Feminist Political Philosophy

First published Sun Mar 1, 2009; substantive revision Fri Dec 15, 2023

This entry turns to how feminist philosophers have intervened in and, to a great extent, transformed the intellectual field known as political philosophy, which for millennia had largely ignored matters of sex and gender. Traditional political philosophy largely sidelined and excluded the private sphere and civil society from political theorizing, the very realms in which women were largely sequestered. It focused instead on matters of state and governance. The rise of liberalism since the seventeenth century abetted this tendency by drawing a sharp line between the public and the private realms. What happened in the household, it held, were not matters of political concern. Today, thanks largely to feminist interventions, political philosophy is a far richer field of philosophical inquiry. It understands power and governance much more broadly.

In its own right, feminist political philosophy is a branch of both feminist philosophy and political philosophy. As a branch of feminist philosophy, it serves as a form of critique or a hermeneutics of suspicion (Ricœur 1970). That is, it serves as a way of opening up or looking at the political world as it is usually understood and uncovering ways in which women and their current and historical concerns are poorly depicted, represented, and addressed. As a branch of political philosophy, feminist political philosophy serves as a field for developing new ideals, practices, and justifications for how political institutions and practices should be organized and reconstructed. Indeed, the feminist refrain that “the personal is political” speaks to the fact that feminist political philosophy is not only concerned with concepts that have always been mainstays in political philosophy (e.g., justice, equality, freedom), but with redefining and expanding what is considered “political” in the first place (e.g., the family, the workplace, reproduction; Hirschmann 2007). In this sense, feminist political philosophy may be the paradigmatic branch of feminist philosophy.

While feminist philosophy has been instrumental in critiquing and reconstructing many branches of philosophy, from aesthetics to philosophy of science, feminist political philosophy is also paradigmatic because it best exemplifies the point of feminist theory, which is, to borrow a phrase from Marx, not only to understand the world but to change it (Marx 1845). And, though other fields have effects that may change the world, feminist political philosophy focuses most directly on understanding ways in which collective life can be improved. This project involves understanding the ways in which power emerges and is used or misused in public life (see the entry on feminist perspectives on power). As with other kinds of feminist theory, common themes have emerged for discussion and critique, but there has been little in the way of consensus among feminist theorists on what is the best way to understand them. This introductory article lays out the areas of concern that have occupied this vibrant field of philosophy for the past forty years. It understands feminist philosophy broadly to include work conducted by feminist theorists doing this philosophical work from other disciplines, especially political science but also anthropology, comparative literature, law, and other programs in the humanities and social sciences.

1. Historical Context and Developments

Historically, political philosophy focused on the state and various forms of governance. It largely ignored other realms as outside the scope of the political. In general, political thought presumed that political actors were necessarily male and that politics was a masculine enterprise (Okin 1979). It sharply distinguished the public realm of the state from the purportedly non-political realms of civil society and the household, hence forgoing any serious scrutiny of relations of domination in the private sphere. It presumed that women were naturally inferior to men and lacked the capacity to rule themselves. Hence traditional political thought deemed that it was appropriate for them to be ruled by their fathers or husbands, all in the sanctity of the home, immune from public scrutiny. These presuppositions went largely unremarked upon until some women began to demand the same “universal” human dignity that men were proclaiming in newly republican and democratic states of the eighteenth century (Gouges 1791). The first feminist theorists—avant la lettre of feminism—began questioning the tenets of political thought not as an abstract exercise but out of their very real, lived experience. As feminist activists and theorists entered the fray, they quickly pointed out how many of political theory’s presuppositions were thoroughly gendered. Over millennia, feminists noted, political thought coded the public realm as masculine and the private one as feminine; there was the public world of men’s work and the private domain of women’s labor. Political claims of universality were usually quite particular: for men alone.

As they did this work, drawing on their own experience, feminist political thinkers began creating new philosophical concepts. Early feminist thinkers pointed out how social conditions (such as the lack of education) diminished women’s capacities. Later, other theorists pointed to the ways that women and their concerns were excluded or sidelined. Already in the nineteenth century they were noticing how people are socially constituted. By the mid-twentieth century, again drawing from their experience and collective “consciousness-raising” groups, they began challenging norms that countenanced women being harassed on the street by catcalls and whistles. They created new concepts like “sexual harassment” and “objectification”. Over time feminist political philosophers began to notice deeper metaphysical presuppositions underlying gender divisions and to comment on how philosophy had long construed such fundamental concepts as reason, universality, and nature in thoroughly gendered and hence suspect ways. In doing this work, feminist philosophers began to transform the field of political philosophy itself, moving it from its narrow focus on governance to a broader focus on philosophical questions of identity, essence, equity, difference, justice, and the good life.

In the European and U.S. context, earlier generations of feminist scholarship and activism, including the first wave of feminism in the English-speaking world from the 1840s to the 1920s, focused on improving the political, educational, and economic system primarily for middle-class white women. Its greatest achievements were to develop a language of equal rights for women and to garner women the right to vote. Beginning in the 1960s, second wave feminists made further interventions in political theory by drawing on the language of the civil rights movements (e.g., the language of liberation) and on a new feminist consciousness that emerged through women’s solidarity movements and new forms of reflection that uncovered sexist attitudes and impediments throughout the whole of society.

These advances opened up new questions, namely: is there anything that unites women across cultures, time, and contexts? Just as Marxist theory sought out a universal subject in the person of the worker, feminists theorists sought out a commonality that united women across cultures, someone for whom feminist theory could speak. No sooner had that question been posed than it got taken down, as in the title of a paper co-written by the Latina feminist philosopher María Lugones and the white philosopher Elizabeth Spelman: “Have We Got A Theory For You: Feminist Theory, Cultural Imperialism, and the Demand for ‘The Woman’s Voice” (1986). This notion of a universal womanhood was also interrupted by other thinkers, such as bell hooks, saying that it excluded non-white and non-middle-class women’s experience and concerns. Hooks’ 1981 book titled Ain’t I a Woman? exposed mainstream feminism as a movement of a small group of middle- and upper-class white women whose experience was very particular, hardly universal. The work of Lugones, Spelman, hooks and also Cherríe Moraga, Gloria Anzaldúa, Audre Lorde, and others foregrounded the need to account for women’s multiple and complex identities and experiences. By the 1990s the debates about whether there was a coherent concept of woman that could underlie feminist politics was further challenged by non-Western women challenging the Western women’s movement as caught up in Eurocentric ideals that led to the colonization and domination of “Third World” people. What is now known as postcolonial and decolonial theories further heighten the debate between feminists who wanted to identify a universal feminist subject of woman (e.g., Okin, Nussbaum, and Ackerly) and those who call for recognizing multiplicity, diversity, and intersectionality (e.g., Spivak, Narayan, Mahmood, and Jaggar).

As a branch of political philosophy, feminist political philosophy has often mirrored the various divisions at work in political philosophy more broadly. Prior to the fall of the Berlin Wall and the end of the Cold War, political philosophy was usually divided into categories such as liberal, conservative, socialist, and Marxist. Except for conservatism, for each category there were often feminists working and critiquing alongside it. Hence, as Alison Jaggar’s classic text, Feminist Politics and Human Nature, spelled out, each ideological approach drew feminist scholars who would both take their cue from and borrow the language of a particular ideology (Jaggar 1983). Jaggar’s text grouped feminist political philosophy into four camps: liberal feminism, socialist feminism, Marxist feminism, and radical feminism. The first three groups followed the lines of Cold War global political divisions: American liberalism, European socialism, and a revolutionary communism (though few in the west would embrace Soviet-style communism). Radical feminism was the most rooted in specifically feminist approaches and activism, developing its own political vocabulary with its roots in the deep criticisms of patriarchy that feminist consciousness had produced in its first and second waves. Otherwise, feminist political philosophy largely followed the lines of traditional political philosophy. But this has never been an uncritical following. As a field bent on changing the world, even liberal feminist theorists tended to criticize liberalism as much or more than they embraced it, and to embrace socialism and other more radical points of view more than to reject them. Still, on the whole, these theorists generally operated within the language and framework of their chosen approach to political philosophy.

Political philosophy began to change enormously in the late 1980s, just before the end of the Cold War, with a new invocation of an old Hegelian category: civil society, an arena of political life intermediate between the state and the household. This was the arena of associations, churches, labor unions, book clubs, choral societies and manifold other nongovernmental yet still public organizations. In the 1980s political theorists began to turn their focus from the state to this intermediate realm, which suddenly took center stage in Eastern Europe in organizations that challenged the power of the state and ultimately led to the downfall of communist regimes. It also opened up more avenues, beyond the state, for feminist political theorizing.

After the end of the Cold War, political philosophy along with political life radically realigned. New attention focused on civil society and the public sphere, especially with the timely translation of Jürgen Habermas’s early work, the Structural Transformation of the Public Sphere (Habermas 1962 [1989]). Volumes soon appeared on civil society and the public sphere, focusing on the ways that people organized themselves and developed public power rather than on the ways that the state garnered and exerted its power. In fact, there arose a sense that the public sphere ultimately might exert more power than the state, at least in the fundamental way in which public will is formed and serves to legitimate—or not—state power. In the latter respect, John Rawls’s work was influential by developing a theory of justice that tied the legitimacy of institutions to the normative judgments that a reflective and deliberative people might make (Rawls 1971). By the early 1990s, Marxists seemed to have disappeared or at least become very circumspect (though the downfall of communist regimes needn’t have had any effect on Marxist analysis proper, which never subscribed to Leninist or Maoist thought). Socialists also retreated or transformed themselves into “radical democrats” (Mouffe [ed.] 1992a, 1993, 2000).

Now the old schema of liberal, radical, socialist, and Marxist feminisms were much less relevant. There were fewer debates about what kind of state organization and economic structure would be better for women and more debates about the value of the private sphere of the household and the nongovernmental space of associations. Along with political philosophy more broadly, more feminist political philosophers began to turn to the meaning and interpretation of civil society, the public sphere, and democracy itself. At this point in the early 1990s new work in political theory turning to civil society converged with feminist political theory that was rendering “political” realms that heretofore had been excluded from mainstream political theory. A synergy arose between those studying communitarianisms and feminists working in an ethics-of-care tradition: both pointed to how particular care relations and communal ties were as or more important than abstract principles of justice. They also began to question the binary and hierarchical divisions of justice over care, universality over particularity, and the right over the good, all metaphysical suppositions that were hardly neutral.

2. Contemporary Approaches and Debates

Political philosophy today is significantly more interesting, complex, and capacious thanks to feminist interventions in the field. While the previous section traces these interventions in broad terms, showing how political philosophy has been transformed as a result, this section will provide more detailed descriptions of some of the major sites of concern, debate, and critique animating feminist political philosophy. Because feminist political philosophy is often distinguished by its attention to the concrete realities shaping the lives of women, differences among women (cultural, social, economic, experiential) drive the rich diversity of work being done in this field, and difference itself is a major topic for theorizing with respect to foundational concepts like justice, freedom, and equality. Thus, it is important to emphasize that there is no one feminist perspective shaping work in feminist political philosophy, but a rich variety of perspectives emerging from particular contexts, histories, and traditions. They are sometimes in tension with each other.

Now in the second decade of the twenty-first century, feminist theorists are doing an extraordinary variety of work on matters political and democratic that confront new and/or pressing challenges. Similar developments in the areas of global ethics, public policy, human rights, disabilities studies, bioethics, climate change, and international development blur the distinction between theory and practice in philosophically generative ways.

For example, in global ethics there is a debate over whether there are universal values of justice and freedom that should be intentionally cultivated for women in the developing world or whether cultural diversity should be prioritized. Feminist theorists have sought to answer this question in a number of different and compelling ways. (For some examples see Ackerly 2000; Ackerly & Okin 1999; Benhabib 2002 and 2006; Butler 2000; Gould 2004; Khader 2019; Abu-Lughod 2013; Nussbaum 1999a; and Zerilli 2009; see also the entry on feminist perspectives on globalization.)

Modern abolitionist feminism is driven by the contributions of Black feminist philosophers like Angela Davis (2003, 2005, 2016, and in Davis, Dent, Meiners, & Richie 2022), whose work on the racialized prison industrial complex has helped spur the social-political movement to abolish prisons and develop new theories of restorative justice. Contemporary feminist theories of abolitionism have also built on Michel Foucault’s critique of the prison, generating new work on political resistance to social structures of incarceration, as well as new ways of exploring foundational political concepts like privacy, freedom, and justice (Pitts 2021b; Zurn & Dilts [ed.] 2016; Zurn 2021). (See also Ruth Wilson Gilmore 2007 and 2022; Davis, Dent, Meiners, & Richie 2022; Guenther 2013; Montford & Taylor [eds] 2022.)

The work of feminist legal theorists (see the entry on feminist philosophy of law) has been transformative on both the theory and policy fronts. In her 1989 article “Demarginalizing the Intersection of Race and Sex” Kimberlé Crenshaw critiqued “single-axis” legal frameworks for failing to address race- and gender-based discrimination occurring at the intersection of multiple identities (Crenshaw 1989). Instead, she promoted an intersectional framework and, along with many others, developed a theory of intersectionality as an analytic framework for understanding how compounded and intermeshed systems of privilege and oppression structure experience (see also section 2.6 below). Along with Crenshaw, Anita Allen (2011), Martha Fineman (2008 [2011]), Catherine MacKinnon (1987, 1989), Mari J. Matsuda (1986, 1996), and Patricia J. Williams (1991) are prominent legal scholars whose work has made significant contributions to debates in feminist political philosophy.

Feminists contributions in ethics and moral psychology that emphasize relations of care have also had a major impact on political philosophy. This intervention has challenged masculinist characterizations of political subjects as highly independent and rational, as well as core concepts within political philosophy (e.g., justice, freedom, rights, sovereignty, and autonomy) derived from that characterization (see also section 2.5 below).

Likewise, new philosophical work on disabilities, as the entry on feminist perspectives on disability explains, is informed by a great deal of feminist theory, from standpoint philosophy to feminist phenomenology and feminist care ethics, as well as political philosophical questions of identity, difference, and diversity (see also Kittay & Carlson [ed.] 2010). Feminist political philosophers like Martha Nussbaum (2006) have drawn on the insights of philosophers of disability to offer new conceptions of justice (i.e., the capabilities approach).

Ultimately, the number of approaches that can be taken on any of these issues are as many as the number of philosophers there are working on them. The remainder of this entry will outline a variety of approaches to central concerns in feminist political philosophy, noting general family resemblances among these approaches (i.e., liberal feminist, radical feminist, Marxist feminist, socialist feminist) and highlighting new constellations that have emerged (e.g., intersectional feminisms).

2.1 Feminist Engagements with Liberalism and Neoliberalism

Liberal feminism remains a strong current in feminist political thought. Following liberalism’s focus on freedom and equality, liberal feminism’s primary concern is to protect and enhance women’s personal and political autonomy, the first being the freedom to live one’s life as one chooses and the second being the freedom to help decide the direction of the political community. This follows from Enlightenment liberalism’s core norm of equal respect for personhood, where personhood is tied to moral equality, or the equal worth of persons as moral choosers (Nussbaum 1999a). This approach was invigorated with the publication of John Rawls’s A Theory of Justice (1971) and subsequently his Political Liberalism (1993). Susan Moller Okin (1989, 1979, 1999), Eva Kittay (1999), Martha Nussbaum (2006), and Amy Baehr (2017) have used Rawls’s work productively to extend his theory to attend to women’s concerns.

Perhaps more than any other approach, liberal feminist theory parallels developments in liberal feminist activism. While feminist activists have waged legal and political battles to criminalize, as just one example, violence against women (which previously, in marital relations, hadn’t been considered a crime), feminist political philosophers who have engaged the liberal lexicon have shown how the distinction between private and public realms has served to uphold male domination of women by rendering power relations within the household as “natural” and immune from political regulation. Such political philosophy uncovers how seemingly innocuous and “commonsensical” categories have covert power agendas. For instance, Clare Chambers has critiqued the institution of marriage, arguing that it violates liberal political principles of equality and liberty (Chambers 2017a). Feminist critiques of the public/private split supported legal advances that finally led in the 1980s to the criminalization in the United States of spousal rape (Sigler & Haygood 1988). Efforts to politicize the private sphere have also challenged the capitalist economic system that relies on women’s unpaid labor. As the entry on feminist perspectives on class and work explains, scholars like Silvia Federici have argued that women’s unpaid housework and reproductive labor is essential to the social reproduction of capitalism that exploits women. The “wages for housework” movement led by scholar-activists like Federici is an attempt to demand remuneration for women’s unpaid work (Federici 2012, 2021; more on this Marxist feminist lineage in section 2.3). Reproductive justice, pornography, and sex work are yet more issues of convergence for feminist proponents and critics of liberalism alike (see the section on Reproductive Rights in the entry on feminist philosophy of law; Altman & Watson 2019; Watson & Flanigan 2020). While the U.S. legal tradition has typically grounded abortion rights in the right to privacy, feminist political philosophers such as Shatema Threadcraft (2016) have understood reproductive justice as more fundamentally having to do with the freedom to choose one’s destiny. As such, it is connected to the history of other struggles for race and gender equality in earlier eras.

Carole Pateman and Charles Mills have worked within the liberal tradition to show the limits and faults of social contract theory, and Enlightenment liberalism more broadly, for women and people of color. Their jointly authored book, Contract & Domination, levels a devastating critique against systems of sexual and racial domination. This work engages and critiques some of the most dominant strains of political philosophy. Martha Nussbaum has defended liberalism from some of its critics, arguing that the most appealing versions of liberalism successfully avoid feminist criticisms that liberalism is overly individualistic, abstract, and rationalist (Nussbaum 1999a). She does however take seriously two deep and unresolved problems within liberalism “exposed by feminist thinkers”: (1) the fact of dependency and the need for care and (2) gender inequality and the family (Nussbaum 2004). With respect to dependency—the reality of human dependency and thus the need for care throughout the course of life—Asha Bhandary (2020) has developed a Rawlsian social contract framework to expose and address systemic inequalities in who receives and provides care (see also Bhandary & Baehr [eds] 2021 and section 2.5 below). With respect to the second issue, which deals with the social institution of the family as a site of gender hierarchy and oppression, Marxist, socialist, and materialist feminists have analyzed the material conditions under which these social arrangements (the family and gender hierarchy) have developed. These feminists typically critique liberalism for entrenching social arrangements (such as the public/private split and the system of wage labor) that arise with capitalism and marginalize and disempower women as a social group (see section 2.3 below).

As other feminist critics have argued, many of the central categories of liberalism occlude women’s lived concerns. For example, the right to privacy coveted by classical liberals is a major source of contention for feminists: the private realm, understood as a domain free from state intervention, has historically been the domain where women and children have experienced the bulk of everyday forms of oppression. The liberal private/public distinction sequesters the private sphere, and any harm that may occur there to women, away from political scrutiny (Pateman 1988). Other feminist critics note that liberalism continues to treat as unproblematic concepts that theorists in the 1990s and since have problematized, such as “woman” as a stable and identifiable category and the univocity of the self underlying self-rule or autonomy. Decolonial feminists like María Lugones have exposed the Eurocentric foundations of this view of the self (Lugones 2003; see also section 2.7). While Mari Matsuda develops a feminist critique of the methodological abstraction in liberal theories such as Rawls’ A Theory of Justice (Matsuda 1986), others (such as Zerilli 2009) have argued that the universal values that liberal feminists such as Okin invoked were really expanded particulars, with liberal theorists mistaking their ethnocentrically derived values as universal ones. In this vein, Falguni Sheth, focusing on the treatment of Muslim women in the contemporary United States, argues that despite liberal claims to secular neutrality, liberal states actively exclude and discriminate against racialized and marginalized populations (Sheth 2022).

Beyond liberal feminism, contemporary feminist philosophers have led the way in theorizing and critiquing what is known as neoliberalism, especially the ways that neoliberal social and economic forces impact the lives of women. On Wendy Brown’s account (2015), neoliberalism refers to a set of relations between state, society, and subjects that mimics and reinforces radical free-market ideals in the economy. These forces, Brown argues, undermine liberal democratic citizenship, public institutions, and popular sovereignty. Nancy Fraser (2013), Jodi Dean (2009), Bonnie Honig (2017) and Judith Butler (2015) join Brown in asking whether democracy—or “the demos”—can be sustained under neoliberal conditions of rapidly increasing economic precariousness and diminishing social and political resources for resistance. Meanwhile, Elizabeth Anderson asks how putatively positive values like “work ethic” have become central to the moral and physical exploitation of workers under neoliberalism.

2.2 Radical Feminism

While feminist liberalism continues to flourish, the historical developments and emerging debates described in the previous sections have eclipsed or deeply transformed Jaggar’s other three categories of radical, Marxist, and socialist feminism (Jaggar 1983). The “grand narratives” that underlay the latter two have become less credible (Snyder 2008). Among theorists, radical feminism has always been somewhat of a niche approach, likely because its stance is rather exacting. As the name “radical” suggests, radical feminists share the belief that existing structures and institutions need to be overhauled—rather than reformed, as liberalism would have it—in order to get at the “root” of women’s oppression.

Those who work in radical feminism continue to take issue with many of the central tenets of liberal feminism, especially its focus on the individual and the supposedly free choices that individuals can make. Where the liberal sees the potential for freedom, the radical feminist sees structures of domination that are bigger than any individual. The idea that domination and oppression affect social groups in ways that are structural and systemic, though they may be experienced differently by members of different social groups, is a major contribution of feminist political philosophy (Frye 1983; Young 1990). Radical feminists remain committed to getting at the root of male domination by understanding the source of power differentials, which some radical feminists, including Catharine MacKinnon, trace back to sexuality and the notion that heterosexual intercourse enacts male domination over women.

Women and men are divided by gender, made into the sexes as we know them, by the requirements of its dominant form, heterosexuality, which institutionalizes male sexual dominance and female sexual submission. If this is true, sexuality is the linchpin of gender inequality. (MacKinnon 1989: 113)

Patriarchy itself, according to this view, dominates women by positioning them as objects of men’s desire (Welch 2015). Radical feminists of the 1980s tended to see power as running one-way, from those with power over those who are being oppressed. As Amy Allen puts it,

Unlike liberal feminists, who view power as a positive social resource that ought to be fairly distributed, and feminist phenomenologists, who understand domination in terms of a tension between transcendence and immanence, radical feminists tend to understand power in terms of dyadic relations of dominance/subordination, often understood on analogy with the relationship between master and slave. (2005: §3.2)

Radical feminists of the 1970s and 1980s sought to reject the prevailing order in various ways, sometimes advocating separatism (Daly 1973 [1985], 1978 [1990]), the technologization of procreation (and thus freeing women from their oppressive role in biological reproduction; Firestone 1970), or, as MacKinnon would have it, rejecting normative sexuality as rooted in male domination (MacKinnon 1989). As Nancy Hirschmann notes, many radical feminists take biology as a “fundamental starting point” for theorizing (Hirschmann 2007: 146). This approach is generally recognized to be retrograde.

A new generation of radical feminist theorists are renewing the tradition, showing how it has respected concerns such as intersectionality (Whisnant 2016) and shares some of the commitments of the postmodern feminists discussed below, e.g., skepticism about any fixed gender identity or gender binaries and a more fluid and performative approach to sexuality and politics (Snyder 2008), as well as the ways that power and privilege continue to hold women back (Chambers 2017b: 656).

2.3 Socialist, Marxist, and Materialist Feminisms

Throughout the twentieth century, many political theorists in Europe, the United States, and Latin America drew on socialist and Marxist texts to develop theories of social change attentive to issues of class relations and exploitation in modern capitalist economies. By and large, Marxist feminists focus on how modes of production, along with changing relations of production and reproduction shape the social arrangements (e.g., the gender division of labor, gender hierarchy) and institutions (e.g., marriage, motherhood, the family) that contribute to women’s oppression. After learning of the horrors of Stalinism, most Western Marxists and socialists, feminists included, were extremely critical of the communist systems in the Soviet Union and later in China. Western, mostly anti-communist, Marxist thought flourished in Italy (with Antonio Gramsci’s work), England (with Stuart Hall and Raymond Williams’ work), France (with the Socialisme ou Barbarie group), and the United States (less so there after McCarthyism, yet renewed somewhat in the 1960s with the New Left). Jaggar’s 1983 book summed up well the way feminists were using socialist and Marxist ideas to understand the way women were exploited and their laboring and reproductive work devalued and unpaid though necessary for capitalism to function. Drawing on Frederick Engels’ emphasis on the “reproduction of immediate life”, Marxist and socialist feminists were able to move beyond more orthodox readings of Marx that restrict focus to modes of “production” that privilege the experience of men as wage-laborers (Engels 1884: Preface). Social reproduction theorists instead analyze forms of labor, most often women’s unpaid labor, that contribute to the maintenance of life at the individual, family, and species level (see Bhattacharya [ed.] 2017; Federici 2004 and 2021; S. Ferguson 2019). In the entry on feminist perspectives on class and work, the authors point to much of the work that was going on in this field up through the mid-1990s. Since then, the authors note, various postmodern, postcolonial, poststructuralist, and deconstructive theories have criticized the bases for socialist and Marxist thought, including the “grand narrative” of economic determinism and the reduction of everything to economic and material relations. Despite this, Marxist analyses remain important to a variety of work being done in contemporary feminist political philosophy (see Dean 2009; Delphy 1984; Federici 2004; Fraser 2009, 2022; Gago 2019 [2020]; Spivak 1987; Vogel 1983).

While the lineage and trajectory of materialist feminism (as distinct from Marxist or socialist feminism) is unclear (see Gimenez 2000), Marxist, Socialist, and materialist feminisms all share an attention to the concrete material conditions underlying existing social arrangements (e.g., of gender hierarchy), the historically specific nature of these conditions, and a commitment to feminism as an emancipatory movement, not merely a scholarly endeavor. Meanwhile, feminists associated with these schools of thought tend to diverge when it comes to which topics of analysis are taken up, which aspects of Marx’s theory are considered pertinent for explaining women’s oppression, and the relationship between feminism and (anti)capitalism (Gimenez 2000). While the categories of socialist and Marxist feminisms are less relevant today, materialist feminism is experiencing something of a renaissance. While “materialist” can mean many things, as in the broader focus on matter and the body animating the work of “New Materialism” (e.g., see Coole & Frost [ed.] 2010), for the purposes of this entry, “materialist feminism” has a deeper and more explicit connection to the Marxist usage of the term “materialism” as described by Engels (and referenced above):

According to the materialist conception, the decisive element of history is pre-eminently the production and reproduction of life and its material requirements. This implies, on the one hand, the production of the means of existence (food, clothing, shelter and the necessary tools); on the other hand, the generation of children, the propogation of the species. (Engels 1884 [trans. Untermann 1902], Preface).

In Martha Gimenez’s view, the fact that materialist feminism has somewhat displaced Marxist and socialist feminisms may have more to do with the “ideological balance of power” in politics, academia, and publishing than the strength of feminist critiques of Marxism for its alleged economism and class reductionism (Gimenez 2000: 25).

Since the 1990s, the feminist concern with culture, identity, and difference—issues that were previously marginalized within mainstream white Anglo-American and French feminist theory and activism—increased, somewhat displacing Marxist and socialist feminism’s focus on systemic social forces and concrete material conditions. Certainly, new generations of materialist feminists and critical theorists tend to be more friendly to postmodern theories of meaning, identity, and subjectivity important in the field (see, for example, Fraser 2009; Fraser & Jaeggi 2018; Amy Allen 2008; McAfee 2008; and Young 2000) and classic works by philosophers like Angela Davis (Women, Race, and Class, 1981) demonstrate that concerns about identity, culture, and difference are not incompatible with Marxist feminist analysis.

2.4 Poststructuralist Feminisms

Like Marxist/materialist feminists who take seriously the role that sexual difference plays in systems of production and reproduction, poststructuralist feminists also take sexual difference seriously, attending to the ways in which language and meaning-systems structure experience. Notable among them are the so-called French Feminists, namely Cixous, Kristeva, and Irigaray. Of them all, Irigaray may have the most developed political philosophy, including several books on the rights that should be afforded to girls and women. Irigaray’s early work (1974 [1985a] and 1977 [1985b]) made the case that in the history of philosophy women have been denied their own essence or identity. Rather, they have been positioned as men’s mirror negation. So that to be a man is to not be a woman, and hence that woman equals only not-man. Her strategy in response to this is to speak back from the margins to which women have been relegated and to claim some kind of “essence” for women, and, along with that, a set of rights that are specifically for girls and women (Irigaray 1989 [1994] and 1992 [1996]). Criticisms of her views have been heated, including among feminists themselves, especially those who are wary of any kind of essentialist and biological conflation of women’s identity. To the extent that Irigaray is an essentialist, her view would be relegated to what is sometimes called symbolic difference feminism (Dietz 2003). However, there are also compelling arguments that Irigaray is wielding essentialism strategically or metaphorically, that she isn’t claiming that women really do have some kind of irreducible essence that the history of metaphysics has denied them (Fuss 1989). This other reading would put Irigaray more in the performative group described below (section 2.8). The same kind of argument could be made for the work of Julia Kristeva—that her metaphors of the female chora, for example, are describing the Western imaginary, not any kind of womanly reality. So whether French feminist thought should be grouped as difference feminism or performative feminism is still very much open to debate.

To the extent that the above two types of feminist theory are pinpointing some kind of specific difference between the sexes, they raise concerns about essentialism or identifying distinct values that women have as women. Such concerns are part of a larger set of criticisms that have run through feminist theorizing since the 1970s, with non-white, non-middle-class, and non-western women questioning the very category of “woman” and the notion that this title could be a boundary-spanning category that could unite women of various walks of life. (See the entries on identity politics and feminist perspectives on sex and gender.) Criticisms of a unitary identity of “woman” have been motivated by worries that much feminist theory has originated from the standpoint of a particular class of women who mistake their own particular standpoint for a universal one. In her 1981 book, Ain’t I a Woman?: Black women and feminism, bell hooks notes that the feminist movement pretends to speak for all women but was made up of primarily white, middle class women who, because of their narrow perspective, did not represent the needs of poor women and women of color and ended up reinforcing class stereotypes (hooks 1981). What is so damning about this kind of critique is that it mirrors the one that feminists have leveled against mainstream political theorists who have taken the particular category of men to be a universal category of mankind, a schema that does not in fact include women under the category of mankind but marks them as other (Lloyd 1984 [1993]).

The question of subjectivity has been a particularly fertile one for feminist political philosophy. Feminist politics and activism, informed by poststructuralist and postcolonial critiques of the subject, have spurred new work that seeks to understand what remains of the “feminist subject” after critiques of essentialism and Eurocentrism (Butler 1995; Kramer 2017; Weeks 1998; Zerilli 2005).

2.5 Care, Vulnerability, Affect

Many of the recent developments in feminist political philosophy have followed on the heels of feminist critiques or reinterpretations of the Western philosophical canon. Earlier works by Wendy Brown (1988), Alison Jaggar (1989), Genevieve Lloyd (1984 [1993]), Susan Moller Okin (1979, 1989), Carole Pateman (1988, 1989), and others, revealed the masculinist foundations of mainstream political theory. As Okin put it,

[It] has proved to be no simple matter to integrate women into a tradition of theorizing created by, for, and about men. (Okin 1998: 118)

As she goes on to say,

Great value has been placed on things traditionally associated with men—on the allegedly transcendent nonphysical realm, on excessive individualism, on reason as all-important, and on the so-called manly virtues—including competitiveness and aggression. At the same time, the realm of things traditionally associated with women—concern with physical needs and nurturance, emotionality, cooperation (with other people and with nature)—have been much more inclined to be denigrated. (Okin 1998: 119)

Rather than attempting to align their theories with those values of individualism, rationality, and abstraction associated with masculinity (and classical liberalism), many feminist thinkers have instead sought to revalue traditionally denigrated values associated with femininity.

A prime example is care ethics (see the discussion in the entry on feminist ethics). Drawing on Carol Gilligan’s pathbreaking research in moral psychology (Gilligan 1982), which showed that the dominant conception of moral development and subjectivity was really a reflection of a particular, masculine style of moral reasoning, feminist political theorists challenged dominant conceptions of political subjectivity, judgment, and action. Just as Gilligan and other feminist ethicists emphasized that styles of moral reasoning associated with women were not inferior because of their distinctiveness from masculinist models—and that distinctiveness includes an emphasis on emotions like empathy and care, responsiveness to need, and an awareness of one’s connection with others and the natural world—feminist political philosophers argued that ways of looking at and organizing the world informed by care are not inferior or pathological. This spurred new approaches to theorizing foundational political concepts that are at odds with liberal political theory in particular. First and foremost, political theorists influenced by the care ethics tradition insist that political subjects are not independent, but fundamentally (inter)dependent, enmeshed in complex networks of relation necessary for survival. This means that as political agents, we do not act on our own, but rely on others who are themselves dependent. This transformed view of the self has both theoretical and practical implications. From a care perspective, agency is relational, and individuals are nonsovereign and heteronomous. Taking up insights about our varied proximity to states of dependency throughout the course of life arising in the field of disability studies, thinkers like Judith Butler have argued that vulnerability is both an enabling and constraining feature of our ontological condition and one that is often politically induced in particular populations, marking them as “precarious” (Butler 2004, 2015). In her 2017 book The Right to Maim, Jasbir Puar draws on similar theoretical approaches in disability studies and biopolitics to analyze and critique the ways that the liberal nation-state “debilitates” populations in order to discipline and control them (Puar 2017). This recent work marks an interest among feminist political theorists in exposing the myriad ways that contemporary liberal and neoliberal frameworks care-lessly intensify and/or manipulate vulnerability. Along with disability, these thinkers seek to expose the ways that gender, race, ethnicity, immigration status, and age are complexly enmeshed in these scenes of abandonment (see also Fineman 2008 [2011]; Fraser 2022; Povinelli 2011; Collins 1990 [2000]). From a policy standpoint, care has also been front and center for feminist political thinkers, especially in the wake of the COVID-19 global pandemic, which exposed the radical insufficiency of our infrastructures of care. The authors of The Care Manifesto (known as “The Care Collective”, 2020) explore how we might reorganize our institutions and relationships to meet the moment, including reclaiming public spaces, making healthcare for all a reality, and taking action to protect the natural world.

Some of the foundations and consequences of the care ethics approach have also produced serious skepticism from feminist political philosophers. First, there is the question of whether and, if so, how women-as-care-givers have distinct virtues. Feminists as a whole have long distanced themselves from the idea that women have any particular essence, choosing instead to see femininity and its accompanying virtues as social constructs, dispositions that result from culture and conditioning, not biological givens. So for care ethicists to champion the virtues that have inculcated femininity seems also to champion a patriarchal system that relegates one gender to the role of caretaker. The care ethicists’ answer to this problem has often been to flip the hierarchy. That is, to claim that the work of the household is more meaningful and sustaining than the work of the polis. But critics, such as Drucilla Cornell, Mary Dietz, and Chantal Mouffe, argue that such a revaluation keeps intact the dichotomy between the private and the public and the old association of women’s work with childcare (Butler & Scott [eds.] 1992; Phillips [ed.] 1998: 386–389).

Feminist political theorists associated with the care tradition have explored how the distinct values that arise from practices of care might transform our political concepts, aims, and organizations. How might those activities and values typically relegated to the private realm provide an alternative to the traditional emphases in moral and political philosophy on impartiality, rationality, and universal principles of justice in the public realm? The care approach challenged the default to abstract principles in political philosophy, leading to intense debates between liberals who advocated universal ideals of justice and care ethicists who advocated attention to the particular, to relationships, to care. In Gilligan’s early work, for instance, the care approach is presented as opposed to what she terms “the justice approach”, giving the impression that the two approaches are separate and mutually exclusive styles of moral reasoning (Gilligan 1982). By the 1990s, however, many care ethicists had revised their views. Rather than seeing care and justice as mutually exclusive alternatives, they began to recognize that attention to care should be accompanied by attention to fairness (justice) in order to attend to the plight of those with whom we have no immediate relation (Koggel 1998). Moreover, they recognized that the need to evaluate existing practices or systems of care requires applying principles of justice like equality and fairness (Held [ed.] 1995; Kittay 2002; Schutte 2002).

Like care, the history of Western philosophy has largely disregarded the role of emotion in political life, in particular because emotionality is frequently associated with women and racialized others. However, feminist political philosophers have insisted on the importance of this intersection (for example Hall 2005, Krause 2008, and Nussbaum 2013). Building on the contributions of feminist care ethicists and difference feminists who worked to show the significance of positive affects typically associated with femininity in ethical encounters—such as love, interest, and care—(see Held [ed.] 1995; Tronto 1993), other thinkers worried that this appraisal merely reified a false (gendered) dichotomy between reason and emotion, mind and body. Instead, early work by Alison Jaggar (1989), Elizabeth Spelman (1989 and 1991), Genevieve Lloyd (1984 [1993]), Elizabeth Grosz (1994), and others argued that reason is both embodied and emotion-laden, and that emotion has epistemic and moral value. Building on this work, feminist political theorists have argued that understanding the role of emotion and affect is crucial for understanding a number of important political phenomena: motivation for action (Krause 2008), collective action and community formation (Beltrán 2009 & 2010; Butler 2004 & 2015), solidarity and patriotism (Nussbaum 2006 and 2013), as well as vulnerability (Fineman 2008 [2011]), racism and xenophobia (Ahmed 2004 [2014]; Anker 2014; Ioanide 2015). Meanwhile, others examine the political significance of specific emotions, for instance: shame (Ahmed 2004 [2014]), grief (Butler 2004), anger (Cherry 2021; Spelman 1989; Lorde 1984), fear (Anker 2014), empathy (Hirji 2022), and love (Nussbaum 2013).

More recently, many feminist critics have turned their attention to the ways that neoliberalism demands resiliency and self-reliance in the face of increasing precarity. Some borrow from Michel Foucault’s late work on biopolitics, examining how neoliberal demands for autonomy, self-sufficiency, self-discipline, and self-investment impact individuals on the level of subjectivity, making both life and the possibility of political action to transform the conditions of life increasingly untenable. Individuals, they argue, are met with increasing vulnerability to economic forces and fewer resources to overcome vulnerability due to social isolation and limited access to social services (Butler 2015; Povinelli 2011). Some feminists study how subjectivity, affect, and morality accommodate these neoliberal trends. For instance, this shows up in how the demand to “overcome vulnerability” via the contemporary emphasis on individual “resilience” attempts to transform vulnerable persons, especially women, into productive neoliberal subjects (James 2015), how productive emotions like “happiness” are encouraged and unruly ones like “willfulness” are discouraged (Berlant 2011; Ahmed 2014), or how the targeted discourse around “self-care” can contribute to individualist consumer culture that diminishes women’s capacities for collective action (Ahmed 2017). Instead, many feminist critiques challenge neoliberal individualism by reasserting that agency need not be synonymous with autonomy, and propose nonsovereign or relational accounts of the agentic subject instead (Butler 2015). Along with care, some theorists have turned to contemplative practices like meditation (in the Zen Buddhist tradition, for instance) to recover important resources for democratic life (Mariotti 2020).

2.6 Intersectional Feminisms

One of the issues that has been most vexing and generative for feminist theory in general and feminist political philosophy in particular is the matter of identity (see the entry on identity politics). Identity politics, itself a politically vexed term, refers to political practices of mobilizing for change on the basis of a political identity (women, Black, Chicana, etc.; see Alcoff 2006; Matsuda 1996). The philosophical debate is whether such identities are based on some real difference or history of oppression, and also whether people should embrace identities that have historically been used to oppress them. Identity politics in feminist practice is fraught because for some feminists, concerns about identity are thought to weaken feminist political unity and solidarity (Hooker 2009; Zerilli 2005). As Emi Koyama writes in the introduction to “The Transfeminist Manifesto”:

The latter half of the twentieth century witnessed an unprecedented broadening of American feminist movement as the result of the participation of diverse groups of women. When a group of women who had previously been marginalized within the mainstream of the feminist movement broke their silence, demanding their rightful place within it, they were first accused of fragmenting feminism with trivial matters, and then were eventually accepted and welcomed as a valuable part of the feminist thought. We have become increasingly aware that the diversity is our strength, not weakness. (Koyama 2001: 11)

Moreover, feminist theorists of color have shown (Davis 1981; hooks 1981; Lorde 1984; Mohanty 1991) that the feminist movement has always elevated the interests of some groups and ignored or disfigured the interests of others. What looks like unity or neutrality is often exclusion. Indeed, those for whom “woman” is only one of several sources for group identification (e.g, Black women) have raised questions about which identity is foremost or whether either identity is apt. Such questions play out with the question of political representation—what aspects of identity are politically salient and truly representative, whether race, class, or gender (Phillips 1995; Young 1997, 2000). The ontological question of women’s identity gets played out on the political stage when it comes to matters of political representation, group rights, and affirmative action. The 2008 U.S. Democratic Party primary battle between Senators Barack Obama and Hillary Clinton turned this philosophical question into a very real and heated one from Black women throughout the United States. Was a Black woman who supported Clinton a traitor to her race, or a Black woman who supported Obama a traitor to her sex? Or did it make any sense to talk about identity in a way that would lead to charges of treason?

Theories of intersectionality emerged in the U.S. context from the groundbreaking work of multiple thinkers (for an excellent history of the emergence of “intersectionality” within Black feminist and womanist thought, see J. Nash 2019), including Kimberlé Crenshaw’s “Demarginalizing the Intersection of Race and Sex: A Black Feminist Critique of Antidiscrimination Doctrine, Feminist Theory and Antiracist Practice” (Crenshaw 1989), Patricia Hill Collins’s book Black Feminist Thought: Knowledge, Consciousness and the Politics of Empowerment (Collins 1990), Angela Davis’s Women, Race, and Class (Davis 1981), Audre Lorde’s Sister Outsider (1984), and Patricia Williams’s The Alchemy of Race and Rights (Williams 1991). While their specific language and emphasis varies, these theorists and others generally agree that intersectionality is an analytic framework that helps to understand how oppression and privilege along particular “axes” of identity (gender, race, class, disability, and the like) do not work independently, but intermesh in complex ways that shape our social relations, identities, interests, and experiences. The impact of this work was felt strongly where it originated in feminist legal theory (see feminist philosophy of law), and has continued to be an important concept for theories of power and oppression in and out of feminist political philosophy. (See also the section on intersectionality in the entry on discrimination.)

2.7 Transnational, Decolonial, and Indigenous Feminisms

While intersectionality emerged largely within the U.S. context, transnational, decolonial, and indigenous feminists theorize the political across, between, and against nation-state borders. Indeed, “the border” becomes an important geopolitical, cultural, and symbolic figure animating the work of feminist thinkers in this area. Here, like elsewhere in feminist political philosophy, new ideas in philosophy are often generated through the examination of practical political concerns in the lives of women. For scholars working in these areas, many of the issues and theories discussed emerge from ongoing histories of colonialism, settler colonialism, and imperialism.

The writings of postcolonial and transnational feminist theorists often raised the need for awareness of multiple global perspectives as a challenge to Euro- and Anglo-centric feminist theory by focusing on the lived realities of women in the Global South, such as issues related to working conditions and migration (Walia 2013). Chandra Talpade Mohanty’s Feminism without Borders (2003) is a pathbreaking work in this respect, examining both the theoretical and practical political consequences of global capitalism for women across the globe and for the future of feminist struggle. In the Middle Eastern context, Lila Abu-Lughod famously asked “Do Muslim Women Need Saving?” (2013), challenging the notion in many strains dominant in Western feminism that Muslim women are oppressed by their own culture (for more on culture see Narayan 1997). Discussing the impact of transnational feminist work during this period, Sharon Krause writes that, “this development involved the ‘world diversification’ of feminism to a more global, comparative, and differentiated body of work” (Krause 2011: 106). This diversification, Krause notes, is also due to new literature on intersectionality, that is, the ways in which the intersections of our multiple identities (race, gender, orientation, ethnicity, etc.) all need to be attended to in talking about political change (Krause 2011: 107). Intersectionality also resonates with discussions of “hybridity” in postcolonial literature, of religion and globalization, and of the experiences of LGBTQ people. “The result is an explosion of knowledge about the lived experience of differently placed and multiply-positioned women” (2011: 107). Given so many sources of difference and division among women across the globe, is a transnational feminist solidarity possible? Are there universal values and commitments on which to ground feminist activism and solidarity that do not reproduce Western ethnocentrism and imperialism? (For approaches to these questions, see Khader 2019.)

While transnational feminist theorists are largely concerned with the impacts of cross-border global processes, indigenous feminist contributions to political theory in the U.S. and Canada have developed important critiques of settler colonialism and its borders (for more on settler colonial states, decolonial resistance, and post-colonial theory see the entry on colonialism). Audra Simpson’s Mohawk Interruptus: Political Life Across the Borders of Settler States (2014) “interrupts” settler colonial conceptualizations of political terms like legitimacy and sovereignty with alternative meanings rooted in Kahnawà:ke Mohawk life and the political history of the Iroquois Confederacy. (See also Leanne Betasamosake Simpson 2017 on place-based resistance to settler colonialism.) In the Australian context, Aileen Moreton-Robinson challenges the ways that white women inside and outside of the academy benefit from colonialism and strategically wield power against indigenous women (Moreton-Robinson 2000). These concerns mark a broader and increasing focus among indigenous, decolonial, and intersectional feminists on critiques of whiteness (see also Alcoff 2006 & 2015).

Decolonial feminists overlap in many areas with other women of color feminists, but they bring several unique concerns specific to the colonial and post-colonial experience. In contemporary decolonial theory, these concerns are largely framed within the discourse of “coloniality”, first theorized in terms of “coloniality of power” by Anibal Quijano (2003). Here, “coloniality” refers to how relations between colonizer and colonized are racialized, for instance how labor, subjectivity, and authority are racialized around the colonial system of capitalist exploitation. (For more on “coloniality”, see Lugones 2010; Mignolo 2000; Maldonado Torres 2008; Wynter 2003.) For feminist thinkers like María Lugones (2007, 2010), gender is another axis around which the global capitalist system of power classifies and dehumanizes colonized people. For Lugones and others, including Oyèrónkẹ́ Oyěwùmí (1997), gender is a colonial imposition in tension with non-modern cosmologies, economies, and modes of kinship. Lugones calls this the “coloniality of gender”, noting that de-colonizing gender is part of a wider project of decolonial resistance opposed to the categorial, dichotomous, and hierarchical logics of capitalist modernity that are rooted in the colonization of the Americas. According to Lugones, the autonomous, independent, and univocal conception of the self is one of the Eurocentric “logics of purity” that has become culturally dominant, shaping our modes of political thought and action in ways that pathologize decolonial resistance. Lugones’ critique is especially evident in her claim that colonized people are not agents. Here, she does not mean that the colonized and oppressed, including colonized women, lack capacities for action and resistance—indeed, she argues that resistance meets oppression “enduringly”. Rather, she points out that according to the Eurocentric logic that defines agency as fully capacitated, intentional, and autonomous, colonized people are considered non-agential (Lugones 2005: 86). Instead, she develops the concept “active subjectivity” to name the kinds of resistant practices that develop under conditions of oppression. Rather than a feminist or decolonial “unity” that collapses difference, Lugones seeks to sustain forms of coalition across difference (Lugones 2003). (See also the section “Latin American Feminist Philosophy” in the entry on Latin American Feminism.)

In feminist decolonial literature, resistance is often discussed in terms of the coloniality of gender (Lugones 2003, 2007, 2010; Oyěwùmí 1997); language (Spivak 1988); identity and subjectivity—for instance, accounts of hybridity, border-thinking, multiplicity, and mestizaje (Anzaldúa 1987; Ortega 2016; Moraga & Anzaldúa [eds] 1981 [2015]; Pitts 2021a); and “world-traveling” (Lugones 1995; Ortega 2016). Many of these same thinkers argue that feminism itself must be decolonized, critiquing feminist universalisms that claim to account for the complex intersections of sexuality, race, gender, and class (see Khader 2019; Lugones 2010; Mohanty 2003; Vergès 2019 [2021]).

2.8 Feminist Democratic Theory

Are there any reliable foundations on which to base feminist politics? By the end of the 1990s, postmodern critiques of the subject and feminist critiques of the category “woman” produced real uncertainty about the status of the subject of feminist politics, seeing a radical danger of relativism and disunity, and the field seemed to be at an impasse. But then another approach began to emerge. As Mary Dietz writes in her 2003 essay on current controversies in feminist theory,

In recent years, political theorists have been engaged in debates about what it might mean to conceptualize a feminist political praxis that is aligned with democracy but does not begin from the binary of gender. Along these lines, Mouffe (1992b: 376, 378; 1993), for example, proposes a feminist conception of democratic citizenship that would render sexual difference “effectively nonpertinent”. Perhaps the salient feature of such conceptions is the turn toward plurality, which posits democratic society as a field of interaction where multiple axes of difference, identity, and subordination politicize and intersect. (Dietz 2003: 419; citing Phelan 1994; Young 1990, 1997, 2000; Benhabib 1992; Honig 1992; K. Ferguson 1993; Phillips 1993, 1995; Mouffe 1993; Yeatman 1994, 2001; Bickford 1996; Dean 1996; Fraser 1997; K. Nash 1998; Heyes 2000; McAfee 2000)

Following up on what has happened in feminist political theory since Dietz’s article, Sharon Krause writes that this work is “contesting the old assumption that agency equals autonomy” and makes room “within agency for forms of subjectivity and action that are nonsovereign but nevertheless potent” (Krause 2011; citing Amy Allen 2008, Beltrán 2010, Butler 2004, Hirschmann 2003, and Zerilli 2005.) “For some theorists”, Krause writes,

this shift involves thinking of agency and freedom in more collective ways, which emphasize solidarity, relationality, and constitutive intersubjectivity. (Krause 2011: 108; citing Butler 2004; Cornell 2007; Mohanty 2003; and Nedelsky 2005)

(As we saw in the previous section, decolonial feminists like Lugones were already critiquing Eurocentric conceptualizations of agency that presume individual autonomy and sovereignty [Lugones 2003].)

This constellation of thinkers have a performative account of politics and subjectivity. Performative in several senses: in theorizing how agency is constituted, how political judgments can be made in the absence of known rules (Honig 2009: 309), how new universals can be created and new communities constituted. From a performative feminist perspective, feminism is a project of anticipating and creating better political futures in the absence of foundations. As Linda Zerilli writes,

politics is about making claims and judgments—and having the courage to do so—in the absence of the objective criteria or rules that could provide certain knowledge and the guarantee that speaking in women’s name will be accepted or taken up by others. (Zerilli 2005: 179)

Zerilli calls for a “freedom-centered feminism” that

would strive to bring about transformation in normative conceptions of gender without returning to the classical notion of freedom as sovereignty

that feminists have long criticized but found difficult to resist (ibid.). Rather than basing politics on already existing categories, principles, or values, a performative approach understands categories like identity and gender to be performatively constituted, thus appealing to other people, not to supposed universal truths or foundations. “How we assume these identities”, Drucilla Cornell writes,

is never something “out there” that effectively determines who we can be as men and women—gay, lesbian, straight, queer, transsexual, transgender, or otherwise. (Cornell 2003: 144)

It is something that is shaped as we live and externalize identities with others.

This view takes democracy to be an ongoing and unfinished project with any outcome open to further contestation. It recuperates many of the ideals of the Enlightenment—such as freedom, autonomy, and justice—but in a way that drops the Enlightenment’s metaphysical assumptions about reason, progress, and human nature. Instead of seeing these ideals as grounded in some metaphysical facts, this new view sees them as ideals that people hold and try to instantiate through practice and imagination. Where many ancient and modern ideals of politics were based on suppositions about the nature of reality or of human beings, contemporary political philosophies generally operate without supposing that there are any universal or eternal truths. Some might see this situation as ripe for nihilism, arbitrariness, or the exercise of brute power. The democratic alternative is to imagine and try to create a better world by anticipating, claiming, and appealing to others that it should be so. Even if there is no metaphysical truth that human beings have dignity and infinite worth, people can act as if it were true in order to create a world in which it is seen to be so.

Despite the shared post-foundational theorizing among democratic feminist theorists and the commitment to thinking of politics as plural, when it comes to thinking about democratic politics, there are sharp divergences, namely on the question of “what it means to actualize public spaces and enact democratic politics” (Dietz 2003: 419). On this question, theorists tend to diverge into two groups: associational and agonistic. Associational theorists (e.g., Benhabib 1992, [ed.] 1996b; Benhabib & Cornell [eds] 1987; Fraser 1989; Young 1990, 1997, 2000) gravitate more toward deliberative democratic theory. They have roots in the socialist and Marxist traditions, especially as they developed in the Frankfurt-School tradition of critical theory. They are more optimistic about the prospects for democracy. Agonistic theorists (e.g., Mouffe [ed.] 1992a, 1993, 1999, 2000; Honig [ed.] 1995; Ziarek 2001) worry that democratic theories that focus on consensus can silence the kind of disagreement essential for democratic progress. Thus they focus more on plurality, dissensus, and the ceaseless contestation within politics. Agonistic theorists are grounded in much of the poststructural feminist approach described earlier, wary of any claims to universality and identity.

The differences spring from, or perhaps lead to, different readings of the philosopher who has most inspired performative political theory: Hannah Arendt, namely Arendt’s ideas of speech and action in the public sphere, of the meaning of plurality, of the ways in which human beings can distinguish themselves. As Bonnie Honig, a champion of the agonistic model writes,

Political theorists and feminists, in particular, have long criticized Arendt for the agonistic dimensions of her politics, charging that agonism is a masculinist, heroic, violent, competitive, (merely) aesthetic, or necessarily individualistic practice. For these theorists, the notion of an agonistic feminism would be, at best, a contradiction in terms and, at worst, a muddled and, perhaps, dangerous idea. Their perspective is effectively endorsed by Seyla Benhabib who, in a recent series of powerful essays, tries to rescue Arendt for feminism by excising agonism from her thought. (Honig 1995b: 156)

Associational theorists tend to look for ways, amidst all the differences and questions about the lack of foundations, it is possible to come to agreement on matters of common concern. This is seen in feminist democratic theory, perhaps best known through the works of Seyla Benhabib (1992, 1996b), greatly inspired by her non-agonistic reading of Arendt and of the work of the German critical theorist, Jürgen Habermas. Benhabib’s work engages democratic theorists quite broadly, not just feminist theorists. The following passage helps to clarify what she takes to be the best aim of a political philosophy: a state of affairs to which all affected would assent. As she writes,

Only those norms (i.e., general rules of action and institutional arrangements) can be said to be valid (i.e., morally binding), which would be agreed to by all those affected by their consequences, if such agreement were reached as a consequence of a process of deliberation that had the following features: 1) participation in such deliberation is governed by norms of equality and symmetry; all have the same chances to initiate speech acts, to question, to interrogate, and to open debate; 2) all have the right to question the assigned topics of conversation; and 3) all have the right to initiate reflexive arguments about the very rules of the discourse procedure and the way in which they are applied or carried out. (Benhabib 1996b: 70)

Following Habermas, Benhabib contends that certain conditions need to be in place in order for members of a political community to arrive at democratic outcomes, namely the proceedings need to be deliberative. Some take deliberation to be a matter of reasoned argumentation; others see it as less about reason or argumentation but more about an open process of working through choices. (McAfee 2004.)

Not all theorists who tend toward the associational model embrace deliberative theory so readily. Iris Young’s pioneering book, Justice and the Politics of Difference and several of her subsequent works have been very influential and led to a good deal of hesitance in feminist theoretical communities about the claims of deliberative theory. Where Benhabib is confident that conditions can be such that all who are affected can have a voice in deliberations, Young points out that those who have been historically silenced have a difficult time having their views heard or heeded. Young is skeptical of the claims of mainstream democratic theory that democratic deliberative processes could lead to outcomes that would be acceptable to all (Young 1990, 1997). Young, along with Nancy Fraser (1989) and others, worried that in the process of trying to reach consensus, the untrained voices of women and others who have been marginalized would be left out of the final tally. Young’s criticisms were very persuasive, leading a generation of feminist political philosophers to be wary of deliberative democratic theory. Instead of deliberative democracy, in the mid 1990s Young proposed a theory of communicative democracy, hoping to make way for a deliberative conception that was open to means of expression beyond the rational expression of mainstream deliberative democratic theory. Young worried that deliberation as defined by Habermas is too reason-based and leaves out forms of communication that women and people of color tend to use, including, as she puts it, “greeting, rhetoric, and storytelling”. Young argued that these alternative modes of communication could provide the basis of a more democratic, communicative theory. In her last major book, Inclusion and Democracy (2000), Young had clearly moved to embrace deliberative theory itself, seeing the ways in which it could be constructed to give voice to those who had been otherwise marginalized. More recent feminist democratic theory has engaged deliberative theory more positively (see McAfee & Snyder 2007).

Where liberal feminists inspired by John Rawls and democratic feminists inspired by Jürgen Habermas and/or John Dewey hold out the hope that democratic deliberations might lead to democratic agreements, agonistic feminists are wary of consensus as inherently undemocratic. Agonistic feminist political philosophy comes out of poststructural continental feminist and philosophical traditions. It takes from Marxism the hope for a more radically egalitarian society. It takes from contemporary continental philosophy notions of subjectivity and solidarity as malleable and constructed. Along with postmodern thought, it repudiates any notion of pre-existing moral or political truths or foundations (Ziarek 2001). Its central claim is that feminist struggle, like other struggles for social justice, is engaged in politics as ceaseless contestation. Agonistic views see the nature of politics as inherently conflictual, with battles over the direction of political society being the central task of democratic struggle. Advocates of agonistic politics worry that the kind of consensus sought by democratic theorists (discussed above) will lead to some kind of oppression or injustice by silencing new struggles. As Chantal Mouffe puts it,

We have to accept that every consensus exists as a temporary result of a provisional hegemony, as a stabilization of power, and that it always entails some form of exclusion. (Mouffe 2000: 104)

Where associational theorists seek out ways that people can overcome systematically distorted communication and deliberation, Dietz notes that agonists eschew this project because they understand politics as

essentially a practice of creation, reproduction, transformation and articulation.... Simply put, associational feminists scrutinize the conditions of exclusion in order to theorize the emancipation of the subject in the public sphere of communicative interaction; agonistic feminists deconstruct emancipatory procedures to disclose how the subject is both produced through political exclusions and positioned against them. (Dietz 2003: 422)

3. New Directions in Feminist Political Philosophy

As a recent review writes,

Feminist theory today is a sprawling, productive, diverse intellectual and political assemblage. It grows through imaginative interdisciplinary work and critical political engagements. Feminist theory is not only about women, although it is that; it is about the world, engaged through critical intersectional perspectives. (K. Ferguson 2017)

New work in feminist political philosophy continues to transform political philosophy, including ancient debates over identity versus difference, the private and the public, certainty and freedom. For example, new readings of Arendt’s philosophy offer hope of moving beyond the associational/agonistic divide in democratic feminist theory (Barker et al. [eds] 2012). Benhabib’s proceduralism is being surpassed with more affect-laden accounts of deliberation (Krause 2008; Howard 2017). Instead of the rational back-and-forth of reasoned argumentation, theorists are beginning to see deliberative talk as forms of constituting the subject, judging without pre-conceived truths, and performatively creating new political projects (Zerilli 2005 and 2016).

Some of the most generative sites for feminist political theorizing today are the global threats that face all of us, for instance environmental degradation or the rise of authoritarianism. In ecofeminist perspectives, as the entry on feminist environmental philosophy explains, the domination and destruction of “nature” has long been recognized as a feminist issue of political significance (especially due to the deep associations between femininity and nature that run through Western patriarchal philosophy and culture). More recently, ecofeminists have extended theories of democracy, agency, and rights to include elements of the natural world (Nussbaum 2022). Meanwhile, with the rise of authoritarianism in governments across the globe in the second decade of the twenty-first century, feminist political philosophers have tried to understand the roots of recent threats to democracy (Fraser 2019; McAfee 2019; Nussbaum 2018).

In sum, feminist political philosophy is a still evolving field of thought that has much to offer mainstream political philosophy. In the past two decades it has come to exert a stronger influence over mainstream political theorizing, raising objections that mainstream philosophers have had to address, though not always very convincingly. And in its newest developments it promises to go even further.


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