Plato's Ethics: An Overview
Like other ancient philosophers, Plato maintains a virtue-based eudaemonistic conception of ethics. That is to say, human well-being (eudaimonia) is the highest aim of moral thought and conduct, and the virtues (aretê: ‘excellence’) are the requisite skills and dispositions needed to attain it. If Plato's conception of happiness is elusive and his support for a morality of happiness seems somewhat subdued, there are several reasons. First, his conception of happiness differs in significant ways from ordinary views. In his early works his approach is largely negative: Socratic questioning seems designed to undermine the traditional values rather than to develop a positive account of his own. Second, the positive accounts contained in his later works, especially that of the Republic, treat happiness as a state of perfection that is hard to comprehend because it is based on metaphysical presuppositions that seem both hazy and out of the realm of ordinary understanding. In other dialogues he confines himself to intimations of different aspects of what is good in and for the soul, intimations that are hard to fit together in a coherent picture. There is not, as there is in Aristotle, much talk about happiness as a self-sufficient state of the active individual. Third, in crucial texts Plato's moral ideals appear both austere and self-abnegating: the soul is to remain aloof from the pleasures of the body; communal life demands the subordination of individual wishes and aims.
The difficulties of assessing Plato's ethical thought are compounded by the fact that it was subject to various modifications during his long life. In Plato's early works, the so-called Socratic dialogues, there are no indications that the search for virtue and the human good goes beyond the human realm. This changes with a growing interest in an all-encompassing metaphysical grounding of knowledge in Plato's middle dialogues, a development that leads to the positing of the ‘Forms’, as the true nature of all things, culminating in the Form of the Good as the transcendent principle of all goodness. In addition, moral values presuppose an appropriate political order that can be maintained only by leaders with a rigorous philosophical training. Though the theory of the Forms is not confined to human values, but encompasses the whole of nature Plato at this point seems to assume no more than an analogy between human affairs and cosmic harmony. The late dialogues, by contrast, display a growing tendency to see a unity between the microcosm of human life and the macrocosmic order of the entire universe. Such holistic tendencies would seem to put the attainment of the requisite knowledge beyond the boundaries of human understanding. But although Plato's late works do not show any willingness to lower the standards of knowledge as such, he acknowledges that his design of a rational cosmic order is based on conjecture and speculation, an acknowledgement that finds its counterpart in his more pragmatic treatment of ethical standards and political institutions in his late work, the Laws. Finally: At no stage in Plato's philosophy is there a systematic treatment of and commitment to basic principles of ethics that would justify the derivation of rules and norms of human interaction in the way that is expected in modern discussions. Nor is there a fully fleshed-out depiction of the good life. Instead, Plato largely confines himself to the depiction of the good soul and the good for the soul, evidently on the assumption that the state of the soul is the condition of the good life, both necessary and sufficient to guarantee it. And given that his approaches in different dialogues vary, readers have to fit together what often looks like disparate pieces of information. This explains the widely diverging reconstructions of his intentions in the secondary literature from antiquity to this day.
- 1. Preliminaries
- 2. The early dialogues: Examining life
- 3. The middle period: Justice and other virtues
- 4. The later dialogues: Ethics and Dialectic
- 5. The late dialogues: Ethics and Cosmology
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If ethics is the most accessible branch of philosophy, it is so because many of its presuppositions seem to be truisms. To name just a few: All human actions serve some end or purpose. Whether these purposes are judged right or wrong depends on their overall aims. At least for secularists, the attainment of these overall aims constitutes the quality of life. What we regard as a life worth living depends on the notion we have of our own nature and of the conditions of its fulfillment. This in turn is determined, at least in part, by the society we live in, its values and standards. Personal ends and purposes in each case depend not only on reason, but also on the individual agents' dispositions, their likes and dislikes, that make up their character. In addition, attainment of these ends depends in part on external factors such as health, material prosperity, social status, or even good looks or sheer luck.
Self-evident as these truisms may appear, most of the time we are aware of them only implicitly. Human beings for the most part simply grow into a form of life with its pre-established standards and values. Under normal circumstances these standards are not objects of reflection or choice. It is only in times of crisis that a society's traditions are challenged by a Socrates, who sees the need to disturb his fellows' complacency. The historical Socrates was, of course, not the first to question the Greek way of life. Presocratic philosophers such as Heraclitus or Xenophanes had been critics of their times, and the sophists had argued that, contrary to the naïve view, it is custom and convention, rather than nature that set the standards for what is deemed right or wrong, good or bad, in every society. But if other thinkers had preceded Socrates with moral and social criticism, he was certainly the first to challenge his fellows on an individual basis on the ground that ‘the unexamined life is not worth living’ (Ap. 38a). Whatever position one may take in the controversy concerning the degree to which Plato's early dialogues are true to the historical Socrates' discussions, there can be little doubt that the latter's cross-examinations (elenchos) provoked the kind of enmity that led to his conviction and execution. In the eyes of conservative Athenians Socrates' questioning undermined the traditional values of their society, while he regarded it as his mission to instigate a re-valuation of those values. The ‘virtues’, the social skills, attitudes, and character-traits that characterized most of the citizens of his time, were all too often geared to their possessors' wealth, power, and self-indulgence, to the detriment of public morality and the community's well-being.
The Socratic legacy prompted Plato to engage in a thorough examination of the nature of knowledge and reality, an examination that gradually took him far beyond the scope of the historical Socrates' discussions. Nevertheless, Plato continued to present his investigations as dialogues between Socrates and some partner or partners. He preserved the dialogical form even in those of his late works where Socrates is replaced by a stand-in and the didactic nature of the presentations is hard to reconcile with the pretense of dialogue. This literary form makes the interpretation of his ethics difficult because the informal discussions combine questions of ethical, political, social or psychological importance with metaphysical, methodological and epistemological considerations. There are, as a result, no central texts on Plato's ethical doctrine. And given that each dialogue has different partners and therefore makes a fresh start, the information that can be culled from the different dialogues does not always fit together well. Because Plato never speaks in his own name, it is difficult to assess the extent to which he agrees with his figures' pronouncements, even if the speaker is Socrates. Furthermore, the fact that a certain problem or its solution is not mentioned in a dialogue does not mean that Plato was unaware of it. This makes it hard to be certain about the question: “What did Plato see and when did he first see it?” Added to this difficulty is the fact that we lack information about the order in which Plato wrote his works. It stands to reason, however, that he started with the short dialogues that question traditional virtues—courage, justice, moderation, piety. It also stands to reason that Plato gradually widened the scope of his investigations by reflecting not only on the social and political conditions of morality, but also on the logical, epistemological, and metaphysical presuppositions of a successful moral theory. These theoretical reflections often take on a life of their own. Several of Plato's later works are concerned with ethical problems only marginally or not at all. The Parmenides, the Theaetetus, and the Sophist deal primarily or exclusively with epistemological and metaphysical problems of a quite general nature. Nevertheless, as witnessed by the Philebus, the Politicus, the Timaeus, and the Laws, Plato never lost interest in the conditions of the good human life. This article will elucidate the most important stages in the progress of Plato's thought. Because of the informal character of the discussions a certain amount of attention has to be paid to the way the thoughts are broached, so a certain amount of presentation in paraphrase is therefore unavoidable.
When confronted with Plato's early dialogues and their investigation of the different kinds of virtue, we may well ask ourselves why he focuses on these virtues almost exclusively. The answer seems to lie in the peculiar style of Socratic discussions. First, they always address particular persons. Second, they ask for definitions and their presuppositions (cf. Xenophon Memorabilia I, 10; 16). Both features have important consequences.
(1) The personal character of the discussion explains that the focus is on a particular virtue or virtues rather than on the general foundations and principles of ethical thought that would be the natural starting point in a systematic investigation. Socrates' partners either possess, or pretend to possess, certain socially valued skills and attitudes. Thus in the Euthyphro Socrates discusses piety with an ‘expert’ in religious affairs. In the Laches he discusses courage with two renowned generals of the Peloponnesian war, Laches and Nicias. In the Charmides Socrates addresses—somewhat ironically—the nature of moderation with the two later tyrants, the then very young Charmides, an alleged paragon of modesty, and his guardian and intellectual mentor, Critias. The Greater Hippias raises the question of the nature of the beautiful with a producer of ‘beautiful things’, the sophist and polymath Hippias. The Protagoras focuses on the question of the unity of virtue with the most famous teacher of ‘civic virtues’ among the sophists. The Gorgias discusses the nature of rhetoric and its relation to virtue with the most prominent teacher of rhetoric among the sophists. In the Meno the question how virtue is acquired is raised by a disciple of Gorgias, an ambitious seeker of power, wealth, and fame. All of Socrates' interlocutors are at first quite confident about their own competence in discussion. Nor is such confidence unreasonable. If virtue is a kind of ‘skill’ or attitude that enjoys general recognition, its possessor should be able to give an account of his excellence. That such ‘knowledge’ is often at best implicit comes to light only gradually—and often much to the victims' chagrin and anger when they are confronted with their inability to explain the nature of their cherished expertise. This accounts at least for part of the widespread enmity against Socrates.
(2) Though there were no acknowledged formal standards for definitions in Socrates' time, his investigations contributed significantly to the establishment of such standards by exposing the flaws in his partners' abortive attempts to justify their convictions. These flaws vary greatly in kind and gravity: Enumerations of examples are not sufficient to capture the nature of the thing in question. Definitions that merely replace a given concept with a synonym are open to the same attack as the term itself. Definitions may be hopelessly vague or miss the mark entirely; they may be too wide and include unwanted characteristics or subsets; they may be too narrow and exclude essential characteristics. Moreover, definitions may be incomplete because the object in question does not constitute a unitary phenomenon. If generally accepted ‘social excellences’ are not simple conditions, they may be subject to conflicting convictions. Examples of all these flaws are exposed in Plato's early dialogues with more or less diagnostic transparency of the exact nature of the respective deficiencies.
Given that the focus in the early dialogues is almost entirely on the exposure of inconsistencies, one cannot help wondering whether Plato himself knew the answer to his queries, had some card up his sleeve that he chose not to play for the time being. This would presuppose that he had not only a clear notion of the nature of the different virtues, but also a positive conception of the good life as such. Since Plato was neither a moral nihilist nor a sceptic, he cannot have regarded moral perplexity (aporia) as the ultimate end, nor continued mutual examination, more Socratico, as a way of life for everyone. Perplexity, as is argued in the Meno, is just a wholesome intermediary stage on the way to knowledge (Me. 84a–b). But if Plato assumes that those convictions that survive Socratic questioning will coalesce into an account of the good life, then he keeps this expectation to himself. Nor would such optimism seem warranted, given Socrates' disavowal of knowledge and his disdain for the values of ‘the Many’. There is no guarantee that only false convictions are discarded and true ones retained in a Socratic investigation. Quite the contrary: promising suggestions are as mercilessly discarded as their less promising brethren. Perhaps Plato counted on his readers' intelligence to straighten out what is skewed in Socratic refutations, to detect unfair moves, to supplement what is missing. It is in fact often quite easy to make out fallacies and to correct them; but such corrections must remain incomplete without sufficient information about Plato's conception of the good life and its moral presuppositions. It is therefore a matter of conjecture whether Plato himself held any such view while he composed one aporetic dialogue after the other. He may have regarded his investigations as experimental stages, or have seen each dialogue as a piece of a mosaic that he hoped to complete eventually.
If there is a lesson to be drawn from the many failed accounts of the virtues by different partners, it is that definitions of particular virtues in isolation, summed up in one sentence, will not do. The evidence that Plato wants his readers to draw this very conclusion from early on is somewhat contradictory, however. Plato famously pleads for the unity of the virtues in the Protagoras and seems intent to reduce them all to knowledge. Scholars are therefore wont to speak of the ‘intellectualistic’ character of the so-called ‘Socratic ethics’, because it leaves no room for other motivational forces such as emotions or desires. Socrates' proof in the Protagoras that reason cannot be overcome by the passions has, from Aristotle on, been treated as a denial of akrasia, of the phenomenon that was later somewhat misleadingly dubbed ‘weakness of the will’. This intellectualizing tendency does not tell us, however, what kind of master-science would fulfill all requirements and what its content should be. What is more, the emphasis on knowledge does not rule out awareness on Plato's part of the importance of other factors, even in his early dialogues. Though he often compares the virtues with technical skills, such as those of a doctor or a pilot, he may have realized that virtues also involve emotional attitudes, desires and preferences, but have seen no clear way to coordinate the rational and the affective components that are connected with the virtues. The discussion of courage in the Laches, for instance, struggles with two different conditions. In his attempt to define courage as ‘steadfastness in battle’, Laches, one of the two generals and ‘experts’ on courage, is faced with the dilemma that steadfastness renders a satisfactory definition of courage neither in combination with knowledge nor without it (La. 192a–194c). His comrade Nicias, on the other hand, fails when he tries to identify courage with a certain type of knowledge exclusively (197e–200a). The investigation of moderation in the Charmides, likewise, points up that there are two disparate elements commonly associated with that virtue, namely a certain calmness of temper on the one hand (Chrm. 158e–160d) and self-knowledge on the other (166e–175a). It is clear that a complex account would be needed to combine these disparate factors. For moral skills not only presuppose sufficient ‘operative’ rationality but also appropriate attitudes towards the desirable ends to be attained and the means to be employed. Such an insight is at least indicated in Socrates' long and passionate argument in the Gorgias against Polus and Callicles that the just life is better for the soul of its possessor than the unjust life, an argument that he fortifies with a mythical depiction of the soul's reward and punishment after death (523a–527e). But the nature of justice and what is required for the proper care of one's soul is thereby illuminated only indirectly. For the most part, the arguments focus on the incompatibility of his interlocutor' selfish aims with their better social insights. Plato may or may not have yet envisaged the kind of solution to the problem that he is going to present in the Republic: the establishment of a hierarchy among the virtues with wisdom, the only intellectual virtue, as their basis. Courage, moderation, and justice presuppose a certain steadfastness of character as well as a harmony of purpose among the disparate parts of the soul, but their goodness depends entirely on the intellectual part of the soul, just as the virtue of the citizens in the just state depends on the wisdom of the philosopher kings (R. 428a–444e). Thus Plato confines the dispositional or ‘demotic’ virtues to second place (500d; 522a–b).
There are at least some indications that Plato already saw the need for a holistic conception of the good life at the time when he composed his ‘Socratic’ dialogues. At the end of the Laches he lets Nicias founder with his attempt to define courage as the ‘knowledge of what is to be feared and what should inspire confidence’. Nicias is forced to admit that such knowledge presupposes the knowledge of good and bad tout court (La. 199c–e). In a different but related way Socrates alludes to a comprehensive knowledge at the end of the Charmides in his final refutation of Critias' definition of moderation as ‘knowledge of knowledge’ by urging that this type of knowledge is insufficient for the happy life without the knowledge of good and bad (Chrm. 174b–e). But pointing out what is wrong and missing in particular arguments is a far cry from a philosophical conception of the good and the bad in human life. The fact that Plato insists on the shortcomings of a purely ‘technical’ conception of virtue suggests that he was at least facing up to these problems. The discussion of the ‘unity of the virtues’ in the Protagoras—regardless of the perhaps intentionally unsatisfactory structure of his proofs—confirms that Plato realized that a critique of the inconsistencies implied in the conventional values is insufficient to justify such a unitary point of view. But the evidence of a definitive conception of the good life remains at most indirect at this early stage.
Reflection on what is implied in the quest for definitions confirms that Plato cannot have been blind to the sterility of a purely negative way of argument, or if he was blind at first, his blindness cannot have lasted long. For the quest for definitions has important consequences. First and foremost, definitions presuppose that there is a definable object; that is to say, that it must have a stable nature. Nothing can be defined whose nature changes all the time. In addition, the object in question must be a unitary phenomenon, even if its unity may be complex. If definitions are to provide the basis of knowledge, they require some kind of essentialism. This presupposition is indeed made explicit in the Euthyphro, where Plato employs for the first time the terminology that will be characteristic of his full-fledged theory of the Forms. In response to Euthyphro's enumeration of various examples of pious behavior, Socrates demands an account of the one feature (Euthphr. 5d: idea; 6d: eidos; 6e: paradeigma) that is common to all cases of what is holy or pious. Despite this pregnant terminology, few scholars nowadays hold that the Euthyphro already presupposes transcendent Forms in a realm of their own—models that are incompletely represented by their imitation in material conditions. The terms eidos and idea preserved their original meaning of ‘look’ or ‘shape’ into the classical age. But they were also often used in ordinary prose in the more abstract sense of ‘form’, ‘sort’, ‘type’, or ‘kind’. No more than this abstract sense seems to be presupposed in the discussion of the Euthyphro. There is, at any rate, no mention here of any separation of a sensible and an intelligible realm, let alone of an existence of ‘the holy itself’, as an entity existing in splendid isolation from all particular cases of holiness.
The passage in the Euthyphro makes intelligible, however, the reason why Plato felt encouraged to develop such a view in dialogues that no longer confine themselves to the ‘negative way’ of questioning the foundations of other people's convictions. The requisite unity and invariance of entities like ‘the holy’, ‘ the beautiful’, ‘the just’ or ‘the equal’, necessarily prompts reflections on their ontological status and on the appropriate means of access to them. Given that they are the objects of definition and the paradigms for their ordinary representatives, there is every reason not only to treat them as real, but also to assign them a state of higher perfection. And once this step has been taken, it is only natural to make certain epistemological adjustments. For, access to paradigmatic entities is not to be expected through ordinary experience, but presupposes some special kind of intellectual insight. It seems, then, that once Plato had accepted invariant and unitary objects of thought as the objects of definition, he was predestined to follow the path that let him adopt a metaphysics and epistemology of transcendent Forms, . The alternative of treating these objects as mere constructs of the mind that more or less fit the manifold of everyday-experience clearly was not to Plato's taste. It would have meant the renunciation of the claim to unassailable knowledge and truth in favor of conjecture and, horribile dictu, of human convention. The very fact that mathematics was already an established science with rigorous standards and unitary and invariant objects must have greatly enhanced Plato's confidence in applying the same standards to moral philosophy. It led him to search for models of morality beyond the limits of everyday experience. This, in turn, explains the development of his theory of recollection and the postulate that he refers to in the Meno, and argues for in the Phaedo, of transcendent immaterial objects as the basis of reality and thought.
We do not know when, precisely, Plato adopted this mode of thought, but it stands to reason that contact with the Pythagorean school on his first voyage to Southern Italy and Sicily around 390 BC played a major role in this development. Mathematics as a model-science has several advantages. It deals with unchangeable entities that have unitary definitions. It also makes plausible that the essence of these entities cannot be comprehended in isolation but only in a network of interconnections that have to be worked out at the same time as each particular entity is defined. To understand what it is to be a triangle, it is necessary—inter alia—to understand the nature of points, lines, planes and their interrelations. That Plato was aware of this fact is indicated by the somewhat prophetic statement in his introduction of the theory of recollection in the Meno, 81d: “As the whole of nature is akin, and the soul has learned everything, nothing prevents a man, after recalling one thing only—a process men call learning—discovering everything else for himself, if he is brave and does not tire of the search; for searching and learning, are, as a whole, recollection (anamnesis).” The somewhat mystifying claim of an ‘overall kinship’ is then illuminated in the famous ‘mathematical experiment’ (Me. 82b–85c). The slave finally manages, with some pushing and pulling by Socrates and some illustrations drawn in the sand, to double the area of a given square. In the course of this interrogation, the disciple gradually discovers the relations between the different lines, triangles, and squares. That Plato regards these interconnections as crucial features of knowledge is confirmed later by the distinction between knowledge and true belief (97b–98b). As Socrates argues, true beliefs are unreliable, because they behave like the statues of Daedalus that easily run away as long as they are not tied down. The requisite ‘tying down’ happens (98a): “by giving an account of the reason why. And that, Meno my friend, is recollection, as we previously agreed. After they are tied down, in the first place, they become knowledge, and then they remain in place.” This explanation indicates that according to Plato knowledge does not consist in a mental ‘gazing’ at isolated models, but rather in uncovering the invariant relations that constitute the objects in question.
The complexity underlying Plato's theory of the Forms at this stage is easily overlooked because the first application of that theory in the Phaedo suggests that recollection is no more than the grasping of concepts such as ‘exact equality in size’ prompted by the perception of more or less equal-seeming sticks and stones (74a–e). Not only that, the same is suggested by the list that first introduces the Forms, 65d–e: “Do we say that there is such a thing as the Just itself or not? And the Beautiful, and the Good? […] I am speaking of all things such as Tallness, Health, Strength, and in a word, the reality of all other things, that which each of them essentially is.” Such an appeal to recollection leaves a lot to be desired. How does it work? How can one ensure that one's intuitive grasp of these natures is correct? That ‘recollection’ of isolated ideal objects is not the whole story emerges later in the Phaedo in Socrates' presentation of a ‘simple minded hypothesis’ of the Forms as a way to avoid his difficulties with the causes of generation and destruction (Phd. 99d–100e). The hypothesis he starts out with seems simpleminded indeed, because it consists of nothing more than the assumption that everything is what it is by participating in the corresponding Form. But it soon turns out that more is at stake than that simple postulate. First, the hypothesis of the respective Form is to be tested by looking at the compatibility of its consequences; second, the hypothesis itself is to be secured by higher hypotheses until some satisfactory starting-point is attained. Unfortunately Socrates gives neither an explanation of the kinds of consequences he has in mind, nor of the kind of ‘satisfactory highest principle’, but confines himself to the demand for an orderly procedure. The subsequent distinctions he introduces in preparation of the last proof of the immortality of the soul seem, however, to provide some information about the procedure in question (103d–107b). Socrates first introduces the distinction between essential and non-essential attributes. This distinction is then applied to the soul: because it always causes life in whatever it occupies, it must have life as its essential property, which it cannot lose. Hence the soul is incompatible with death and must therefore be immortal. The viability of this argument, stripped here to its bare bones, need not engage us. The procedure shows, at any rate, that and why Plato resorts to relations between Forms here. The essential tie between soul and life is clearly not open to sense-perception; instead, it takes a good deal of reflection on what it means to be and to have a soul. To admirers of a two-world metaphysics in Plato it may come as a disappointment that recollection should consist of no more than the uncovering of such relationships. But this agrees well with the fact that with the exception of such concepts of perfection as ‘the Good’ and ‘the Beautiful’, all of Plato's examples in the Phaedo are quite pedestrian. Not only does he confine himself to concepts like ‘tallness’, ‘health’, ‘strength’ and ‘the equal as such’, invoking objects that are familiar from sense-perception; he treats the fact that knowledge of their nature cannot be derived from sense-perception alone as sufficient evidence for the existence of the respective Forms, as the case of equal looking sticks and stones shows.
Plato in the Phaedo does not employ his newly established metaphysical entities to work out a definitive conception of the human soul and the appropriate way of life. Rather, he confines himself to warnings against the contamination of the soul by the senses and their pleasures, and quite generally against the corruption by worldly values. He gives no advice concerning human conduct beyond the recommendation of a general abstemiousness from worldly temptations. This seems a rather austere picture of human life, and an egocentric one, to boot, for nothing is said about relations between human beings, beyond Socrates' exhortations that his friends should likewise take care of their souls as best they can. It is unclear whether this otherworldly and ascetic attitude is the sign of a particularly pessimistic period in Plato's life or whether it merely reflects the circumstances of the discussion, Socrates' impending death. But as long as this negative attitude towards the physical side of human nature prevails, no interest is to be expected in nature as a whole—let alone in the principles of the cosmic order (but cf. 5.1 below). But it is not only Platonic asceticism that stands in the way of such a wider perspective. Socrates himself seems to have been quite indifferent to the study of nature. The Phaedo admits that Socrates in unable to deal with the causes of natural processes, and the Apology contains an energetic denial of any concern with natural philosophy on Socrates' side. The accusations that depict him as “a student of all things in the sky and below the earth” are quite false (18c); he has never conversed on such issues at all; the attribution to him of the Anaxagorean tenet that the sun is stone and the moon earth is a sign of his accusers' recklessness (26d–e). And in a dialogue as late as the Phaedrus, Socrates famously explains his preference for the city and his avoidance of nature (230d): “Landscapes and trees have nothing to teach me—only the people in the city can do that.” That Plato is not here distorting the facts is confirmed by the testimony of Xenophon, who is equally emphatic about Socrates' repudiation of the study of heavenly phenomena and his concentration on human affairs (Memorabilia I 1.15–16). If Plato later takes a much more positive attitude towards nature in general, this is a considerable change of focus. In the Phaedo he quite deliberately confines his account of the nature of heaven and earth to the mythic (108d–114c). As he states in conclusion, this mythical depiction is not to be taken literally, but as an encouragement to heed its moral message and to take care of one's soul (114d–e). This is as constructive as Plato gets in his earlier discussion of the principles of ethics.
If Plato went through a period of open-ended experimentation, this stage was definitely over when he wrote the Republic, the central work of his middle years. Because of that work's importance a more detailed account will be necessary, in order to explain its ethical principles, for in that text they are closely intertwined with political, psychological, and metaphysical conceptions. That the work represents a major change of mind is indicated already by the dialogue's setting. The aporetic controversy about justice in the first book is set off quite sharply against the cooperative discussion that is to follow in the remaining nine books. Like the Gorgias, the first book of the Republic presents three interlocutors who defend, with increasing vigor, their notion of justice against Socrates' elenchos. Of these disputes the altercation with the sophist Thrasymachus has received a lot of attention, because he defends the provocative thesis that natural justice is the right of the stronger and that conventional justice is at best high-minded foolishness. The arguments employed by Socrates at the various turns of the discussion will not be presented here. Though they reduce Thrasymachus to angry silence they are not above criticism. Socrates himself expresses dissatisfaction with the result of this discussion, R. 354c: “As far as I am concerned, the result is that I know nothing, for when I don't know what justice is, I'll hardly know whether it is a kind of virtue or not, or whether a person who has it is happy or unhappy.” For once, the confession of aporia is not the end of the discussion. Two members of the audience, Plato's brothers Glaucon and Adeimantus, challenge Socrates: Perhaps Thrasymachus has defended his case badly, but if Socrates wants to convince his audience, he must do better than that. Now the brothers demand a positive account of what justice is and what it does to the soul of its possessor.
The change of character in the ensuing discussion is remarkable. Not only are the two brothers not subjected to elenchos, they get ample time to elaborate on their objections (357a–367e). Though they are not themselves convinced that injustice is a better good than justice, they argue that in the present state of society injustice pays—with the gods as well as with men—as long as the semblance of respectability is preserved. To prove this claim the brothers play devil's advocate by unfolding a scathing picture of their society's attitude towards justice. As the story of the Ring of Gyges and its gift of invisibility proves, everyone who does not have a god-like character will eventually succumb to such a ring's temptations (359c–360d). Instead of the wolf of Thrasymachus' account, it is the fox who is the paragon of injustice. He will succeed at every level because he knows how to play the power-game with cunning. The just man, by contrast, pays no heed to semblance and therefore suffers a Christ-like fate, because he does not comply with the demands of favoritism and blandishment (361e). Even the gods, as the poets allegedly confirm, are on the side of the successful scoundrel, since they can be propitiated by honors and sacrifices. Given this state of affairs, a logic-chopping argument that justice is better than injustice is quite insufficient for the brothers (367b–e: logôi). Instead, Socrates should show what effect each of them have on the soul of their possessors. Plato at this point clearly regards refutation as insufficient to make true converts; whether he ever had such confidence in the power of refutation must remain a moot point. The Republic suggests that he saw that the time had come for a positive account of morality and the good life. If elenchos is used in Plato's later dialogues, it is never again used in the knock-down fashion of the early dialogues.
Socrates complies with the brothers' request by engaging in a long drawn-out investigation of justice and injustice. A brief sketch of its main points must suffice here, to make intelligible Plato's distinction of justice form the other kinds of virtue, and their role in the good life. This question is addressed in a quite circuitous way. Justice is first to be studied in the state as in a ‘larger text’, rather than in the hard to decipher small text of the soul. A study of how a city comes to be will supposedly reveal the origin of justice and injustice (II 369a). Its founding-principle is, at least at first, no high-minded concern but mutual economic need: “A city comes to be because none of us is self-sufficient (autarkês), but we all need many things. … And because people need many things, and because one person calls on a second out of one need and on a third out of a different need (chreia), many people gather in a single place to live together as partners and helpers.” The ‘need’ is, at least at this point, purely economic. The minimal city is based on the need for food, clothing, shelter, and for the requisite tools. Need also dictates the adoption of the principle of the ‘division of functions’. This principle determines not only the structure of the minimal, self-subsistent state of farmers and craftsmen, but also the subsequent separation of three classes in the ‘maximal state’ that caters to higher demands. A more luxurious city needs protection by a professional army as well as the leadership of a class of philosopher-kings and -queens. Beyond the claim that the division of functions is more economical, Plato gives no justification for this fateful decision, one that determines the social order in the state, as well as the nature of the virtues. Human beings are not born alike, but with different abilities that predestine them for different tasks in a well-ordered state. This leads to Plato's rule: ‘one person—one job’ (R. 370a–c; 423d).
Because the division of functions paves the way for the definition of justice as ‘doing your own thing’ in book IV (432d–433b), it is necessary to briefly review the kind of social order Plato has in mind, the psychological principles he assumes, and the political institutions by which it is to be attained. For this explains not only the establishment of a three-class society and the corresponding structure of the soul, it also explains Plato's theory of education and its metaphysical underpinnings. That economic needs are the basis of the political structure does not, of course, mean that they are the only human needs Plato recognizes. It indicates, however, that the emphasis here is on the unity and self-sufficiency of a well-structured city, not on the well-being of the individual (423c–e; 425c). This focus should be kept in mind in the assessment of the ‘totalitarianism’ and rigorous cultural conservatism of Plato's political philosophy.
The need for a professionally trained army leads to the discussion of education and moral psychology, because the preservation of internal peace and external security presupposes the combination of two different character-traits among the ‘guardians’ (‘the philosophical watchdogs’, 375d–376c): friendliness towards their fellow-citizens and fierceness towards their enemies. The injunctions concerning their appropriate education are very detailed, because it must combine the right kind of ‘muses’ (poetry, music, and other fine arts) with the appropriate physical training to procure the right temperament and attitude in the soldiers (376d–403d). The ‘muses’ come in for protracted criticism, both in content and form. All stories that undermine respect towards the gods are to be banned, along with tales that instill fear of death in the guardians. Imitation of bad persons is forbidden, as are depictions of different types of character, quite generally. Analogous injunctions apply, mutandis mutatis, to the modes and rhythms in music and to painting. Physical exercise must fit the harmonious soul and therefore must not exceed what is healthy and necessary (403e–412b). Because the educational scheme is geared to secure a harmonious and yet spirited class of soldiers, Plato bans from his city most of the cultural achievements that were his contemporaries' pride and joy. There must be nothing to disturb the citizens' willingness to fulfill their tasks. The supervision of the education is the function of the third class, the rulers of the city (412b–417b). They are to be selected through tests of intelligence and character from among the soldiers, selecting for characters that are unshakable in their conviction that their own well-being is intimately tied to that of the city. To secure this attitude, both classes must lead a communal life, without private homes, families, or property. His interlocutor's objection that such a life is not apt to make these citizens happy (419a), is the first approach to that topic, but it is quickly brushed aside at this point on the ground that the political order is designed to make the entire city happy, not any particular group.
The division of functions that leads to the separation of three classes in the search for justice concludes the discussion of the social order (427d–434c). This sequence explains the peculiar character of Socrates' further procedure. The catalogue of what in later tradition has been dubbed ‘the four cardinal Platonic virtues’—wisdom, courage, moderation, and justice—is first presented without comment. Piety, as the text indicates, is no longer treated as a virtue, for religious practices should be left to tradition and the oracle of Apollo at Delphi (427b–c). The definition of justice is to be discovered by a process of ‘elimination’. If there are four virtues in the city, then justice must be the one that is left over after the other three have been identified (427e). There is no proof offered that there are exactly four virtues in a state, nor that they are items that can be lifted up, singly, for inspection, like eggs from a basket. Instead, Socrates points out the role they play in the maintenance of the social order. About wisdom (sophia), the only purely intellectual virtue and the exclusive possession of the rulers (428b–429a), little more is said than that it is ‘good council’ (euboulia) in decisions about the internal and external affairs of the city. Courage (andreia) is the soldiers' specific excellence (429a–430c). Socrates takes some trouble explaining its nature, because it is a mixture of belief (doxa) and steadfastness of character (sôtêria). It is compared to colorfast wool: through thick and thin the guardians must be dyed-in-the-wool adherents to the laws' decrees about what is to be feared. Moderation (sôphrosunê) (430d–432a) is not an intellectual excellence, but rather a combination of belief with a certain orderly disposition. It is a conviction (doxa, 431e) shared by all classes about who should rule, a conviction based on a state of ‘order’ (kosmos), ‘consonance’ (sumphônia) and ‘harmony’ (harmonia) that consists in the control of the better part of the pleasures and desires of the lower parts. The third class, then, has no specific virtue of its own. The identification of justice, the excellence that is left over, is due to a sudden insight on Socrates' part (432d–434c): justice is neither more nor less than the principle that has been employed all along in the founding of the model-state, namely that everyone is to “do their own thing and not meddle with that of another” (433a). At first sight it seems hard to tell how justice differs from moderation as a “consonance about who should rule and be ruled.” Justice as “doing your own thing” may represent a more active state of mind with a wider extension, given that its task is also to see to it that “no citizen should have what belongs to another or be deprived of what is his own” (433e). But since the dispositions of justice and moderation are not specified any further, there seems to be only a fine line between the functions of justice and moderation in the city. That there are four virtues rather than three may also reflect the fact that this catalogue of four was a fixture in tradition. As will emerge in connection with the virtues in the individual soul, the distinction between justice and moderation is far less problematic in the case of the individual than in that of the city as a whole, because in the individual soul internal self-control and external self-restraint are clearly different attitudes.
The promise to establish the isomorphic structure of city and soul (= the larger and the smaller text) has not been forgotten. After the definition and assignment of the four virtues to the parts of the city the investigation turns to the virtues in the soul. This requires the distinction of three parts in the soul, corresponding to the three classes in the city. The lengthy argument for the tri-partition of the soul into a rational (logistikon), a spirited (thumoeides), and an appetitive (epithumêtikon) part (434d–441c), can here be neither reproduced nor subjected to critical evaluation. That Plato lets Socrates express reservations concerning the adequacy of his own procedure (435c–d), despite his unusually circumspect way of justifying his division of the soul's faculties, indicates that he regards it as an important innovation. Indeed, there is no mention of separate parts of the soul in any of the earlier dialogues; there irrational desires are attributed to the influence of the body. In the Republic, by contrast, the soul itself becomes the source of the appetites and desires. It requires little trouble to establish the difference between a rational and an appetitive part, because the opposition between the decrees of reason and the various kinds of unreasonable desires is familiar to everyone (438d–439e). That there must be a third, a ‘spirited’ or courageous part, different from reason and desire, is more difficult to prove. The phenomenon of moral indignation is treated as evidence for a psychic force that is reducible neither to reason nor to any one of the appetites, for it is an ally of reason in a well-ordered soul, a force opposed to unruly appetites (439e–441c). This concludes the proof that there are three parts in the soul corresponding to the classes in the city—the rational part to the wisdom of the rulers, the spirited part to the courage of the soldiers, the appetitive part representing the rest of the population whose defining motivation is material gain.
The division of the soul leads to the final evaluation of justice and injustice: In the city there is justice if the members of the three classes mind their own business; in the individual soul justice likewise consists in each part fulfilling its own function. This presupposes that the two upper parts have been given the right kind of training and education in order to control the appetitive part (441d–442a). The three other virtues are then assigned to the respective parts of the soul. Courage is the excellence of the spirited part, wisdom belongs to the rational part, and moderation is the consent of all three about who should rule and who should obey. Justice, thus, turns out to be the overall unifying quality of the soul (443c–e). The just person not only refrains from meddling with what is not his, externally, but also harmonizes the three parts of the soul internally. While justice is order and harmony, injustice is its opposite: it is a rebellion of one part of the city or soul against the others and an inappropriate rule of the inferior parts. Justice and injustice in the soul are, then, analogous to health and illness in the body. This comparison suffices to bring the investigation to its desired result. If justice is health and harmony of the soul, then injustice must be disease and disorder. Hence it is clear that justice is a good state of the soul that makes its possessor happy and injustice its opposite. Just as no-one in his right mind would prefer to live with a ruined body so no-one would prefer to live with a diseased soul. In principle the discussion of justice has already reached its promised goal at the end of book IV. For Socrates has met Glaucon's and Adeimantus' challenge to prove that justice is a good for the soul of its possessor in and by itself, and preferable to injustice.
That the discussion does not end here but occupies six more books is due, most of all, to several loose ends that need to be tied up. Apart from the fact that reason and order are to reign supreme, little has been said about the citizens' way of life. This gap will be filled, at least in part, by the description in book V of the communal life without private property and family. More importantly, nothing has been said about the rulers and their particular kind of knowledge. This is a crucial point because, as their definitions show, the quality of the three ‘inferior’ virtues is contingent on the rulers' wisdom. Socrates addresses this problem with the provocative thesis (473c–d): “Until philosophers rule as kings or those who are now called kings and leading men genuinely and adequately philosophize ... cities will have no rest from evils, nor will the human race.” This thesis starts the discussion through books VI and VII of the philosophers' knowledge, their upbringing and education. Because they also introduce the special objects of the philosophers' knowledge, these books provide the metaphysical underpinning of the entire conception of the good state and the good soul. For the ‘Form of the Good’ turns out to be the ultimate source of all being and knowledge. A short summary of the upshot of the educational program must suffice here. The future philosophers, both women and men, are selected from the group of guardians whose general cultural training they share. If they combine moral firmness with quickness of mind, they are subject to a rigorous curriculum of higher learning that will prepare them for the ascent from the world of the senses to the world of intelligence and truth, a distinction and ascent whose stages are summed up in the similes of the Sun, the Line, and the Cave (508a–518b). To achieve this ascent, the students have to undergo, first, a preparatory schooling of ten years duration in the ‘liberal arts’: arithmetic, geometry, astronomy and theoretical harmonics (518c–531c). Afterwards they are admitted to the training in the master-science of ‘dialectic’, a science of which little more is said beyond the indication that it enables its possessor to deal in a systematic way with the objects of real knowledge, the Forms, and with the Form of the Good in particular, the principle of the goodness of all else (531c–535a). This study is to last for another five years. Successful candidates are then sent back into the Cave of ordinary political life as administrators for about 15 years. At the age of fifty the rulers are granted the pursuit of philosophy, an activity that is interrupted only by periods of service as overseers over the order of the state. This completes, in a nutshell, the description of the philosopher-kings' and -queens' education and activities (539d–541b).
This picture of autocratic rule by an aristocracy of the mind has received a lot of flak. An assessment of Plato's politics must here be limited to the kind of happiness it supposedly provides. Regardless of whether or not we accept his overall principle of the Good as the basis of the political order, Plato's model-state has, at least in theory, the advantage that it guarantees external and internal peace. That is no mean feat in a society where external and civil wars were a constant threat and often enough ended in the destruction of the entire state. The division of functions guarantees a high degree of efficiency, if every citizen does what he/she is naturally suited to do. But what about the citizens' needs, beyond those for security and material goods? Are they to find their life's fulfillment in the pursuit of their jobs only? Plato seems to think so; he characterizes each class by its specific kind of desire and its respective good (581c): the philosophers are lovers of wisdom (philosophoi), the soldiers lovers of honor (philotimoi), and the workers are lovers of material goods (philochrêmatoi). That human beings find, or at least try to find, satisfaction in the kinds of goods they cherish is a point pursued at length in the depiction of the decay of the city and its ruling citizens, from the best, the aristocracy of the mind, down to the worst, the tyranny of lust, in books VIII and IX. A discussion of the tenability of this explanation of political and psychological decadence will not be pursued here. It is supposed to show that all inferior forms of government of city and soul are doomed to fail because of the inherent tensions between the goods that are aimed for. Some comments on Plato's conception of happiness are in order, however: He clearly goes on the assumption that human beings are happy insofar as they achieve the goals they cherish. Now, ‘preference-satisfaction’ for all citizens is nowadays regarded as the primary aim of every liberal state. What seems to be objectionable is Plato's restriction of each class to one type of good. That seems quite ‘illiberal’, most obviously in the case of the citizens of the third class who supposedly covet nothing but material goods. This ‘reductive’ view of human nature militates not only against present-day intuitions, it should also militate against Plato's own moral psychology, in that all human souls consist of three parts, a rational, a spirited, and an appetitive part, whose health and harmony constitute the soul's and the state's happiness. Why, then, reduce the third class to animal-like creatures with low appetites, as suggested by the comparison of the people to a strong beast that must be placated (493a–c)? This comparison is echoed later in the comparison of the soul to a multiform beast, where reason just barely controls the hydra-like heads of the appetites, and then only with the aid of a lion-like spirit (588c–590d). Is Plato thereby giving vent to anti-democratic sentiments, showing contempt for the rabble, as has often been claimed? He can be cleared of the suspicion that the workers are mere serfs of the upper classes, because he explicitly grants them the free enjoyment of all the customary goods that he has denied to the upper classes (419a): “Others own land, build fine big houses, acquire furnishings to go along with them, make their own private sacrifices to the gods, entertain guests, and also, of course, possess what you were talking about just now, gold and silver and all the things that are thought to belong to people who are blessedly happy.” But apart from such liberties, the members of the third class are quite neglected in Plato's ideal city; no education is provided for them. There is no suggestion that they participate in the guardians' musical and athletic training, and there is no mention that happiness for the third class cannot just consist in obedience to the rulers' commands. Plato seems to sidestep his own insight that all human beings have an immortal soul and have to take care of it as best they can, as he not only demands in the Phaedo but is going to confirm in a fanciful way in the Myth of Er at the end of Republic book X.
The life-style designated for the upper classes seems also open to objections. The soldiers' musical and physical training is strictly regimented; they must take satisfaction in the obedience to the laws in the preservation of the city's inner and outer peace and in deeds of valor in war. Theirs is an austere camp-life; not all of them will be selected for higher education. But even the philosophers' lives leave a lot to be desired, and not only because they have to starve their common human appetites and devote many years to administration back in the ‘Cave’. Their intellectual pursuits are also not entirely enviable, as a closer inspection would show. Not only do the philosophers have two jobs, in violation of the rule ‘one person one function’, in that they are responsible for both administrative work and philosophical reflection. They are also not to enjoy open-ended research, but are subject to a mental training that is explicitly designed to turn their thoughts away from worldly conditions and to the contemplation of the Forms. This is indicated in the injunctions concerning the study of astronomy (529a–530c). The students are not to crane their necks to watch the “embroidery in the heavens”, but rather to concern themselves with the ideal motions of ideal moving bodies in a purely geometrical fashion. The universe is not treated as an admirable cosmos, with the explicit purpose of providing moral and intellectual support to the citizens, in the way Plato is going to treat it in the Timaeus and in the Laws. Given these limitations of the philosophers' mental exercises in the Republic, the claim that their lives are 729 times more pleasant than the tyrants' (IX 587e) seems like a gross exaggeration, even if they enjoy the pleasures of being filled with pure and unadulterated truths while everyone else enjoys only semblances of the really real (581e–588a).
For all the advances the Republic represents in some respects, Plato's ideal city seems to us far from ideal: The system resembles a well-oiled machine where everyone has their appointed function and economic niche; but its machine-like character seems repellent, given that no deviations are permitted from the prescribed pattern. If innovations are forbidden, no room seems to be left for creativity and personal development. Plato presupposes that the fulfillment of a person's function is sufficient to secure her happiness, or at least that is suggested by the ‘functional’ argument that defeats Thrasymachus (352d–354a). It states that every object, animal, and person has a specific function or work (ergon). If it performs its function well, it does well; for a living thing ‘doing well’ means ‘living well’ and living well is tantamount to living happily. Though Socrates' refutation of Thrasymachus is found wanting as a proof of justice's superiority, the ergon-argument is nowhere revoked. On the contrary, it is affirmed by the principle of ‘one person—one job’ that is the basis of Plato's ideal city. But it seems rather inhumane to confine everyone's activities to just one kind of work, even if such confinement may be most economical and efficient. These features suffice to make the ideal life in Plato's city unpalatable to us, not to speak of certain other features that have not been explored here, such as the communal life envisaged for the upper classes, and the assignment of sexual partnerships by lotteries that are rigged for reasons of eugenics.
What is perhaps strangest about Plato's depiction of his citizens' lives is the fact that he does not even emphasize the one feature that could throw a more favorable light on his social order—that each citizen will take pride and joy in the products of their work, especially given that they are to be regarded—each in their own way—as valuable contributions to the community's well-being. This applies especially to the members of the third class, because they produce the city's material goods: tailors, carpenters, doctors, architects, sailors, and all those who are summed up rather ungraciously under the epithet of ‘money-lovers’. Has this fact escaped Plato's notice, alongside other deficiencies of his blue-print of an ideal city? Against all these complaints, justified as they must seem, it should be pointed out that Plato clearly is not concerned with all the conditions that would make his city ‘livable’. His aim is rather more limited. He wants to present a model, and to work out its essential conditions. The same explanation applies to his depiction of the city's and the citizens' decay in books VIII and IX. Contrary to many critics' assumptions, Plato is not there trying to explain the course of history. Rather he wants to explain the generation and decay typical of each political system and the psychopathology of its leaders, which is based on the respective constitutions' characteristic ‘values’, be it honor, money, freedom, or lust. It is unlikely that Plato presupposes that there are pure representatives of these types, though some historical states may come closer to some of the decadent constitutions than others. Given that his aim is to work out the model of a well-functioning state, he need not concern himself with softening the features of his bare sketch of the decay of city and soul due to their inherent tensions.
If concentration on the depiction of a mere model explains certain inhumane features of Plato's political vision, are there also indications that he was aware of the limitations he imposed on his ‘political animals’ by their confinement to just one function in an efficiently run community? Was he aware of the fact that his black-and-white picture disregards the claim of individuals to have their own aims and ends and not to be treated like automata with no thoughts and wishes of their own? Though the Republic contains some suggestions that would mitigate this bleak picture, it is more fruitful, in order to balance the picture, to look at other works of Plato's middle period that concentrate on and prioritize the conditions of the individual soul rather than on the demands of the community. These works are the Symposium and the Phaedrus.
The Symposium and the Phaedrus are two dialogues that focus on the individual soul and pay no attention to communal life. Instead they concentrate on self-preservation, self-improvement, and self-completion. The Symposium is often treated as a dialogue that predates the Republic, most of all because it mentions neither the immortality nor the tripartition of the soul. But its dramatic staging, the praise of Eros by a company of symposiasts, is not germane to the otherworldly and ascetic tendency of the Gorgias and the Phaedo. In addition, Plato has good reasons for leaving aside a separation of the soul's faculties, because he aims to show that love is an incentive, not only for all humans, but also for other living beings. Contrary to the assumption of all other speakers in the Symposium, Socrates denies that Eros is a god, because the gods are in a state of perfection. Love, by contrast, is a desire of the needy for the beautiful and the good (199c–201c). Socrates thereby corrects the previous speakers' confusion of love with the beloved object. This insight is presented not as Socrates' own, but as the upshot of a “lecture on the nature of love by the wise Diotima” (201d–212b): Eros is a powerful demon, a being between the mortal and the immortal, an eternally needy hunter of the beautiful. Human beings share that demonic condition, for they are neither good nor bad, but desire the good and the beautiful, the possession of which would constitute happiness for them. Because all people want happiness, they pursue the good as well as they can (205a–206b). In each case they desire the particular kinds of objects they hope will fulfill their needs. Such fulfillment is not a passive possession; it is, most of all, productivity in the strife for self-preservation and -completion, 207d: “For among animals the principle is the same as with us, and mortal nature seeks so far as possible to live forever and be immortal. And this is possible in one way only: by reproduction, because it leaves behind a new young one in place of the old.” There is, then, a constant need for self-restoration and self-improvement by procreation. In the case of human beings this need expresses itself in different ways. There is the search for ‘self-eternalization’ by the production of children of the body or of children of the mind, such as the works of the arts and crafts, and by the production of order in the cities in justice and moderation (209a–e). The Diotiman lecture is finally crowned with a depiction of the famous ‘scala amoris’, the explanation of the refinement and sublimation that a person experiences by recognizing higher and higher kinds of beauty (210a–212a). Starting with the love of one beautiful body, the individual gradually learns to appreciate not only all physical beauty, but also the beauty of the mind, and in the end she gets a glimpse of the supreme kind of beauty, the Form of the beautiful itself, a beauty that is neither relative, nor changeable, nor a matter of degree.
Because beauty of the higher kind is tied to virtue and is attained by the comprehension of what is common in laws and public institutions, it is clear that Plato does not have aesthetic values in mind, but principles of good order that are ultimately tied to the Form of the Beautiful/Good. The difference between the Republic's and the Symposium's accounts lies in the fact that the scala amoris treats physical beauty as an incentive to the higher and better, an incentive that in principle affects every human being. There is no talk of a painful liberation from the bonds of the senses and a turn-around of the entire soul reserved only for the better educated. Brief as the Symposium's explanation of happiness is, it shows three things: First, all human beings aim for their own self-preservation and completion. Second, this drive finds its expression in the products of their work, in creativity. Third, the respective activities are instigated by each person's own particular desire for the beautiful. There is no indication that individuals must act as part of a community. Though the communitarian aspect of the good/beautiful comes to the fore in the high praise of the products of the legendary legislators (209e– 210a), the ultimate assent to the Beautiful itself is up to the individual. The message of the Symposium is not unique in Plato's works. The Lysis shares its basic assumption concerning the intermediary state of human nature between good and bad, and regards need as the basis of friendship. Due to the aporetic character of that dialogue, its lesson remains somewhat obscure, but it is obvious enough that it shares the Symposium's general anthropological presuppositions.
The idea that eros is the means of sublimation and self-completion is worked out further in the Phaedrus. Although the close relationship between the two dialogues is generally acknowledged, the Phaedrus is commonly regarded as a much later work. For not only does it accept the Republic's psychological doctrine of a tri-partite soul, it also advocates the immortality of the soul, doctrines that are conspicuously absent in the Symposium. But this difference seems due to a difference in perspective rather than to a change of mind. The discussion in the Symposium is deliberately confined to the conditions of self-immortalization in this life, while the Phaedrus takes the discussion beyond the confines of this life. If it shares the Republic's doctrine of a division of the soul into three parts, it does so for quite different reasons. The three parts of the soul in the Phaedrus are not supposed to justify the separation of three classes of people. They explain, rather, the different routes taken by individuals in their search for beauty and their level of success. If the Phaedrus goes beyond the Symposium it does so in order to show how the enchantment by beauty can be combined with an element of Plato's philosophy that seems quite alien to the notion of self-improvement and sublimation through the love of beauty. That element is the systematic method of collection and division that is characteristic of dialectic in Plato's later work. At first sight it might seem that the dialogue's topic, Eros, is hardly the right tie to keep together the dialogue's two disparate parts, the highly poetically expressed depiction of the enchantment by beauty, and the quite pedestrian methodological explanations of the nature of rhetoric. But although the coherence of the Phaedrus cannot be argued for in full here, this diagnosis does not do justice to the dialogue's careful composition and overall aim.
Rhetoric, its purpose and value, is in fact the dialogue's topic right from the start. The misuse of rhetoric is exemplified by the speech attributed to the orator Lysias, a somewhat contrived plea to favor a non-lover rather than a lover. Socrates' retort points up Lysias' presuppositions: Love is a kind of sickness, an irrational craving for the pleasures of the body; such a lover tries to dominate and enslave the beloved physically, materially and mentally, and—most importantly—to deprive him of philosophy. Once restored to his senses the lover will shun his former beloved and break all his promises. This one-sided view of Eros is corrected in Socrates' second speech: Eros, properly understood, is not a diseased state of mind, but a kind of ‘divine madness’ (theia mania). To explain the nature of this madness, Socrates employs the comparison of the tripartite soul to a charioteer with a team of two winged horses, an obedient white one and an unruly black one. The crucial difference between the Phaedrus' tripartition and that in the Republic lies in in this: instead of a painful liberation through education the Phaedrus envisages a liberation through the uplifting forces of love, a love that is—just as it is in the Symposium—instigated by physical beauty. That is what first makes the soul grow wings and soar in the pursuit of a corresponding deity, to the point where it may attain godlike insights. The best-conditioned souls, those where the charioteer has full control over his horses, get a glimpse of true being, including the nature of the virtues and the good (247c–e). Depending on the quality of each soul, the quality of the beauty pursued will also determine the cycle of reincarnations that is in store for each soul after death (248c–249c).
What is remarkable in the Phaedrus' picture of the uplifting effect of beauty is not only the exuberant tone and imagery that goes far beyond the Symposium's unadorned scala amoris, but also its intricate interweaving of the mythical and philosophical elements. For in the midst of the fanciful depiction of the fates that are in store for different kinds of souls Plato specifies, in quite technical terms, that the capacity “to understand speech in terms of general Forms, proceeding to bring many perceptions together into a reasoned unity”(249b–c) is the condition for the reincarnation in a human form. It is this capacity for abstract thought that he then calls “recollection of what the soul saw when it was traveling with god, when it disregarded the things we now call real and lifted up its head to what is truly real instead.” The heavenly adventure seems to amount to no more than the employment of the dialectical method that Socrates is going to describe, without further mythical camouflage, in the dialogue's second part. The ability to establish unity in a given subject-matter and to divide it up according to its natural kinds is the art that characterizes the ‘scientific rhetorician’ (265d–266b). Socrates professes the greatest veneration for such a master: “If I believe that someone is capable of discerning a single thing that is also by nature capable of encompassing many, I follow ‘straight behind, in his tracks, as if he were a god’.” So the heavenly voyage has a quite down-to-earth counterpart in the dialectical method, a method that Plato regards, as he is going to confirm in the Philebus, as a “gift of the gods”. Plato's esteem for taxonomy explains at the same time the inner unity of the Phaedrus' apparently incongruous two parts as two sides of one coin, and it also shows why Plato no longer treats the sensory as a distraction and disturbance of the mind per se. For the properly conditioned souls' sensory impressions are the first incentives to the higher and better.
What concept of happiness is suggested by this ‘inspired’ view of human life? The individual does not find its fulfillment in peaceful interactions in a harmonious community. Instead, life is spent in the perennial pursuit of the higher and better. But in that task the individual is not alone; she shares that task with kindred spirits. The message of the two dialogues is therefore two-pronged. (1) On the one hand, there is no permanent attainment of happiness as a stable state of completion in this life. In the ups and downs of life (and afterlife), humans are in constant need of beauty as an incentive to aim for their own completion. Humans are neither god-like nor wise; at best they are god-lovers and philosophers, demonic hunters for truth and goodness. To know is not to have; and to have once is not to have forever. Diotima states in no uncertain terms that humans have a perennial need to replenish what they lose, both in body and soul, because they are mortal and changeable creatures, and the Phaedrus also confirms the need for continued efforts, for the heavenly voyage is not a one-time effort. (2) On the other hand, the pursuit of the good and the beautiful is not a lonely enterprise. As the Phaedrus makes especially clear, love for a beautiful human being is an incentive to search for a higher form of life, as a sacred joint journey of two friends in communion (255a–256e). The need for, and also the possibility of, constant self-completion and -repletion is a motive that will also reappear in the ethical thought of Plato's late works, a motive he sometimes presents as the maxim that humans should aim at ‘likening of oneself to god’, a homoiôsis theôi (Theaetetus 176b; Timaeus 90c).
Sober philosophers have a tendency to ignore such visionary talk as too elevated and lacking in substance to be worth serious thought. That Plato, appearances notwithstanding, is not indulging in a god-besotted rêverie is indicated by the interweaving of the mythical description with an emphasis on methodical ‘taxonomical’ procedure. The method is pursued in the determination of the requirements of scientific rhetoric in the second half of the Phaedrus (259e–279c). Artful speaking (and even artful deception) presupposes knowledge of the truth, especially where the identity of the phenomenon is difficult to grasp, because similarities can be deceptive. This applies in particular to concepts like the good and the just, as witnessed by the wide disagreement about their nature (263a–c). The development of the ‘sharp eye’ that is needed for the assignment of a certain object to the right class is the aim of the method of dialectic by collection and division, a method that Plato expounds at some length in the Phaedrus. Plato describes there the care that is needed in order to (265d–e) “see together things that are scattered about everywhere, and to collect them into one kind (mia idea)”, as well as “to cut the unity up again according to its species along its natural joints, and to try not to splinter any part, as a bad butcher might do.” That this method is supposed to serve an overall ethical purpose is confirmed by the fact that scientific rhetoric must not only know the different types of souls and the types of speech that fit them (271d), but also the truth about just and good things (272d).
That dialectic is geared to this end is somewhat obscured in the subsequent discussion in the Phaedrus. First of all, Plato turns away from this issue in the long exposition of the iniquities of contemporary rhetoricians by a comparison with ‘scientific rhetoric’ and in the discussion of speaking and writing, culminating in his famous ‘critique of writing’. Second, the ample use Plato makes of the method of collection and division in later dialogues such as the Sophist and the Statesman, seems to pay little heed to problems of ethics, with the exception of the Philebus. But the aptness of the dialectical method to discern the nature of the good has already been emphasized in the Republic (534b–c): “ Unless someone can distinguish in an account the Form of the good from everything else, can survive all refutation as if in battle... you will say that he does not know the good itself or any other good. ” Brief as theses remarks are, they show that the application of dialectic to the good was of central importance. That the Good is nowhere subjected to such treatment must be due to the enormity of a systematic identification of all that is good and its distinction from every other good. Although it is unclear whether Plato had already refined the dialectical method in the systematic way indicated in the Phaedrus, the hints contained in the Republic about a ‘longer way’ (435d; 504b) to determine the nature of justice and the other virtues seem to suggest that the systematic method of collection and division was already at least ‘in the works’. As a closer look at the much later Philebus will show, the determination of what is good about each kind of thing presupposes more than a classification by collection and division. For in addition, the internal structure of each kind of entity has to be determined. Knowledge is not confined to the comprehension of the objects' being, identity, difference and other such external interrelations that exist in a given field. It also presupposes the knowledge of what constitutes the objects' internal unity and plurality. It would, of course, be rather presumptuous to claim that Plato had not seen the need to do ontological ‘anatomy’, as well as taxonomy. of the Forms from early on. But as the late dialogues show, it took him quite some effort to develop the requisite conceptual tools for such analyses.
Before we turn to that question, a final review is in order of the kind of good life Plato envisages in the dialogues under discussion here. In the Symposium the emphasis is on the individual's creative work that involves others as sort of catalysts in one's effort to attain self-perpetuation and completion: the quality of life attainable for each person differs, depending on the kind of ‘work’ each individual is able to produce. This is what the scala amoris is all about. In the Phaedrus the emphasis is more on the ‘joint venture’ of kindred souls. True friends will get to the highest point of self-fulfillment that their souls' conditions permit them to attain. Just as in the Symposium, the philosophical life is deemed the best. But then, this preference is found everywhere in Plato and is not unique to him: all ancient philosophers regard their own occupation as the true fulfillment of human life. If there are differences between them, they concern the kind of study and occupation that is deemed appropriate to philosophy. The more individualistic view of happiness espoused in the Symposium and in the Phaedrus need not be seen as a later stage in Plato's development than the Republic's communitarian conception. They may be complementary, rather than rival, points of view, and no fixed chronology need be assumed in order to accommodate both.
Nature and natural things are not among the objects that concern Plato in his earlier and middle philosophical investigations. Thus in the Republic he dismisses the study of the visible heaven from the curriculum of higher learning along with audible music. But such generalizations about Plato's intentions may be misleading. What he denigrates is not the study of the heavenly order as such, nor that of harmonics; it is rather the reliance on our eyes and ears that is necessary in those concerns. Students of philosophy are encouraged to work out the true intelligible order underlying the visible heaven and the audible music. Not only that: The ascent out of the Cave includes recognition of objects outside, especially “the things in the sky” (R. 516a–b). If Plato is critical of natural science, it is because of its empirical approach. This echoes the Phaedo's complaint that one ruins one's eyes by looking directly at things, most of all at the sun (Phdo. 99d–e). Nevertheless, Plato already indicates in his critique of Anaxagoras that comprehension of the workings of the order of nature would be highly desirable, as long as it contained an explanation of the rationale of that order (98a): “I was ready to find out about the sun and the moon and the other heavenly bodies, about their relative speed, their turnings and whatever happens to them, how it is best that each should be acted upon.” But Anaxagoras has not fulfilled his promise to explain how mind is the cause of all things by showing (99c): “that the truly good and ‘binding’ ties and holds everything together”, i.e. through a teleological rather than a mechanical explanation of the cosmic order. Plato himself does not pursue this idea in the rest of the Phaedo, but his elaborate ‘geographical’ depiction of the under-, middle-, and upper world in the final myth can be read as a model of such an explanation in mythological garb. The same may be claimed for the description of the heavenly order and the structure of the ‘spindle of necessity’ in the myth of Er at the end of the Republic (R. 616b–617d).
What kind of ‘binding force’ does Plato attribute to ‘the Good’? His reticence about this concept, despite its centrality in his metaphysics and ethics, is largely responsible for the obscurity of his concept of happiness and what it is to lead a good life, except for the claim that individuals are best off if they ‘do their own thing’. In what way the philosophers' knowledge provides a solid basis for the good life of the community and the—perhaps uncomprehending—majority of the citizens remains an open question, beyond the claim that they benefit from good order in the state. What, then, is ‘the Good’ that is responsible for the goodness of all other things? A lot of ink has been spilt over the much quoted passage in Republic book VI, 509b: “not only do the objects of knowledge owe their being known to the Good, but their being (ousia) is also due to it, although the Good is not being, but superior (epekeina) to it in rank and power.” The analogy with the sun's maintenance of all that is alive suggests that the Good is the intelligent inner principle that determines the nature of every object capable of goodness so that it fulfills its function in an appropriate way. How such a principle of goodness works in all things Plato clearly felt unable to say when he wrote the Republic. That he was thinking of an internal ‘binding force’ is indicated, however, in book X in the elucidation of the ontological difference between the Forms as the products of a divine maker, their earthly copies, and the imitation of these copies by an artist (R. 596a ff.). There Plato explains that in each case it is the use or function that determines what it is to be good, 601d: “Aren't the virtue or excellence, the beauty and correctness of each manufactured item, living creature, and action related to nothing but the use (chreia) for which each is made or naturally adapted?” Given that he does not limit this account to instruments, but explicitly includes living things and human actions in it, he seems to have a specific ‘fittingness’ in mind that constitutes each thing's excellence. A similar thought is already expressed in Republic I (353a–e) when Socrates in his refutation of Thrasymachus employs the argument that the ability to fulfill one's own task (ergon) well constitutes the excellence of each object. In the case of human beings this means ‘doing well’, and ‘doing well’ means ‘living well’, and ‘living well’ means ‘living happily’. The stringency of these inferences is far from obvious; but they show that Plato saw an intimate connection between the nature, the function, and the well being of all things, including human beings.
What determines the ‘use’ of a human being, and in how far can there be a common principle that accounts for all good things? In the Republic this question is answered only indirectly through the isomorphism of the just state and soul as a harmonious internal order. The postulate of such an orderly structure is not explicitly extended beyond the state and the soul. In the later dialogues the Good clearly operates on a cosmic scale. That such is Plato's view comes to the fore in the excursus on the philosopher's nature in the Theaetetus (173c–177c). Contrary to Socrates' denial in the Apology, the philosopher now is to pursue both what lies below the earth and the heights above the heaven (173e): “tracking down by every path the entire nature of each whole among the things that are.” He also concerns himself with the question: “What is man? What actions and passions properly belong to human nature and distinguish it from all other beings?” In that connection he ties the need to discover the true nature of things with ‘likening oneself to God’ (homoiôsis theôi) and indicates that there is a unitary principle of goodness. The ability to achieve this superhuman state depends on the readiness to engage in strenuous philosophical discourse (177b).
If in the Republic the goodness of the individual soul is explained as that of a smaller copy of a harmonious society, in the Timaeus Plato leaves out that ‘middle-size’ model. The universe now supplies the larger text for deciphering the nature of the human soul. The structure of the world-soul is replicated in the nature of the human soul. That there is, nevertheless, a close affinity between the Republic and the project Plato meant to pursue in the Timaeus and its intended sequels is clearly indicated in the preface to the Timaeus. The tale of the origin of the universe, including human nature, is presented as the first step in a reply to Socrates' wish to see his own best city ‘in action’ (Ti. 19b–c). From antiquity on, this introduction has created the impression that the Timaeus is the direct continuation of the Republic, an impression that explains its juxtaposition in the Corpus Platonicum. Strong indications speak, however, for a much later date of the Timaeus. If Plato establishes a link between these two works, his intent is to compare as well as to contrast. The continuity consists solely in the fact that Socrates reaffirms that he still considers his city's order as best (Ti. 17c–19b). It is this order that Critias promises to put in action in the tale of the war between pre-historic Athens, a city with the ideal order, and Atlantis, a powerful tyrannical superpower (Ti. 20d–26e), a project that Plato eventually set aside: the Critias breaks off after 15 pages in mid-sentence, and the third dialogue in the series, Hermocrates, was never written at all. So the story of Socrates' city in action and the life of its citizens remains untold.
The difference between the philosophical approach of the Republic and the Timaeus lies in the fact that Plato is now concerned with the structure of the visible heaven as a model for the human soul, and also with the material conditions of human physiology. What is confined to the myths in Plato's earlier works is here worked out—though not without some caveats concerning the mere likeliness of such an account. Plato's choice of presenting his explanation of the order of the universe as a story of creation by a ‘divine workman’ is certainly no accident. It is a kind of ‘revocation’ of his depreciation of the divine workman's product in the Republic, where it was denigrated because of its inferiority to a purely theoretical model. To be sure, the Timaeus presupposes the Forms as the divine workman's unchanging models (27d–29d; 30c–31b) and resorts to mathematical principles in the explanation of the cosmic order, but the focus is almost exclusively on the construction of the visible heavens. Plato now seems convinced that in order to explain the nature of a living being it is necessary to show what factors constitute such a live organism.
This intention explains certain peculiarities of the Timaeus that make the dialogue hard to penetrate. For the dialogue falls into three rather disparate parts. The first part describes the structure of the world-soul and its replication in the human soul in a way that combines formal principles of mathematics and harmonics with fantastic imagery (29d–47e). The second part consists of a rather meticulous account of the elementary physical constituents of nature on the basis of geometrically constructed atoms (47e–69a). The third part combines elements from the first and second parts in a lengthy explanation of the human physiology and psychology (69b–92c). Both the physical and the physiological explanations are hard to follow because of their very concern with detail, while the first, cosmological, part greatly taxes one's ability to fit together the notion of a divine creation of a world-soul with the bare hints at an intelligible, mathematical, and harmonic structure that explains the heavenly motions.
This is not the place to describe the complex structure of the world-soul. Suffice it to say that this structure combines three features. (1) The ingredients of the soul are the essential tools for dialectic: the soul is composed of being, sameness, and difference, i.e. three of the ‘most important kinds’ discussed in the Sophist as the objects of the philosopher's art of combination and separation (Sph. 253b–254b). Each of the three concepts that constitute the world-soul do so in a mixture of their unchangeable and their changeable types (Ti. 35a–b): it is a combination of unchangeable and changeable being, of unchangeable and changeable sameness, and unchangeable and changeable difference. What is the use of this strange concoction? As Timaeus points out, the combination of the eternal and temporal versions of the formal concepts allows the soul to comprehend both unchangeable and changeable objects in the world (37a–c). In other words, the soul has ‘unchangeable’ tools to identify the Forms, and ‘changeable’ tools to deal with the objects in the physical realm. By mixing together the two types of the formal concepts, Plato maintains the unity of the soul. There is not a world-reason dealing only with eternal being, sameness and difference, separate from the world-soul that is concerned with temporal and changeable things, their being, sameness and difference. Rather, there is one mental force that does both—resulting in either knowledge or firm belief. Nous and psuchê are united in the Timaeus. (2) The ‘mixed tools’ of dialectic are at the same time depicted as extended ‘bands’ that provide the soul with a mathematical structure through division in a complex set of proportions (35b–36b). The portions (1 - 2 - 4 - 8 - 3 - 9 - 27) of the mixture, with further subdivisions according to the arithmetical, geometrical and harmonic means, are the proportions that demarcate the intervals in theoretical harmonics (1 : 2 is the ratio underlying the octave, 3 : 2 the fifth, 4 : 3 the fourth, 9 : 8 the major second, etc.). As these harmonic divisions suggest, the world-soul is at the same time a kind of musical instrument. No music of the spheres is mentioned in the Timaeus, however, but Plato may have in mind at least the possibility of such a musical capacity. (3) The mathematical proportions are applied as explanations of the order and the motions of the heavenly bodies (36b–d). For the soul-bands, divided in different proportions, form circles that are ordered in a complicated system; they represent a geometrical model of the motions and distances of the stars revolving around the earth.
Why does Plato burden himself and his readers with such a complex machinery and what does this heavenly instrument have to do with ethics? Since the human soul is formed from the same ingredients as the world soul (albeit in a less pure form) and displays the same structure (41d–e), Plato is clearly not just concerned with the order of the universe but with that of the human soul as well. He attributes to it the possession of the kinds of concepts that are necessary for the understanding of the nature of all things, both eternal and temporal. The soul's ingredients are here limited to the purely formal conditions, however. A theory of recollection of the nature of all things is no longer being advocated. There are (a) the most important concepts to identify and differentiate objects in the way necessary for dialectical procedure; there are (b) the numbers and proportions needed to understand numerical relations and harmonic structures of all sorts; and there is (c) the capacity to perform and comprehend harmoniously coordinated motions. This, it seems, is all the soul gets and all it needs in order to perform its various tasks. The unusual depiction of the soul's composition makes it hard, at first, to penetrate to the rationale of its construction, and it must remain an open question to what extend Plato expects his model to be taken in a literal rather than in a figurative sense. His overall message should be clear, however: the soul both is a harmoniously structured entity, that can in principle function forever, and it comprehends the corresponding structures in other entities and therefore has access to all that is good and well-ordered. This last point has consequences for his ethical thought that are not developed in the Timaeus itself, but that can be detected in other late dialogues.
Plato's concern with ‘right measure’ in a sense that is relevant for ethics is, of course, not confined to his late work. It shows up rather early. Already in the Gorgias Socrates blames Callicles for the undisciplined state of his soul and attributes it to his neglect of geometry, 508a: “You've failed to notice that proportionate equality (geometrikê isotês) has great power among both gods and men.” But it is unclear whether this expression is to be taken in a more than metaphorical sense; it is, at any rate, not repeated anywhere else in Plato's earlier work. Numbers are treated as paradigmatic entities from the middle dialogues on, and in the Protagoras (156c–157e) Socrates maintains that virtue is ‘ the art of measuring’ (metrêtikê technê) pleasure and pain. But nothing further is made of that suggestion; the dialogue ends in aporia about the nature of virtue (161c–d), a fact that strongly speaks against the attribution of a kind of ‘enlightened hedonism’ to Plato, as certain interpreters are wont to do. There is no indication that Plato takes seriously the idea of a ‘quantification’ of the nature of the virtues in his middle dialogues. If mathematics looms large, then, it is as a model science on account of its exactness, the stability of its objects, and their accessibility to reason. A systematic exploration of the notion that measure and proportion are the fundamental conditions of goodness is confined to the late dialogues. Apart from the Timaeus' emphasis on a precise cosmic and mental order there is a crucial passage in the Politicus (283d–285c), where the Eleatic Stranger distinguishes two kinds of ‘art of measurement’. The first kind is the ordinary measuring of quantities relative to each other (‘the great and small’). The second kind has a normative component; it is concerned with the determination of ‘due measure’ (to metrion). The latter kind is treated with great concern, for the Eleatic Stranger claims that it is the basis of all expertise, including statesmanship, the art they are looking for (284a–b): “It is by preserving measure in this way that they produce all the good and fine things they do produce.” His point is that all good productions and all processes of generation that come to a good end presuppose ‘right measure’, while arbitrary quantities (‘the more and less’) have no such results. The Eleatic Stranger therefore suggests the separation of the simple arts of measuring from the arts concerned with ‘due measure’ (284e): “Positing as one part all those sorts of expertise that measure the numbers, lengths, depths, breadths and speeds of things in relation to what is opposed to them, and as the other, all those that measure in relation to what is in due measure (to metrion), what is fitting (to prepon), the right moment (to kairion), what is as it ought to be (to deon)—everything that is removed from the extremes to the middle (meson).” This distinction is not applied in the Politicus itself, except that due measure seems to be presupposed in the final definition of the statesman as a ‘kingly weaver’, weaving together the fabric of the state by combining the aggressive and the moderate temperaments of the population so as to produce a harmonious citizenry (305e– 311c). But no mathematics is mentioned as the condition of the ‘mixing of the citizens characters’.
The importance of measure in a literal sense becomes more explicit, however, in the Philebus. In that dialogue number (arithmos), measure (metron), and limit (peras) play a crucial role at various points of the discussion. First of all, the Philebus is the dialogue where Plato requires that numerical precision must be observed in the application of the ‘divine gift’ of dialectical procedure by collection and division (16c–17a). The dialectician must know precisely how many species and subspecies a certain genus contains; otherwise he has no claim to any kind of expertise. Despite this emphasis on precision and on the need to determine the numerical ‘limit’ in every science, Socrates does not provide the envisaged kind of numerically complete division of the two contenders for the rank of the best state of the human soul, pleasure and knowledge, because he suddenly remembers that neither of the two candidates suffices for the good life, but a mixture of the two is preferable. To explain the nature of the mixture Socrates introduces a fourfold division of all beings (23c–27c), a division that uses the categories of ‘limit’ and ‘measure’ in a different way than in the ‘divine method of dialectic’. As he now states, all beings are in the class of either (a) limit (peras), (b) the unlimited (apeiron), (c) the mixture (meixis) of the unlimited and limit, or (d) the cause (aitia) of such a mixture. As his subsequent explications concerning the four classes show, the unlimited comprises all those things that have no exact grade or measure in themselves, such as the hotter and colder, the faster and slower. Although at first the examples are confined to relative terms, the class of the unlimited is then extended to things like hot and cold, dry and moist, fast and slow, and even heat and frost. Mixture takes place when such qualities take on a definite quantity (poson) or due measure (metrion) that that delimits their variation. That only measured entities qualify as mixtures is not only suggested by the examples Socrates refers to (health, strength, beauty, music, and the seasons), but by his assertion much later in the dialogue that a mixture without due measure or proportion does not deserve its name (64d–e): “it will necessarily corrupt its ingredients and most of all itself. For there would be no blending in such cases at all, but really an unconnected medley, the ruin of whatever happens to be contained in it.” The upshot of the discussion is that all stable entities (mixtures) represent a harmonious equilibrium of their otherwise unlimited ingredients. Since indeterminate elements usually turn up in pairs of opposites, the right limit in each case is the right proportion necessary for their balance. In the case of health there must be the right balance between the hot and the cold, the dry and the moist. The cause of the proper proportion for each mixture turns out to be reason; it is the only member of the fourth class. As Socrates indicates, divine reason is the ultimate source of all that is good and harmonious in the universe, while human reason is but its poor copy (26e–27c; 28a–30e).
This adoption of a fourfold ontology allows Socrates to assign the two contenders for best state to two of the four classes: pleasure turns out to be unlimited, because it admits of the ‘more and less ’. Reason, by contrast, belongs to the fourth class, as the cause of good mixtures. On the basis of this classification the investigation provides a critical assessment of different kinds of pleasure and knowledge (31b–59d). It turns out that pleasure is at best a remedial good: pleasure is always the filling of a lack or the restoration of a harmonious state and therefore presupposes some kind of disturbance of the physical or mental equilibrium. Pleasures may be false, harmful or violent if their pursuer is mistaken about the object's identity and quantity, or if there is no real cure for the irritation. Pleasures may be ‘true and pure’ if they are compensations of harmless and unfelt kinds of lack and if their possessor is not mistaken about the object's nature (31b–55c). The rival of the pleasures, the different intellectual disciplines, also vary in quality; but in their case the difference in quality depends on the amount of mathematical precision they contain (55c–59d). The decision about what mixture will make for a happy life leads to a combination of the true and pure pleasures with all the kinds of knowledge and disciplines that are necessary for life's needs (59d–64b). In the final ranking of goods, measure and due proportion, unsurprisingly, get the first rank, things in proper proportion come in second, reason is ranked third, the different sorts of arts and sciences obtain fourth place, and the true and pure pleasures get fifth and last place on the scale of goods (64c–67b). If Plato in the Philebus is more favorably disposed towards a hedonist stance than in some of his earlier works, he is so only to a quite limited degree: he regards pleasure as a necessary ingredient in human life, because both the physical and the psychic equilibria that constitute human nature are unstable. There is always some deficiency or lack that needs supplementing. Because the range of such ‘supplements’ include learning and the pursuit of the virtues, there are some pleasures that are rightly cherished. But even they are deemed goods only because they are compensations for human imperfection.
What are we to make of this conception of happiness as a mixture of pleasure and knowledge that is based on ‘due measurement’? There are two questions worth exploring here. (1) One is the role Plato assigns to measure in his late concept of ethics. (2) There is also the question of how serious Plato is about such a ‘mathematization’ of his principles, quite generally.
(1) Though harmony and order are treated as important principles in Plato's metaphysics and ethics from early on, in his late dialogues he seems to envisage right measure in a literal sense. This explains his confidence that even physical entities can attain a relatively stable state as specified both in the Timaeus and in the Philebus: not everything is in a hopeless constant flux, but those things that possess the measure that is right for their type are stable entities and can be the objects of ‘firm and true beliefs and convictions’ (Ti. 37b–c). This applies not only to the nature of the visible universe, but also to the human body and mind, as long as they are in good condition. Plato seems to have been encouraged to embrace such theories by the advances of astronomy and harmonics in his own lifetime, so that he postulates ‘due proportion’ in an arithmetical sense as the cause of all harmony and stability. His confidence seems to have extended not only to the physical, but also to the moral state of human nature. That assumption is confirmed not only by the emphasis on right mixture in the Philebus, but also by the basic tenet of the Laws about the way the laws are to achieve peace in the state and harmony in the soul of its citizens. It seems that Plato now no longer regards the emotions as a menace to the virtues, but sees it as the legislators' obligation to provide an adequate balance of pleasure and pain by habituating citizens in the right way (632a–643a). This balance, through paideia, is crucial for maintaining a truly free soul (I 636e): “Pleasure and pain flow like two springs released by nature. If a man draws the right amount from the right one at the right time, he lives a happy life.” This is not the place to introduce the project Plato pursues in the Laws as a whole. For our purpose it suffices to notice that the discussion of the right measure of pleasure and pain forms the preface to the entire project. This is an indication of a considerable shift of emphasis in the Laws compared with Plato's treatment of the emotions in the Republic. For the form of education that provides the right habituation (ethos) concerning the measure of pleasure and pain is the topic of the Laws' second book. The emphasis put on the right measure and on the right object of pleasure and pain in the citizens' sentimental education to some degree anticipates the Aristotelian conception of the moral virtues as the right mean between excess and deficiency (II 653b–c): “Virtue is this general concord of reason and emotion. But there is one element you could isolate in any account you give, and this is the correct formation of our feelings of pleasure and pain, which makes us hate what we ought to hate from first to last, and love what we ought to love.” The confidence expressed in the Laws in the power of due measure in all matters finally culminates in the famous maxim that God is the measure of all things (IV 716c–d: “In our view, it is God who is preeminently the ‘measure of all things’, much more so than any man, as they say. So if you want to recommend yourself to someone of this character, you must do your level best to make your own character reflect his, and on this principle the moderate man is God's friend, being like him, whereas the immoderate and unjust man is not like him and is his enemy; and the same reasoning applies to the other vices too.” Because Plato—like Aristotle after him—carefully refrains from any kind of specifications about what actual right measures might be, we may treat the ‘arithmetic’ of the good life with more than a pinch of salt. That individuals differ in their internal and external conditions is as clear to Plato as it is to Aristotle. This does not shake his faith in the Laws that right habituation through the right kind of education, most of all in the arts, will provide the necessary inner equilibrium in the good citizen.
(2) As stated earlier, Plato's confidence in a mathematically structured order of the universe that also includes human nature was greatly enhanced by the progress of the scientists of his day. This seems to be the rationale for his depiction in the Timaeus of the world's creation as a construction by a divine craftsman that makes use of proportion and also takes care to give a geometrical construction to the four elements (a factor left out of consideration here). This conviction is echoed in the Philebus' emphasis on measure and proportion as the ultimate criteria of goodness. It should be noted, however, that Plato carefully refrains from going into any specifics about concrete mathematical relations. Even in the Timaeus he does not apply his complicated system of proportions when it comes to specify the actual size, distance, and speed of the heavenly bodies. Nor does he indicate in the Philebus how the art of establishing the limits of good mixtures should be obtained. It therefore remains an open question to what extent Plato regarded as viable the project of doing mathematical physics and metaphysics. That Plato went some way in that direction seems to be indicated by claims in later reports on his theory of Forms, that he either treated the Forms as numbers or associated numbers with them. Because Aristotle is quite vociferous in his criticism of this theory in Metaphysics A 6 and 9 and further expands his criticism of ideas as numbers or idea-numbers in books M and N, there must be some substance to that claim. This is not the place to enter the controversy about the nature and extent of Plato's ‘unwritten doctrine’ that has been the focus of the so-called ‘Tübingen School’ of interpreting Plato. As the obscurities in Aristotle's various reports indicate, the doctrine cannot ever have reached a definitive stage, for at one point he complains that Plato's theory relied on too few numbers (Met. 1084a10–27), while elsewhere he objects that, 1073a20: “they speak of numbers now as unlimited, now as limited by the number 10.” That Plato never presented this theory in a magisterial form is confirmed by the reports on his public ‘lecture on the good’ that scandalized the general audience because Plato, instead of speaking about ordinary goods, as expected by the uninformed public, spoke about mathematics and “finally, that the Good is one” (cf. Aristoxenos, Harmonica, II, 30). But it was not just the general public who found the message hard to comprehend. As Simplicius reports, even Plato's mature students such as Aristotle, Heraclides Ponticus, and Hestiaeus took notes on the lecture, “because it was stated enigmatically”. Simplicius also reports that Porphyry, his source, used the Philebus to unravel the enigma (In Aristotelis physica 453,29). Given the disagreements in our sources, it may forever remain a matter of debate how far Plato went in his mathematization of his metaphysics. It seems clear, however, that he must at least have entertained the hope that all that is good rests on ‘due measure’ in a more than metaphorical sense. We may well ask why he shouldered his philosophy with such heavy baggage that made it inaccessible to the mathematically untrained, an inaccessibility that largely persists to this day and age. Clearly there is one conviction that Plato never gave up: The nature of all things requires knowledge, and that condition applies most of all to the Good. And if it takes mathematical knowledge to comprehend it, then that is the way to go.
The speculative character of Plato's metaphysical thought may explain why in his late works his treatment of ethics strikes us as less rigid, more ready to come to terms with the complexity of human nature and with ordinary demands for a satisfactory life. Signs of this more conciliatory stance can be seen in the depiction of a mixed life in the Philebus, which is a life open to everyone, as well as in the suggestions in the Lawsof a second-best state, a state that is more accommodating to common human nature. It is a state that is no longer divided into three classes, and there are no philosopher-kings and -queens in control of everything (and the heavy work is done by slaves of foreign origin). The ‘overseers’ over the laws are chosen from the most upright and experienced of the citizenry. If they meet in a ‘Nocturnal Council’ this is because during the day they have the same occupations as all other citizens. If Plato does not assign unlimited power to a special class it is for two reasons. (1) He saw that persons of super-human virtue are not easy to find. (2) Scientific education and philosophy alone are no warranty of goodness. Plato no longer expects any human being to be immune to the temptations of power. Therefore in Laws book V he recommends a mixed constitution and a ‘nomocracy’ as more appropriate than a monarchy of the best minds. Humans are to be servants of the laws, not masters of each other. It may seem paradoxical that Plato became more conciliatory towards the ordinary human condition at the same time as his confidence in scientific rigor increased. But there actually is no paradox. His conciliatory stance seems, rather, to reflect his insight that, the more complex things get, the less precision is to be attained. Therefore no mathematical precision can be be expected in the ordering of as complex mixtures as the human soul and life. ‘Due measure’ as applied to the human condition must therefore be given some leeway, “if ever we are to find our way home”, as Plato lets Socrates' partner conclude in the Philebus. That ethics cannot be done with the same precision as mathematics is not, then, an insight that occurred only to Aristotle. But Plato must have thought that precision should at least be aimed for, if life is to be based on a harmonious order that is accessible, at least to a certain degree, to human knowledge.
Did Plato' conception of the good in human life, then, become more democratic in his latest works? If we follow the indications in the Timaeus concerning the good state of the human soul in ‘orderly circles’, Plato seems to remain as elitist as ever. But he no longer puts so much emphasis on the distance between the best and the ordinary. As he states in the Politicus, even the most gifted statesmen don't stick out from the rest of humankind like queen-bees do from ordinary bees. Further, all human beings have at best only ‘second best souls’ when compared with the world-soul. If all human beings have to seek the best obtainable mixture of life, and if even the best of them can be no more than servants of the laws, then Plato has indeed become more democratic in the sense that he regards the ‘human herd’ as a more uniform flock than he did in his earlier days. He retained his conviction, however, that a well-ordered soul is the prerequisite of the good life and that human beings need not only a careful moral education but also a well-regulated life. Whether the life in Plato's nomocracy would better please the modern mind than rule by the philosopher-king, however, is a question that would require a careful perusal of that enormous compendium of regulations and laws that make the Laws such hard work.
- account: logos
- appetitive part: épithumetikon
- art: technê
- being: ousia
- cause: aitia
- consonance: sumphonia
- courage: andreia
- difference: heteron
- education: paideia
- enthusiasm: enthusiasmos
- excellence: aretê
- form: eidos, idea
- function: ergon
- habit: ethos
- happiness: eudaimonia
- harmony: harmonia
- kind: eidos, idea
- justice: dikaiosunê
- likening to god: homoiôsis theô
- limit: peras
- look: idea
- love: erôs
- madness, divine: theia mania
- measure: metron; metrion
- mixture: meixis
- model: paradeigma
- moderation: sôphrosunê
- need: endeia; chreia
- number: arithmos
- order: kosmos
- perplexity: aporia
- quantity: poson
- rational part: logistikon
- reason: nous
- reasoning: logos
- recollection: anamnêsis
- refutation: elenchos
- sameness: tauton
- self-mastery: egkrateia
- self-sufficiency: autarkeia
- soul: psuchê
- sort: eidos, idea
- spirited part: thumoeides
- steadfastness: sôtêria
- unlimited: apeiron
- virtue: aretê
- weakness of the will: akrasia
- wisdom: sophia
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