism utterly repugnant (1783, Ak. IV, end of §46). This is an interesting psychological fact about Kant but needs no further discussion.
Second and more importantly, Kant in fact held that we do have knowledge of the mind as it is. In particular, we know that it has forms of intuition in which it must locate things spatially and temporally, that it must synthesize the raw manifold of intuition in three ways, that its consciousness must be unified, and so on — all the aspects of the model examined above.
To square his beliefs about what we cannot know and what we do know about the mind, Kant could have made at least two moves. He could have said that we know these things only ‘transcendentally’, that is to say, by inference to the necessary conditions of experience. We do not know them directly, in some sense of ‘directly’, so we don't have intuitive, i.e., sense-derived knowledge of them. Or he could have said that ontological neutrality about structure and composition is compatible with knowledge of function. As we saw, Kant's conception of the mind is functionalist—to understand the mind, we must study what it does and can do, its functions—and the doctrine that function does not dictate form is at the heart of contemporary functionalism. According to functionalism, we can gain knowledge of the mind's functions while knowing little or nothing about how the mind is built. Approached this way, Kant's view that we know nothing of the structure and composition of the mind would just be a radical version of this functionalist idea. Either move would restore consistency among his various claims about knowledge of the mind.
We will close by returning to the question of Kant's relationship to contemporary cognitive research. As we saw, some of Kant's most characteristic doctrines about the mind are now built into the very foundations of cognitive science. We laid out what they were. Interestingly, some of the others have played little or no role.
Consider the two forms of Synthesis of Recognition in a Concept. In the form of binding, the phenomenon that he had in mind in the first kind of synthesis is now widely studied. Indeed, one model, Anne Treisman's (1980) three-stage model, is very similar to all three stages of synthesis in Kant. According to Treisman and her colleagues, object recognition proceeds in three stages: first feature detection, then location of features on a map of locations, and then integration and identification of objects under concepts. This compares directly to Kant's three-stage model of apprehension of features, association of features (reproduction), and recognition of integrated groups of under concepts (A98-A106). However, Kant's second kind of recognition under concepts, the activity of tying multiple representations together into a global representation (A107–14), has received little attention.
The same was true until recently of the unity of consciousness and Kant's work on it. However, this is changing. In the past twenty years, the unity of consciousness has come back onto the research agenda and there are now hundreds of papers and a number of books on the topic. However, claims such as Kant's that a certain form of synthesis and certain links among the contents of experience are required for unity continue to be ignored in cognitive science, though a few philosophers have done some work on them (Brook 2004). The same is true of Kant's views on consciousness of self; cognitive science has paid no attention to non-ascriptive identification of self and the idea of the essential indexical. Here, too, a few philosophers have worked on these issues, apparently without knowing of Kant's contribution (Brook & DeVidi, 2001), but not cognitive scientists.
In short, the dominant model of the mind in contemporary cognitive science is Kantian, but some of his most distinctive contributions have not been taken into it (Brook, 2004).
The Cambridge Edition of the Work of Immanuel Kant in Translation has translations into English complete with scholarly apparatus of nearly all Kant's writings. It is probably the best single source for Kant's works in English. Except for references to the Critique of Pure Reason, all references will include the volume number and where appropriate the page number of the Gesammelte Schriften, ed. Koniglichen Preussischen Academie der Wissenschaften, 29 Vols. Berlin: Walter de Gruyter et al., 1902– [in the format, Ak. XX:yy]).
- Kant, I. (1781/1787) Critique of Pure Reason, P. Guyer and A. Wood (trans.), Cambridge and New York: Cambridge University Press, 1997. (I have consulted this translation and the Kemp Smith translation but translated anew the passages that I quote. References to CPR are in the standard pagination of the 1st (A) and 2nd (B) editions. A reference to only one edition means that the passage appeared only in that edition.)
- Kant, I. (1783) Prolegomena to Any Future Metaphysics, P. Carus (trans.), revised and with an Introduction by James Ellington, Indianapolis, IN: Hackett Publishers, 1977 (Ak. IV).
- Kant, I. (1786) The Metaphysical Foundations of Natural Science, translated and with an Introduction by James Ellington, Indianapolis, IN: Library of Liberal Arts, 1970. (Ak. IV).
- Kant, I. (1798) Anthropology from a Pragmatic Point of View, Mary Gregor (trans.), The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff, 1974 (Ak. VII).
In the past ten years alone, upwards of 35,000 new books and new editions by or about Kant have been published, so any bibliography is bound to be seriously incomplete. In what follows, I have focused on books of the past five years in English that are having an influence. I have included a few important earlier commentaries, too. General bibliographies are readily available on the websites listed later.
- Allison, H., 1983. Kant's Transcendental Idealism: An Interpretation and Defense, New Haven, CN: Yale University Press.
- Altman, M. C., 2007. A Companion to Kant's Critique of Pure Reason, Boulder, CO:Westview Press
- Ameriks, K., 2000. Kant's Theory of Mind: An Analysis of the Paralogisms of Pure Reason, 2nd edition, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- –––, 2006. Kant and the Historical Turn: Philosophy As Critical Interpretation, Oxford: Oxford University Press
- Anderson, P.M and J. Bell, 2010. Kant and Theology, London: T. and T. Clark Publishers.
- Banham, G., 2006. Kant's Transcendental Imagination, Basingstoke: Palbgrave Macmillan
- Beck, L. W., 2002. Selected Essays on Kant (North American Kant Society Studies in Philosophy, Vol. 6), Rochester NY: North American Kant Society. [NAKS has published an excellent series of roughly annual books on Kant. Some more examples will be cited below.]
- Beiser, F. C., 2006. The Fate of Reason: German Philosophy from Kant to Fichte, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press
- Bennett, J., 1966. Kant's Analytic, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- –––, 1974. Kant's Dialectic, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Bird, G., 2006. The Revolutionary Kant, Peru, IL: Open Court Publishing
- –––, 2009. A Companion to Kant, Oxford: Wiley-Blackwell.
- Brook, A., 1993. “Kant's A Priori Methods for Recognizing Necessary Truths,” in Return of the A Priori, Philip Hanson and Bruce Hunter (eds.), Canadian Journal of Philosophy (Supplementary Volume), 18: 215–52.
- –––, 1994. Kant and the Mind, Cambridge and New York: Cambridge University Press.
- –––, 1998. “Critical Notice of L. Falkenstein, Kant's Intuitionism: A Commentary on the Transcendental Aesthetic,” Canadian Journal of Philosophy, 29: 247–68.
- –––, 2001. “Kant on self-reference and -self-awareness,” in A. Brook and R. DeVidi (eds.) 2001.
- –––, 2004. “Kant, cognitive science, and contemporary neo-Kantianism,” in D. Zahavi (ed.), Journal of Consciousness Studies, special issue.
- Buroker, J. V., 2006. Kant's 'Critique of Pure Reason': An Introduction (Cambridge Introductions to Key Philosophical Texts), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Caranti, L., 2007. Kant and the Scandal of Philosophy: The Kantian Critique of Cartesian Scepticism (Toronto Studies in Philosophy), Toronto: University of Toronto Press.
- Caygill, H., 1995. A Kant Dictionary, Oxford: Blackwell Publishers
- Cohen, A., 2009. Kant and the Human Sciences: Biology, Anthropology and History, Basingstoke, UK: Palgrave Macmillan Publishers.
- Dickerson, A.B., 2007. Kant on Representation and Objectivity, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press
- Easton, P.A. (ed.), 1997. Logic and the Workings of the Mind, (North American Kant Society Studies in Philosophy, Vol. 5), Rochester NA: North American Kant Society.
- Forster, M. N., 2008. Kant and Skepticism, Princeton NJ: Princeton University Press
- Falkenstein, L., 1995. Kant's Intuitionism: A Commentary on the Transcendental Aesthetic, Toronto: University of Toronto Press.
- Friedman, M., 1992. Kant and the Exact Sciences, Cambridge MA: Harvard University Press
- Gardner, S., 2012. Routledge Philosophy GuideBook to Kant and the Critique of Pure Reason (Routledge Philosophy GuideBooks), London: Routledge Francis Taylor.
- Glock, H.-J., 2003. Strawson and Kant (Mind Association Occasional Series), Oxford: Oxford University Press
- Goldman, A., 2012. Kant and the Subject of Critique: On the Regulative Role of the Psychological Idea, South Bend, IN: University of Indiana Press.
- Greenberg, R., 2008. Kant's Theory of A Priori Knowledge, State College PA: Pennsylvania State University Press
- Grier, M., 2007. Kant's Doctrine of Transcendental Illusion (Modern European Philosophy), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press
- Guyer, P., 1987. Kant and the Claims of Knowledge, Cambridge and New York: Cambridge University Press.
- –––, 2005. Kant's System of Nature and Freedom: Selected Essays, Oxford: Oxford University Press
- –––, 2006. Kant (Routledge Philosophers), London: Routledge Taylor
- –––, 1987. The Cambridge Companion to Kant and Modern Philosophy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press
- –––, 2008. Knowledge, Reason, and Taste: Kant's Response to Hume, Princeton NJ: Princeton University Press
- Guyer, P. (ed.), 1992. The Cambridge Companion to Kant, Cambridge:Cambridge University Press
- ––– (ed.), 2010. The Cambridge Companion to Kant's Critique of Pure Reason, Cambridge and New York: Cambridge University Press.
- Hall, B., M. Black and M. Sheffield, 2010. The Arguments of Kant's Critique of Pure Reason, Lanham, MD: Rowman and Littlefield.
- Hanna, R., 2004. Kant and the Foundations of Analytic Philosophy, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- –––, 2006. Kant, Science, and Human Nature, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Heidemann, D., 2012. Kant and Non-Conceptual Content, London: Routledge Taylor Francis.
- Hems, N., D. Schulting and G. Banham (eds.), 2012. The Continuum Companion to Kant, London: Continuum Publishers.
- Henrich, D., 1976. Identität und Objektivität, Heidelberg: Carl Winter Universitäts-Verlag.
- Howell, R., 1992. Kant's Transcendental Deduction, Dordrecht: Kluwer Publishers
- Huneman, P., 2007. Understanding Purpose: Kant and the Philosophy of Biology (North American Kant Society Studies in Philosophy, Vol. 9), Rochester NA: North American Kant Society.
- Jacobs, B. and Kain, P. (eds.), 2007. Essays on Kant's Anthropology, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press
- Keller, P., 1998. Kant and the Demands of Self-consciousness, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Kneller, J., 2007. Kant and the Power of Imagination, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Kitcher, P., 1990. Kant's Transcendental Psychology, New York: Oxford University Press.
- –––, 2011. Kant's Thinker, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Kuehn, M., 2001. Kant: A Biography, Cambridge and New York: Cambridge University Press.
- Kukla, R. (ed.), 2006. Aesthetics and Cognition in Kant's Critical Philosophy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press
- Laywine, A., 1993. Kant's Early Metaphysics and the Origins of the Critical Philosophy (North American Kant Society Studies in Philosophy, Vol. 3), Rochester NA: North American Kant Society
- Louden, R., 2011. Kant's Human Being: Essays on His Theory of Human Nature, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Meerbote, R., 1989. “Kant's functionalism,” in J. C.Smith (ed.), Historical Foundations of Cognitive Science, Dordrecht, Holland: Reidel.
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Kant on the Web and most of the other sites listed below link to many other sites.
- Kant on the Web, maintained by Steve Palmquist, Hong Kong Baptist University. Contains a bibliography of English translations of Kant up to 2007 and much, much else.
- Immanuel Kant, from EpistemeLinks, contains links to other sites on Kant.
- North American Kant Society.
- Kant Lexicon, maintained by G.J. Mattey, University of California, Davis, contains much more than a lexicon of Kant's technical terms.