Kant’s Philosophy of Religion

First published Tue Jun 22, 2004; substantive revision Mon Apr 19, 2021

Kant has long been seen as hostile to religion. Many of his contemporaries, ranging from his students to the Prussian authorities, saw his Critical project as inimical to traditional Christianity. The impression of Kant as a fundamentally secular philosopher became even more deeply entrenched through the twentieth century, though this is belied by a closer inspection of his writings both before and after the publication of his Critique of Pure Reason (1781), i.e., what are commonly referred to as his “pre-Critical” and “Critical” periods.

After an initial overview discussion of Kant’s philosophy of religion, this entry will turn to his views during the pre-Critical and then Critical periods. With regards to the former period, we will discuss Kant’s religious background, his views on the relationship between God and nature, and then how some of the key figures of the period influenced his philosophy of religion. We will also discuss his conception of God and approach to the arguments for God’s existence during this period.

We will then turn to his Critical period, where we will discuss how Transcendental Idealism shaped his philosophy of religion, his Critical treatment of the arguments for God’s existence, his conception of God, epistemology of religion, distinction between Deism and Theism, the relationship between the highest good and the practical postulates, interpretations of his approach to Christian doctrine, an overview of the four parts of Religion within the Boundaries of Mere Reason, and, finally, his Opus Postumum. Throughout, attention will be paid to many of the points of interpretative dispute over key aspects of his philosophy of religion.

1. Overview

The impression through the twentieth century of Kant as a fundamentally secular philosopher was due in part to various interpretative conventions (such as Strawson’s “principle of significance” – Strawson 1966, 16) whereby the meaningfulness and/or thinkability of the supersensible is denied, as well as through an artifact of how Kant’s philosophy religion is introduced to most, namely through the widespread anthologization of his objections to the traditional proofs for God’s existence.

Kant’s philosophy in the pre-Critical period has been characterized variously as a progression from rationalism to empiricism to criticism (Paulsen 1963), the continued search for a more proper method for metaphysics (De Vleeschauwer 1962), a reconciliation of Newtonian and Leibnizian-Wolffian ideas (Friedman 1994) or of natural science and metaphysics (Schönfeld 2000; cf. Anderson 2015), and as an attempted articulation of a metaphysical alternative to Leibnizian “logicism” (i.e., the view that “anything that is not logically contradictory is possible” (Stang 2016). But what nearly all of Kant’s pre-Critical writings have in common is the desire to frame a more adequate concept of God and of the relation of this being to the created universe. Thus among his earliest reflections we find a detailed sketch of a religious outlook extracted from Alexander Pope’s “An Essay on Man” (1734) and a discussion, among other things, of why this position is philosophically superior to that of Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz (1646–1716) and Christian Wolff (1679–1754).

Within Kant’s Critical period, not only do we find powerful defenses of religious belief in all three Critiques {1781, 1788, 1790}, but a considerable share of Kant’s work in the 1790s is also devoted to the positive side of his philosophy of religion. This includes his 1791 “Theodicy” essay, Religion within the Boundaries of Mere Reason (1793), “The End of All Things” (1794), and the Conflict of the Faculties (1798). Moreover, his lectures on logic, Reflexionen and the Jäsche Logic present a robust account of the nature of religious belief/faith [Glaube]. So, while Kant does deny the possibility of religious knowledge (as well as opinion), he characterizes this denial as necessary to safeguard faith, which he endorses as the proper mode of religious assent. One must, therefore, understand the negative elements in his philosophy of religion, such as his infamous objections to the traditional proofs for God’s existence, in this context. As stated in the B-Preface to the Critique of Pure Reason, a central goal of the Critical project is to establish the limits to knowledge “in order to make room for faith” (Bxxx).

Throughout Kant’s writings, we find ample discussions of religious issues. These are, in many instances, clearly affirmative, though they are often framed within objections to theoretical reason’s encroachments into the domain that is instead proper to faith. Although his discussions of God and immortality are familiar to most Kantians, the Critical corpus moves well beyond just these. Especially in the 1790s, we find detailed treatments of biblical hermeneutics, miracles, revelation, as well as many distinctively Christian doctrines such as Original Sin, the Incarnation, Vicarious Atonement, and the Trinity.

Unfortunately, however, the many positive elements of Kant’s philosophy of religion have been eclipsed by its initial negative moments, moments not meant to oppose religion, but rather reflective of the Lutheranism (or more precisely, the anti-liturgical Lutheran Pietism) of his youth. Just as with Luther’s own negative polemics against religious despotism and scholastic arcana, we see in Kant a parallel dialectic, where he, rather than opposing religion, sought to free it from the “monopoly of the schools” and set it on a footing suitable to “the common human understanding” (Bxxxii). Hence, as we will discuss through this entry, the statement that Kant sought out the limits to knowledge [Wissen] in order to “make room for faith [Glaube]” (Bxxx), is not an empty bromide, but rather the key anthem for his overall philosophy of religion.

2. Kant’s Pre-Critical Religious Thought

2.1 Context and Influences

The influences on Kant’s pre-Critical religious thought can be divided under three general headings, namely, the personal, the scientific and the philosophical.

2.1.1 Personal

Among the most important influences on Kant’s understanding of religion is no doubt his experience of Pietism, a reform movement within German Lutheranism which aimed to fulfill what it saw as the original intention of Martin Luther. According to the founders of Pietism, such as Philip Jacob Spener (1635–1705), this original intention required a more scrupulous religious and moral outlook, a deep personal devotion to increasing one’s own piety and that of others (through collegia pietatis, i.e., through private meetings among lay persons for development of personal holiness), and consequently exacting self-examination as well as the creation of a general culture of supporting progress in these matters. Pietists saw Orthodox Lutheranism, by contrast, as having become frozen in vain intellectualism, an adherence to over-subtle and lifeless formalisms, and ecclesiastical politics. As a consequence, Pietists sought a return what Spener referred to as “apostolic simplicity” in theological matters.

Kant lived his entire life in the city of Königsberg, the second largest center of Pietism after Halle. His parents were Pietists and he was educated at the Collegium Fridericianum, a Pietist gymnasium directed by Franz Albert Schultz (1692–1763). Although the positive influence of Protestantism in general, and Pietism in particular, has been strongly disputed (Wood 1970: 197n.; Kuehn 2001), the majority of scholars have argued otherwise. Kant’s use of Pietist terminology such as the “change of heart” (Herzensänderung), classic theological language such as “radical evil” (radix malorum), his detailed engagement with Augustinian themes throughout the Religion, and focus on Pietist and Moravian models of grace (AK 7:54–57 [1798]), which were prevalent in his region, all indicate the lasting influence of his religious upbringing.

Like all of his German contemporaries, Kant could not have avoided being affected by memory of the acrimonious conflict that had occurred between the Pietists and Christian Wolff (1679–1754) at the University of Halle just a generation prior. However, by the time Kant arrived at the Collegium Fridericianum, Pietism—particularly in Königsberg—had taken on a milder form, one which often sought to adopt but also revise the teachings of Wolff in accordance with Pietist principles (De Vleeschauwer 1962; Kuehn 2001). The most significant example of this is found in Kant’s influential teacher at the University of Königsberg, Martin Knutzen (1713–1751), whose Philosophical Proof of the Truth of the Christian Religion (1740) argues that the core of Christianity lies in “presenting us with a genuine means of atonement” (Knutzen 1740: §39) and that the necessary revelation of such a means can be rationally demonstrated using largely, but not exclusively, Wolffian principles.

Finally, among the personal influences on Kant’s view of religion, whether positive or negative, there must be numbered his long associations with Johann Georg Hamann (1730–1788) and Johann Gottfried Herder (1744–1803). Hamann, who at points was part of Kant’s small circle of friends, fiercely defended a mystical fideism and railed against the Enlightenment’s confidence in reason. Through both his published writings and his direct personal contacts, Hamann continually challenged Kant to develop and defend his own views regarding the relation between faith and reason, often drawing support from the skepticism of David Hume (see e.g., Hamann’s letters to Kant dated 27 July 1759 [AK 10:7–17; C 47–54] and December 1759 [AK 10:26–31; C 61–66; also Kuehn 2001: 118–126). Although less radical in outlook, Herder played a similar role, particularly later in Kant’s life.

2.1.2 Scientific

As with many philosophers of the modern period, Kant’s religious views are deeply influenced by the scientific picture of nature that took root in the wake of Copernicus. Most significant during the pre-Critical period are the ideas that the universe is a centerless, ceaselessly expanding, totality of things, which evolves towards ever greater perfection according to physical (Newtonian) and spiritual laws. Kant draws support for this view as well as inspiration for interpreting its religious significance from the writings of, among others, Alexander Pope (1688–1744), Thomas Wright (1711–1786), Pierre Louis Moreau de Maupertuis (1698–1759), Johann Heinrich Lambert (1728–1777), and Jean-Jacques Rousseau (1712–1778) (see Kant’s important note on Newton and Rousseau justifying God and so proving Pope’s “theorem” that “Whatever is, is right” AK 20:58–59). Consequently, much of Kant’s thinking about God during this period is focused on framing a conception of God and of this being’s relation to nature that adequately takes into account this revised picture of the universe.

2.1.3 Philosophical

The third set of influences on Kant’s early religious views were philosophical in the sense that he mainly encountered them in published philosophical treatises and textbooks. To these chiefly belong the writings of the Leibnizian-Wolffian school and those of what is sometimes referred to as the Thomasian-Pietistic school.

The Leibnizian-Wolffian School. As noted above, Kant had already developed some criticisms of Leibniz’s Theodicy (1710) in 1753. He also studied the works of Wolff—most notably the two-volume Natural Theology (1736–1737)—as well as the theological writings of most of Wolff’s many followers. The most important of these latter are Alexander Gottlieb Baumgarten (1714–1762) and Johann August Eberhard (1739–1809). Kant used Baumgarten’s Metaphysics (1739) in his courses on metaphysics for over forty years, and late in his career adopted its section on natural theology alongside Eberhard’s Preparation for Natural Theology (1781) for his lectures on philosophical theology. Although there are many differences, sometimes major, between these figures, they all agree generally in maintaining that the Principle of Non-Contradiction is the first principle of metaphysics, that human actions are free but still subject to the Principle of Sufficient Reason, that truths in the divine intellect place limits on the divine will, and that physical and moral laws are dependent on divine choice but can also be known as necessary from nature alone. They also all defend some version of the Ontological Argument.

The Thomasian-Pietistic School. Under this heading falls a group of philosophers that perhaps should not be called a school, but nevertheless arise from two common sources, namely the writings of Christian Thomasius and also often from Pietism, and generally share one common opponent, namely Christian Wolff. In terms of his influence on Kant, the most important of these is undoubtedly Christian August Crusius (1715–1775). Although Kant is never an uncritical follower of Crusius, it is clear that Kant studied his works intensely from the late 1750s until the middle of the 1760s, often taking his side against that of Leibniz and Wolff. Like others in this group, Crusius argues that the Principle of Non-Contradiction is an empty principle and thus is insufficient for founding metaphysics, that human actions are radically free and so not subject to the Principle of Sufficient Reason, and that moral laws can only be known through the revelation of the divine will (in scripture or in conscience). Nearly all of these disagreements with Wolff stem from the contention that his system is inconsistent with the real significance of such religious concepts as the duty and obedience to God, guilt, and conscience.

Crusius also rejected the Principle of Sufficient Reason and the Ontological Argument in terms that are very close to what we find in Kant’s writings of this period. Philosophers of this school developed a far more robust account of rational faith than is found in the writings of Wolff. Thus, in a way reminiscent of the later Kant, Crusius argues that we are necessitated to believe something if its denial would undermine or render impossible the pursuit of an end towards which we have a duty (Crusius 1751: §339), the most important of which is our obligation to God (Crusius 1751: §345). This obligation, according to Crusius, necessitates, among other things, a belief in freedom, immortality and even in the reliability of reason itself (see Chance 2019).

Finally, any account of the philosophical influences on Kant’s early religious thought must include mention of the “Profession of Faith of the Savoyard Vicar” from Rousseau’s Emile, or Education (1762), a book that is thought to have had a profound impact on Kant’s intellectual development in the second half of the 1760s. In many respects, the Vicar’s expression of a humble and common sense religious outlook has parallels in Kant’s own development in the later 1760s as mentioned in section 2.2 below.

2.2 Kant’s Pre-Critical Religious Thought

An mentioned above, Kant earliest reflections on religious themes include a comparison between Alexander Pope’s Essay on Man (1733–4) and the theologies advanced by Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz (1646–1716) and Christian Wolff (1679–1754). According to the pre-Critical Kant, the Leibnizian position rests on an inconsistent and limited view of the divine being, one in which the eternal essences of things retain a degree of independence, whereas Pope

subjects every possibility to the dominion of an all-sufficient Being; under this Being things can have no other properties, not even those which are called essentially necessary, apart from those which harmonise together to give complete expression to His perfection. (AK 2:233–234, note 3704)

Already in these passages we find hints of the main features of Kant’s pre-Critical metaphysics, all of which point back to this religious context, namely:

  1. his framing of the concept of God in terms of the single all-sufficient (allgenugsam) being,
  2. his rejection of the Ontological argument,
  3. his own proof of the existence of such a being based upon its status as the absolutely necessary ground of all real possibility,
  4. the derivation of the further properties of the divine being, i.e., unity and wisdom, from this concept,
  5. the subjection of the inner possibility of things and so also the necessary and contingent laws of physical nature to a being with such properties, and finally
  6. the carving out of a new and more consistent method for reflecting on the design of nature and its relation to God.

Kant’s engagement with this last point in particular relates to his lifelong preference for, and interest in, the Physico-Theological Argument (see section below).

Kant’s initial attempt to articulate a metaphysics that could justify all these views is found in two works of 1755, A New Elucidation of the First Principles of Metaphysical Cognition and Universal Natural History and Theory of the Heavens, Or Essay on the Constitution of the Mechanical Origin of the Whole Universe according to Newtonian Principles. The former focuses on the laying the foundation of a metaphysical system including points (i–v) above. The latter then focuses on (vi) by purporting to show that even just the Newtonian laws of nature exhibit such a tendency to bring about order and perfection in nature as can only be explained by a conception of God as the all-sufficient ground of the essences of things. The continued influence of the religious outlook of Pope’s Essay on Man (and hence also of the specific brand of Deism, similar to Shaftesbury’s and Lord Bolingbroke’s, to which it is related) is evidenced in the fact that the Universal Natural History contains no less than six separate passages from this work, three of which Kant uses to introduce the three divisions of his book.

For whatever reasons, Kant seems to have been unsatisfied by this initial attempt, and so set out in the 1760s to better defend and explain this same general system of thought in his Only Possible Argument in Support of a Demonstration of the Existence of God (1763b). This time, however, he is much more concerned with articulating a firm methodological basis for his metaphysics, as is evident in the work itself as well as in the key essays of the period, Attempt to Introduce the Concept of Negative Magnitudes into Philosophy (1763a) and Inquiry Concerning the Distinctness of the Principles of Natural Theology and Morality (1764).

Despite retaining this commitment to his earlier metaphysics, it seems clear that at this time Kant also becomes convinced that there exists a common sense religious standpoint that is not dependent upon the proof of metaphysical doctrines, but which is equivalent or perhaps even stronger in its practical import (see, e.g., AK 2:65 [1763b]). With the eventual abandonment of his pre-Critical project in the late 1760s it is this alternative source of religious conviction that will blossom into the re-founding of his religious thought in moral theology (see sections 3.3–3.7 below).

Through the remainder of this section, we will focus on three particular religious topics discussed by Kant during the Pre-Critical period: his treatment of God as an all-sufficient being, his critique of the ontological argument, and his own early argument for God’s existence.

2.2.1 God as the all-sufficient (allgenugsam) being

As noted above, this idea first makes its appearance in Kant’s early notes. Kant does not attempt to justify the concept, but instead uses it in order to argue that the view that evil has its source in restrictions placed on the divine will by the truths of the divine intellect—a view he attributed to Leibniz—is incomprehensible. The primary significance of divine all-sufficiency here is that it means that there can be no necessity prior to the divine will. Since Leibniz and Wolff identified truths in the divine intellect with the natures or essences of things, as well as with their inner possibility, all-sufficiency for Kant also means that these too must be dependent on the plan of the divine will. In Universal Natural History, Kant argues from the perfect order of the physical universe to the existence of an all-sufficient being, asking whether it does

not provide an undeniable proof of their [i.e., all physical things] common first origin, which must be an all-sufficient highest mind in which the natures of things were designed in accordance with unified purposes? (AK 1:228–229 [1755b])

For Kant this means that the divine will not only orders what is contingent in nature—a view held equally by Leibniz and Wolff—but also that it brings about order and perfection through being the ground of the inner possibilities of all things (i.e., their natures or essences), indeed even the most basic laws of matter (see AK 2:151–154 [1763b]).

In The Only Possible Argument, Kant claims that the thought of God as the all-sufficient is “of all thoughts the most sublime, [but] is still widely neglected, and mostly not considered at all” (AK 2:151), and declares that if

expanded to include all that is possible or real, is a far more appropriate expression for designating the supreme perfection of the Divine Being than the concept of the infinite, which is commonly employed. (AK 2:154)

2.2.2 Rejection of the ontological argument

In connection with section below, it is important to note that Kant rejects the Ontological Argument in both the New Elucidation and in The Only Possible Argument, though for different reasons in each case. In the former, Kant employs a version of the objection formulated by Johannes Caterus (1590–1655) in his response to Descartes’ Meditations (AK 1:395 [1755a]). In essence, the objection is that although the Ontological Argument proves that the concept of existence is necessarily contained in the concept of God, this is only a connection among concepts. For the argument to work, then, one would first have to show that it is a concept of something actual. By the time of The Only Possible Argument, however, Kant seems to no longer accept this criticism. Instead, he mainly rejects the argument based upon his analysis of concept of existence, which purportedly shows that it is not a real predicate (AK 2:72–77, AK 2:156–157 [1763b]). His preferred pre-Critical reason for rejecting the Ontological Argument is basically the same as will be discussed in section Nevertheless, at this time Kant also articulates a version the objection used by Gaunilo of Marmoutiers (eleventh century) in response to Anselm of Canterbury (1033–1109) (AK 2:156–157 [1763b]).

2.2.3 Kant’s own argument for God’s existence

Kant’s own argument for God’s existence is closely connected to his conception of God as all-sufficient and the ground of all real possibility. In the New Elucidation, the argument is extremely brief with its core consisting in the claim that “nothing can be conceived as possible unless whatever is real in every possible concept exists and indeed exists absolutely necessarily”; “for if this be denied, nothing at all would be possible; in other words, there would be nothing but the impossible” (AK 1:395). A very similar argument features later in The Only Possible Argument where it is presented in much greater detail. Here again the central idea is that possibility presupposes something actual, and so there is a being which, if it did not exist, then nothing would be possible; but such a being is absolutely necessary (AK 2:83).

2.2.4 Derivation of the divine properties

In both the New Elucidation and in The Only Possible Argument, though more fully, Kant immediately proceeds to derive from the above proof the further properties of what is absolutely necessary. This ground of all possibility must be found in one being, which is unique, simple, immutable and eternal, containing supreme reality, and hence possessing both intellect and will. Consistent with his criticism of Leibniz mentioned in section 2.2.1 Kant rejects both theological voluntarism and intellectualism, arguing that neither God’s intellect nor will takes precedence over and so limits the other, but instead they must stand in absolute harmony. For this reason, “the possibilities of things themselves, which are given through the divine nature, harmonise with his great desire” so that “unity, harmony and order are themselves to be found in the possibilities of things” (AK 2:91–92 [1763b]).

3. Kant’s Philosophy of Religion during the Critical Period

With the introduction of Transcendental Idealism’s epistemic strictures, Kant came to the conclusion that religion must fall outside the scope of theoretical reason. However, instead of atheism or agnosticism, Kant advanced a novel philosophical theology that grounds religion on the “needs” of practical reason. In the B-Preface to the Critique of Pure Reason, he in fact intimates that his interest in religion is part of what motivated Transcendental Idealism. That is, as quoted earlier, Kant sought to establish the limits to knowledge “in order to make room for faith” (Bxxx). Such a faith has its source in the needs of pure practical reason (AK 8:137 [1785a], AK 5:142 [1788], AK 6:139 [1793]), and it is through these needs that Kant maintains that we can extend our cognition for practical purposes, allowing us to form a warranted conception of God and the afterlife in the service of the highest good (A814/B843–A819/B847). Kant coins the term “pure rational faith” (AK 8:142) in What does it mean to Orient oneself in Thinking (1785a) and later uses this term as well as the “pure philosophical doctrine of religion” (AK 6:10 [1793]), “pure religion of reason” (AK 6:12), “pure rational system of religion” (AK 6:12) and simply “pure rationalism” to refer to his positive philosophy of religion. Note, however, that Kant always intends by these terms specifically practical rather than theoretical reason, as the “needs” which serve as the basis for faith pertain to our practical, moral lives.

We will here begin with a discussion of Kant’s critique of the traditional proofs for God’s existence before moving on to the positive side of his philosophy of religion. Although the fame of this critique has been taken as indicative of his philosophy of religion as a whole, it is instead representative of his distinction in the Critical period between the illicit attempts at a positive philosophy of religion driven by theoretical reason, versus a philosophy of religion that has its ground in practical philosophy.

3.1 God in the Critique of Pure Reason’s Transcendental Dialectic

The Transcendental Dialectic’s “Ideal of Reason” contains the best known and most frequently anthologized components of Kant’s philosophy of religion. In addition to its portrayal of the ens realissimum, one finds within it Kant’s objections to the Ontological, Cosmological and Physico-theological (Design) arguments. It is thus the text most central to the negative elements of Kant’s philosophy of religion and is integral to the widely held view that Kant is hostile to religion.

3.1.1 The Ens Realissimum

Kant maintains that underlying all the traditional proofs for God’s existence is the concept of the ens realissimum, the most real being. Reason comes to the idea of this being through the principle that every individuated object is subject to the “principle of complete determination”. While the generality of concepts allows them to be less than fully determined (e.g., our concept of a horse extends over horses that are different colors, heights, etc.), individuated objects must be completely determined (e.g., an individual horse must have specific colors, a specific height, etc.).

Hence, where the particular determinations of actual objects are discovered through experience, our concepts, which in themselves are not objects of experience, remain partly indeterminate. Nevertheless, reason can construct for itself what is on the one hand still an abstraction but yet also an individuated entity. Kant refers to such entities as “ideals” and in most instances they are used by us regulatively as archetypes for reflection. For example, when considering whether or not to get a pet, one might envision an ideal pet, a pet with the optimal set of desirable attributes. Such an archetype for thought, however, is still not completely determined, for the ideal can still be neutral between various attributes that are not regarded as relevant to one’s interests (for example, one may not consider any specific nostril width salient to one’s choice of pet).

By contrast, the ens realissimum is the concept of an individual object that is completely determined, and is such through reason alone. In the case of most ideals, their determinations are the result of various empirical concepts as well as various subjective interests (such as what one believes a pet would bring to one’s daily life). However, in the ens realissimum, all its determinations are set solely through reason’s formal application of the principle of complete determination, aggregating together all possible predicates and selecting from these predicates all those which have a fully positive reality (no negative predicates, no derivative predicates). That is, following the concept of “the most real being”, reason brings together all possible predicates and eliminates those which involve some limitation or deficiency.

In doing this, the faculty does not violate any of the standards Kant sets out within Transcendental Idealism, for reason is merely applying the formal principle of complete determination to all possible predicates and constructing an idea (or more precisely, an ideal) thereby. This construction can then be entertained by the intellect, or perhaps, used as a regulative principle, as one does with other less grand ideals. Transcendental error comes in, however, if reason also then tenders the ens realissimum as not merely a formal construct but as the metaphysical ground of all that is: since it (in principle) contains all determinations, and these determinations are of actual entities, a “transcendental subreption” may occur that transforms the ens realissimum from just an intellectual construct into a metaphysical reality as the sum total of all actuality.

As with other transcendental errors, we can subreptively conflate a subjective principle generated by our intellects and of only regulative use to one that is objective, a real being not constructed in thought, but discovered through thought. Such, we may say, is the source of error in Spinoza’s use of substance and in other monistic metaphysics. Our construction of the ens realissimum has the appearance of an actual unity since it is the concept of the sum total of all positive predicates. This appearance then casts an illusion unrecognized by the metaphysicians, leading them into the subreptive error.

3.1.2 Kant’s critique of the traditional arguments for God’s existence Ontological argument

According to the Ontological Argument, it is self-evident from the idea of the most real being that that being exists. Whatever it is that is this most real being, it must include all predicates that contribute to its greatness or reality; and given that actual existence is (allegedly) one such predicate, whatever it is that is the most real being is therefore a being who by definition must exist. Hence, if one were to compare two beings, both equally great in all respects except that one exists and one does not, the one that does not exist, by virtue of its non-existence, is lacking a predicate that contributes to the greatness of the other. The correct conception of that than which nothing greater can be conceived must, therefore, include existence.

The Critique of Pure Reason contains four distinct objections to the Ontological Argument. The first two of these follow what may be thought of as the standard assumption by the proponents of this argument that “God exists” is to be treated as an analytic judgment (A594/B622–A597/B625). Though rarely mentioned in the literature, these arguments are salient to the common objection that Kant’s critique of the Ontological Argument doesn’t impact the Anselmian version (Plantinga 1966, Forgie 1975).

The second two objections arise as a result of the defeat of the analytic rendering, and turn to a reading of “God exists” as synthetic (A597/B625–A602/B630). By far, the most famous of these objections is that existence is not a predicate. What, however, Kant means by “predicate” requires some examination.

Of key significance here is Kant’s distinction between “logical” versus “real” predicates. The former is best understood as a syntactic notion: the second term, along with the subject term, of a complete and well-formed proposition. A real predicate, by contrast, is distinguished by its semantic function. As Kant describes it, a real predicate “goes beyond the concept of the subject and enlarges it” (A598/B626). Hence, logical and real predicates involve two different orders of analysis, one syntactic, one semantic. They are neither mutually exclusive (Abaci 2008), nor exhaustive (Pasternack 2018). They instead distinguish between two different roles that one and the same term can have.

To help Kant make his case that existence is not a real predicate, i.e., a predicate that “enlarges” the subject term, he appeals to the distinction between an actual and non-actual unit of currency, say one hundred dollars. Between the two, there is no difference in the concepts of each: existence adds nothing to the concept of one hundred dollars. So, when one claims that “one hundred dollars exist”, one is not picking out one of its predicates, part of the nature of a hundred dollars, but rather one is just “positing” (A598/B626) its existence. Likewise, to claim that “God exists” is merely to posit God’s existence. It is not a statement which attributes the property of existence to the subject term, God.

Underlying this analysis is Kant’s contention that existence does not add anything to the subject concept; for it if did, then, he contends, a hundred dollars actualized would be different from it as merely possible: “my concept would not express the entire object and thus would not be the suitable concept for it” (A599/B627). That is, the hundred dollars as possible would not be the same as what is actualized in the actual hundred dollars.

There are, unsurprisingly, many different interpretations as to what Kant means when he claims that existence does not “enlarge” or add to the subject term. Let us here consider three.

The first comes from James Van Cleve’s Problems from Kant (1999), where he offers an analysis of real predication that renders conceptual enlargement (i.e., a predicate that “goes beyond” its subject) in terms of logical non-entailment. He writes:

A predicate P enlarges a concept \(C =_{df} \Diamond \exists x (Cx \amp {\sim}Px)\).

If C = triangle and P = red, P would be, following this definition, a real predicate, since it is possible that there exists an x which is a triangle and is not red. By contrast, if P = three-sidedness, then we do not, by this definition, have a real predicate of C, since there are no triangles that are not three-sided. In other words, where C = triangle and P = three-sidedness, since \(\forall x (Cx \supset Px)\), P fails to meet the test for conceptual enlargement of C. Likewise, existence will fail to meet the definition above since for any concept C, \(\exists x (Cx \supset \langle\textrm{exists}\rangle x)\). That is, if there exists some x such that x is a C, then x exists. Hence, Van Cleve treats existence as not an enlarging concept since, per his analysis, he is “letting the existential quantifier express existence” (Van Cleve 1999: 188).

Nick Stang follows Van Cleve in “letting the existential quantifier express existence” and further argues that Kant subscribes to an “actualism” whereby there are no non-existing objects (i.e., if unicorns do not exist, “unicorn” does not name an object, but rather references a string of predicates). As such, Stang asserts that since “exists applies to every object, it does not distinguish some objects from other objects” (Stang 2015: 599). Notice, however, that Stang’s rationale for why existence is not a predicate is that it is actually a “predicate that applies to every object there is”. That is, Stang interprets existence as an internal mark of our concept of objecthood itself (Stang 2015: 599).

A third recent analysis can be found in R. Lanier Anderson’s The Poverty of Conceptual Thought (2015). Anderson seeks to show that philosophers need to follow Kant’s treatment of existence in order to preserve our contemporary use of modal terms. For if our modal terms (existence, possibility, necessity) were predicates, then a change in modal terms would demand a change in the contents of our concepts of objects.

Accordingly, Anderson’s argument is intended to reflect Kant’s conclusion from his hundred dollars example: “what would exist would not be the same as what I had thought in my concept” (A600/B628). More specifically, Anderson argues that if our modal terms were predicates, then the non-actual possible would have as one of its marks, non-actual possibility; whereas the actual would have existence as one of its marks. As a result, if one were to consider the actualization of some non-actual possible P, P-actualized would no longer be the same P as the P of P-non-actual possible. As Anderson explains:

the supposition that <existence> would determine the concept of a thing is incompatible with its logical function of a modal category, which is to separate the actual objects from the merely possible ones without altering the contents of the things’ concepts. (Anderson 2015: 322) Cosmological argument

Kant further contends that the Cosmological Argument is parasitic on the Ontological. He demonstrates this by taking Leibniz’s Modal Argument as emblematic of all other Cosmological Arguments and then contends that a being posited as necessary in order to explain the contingency of creation has built into it the same error as discussed above. According to Leibniz’s Modal Argument, the existence of a contingent reality can only be ultimately explained through a cause whose existence is in itself necessary. However, something whose existence is in itself necessary is something whose existence cannot depend upon anything else but itself, its own nature. This returns us to the Ontological Argument, or at least the objectionable idea at its heart, for the necessary being that the Cosmological Argument proposes is also the idea of a being whose essence involves existence. So, as before, since existence is not a predicate, Kant rejects the coherence of the idea of a being whose existence depends upon nothing but its own nature. Physico-theological argument

Kant’s assessment of the Physico-Theological (Design) Argument is substantially different from his treatment of the other two classic proofs. While he still contends that it, like the Cosmological argument, remains ultimately grounded upon the Ontological Argument’s assumption that existence is a predicate, this objection does not fully undo the force of the Physico-Theological Argument. Kant in fact expresses sympathy for this argument, writing, for instance, that it “always deserves to be mentioned with respect” (A623/B651) and that it is “the oldest, the clearest, and the most accordant with the common reason of mankind” (A623/B651). He further claims that the argument succeeds in at least establishing “an architect of the world” and a cause “proportioned” to the order of nature. So, up to this point in the argument, he writes, “we have nothing to bring against the rationality and utility of this procedure, but have rather to commend it further” (A624/B652). What Kant cannot accept, however, is its advance from a “Wise Author of Nature” to an infinite creator. When it moves from architect to creator, it proposes an “original” and “supreme” cause, and in so doing, it calls for a being whose existence depends upon nothing but itself. This returns us to the Cosmological/Modal argument, and thus to its dependency on the Ontological. Despite, however, the failure of the argument to establish the existence of an infinite creator, Kant does not abandon the relevance, particularly the regulative relevance of the idea of a “Wise Author of Nature” for the natural sciences, a point he repeats in both the Appendix to the Transcendental Dialectic and in the Canon of Pure Reason.

3.2 Kant on Deism and Theism

Kant’s distinction between Deism and Theism is intertwined with his distinction between Transcendental Theology and Natural Theology (A631/B659–A632/B660). The meaning of these terms, however, are not what some have assumed (e.g., Wood 1991).

In his Lectures on the Philosophical Doctrine of Religion, Kant defines “Transcendental Theology” as the “recognition [Kenntniss] of God by means of concepts of pure reason” (AK 28:596 [1821]). These concepts are not, however, the pure concepts of the understanding, but rather what he calls the four “classes of concepts” (B110): namely, quantity, quality, relation and modality. More precisely, Kant sees Transcendental Theology as a consequence of reason’s quest for the unconditioned condition, with its concepts of God corresponding to the unconditioned for each of the “classes of concepts”, namely: ens summum (quality), ens entium (quantity), ens originarium (modality), and ens realissimum (relation).

As Transcendental Theology employs no “information” about the conditioned (i.e., the created world), it is without the resources needed to develop a concept of God “in concreto” (AK 28:1020 [1817]). Absent the “materials for the concept of God from empirical principles and empirical information” (AK 28:1020 [1817]), Transcendental Theology can do no more than attribute to God “what is true of him as a thing in general” (AK 28:1020 [1817]). That is, its concept of God is just that of unconditioned quality, quantity, modality, and relation.

Absent all “information” about the conditioned, Transcendental Theology is thus without the resources to develop the concept of God used in either Natural or Moral Theology, i.e, the “wise author of nature” or the judge and “ruler” of nature, respectively (AK 28:452 [1968], AK 28:596 [1821], AK 28:1002 [1817]). Consequently, Kant claims that Transcendental Theology is inadequate, yielding “only a silhouette of a theology” (AK 28:605, AK 28:452 [1968]). Its conception of God is “useless” (AK 28:596 [1821]), “unusable” (AK 28:452 [1968]), and “quite superfluous to us” (AK 28:1020 [1817]). For it provides us only with the god of Deism, and according to the lectures, this God is “useless” and “unusable”.

Hence, despite the familiar-seeming term, Kant does not mean by “Deism” how it was typically used by the British. Their Deism is rather much more akin to what Kant means by “Theism”, as the outcome of Natural (vs. Transcendental) Theology. That is, Kant maintains in the Critique of Pure Reason that our picture of nature as having systematic unity commits us to seeing nature “as if” it were created by a “Wise Author” (A644/B672–A645/B673).

This is not, however, a new twist on the Argument from Design. While Kant turns to Theism to explain how we make the ground of the natural order “comprehensible” (AK 6:65n [1793]) to ourselves, this is not a proof for God’s existence but rather an appeal to the idea of a Wise Author varyingly described as “symbolic” (AK 4:437 [1785b]), “heuristic” (A671/B699), a “focus imaginarius” (A645/B673), or a supposition to be taken

only problematically [vs assertorically] … so as to regard all the connection of things in the world of sense as if they had their ground in this being of reason. (A681/B709)

It is nonetheless a supposition that (at least from the later 1770 through most of the 1780s) Kant believes we cannot do without. “[W]e must presuppose such a being” (A697/B725), for in its absence, reason would be at odds with itself, at once intending a systematic unity to nature and at the same time without a principle to ground that systematicity.

Lastly, note that despite Allen Wood’s claim in “Kant’s Deism” that Kant’s account of Deism is disconnected from the “common seventeenth- and eighteenth-century usage” and thus is “idiosyncratic” (Wood 1991), Wood has mistaken the more familiar British use of the term with how the term was used by German Rationalism. For example, Wolff, in his Theologia Naturalis highlights the areas of agreement between Deism and atheism, arguing that Deism can easily devolve into a “practical atheism”. (Theologia Naturalis, §547). Baumgarten as well, in the Metaphysica, the textbook that Kant used in his courses on Metaphysics and Natural Theology, follows Wolff in this, describing Deism as “the doctrine [which] maintains that almost nothing is conceivable about God, except perhaps his existence” (§862). Hence, however idiosyncratic this use of “Deism” may seem to the modern reader, it would not have been so for Kant’s contemporary audience. In short, Kant uses “Deism” in a manner reflective of Wolff and Baumgarten’s approach rather than how the British employed it.

3.3 Religion and Theoretical Knowledge

Despite Kant’s explicit claim that one of the underlying drivers of Transcendental Idealism is to defend faith against theoretical reason, it is widely believed that his philosophical system powerfully challenges, if not outright bars, religious belief. His criticisms of the traditional arguments for God’s existence are taken as illustrative of his opposition to religion, and the so-called “Restriction Thesis” of Transcendental Idealism is regarded as a barrier against all legitimate religious assent (Wolterstorff 1998, Rawls 2000, DiCenso 2012).

According to Kant, we can have no knowledge of anything outside of experience, outside the scope of the spatio-temporal-causal order. Hence, there can be no knowledge of God, of the soul, of the afterlife, or anything else beyond that order. To compound this restriction, Kant further asserts that we also can have no “cognition” [Erkenntnis] of objects outside the scope of experience. While the former is less ambiguous, the latter has generated more debate, hanging very much on what it is to have a “cognition” (e.g., Watkins & Willaschek 2017, Chignell 2017).

Many have taken “cognition” to be a semantic notion, and so have taken Kant’s denial of the cognizability of the supersensible as a denial of even the intelligibility of religious concepts. Thus, it is not merely that we cannot prove whether or not God exists, but the concept of God itself, like all other concepts of supersensible entities and properties, (allegedly) cannot even have meaning for us.

The former position, that we can have no knowledge of the supersensible, is textually well supported. Knowledge [Wissen], for Kant, follows its traditional tripartite model as justified-true-belief, and if there is neither experience nor rational proof of any supersensible claim, no such claim can meet with suitable justification.

The latter position, that we can have no cognition of supersensible objects, is likewise correct. However, the alleged implication that this makes meaningful thought about them impossible is false. Kant does not reject the thinkability of the supersensible, and, in fact, the body of arguments in the Transcendental Dialectic show this to be clearly the case. If, for example, propositions about the supersensible were incoherent according to Kant, then he would not need his Antinomies or Paralogisms. Rather, he could sweep them all away quite simply through the charge that they fall short of the conditions for meaning.

The problem, thus, is not that we cannot coherently think the supersensible. It is, rather, that we can think about it in too many ways. Absent experience, reason is without a touchstone through which hypotheses can be refuted. Instead, so long as the ideas of reason are internally consistent, it can construct a multitude of theses and antitheses about the supersensible. It can, moreover, argue quite robustly in favor of each, something we see both in the Antinomies and all the more grandly in the great tomes of the metaphysicians. The problem, for Kant, is thus not about meaning, but rather it is epistemic: having no possible experience of the supersensible, we lack the theoretical resources to adjudicate between competing claims. Accordingly, to cognize, for Kant, is to think an object or proposition in relation to the order of nature and the material conditions that govern whether or not it obtains—what Kant calls the cognition’s “real possibility”. The conditions for real possibility, in turn, provide the investigational framework through which we can verify or falsify what is being cognized.

“Cognition”, thus, is not a semantic notion, but epistemic. It is a mode of thinking that is not just fanciful imagining but is directed to objects whose reality can be determined. Thinking requires merely the logical possibility of what is being entertained. So long as it is not self-contradictory, it can be thought. Cognition, by contrast, embeds the thought in the material conditions for, or the Real Possibility of, the object of thought, something that is not possible once one steps beyond the scope of possible experience.

Hence, we cannot have a cognition of God because, as Kant argues in the Transcendental Dialectic’s Ideal of Reason, there is no viable argument for God’s existence. Likewise, we cannot prove or disprove a miracle, for its alleged supersensible cause is not something whose conditions are determinable for us. Even if we experience some event whose cause is supersensible, we have no way whatsoever to establish that this is so, and have nothing to guide our hypotheses about how to test for miracles or how they come to be.

None of this challenges the intelligibility of religious doctrines. So long as they are not self-contradictory, they are thinkable. It is just that their truth or falsehood cannot possibly be known. Moreover, since they are not within the spectrum of epistemic evaluation, we cannot opine regarding them, for opinion [Meinung], as Kant understands the term, is a mode of assent based upon the weighing of theoretical grounds (evidence and argument) for and against truth.

Yet, this does not leave us with agnosticism either. Along with knowledge and opinion, Kant identifies faith as our third legitimate mode of holding-to-be-true [Fürwahrhalten]. Faith is, for Kant, a mode of justified assent, though the nature of its justification is quite different from opinion and knowledge. It is not rooted in experience or argument, but rather in what he characterizes as the “needs” of practical reason. Hence, for Kant, religious belief finds its proper seat not in intellectual reflection but in our practical lives.

Moreover, Kant sees faith, unlike knowledge, as engaging with our will, calling it a “free assent”. This is important for the practical function of faith, since our commitment to morality does not so simply depend on our affirmation of the postulates, but in our free act of faith through which we more completely bind ourselves to morality. Morality, thus “inevitably leads to religion” (AK 6:6 [1793]), since we need the latter in order to sustain or fully realize our commitment to the former. This, however, must not be interpreted as “theological ethics”, as if the authority of the moral law depended upon God. It is not its authority that is in question (perhaps with the exception of the argument at AK 5:114 in the Critique of Practical Reason [1788]). Rather, this advance from morality to religion concerns how we bind ourselves to the former (cf. A632/B660, AK 5:481 [1788], AK 6:3 [1793]).

3.3.1 Competing interpretations of Kant on religious assent

Although Kant’s presentation of faith as legitimate mode of “holding-to-be-true”, is consistently maintained through the Critical period’s published corpus, some Kantians have opted to develop interpretations which dismiss or overlook such discussions. We will here briefly compare four different stances on religious assent in Kant. A mistake for Kant

Some scholars hold that we should mostly ignore what Kant has to say about the postulates, and, consequently, the positive part of his religious philosophy. This is either because the postulates are taken as hold-overs from Kant’s pre-Critical period that are incompatible with his Critical philosophy (Allison 1990), or because the philosophical reasoning involving them is so bad as to be irrelevant to what makes Kant an important philosopher (Rawls 2000). Regardless of whether the postulates are a hold-over or simply poorly supported, the result is the same: for scholars who take this view, it is not important to have a detailed understanding of the attitudes involved in postulation, as they aren’t key to understanding what is valuable about Kant’s philosophy. Only as symbol (useful representation but no assent)

A second position that may be understood as an attempt to reconcile Transcendental Idealism with Kant’s philosophy of religion is to replace what he says about assent with a non-doxic attitude where religious concepts, rather than objects of belief, are instead taken as regulative ideals or representations of moral principles (Davidovich 1993, Henrich 1999, DiCenso 2012). While there are many passages in the Critical period where Kant promotes assent, this is a view in line with some fasciles of the Opus Postumum. Guyer (2005), for example, maintains that rather than the Opus Postumum reflecting a break from Kant’s Critical stance on religious assent, it instead finally brings the true character of his position to light. Needed assent on practical grounds

The most widespread view in recent scholarship is one that corresponds with the works of Stevenson (2003), Chignell (2007), and Pasternack (2011). It also has earlier adherents including Beck (1960) and Wood (1970). Although there are interpretative differences among these figures, there is a shared recognition that Kant does regard actual assent (holding-to-be-true) as having its ground in our moral interests, as driven by a “need” or the “needs” of practical reason.

Wood (1970), for example, bases his view upon the “Absurdum Practicum” argument where Kant states that anyone who renounces the postulates would become “contemptible” in their own eyes (A828/B856, AK 28:1083 [1817]). Chignell and Pasternack develop their interpretations primarily by way of an analysis of texts where Kant discusses the relationship between belief, knowledge and opinion. What is emphasized among these interpreters is the moral significance of religious assent rather than ontological commitment. Such may be taken as the spirit of Kant’s comment that “I must not even say ‘It is morally certain that there is a God’, but rather ‘I am morally certain’” (A829/B857).

Note that while there are a considerable number of texts where Kant endorses the need for religious assent, we may nevertheless distinguish between a number of positions. One holds that the adoption of a belief-state that is more akin to the symbolic use of the postulates, adopting them only in the form of an “as if”, without a commitment to their objective reality (Ferreira 2014). The most famous indication of the “as if” attitude appears at 4:448. Another position (Pasternack 2011, Insole 2016) is that Kant regarded faith as including a commitment to the objective reality of its objects. Passages in support of this view include AK 5:4 & 5:134 [1788], AK 5:456 & 5:469 [1790], AK 8:139 [1785a], AK 20:299. Note further that the spirit behind the “as if” attitude may be reemerging in a new form within the recent interest in Kant’s conception of moral hope.

3.3.2 Hope

In the Canon of the Critique of Pure Reason, Kant writes that

all interest of my reason (the speculative as well as the practical) is united in the following three questions: 1. What can I know? 2. What should I do? 3. What may I hope.

Kant then goes on to explain that hope is

simultaneously practical and theoretical, so that the practical leads like a clue to a reply to the theoretical question and, in its highest form, the speculative question.

Kant further describes hope in relation to our interest in happiness (A805/B833). The latter point perhaps connects more specifically with how Kant frames the highest good in the Critique of Pure Reason versus later work. Nevertheless, despite how Kant highlights the question of hope in this text, it does not receive the same level of exposition as knowledge, opinion or faith. For further discussion of Kant on hope, see the section on Kant in the entry on hope.

3.4 The Highest Good

Kant’s doctrine of the highest good is the foundation of his positive philosophy of religion. With the exception of some musings (esp. in the Critique of Pure Reason) about an assent driven by our regulative employment of purposiveness (cf. B426, A670/B698 and A826/B854), the path to religion is through the highest good. It is through this doctrine that Kant endorses belief in God’s existence as well as the immortality of the soul. It is also through this doctrine that Kant sets out what in the Religion he calls the Pure Rational System of Religion. Therein, Kant appraises Christian doctrines to determine whether or not they are conducive to our duty to pursue the highest good (see section 3.6.4 and section 3.7 below).

In the Critique of Practical Reason, Kant distinguishes between the “supreme”, the “complete”, and “highest” good. By “supreme good”, he means the good that is “not subordinate to any other” (AK 5:110 [1788]). That is, if there are a plurality of values, the supreme good is the one that overrides the rest. Hence, if pleasure were taken as a value, its value would be subordinate to morality, and thus its value would be defeated or overridden if the pleasure comes through a violation of the moral law.

The “complete good” is one that “is not part of a still greater whole of the same kind” (AK 5:110 [1788). Kant then explains that while morality is the supreme good, it is not the complete good “as the object of the faculty of desire of rational finite beings” (AK 5:110). This is because in addition to morality, finite rational beings also desire happiness. So, although happiness is subordinate to morality, morality is not the “complete good” because it does not encompass all that we desire.

Kant then presents the highest good as a synthesis of morality and happiness in order to meet the axiological principles of supremacy and completeness. More specifically, he presents the highest good as an ideal state of affairs in which there is a proportional distribution of happiness in accordance with moral worth (A809/B837, AK 5:110 & 5:145 [1788]; AK 5:471 [1790]; AK 6:8n & 6:99 [1793]; AK 8:139 [1785a]; AK 8:281 [1764]). Nevertheless, some interpreters have proposed that Kant withdrew this formulation in later years, supporting instead the notion that the highest good reflects the idea of maximal happiness and maximal morality as two independent variables (Reath 1988, Guyer 2011, Moran 2012). However, Pasternack (2017a) argues at length that the corpus neither supports this nor the putative abandonment of one or both of the postulates of God and immortality (see section 3.5.2 below).

3.5 The Practical Postulates

Although Kant enumerates three postulates, freedom, God, and immortality, their etiologies differ. In contrast to the latter two, the postulate of freedom is more directly tied to the fact of reason, taken as a necessary condition for the bindingness of the moral law upon us. By contrast, the postulates of God and Immortality are rooted in the highest good. As such, we will here only be concerned with the latter two “religious” postulates.

3.5.1 The postulate of God

While the Critique of Pure Reason shows some sympathy for the Argument from Design, Kant remarks that it can only get us to a “Wise Author of Nature”, a being who is responsible for the order of nature, rather than a creator, a being with infinite capacities, or a moral being. By contrast, the Canon of the First Critique advances a conception of God as omnipotent, omniscient, and omnibenevolent. Hence, as there argued, in order for the highest good to obtain, there must be a being capable of arranging the world such that happiness is exactly proportioned to moral worth. This being must further have the cognitive powers necessary to judge or moral worth, and, presumably, a will aligned with morality.

Kant explains that our construction of the classic conception of God as omnipotent, omniscient and all good gains its validity through the need for this being as the agent responsible for the distribution of happiness in proportion to moral worth (A816/B845–A819/B847). It is through morality and the highest good that we “produced a concept of the divine being that we now hold to be correct” (A818/B846). Likewise, “What does it Mean to Orient Oneself in Thinking”, Kant explains that the very “concept of God and even the conviction of his existence” arises through our practical needs and that these needs operate as the “signpost or compass by means of which the speculative thinker orients himself in his rational excursions into the field of supersensible objects” (AK 8:142 [1785a]). In other words, while theoretical reason on its own ventures into this field without any valid warrants, the needs of practical reason, from which we form both our concepts of the postulates and the basis for our assent, is, Kant maintains, the sole basis by which we may extend our cognition (i.e., valid construction of concepts) into the supersensible.

3.5.2 The postulate of immortality

The postulate of immortality is typically found alongside Kant’s discussions of the postulate of God. He regards both as necessary conditions for the realization of the highest good, though the function of this postulate undergoes a number of revisions through the Critical period.

In the Critique of Pure Reason, Kant presents two distinct arguments for it. The first is a non-moral argument and is found in the B-Paralogism, after his rejection of Mendelssohn’s argument for the same. Mendelssohn’s argument builds off the thesis that the soul is a simple entity and cessation of existence involves a dissolution of one part and then another. He thus concludes that since the soul is simple, it is impossible for it to cease to exist. Kant rejects this argument on the grounds that even simple beings can have a degree of reality (an intensive magnitude) that can diminish to zero, he shortly thereafter presents his own argument for the soul’s immortality, one that has a similar metaphysical bent: (a) since throughout nature there is a proportionality between purposes and the conditions for the realization of those purposes, there should be a similar proportionality between our capacities and the conditions for their realization, and (b) since the grandeur of our capacities, including both our natural talents and moral vocation, exceeds what can be realized in this life, it follows (c) that we are justified in affirming a “future life”. This argument, or one very similar to it, is also present in the Canon’s discussion of “doctrinal belief” [doctrinale Glaube]. However, this is not an argument that endures beyond the 1780s. It is absent in later works, and in the Critique of Judgment, Kant explicitly dismisses it along with all other non-moral arguments for the afterlife (cf. AK 5:460 & 5:468 [1790]).

The other and better known argument for this postulate is first found in the Critique of Pure Reason’s Canon. Like his argument for the postulate of God, Kant also argues that we must postulate the immortality of the soul as a necessary condition for the distribution of happiness in the highest good. Given the exigencies of the natural order, this distribution cannot be secured within this order. We must therefore posit a “future life”, a “Kingdom of Grace” where “every happiness awaits us as long as we do not ourselves limit our share of it through the unworthiness to be happy” (A812/B840). Hence, in the First Critique, the purpose of the afterlife is to provide a domain for the highest good’s distribution of happiness.

Before moving forward, let us discuss the belief found in some quarters (Reath 1989, Rawls 2000, Guyer 2005) that Kant abandoned the postulate of immortality in the 1790s.

The most common claim used to support this assertion is that Kant’s uses the phrase “highest good in the world” (AK 5:450 [1790]) in the Critique of Judgment in order to signal a shift away from an afterlife ideal distribution of happiness in proportion to moral worth to the ideal of the highest good as connected with our ordinary corporeal existence. What, however, Kant means by “in the world” requires some investigation before any such conclusions can be drawn.

First, Kant directly discusses what he intends by “world” in the Critique of Pure Reason where he explains to readers that he will be using “nature” to refer to “the unity in the existence of appearances” (A419/B447) versus “world”, which has a “transcendental sense”, such that when dealing with cosmological ideas, “world” goes beyond just the phenomenal to the “sum total of existing things” (A419/B447).

Second, we see “world” used in this manner throughout the corpus, including passages where it is quite clear that Kant uses “world” in its “transcendental sense”, extending beyond just the realm of nature (e.g., A811/B839, A813/B839, AK 5:143 [1788], AK 8:139 [1785a], 20:298. In fact, Kant even describes the postulate of immortality as obtaining “in the world” at the opening of his discussion of this postulate in the Critique of Practical Reason (AK 5:122—see also 5:143 [1788]).

Third, the highest good is linked with the immortality of the soul continually through the texts of the 1790s, including the Critique of Judgment, where it can be found more than a dozen times through its final section. It is mentioned briefly in the “Theodicy” essay of 1791 (AK 8:262 & 8:269n), in multiple passages throughout the Religion, in “The End of All Things” (AK 8:328–330 [1794]) in the Conflict of the Faculties (AK 7:40, 7:44, etc. [1798]), the 1796 “Proclamation” Essay (AK 8:418–419), as well as in “Real Progress” (AK 20:298). Accordingly, despite the stature of those who put forward the claim that Kant abandoned the postulate of immortality circa 1790, it is a claim that does not attend to either how Kant uses “world” versus “nature”, nor the surfeit of affirmative discussions about the afterlife through the 1790s.

Fourth, supporters of the abandonment thesis assert that Kant no longer needs the postulate of immortality (and perhaps God) because in the 1790s he further abandons his earlier picture of the highest good as a distribution of happiness in proportion to moral worth, adopting instead the idea that this ideal is composed of maximal happiness and maximal morality as two independent variables. The basis for this claim is his 1793 essay “On the Common Saying: ‘That may be Correct in Theory, but it is of no use in Practice’” where Kant describes the highest good as “universal happiness combined with and in conformity with the purest morality throughout the world” (AK 8:279). Yet the interpretative merits of this claim built upon this passage are greatly diminished once one attends to the footnote Kant attaches to it, where he explains that he does not mean happiness on its own, “but only of a proportion between it and the worthiness of a subject” (AK 8:280n).

The abandonment thesis is further defended by Guyer (2016) where in addition to building his case for this thesis based upon the aforementioned depiction of the highest good at AK 8:279, he also argues that in the Religion Kant has given up the Second Critique’s rationale for the postulate of immortality, namely, immortality as required for the sake of an eternal striving for perfection. Rather than being tied to (striving for) perfection, we find in the Religion that our moral worthiness is instead tied to our supreme maxim or “change of heart”.

That is, Guyer proposes that the standard for moral worthiness offered by Kant in the Religion no longer itself requires the postulation of immortality. This is a view likewise advanced by Pasternack (2014: 142–146) in his discussion of the “change of heart” in the Religion. Unlike what is found in the Second Critique, in both the Religion and “The End of All Things” (1794), Kant presents our afterlife fate as solely dependent upon (or should be viewed as solely dependent upon) what we can morally achieve in this life (AK 6:69n–71n [1793], AK 8:328–330 [1794]). Hence, once our moral worthiness is understood as something to be achieved in this life, how one interprets Kant’s commitment to the postulate centrally turns on how one interprets his views on the distribution of happiness within the highest good.

As discussed through this subsection, Kant’s views on the postulate of immortality through the Critical period involve these three core issues: (a) the standard for moral worth articulated by Kant in various texts; (b) whether Kant continues to regard the highest good as a distribution of happiness in proportion to moral worth versus as maximal happiness and maximal morality as two independent variables; and (c) whether or not the distribution of happiness (especially if taken as proportionate to moral worth) depends upon the postulate of immortality (i.e., cannot take place within the causal order of nature). Beyond these three core issues, further issues include: (d) the limitations to and relevance of our speculations about the nature of the afterlife (see AK 6:69n–6:71n [1793] and AK 8:328–332 [1794]) and (e) the historical backdrop for Kant’s engagement with various models of the afterlife (see Bunch 2010).

3.6 Kant as Philosophical Theologian

In October 1794, Kant received a royal rescript from the court of Frederick William II reprimanding him for his heterodox writings on Christianity and prohibiting him from further publication which “distort and disparage” Christianity (cf. AK 7:6 [1798]). In his official response (unknown date, but late October 1794 is most likely), Kant agreed to “hereafter refrain altogether from discoursing publicly, in lectures or writing, on religion,” but also protested that his writings nevertheless have made “no appraisal of Christianity” (AK 7:8 [1798]).

Putting aside the question as to whether Kant might have prevaricated in his response, the question remains: to what extent does Kant engage with Christian doctrine and to what extent is his philosophical theology compatible with it? On the one hand, there are epistemological questions which we have addressed elsewhere in this entry. But there is also the question of whether or not Kant saw his work as compatible or at odds with such core Christian doctrines as Original Sin, Grace, the Incarnation, and Vicarious Atonement. We will here consider four interpretative positions.

3.6.1 A successful Christian apologist

Some interpreters have claimed that the Religion serves as Kant’s philosophical defense of traditional Christian doctrines, and that it succeeds in this regard. This is a view advanced by Chris Firestone and Nathan Jacobs in their In Defense of Kant’s Religion. For example, these authors hold that Kant’s portrayal of moral evil in Part One is shaped by an “Augustinian metaphysic” (Firestone & Jacobs 2008: 136), that in Part Two Kant promotes the idea of the Incarnation, utilizing a “Scotistic understanding of divine being” (Firestone & Jacobs 2008: 161) and that Part Four not only concludes with an argument for the “priority of belief in Christianity” but defends the necessity of special revelation which, as they earlier claim, is necessary for Kant’s critical philosophy as a whole (Firestone & Jacobs 2008: 115).

A similar position is advanced by Stephen Palmquist who finds in the Religion not only an examination of those aspects of rational religion which conform with Christian doctrine, but also a philosophical defense of the need for revelation. Palmquist claims, for example, that Religion’s treatment of Original Sin is used by Kant to articulate “what we might call a Christ-sized ‘hole’ in the heart of humanity’s rational capacity” (Palmquist 2016: 165), that Kant “regarded the Christian Gospel as a genuine revelation” (Palmquist 2016: 166) and that an otherwise deficient “bare reason” requires revelatory content in order that we may “believe” in our own capacity to imitate the “archetype of perfection” (Palmquist 2016: 166). That is, Palmquist contends that, in line with traditional Christianity, Kant regards our salvation as dependent upon having faith in the historical reality of the Incarnation.

3.6.2 A Failed Christian apologist

A second school of interpretation likewise maintains that Kant wrote the Religion for the purposes of offering a philosophical defense of traditional Christian doctrines. This school, however, holds that he was ultimately unsuccessful. This is a view which principally flows from Karl Barth’s 1947 Die protestantische Theologie im 19. Jahrhundert, and is adopted by a group of later philosophers of religion including members of the school of “Reformed Epistemology”, including Philip Quinn, Nicholas Wolterstorff and John Hare.

Within Kant circles, they are best known for the so-called “Conundrum” interpretation of Kant’s Religion, where these authors protest that Kant’s venture into philosophical theology is not only inconsistent with the epistemic strictures of Transcendental Idealism (Wolterstorff 1998), but also is internally inconsistent in virtue of the fact that its understanding of Original Sin is essentially Augustinian while its understanding of moral restoration is Pelagian. Wolterstorff goes so far as to claim that Kant’s philosophical theology suffers from “not just implausibility or tension, but internal contradiction” (Wolterstorff 1991: 49). Likewise, John Hare (1996) declares it an outright “failure” and Gordon Michalson (1990) contends that the Religion contains a litany of “wobbles” between incompatible Christian and Enlightenment commitments.

Although there are a number of other targets of criticism, their main contention is that Kant inconsistently accepts (a) the Augustinian conception of Original Sin which holds that our moral capacities have through the Fall been damaged in such a way that we are incapable of moral improvement without Sanctifying Grace; and yet (b) Kant subscribes to what they call his “Stoic Maxim” that “a person’s moral worth is determined entirely by that person himself” (Wolterstorff 1991: 48). Recently, Andrew Chignell has accepted the essence of the “Conundrum” objection, relying upon it as a reason why Kant must appeal to hope: since Kant’s alleged “Stoic Maxim” leaves no room for divine aid, and yet divine aid seems to be needed, it can be (at best) an object of hope, since unlike other propositional attitudes, hope is rationally permissible in the face of a (seeming) impossibility so long as it does not rise to an impossibility of “the most fundamental modal level” (Chignell 2014: 114–115).

3.6.3 Non-doxic theologian

A third school holds that despite appearances to the contrary, the Religion does not engage in “theological speculation concerning the doctrine of grace in any form” (DiCenso 2012: 117). This view is advanced by James DiCenso in his 2012 commentary on the Religion, and more recently by Allen Wood in his Kant and Religion (2020). The former’s 2012 commentary advises that we avoid any literal reading of religious doctrines in the text, and that we should instead interpret Kant’s treatment of them as presenting no more than our moral ideals in “imaginatively enhanced or pictorial form” (2012: 28). Likewise, in the latter’s Kant and Religion (2020), the author presents the Religion as a study of how we can understand Christianity’s presentation of a “second-person relationship between myself and God” (Wood 2020: 137) as instead symbols for a first-person “self-relation” (Wood 2020: 137, 143) through which we gain “a meaningful and emotionally enriched way of relating to our own past” (Wood 2020: 145). Interestingly, these interpretations cohere with certain interpretations of Kant’s philosophical theology in the Opus Postumum (see Section 4 below), with both extending not only the thesis that God, for Kant, is nothing but a symbol of our moral ideals, but that all religious doctrines involving the supersensible should likewise be interpreted as such.

Further, both interpretations pick up on a number of comments in the Religion where Kant associates the historical side of religion with our need for symbols to help us with the “highest concepts and grounds of reason” (AK 6:109 [1793]) and hopes for a future time where we will no longer need “all statutes that rest on history” (AK 6:121 [1793]). Nevertheless, this aspect of Kant’s treatment of religion does not apply to the postulates, nor does it pertain to the underlying moral/theological issues which are symbolized in specific doctrines (e.g., our innate propensity to evil as represented in the story of Genesis, or our hope for divine as represented in the Crucifixion).

What principally differentiates DiCenso (2012) and Wood (2020), however, is that the former’s hermeneutic denies outright that Kant ever engages with any doctrine in its literal form, whereas the latter sees the core goal of the Religion to “interpret revealed Christianity in such a way … [to] show that reason and Christianity are allies, not enemies” (Wood 2020: 20). But in order to realize that goal, doctrines have to be rendered as just symbols. So, while Wood recognizes that Kant rejects various doctrines (e.g. the story of Abraham and Isaac on Wood 2020: 14; and the inheritability of sin on Wood 2020: 62), such rejections occur only when doctrines are understood literally. Accordingly, Wood would have us look past Kant’s engagements with literal doctrines and take Kant as claiming that they need to be understood just as symbols. This would then allow for the thesis that “everything in revealed (Christian) faith is compatible with rational faith” (Wood 2020: 20), which Wood asserts is the aim of the so-called “Second Experiment” of the Religion, i.e. the goal of the Second Experiment is to “disprove the hypothesis... [that] there are parts of revealed Christianity that are demonstrably and permanently incompatible with rational religion” (Wood 2020: 20).

3.6.4 Pure rational system of religion

A fourth interpretative position is that the aim of Religion is to (a) examine the scope of “unity” or “compatibility” between rational religion and historical faith and (b) evaluate which aspects of historical faith (with Christianity being the primary focus) are apt vehicles for rational religion versus those which are incompatible with it (Pasternack 2014). Hence, the Religion was not written as a Christian apologetic, but rather is Kant’s inquiry into the relationship between natural theology and revealed religion. However, unlike the many other such inquiries written during the era, Kant’s own version of natural theology is one that shaped by moral rather than theoretical reason.

By way of this interpretative framework, Pasternack (2014) maintains that the Religion is both compatible with the epistemic strictures of Transcendental Idealism (contrary the interpretations summarized above) as well as internally consistent. As for the discussions where Kant appears to be guided by an “Augustinian metaphysic” (Firestone & Jacobs 2008: 136), “firmly ensconced within the Augustinian tradition” (Quinn 1988: 91) or “accommodating” (Wood 1970: 246) tenets “fundamental to Augustine” (Beiser 2006: 594), he is rather examining such tenets in order to determine whether or not they have “unity” or “compatibility” with rational religion. Such doctrines as Original Sin, Grace, the Incarnation, Vicarious Atonement and so forth are thus examined by Kant in the Religion in order to, in each case, assess whether or not they cohere with his moral anthropology and doctrine of the highest good.

3.7 The Aims and Structure of the Religion

Until the recent spate of commentaries on the Religion, little work has been done on its overall aims and structure. Although Part One of the text has long been mined for insights into Kant’s picture of the moral agency, such studies did not consider how the overall text might inform the passages minded therefrom. The last decade, however, has seen the publication of a number of commentaries on the Religion, each with their own distinctive interpretations (Firestone & Jacobs 2008, DiCenso 2012, Pasternack 2014, Miller 2015, Palmquist 2016), most of whose authors are mentioned in this entry. The above section also provides a brief overview of their respective positions with regards to the relationship between Kant’s Religion and core Christian doctrines. In this section, we will briefly review what Kant himself says about his project and how it unfolds through its four parts.

3.7.1 The two prefaces

To begin, the publication of the Religion (1793) has a complicated history. Kant initially planned to write a series of essays on Christian doctrines, but that was frustrated when the second of these essays was denied official imprimatur. Because the Prussian Censorship Commission had different rules for the publication of articles versus books, Kant chose to combine the planned essays into a single volume, and to avoid further scrutiny by the Commission, he made sure that it was assessed as a work of philosophy rather than theology. Although such maneuvers ultimately led to his censorship during the reign of Frederick William II, Kant nevertheless was able to publish the Religion, whose First Preface includes, after an initial discussion of how through the highest good “morality leads inevitably to religion” (AK 6:8n), a defense of his rationale for treating the work as one of philosophical theology rather than “biblical theology” (AK 6:7–6:11). The Preface then ends with Kant’s characterization of the Religion as an “attempt” or “experiment” (Versuch) at determining the scope of overlap between the “pure philosophical doctrine of religion” (AK 6:10) and the contents of historical faith (especially Christianity).

The Preface to the second edition begins with a discussion of the Religion’s title, which as Kant explains, is meant to depict two overlapping domains, the “wider sphere of faith” and the “narrower” sphere of the “pure religion of reason” (AK 6:12). Kant then writes that from “this standpoint I can also make this second experiment” (zweiten Versuch), without, however, explicitly enumerating a “first experiment”.

Some have proposed (Hare 1996, Reardon 1988) that the unstated “first experiment” pertains to the domain of overlap between Biblical Theology and the Pure Rational System of Religion. The Second Experiment then seeks

to show that certain items in the outer circle lead back within the inner circle when looked at in the light of, or translated in terms of moral concepts. (Hare 1996: 40)

Others have proposed that the First Experiment pertains to the Religion’s “transcendental elements” while the Second Experiment “aims at assessing one particular empirical religion”, namely Christianity (Palmquist 2000: 143), or serves as a philosophical apologetic for Christianity (Firestone & Jacobs 2008).

Pasternack (2017b), however, argues that the interpretative debate over the first/second experiment distinction rests on a simple mistake. Normally, Versuch would be translated as “attempt”, but early Anglophone translators of the Religion chose instead “experiment”. That choice has passed along through contemporary translations and has led interpreters to make far too much of this passage. The passage appears towards the opening of the Preface to the second edition of the Religion and is, as argued by Pasternack, merely meant by Kant to indicate that he is issuing his second attempt [zweiten Versuch] at the very same non-enumerated “experiment” [Versuch] similarly described in the Preface to the first edition (compare the language at AK 6:10 in the First Preface to AK 6:12 in the Second). In other words, Pasternack asserts that the many attempts to divide out the Religion into two distinct “experiments” is an unfortunate byproduct of the secondary literature, unrelated to the actual structure of the text.

What both Prefaces ultimately explain is that Kant’s goal in the Religion is to (a) provide an inquiry into the scope of overlap between historical faith (especially in the form of Christianity) and pure rational religion; and (b) use the latter as a guide for distinguishing between which elements of the former are matters of “genuine religion” rather than “cult” (AK 6:12–13). Each of the Religion’s four parts then take on core issues with Christian doctrine.

3.7.2 Part one

In Part One, Kant’s aim is to examine the Christian doctrine of Original Sin, especially as he would have been exposed to it through his Lutheran Pietist upbringing. His interest is in finding out whether there is any overlap between this historical doctrine and pure rational religion. More specifically, his goal is to assess the doctrine of Original Sin so as to determine what (if any) overlap it has with rational religion. He thus considers such matters as: how can our moral condition be innate and yet we can remain responsible for it; whether, as would have been held by the Augustinian tradition, Original Sin involves such a fundamental corruption of our faculties that we lose the cognitive and volitional capacities needed to will the good; and then in the “General Remark” or first Parergon, whether or not our corrupted moral condition is such that divine aid is required for us to overcome it. Throughout, we see Kant taking up these and other themes within the Augustinian conception of Original Sin, sometimes finding places of overlap with rational religion, sometimes finding the two in conflict.

3.7.3 Part two

The Second Part of the Religion moves on to Christology and the alleged role of Christ in our salvation. Kant begins with a discussion of the Incarnation and whether it can be interpreted in such a way that is compatible with pure rational religion (AK 6:60–6:66). He then moves on to three “difficulties:” how to understand the doctrine of Sanctifying Grace (the “change of heart” or moral regeneration) in relation to pure rational religion; whether an individual can know his/her moral status as having undergone a “change of heart”, and how this relates to the challenge of moral perseverance; how to understand the “debt of sin” or the issue of “Justifying Grace”. On this issue, we again see Kant opposing the prevailing doctrines of his day, explicitly rejecting the idea of “vicarious atonement” (AK 6:72–73) as anathema to pure rational religion.

3.7.4 Part three

The Third Part of the Religion considers religion from a historical standpoint, including the need for the founding of a universal church, the importance of that church for the moral improvement of society (the “ethical community”), questions of divine providence, and eschatology.

Kant’s focus in this part is the social dimension of moral evil, where he draws from the Predisposition to Humanity discussed in Part One (see Wood 1999), and argues that we “mutually corrupt each other’s moral dispositions and make one another evil” (AK 6:94). The goal of the universal church is to promote a new sort of social exchange guided by our collective “duty sui generis” of human beings to work cooperatively towards “a common end, namely the promotion of the highest good” (AK 6:97). The ethical community is then presented as an ideal state of affairs reflecting the realization of the highest good.

3.7.5 Part four

The final part of the Religion focuses on ecclesiology. After an initial discussion of the religious framework for the ethical community, Kant offers an important discussion of Christianity as a natural versus a “learned” religion. The point of the former is that “genuine religion”, is one that can be “comprehensibly and convincingly” communicated to all human beings “through their own reason” (AK 6:162) without any necessary role for revelation. The latter, by contrast, turns to the “dogmas of faith” (AK 6:163) and its dangers. This begins Kant’s discussion of “counterfeit service”, “priestcraft” and the “delusions of religion” he sees in ecclesiastical practice. While rational religion maintains that nothing apart from “good life-conduct” is required to “become well-pleasing to God” (AK 6:170), historical faith routinely claims that God’s judgment is based instead on our doctrinal commitments and liturgical observances.

Therein, Kant examines the ultimate “subjective ground of religious delusion” (AK 6:168), how the artificies of organized religion let us “slip back into evil” (AK 6:184) and then finally how practices including prayer, church attendance, and rituals could nevertheless still be reconstituted for the genuine moral religion of a universal church and “cosmopolitan moral community” (AK 6:194–200).

3.7.6 The Parerga or General Remarks

Each of the four parts of the Religion close with a section entitled “General Remark” or “Parergon” (Supplement or Appendix) to its main body. In the Second Edition to the Religion, Kant adds a brief explanation of the function of the Parerga, describing them as concerned with matters which are at the “border” of the “boundaries of pure reason”. He lists these as: (1) the effects of grace; (2) miracles; (3) the holy mysteries; (4) the means of grace. Kant explains that reason

does not contest the possibility or actuality of the objects of these ideas; it just cannot incorporate them into its maxims of thought or action. (AK 6:52)

They are topics to which we are lead given the issues under discussion through the main body of each part, but are all matters of caution for us for while they each pertain to a need that seems unfulfilled through what pure reason can allow for genuine religion, and in some manner may invigorate our moral lives, they are all also paths to “dogmatic faith” (6:52).

Hence, each part of the Religion ends with a caution somewhat akin to the cautions which shape the Critique of Pure Reason’s Dialectic: though the needs of reason drive us to speculation, we must not fall into error thereby. For example, while the logic of ought implies can warrants our belief that a “change of heart” is possible, we cannot either affirm or deny a role for divine aid/grace. Likewise, while Transcendental Idealism leaves room for the possibility of a “supernatural intervention” (AK 6:191), we are not epistemically situated so that we can ever justifiably claim that some particular effect was in fact due to such intervention.

The parerga thus are used by Kant to separate out what doctrines of historical faith the pure rational system of religion can assess versus what doctrines that—while we are compelled to speculate about them—require our agnosticism. As such, the parerga reflect limit issues, at the “border” of rational religion, for which there is both a theoretical interest and moral need to visit, but also where the dangers that we stray into dogmatism are the greatest (Palmquist 2016, Muchnik 2019).

4. Religion in the Opus Postumum

In the mid-1790s, Kant began to explore what he saw as a “gap... in the critical philosophy” (Kant to Garve, September 21, 1798 AK 12:257), namely, how to transition from what he established about natural science in general in the Metaphysical Foundations of Natural Science to physics in particular. However, his notes on this “gap” exceeded his original plan, as they came to cover not only how to transition from the foundations of natural science to physics, but also self-positing, God, and the nature of transcendental philosophy. These notes, which were composed during a roughly seventeen-year period, and came to be assembled under the title, Opus Postumum, prompt questions as to whether or not Kant’s views on God during this period represent a break from or continuity with the philosophy of religion he presented in his previous works. And further, if there is continuity, in what way might its contents help to illuminate Kant’s overall Critical philosophy of religion?

For instance, there are many passages in the Opus Postumum which present God not as a substance or a being outside of us, but rather an ideal or thought-object. For some, this is taken as an indication that in Kant’s final years, he withdrew from his more affirmative religious views seen up through the mid-1790s (Förster 2000). While for others, it finally articulates the view that Kant held throughout the Critical period, namely that despite textual evidence to the contrary, Kant never advanced any argument, moral or otherwise, for belief in God (W. Sullivan 1971, Guyer 2000, Byrne 2007).

Nevertheless, amidst the passages in the Opus Postumum which present God as merely an ideal or thought-object, there are others which are not so deflationary, presenting God in a manner similar to the more familiar works of the Critical period (AK 21:13–14 [OP 220–222], AK 22:126–127 [OP 206–207]).

One way to understand these discrepancies is to recognize that the Opus Postumum is a collection of notes written over more than a decade, unedited, and possibly different from what would have been the final version of the treatise. Hence, Kant might have been rethinking his philosophy of religion, exploring possibilities, or working through some ideas which could fill his perceived “gap in the critical philosophy”, ideas that neither undercut the epistemic strictures of the Critique of Pure Reason nor the religiously affirmative language in his practical philosophy.

Further, though Kant sometimes describes God as an ideal or thought-object, he also says the same about the world and man-in-the-world, raising the possibility that his discussions of God took place in two separate spheres: transcendental philosophy proper, which provides the purely formal conditions of metaphysics and so includes only the ideals we must construct in order to posit ourselves in the world (namely, God, the world, and man-in-the-world); and metaphysics, which is transcendental philosophy applied to certain objects (“[the transcendental philosopher] addresses merely what is formal, [the metaphysician] what is material (the object, the material)” [AK 21:79 [OP: 246]]). If this is right, then it could be that Kant does not repudiate or deflate his prior philosophy of religion, but merely adds a new layer to it. Unfortunately, the Opus Postumum’s unfinished state makes it difficult to come to a secure conclusion about where Kant’s thinking on religion stood in his final years.


Primary Literature

Citations from Kant’s texts refer to volume and page numbers in the Akademie edition (AK),

  • [AK] Königlichen Preußischen (later Deutschen) Akademie der Wissenschaften (ed.), 1900–, Kants gesammelte Schriften, Berlin: Georg Reimer (later Walter De Gruyter).

except for references to the Critique of Pure Reason, which is cited by page numbers in the original first (A) and second (B) editions. Some of the English language collections are:

  • [C] Correspondence, Arnulf Zweig (trans. and ed.), Cambridge, Cambridge University Press, 1999. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511527289
  • [TPpre] Theoretical Philosophy 1755–1770, David Walford (trans. and ed.), Cambridge, Cambridge University Press, 1992. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511840180
  • [RRT] Religion and Rational Theology, Allen W. Wood and George di Giovanni (eds. & trans.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511814433
  • [PP] Immanuel Kant: Practical Philosophy, Mary J. Gregor (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511813306

A. Pre-critical writings

The following texts are central to Kant’s pre-critical views on religion. They are found in Theoretical Philosophy 1755–1770 (TPpre):

  • 1755a, A New Elucidation of the First Principles of Metaphysical Cognition, TPpre: 1–45. [AK 1:385–416]
  • 1763a, Attempt to Introduce the Concept of Negative Magnitudes into Philosophy, TPpre: 207–241. [AK 2:167–204]
  • 1763b, The Only Possible Argument in Support of a Demonstration of the Existence of God, TPpre: 107–201. [AK 2:63–163]
  • 1764, Inquiry Concerning the Distinctness of the Principles of Natural Theology and Morality, TPpre: 243–286. [AK 2:273–301]

See also:

  • 1755b, Universal Natural History and Theory of the Heavens or Essay on the Constitution and the Mechanical Origin of the whole Universe According to Newtonian Principles, Olaf Reinhardt (trans.), in Immanuel Kant, Natural Science, Eric Watkins (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2015, 182–308. [AK 1:215–368]

B. Critical writings

The following texts focus most directly on religion. They are all found in Religion and Rational Theology (RRT):

  • 1785a, What Does It Mean to Orient Oneself in Thinking? Allen W. Wood (trans.), RRT: 7–18. [AK 8:133–146] doi:10.1017/CBO9780511814433.003
  • 1791, On the Miscarriage of All Philosophical Trials in Theodicy, George Di Giovanni (trans.), RRT: 24–37. [AK 8:253–271] doi:10.1017/CBO9780511814433.004
  • 1793, Religion within the Boundaries of Mere Reason, George Di Giovanni (trans.), RRT: 57–215. [AK 6:1–202] doi:10.1017/CBO9780511814433.005
  • 1794, The End of All Things, Allen W. Wood (trans.), RRT: 221–31. [AK 8:327–339] doi:10.1017/CBO9780511814433.006
  • 1798, The Conflict of the Faculties, Mary J. Gregor and Robert Anchor (trans.), RRT: 239–327. [AK 7:5–116] doi:10.1017/CBO9780511814433.007
  • 1817, Lectures on the Philosophical Doctrine of Religion, Allen W. Wood (trans.), RRT: 341–451. [AK 28:993–1126] doi:10.1017/CBO9780511814433.009

Other writings from the critical period relevant to Kant’s view of God and religion:

  • 1781 [1787], Critique of Pure Reason; second edition 1787, Paul Guyer and Allen W. Wood (trans.) Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1998.
  • 1783, Prolegomena to any Future Metaphysics That Will Be Able to Come Forward as a Science, Gary Hatfield (trans.), in Theoretical Philosophy after 1781, Henry Allison and Peter Heath (eds), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2002, 51–169. [AK 4:255–383]
  • 1784a, An Answer to the Question: What Is Enlightenment? Mary J. Gregor (trans.), in PP: 17–22. [AK 8:35–42]
  • 1784b, Idea for A Universal History from a Cosmopolitan Point of View, Lewis White Beck (trans.). 1963, In Kant: On History. Lewis White Beck (ed.). Indianapolis and New York: Bobbs-Merrill, 11–26. [AK 8:17–31]
  • 1785b, Groundwork of the Metaphysics of Morals, Mary J. Gregor (trans.), in PP: 43–108. [AK 4:387–463]
  • 1786, The Conjectural Beginning of Human History, Emil L. Fackenheim (trans.). 1963, In Kant: On History. Lewis White Beck (ed.). Indianapolis and New York: Bobbs-Merrill, 53–68. [AK 8:109–123]>
  • 1786, The Metaphysical Foundations of Natural Science, Michael Friedman (trans.), in Theoretical Philosophy after 1781, 171–270. [AK 4:467–565]
  • 1788, Critique of Practical Reason, Mary J. Gregor (trans.), in PP: 139–271. [AK 5:3–163]
  • 1790, Critique of the Power of Judgment, Paul Guyer and Eric Matthews (trans.). 2000. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. [AK 5:167–485]
  • 1793, On the Common Saying: ‘This may be true in theory, but it does not apply in practice’, Mary J. Gregor (trans.), in PP: 279–309. [AK 8:275–313]
  • 1795, Toward Perpetual Peace, Mary J. Gregor (trans.), in PP: 317–351. [AK 8:343–86]
  • 1796, Proclamation of the Imminent Conclusion of a Treaty of Perpetual Peace in Philosophy, Peter Heath (trans.), in Theoretical Philosophy after 1781, 453–460.
  • 1797, The Metaphysics of Morals, Mary J. Gregor (trans.), in PP: 365–603. [AK 6:205–493]
  • 1804, What Real Progress Has Metaphysics Made in Germany since the Time of Leibniz and Wolff? Peter Heath (trans.), in Theoretical Philosophy after 1781, 337–424. [AK 20:257–332]
  • 1821, Metaphysik L2. [AK 28:525–610]
  • 1968, Metaphysik Volckmann. [AK 28:355–459]
  • [OP] Opus Postumum, unpublished at his death, Ekart Förster (ed.), Ekart Förster and Michael Rosen (trans.) Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1993. [AK 21 and AK 22] doi:10.1017/CBO9780511625169

C. Other works

  • Baumgarten, Alexander Gottlieb, 1739, Metaphysics: A Critical Translation with Kant’s Elucidations, Selected Notes, and Related Materials, Courtney Fugate, and John Hymers (trans.), London: Bloomsbury, 2013.
  • Crusius, Christian August, 1751, Opuscula Philosophico-Theologica, Leipzig: Gleditsh.
  • Eberhard, Johann August and Immanuel Kant, 1781, Preparation for Natural Theology: With Kant’s Notes and the Danzig Rational Theology Transcript, Courtney Fugate and John Hymers (trans.), London: Bloomsbury, 2016.
  • Knutzen, Martin, 1740, Philosophischer Beweiss von der Wahrheit der Christlichen Religion, Königsberg: Hartung.
  • Leibniz, G.W., 1710, Theodicy, E.M. Huggard (trans.), Chicago: Open Court, 1990.
  • Pope, Alexander, 1734, An Essay on Man, Dublin: Powell.
  • Rousseau, Jean-Jacques, 1762, Emile, or On Education, Allan Bloom (trans.) Basic Books: 1979.
  • Wolff, Christian, 1736–7, Theologica Naturalis, 2 volumes, Frankfurt: Officina Libraria Rengeriana.

Secondary Literature

A. Kant’s treatment of religion in his pre-Critical philosophy

  • Anderson, R. Lanier, 2015, The Poverty of Conceptual Truth: Kant’s Analytic/Synthetic Distinction and the Limits of Metaphysics, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780198724575.001.0001
  • Dell’Oro, Regina O. M., 1994, From Existence to the Ideal: Continuity and Development in Kant’s Theology, New York: Peter Lang.
  • De Vleeschauwer, Herman J., 1962, Development of Kantian Thought: The History of a Doctrine, New York: Thomas Nelson & Sons.
  • England, Frederick Ernest, 1930, Kant’s Conception of God, New York: Dial Press.
  • Friedman, Michael, 1994, Kant and the Exact Sciences, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Laberge, Pierre, 1973, La Théologie Kantienne précritique, Ottawa: Éditions de l’Université d’Ottawa.
  • Lehner, Ulrich, 2007, Kants Vorsehungskonzept auf dem Hintergrund der deutschen Schulphilosophie und-theologie, (Brill’s Studies in Intellectual History, 149), Leiden: Brill. doi:10.1163/ej.9789004156074.i-532
  • Paulsen, Friedrich, 1963, Immanuel Kant: His Life and Doctrine, New York: Ungar.
  • Schönfeld, Martin, 2000, The Philosophy of the Young Kant: The Precritical Project, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/0195132181.001.0001

B. Kant’s treatment of religion in his Critical philosophy

  • Abaci, Uygar, 2008, “Kant’s Theses on Existence∗”, British Journal for the History of Philosophy, 16(3): 559–593. doi:10.1080/09608780802200729
  • Adams, Robert Merrihew, 1998, “Introduction”, in Kant: ‘Religion within the Boundaries of Mere Reason’ and Other Writings, Allen Wood and George di Giovanni (eds.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, vii–xxxii. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511809637.001
  • –––, 1999, “Original Sin: A Study in the Interaction of Philosophy and Theology”, in The Question of Christian Philosophy Today, Francis J. Ambrosio (ed.), New York: Fordham University Press.
  • Allison, Henry E., 1990, Kant’s Theory of Freedom, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9781139172295
  • –––, 2002, “On the Very Idea of a Propensity to Evil”, The Journal of Value Inquiry, 36(2/3): 337–348. doi:10.1023/A:1016112805381
  • Anderson-Gold, Sharon, 2001, Unnecessary Evil: History and Moral Progress in the Philosophy of Immanuel Kant, Albany, NY: State University of New York Press.
  • Barth, Karl, 1947, Die protestantische Theologie im 19. Jahrhundert, Zürich: Theologischer Verlag.
  • Bauch, Bruno, 1904, Luther und Kant, Berlin: Verlag.
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  • Forgie, J. William, 1975, “Kant And The Question ‘Is Existence A Predicate?’”, Canadian Journal of Philosophy, 5(4): 563–582. doi:10.1080/00455091.1975.10716968
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  • Gerrish, Brian A., 2000, “Natural and Revealed Religion”, in The Cambridge History of Eighteenth-Century Philosophy, Knud Haakonssen (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, volume 2, 641–665. doi:10.1017/CHOL9780521867436.002
  • Greene, T. H., 1960, “The Historical Context and Religious Significance of Kant’s Religion”, in Green and Hudson 1960: ix–lxxviii.
  • Green, Theodore M. and Hoyt H. Hudson (eds.), 1960, Religion within the Limits of Reason Alone, New York: Harper and Row.
  • Guyer, Paul, 2000, Kant on Freedom, Law, and Happiness, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9781139173339
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  • –––, 2011, “Kantian Communities: The Realm of Ends, the Ethical Community, and the Highest Good”, in Kant and the Concept of Community, Charleton Payne and Lucas Thorpe (eds.), (NAKS Studies in Philosophy, 9), Rochester, NY: University of Rochester Press, pp. 88–137.
  • –––, 2016. “Kant, Mendelssohn, and Immortality”, in The Highest Good in Kant’s Philosophy, Thomas Höwing (ed.), Boston: DeGruyter, pp. 157–179.
  • Hare, John E., 1996, The Moral Gap: Kantian Ethics, Human Limits, and God’s Assistance, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780198269571.001.0001
  • Henrich, Dieter, 1999, “Versuch über Fiktion und Wahrheit”, in his Bewusstes Leben: Untersuchungen zum Verhältnis von Subjektivität und Metaphysik, Stuttgart: Reclam, 139–151.
  • Höffe, Otfried, 1992 [1994], “What May I Hope?—The Philosophy of History and Religion”, in part 4 of his Immanuel Kant, Marshall Farrier (trans.), (SUNY series in ethical theory), Albany, NY: State University of New York Press, 1994, 193–209.
  • Hunter, Ian, 2005, “Kant’s Religion and Prussian Religious Policy”, Modern Intellectual History, 2(1): 1–27. doi:10.1017/S1479244304000307
  • Insole, Christopher, 2008, “The Irreducible Importance of Religious Hope in Kant’s Conception of the Highest Good”, Philosophy, 83(3): 333–351. doi:10.1017/S0031819108000703
  • –––, 2013, Kant and the Creation of Freedom: A Theological Problem, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199677603.001.0001
  • –––, 2016, The Intolerable God: Kant’s Theological Journey, Grand Rapids, MI: Eerdmans.
  • Kain, Patrick, 2005, “Interpreting Kant’s Theory of Divine Commands”, Kantian Review, 9: 128–149. doi:10.1017/S136941540000203X
  • Kleingeld, Pauline, 2001, “Nature or Providence? On the Theoretical and Moral Importance of Kant’s Philosophy of History:”, American Catholic Philosophical Quarterly, 75(2): 201–219. doi:10.5840/acpq200175216
  • Kuehn, Manfred, 2001, Kant: A Biography, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9781107050433
  • Lestition, Steven, 1993, “Kant and the End of the Enlightenment in Prussia”, The Journal of Modern History, 65(1): 57–112. doi:10.1086/244608
  • Mariña, Jacqueline, 1997, “Kant on Grace: A Reply to His Critics”, Religious Studies, 33(4): 379–400. doi:10.1017/S0034412597004046
  • Michalson, Gordon E., 1989, “Moral Regeneration and Divine Aid in Kant”, Religious Studies, 25(3): 259–270. doi:10.1017/S0034412500019843
  • –––, 1990, Fallen Freedom: Kant on Radical Evil and Moral Regeneration, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511554728
  • –––, 1999, Kant and the Problem of God, Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Miller, Eddis, 2015, Kant’s Religion within the Boundaries of Mere Reason: A Reader’s Guide, London: Bloomsbury.
  • Moran, Kate, 2012, Community and Progress in Kant’s Moral Philosophy, Washington, DC: Catholic University of America Press.
  • Morgan, Seiriol, 2005, “The Missing Formal Proof of Humanity’s Radical Evil in Kant’s Religion”, Philosophical Review, 114(1): 63–114. doi:10.1215/00318108-114-1-63
  • Muchnik, Pablo, 2009, Kant’s Theory of Evil: An Essay on the Dangers of Self-Love and the Aprioricity of History, Lanham, MD: Lexington Books.
  • –––, 2019, “Clipping Our Dogmatic Wings: The Role of Religion’s Parerga in Our Moral Education”, Educational Philosophy and Theory, 51(13): 1381–1391. doi:10.1080/00131857.2018.1516139
  • Mulholland, Leslie, 1991, “Freedom and Providence in Kant’s Account of Religion: The Problem of Expiation”, in Rossi and Wreen 1991: 77–102.
  • Neiman, Susan, 1994, “The Structure of Faith”, in her The Unity of Reason: Rereading Kant, New York and Oxford: Oxford University Press, 145–184 (Chapter 4).
  • –––, 2002a, “Fire from Heaven”, in Neiman 2002c: 57–84 (chapter 1).
  • –––, 2002b, “Homeless”, in Neiman 2002c: 314–328 (chapter 4).
  • –––, 2002c, Evil in Modern Thought: An Alternative History of Philosophy, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • O’Neill, Onora, 1997, Kant on Reason and Religion, (The Tanner Lectures on Human Values, 1997), Grethe B. Patterson (ed.), Salt Lake City, UT: University of Utah Press, 269–308.
  • Palmquist, Stephen R., 1992, “Does Kant Reduce Religion to Morality?”, Kant-Studien, 83(2): 129–148. doi:10.1515/kant.1992.83.2.129
  • –––, 2000, Kant’s Critical Religion, Aldershot: Ashgate.
  • –––, 2008, “Kant’s Quasi-Transcendental Argument for a Necessary and Universal Evil Propensity in Human Nature”, The Southern Journal of Philosophy, 46(2): 261–297. doi:10.1111/j.2041-6962.2008.tb00079.x
  • –––, 2010, “Kant’s Ethics of Grace: Perspectival Solutions to the Moral Difficulties with Divine Assistance”, The Journal of Religion, 90(4): 530–553. doi:10.1086/654821
  • –––, 2016, Comprehensive Commentary on Kant’s Religion within the Bounds of Bare Reason, London: Blackwell. doi:10.1002/9781118619599
  • Pasternack, Lawrence, 2011, “The Development and Scope of Kantian Belief: The Highest Good, The Practical Postulates and The Fact of Reason”, Kant-Studien, 102(3): 290–315. doi:10.1515/kant.2011.022
  • –––, 2014, Kant’s Religion within the Boundaries of Mere Reason: an Interpretation and Defense (Routledge Guidebook Series), London: Routledge.
  • –––, 2017a, “Restoring Kant’s Conception of the Highest Good”, Journal of the History of Philosophy, 55(3): 435–468. doi:10.1353/hph.2017.0049
  • –––, 2017b, “The ‘Two Experiments’ of Kant’s Religion: Dismantling the Conundrum”, Kantian Review, 22(1): 107–131. doi:10.1017/S136941541600039X
  • –––, 2018, “Kant’s Fourfold Critique of the Ontological Argument: Containment, Predication, and the Wisdom of Free Logic”, in Ontological Arguments, Graham Oppy (ed), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 99–120.
  • Plantinga, Alvin, 1966, “Kant’s Objection to the Ontological Argument”, The Journal of Philosophy, 63(19): 537–546. doi:10.2307/2024217
  • Quinn, Philip L., 1986, “Christian Atonement and Kantian Justification”:, Faith and Philosophy, 3(4): 440–462. doi:10.5840/faithphil19863433
  • –––, 1988, “‘In Adam’s Fall, We Sinned All’”, Philosophical Topics, 16(2): 89–118. doi:10.5840/philtopics198816215
  • –––, 1990, “Saving Faith from Kant’s Remarkable Antimony:”, Faith and Philosophy, 7(4): 418–433. doi:10.5840/faithphil19907436
  • Rawls, John, 2000, Lectures on the History of Moral Philosophy, Barbara Herman (ed.), Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Reardon, Bernard, 1988, Kant as Philosophical Theologian, New York: Macmillan Press.
  • Reath, Andrews, 1988, “Two Conceptions of the Highest Good in Kant”, Journal of the History of Philosophy, 26(4): 593–619. doi:10.1353/hph.1988.0098
  • –––, 1989, “Kant’s Theory of Moral Sensibility. Respect for the Moral Law and the Influence of Inclination”, Kant-Studien, 80(1–4): 284–302. doi:10.1515/kant.1989.80.1-4.284
  • Ricken, Friedo and François Marty (eds), 1992, Kant über Religion, Stuttgart: Kohlhammer.
  • Rossi, Philip, 2005a, The Social Authority of Reason: Kant’s Critique, Radical Evil, and the Destiny of Humankind, Albany, NY: State University of New York Press.
  • Rossi, Philip J. and Michael J. Wreen (eds), 1991, Kant’s Philosophy of Religion Reconsidered, (Indiana series in the philosophy of religion), Bloomington, IN: Indiana University Press.
  • Samet-Porat, Irit, 2007, “Satanic Motivations”, The Journal of Value Inquiry, 41(1): 77–94. doi:10.1007/s10790-007-9073-9
  • Savage, Denis, 1991, “Kant’s Rejection of Divine Revelation and His Theory of Radical Evil”, in Rossi and Wreen 1991: 54–76.
  • Shade, Patrick, 1995, “Does Kant’s Ethics Imply Reincarnation?”, The Southern Journal of Philosophy, 33(3): 347–360. doi:10.1111/j.2041-6962.1995.tb00749.x
  • Shell, Susan Meld, 2007, “Kant and the Jewish Question”, Hebraic Political Studies, 2(1): 101–136.
  • Silber, John R., 1959, “The Context of Kant’s Ethical Thought—I”, The Philosophical Quarterly, 9(36): 193–207. doi:10.2307/2216914
  • –––, 1960, “The Ethical Significance of Kant’s Religion”, in Green and Hudson 1960: lxxix–cxxxiv.
  • Stang, Nicholas F., 2015, “Kant’s Argument That Existence Is Not a Determination”, Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 91(3): 583–626. doi:10.1111/phpr.12227
  • –––, 2016, Kant’s Modal Metaphysics, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780198712626.001.0001
  • Stevenson, Leslie, 2003, “Opinion, Belief or Faith, and Knowledge”, Kantian Review, 7: 72–101. doi:10.1017/S1369415400001746
  • Strawson, Peter F., 1966, The Bounds of Sense, London: Routledge.
  • Sullivan, Roger J., 1989a, “The Formula of Legislation for a Moral Community”, in Sullivan 1989c: 212–229 (Chapter 15).
  • –––, 1989b, “Kant’s Philosophy of Religion”, in Sullivan 1989c: 261–75 (Chapter 18).
  • –––, 1989c, Immanuel Kant’s Moral Theory, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511621116
  • Sullivan, William J., 1971, “Kant on the Existence of God in the ‘Opus Postumum’”, The Modern Schoolman, 48(2): 117–133. doi:10.5840/schoolman197148236
  • Surprenant, Chris W., 2008, “Kant’s Postulate of the Immortality of the Soul:”, International Philosophical Quarterly, 48(1): 85–98. doi:10.5840/ipq200848127
  • Sussman, David, 2001, The Idea of Humanity: Anthropology and Anthroponomy in Kant’s Ethics, New York: Routledge.
  • –––, 2009, “For Badness’ Sake:”, Journal of Philosophy, 106(11): 613–628. doi:10.5840/jphil20091061129
  • Van Cleve, James, 1999, Problems from Kant, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Walsh, W. H., 1967, “Kant, Immanuel: Philosophy of Religion”, The Encyclopedia of Philosophy, Volume Four, Paul Edwards (ed.), New York: Macmillan Publishing Co. Inc. & The Free Press, 322.
  • Wand, Bernard, 1971, “Religious Concepts and Moral Theory: Luther and Kant”, Journal of the History of Philosophy, 9(3): 329–348. doi:10.1353/hph.2008.1268
  • Ward, Keith, 1972, The Development of Kant’s View of Ethics, Oxford: Basil Blackwell; see especially Chapters 5–6 (67–92) and Chapters 9–10 (144–74).
  • Wike, Victoria S. and Ryan L. Showler, 2010, “Kant’s Concept of the Highest Good and the Archetype-Ectype Distinction”, The Journal of Value Inquiry, 44(4): 521–533. doi:10.1007/s10790-010-9252-y
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  • Wolterstorff, Nicholas, 1991, “Conundrums in Kant’s Rational Religion”, in Rossi and Wreen 1991: 40–53.
  • –––, 1998, “Is It Possible and Desirable for Theologians to Recover from Kant?”, Modern Theology, 14(1): 1–18. doi:10.1111/1468-0025.00054
  • Wood, Allen W., 1970, Kant’s Moral Religion, Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press.
  • –––, 1978, Kant’s Rational Theology, Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press.
  • –––, 1991, “Kant’s Deism”, in Rossi and Wreen 1991: 1–21.
  • –––, 1992, “Rational Theology, Moral Faith, and Religion”, in The Cambridge Companion to Kant, Paul Guyer (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 394–416. doi:10.1017/CCOL0521365872.014
  • –––, 1996a, “General Introduction”, in RRT: xi–xxiv. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511814433.002
  • –––, 1996b, “Translator’s Introduction” to What Does It Mean to Orient Oneself in Thinking, in RRT: 3–6.
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  • –––, 2020, Kant and Religion, Cambridge: Cambridge Univeristy Press. doi: 10.1017/9781108381512
  • Yovel, Yirmiahu, 1989, Kant and the Philosophy of History, Princeton: Princeton University Press.

C. The Influence of Kant’s philosophy of religion

  • Adams, Robert Merrihew, 1999, “Original Sin: A Study in the Interaction of Philosophy and Theology”, in The Question of Christian Philosophy Today, Frank J. Ambrosio (ed.), New York: Fordham University Press, 80–110.
  • Charlesworth, M. J., 1972, Philosophy of Religion: The Historic Approaches, New York: Herder and Herder, see especially pages vii–xiv and 102–144.
  • Collins, James, 1967, The Emergence of Philosophy of Religion, New Haven, CT: Yale University Press; see especially pp. vii–xi, 350–422.
  • Di Giovanni, George, 2005, Freedom and Religion in Kant and his Immediate Successors: The Vocation of Humankind 1774–1800, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Dupré, Louis, 1977, A Dubious Heritage: Studies in the Philosophy of Religion After Kant, New York: Paulist; see especially pp. 1–5.
  • –––, 2004, The Enlightenment and the Intellectual Culture of Modernity, New Haven, CT and London: Yale University Press; see especially pp. 282–288.
  • Fischer, Norbert (ed.), 2005, Kant und der Katholizismus: Stationen einer wechselhaften Geschichte, Freiburg: Herder.
  • Green, Ronald M., 1978, Religious Reason: The Rational and Moral Basis of Religious Belief, New York: Oxford.
  • –––, 1988, Religion and Moral Reason: A New Method for Comparative Study, New York: Oxford.
  • –––, 1992, Kierkegaard and Kant: The Hidden Debt, Albany, NY: The State University of New York Press.
  • –––, 2001, “Human Autonomy”, in his God’s Call: Moral Realism, God’s Commands and Human Autonomy, Grand Rapids, MI: Eerdmans, 87–119 (chapter 3).
  • Hartshorne, Charles, 1962, The Logic of Perfection, and Other Essays in Neoclassical Metaphysics, LaSalle, IL: Open Court.
  • –––, 1965, Anselm’s Discovery: a Re-examination of the Ontological Proof for God’s Existence, La Salle, IL: Open Court.
  • Hegel, Georg Wilhelm Friedrich, 1948, Early Theological Writings, T. M. Knox (trans.) Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 67–145.
  • Hick, John and Arthur McGill (ed.), 1967, The Many-faced Argument; Recent Studies on the Ontological Argument for the Existence of God, New York: Macmillan.
  • Maréchal, Joseph, 1944–1949, Le point de départ de la métaphysique: leçons sur le développement historique et théorique du problème de la connaissance, Bruxelles: L’Édition universelle; Paris: Desclée, De Brouwer.
  • Mercier, Désiré, 2002, “The Two Critiques of Kant”, in Cardinal Mercier’s Philosophical Essays: A Study in Neo-thomism, David A. Boileau (ed.), Herent, Belgium: Peeters, 137–150.
  • Murdoch, Iris, 1993, Metaphysics as a Guide to Morals, New York: Allen Lane/Penguin; see especially pp. 391–449.
  • Plantinga, Alvin, 1965, The Ontological Argument, from St. Anselm to Contemporary Philosophers, Garden City, NY: Anchor Books.
  • Rossi, Philip, 2005b, “Reading Kant Through Theological Spectacles”, in Kant and the New Philosophy of Religion, Chris L. Firestone and Stephen Palmquist (eds), Bloomington, IN: Indiana University Press, 107–123.
  • Schaeffler, Richard, 1979, Was dürfen wir hoffen?: die katholische Theologie der Hoffnung zwischen Blochs utopischem Denken und der reformatorischen Rechtfertigungslehre, Darmstadt: Wissenschaftliche Buchgesellschaft.
  • Westphal, Merold, 1997, “The Emergence of Modern Philosophy of Religion”, in A Companion to Philosophy of Religion, Philip L. Quinn and Charles Taliferro (eds.), Malden, MA and Cambridge: Blackwell, 111–117.

Other Internet Resources


The co-authors jointly authored Section 1 (“Overview”). Fugate wrote most of Section 2 (“Kant’s Pre-Critical Religious Thought”) and provided input on Sections 3 and 4. Pasternack wrote the remaining material. The authors would like to acknowledge the contributions of Rob Gressis, who spent time reading through various drafts and offered valuable input for Section 4 (“Religion in the Opus Postumum”).

Copyright © 2021 by
Lawrence Pasternack
Courtney Fugate <courtney.fugate@gmail.com>

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