Desiderius Erasmus

First published Wed Sep 27, 2017

Desiderius Erasmus of Rotterdam (1467?–1536) was not a systematic philosopher although we discern in the large body of his writings a certain Erasmian habit of mind. He often reflected on subjects that invite philosophical inquiry: the influence of nature versus nurture, the relationship between word and thing, the ideal form of government, the nature of faith, and the theory of knowledge. Erasmus’ views on these subjects are of interest to historians today, even if they are unstructured, because his works circulated widely and his influence in Northern Europe was pervasive. In modern parlance, he was an opinion maker. If a general label is needed, Erasmus’ thought is best described as “Christian Humanism”, that is, a philosophy of life combining Christian thought with classical traditions. He embraced the humanistic belief in an individual’s capacity for self-improvement and the fundamental role of education in raising human beings above the level of brute animals. The thrust of Erasmus’ educational programme was the promotion of docta pietas, learned piety, or what he termed the “philosophy of Christ”. As a biblical scholar he supported the humanistic call Ad fontes, a return to the texts in the original language and therefore promoted the study of the biblical languages Hebrew, Greek, and Latin. He was in the vanguard of modern philology. His pioneering edition of the Greek New Testament shows that he had an understanding of the process of textual transmission and had developed text-critical principles. In politics, Erasmus embraced consensus, compromise, and peaceful cooperation, ideals he recommended to the participants in the Reformation debate, albeit with little success. Considered a forerunner of the Reformation by his contemporaries, he broke with Martin Luther over the latter’s sectarianism. More fundamentally, the two men disagreed over heuristics and engaged in a polemic over the question of free will. Erasmus took a skeptical position vis-à-vis Luther’s assertions. Unlike the reformer, he did not believe in the clarity of Scripture and used consensus and tradition as criteria to settle questions that did not allow a rational conclusion. Erasmus rarely ventured into doctrinal questions, however, favoring simple faith and devotion over dialectics and scholastic speculation. The circulation of Erasmus’ works was temporarily curtailed when the Catholic Church put them on the Index of Forbidden Books, but his ideas saw a revival during the Enlightenment when he was regarded as a forerunner of rationalism. His most famous work, The Praise of Folly, has remained in print to the present day, a distinction shared by few books from the 16th century.

1. Life and Works

Erasmus was born in Rotterdam on 27 October 1467 (?) as the illegitimate son of a priest. He attended a school at Deventer which was regarded as progressive and had capable teachers who introduced Erasmus to “something of a higher standard of literature” (CWE 4: 405). Orphaned in 1483, he came into the care of guardians who sent him to a school run by the Brethren of the Common Life in the spirit of the Devotio Moderna. Since Erasmus’ inheritance was small, his guardians persuaded him to enter the monastery of the Augustinian Canons Regular at Steyn. He was ordained priest in 1492.

In later years Erasmus alleged that he had been pressured into taking the vows. His misgivings found expression in one of his first works, De Contemptu Mundi (On disdaining the World, written in the 1490s, published 1521). Ostensibly a praise of monastic life, it began by recommending seclusion and withdrawal from the world but ended in a lament about the decline of monasticism and a warning to postulants not to take the vows rashly. Erasmus himself discovered that he was constitutionally and psychologically unsuited to the monastic life. He would have preferred to go to university. In 1495 he saw a chance to realize this goal when Bishop Hendrik of Bergen sent him to the Collège de Montaigu in Paris and promised him financial support. It is uncertain how much, if any, theological training Erasmus received during his brief stay at the college. In any case, he did not find the Parisian brand of theology to his liking, declaring that scholasticism “repelled him” (CWE 4: 408).When the promised financial support did not materialize, Erasmus left the college, then renowned for its strict discipline and harsh living conditions, and supported himself by tutoring well-to-do young men. This experience produced a number of educational handbooks and aids, among them De Epistolis Conscribendis, a letter-writing manual (1522); De Copia, a handbook of style (1502); Colloquia, a collection of dialogues meant to teach correct Latin (1518), and the Adagia , an anthology of proverbs to be used as rhetorical tools to embellish style (1500). All of these books saw multiple editions, some of them expanded and given a larger purpose. Thus some of the proverbs provided starting points for essays, and many of the colloquies likewise became opinion pieces on issues of the day.

In 1499 Erasmus accompanied one of his pupils, William Blount, Lord Mountjoy, to England. The visit led to important connections. He made life-long friends, among them the humanists William Grocyn and Thomas Linacre, who inspired him to take up the study of Greek, and John Colet who shared his scorn for scholastic theology and drew him toward biblical studies. He was on close terms also with Thomas More, later Lord Chancellor of England, with whom he collaborated on translations of Lucian, and he found a patron in William Warham, archbishop of Canterbury, who granted him an ecclesiastical benefice in Aldington, Kent. His illegitimate birth disqualified Erasmus from taking up benefices, but he received a papal dispensation through the intervention of the nuncio Andrea Ammonio, another of his English connections. Eventually he drew a steady income from pensions and benefices. A stipend, which he received as councilor to Charles V, was paid only irregularly, however.

Over the next two decades Erasmus traveled extensively. He returned to France for a time, made two more journeys to England, and traveled to Italy where he obtained a doctorate in theology at the University of Turin. In 1517 he finally settled in Leuven. By that time he had made a name for himself. He had published a number of bestsellers: the witty satire Encomium Moriae (The Praise of Folly, 1511); the Adagia, which he enriched and expanded to more than 5000 proverbs; and the devotional Enchiridion Militis Christiani (Handbook of the Christian Soldier, 1503). In 1516, he published his magnum opus, an edition of the Greek New Testament, the first to reach the market. It anticipated the Complutensian Polyglot, which was already in print but still awaiting the papal imprimatur. Thus Erasmus found success in four different genres: literature, education, religion, and theology. In a catalogue he published in 1523, Erasmus arranged his writings under nine headings: works furthering language arts, that is, literary and educational writings; his collection of adages; his correspondence; works furthering moral education (he noted that their content overlapped with works in the first category); works promoting piety; the annotated edition of the New Testament; paraphrases on the New Testament; polemics; and editions and translations of patristic works.

While Erasmus was revered among humanists, his biblical scholarship soon came under attack from theologians. They refused to acknowledge him as a colleague and derided his doctorate, which had been granted per saltum, that is, without fulfilling the residence requirements or passing the usual examinations. In their eyes, Erasmus was merely a “theologizing humanist”, as the prominent Paris theologian Noël Beda put it (Preface to Annotations 1526). Erasmus was not the first humanist to treat the New Testament in a text-critical fashion and to compare the Latin Vulgate with the Greek original, although none of his predecessors had dared to use their findings to publish an amended edition of the text. Erasmus had discovered a manuscript of Lorenzo Valla’s annotations on the New Testament and originally planned to publish notes of a similar nature, that is, observations of errors, discrepancies, and mistranslations. He expanded the scope of his project on the urging of his publisher, Johann Froben, and rather hastily assembled a text based on the biblical manuscripts he had been able to consult. In the resulting edition, the Greek text was faced by a lightly amended Vulgate, with Erasmus’ editorial changes explained in annotations following the text. The reception of the edition varied. Humanists generally praised it as an exceptional achievement; a considerable number of theologians disapproved of it and not only impugned Erasmus’ scholarship but also questioned his orthodoxy. Their attacks must be seen in the context of Luther’s coincidental rise to prominence and the resulting religious debate which cast a long shadow over state and church and over society at large. Erasmus’ move from Leuven to Basel in 1521 was partly motivated by a desire to escape the hostile climate at the University of Leuven, but his opponents were not limited to the Low Countries. He had critics in Italy and was formally investigated by ecclesiastical authorities in Spain and in France. In 1531the prestigious faculty of theology at the University of Paris publicly censured and condemned numerous passages in his works as unorthodox. Erasmus responded to his critics with lengthy polemics, which fill two folio volumes in the Leiden Opera Omnia. He also published four revised editions of his New Testament (1519, 1522, 1527, 1531) with corrections and expanded notes.

Critics of Erasmus’ New Testament edition accused him of introducing changes to a sacred text and thus challenging the principle of inspiration. Erasmus denied these charges. On the contrary, he said, his edition restored the original text and corrected the errors introduced by translators and scribes. Theologians questioned Erasmus’ qualifications to tackle Holy Writ, but he insisted that editing and textual criticism did not require a degree in theology. They were the tasks proper of philologists. The prefaces he added to successive editions of the New Testament attempted to clarify his aims and methods. He somewhat ingenuously claimed that he was only doing philological work and ignored the fact that a change in words frequently also shifted the meaning. Indeed, some of his critics acknowledged the usefulness of his work, but took issue with specific editorial choices. Thus they protested against Erasmus replacing the traditional poenitentiam agite (do penance) at Matt. 3:2 with poeniteat vos (repent), in which they saw a Lutheran slant. There was an uproar also about his omission of the so-called Comma Johanneum at I John 5:7, one of the proofs for the divine trinity, for which Erasmus had found no evidence in the Greek manuscripts or support in the Fathers. The biblical commentaries of the Church Fathers and their quotations from the bible were important sources for Erasmus in establishing the text of the New Testament. He read widely and published numerous editions and translations of patristic writings, among them Jerome, Augustine, Chrysostom, and Origen, and in many cases established the first reliable critical text of their works.

In the last two decades of his life, Erasmus wrote numerous apologiae, refuting critics of his New Testament edition and battling the accusation that he had inspired the Reformation and was a supporter of Luther. It was difficult, however, to change an opinion that was so entrenched that it had become proverbial and issued in the popular saying “Erasmus laid the egg, and Luther hatched it”. Erasmus’ critics demanded proof of his orthodoxy in the form of a direct attack on Luther. For some years Erasmus held out and refused explicitly to endorse any religious party. Maintaining scholarly detachment was, however, impossible in the militant climate of the Confessional Age. In 1524 Erasmus reluctantly published De Libero Arbitrio Diatribe (Discussion of Free Will). A politely worded disquisition addressed to Luther, it showed their fundamental disagreement on a crucial theological question. The ensuing polemic failed to convince Erasmus’ critics of the orthodoxy of his views. It was undeniable that Erasmus had been in sympathy with the reformers for a time, although he was not prepared to challenge the authority of the church and never promoted schism. Erasmus’ criticism concerned abuses rather than doctrine, and although his annotation on the New Testament show that he disagreed with certain traditional interpretations, he always emphasized his willingness to defer to the judgment of the Church.

In 1529 when the city of Basel, where he resided at the time, turned Protestant, he voted with his feet and moved to Catholic Freiburg. Questions about Erasmus’ orthodoxy persisted, however, even after his death in 1536. In the wake of the Council of Trent, which defined articles of faith more rigidly, Erasmus’ works were placed on the Index of Prohibited Books.

2. Methodology

During his lifetime Erasmus’ name became synonymous with humanism, a label also adopted in modern reference works. Today the term “humanist” has a broad range of meanings. In the 16th century the word denoted a student or teacher of the studia humanitatis, a curriculum focusing on the study of classical languages, rhetoric, and literature. At northern universities, where scholasticism and the dialectical method reigned supreme, the trend-setting humanists were regarded as challengers of the status quo. The defenders of tradition belittled their competitors as “grammarians” and dismissed the humanities as poetria, the stuff of poetry. To a certain extent, the tensions between the two schools of thought may be explained in terms of professional jealousy, but at its core was the dispute over methodology and qualifications. Humanists favored rhetorical arguments; scholastics insisted on logical proof. Scholastic theologians in particular regarded the humanists as dangerous interlopers. They questioned their orthodoxy because of their inclination to use the skeptical ars dubitandi and denied their right to apply philological principles to the biblical text. Scripture, they insisted, was the exclusive domain of graduate theologians. Humanists in turn saw the dialectical method used by the scholastics as a perversion of Aristotelian logic and derided their technical terminology as a corruption of the Latin language. In the Praise of Folly Erasmus lampooned scholastic theologians in a passage that became notorious:

They are fortified with an army of scholastic definition, conclusions, corollaries, and propositions both explicit and implicit…. They quibble about concepts, relations, instants, formalities, quiddities and ecceities, which a man could not possibly perceive unless like Lynceus he could see through blackest darkness things which don’t exist…. You’d extricate yourself faster from a labyrinth than from the tortuous obscurities of realists, nominalists, Thomists, Albertists, Ockhamists, and Scotists…. Such is the erudition and complexity they all display that I fancy the apostles themselves would need the help of another Holy Spirit if they were obliged to join issue on these topics with our new breed of theologians. (CWE 27: 126–7)

On a more serious note, he voiced two objections against the dialectical disputations of the theologians: “The portentious filth of their barbarous and artificial style” obscured the meaning (CWE 3: 124), and their argumentation lacked a moral dimension. Scholastic disputations honed intellectual skills but failed to make better Christians of the protagonists. “We are not training pugilists; we are training theologians”, Erasmus says in his Methodus, “and theologians who will demonstrate what they profess in the way they live rather than in syllogisms” (Holborn: 161).

He further insisted on the right of humanists, who were trained in the classical languages, to apply their philological skills to both secular and sacred writings. Translation and textual criticism of the Bible required philological skills, and theologians who engaged in this task “were acting in the capacity of philologists (grammatici)” (Ep. 181: 120–5; CWE 2).

While the need for language studies and the use of philological methods found gradual acceptance among theologians, the skeptical ars dubitandi, which was also closely associated with humanism, remained anathema. Since skepticism was identified with atheism in Erasmus’ time, most humanists refrained from advocating this method openly. They expressed their skepticism through the use of open-ended dialogue or rhetorical compositions that argued opposing points of view. Erasmus used these means to argue for and against marriage, for and against monastic vows, and for and against doctrinal positions. Rather surprisingly he admitted to his preference for skepticism in A Discussion of Free Will. This tract was aimed at Luther’s assertion that free will did not exist and the sinner was justified sola fide, by faith alone, and sola gratia, by grace alone.

Erasmus’ tract, which he called a diatribe, that is, a disquisition, is a showpiece of his methodology. He begins his argumentation in the classic skeptical fashion by collating scriptural evidence for and against the concept of free will and demonstrating that there is no consensus and no rational way of resolving the resulting dilemma.

The method of arguing in utramque partem, on both sides of a question, was first developed by the Greek Sophists as a demonstration of their rhetorical prowess. Pyrrhonic skeptics adopted this method as a preliminary step in arguing a case. If the evidence was ambivalent, they advocated epoche, suspension of judgment. Academic skeptics modified this process, admitting probability as a criterion to settle an ambiguous question. A variant of the skeptical method also appears in medieval scholastic handbooks where doctrinal questions are argued sic et non, that is, on both sides, then settled by a magisterial decision or resolutio.

Erasmus stressed that he was not prepared to pass judgment on the question of free will himself. Indeed his natural inclination was to take the Pyrrhonic route and suspend judgment since the evidence was not unequivocal. “I take so little pleasure in assertions that I will gladly seek refuge in Scepticism”, he writes (CWE 76: 7), but as a believer he was obliged to take a different route. He substituted for his own judgment the authoritative decision of the Catholic Church, which affirmed the existence of free will. As her obedient son, he accepted this resolution. Unlike the scholastics, then, Erasmus does not provide a dialectically reasoned answer, but submits to “commonly accepted creeds or universal synods” (LB IX: 1091C), that is, to long-standing tradition and to decisions arrived by the consensus of authorized representatives of the Catholic Church. Modern scholars acknowledge this slant when they label Erasmus a “Christian humanist”. Likewise his skepticism might be called a “Christian skepticism”, that is, a pagan philosophy modified and adapted to Christian thought.

Erasmus’ skepticism shaped his attitude toward the reformers. For several years he gave them his qualified support, but in the 1520s when he saw Luther openly defy Catholic authorities, he decried his radical methods and distanced himself from the Reformation movement. The decision to disengage may have been prompted by considerations for his own safety and a desire to avoid inquisitorial scrutiny, but epistemological considerations also played a role in his withdrawal from the reformers and ultimate reversal of opinion about Luther. Erasmus regarded consensus as an essential criterion of the doctrinal truth. Schism posed a threat to his decision-making process. If papal authority was questioned in principle and the decrees of the synods were not binding, Erasmus the Christian Skeptic was paralyzed in his decision-making process and unable to settle questions that did not allow a resolution based on clear scriptural evidence.

Luther, who believed in the clarity of Scripture, did not accept skepticism as a methodological approach. He saw it as waffling. He scoffed at Erasmus who wanted “to compare everything and affirm nothing” and called him a follower of Lucian or Epicurus, an atheist who ridiculed the beliefs of others. “Permit us to be asserters”, he wrote, “to be devoted to assertions and delight in them, while you stick to your sceptics and Academics… The Holy Spirit is no Sceptic!” Luther criticized Erasmus of using the skeptical method also in his Catechismus (1524) and thereby sowing doubt among catechumens. He was unwilling to put up with ambivalence and demanded a clear-cut judgment. There was no room in doctrinal discussions for Erasmus’ slippery rhetoric (see CWE 76: 116–24; Luther 1525, &lquo;On the Bondage of the Will”quoted in Rummel 2000, 59–60).

Erasmus responded to Luther’s criticism with a second tract, Hyperaspistes (A Defensive Shield, 1526), reaffirming his skepticism, but clarifying its meaning:

A Sceptic is not someone who doesn’t care to know what is true or false…but rather someone who does not make a final decision easily or fight to the death for his own opinion, but rather accepts as probable what someone else accepts as certain.

Up to this point he might be describing the position of an Academic skeptic, but he goes on to specify:

I explicitly exclude from Scepticism whatever is set forth in Sacred Scripture or whatever has been handed down to us by the authority of the Church. (CWE 76: 118)

Erasmus’ criteria then are first of all Scripture, but if scriptural evidence is ambiguous, he relies on

the decrees of the Catholic Church, especially those issued by general councils and fully approved by a consensus of the Christian people. (CWE 76: 127)

In other words, he substitutes for the Academic criterion of probability, the criteria of Christian tradition and consensus.

Luther disapproved of Erasmus’ use of rhetorical terms in what was a doctrinal dispute. His admirers, by contrast, praised his skillful use of language. They contrasted his moderate wording with Luther’s antagonistic tone and commended Erasmus’ courteous and accommodating style, but did not comment on the epistemological underpinning of his conclusions. It is possible that they appreciated Erasmus’ arguments but did not think it politic or indeed helpful to his cause to acknowledge his skepticism.

In addition to the arguments rooted in skepticism, Erasmus also brings ethical criteria to bear on the question of free will. He argued that denying the existence of free will would destroy the moral basis of human action. Affirming the power of free will was socially expedient. Humanists criticized the dialectic method used by the scholastics precisely because it resulted only in a technical victory over their opponents and did not produce moral conviction or change their opponents’ mind. To convince the other party, consensus was necessary. Thus the characters in Erasmus’ Colloquies “Inquiry into Faith” and “The Godly Feast” argue on both of sides of the questions at issue, but their dialogue ends in a friendly consensus. This rhetorical type of argumentation which emphasizes collaboration and consensus-building is a typical humanistic approach and an important element also of Erasmus’ political thought and his educational philosophy.

3. Educational Philosophy

Erasmus earned his living as a teacher for only a few years, but education remained a lifelong interest and a central theme in his writings. Erasmus expressed confidence in the potential of human beings for self-improvement, a corollary of his acceptance of free will. He believed in the preponderance of nurture over nature, given the power of the will. It was therefore the duty of parents and teachers to ensure that children fulfilled their potential and of adults to live up to it. “What is man’s real nature?” Erasmus asks.

Is it not to live according to reason? This is why he is called a rational being, and this is what sets him apart from animals. And what is the most harmful influence upon man? Surely it is ignorance. (CWE 26: 312)

Citing Origen, Erasmus speaks of a tripartite human nature, made up of spirit, soul, and flesh. The soul, which is “the middle part”, may through free will align itself either with the divine spirit and “itself become spiritual, but if it abandons itself to the cupidities of the flesh, it will degenerate into the body” (CWE 66: 51). This is a characteristic humanistic position and recalls the wording of Pico della Mirandola’s iconic Oration on the Dignity of Man (1496 [1996], 8), which describes the choice as one between “descend[ing] to the lower, brutish forms of life…[or] ris[ing] again to the superior orders whose life is divine”.

Erasmus accepted the classical doctrine of the three prerequisites of excellence—natural talent, instruction, and practice (CWE 26: 311)—but he tended to blame a poor result on neglect and wrong teaching methods rather than a lack of ability or intention on the part of student. This parallels the Catholic belief in the limited power free will. Without divine guidance human endeavours are in vain. Similarly the successful education of children depends on the guidance of parents and teachers, father figures recalling God’s patriarchal model.

Erasmus composed a number of treatises on the subject of education. He discussed curriculum in two works, De Ratione Studii (On the Method of Study, 1511) and Ratio Verae Theologiae (Method of True Theology, 1518). In both tracts he emphasized the importance of learning the classical languages and studying the classics. In the case of secular education, he counseled early exposure of students to Greek and Latin and extensive reading in probati autores (the approved canon of authors), like Homer, Terence, Plautus, Virgil, Horace, and Cicero. He recommended an all-round education but emphasized the study of history, the proverbial teacher of life. Similarly, he counseled theology students to read the “classics”, that is, the sources of Christianity: the Bible and the Church Fathers. In contrast to the scholastics, whose core subject was dialectic, Erasmus privileged ethics over logic and the formation of character over factual knowledge.

His ideas on the aims and methods of education are contained in De Pueris Instituendis (On the Education of Children, 1529) and Institutio Principis Christiani (On the Education of a Christian Prince, 1516), but are expressed there in a rhetorical rather than a systematic fashion. Erasmus himself calls On the Education of Children a demonstration of rhetorical principles, an example of a theme “presented first in brief summary form and then developed into a more elaborate and more detailed argument” (CWE 26: 295). The rhetorical nature of the Education of a Christian Prince is self-evident. It is hardly more than a collection of aphorisms, a showcase for Erasmus’ rhetorical skills rather than an expression of personal opinions. This creates a problem of interpretation for the modern reader. To separate clichés from principles it is necessary to consider the frequency and consistency of certain thought patterns in Erasmus’ works. Four ideas are recurring themes in his writings on education: the humanizing effect of education; the effectiveness of cooperative rather than coercive methods; the ability of both sexes to benefit from education, and the importance of internalizing the material taught.

He proclaimed that human beings without education had no humanity: “Man was not born but made man” (CWE 26: 304). It was education that raised human being above the level of brute beasts and made them useful members of society. “Man, unless he has experienced the influence of learning and philosophy, is at the mercy of impulses that are worse than those of a wild beast” (CWE 26: 305). Education is an important socializing process. A child that has been well educated will grow up “a son who will be a faithful protector of his family, a good husband to his wife, and a solid and useful citizen of his country” (CWE 26: 302). There are immediate practical advantages to schooling as well.

Being occupied with his studies, a child will avoid the common pitfalls of youth—for learning is something that engages the entire person- and this is a blessing which should not be undervalued. (CWE 26: 297)

Teachers must understand that education will bear fruit only if it is a cooperative effort. It is the teacher’s task to present the material in an instructive and entertaining fashion to retain the student’s interest rather than use punitive methods. Coercion and corporal punishment are counter-productive, whereas an appeal to the students’ interests and praise for their effort are effective means of education.

Like many of his contemporaries, Erasmus grew up in the belief that women were intellectually inferior to men and therefore could not benefit from education in the same measure. He changed his mind after meeting the erudite daughters of Thomas More and hearing of learned women like Marguerite of Navarre and Caritas Pickheimer. Several of his Colloquies, notably “The Abbot and the Learned Lady” and “The New Mother”, acknowledge the intellectual aspirations of women (and in a winking manner, their occasional superiority to men).

In Erasmus’ time memorization and imitation were the predominant methods of education. Anticipating modern principles, Erasmus emphasized the importance of understanding and internalizing the material presented. This approach is examined at length in his treatise Ciceronianus (The Ciceronian, 1528), which deals with the imitation of Cicero’s style, a subject of burning interest to Erasmus’ contemporaries. He emphasizes the importance of aptum et decorum in compositions, that is, the appropriateness of arguments to time, place, and audience. This cannot be achieved by a slavish imitation of classical models. It requires a solid understanding of the rules underpinning style, which in turn will allow a creative reworking of the original to meet the requirements of the writer’s own circumstances.

Imitation does not immediately incorporate into its own speech any nice little feature it comes across, but transmits it to the mind for inward digestion, so that becoming part of our own system, it gives the impression not of something begged from someone else, but of something that springs from our own mental processes. (CWE 28: 441)

The gist of Erasmus’ arguments about imitation is drawn from classical handbooks of rhetoric, such as Quintilian’s Institutio Oratoria or Cicero’s Ad Herennium, but Erasmus goes further, giving a Christian context to the classical precepts. To satisfy the requirements of aptum et decorum, a Christian’s speech must savor of Christ, “or you will turn out not Ciceronian but pagan”. Indeed, this was the purpose of all education, “of studying philosophy, of studying eloquence, to know Christ, to celebrate the glory of Christ. This is the goal of all learning and all eloquence” (CWE 28: 447)

4. Philosophy of Language

The formation and correct use of language was a primary concern for Erasmus. He wrote several works that would seem to provide a starting point for a philosophy of language. Indeed, he devoted a treatise to the subject of language (De Lingua, The Tongue, 1525), but no systematic thought on the nature, origin, or function of language emerges from this tractate. We find only isolated comments about the relationship between words and things, for example, the statement that things were intelligible only through words, “by the sounds we attach to them”. A person who did not understand the force of words was “short-sighted, deluded, and unbalanced in his judgment of things as well” (CWE 24: 666). The treatise De Recta Pronuntiatione (The Right Way of Speaking, 1528) contains another stand-alone pronouncement. Citing the ancient physician Galen, Erasmus declares that language (oratio), rather than reason (ratio), was the distinguishing mark of human beings (CWE 26: 369). A promising statement in De Ratione Studii likewise remains without follow-up. “In principle, knowledge as a whole seems to be of two kinds, of things and of words”, Erasmus states. “Knowledge of words comes earlier, but that of things is the more important” (CWE 24: 666). These words appear to introduce a theory resembling the duality of word/thing developed in Plato’s Cratylus or Aristotle’s Metaphysics, but turn out to be only an organizational principle indicating to readers that Erasmus will talk first of language, then of content.

Occasionally Erasmus uses metaphors to indicate the relationship between words and things, likening them to clothing /body (“style is to thought as clothes are to the body”, CWE 24: 306) or vessel/content (“mystery concealed by the letter”, CWE 66: 32), but these expressions are no more than apt figures of speech. Similarly, a statement in his annotations on the New Testament appears to be an instance of ideational epistemology. Commenting on John 1:1 (“In the beginning was the word”) and on the implications of rendering Greek logos into Latin using sermo or verbum, Erasmus explains that verbum is used “of what sounds rather than of what is conceived in the mind”, although “things the voice expresses are signs of the states that are present first in the mind” and therefore may also be called verbum. He adds: “Thinking is, as it were, talking to oneself” (CWE 73: 35–6). In this case, too, Erasmus’ remarks remain without solid context.

Similarly, Erasmus’ comments on the function of language as a means of communication appear significant at first sight. In the Lingua, for example, he says: “The tongue was given to men so that by its agency as messenger one man might know the mind and intention of another” (CWE 29: 314). He also acknowledges the communicative function in the Paraclesis, one of the prefaces to his New Testament edition: “For in general our daily conversations reveal what we are. Let each one comprehend what he can, let him express what he can” (LB V: 140C). Here as elsewhere Erasmus does not elaborate on his thoughts. His statements on the nature of words and their relationship to things remain undeveloped and fall short of a philosophy of language.

5. Political Thought

Scholars investigating Erasmus’ political thought generally consider the Institutio Principis Christiani (The Education of a Christian Prince, 1516) and the Panegyricus (Panegyric, 1504 ) the main sources for his ideals. For his views on the legitimacy of warfare, they draw on the Querela Pacis (The Complaint of Peace, 1517) and the adage Dulce Bellum Inexpertis (War is sweet to those who have not experienced it). These sources are problematic, however, because of their strong rhetorical flavor and the commonplace nature of the arguments presented there. In fact it is possible to show a literal correspondence between passages in these works and the Copia, Erasmus’ textbook of style, and Erasmus himself acknowledges that The Education of a Christian Prince is a collection of aphorisms (CWE 27: 204). It will serve as an additional caveat to readers that Erasmus, who is often depicted as a pacifist, also wrote a piece in praise of war—now lost, but documented in his Catalogue of Works (Ep. 1341A: 1455–57; CWE 9. I would not go as far as saying that the (rhetorical) medium invalidates the message, but it is important to support and reinforce any views expressed in Erasmus’ epideictic writings with passages in more cogently argued works, notably his theological and polemical tracts. There are two treatises, contained within psalm commentaries, which are relevant to Erasmus’ pacifism: De Bello Turcico (On War Against the Turks, 1530) and De Sarcienda Ecclesiae Concordia (On Mending the Peace of the Church, 1533). Both recommend compromise and arbitration as alternatives to warfare.

Erasmus first voices the idea of arbitration as a method of conflict resolution in The Education of a Christian Prince: “If some dispute arises between princes, why do they not take it to arbitration instead [of waging war]?” (CWE 27: 183) He suggests a committee of churchmen, magistrates, and scholars to settle the dispute. Similar ideas are voiced in Dulce Bellum. Why not call on bishops, nobles, and councils as intermediaries to “settle the childish disputes of princes by arbitration?” (CWE 35: 430). We may take this to be an authentic Erasmian point of view because it appears not only in these rhetorical compositions but also in his psalm commentary, De Concordia. There it is presented not merely as a general proposition but given a more specific context. Erasmus suggests that the religious strife which characterized his age be settled by a general council of the church—a desire also voiced in contemporary religious colloquies and Imperial Diets and realized after long delay in the Council of Trent. Erasmus furthermore counseled the parties to find a middle ground and make concessions. He called this process synkatabasis (CWE 65: 201), a military term denoting a move in which two armies give up their vantage point and descend into the open plain to negotiate.

Erasmus does not entirely reject warfare, although he depicts it as a last resource. In his rhetorical tracts he waxes eloquent about the horrors of war and the destruction inflicted on the population. He calls war fundamentally unchristian and fit for beasts rather than humans. In his annotations on the New Testament (Luke 22: 36) he wrote in a more sober tone about war and the circumstances under which it was legitimate. By that time Erasmus’ pacifism and strong rejection of warfare had been called heretical, that is, at variance with the accepted definition of just war. Erasmus amended his annotation accordingly. The expanded and finely nuanced version of 1527 serves as clear testimony to his views on the subject. He begins by quoting St. Martin and St. Jerome condemning war. He then succinctly states his own opinion:

We should not propagate the Christian religion only with arms, nor should princes undertake war when it can be avoided by using other means. They should, moreover, conduct a war they have undertaken with a minimum of bloodshed and end it as quickly as possible. Finally, [war] is not compatible with the purity of the gospel, and we must not seek to derive the right to go to war from gospel precepts…There are many necessary evils in human affairs, which are tolerated because they prevent greater evils; yet they are not approved as gospel teaching. (ASD VI.5: 594)

Erasmus’ praise of peace and concord is informed by the Christian ideal of a universal fellowship. “Why don’t you wish [your neighbour] well as another man and a fellow Christian?” he asks in The Complaint of Peace (CWE 27: 315). The theme is also taken up in War Against the Turks. There Erasmus concedes that the war against the Ottoman Empire is “just” by the definition of the Church, but disparages a military solution and promotes instead the idea of using spiritual weapons. He depicts the Turks as a scourge of God (an idea promoted also by Luther) and therefore urges his contemporaries to repent and reform to appease God and overcome the enemy.

The Institutio Principis and the Panegyricus are addressed to Charles (later Emperor Charles V) and his father Philip respectively. They belong to the genre of Mirror of Princes, in which the ideal of a ruler is held up as a model to be imitated. The Erasmian model prince is a father figure who has the wellbeing of his people at heart. He is the guardian of justice and provides moral leadership. He is God’s representative and as such owed obedience. Conversely, the ruler must give an account of his stewardship to God. Although “it is pretty well agreed among the philosophers that the most healthy form [of government] is monarchy”, Erasmus believes that monarchy should be “checked and diluted with a mixture of aristocracy and democracy to prevent it ever breaking out into tyranny” (CWE 27: 231). It is not entirely clear what Erasmus meant by “democracy”. It may be no more than a loose reference to the cooperation of the subjects with their ruler. The best situation is for people to obey voluntarily, Erasmus says (CWE 27: 236). Alternatively he may be thinking of the historical roots of kingship when he says that “it takes general agreement to make a prince” and “government depends to a large extent on the consent of the people, which was what created kings in the first place” (CWE 27: 284). Some of the qualifications and limitations he imposes on absolute monarchy are based on the Christian ideals of charity and fellowship. Echoing Plato, Erasmus believes that the best ruler must be a philosopher, that is, a wise man,

not someone who is clever at dialectics or science but someone who rejects illusory appearance and undauntedly seeks out and follows what is true and good.

Being a philosopher is in practice the same as being a Christian, he notes (CWE 27: 214). The ruler must not shirk his moral obligations. “Power without goodness is unmitigated tyranny” (CWE 27: 220). In an even more radical tone, Erasmus declares: “If you cannot defend your kingdom without violating justice…then abdicate” (CWE 27: 217).

The prince’s rights need to be balanced against the welfare of his people.

The good prince uses the public interest as a yardstick in every field, otherwise he is no prince. He has not the same rights over men as over cattle. (CWE 27: 284)

The duties and obligations are mutual. Neither the ruler nor his subjects are above the law: “The happiest situation arises when the prince is obeyed by all and himself obeys the laws” (CWE 27: 264). Many of the ideas voiced in The Education of the Christian Prince also appear in the Panegyric, but are expressed there in more fulsome terms and, to the modern ear, with excessive flattery. The message is the same, however. The prince is God’s representative and his steward and “ought never to take his eyes off his model, …Christ, the prince of princes” (CWE 27: 56–7).

Describing the hierarchy preserved in the ideal state, Erasmus draws on the traditional medieval image of the three estates—clergy, nobility, and common people—arranged in three concentric circles around the central figure of Christ. This suggests a political and moral hierarchy with specific duties assigned to each tier. While everyone “according to the measure that is given him must strive upwards toward Christ” the hierarchical arrangement also involves a responsibility to those in the tier below. Explaining the image, Erasmus notes that this monarchic order is divinely instituted, and those who fight it, “fight against God its author” (CWE 42: 74). Thus kings, the representatives of Christ, must be obeyed even if they are corrupt,

because they administer public justice and because God is justice; they are the ministers of God and in a way rule for him as long as they apply their efforts to the mandate given them by public authority. (CWE 42: 75)

Indeed, “Order is a good in itself” (CWE 42: 74). There are multiple roots for the idea of mutual obligations among the members of a society. It is the foundation of the Medieval feudal system and embedded in the paternalistic biblical model. It also resembles the virtue of justice as defined in Plato’s Republic, with each member of society maintaining their proper place and a higher position entailing higher moral authority and corresponding responsibilities.

Outlining his ideals, Erasmus thus makes use of concepts found in classical philosophers and Christianizes or adapts them to specific rhetorical needs. The persistence of key elements in his thought over a lifetime and in diverse literary genres would indicate that these ideas, even if they fall short of a philosophy, developed into a habit of mind that can be labeled “Erasmian”. This applies more particularly to his views on pietas.

6. Pietas and Philosophia Christi

The term philosophia Christi , the philosophy of Christ, first appears in patristic writings. It is an aspect of the larger concept of pietas, the moral conscience governing the proper relationship between individual and God as well as the individual and society. A central tenet in Erasmus’ spiritual writings, pietas thus straddles the subjects of theology and philosophy.

The main sources for Erasmus’ concepts of piety and the philosophy centered on Christ are his Enchiridion Militis Christiani (Handbook of the Christian Soldier, 1503) with its prefatory letter to the 1518 edition (Ep. 858; CWE 6), the Paraclesis (Summons, 1516) and, perhaps surprisingly, his lampoon of human foibles, Moriae Encomium (The Praise of Folly, 1511). As he said in reply to indignant critics of his famous jeu d’ésprit:

The Folly is concerned in a playful spirit with the same subject as the Handbook of the Christian Soldier. My purpose was guidance and not satire; to help, not to hurt; to show men how to become better, and not stand in their way…not only to cure them but to amuse them, too. I had often observed that this cheerful and humorous style of putting people right is with many of them most successful. (Ep. 337: 98–101, 126–8; CWE 3)

While the Paraclesis, the Enchiridion, and the Moriae Encomium constitute the main sources for Erasmus’ thoughts on Christian morality, this theme is so pervasive in his works, that any attempt to define his concept of pietas “would be almost tantamount to summarizing and synthesizing everything that has been written on Erasmus” (O’Malley in CWE 66: xv). Three characteristics stand out, however. Piety is an internal quality independent of the outward observance of rites; it is perfected through divine grace; and it is inclusive, that is, open to all.

Erasmus calls pietas a quality of the mind (animi affectus, LB X: 1675 B) which is expressed in a person’s way of life. Describing human nature, he notes the dichotomy of spirit and flesh which parallels the duality of visible and invisible things. Piety requires the development of a person’s inner, spiritual qualities:

[A person] participates in the visible world through the body, and in the invisible through the soul. Since we are but pilgrims in the visible world, we should never make it our fixed abode, but should relate by a fitting comparison everything that occurs to the senses either to the angelic world or, in more practical terms, to morals and to that part of man that corresponds to the angelic. (CWE 66: 65)

Erasmus’ emphasis on piety as an inner quality is a response to the undue importance his contemporaries placed on external ceremonies. He offered his definition as an alternative or rather, a corrective to the ritualistic observances which he calls “a kind of Judaism” (CWE 66: 74). He used the term “Judaism” because in his eyes the rigid observance of rites exemplified the spirit of the Old Testament, which had been superseded by the new covenant with Christ. His critique of ritualistic practices puts him in the vanguard of the Reformation, whose representatives also protested against the emptiness of ceremonies in the absence of sincere faith. Like Luther, Erasmus demanded “Christian liberty”, that is, deliverance from the dead letter of the law.

For Erasmus, monasticism typified the superstitious observance of external rites and the reliance on human works instead of divine grace. In a notorious phrase, he declared: Monachatus non est pietas, being a member of a religious order does not amount to piety. “I advise you to identify piety not with diet, or dress, or any visible thing, but with what I have taught here [in the Enchiridion]”—the priority of soul over body and of the inner over the outer person (CWE 66: 127).

Some scholars have associated Erasmus’ dualism with Platonic philosophy, although it is more readily explained as a Christian principle and more specifically as Pauline teaching, which Erasmus discusses at length in the Enchiridion. He does quote Plato as well, but then it is his habit to cite classical sources in order to give a historical and pan-cultural dimension to Christian values. Indeed he drew on a number of models, both pagan and Christian, to describe human nature. Thus he also introduced the concept of a three-fold division—body, soul, and spirit—an idea for which he cited Origen. Scholars have also pointed to the Stoic underpinnings found in Erasmus’ thoughts on pietas and even argued that he consciously embraced the Stoic concept of the simultaneous working of two opposite but equally essential types of value: spirit and instinct. In addition, one may point to a chapter in Disdaining the World in which Erasmus speaks of the spiritual pleasures of the solitary life, calling its rationale “Epicurean” (CWE 66: 165). In the Enchiridion, however, Erasmus makes it clear that he does not privilege one philosophy over another. Rather he deliberately presents various concepts of human nature by way of offering a survey of philosophical positions. He “provided a mass of material” (CWE 66: 54), illustrating in a general way the superiority of spiritual over material concerns. His message to the reader was: You should be able to master as a Christian and for the love of God “what pagan philosophers did not find hard…for the sake of learning or reputation” (CWE 66: 142).

Erasmus described his Enchiridion as a “summary guide” to Christian living, which included not only personal, but also public piety. In its social dimension, pietas equals caritas, love of one’s neighbor. Caritas in turn parallels love of God. Caring for one’s neighbor is “how our heavenly creditor taught us to pay our debt” (CWE 66: 124).

The ability to fulfill one’s moral duty depends on divine grace, however, and is an aspect of pietas related to the Catholic doctrine of Free Will. Thus human beings have a capacity for piety and a moral duty as well as the power to do good, although their power is limited and dependent on the efficacy of divine grace. Erasmus is emphatic about this aspect in his definition of the philosophia Christi, that is, the pursuit of pietas. In a letter to Anton Slechta (1519), he writes:

The whole of Christian philosophy lies in this, our understanding that all our hope is placed in God, who freely gives us all things through Jesus his son, that we were redeemed by his death and engrafted through baptism with his body, that we might be dead to the desires of this world and live by his teaching and example…that we may ever advance from one virtue to another, yet in such a way that we claim nothing for ourselves, but ascribe any good we do to God. (Ep. 1039: 245–54; CWE 7)

The Erasmian concept of piety was “principled rather than prescriptive” (as O’Malley puts it, CWE 66: xix). It is ironic (and perhaps meant ironically) that Erasmus chose to present his counsel in the form of twenty-two rules since his overall message is that there are no fixed rules and no need for definitions and pronouncements. These are the hallmark of institutional theology, whereas the philosophy of Christ does not require formal training or attendance at university. It is open to anyone. “All can be devout, and—I shall boldly add—all can be theologians” (Olin: 104). Every Christian must study the bible, however, Erasmus says.

I wish that even the lowliest women read the gospels and the Pauline Epistles. And I would that they were translated into all languages so that they could be read and understood not only by Scots and Irish, but also by Turks and Saracens…Would that, as a result, the farmer sing some portion of them at the plow, the weaver hum some parts of them to the movement of his shuttle, the traveler lighten the weariness of the journey with stories from this source. (Olin: 101)

Pietas does not depend on learning. Faith is the only prerequisite. This is the conclusion Erasmus offers in The Praise of Folly. He begins his satire showing off his classical learning and ends it paradoxically by praising the devout fool. Those who scorn the world are considered fools or madmen by the majority of people, Erasmus says, but they will inherit God’s kingdom and in their ecstasy “feel some foretaste and savour of the reward to come” (CWE 27: 152).

Praising Christian folly in such extravagant terms, Erasmus seems to align himself with the radical mystics who considered human intelligence worthless and studies futile. As we have seen, however, education is a central concern for Erasmus, and what seems like a contradiction, is merely a matter of priorities. Erasmus urges everyone to pursue learning, as long as it plays a supportive role to faith. He repeatedly praises docta pietas, piety which combines learning with a devout and humble spirit and warns against its opposite, impia curiositas, unholy inquisitiveness. Docta pietas means respecting the limits of human understanding:

Embrace what you are allowed to perceive; venerate from afar what you are not allowed to perceive, and look in awe and with simple faith on whatever it is that is concealed from you. Keep far away from impia curiositas,

he counsels students of theology in the Ratio (Holborn: 180). For Erasmus, St. Jerome is the embodiment of docta pietas. In his Life of Jerome (which prefaces his edition of the works of the Church Father, 1516), he depicted him as the Christian scholar par excellence, combining Ciceronian eloquence with a thorough understanding of theology and a devout spirit with a holy life.

In the Paraclesis Erasmus distinguished the simple philosophy of Christ from that of Plato, Aristotle, and other philosophical writers of antiquity, pointing out that the gospel provided the only certain doctrine and Christ was the only true teacher (Olin: 99, 102). For Erasmus learning and knowledge were qualities that had no value unless they centered on Christ and contributed to an understanding of the philosophia Christi. Even language studies, which formed the core of his curriculum proposal, had to be subordinated to that goal. He wished for an eloquence

which not only captivates the ear with its fleeting delight but which leaves a lasting sting in the minds of its hearers, which grips, which transforms, which sends away a far different listener than it had received. (Olin: 98)

This is the goal of a preacher’s eloquence, as Erasmus explains in the Ecclesiastes (The Evangelical Preacher, 1535). There he adapts the threefold task Cicero envisages for the speaker—to instruct, to move, to entertain—and develops the idea that the inspired words of a preacher will not only move but transform the listeners, that the preacher’s sermon will captivate not only the mind but also the soul of the hearers. This ability is “a gift of the Holy Spirit” however (CWE 67: 283).

Although Erasmus’ curriculum focused on the authors of classical antiquity, the philosophy of Christ required the adaption of pagan ideas to Christian thought and their application to Christian ideals, a process Erasmus called (after Augustine) “spoiling the Egyptians”. Accordingly he urges the preacher in the Ecclesiastes to select suitable material from classical writers but inject a Christian perspective. Erasmus himself edited and translated a number of pagan writers whose teachings he considered germane to the philosophy of Christ. Among them, he singled out Plutarch: “I have read nothing outside of Scripture with such a high moral tone” (Ep. 1341A: 259–60; CWE 9). He had high praise also for the Platonists, “because in much of their thinking as well as in their mode of expression they are the closest to the spirit of the prophets and the gospel” ( CWE 66: 33).

Erasmus was a prolific writer. His works were translated into the vernacular and circulated widely. His ideas had a strong impact that can be traced into the modern age. Even in his own time, the term “Erasmian” denoted a certain set of values. In 1530, the Leuven theologian Frans Titelmans noted that enthusiasts of humanistic studies were called “Erasmians” because Erasmus was their chief inspiration (1530, Ei verso–Eii recto). His contemporary, the Swiss chronicler Johann Kessler, declared that “whatever is skilled, polished, learned, and wise is called Erasmian” (1523–1539, 87). It was classical learning and eloquence that defined Erasmus in his own time. In the Age of Enlightenment he was celebrated as a rationalist, an image that held into the 20th century. Wilhelm Dilthey, for example, called Erasmus the Voltaire of the 16th century (GS II, 74). The emphasis shifted in the 20th century, when Erasmus’ irenicism caught readers’ attention. Thus José Chapiro (1950) dedicated his translation of The Complaint of Peace to the United Nations, and Erasmus’ biographer Johan Huizinga identified “Erasmian” with “gentleness, kindliness, and moderation” (1912 [1957], 194). In 1999, Ralf Dahrendorf defined Erasmus-Menschen as people guided by reason and avoiding the pitfalls of political extremism. Their hallmark was compassion and tolerance. In contemporary usage, then, “Erasmian” has come to denote a liberal thinker, an attitude or modus vivendi rather than a school of philosophy.


Erasmus’ Works

For a repertory of individual works and their early editions, see Ferdinand Van der Haeghen, Bibliotheca Erasmiana: Répertoire des oeuvres d’Erasme (first published 1897, most recent reprinted Würzburg: Osthoff, 2005).

Erasmus’ Opera Omnia were first published in Basel: Froben, 1540. The arrangement of works adopted there has become the model for later editions. An authoritative critical edition (ASD) and an English translation (CWE) of his works are ongoing.

  • [Allen] Opus Epistolarum Des. Erasmi Roterodami, 12 vols., edited by P.S. Allen and others, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1906–1958. doi:10.1093/actrade/
  • [ASD] Opera Omnia Des. Erasmi Roterodami, (no primary editor), Amsterdam: North Holland Press, 1969–. In 9 categories each which might have multiple volumes.
  • [CWE] The Collected Works of Erasmus, (no primary editor), Toronto: University of Toronto Press, 1974–
  • [LB] Opera Omnia Des. Erasmi Roterodami, 10 vols. Leiden: Peter van der Aa, 1703–1706.

Texts not (or not yet) included in these editions:

  • Ferguson, Wallace K. (ed.), Erasmi Opuscula. A Supplement to the Opera Omnia, The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff, 1933.
  • [Holborn] Holborn, Hajo and Annemarie Holborn (eds.), Desiderius Erasmus Roterodamus: Ausgewählte Werke, Munich: Beck, 1933.
  • [Olin] Olin, John C. (ed.), Christian Humanism and the Reformation: Selected Writings of Erasmus, third edition, New York: Fordham University Press, 1987.
  • Reeve, Anne and M. A. Screech (eds.), Erasmus’ Annotations on the New Testament, 3 vols, Vol. 1, London: Duckworth, 1986; Vol. 2–3, Leiden: Brill, 1990–1993.

Other Primary Works

  • Beda, Noël, 1526, “A Scholastic Response to Biblical Humanism: Noël Beda Against Lefèvre D’Etaples and Erasmus (1526)”, Mark Crane (trans.), Humanistica Lovaniensia, 59: 55–81, 2010.
  • Dilthey, Wilhelm, [GS II], Gesammelte Schriften II: Weltanschauung und Analyse des Menschen seit Renaissance und Reformation, (World-intuition and the Analysis of Humanity Since the Renaissance and Reformation), Stuttgart: B.G. Teubner Verlagsgesellschaft, 1957.
  • Kessler, Johan, 1523–1539, Johannes Kesslers Sabbata, Emil Egli & Rudolf Schoch (eds.), St. Gallen: Vormals Huber & Co., 1902.
  • Pico della Mirandola, 1496, On the Dignity of Man, A. Robert Caponigri (trans.), Washington, DC: Regnery Publishing, 1996.
  • Titelmans, Frans, 1530, Epistola apologetica … pro opere Collationum, Antwerp: Grapheus.


  • Augustijn, Cornelis, 1991, Erasmus: His Life, Works, and Influence (Erasmus von Rotterdam: Leben, Werk, Wirkung), J.C. Grayson (trans.), Toronto: University of Toronto Press. Original published in 1986.
  • Christ von Wedel, Christine, 2003, Erasmus von Rotterdam: Anwalt eines neuzeitlichen Christentums, Münster: LIT.
  • Halkin, Léon-Ernest, 1993, Erasmus: A Critical Biography (Erasme parmi nous), John Tonkin (trans.), Oxford: Blackwell. Original published 1987.
  • Huizinga, Johan, 1912 [1957], Erasmus and the Age of Reformation, F. Hopman (trans.), New York: Harper.
  • Margolin, Jean-Claude, 1995, Erasme, precepteur de l’Europe, Paris: Editions Juillard.
  • McConica, James K., 1991, Erasmus, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Rummel, Erika, 2004, Erasmus, London: Continuum Press.
  • Schoeck, Richard J., 1990–1993, Erasmus of Europe, Edinburgh: Edinburgh University Press.
    • 1990, Vol. 1: The Making of a Humanist, 1467–1500
    • 1993, Vol. 2: The Prince of Humanists, 1501–1536
  • Tracy, James D., 1972, Erasmus: The Growth of a Mind, (Travaux d'humanisme et Renaissance, 126), Geneva: Droz.

Secondary Works

  • Bejczy, Istvan, 2001, Erasmus and the Middle Ages: The Historical Consciousness of a Christian Humanist, Leiden: Brill.
  • Bené, Charles, 1969, Erasme et Saint Augustin, ou l’Influence de Saint Augustin sur l’humanisme d’Erasme, Geneva: Droz,
  • Bentley, Jerry H., 1983, Humanists and Holy Writ: New Testament Scholarship in the Renaissance, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Bierlaire, Franz, 1978, Les colloques d’Erasme: réforme des études, réforme des moeurs et réforme de l’Eglise au XVIe siècle, Paris: Les Belles Lettres.
  • Bietenholz, Peter, 2009, Encounters With a Radical Erasmus: Erasmus’ Work as a Source of Radical Thought in Early Modern Europe, Toronto: University of Toronto Press.
  • Boyle, Marjorie O’Rourke, 1977, Erasmus on Language and Method in Theology, Toronto: University of Toronto Press.
  • –––, 1981, Christening Pagan Mysteries: Erasmus in Pursuit of Wisdom, Toronto: University of Toronto Press.
  • –––, 1983, Rhetoric and Reform: Erasmus’ Civil Dispute with Luther, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Chantraine, George, 1971, “Mystère” et “Philosophie du Christ” selon Erasme, Gembloux: Editions J. Duculot.
  • Chapiro, José, 1950, Erasmus and Our Struggle For Peace, Boston: Beacon Press.
  • Christ von Wedel, Christine, 1981, Das Nichtwissen bei Erasmus von Rotterdam: Zum philosophischen und theologischen Erkennen in der geistigen Entwicklung eines christlichen Humanisten, Basel: Helbing & Lichtenhan.
  • Dahrendorf, Ralf, “Erasmus-Menschen”, Merkur, Deutsche Zeitschrift für europäisches Denken 53: 1063–1071.
  • Dealy, Ross, 2017, The Stoic Origins of Erasmus’ Philosophy of Christ, Toronto: University of Toronto Press.
  • De Molen, Richard, 1987, The Spirituality of Erasmus, Nieuwkoop: De Graaf.
  • Dodds, Gregory , 2009, Exploiting Erasmus: The Erasmian Legacy and Religious Chance in Early Modern England, Toronto: University of Toronto Press.
  • Gordon, Walter M., 1990, Humanist Play and Belief: The Seriocomic Art of Desiderius Erasmus, Toronto: University of Toronto Press.
  • Herwaarden, Jan van, 2003, Between Saint James and Erasmus. Studies in late-medieval religious life: Devotion and Pilgrimage in the Netherlands, (Studies in medieval and Reformation thought, 97), Wendie Schaffter and Donald Gardner (trans.), Leiden: Brill.
  • Hoffmann, Manfred, 1994, Rhetoric and Theology: The Hermeneutic of Erasmus, Toronto: University of Toronto Press.
  • Kerlen, Dietrich, 1976, Assertio: Die Entwicklung von Luthers theologischem Anspruch und der Streit mit Erasmus von Rotterdam, Wiesbaden: Franz Steiner.
  • Koerber, Eberhard von, 1967, Die Staatstheorie des Erasmus von Rotterdam, Berlin: Duncker & Humbolt.
  • Kohls, Ernst–Wilhelm, 1966, Die Theologie des Erasmus, 2 vols., Basel: F. Reinhardt.
  • Mansfield, Bruce, 2003, Erasmus in the Twentieth Century: Interpretations c. 1920–2000, Toronto: University of Toronto Press.
  • Massaut, Pierre (ed.), 1987, Colloque Erasmien de Liège, Paris: Les Belles Lettres.
  • Monfasani, John, 2012, “Erasmus and the Philosophers”, Erasmus of Rotterdam Society Yearbook (now Erasmus Studies), 32: 47–68. doi:10.1163/18749275-00000005
  • Nauert, Charles G., 2006, Humanism and the Culture of Renaissance Europe, 2nd edition, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Pabel, M. Hilmar (ed.), 1995, Erasmus’ Vision of the Church, Kirksville: Sixteenth Century Journal Publishers.
  • Pavlovskis, Zoja, 1983, The Praise of Folly: Structure and Irony, Leiden: Brill.
  • Quinones, Ricardo, 2007, Dualisms: The Agons of the Modern World, Toronto: University of Toronto Press.
  • Rabil, Albert, 1972, Erasmus and the New Testament: The Mind of a Christian Humanist, San Antonio: Trinity University Press.
  • Remer, Gary, 1996, Humanism and the Rhetoric of Toleration, University Park: Pennsylvania State University Press.
  • Rummel, Erika, 1995, The Humanist-Scholastic Debate in the Renaissance and Reformation, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • –––, 2000, The Confessionalization of Humanism in Reformation Germany, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Ryle, Stephen (ed.), 2014, Erasmus and the Renaissance Republic of Letters, Turnhout: Brepols. doi:10.1484/M.DISPUT-EB.5.105977
  • Thompson, Geraldine, 1973, Under Pretext of Praise: Satiric Mode in Erasmus’ Fiction, Toronto: University of Toronto Press.
  • Tracy, James D., 1978, The Politics of Erasmus: A Pacifist Intellectual and His Political Milieu, Toronto: University of Toronto Press.
  • Trapman, Hans, Jan van Herwaarden and Adrie van der Laan (eds.), 2010, Erasmus Politicus: Erasmus and Political Thought, Leiden: Brill.
  • Vance, Jacob, 2014, Secrets: Humanism, Mysticism, and Evangelism in Erasmus of Rotterdam, Bishop Guillaume Briçonnet, and Marguerite de Navarre, Leiden: Brill. doi: 10.1163/9789004281257
  • Walter, Peter, 1991, Theologie aus dem Geist der Rhetorik zur Schriftauslegung des Erasmus von Rotterdam, Mainz: Mathias-Grünewald-Verlag.
  • Woodward, William, 1904 [1971], . Desiderius Erasmus Concerning the Aim and Method of Education, First published in 1904, most recent reprint: New York: B. Franklin.

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