Natural Theology and Natural Religion

First published Mon Jul 6, 2015

The term “natural religion” is sometimes taken to refer to a pantheistic doctrine according to which nature itself is divine. “Natural theology”, by contrast, originally referred to (and still sometimes refers to)[1] the project of arguing for the existence of God on the basis of observed natural facts.

In contemporary philosophy, however, both “natural religion” and “natural theology” typically refer to the project of using the cognitive faculties that are “natural” to human beings—reason, sense-perception, introspection—to investigate religious or theological matters. Natural religion or theology, on the present understanding, is not limited to empirical inquiry into nature, and it is not wedded to a pantheistic result. It does, however, avoid appeals to special non-natural faculties (ESP, telepathy, mystical experience) or supernatural sources of information (sacred texts, revealed theology, creedal authorities, direct supernatural communication). In general, natural religion or theology (hereafter “natural theology”) aims to adhere to the same standards of rational investigation as other philosophical and scientific enterprises, and is subject to the same methods of evaluation and critique.

Philosophers and religious thinkers across almost every epoch and tradition (Near Eastern, African, Asian, and European) have engaged the project of natural theology, either as proponents or critics. The question of whether natural theology is a viable project is at the root of some of the deepest religious divisions: Shiite thinkers are optimistic about reason’s ability to prove various theological and ethical truths, for instance, while Sunnis are not; Roman Catholic theologians typically think that reason can demonstrate the existence of God, while many Protestant theologians do not. Unlike most of the topics discussed in an encyclopedia of philosophy, this is one over which wars have been fought and throats have been cut.

The most active discussions of natural theology in the West occurred during the high medieval period (roughly 1100–1400 C.E.) and the early modern period (1600–1800 C.E.). The past few decades have witnessed a revival of debate in the public sphere: there are now institutes promoting “Intelligent Design Theory”, popular apologetics courses, campus debates between believers and agnostics, a “New Atheist” movement, Youtube debates between pastors and atheistic apologists regarding new books in natural theology (such as the one between Nathan Lewis and Bernie Dehler on the Blackwell Companion to Natural Theology),[2] and TED talks by famous atheists on resisting natural religion (such as the one by Richard Dawkins in February 2002).[3]

Among professional philosophers (who aren’t typically part of these more popular debates), arguments over our ability to justify positive or negative answers to religious questions have become fairly technical, often employing sophisticated logical techniques in an effort to advance the discussion instead of retreading the same old ground. The prestigious Gifford Lectures series hosted by a consortium of Scottish universities, however, has tried to feature new but still accessible work in natural theology for over 100 years (it too has a Youtube channel!)[4]

In this article, we aim to avoid most the more recent complexities but also explain their origins by focusing on some central developments in the early modern period that helped to frame contemporary natural theological debates.

1. Prolegomenal Considerations

Theologians often follow Kant’s example and address various “prolegomena” or preliminary questions before trying to do any substantive metaphysics. These include questions about the semantics of religious speech and the ability that we do (or do not) have to access religious truths.

1.1 Religious Language and Concepts

We will use the term “natural theologian” to refer to someone who aims to use ordinary human cognitive faculties (reason, sense-perception, introspection) to establish positive truths about God. Such a person presupposes that sentences in human language (or at least sentences in the language of human thought) can express some theological truths, even if other such truths are beyond us.

Critics of natural theology sometimes challenge these semantic presuppositions. They provide reasons to think that our thoughts, concepts, or words are incapable of referring adequately to the transcendent entities that play an important role in many religious doctrines—entities such as Judaism’s YHWH, Neo-Platonism’s One, Vedanta’s Brahman, Mormonism’s Heavenly Father, and so on. The debate surrounding these issues is often designated “the problem of religious language”, but it is usually as much about human concepts as it is about sentences in actual languages.

In the western tradition, there have been a few periods of especially active discussion of this problem. The Neo-Platonic era was one (see the discussion of negative theology in the entry on Plotinus), the high medieval period (1100–1400 or so) was another, the Enlightenment movement in 17th–18th century Europe (especially the empiricist portion of it) was a third. More recent discussions have involved both analytic and continental figures: A.J. Ayer, Ludwig Wittgenstein, Martin Heidegger, Antony Flew, Norman Malcolm, Emmanuel Levinas, and William P. Alston have each discussed, in very different ways, the question of whether and how our language might succeed in referring to transcendent entities. Since the 1970s, however, when analytic philosophers turned away from a focus on language to a revival of metaphysics, the “problem of religious language” has been less prominent.

1.2 Rational Access

In addition to questions about what religious language refers to and how (if at all) religious concepts apply, the natural theologian faces another set of preliminary questions about our ability to generate sound arguments about such entities or facts. Our sense-perceptual and rational faculties are clearly limited and fallible. There are presumably many facts about the natural universe that we are incapable of understanding due to their complexity or inaccessibility. So why should we think that our natural faculties can deliver truths about even more remote or transcendent entities?

A related question concerns whether natural theology exhausts the domain of truths which we could even in principle have access. Some practitioners (call them rationalists) argue that only propositions that can be justified by unaided human reason are candidates for permissible belief. Others (call them hybridists) allow that our natural faculties can take us a certain distance—to knowledge of the basic nature and even existence of God, say—but argue that we must ultimately appeal to faith when it comes to more specific doctrines regarding the divine nature, acts, and intentions. This is the canonical Roman Catholic position on faith and reason developed in authors such as Augustine, Anselm, Aquinas, and revived in the natural scientific context of the Renaissance by Catalan scholar Raymond Sebond (1385–1436). Sebond’s Latin work, Theologia Naturalis (1434–1436), became famous when Michel de Montaigne translated it into French in 1569 and made it the subject of the longest of his renowned Essays (‘Apology for Raymond Sebond’), in 1580.

There are many kinds of hybridists: while they all think a turn to faith is necessary at some point, some seek to establish little more than the bare existence of God before turning to faith for greater details. Others think it is possible to develop a more robust understanding of God from within the bounds of reason and sense-perception. Indeed, in recent years the so-called “ramified natural theology” movement has sought to use our natural faculties to demonstrate (or show to be highly probable) robust doctrines that go well beyond bare theism—for example, specifically Christian doctrines such as that of the Trinity, the resurrection, or the historical authenticity of certain miracles or biblical prophecies (Swinburne 2003; Newman et al. 2003; Gauch Jr. 2011; see section 4 below).

Opponents of natural religion or theology, by contrast, deny that reason or our other ordinary capacities can justify religious beliefs. Some of these opponents are fideists (e.g., on some readings, Tertullian, Blaise Pascal, Pierre Bayle, J.G. Hamann, and Søren Kierkegaard) who hold these same beliefs as articles of faith rather than as teachings of reason (see the entry on fideism). Pascal, for instance, was a preeminent mathematician with strong interests in natural theology, but ultimately concluded (during what he called a “night of fire” in November 1654) that unaided reason is more likely to lead us to the false god “of philosophers and scholars” than to the true “God of Abraham, God of Isaac, God of Jacob”. The 20th century Reformed theologian Karl Barth opposed natural theology for much the same reason, and made his opposition to Emil Brunner’s version of the hybridist project clear in a book titled simply “Nein!” (Barth 1934). In his Gifford Lectures, contemporary theologian Stanley Hauerwas espouses a fideistic view in the tradition of Pascal and Barth but claims (somewhat perversely) that his project (which incorporates biblical texts and specifically Christian doctrines) is one in “natural theology” all the same (Hauerwas 2001: 15ff).

Other opponents of natural theology are agnostics who do not find the fideist’s turn to faith appealing. They deny that our natural faculties succeed in justifying any positive or negative substantial (i.e., non-analytic) theistic beliefs, and consequently suspend belief. Agnostics differ, however, as to whether unaided reason could in principle but does not in fact justify such beliefs (thus Bertrand Russell’s famous response to a question about what he would say if he were to die and then confront God on judgment day: “not enough evidence, God, not enough evidence!”) or whether our unaided faculties are not even in principle adequate to the task.

Still other opponents of natural theology are atheists. Atheists agree with fideists and agnostics that our natural faculties cannot establish the existence of God or other religious entities. But that’s because they think those faculties provide reasons to believe that such entities do not exist at all (see the entry on atheism and agnosticism). One such reason is the negative one that we cannot produce any sound arguments for theistic claims. But atheists also often maintain that there are positive reasons to believe that God does not exist—the incoherence of the concept of God, for instance, or the incompatibility of God’s existence and the existence of horrendous suffering and evil (see the entry on the problem of evil).

There are many ways to approach a survey of natural theology. Here we have chosen to focus largely on the classic historical discussions, and in particular on the debates in the Enlightenment (17th–18th century) period. We will consider versions of the two basic kinds of positive argument in favor of religious theses: a priori arguments and a posteriori arguments. There are species of each of these.

2. A priori arguments

2.1 Ontological arguments

A priori arguments are those that do not require an appeal to particular sense-perceptual experiences in order to justify their conclusions. Immanuel Kant gave the name “ontological” to a priori arguments that aim to prove the existence of an object from a concept or an idea of that object (see entry on ontological arguments). But the argument over whether such a strategy can establish the existence of God began well before Kant’s time.

2.1.1 Saint Anselm of Canterbury (1033–1109)

An early and now-canonical formulation of the ontological argument is found in the second book of St. Anselm’s Proslogion (Anselm 1077–78). Anselm begins by characterizing God as the “being than which none greater can be thought” and then seeks to show that such a being does and indeed must exist.

Anselm’s argument can be reconstructed in various ways (see entry on Saint Anselm), but here is one:

  1. By “God” we understand something than which nothing greater can be thought. [premise]
  2. When we understand the term “God”, God is in the understanding. [premise]
  3. Therefore, something than which nothing greater can be thought is in the understanding. [by (1) and (2)]
  4. What is in the understanding and in reality is greater than what is in the understanding alone. [premise]
  5. Therefore, God exists in the understanding and in reality. [by (3) and (4)]

In support of (2), Anselm notes that

[T]he fool has said in his heart that “There is no God”. But when this same Fool hears me say “something than which nothing greater can be thought”, he surely understands what he hears; and what he understands exists in his understanding, even if he does not understand that it exists [in reality]. (Anselm 81–2)

So according to Anselm, even the “foolish” atheist understands the term “God” when he argues that God does not exist. By this Anselm simply means that the atheist has the idea of God, and thus has God “in his understanding”.

(4) presupposes that things can exist in a number of different ways or modes. One of those ways is as the object of an idea—i.e., existence “in the understanding”. Another way for it to exist is “in reality”. (4) articulates a comparative value judgment about these ways of existing: it is greater for something to exist in both ways than it is to exist merely in the first way.

In order to deduce (5) from (3) and (4), Anselm uses a reductio ad absurdum argument:

And surely that than which a greater cannot be thought cannot exist only in the understanding. For if it exists only in the understanding, it can be thought to exist in reality as well, which is greater. (Anselm 82)

More explicitly:

  1. Suppose a certain being, B1, is conceived of as God is in the proof, and B1 is in the understanding alone. [supposition for reductio]
  2. But we can conceive of another being, B2, that is exactly like B1, except that B2 exists in reality as well as in the understanding. [introspection]
  3. Thus, B2 is greater than B1. [by (4)]
  4. It is impossible to conceive of a being that is greater than B1. [by (a) and (1)]
  5. Contradiction. [by (c) and (d)]
  6. Therefore, (a) is false: If B1 is conceived of as God is in the proof, then B1 must exist in reality as well as in the understanding. [by (e)]

Philosophers and theologians have made numerous efforts to revive or demolish Anselm’s argument over the centuries. The most influential proponents include René Descartes, Gottfried Leibniz, Charles Hartshorne, Norman Malcolm, Robert M. Adams, and Alvin Plantinga. Its main detractors include Anselm’s contemporaneous interlocutor—a monk named Gaunilo—as well as Thomas Aquinas, Descartes’ correspondents Johannes Caterus, Marin Mersenne, and Antoine Arnauld, Immanuel Kant, and, more recently, David Lewis (1970), Peter van Inwagen (1977), and Graham Oppy (1996, 2009). In what follows, a number of the relevant moves in the early modern discussion will be considered, as well as some contemporary developments of the 17th century modal argument.

2.1.2 René Descartes (1596–1650)

Descartes’ ontological argument, first presented in the Fifth Meditation, aims to prove the existence of God from the idea of God (Descartes 1641, cited below from the edition by Adam and Tannery (1962–1976) and referred to as “AT”). Here is one way to formulate the argument (compare Pereboom 1996, 2010; for alternatives see the entry on Descartes’ Ontological Argument):

  1. When I have an idea of an object, the object really has whatever characteristics I clearly and distinctly understand it to have. (premise)
  2. I have an idea of God in which I clearly and distinctly understand God to be the maximally perfect being. (premise)
  3. Therefore, God has all perfections. [by (1) and (2)]
  4. Everlasting existence is a perfection. (premise)
  5. Therefore, God has everlasting existence. [by (3) and (4)]
  6. Therefore, God exists. [by (5)] (AT 7.63–71)

One prominent way of resisting this argument is to reduce it to absurdity by appeal to “parity of reasoning”. Johannes Caterus, for instance, objected to Descartes that by a precisely parallel form of reasoning we could prove the real existence of the object of an idea of an existent lion (AT 7.99). Gaunilo’s reply to Anselm centuries earlier was similar: by parity of reasoning, one can prove the existence in reality (and not just in the understanding) of the maximally perfect island (Anselm 102).

The objection aims to show that, like the idea God, the idea of the existent lion and the idea of the maximally perfect island include existence, and thus the existence of these objects can be established via an ontological argument. But the claim that the existence of Caterus’s lion and Gaunilo’s island can be established in this way is absurd, and thus the same holds for the theistic ontological argument. Note that this parity argument via a reductio ad absurdum, if successful, would show that the ontological argument is unsound, but without indicating which premise or which step in the reasoning is at fault.

A second objection, anticipated by Descartes in the Fifth Meditation, is that truly predicating a property of something without indicating any conditions or intentional contexts seems already to presume that the thing exists. So if we say that “Obama is President of the USA” is true, it follows that Obama exists. As a result, “Pegasus is a winged horse” is strictly-speaking false, though by using the intentional context “according to the myth” we can say, truly, that “According to the myth, Pegasus is a winged horse”. This suggests that premise (3) above is in trouble: it may be that Descartes can legitimately claim only something like “According to the idea of God, God has all perfections”, or, equivalently, “If God exists, then God has all perfections”. But then all that follows in step (6) is the unspectacular conclusion that “According to the idea of God, God exists”, or, equivalently, “If God exists, then God exists”.

A third problem, raised in the Second Objections by Father Marin Mersenne, is that the argument would be sound only if a maximally perfect being is really possible (or, equivalently, only if there is a genuine divine essence). But this, Mersenne complains, has not been established (AT 7.127). (Side note: Gaunilo and Mersenne are good examples of how devout theists might still take issue with certain kinds of efforts to prove God’s existence.)

Descartes’ reply to these objections involves the notion of a “true and immutable nature” (“TIN”) (AT 7.101ff.). Only some of our ideas are ideas of things that have TINs. Moreover, TINs themselves exist in some way, although they need not exist in concrete or empirical reality. Maybe they are abstract objects, like numbers or sets (Descartes explicitly compares them to Plato’s Forms). In any case, the kind of existence TINs have is sufficient to undermine the second objection above: the divine essence—God’s nature—is a true and immutable nature, and thus we do not need to prefix anything like the phrase “According to the idea of God” to premise (3). Rather, we can clearly and distinctly perceive that God’s nature is a TIN, and then say simply that “God has all perfections”. And that would then make the inference to (6) a valid one.

Descartes’ challenge then is to show that God’s nature is a TIN and that the natures of an “existent lion” and “the maximally perfect island” are not. In the Fifth Meditation Descartes maintains that TINs are different from fictitious ideas in that TINs are in some sense independent of the thought of their conceivers. For example, the nature of a triangle is a TIN because it contains properties that we don’t grasp when we first form the idea of a triangle, and deducing these further properties is a process “more like discovery than creation”. God’s nature also has this feature—we obviously don’t grasp all of the properties of the maximally perfect being when we first form an idea of it. The problem, however, is that it is not clear how this criterion would rule out the natures of a most perfect island or an existent lion.

Later, Descartes (AT 7.83–4) characterizes a TIN as having a unity such that it cannot be divided by the intellect. He thinks that having this feature shows that is hasn’t been simply put together by the intellect or imagination, and is thus a genuine nature. Accordingly, the idea of an existent lion does not correspond to a TIN because I can coherently conceive of a lion that doesn’t exist. As for the maximally perfect island, I can conceive of it having fewer coconut trees but one more mango tree, and so on. But although Descartes does not seem to recognize this, it also seems that I can conceive of an omnipotent being that is lacking maximal benevolence. So by this standard it appears that the idea of God also fails to correspond to a true and immutable nature.

To the third problem, concerning the real possibility of God, Descartes replies that our clear and distinct ideas of TINs—produced in us by reason—are reliable. Since we can (supposedly) see clearly and distinctly that there is no contradiction in our idea of God’s nature, the denial that God is possible is on equal footing with the denial that the angles of a triangle are equal to two right angles (AT 7.150–1).

2.1.3 Gottfried Leibniz (1646–1716)

Leibniz takes on several difficulties for Descartes’ ontological argument (in, e.g., Leibniz 1676 [1969]: 167–8; 1677 [1969]: 177–80; 1684 [1969]: 292–3; 1692 [1969]: 386; 1678 [1989]: 237–39; 1699 [1989]: 287–88; Adams 1994: 135–56). These can be grouped as follows:

  1. that the claim that the essence of a most perfect being includes its existence—that existence is a perfection—hasn’t been substantiated;
  2. that all this argument can establish is the conditional “If an object of the concept of God exists, then God exists”; and
  3. that the real possibility of a most perfect being cannot be demonstrated

In several places Leibniz addresses (A) by arguing that by “God” we understand a necessary being, and from this it just follows that the essence of God involves existence. In this way we supposedly avoid altogether the premise that existence is a perfection. (One wonders, however, whether the argument for including “necessary existence” in the idea of God will need to rely on the premise that necessary existence is a perfection.)

In some writings Leibniz bypasses problem (B) by presenting an argument with a different conditional as its conclusion:

  1. If there is a divine essence, then the divine essence involves necessary existence. [premise]
  2. If God is a possible being, then there is a divine essence. [premise]
  3. If God is a possible being, then the divine essence involves necessary existence. [by (1), (2)]
  4. If God is a possible being, then God necessarily exists. [by (3)]
  5. Therefore, if God is a possible being, then God actually exists. [by (4)]

What has yet to be dealt with, clearly, is Mersenne’s problem above—namely, (C), that the real possibility of a most perfect being cannot be demonstrated. Leibniz offers several types of arguments against this. One relies on the fact that other things are clearly possible, together with the claim that only a necessary being provides a satisfactory ground or explanation for the possible existence of contingent beings. So on the assumption that contingent beings possibly exist, it must be at least possible for a necessary God to exist (for more on this kind of argument from possibility, see section 2.3 below).

A second type of Leibnizean argument for God’s real possibility returns to the thesis that God is the most perfect being, and adds that perfections are positive and simple, unanalyzable qualities. So, for example, consider any proposition of the form “A and B are incompatible”, where A and B are any two perfections. Two properties are incompatible only if they are logically incompatible, according to Leibniz. Thus “A and B are incompatible” will be true only if one of these perfections turns out to be the negation of the other (as in omniscient and non-omniscient), or if their analyses reveal simpler properties, one of which is a negation of another. But on the assumption that all the divine perfections are positive, simple, and thus unanalyzable, neither of these scenarios can obtain. Consequently, “A and B are compatible” will always be true for any two perfections, and thus a being with all perfections will be really possible (Leibniz 1678 [1989]: 238–39; Adams 1994: 142–48).

A third Leibnizean response to Mersenne’s objection is that it is rational to presume the real possibility of the things we can conceive, at least until their impossibility has been demonstrated.

2.1.4 Immanuel Kant (1724–1804)

Kant’s most famous criticism of the ontological argument is encapsulated in his claim that “existence” (or “exists”) is not a “real predicate” (Kant 1781/1787: A592/B619ff). Alternatively, “existence” is not “a predicate that is added to the concept of the subject and enlarges it” (A598/B626). Kant’s idea here is that since “existence” is not a real predicate, existing cannot be one of God’s necessary perfections.

One way to interpret the objection is as follows:

  1. Suppose A and B are two entities, and A is greater than B at t1. [premise]
  2. If B becomes as great as A at t2, then B changes. [by (1)]
  3. For every entity x, if x changes, then:
    1. there is a time t1 at which x has (or lacks) some property P, and
    2. there is a later time t2 at which x lacks (or has) P as a result of x’s acting or being acted upon. [premise]
  4. For every entity x, if x comes into existence in reality, conditions (3a) and (3b) are not satisfied. [premise]
  5. Therefore, when an entity comes into existence in reality, it doesn’t change. [by (3), (4)]
  6. Therefore, B cannot become as great as A solely in virtue of B’s coming into existence in reality. [by (2), (5)]
  7. Therefore, A cannot be greater than B solely in virtue of existing in reality. [by (6)]

(4) is the key premise in this formulation—does coming into existence involve a genuine change? There is clearly a technical sense in which saying that a concept applies to something does not enlarge the concept or change our conception of the being it refers to. But it might still remain open that a being that has all perfections but does not exist is not as great as a being that has all perfections and also exists.

Finally, Kant’s objection can perhaps be avoided altogether by proposing that the perfection at issue is necessary existence, and not mere existence. Adding necessary existence to our concept of a being would presumably involve changing it (and thus enlarging its concept). This is effectively a modal version of the ontological argument (see section 2.1.5).

Kant’s most pressing criticism, in our view, goes back to the issue raised by Mersenne: we cannot determine whether God (conceived as having necessary existence or not) is really possible. Kant grants to Leibniz that the notion of a most perfect being may not involve a logical contradiction, but he argues that this is not enough to show that it is really possible, for there are ways of being impossible that do not involve logical contradictions (A602/B630). The implication for the ontological argument is that we cannot know whether it is really possible for the divine perfections to be jointly exemplified even if we know that they involve no contradiction,

for how can my reason presume to know how the highest realities operate, what effects would arise from them, and what sort of relation all these realities would have to each other? (Kant 1830, 1015–16)

2.1.5 Contemporary Modal Versions

Versions of the ontological argument discussed by Leibniz and Kant have been elaborated by Robert M. Adams (1971), Alvin Plantinga (1979), Peter van Inwagen (1977, 2009) and others. These versions employ contemporary modal semantics and metaphysics to motivate the following two assumptions:

(Assumption 1):
“It’s possible that God exists” means “there is some possible world in which God exists”.
(Assumption 2):
“God necessarily exists” means “God exists in every possible world” (i.e., “there is no possible world in which God doesn’t exist”).

The argument then proceeds as follows:

  1. It’s possible that God exists. [premise]
  2. Therefore, God exists in some possible world (call it w*). [by (1), (Assumption 1)]
  3. If God exists, then God necessarily exists. [by definition of “God”]
  4. Therefore, in w* God necessarily exists. [by (2), (3)]
  5. Therefore, in w* God is such that God exists in every possible world [by (4), (Assumption 2)]
  6. The actual world is one of the possible worlds [premise]
  7. Therefore, in w* God is such that God exists in the actual world [by (5), (6)]
  8. Therefore, God exists in the actual world [by (7)]

Critics have resisted numerous aspects of the argument (for comprehensive discussion, see Oppy 1996). The inference to (7), for instance, assumes that the actual world is possible relative to w*. But that assumption is only legitimate on some models of how modal talk works. Thus, the critic claims, it hasn’t been shown that w* has the relation to the actual world that licenses the conclusion that God actually exists.

The most significant disagreement, however, is again the one that Mersenne raised against Descartes. How can the possibility claim in (1) be justified? Adams (1994: ch.8) claims that we are rationally permitted, in the absence of strong reasons to the contrary, to presume the real possibility of most things, including God. Others argue that no such presumption of possibility is justified, especially regarding supersensible things.

2.2 The argument from necessary truths

Leibniz’s argument for God’s existence from the existence of the necessary truths crucially involves the premises that all truths must be true in virtue of something distinct from them (they need what contemporary metaphysicans sometimes call a “truth-maker”). Since necessary truths would be true even if there were no finite minds to think them, such truths cannot be true in virtue of facts about human psychology. Against the Platonic suggestion that they are true in virtue of Forms existing outside of any mind whatsoever, Leibniz argues that some of the truths are about abstract entities, which are not the kinds of things that could have mind-independent existence. The only contender that remains, then, is that these truths are true in virtue of the ideas in an infinite and necessarily existent (divine) mind (Leibniz 1714 [1969]: 647; Adams 1994: 177ff.).

Leibniz’s argument stakes out one position on the grounding of necessary truths, but there are many rival and contending views that do not invoke the existence of a necessary, concrete divine being. A Platonist might respond by claiming that it hasn’t been shown that abstract entities do not have mind-independent existence, while Humeans would argue that necessary truths are all analytic, and that therefore only the structure of language or of our conceptual scheme is required to ground their truth.

2.3 The argument from possibility

A third sort of a priori proof argues from facts about the mere possibility of something (or of some collection of things) to the existence of a “ground of possibility” that somehow explains them. An early version of such an argument can be found in Augustine and the Neo-Platonic tradition, but the canonical presentations of this sort of “possibility proof” are in Leibniz’s Monadology (1714) and, much more elaborately, in Kant’s book-length treatise called The Only Possible Basis for a Demonstration of the Existence of God (1763). Note that if the truths about what is possible are necessary truths, as they indeed seem to be, then this might be a more specific version of the argument from necessary truths (see 2.2).

Kant’s version of the argument is based on the claim that there are real possibilities that are not grounded in the principle of non-contradiction, but that nevertheless must have a ground or explanation (Kant 1763 [1902–], 2: 63ff). If they are not grounded in the principle of non-contradiction, then they are not grounded in God’s thinking them rather than their negation, which is how Leibniz had proposed that all such possibilities are grounded. Put the other way around, Kant thinks that some impossibilities are grounded not in the law of non-contradiction, but in a non-logical kind of “real repugnance” between two or more of their properties. Kant maintains, for instance, that it is impossible for a material being to be conscious, even though no logical contradiction exists between material and conscious (Kant 1763 [1902–], 2: 85–6). It follows that this impossibility is not grounded in divine thought, for God can think any proposition that does not involve a contradiction. So facts about some real possibilities and real impossibilities can only be grounded in a necessary being that somehow exemplifies (rather than merely thinking) every combination of fundamental properties whose joint exemplification is possible. That being, of course, is supposed to be God. (For discussion, see Fisher and Watkins 1998; Adams 2000; Chignell 2009, 2012, 2014; Stang 2010; Abaci 2014; Yong 2014).

One way out of this argument is simply to claim that some real possibilities are primitive or ungrounded. This appears to be an option for Kant in his critical period insofar as he is no longer committed to rationalist principles such as the Principle of Sufficient Reason. Still, even in his critical period (i.e., after 1770 or so), Kant never repudiated the earlier proof—and supposedly claimed in a lecture from the 1780s that it “can in no way be refuted” (Kant 1830, 1034). This suggests that in his critical period Kant still held that God’s existence is the only available ground for real possibility, but that the explanatory point may justify at most a kind of theoretical belief (Glaube) rather than full demonstrative knowledge (see Chignell 2007).

3. A posteriori Arguments

3.1 The classical cosmological argument

An a posteriori argument involves at least one premise whose justification essentially appeals to some sort of empirical fact or experience. The main demonstrative a posteriori argument is what Kant dubbed “the cosmological argument”. It is motivated by the familiar question “Why is there something rather than nothing?” and goes from the empirical fact of the existence of something (or of the cosmos as a whole, perhaps) to the existence of a first cause or ground of that cosmos that is, at least in part, not identical to that cosmos. Cosmological arguments of this sort are found across almost every human philosophical tradition, and find prominence in the West in the writings of Aristotle, numerous medieval Islamic authors, Maimonides, Aquinas, Locke, Leibniz, Samuel Clarke, and David Hume. Here again we will focus largely on the early modern period.

Leibniz’s cosmological argument aims to demonstrate the existence of God from the need to explain certain facts about the actual world. For Leibniz the world is the collection of all the actual contingent beings -- that is, all of the actual beings whose existence is possible but not necessary (Leibniz 1714 [1969]: 646).

Leibniz’s cosmological argument overcomes an important hurdle for earlier versions, such as the Kaläm cosmological argument (Craig 2000), since Leibniz’s does not assume or argue that the world has a beginning in time (a claim that detractors might well dispute, but for which some, such as Craig (2000), have argued). Suppose that in fact the world has no beginning in time, and that each being in the world has an explanation in some previously existing being(s). Two demands for explanation might still arise: Why is there a world at all rather than none? and: Why does this world exist and not some other world? Neither explanation can be provided on the basis of entities within the world (or within time). Leibniz’s conclusion is that there must be a being that is not merely hypothetically, but absolutely necessary, and whose own explanation is contained within itself. This being is God. (A similar cosmological argument is advanced around the same time by Samuel Clarke (1705), see also the entry on Samuel Clarke).

David Hume advances three objections to the type of cosmological argument offered by Leibniz and Clarke (Hume 1779, Part IX, and entry on Hume on religion). The first is that the notion of (absolutely) necessary existence is problematic. Suppose that some being is absolutely necessary—then its nonexistence should be absolutely inconceivable. But, says Hume, for any being whose existence we can conceive, we can also conceive its nonexistence, and thus there isn’t a necessary being. Hume anticipates the objection that if we truly understood the divine nature, we would be unable to conceive God’s nonexistence. He replies that an analogous point can be made about matter: for all we know, if we truly understood the nature of matter, we would be unable to conceive its nonexistence. This would show that the existence of matter is not contingent after all, and that it does not require an external explanation. Thus the cosmological argument cannot establish that God is the necessary being who is responsible for the rest of the cosmos.

Hume’s second objection is that God cannot be the causal explanation for the existence of a series of contingent beings that has no temporal beginning, since any causal relation “implies a priority in time and a beginning of existence” (Part IV). In reply, it seems quite possible to conceive of a non-temporal causal relation, and thus to conceive of God, from outside of time, causing a series of contingent beings that has always existed. Indeed, this view is common in the theological tradition. Similarly, Kant and various contemporary metaphysicians think we can coherently conceive of a relation of simultaneous causation. If this is right, then even a God who is in time could ground the existence of a series of contingent beings with no temporal beginning.

Hume’s third objection is that in a causal series of contingent beings without a temporal beginning, each being will have a causal explanation by virtue of its predecessors. Since there is no first being, there will be a causal explanation for every contingent being on the basis of previously existing contingent beings. However, if each individual contingent being has a causal explanation, then the entire causal series has an explanation. For wholes are nothing over and above their parts:

did I show you the particular causes of each individual in a collection of twenty particles of matter, I should think it very unreasonable should you afterwards ask me what was the cause of the whole twenty. (Part IV)

A reply to this last objection might be that even if one has explained in this way the existence of each individual in the contingent series, one still has not answered the two questions mentioned earlier: Why is there a world at all rather than none? and: Why does this world exist and not some other world? (for more discussion, see Rowe 1975; Pruss 2006).

Kant, too, objects to the cosmological argument, but mainly on the grounds that it delivers an object that is inadequate to the classical conception of God. Any effort to turn the ultimate ground into the most perfect of all beings, Kant says, will have to smuggle in some sort of ontological argument (see Pasternack 2001; Forgie 2003; Proops 2014; and entry Kant’s philosophy of religion).

In general, objections to the cosmological argument (both historical and contemporary) take one of the following forms:

  1. not every fact requires explanation, and the fact that the cosmological arguer is pointing to is one of those;
  2. each being in the cosmos has an explanation, but the cosmos as an entire series does not require an additional explanation, over and above the explanations of each member of the series;
  3. the sort of explanation required to explain the empirical data cited by the cosmological arguer does not amount to a supernatural explanation (e.g., the Big Bang could suffice);
  4. the sort of explanation required to explain the empirical data cited by the cosmological arguer is not going to deliver anything as august as the God of traditional religious doctrine but rather, in Hume’s terms, a somewhat “mediocre deity”.

3.2 Teleological or design arguments

The Greek word “telos” means “end” or “purpose”. The a posteriori arguments in natural theology that are referred to as “teleological” claim that the natural world displays some sort of purposive or end-directed design, and that this licenses the conclusion that the natural world has some sort of very powerful and intelligent designer (see entry on teleological arguments for God’s existence). Earlier authors dubbed this sort of non-demonstrative, inductive argument a “physico-theological” argument (see, e.g., William Derham 1713).

Teleological arguments are often associated with William Paley (1743–1805), although in fact this type of argument has a much longer history (see Taliaferro 2005). The fact that Paley’s 1802 book was called Natural Theology is no doubt part of why natural theology as a whole is sometimes equated with the a posteriori investigations of nature for the purposes of supporting religious theses. In Paley’s famous analogy, the relationship between a watch and a watch-maker is taken to be saliently similar to the relationship between the natural world and its author. If we were to go walking upon the heath and stumble upon a watch, a quick examination of its inner workings would reveal, with a high probability, that “its several parts were framed and put together for a purpose” by what must have been “an intelligence” (1802: 1–6). Likewise with nature as a whole.

A different kind of teleological argument is developed by George Berkeley (1685–1753), for whom natural, physical objects do not exist independently of minds, but consist solely in ideas. Given the regularity, complexity, and involuntariness of our sensory ideas, their source (Berkeley argues) must be an infinitely powerful, benevolent mind that produces these ideas in us in a lawlike fashion. God’s existence can also be demonstrated from the harmony and beauty that the ideas of the world display (Berkeley 1710: §146). Since according to Berkeley our ordinary experience is a type of direct divine communication with us, our relationship with God is in this respect especially intimate. Thus he frequently remarks, quoting St. Paul, that “in God we live and move and have our being” (Acts 17:28).

3.2.1 Hume on the teleological argument

Hume’s Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion pre-date Paley, of course, but they feature an especially influential and elegant critical discussion of teleological arguments (1779), a discussion of which Paley was no doubt aware. Hume’s argument can be formulated as follows (compare Pereboom 1996, 2010):

  1. Nature is a great machine, composed of lesser machines, all of which exhibit order (especially adaptation of means to ends). [premise]
  2. Machines caused by human minds exhibit order (especially adaptation of means to ends). [premise]
  3. Nature resembles machines caused by human minds. [by (1), (2)]
  4. If effects resemble each other, their causes resemble each other as well. [premise]
  5. The cause of nature resembles human minds. [by (3), (4)]
  6. Greater effects demand greater causes (causes adequate to the effects). [premise]
  7. Nature is much greater than machines caused by human minds. [premise]
  8. The cause of nature resembles but is much greater than human minds. [by (5), (6), (7)]
  9. The cause of nature is God. [by (8)]
  10. Therefore, God exists. [by (9)]

Hume’s objections to this argument include the claims that the analogies on which it is dependent are not exact, and thus that there are alternative explanations for order and apparent design in the universe. One response to these objections is that the teleological argument should be conceived as an argument to the best explanation, on the model of many scientific arguments. In that case the analogy need not be exact, but might still show that a theistic explanation is best. Indeed, even Hume, or at least his character Philo, concedes

that the works of nature bear a great analogy to the productions of art is evident; and according to all the rules of good reasoning, we ought to infer, if we argue at all concerning them, that their causes have a proportional analogy. (Part XII)

But Philo also affirms that we cannot infer any important similarities between humans and the author of nature beyond intelligence, and in particular we cannot infer some of the divine attributes that are most important for sustaining traditional theistic religion (Part V). Most significantly, given the evil that there is in the universe, we cannot conclude that its designer has the moral qualities traditional religion requires God to have (Part X). Thus, again, we are left with a rather “mediocre deity”.

One of Hume’s neglected objections to the teleological argument is that it generates an absurd infinite regress (Part IV). If order and apparent design in the material universe are explained by divine intelligence, what explains the order and apparent design that give rise to intelligence in the divine mind? By dint of the reasoning employed in the teleological argument, it would have to be a super-divine intelligence. But what explains the order and apparent design that give rise to super-divine intelligence? An absurd infinite regress results, and to avoid it one might well suppose the material world “contain[s] the principle of order within itself”.

To this Hume has the theist Cleanthes reply that

even in common life, if I assign a cause for any event, is it any objection that I cannot assign the cause of that cause, and answer every new question which may incessantly be started?

In scientific theorizing it is no decisive objection against an explanation that it contains entities that are themselves not adequately explained. Crucial to the value of scientific explanations is that they supply an explanatory advance, and we can reasonably believe that a theory does so without our having in hand adequate explanations for all of the entities it posits.

3.2.2 The teleological argument from fine-tuning

In recent decades, some natural theologians have developed an inductive argument for the existence of God that appeals to the fact that the values of various forces of nature appear to be “fine-tuned” for the existence of intelligent life. William Lane Craig (see e.g., Craig 1990, 2003) argues as follows. The world is conditioned principally by the values of the fundamental constants:

  • a: the fine structure constant, or electromagnetic interaction;
  • mn/me: proton to electron mass ratio;
  • aG: gravitation;
  • aw: the weak force; and
  • as: the strong force.

When one imagines different values to these constants or forces, one discovers that in fact the number of observable universes, that is to say, universes capable of supporting intelligent life, is very small. Just a slight variation in any one of these values would render life impossible. For example, if the strong force (as) were increased as much as 1%, nuclear resonance levels would be so altered that almost all carbon would be burned into oxygen; an increase of 2% would preclude formation of protons out of quarks, preventing the existence of atoms. Furthermore, weakening the strong force by as much as 5% would unbind deuteron, which is essential to stellar nucleosynthesis, leading to a universe composed only of hydrogen. It has been estimated that the strong force must be within 0.8 and 1.2 its actual strength or all elements of atomic weight greater than four would not have formed. Or again, if the weak force had been appreciably stronger, then the Big Bang’s nuclear burning would have proceeded past helium to iron, making fusion-powered stars impossible. But if it had been much weaker, then we should have had a universe entirely of helium. Or again, if gravitation aG had been a little greater, all stars would have been red dwarfs, which are too cold to support life-bearing planets. If it had been a little smaller, the universe would have been composed exclusively of blue giants, which burn too briefly for life to develop. This gives us reason to believe that there is an intelligent agent who fine-tuned the universe to precisely these levels.

A number of opponents press the following objection:

  • (1)We should not be surprised that we do not observe features of the universe that are incompatible with our own existence.

This is the “anthropic principle”—the idea is just that if the features of the universe were incompatible with our existence, we would not be here to notice it. Thus it is not surprising that we do not observe such features.

Craig replies by arguing that it does not follow from (1) that

  • (2)We should not be surprised that we do observe features of the universe that are compatible with our existence.

Here is his analogy. Suppose you are dragged before a firing squad of 100 trained marksmen, all of them with rifles aimed at your heart, to be executed. The command is given; you hear the deafening sound of the guns. And you observe that you are still alive, that all of the 100 marksmen missed! Now while it is true that

  • (3)You should not be surprised that you do not observe that you are dead,

it is equally true that

  • (4)You should be surprised that you do observe that you are alive.

Because the firing squad’s missing you altogether is extremely improbable, the surprise expressed in (4) is wholly appropriate, though you are not surprised that you do not observe that you are dead, since if you were dead you could not observe it. Similarly, while we should not be surprised that we do not observe features of the universe which are incompatible with our existence, it is nevertheless true that

  • (5)We should be surprised that we do observe features of the universe that are compatible with our existence

in view of the enormous improbability that the universe should possess such features.

John Leslie (2002) proposes that the hypothesis of multiple universes would provide the explanation demanded by (5) (although he is also an advocate of a fine-tuning argument). Here is his analogy (which involves guns again, oddly). You are alone at night in an extremely dark forest when a gun is fired from far away and you are hit. If you assume that there is no one out to get you, this would be surprising. But now suppose that you were not in fact alone, but instead part of a large crowd (which you do not see because it’s so dark). In that case, Leslie suggests, you would be less surprised at being shot, since it seems a least somewhat likely that a gunman would be trying to shoot someone in the crowd. Leslie suggests that this story supports the multiple universe explanation for the fact that the values of the fundamental forces of the universe appear fine-tuned for life.

Roger White (2000) argues that there is a problem with Leslie’s account. While the multiple-universe hypothesis would explain why there is some universe or other that is fine-tuned for life, since it would raise the probability of that hypothesis, it would not similarly explain why this universe is fine-tuned for life. He contends that supposing that the gunman was firing at random, being part of a large crowd explains—raises the probability—that someone or other is shot, but not that you are shot. By contrast, the hypothesis that the gunman was aiming at you, as opposed to firing at random, does explain in this way that you are shot. Similarly, the multiple universe hypothesis explains in this way that there is some universe or other that is fine-tuned for life, but not that this universe is fine-tuned for life. By contrast, the hypothesis of a designer does explain why—raises the probability—that this universe is fine-tuned for life. White argues:

Postulate as many other universes as you wish, they do not make it any more likely that ours should be life-permitting or that we should be here. So our good fortune to exist in a life-permitting universe gives us no reason to suppose that there are many universes. (White 2000: 274)

3.3 Arguments from religious experience

Arguments for the existence of God from a special kind of experience are often called “arguments from religious experience”. Some philosophers and theologians have argued that our ordinary human cognitive faculties include what John Calvin called a special “sense of divinity” that, when not impeded or blocked, will deliver immediately justified beliefs about supernatural entities (Plantinga 1981, 1984). Some such thinkers, then, might construe an argument from religious experience as belonging to the category of natural religion or natural theology. Others, however, insist that “characteristic of the Continental Calvinist tradition is a revulsion against arguments in favor of theism or Christianity” (Wolterstorff 1984: 7; see also Sudduth 2009). In any case, most authors who write about religious experience generally construe it as caused by something other than our ordinary faculties and their intersubjectively available objects, and thus do not think of it as one of the topics of natural theology (see Alston 1991).

4. “Ramified” Natural Theology

Some supporters of natural religion or natural theology seek to use our ordinary cognitive faculties to support theses that are more robust and specific than those of generic or “perfect-being” theism. This project has recently been dubbed “ramified” natural theology by Richard Swinburne (see Holder 2013). A few of these efforts involve a priori argumentation: an ancient argument for the Trinity (found in St. Augustine (De Trinitate, c. 399–419, Book IX), and Richard of St. Victor (De Trinitate, c. 1162–1173, III.1–25)) is that any supreme being would have to be a supremely loving being, and any omnipotent supremely loving being would ultimately have to emanate from itself something that is both other and yet just as supreme and lovable as itself, and that a third such person would be necessary as a kind of product of that love between the first two. More recently, Marilyn McCord Adams’s books on theodicy(Adams 2000, 2006) and Eleonore Stump’s Gifford Lectures (Stump 2010) constitute an effort to consider the a priori problem of evil from within the context of a ramified (and thus in this case more robustly Christian) kind of natural theology.

But most ramified natural theology is inductive in spirit: thus John Locke (1695) famously argued for the “Reasonableness of Christianity” using a broadly historical, probabilistic approach. William Paley (1794) further developed this approach, and much more recently the contemporary Lockean Richard Swinburne argued for the conclusion that Bayesian-style reasoning justifies belief in the resurrection of Jesus with a probability of 97% (Swinburne 2003). Numerous other philosophers (and also many natural scientists) appeal to historical and scientific data as well as empirical and statistical principles of reasoning to support the authenticity of various biblical claims, the probability of various miracle stories, and so forth (see e.g., Olding 1990; Polkinghorne 2009; Gauch Jr. 2011). Note that this is a way of appealing to the content of sacred texts and special revelation which is consistent with the methods of natural theology: the prophetic or historical claims of those texts are evaluated using public evidence and accepted canons of inductive reasoning. Still, even such optimistic natural theologians as Locke, Paley, Swinburne, and these others count as hybridists insofar as they think that there are some important doctrines about the divine or supernatural that cannot be justified by our natural cognitive faculties. Thus even they will at some point be willing (in Kant’s famous phrase) to “deny knowledge in order to leave room for faith”.


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Our thanks to Monica Burnett, Hugh Gauch, Chad McIntosh, and Alejandro Naranjo Sandoval for helpful feedback on earlier drafts of this entry.

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