Exchange is fundamental to business. ‘Business’ can mean an activity of exchange. One entity (e.g., a person, a firm) “does business” with another when it exchanges a good or service for valuable consideration, i.e., a benefit such as money. ‘Business’ can also mean an entity that offers goods and services for exchange, i.e., that sells things. Target is a business. Business ethics can thus be understood as the study of the ethical dimensions of the exchange of goods and services, and of the entities that offer goods and services for exchange. This includes related activities such as the production, distribution, marketing, sale, and consumption of goods and services (cf. Donaldson & Walsh 2015; Marcoux 2006b).
Questions in business ethics are important and relevant to everyone. Almost all of us “do business”, or engage in a commercial transaction, almost every day. Many of us spend a major portion of our lives engaged in, or preparing to engage in, exchange activities, on our own or as part of organizations. Business activity shapes the world we live in, sometimes for good and sometimes for ill.
Business ethics in its current incarnation is a relatively new field, growing out of research by moral philosophers in the 1970’s and 1980’s. But scholars have been thinking about the ethical dimensions of commerce at least since the Code of Hammurabi (c. 1750 BC).
This entry summarizes research on central questions in business ethics, including: What sorts of things can be sold? How can they be sold? In whose interests should firms be managed? Who should manage them? What do firms owe their workers, and what do workers owe their firms? Should firms try to solve social problems? Is it permissible for them to try to influence political outcomes? Given the vastness of the field, of necessity certain questions are not addressed.
- 1. Varieties of business ethics
- 2. Corporate moral agency
- 3. The ends and means of corporate governance
- 4. Important frameworks for business ethics
- 5. Firms and consumers
- 6. Firms and workers
- 7. The firm in society
- 8. The status of business ethics
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
1. Varieties of business ethics
Many people engaged in business activity, including accountants and lawyers, are professionals. As such, they are bound by codes of conduct promulgated by professional societies. Many firms also have detailed codes of conduct, developed and enforced by teams of ethics and compliance personnel. Business ethics can thus be understood as the study of professional practices, i.e., as the study of the content, development, enforcement, and effectiveness of the codes of conduct designed to guide the actions of people engaged in business activity. This entry will not consider this form of business ethics. Instead, it considers business ethics as an academic discipline.
The academic field of business ethics is shared by social scientists and normative theorists. But they address different questions. Social scientists try to answer descriptive questions like: Does corporate social performance improve corporate financial performance, i.e., does ethics pay (Vogel 2005; Zhao & Murrell 2021)? Why do people engage in unethical behavior (Bazerman & Tenbrunsel 2011; Werhane et al. 2013). How can we make them stop (Warren, Gaspar, & Laufer 2014)? I will not consider such questions here. This entry focuses on questions in normative business ethics, most of which are variants on the question: What is ethical and unethical in business?
Normative business ethicists (hereafter the qualifier ‘normative’ will be assumed) tend to accept the basic elements of capitalism. That is, they assume that the means of production can be privately owned and that markets—featuring voluntary exchanges between buyers and sellers at mutually agreeable prices—should play an important role in the allocation of resources. Those who reject capitalism will see some debates in business ethics (e.g., about firm ownership and control) as misguided.
Some entities “do business” with the goal of making a profit, and some do not. Pfizer and Target are examples of the former; Rutgers University and the Metropolitan Museum of Art are examples of the latter. An organization identified as a ‘business’ is typically understood to be one that seeks profit, and for-profit organizations are the ones that business ethicists focus on. But many of the ethical issues described below arise also for non-profit organizations and individual economic agents.
2. Corporate moral agency
One way to think about business ethics is in terms of the moral obligations of agents engaged in business activity. Who can be a moral agent? Individual persons, obviously. What about firms? This is treated as the issue of “corporate moral agency” or “corporate moral responsibility”. Here ‘corporate’ does not refer to the corporation as a legal entity, but to a collective or group of individuals. To be precise, the question is whether firms are moral agents and morally responsible considered as (qua) firms, not considered as aggregates of individual members of firms.
We often think and speak as if corporations are morally responsible. We say things like “Costco treats its employees well” or “BP harmed the environment in the Gulf of Mexico”, and in doing so we appear to assign agency and responsibility to firms themselves (Dempsey 2003). We may wish to praise Costco and blame BP for their behavior. But this may be just a metaphorical way of speaking, or a shorthand way of referring to certain individuals who work in these firms (Velasquez 1983, 2003). Corporations are different in many ways from paradigm moral agents, viz., people. They don’t have minds, for one thing, or bodies, for another. The question is whether corporations are similar enough to people to warrant ascriptions of moral agency and responsibility.
In the business ethics literature, French is a seminal thinker on this topic. In early work (1979, 1984), he argued that firms are morally responsible for what they do, and indeed should be seen as “full-fledged” moral persons. He bases this conclusion on his claim that firms have internal decision-making structures, through which they cause events to happen, and act intentionally. Some early responses to French’s work accepted the claim that firms are moral agents, but denied that they are moral persons. Donaldson (1982) claims that firms cannot be persons because they lack important human capacities, such as the ability to pursue their own happiness (see also Werhane 1985). Other responses went further and denied that firms are moral agents. Velasquez (1983, 2003) argues that, while corporations can act, they cannot be held responsible for their actions, because those actions are brought about by the actions of their members. In later work, French (1995) recanted his claim that firms are moral persons, though not his claim that they are moral agents.
Debate about corporate moral agency and moral responsibility rages on in important new work (Orts & Smith 2017; Sepinwall 2016). One issue that has received sustained attention is choice. Appealing to discursive dilemmas, List & Pettit (2011) argue that the decisions of corporations can be independent of the decisions of their members (see also Copp 2006). This makes the corporation an autonomous agent, and since it can choose in the light of values, a morally responsible one. Another issue is intention. A minimal condition of moral agency is the ability to form intentions. Some deny that corporations can form them (S. Miller 2006; Rönnegard 2015). If we regard an intention as a mental state, akin to a belief or desire, or a belief/desire complex, they may be right. But not if we regard an intention in functionalist terms (Copp 2006; Hess 2014), as a plan (Bratman 1993), or in terms of reasons-responsiveness (Silver forthcoming). A third issue is emotion. Sepinwall (2017) argues that being capable of emotion is a necessary condition of moral responsibility, and since corporations aren’t capable of emotion, they aren’t morally responsible. Again, much depends on what it means to be capable of emotion. If this capability can be given a functionalist reading, as Björnsson & Hess (2017) claim, perhaps corporations are capable of emotion (see also Gilbert 2000). Pursuit of these issues lands one in the robust and sophisticated literature on collective responsibility and intentionality, where firms feature as a type of collective. (See the entries on collective responsibility, collective intentionality, and shared agency.)
Another question asked about corporate moral agency is: Does it matter? Perhaps BP itself was morally responsible for polluting the Gulf of Mexico. Perhaps certain individuals at BP were. What hangs on this? Some say: a lot. In some cases there may be no individual who is morally responsible for the firm’s behavior (List & Pettit 2011; Phillips 1995), and we need someone to blame, and perhaps punish. Blame may be the fitting response, and blame (and punishment) incentivizes the firm to change its behavior. Hasnas (2012) says very little hangs on this question. Even if firms are not morally responsible for the harms they cause, we can still require them to pay restitution, condemn their culture, and subject them to regulation. Moreover, Hasnas says, we should not blame and punish firms, for our blame and punishment inevitably lands on the innocent.
3. The ends and means of corporate governance
There is significant debate about the ends and means of corporate governance, i.e., about who firms should be managed for, and who should (ultimately) manage them. Much of this debate is carried on with the large publicly-traded corporation in view.
3.1 Ends: shareholder primacy or stakeholder balance?
There are two main views about the proper ends of corporate governance. According to one view, firms should be managed in the best interests of shareholders. It is typically assumed that managing firms in shareholders’ best interests requires maximizing their wealth (cf. Hart & Zingales 2017; Robson 2019). This view is called “shareholder primacy” (Stout 2012) or—in order to contrast it more directly with its main rival (to be discussed below) “shareholder theory”. Shareholder primacy is the dominant view about the ends of corporate governance in business schools and in the business world.
A few writers argue for shareholder primacy on deontological grounds, i.e., by appealing to rights and duties. On this argument, shareholders own the firm, and hire managers to run it for them on the condition that the firm is managed in their interests. Shareholder primacy is thus based on a promise that managers make to shareholders (Friedman 1970; Hasnas 1998). In response, some argue that shareholders do not own the firm. They own stock, a type of corporate security (Bainbridge 2008; Stout 2012); the firm itself may be unowned (Strudler 2017). Others argue that managers do not make, explicitly or implicitly, any promises to shareholders to manage the firm in a certain way (Boatright 1994). More writers argue for shareholder primacy on consequentialist grounds. On this argument, managing firms in the interests of shareholders is more efficient than managing them in any other way (Hansmann & Kraakman 2001; Jensen 2002). In support of this, some argue that, if managers are not given a single objective that is clear and measurable—viz., maximizing shareholder value—then they will have greater opportunity for self-dealing (Stout 2012). The consequentialist argument for shareholder primacy run into problems that afflict many versions of consequentialism: in requiring all firms to aim at a certain objective, it does not allow sufficient scope for personal choice (Hussain 2012). Most think that people should be able to pursue projects, including economic projects, that matter to them, even if those projects do not maximize shareholder value.
The second main view about the proper ends of corporate governance is given by stakeholder theory. This theory was first put forward by Freeman in the 1980s (Freeman 1984; Freeman & Reed 1983), and has been refined by Freeman and collaborators over the years (see, e.g., Freeman 1994; Freeman et al. 2010; Freeman, Harrison, & Zyglidopoulos 2018; Jones, Wicks, & Freeman 2002; Phillips, Freeman, & Wicks 2003). According to stakeholder theory—or at least, early formulations of it—instead of managing the firm in the best interests of shareholders only, managers should seek to “balance” the interests of all stakeholders, where a stakeholder is anyone who has a “stake”, or interest (including a financial interest), in the firm. Blair and Stout’s (1999) “team production” theory of corporate governance offers similar guidance.
To be clear, in a firm in which shareholders’ interests are prioritized, other stakeholders will benefit too. Employees will receive wages, customers will receive goods and services, and so on. The debate between shareholder and stakeholder theorists is about what to do with the residual revenues, i.e., what’s left over after firms meet their contractual obligations to employees, customers, and others. Shareholder theorists think they should be used to maximize shareholder wealth. Stakeholder theorists think they should be used to benefit all stakeholders.
To its critics, stakeholder theory has seemed both incompletely articulated and weakly defended. With respect to articulation, one question that has been pressed is: Who are the stakeholders (Orts & Strudler 2002, 2009)? The groups most commonly identified are shareholders, employees, the community, suppliers, and customers. But other groups have stakes in the firm, including creditors, the government, and competitors. It makes a great deal of difference where the line is drawn, but stakeholder theorists have not provided a clear rationale for drawing it in one place rather than another. Another question is: What does it mean to “balance” the interests of all stakeholders, other than not always giving precedence to shareholders’ interests (Orts & Strudler 2009)? With respect to defense, critics have wondered what the rationale is for managing firms in the interests of all stakeholders. In one place, Freeman (1984) offers an instrumental argument, claiming that balancing stakeholders’ interests is better for the firm strategically than maximizing shareholder wealth (see also Blair & Stout 1999; Freeman, Harrison, & Zyglidopoulos 2018). (Defenders of shareholder primacy say the same thing about their view.) In another, he gives an argument that appeals to Rawls’s justice as fairness (Evan & Freeman 1988; cf. Child & Marcoux 1999).
In recent years, questions have been raised about whether stakeholder theory is appropriately seen as a genuine competitor to shareholder primacy, or is even appropriately called a “theory”. In one article, Freeman and collaborators say that stakeholder theory is simply “the body of research … in which the idea of ‘stakeholders’ plays a crucial role” (Jones et al. 2002). In another, Freeman describes stakeholder theory as “a genre of stories about how we could live” (1994: 413). It may be, as Norman (2013) says, that stakeholder is now best regarded as “mindset”, i.e., a way of looking at the firm that emphasizes its embeddedness in a network of relationships. In this case, there may be no dispute between shareholder and stakeholder theorists.
Resolving the debate between shareholder and stakeholder theorists (assuming they are competitors) will not resolve all or even most of the ethical questions in business. This is because it is a debate about the ends of corporate governance. It cannot answer questions about the moral constraints that must be observed in pursuit of those ends (Goodpaster 1991; Norman 2013), including duties of beneficence (Mejia 2020). Neither shareholder theory nor stakeholder theory is plausibly interpreted as the view that corporate managers should do whatever is possible to maximize shareholder wealth and balance all stakeholders’ interests, respectively. Rather, these views should be interpreted as views that managers should do whatever is consistent with the requirements of morality to achieve these ends. A large part of business ethics is trying to determine what these requirements are.
3.2 Means: control by shareholders or others too?
Answers to questions about the means of corporate governance often mirror answers to question about the ends of corporate governance. Often the best way to ensure that a firm is managed in the interests of a certain party P is to give P control. Conversely, justifications for why the firm should be managed in the interests of P sometimes appeal P’s rights to control it.
Friedman (1970), for example, thinks that shareholders’ ownership of the firm gives them a right to control the firm (which they can use to ensure that the firm is run in their interests). We might see control rights for shareholders as following analytically from the concept of ownership. To own a thing is to have a bundle of rights with respect to that thing. One of the standard “incidents” of ownership is control. (See the entry on property and ownership.)
As noted, in recent years the idea that the firm is something that can be owned has been challenged (Bainbridge 2008; Stout 2012; Strudler 2017). If this is right, then the ownership argument collapses. But similar contractarian arguments for shareholder control of firms have been constructed which do not rely on the assumption of firm ownership. All that is assumed in these arguments is that some people own capital, and others own labor. Capital can “hire” labor (and other inputs of production) or labor can “hire” capital. It just so happens that, in most cases, capital hires labor. We know this because in most cases capital-providers are the ultimate decision-makers in the firm. In a publicly-traded corporation, they elect the board. These points are emphasized especially by those who regard the firm as a “nexus of contracts” among various parties (Easterbrook & Fischel 1996; Jensen & Meckling 1976).
Many writers find this result troubling. Even if the governance structure in most firms is in some sense agreed to, they say that it is unjust in other ways. Anderson (2017) characterizes standard corporate governance regimes as oppressive and unaccountable private dictatorships. To address this injustice, these writers call for various forms of worker participation in managerial decision-making, including the ability by workers to reject arbitrary directives by managers (Hsieh 2005), worker co-determination of firms’ policies and practices (Ferreras 2017; McMahon 1994), and exclusive control of productive enterprises by workers (Dahl 1985).
Arguments for these governance structures take various forms. One appeals to the value of protecting workers’ interests (González-Ricoy 2014; Hsieh 2005). Another appeals to the value of autonomy, or a right to freely determine one’s actions, including one’s actions at work (Malleson 2014; McCall 2001). A third argument for worker control is the “parallel case” argument. According to it, if states should be governed democratically, then so should firms, because firms are like states in the relevant respects (Dahl 1985; Landemore & Ferreras 2016; cf. Mayer 2000). A fourth argument sees worker participation in firm decision-making as valuable training for citizens in a democratic society (Pateman 1970).
Space considerations prevent detailed examinations of these arguments (for critical reviews see Frega, Herzog, & Neuhäuser 2019; Hsieh 2008). But criticisms generally fall into two categories. The first insists on the normative priority of agreements, of the sort described above. There are few legal restrictions on the types of governance structures that firms can have. And some firms are in fact controlled by workers (Dow 2003; Hansmann 1996). To insist that other firms should be governed this way is to say, according to this argument, that people should not be allowed to arrange their economic lives as they see fit. Another criticism of worker participation appeals to efficiency. Allowing workers to participate in managerial decision-making may decrease the pace of decision-making, since it requires giving many workers a chance to make their voices heard (Hansmann 1996). It may also raise the cost of capital for firms, as investors may demand more favorable terms if they are not given control of the enterprise in return (McMahon 1994). Both sources of inefficiency may put the firm at a significant disadvantage in a competitive market. It may not just be a matter of competitive disadvantage. If it were, the problem could be solved by making all firms worker-controlled. The problem may be one of diminished productivity more generally.
4. Important frameworks for business ethics
Business ethicists seek to understand the ethical contours of business activity. One way of advancing this project is by choosing a normative framework and teasing out its implications for business issues. In principle, it is possible to do this for any normative framework. Below are four that have received significant attention.
One influential approach to business ethics draws on virtue ethics. Moore (2017) develops and applies MacIntyre’s (1984) virtue ethics to business. For MacIntyre, there are goods internal to practices, and certain virtues are necessary to achieve those goods. Building on MacIntyre, Moore develops the idea that business is a practice (or contains practices), and thus has certain goods internal to it (or them), the attainment of which requires the cultivation of business virtues. Aristotelian approaches to virtue in business are found in Alzola (2012) and de Bruin (2015). Scholars have also been inspired by the Aristotelian idea that the good life is achieved in a community (Sison & Fontrodona 2012), and have considered how business communities must be structured to help their members flourish (Hartman 2015; Solomon 1993).
Another important approach to the study of business ethics comes from deontology, especially Kant’s version (Arnold & Bowie 2003; Bowie 2017; Scharding 2015; Hughes 2020). Kant’s claim that humanity should be treated always as an end, and never as a means only, has proved especially fruitful for analyzing the human interactions at the core of commercial transactions. In competitive markets, people may be tempted to deceive, cheat, use, exploit, or manipulate others to gain an edge. Kantian moral theory singles out these actions out as violations of human dignity (Hughes 2019; Smith & Dubbink 2011).
Ethical theory, including virtue theory and deontology, is useful for thinking about how individuals should relate to each other. But business ethics also comprehends the laws and regulations that structure markets and firms. Here political theory seems more relevant. A number of business ethicists have sought to identify the implications of Rawls’s (1971) justice as fairness for business. This is not an easy task, since while Rawls makes some suggestive remarks about markets and firms, he does not articulate specific conclusions or develop detailed arguments for them. But scholars have argued that justice as fairness: (1) is incompatible with significant inequalities of power and authority within firms (S. Arnold 2012); (2) requires people to have an opportunity to perform meaningful work (Moriarty 2009; cf. Hasan 2015); and requires alternative forms of (3) corporate governance (Berkey 2021; Blanc & Al-Amoudi 2013; Norman 2015; cf. Singer 2015) and (4) corporate ownership (M. O’Neill & Williamson 2012).
A fourth approach to business ethics is called the “market failures approach” (MFA). It originates with McMahon (1981), but it has been developed in most detail by Heath (2014) (for discussion see Moriarty 2020 and Singer 2018). According to Heath, the justification of the market is that it produces efficient—in the sense of Pareto-optimal— outcomes. But this only happens when the conditions of perfect competition obtain, such as perfect information, no market power, and no barriers to entry or exit. (When they don’t, markets fail—hence the market failures approach.) On the MFA, these conditions are the source of ethical rules for market actors. The MFA says that market actors, including sellers and buyers, should not create or take advantage of market imperfections. So, for example, firms should not deceive consumers (creating information asymmetries) or lobby governments to levy tariffs on foreign competitors (erecting barriers to entry).
Selecting a normative framework and applying it to a range of issues is an important way of doing business ethics. But it is not the only way. Indeed, the more common approach is to identify a business activity and then analyze it using “mid-level” principles or ideals common to many moral and political theories. Below I consider ethical issues that arise at the nexus of firms’ engagement with three important groups: consumers, employees, and society.
5. Firms and consumers
The main way that firms interact with consumers is by selling, or attempting to sell, products and services to them. Many ethical issues attend this interaction.
5.1 The limits of markets
Many have argued that some things should not be for sale (Anderson 1993; MacDonald & Gavura 2016; Sandel 2012; Satz 2010). Among the things commonly said to be inappropriate for sale are sexual services, surrogacy services, and human organs. Some writers object to markets in these items for consequentialist reasons. They argue that markets in commodities like sex and kidneys will lead to the exploitation of vulnerable people (Satz 2010). Others object to the attitudes or values expressed in such markets. They claim that markets in surrogacy services express the attitude that women are mere vessels for the incubation of children (Anderson 1993); markets in kidneys suggest that human life can be bought and sold (Sandel 2012); and so on. (For a discussion of what it might mean for a market to “express” a value, see Jonker .)
Other writers criticize these arguments, and in general, the attempt to “wall-off” certain goods and services from markets. Brennan and Jaworksi (2016) object to expressive or “semiotic” arguments against markets in contested commodities (cf. Brown & Maguire 2019). Whether selling a particular thing for money expresses disrespect, they note, is culturally contingent. They and others (e.g., Taylor 2005) also argue that the bad effects of markets in contested commodities can be eliminated or at least ameliorated through appropriate regulation, and that anyway, the good effects of such markets (e.g., a decrease in the number of people who die because they are waiting for a kidney) outweigh the bad.
5.2 Product safety and liability
Some things that firms may wish to sell, and that people may wish to buy, pose a significant risk of harm, to the user and others. When is a product too unsafe to be sold? This question is often answered by government agencies. In the U.S., a number of government agencies, including the Consumer Product Safety Commission (CPSC), the National Highway Traffic Safety Administration (NHTSA), and the Food and Drug Administration (FDA), are responsible for assessing the safety of products for the consumer market. In some cases these standards are mandatory (e.g., medicines and medical devices); in other cases they are voluntary (e.g., trampolines and tents). The state identifies minimum standards and individual businesses can choose to adopt more stringent ones.
Questions about product safety are a matter of significant debate among economists, legal scholars, and public policy experts. Business ethicists have paid scant attention to these questions (but see Brenkert 1981). Existing treatments often combine discussions of safety with discussions of liability—the question of who should pay for harms that products cause—and tend to be found in business ethics textbooks. One of the most careful treatments is Velasquez’s (2012). He distinguishes three (compatible) views: (1) the “contract view”, according to which the manufacturer’s duty is only to accurately disclose all risks associated with the product; (2) the “due care view”, according to which the manufacturer should exercise due care to prevent buyers from being injured by the product; and (3) the “social costs view”, according to which the manufacturer should pay for any injuries the product causes, even if the manufacturer has accurately disclosed all risks associated with the product and has exercised due care to prevent injury (see also Boatright & Smith 2017). In the U.S. and elsewhere, the law has moved in the direction of the social costs view, where it is known as “strict liability”.
There is much room for philosophical exploration of these issues. One area that merits attention is the definitions of key terms, such as “safety” and “risk”. Drop side cribs pose risks to consumers; so do trampolines. On what basis should the former be prohibited but the latter not be (Hasnas 2010)? The answer must take into account the value of these products, how obvious the risks they pose are, and the availability of substitutes. With respect to liability, we may wonder whether it is fair to hold manufacturers responsible for harms their products cause, when the manufacturers are not morally at fault for those harms. On the other hand, it may be unfair to force consumers to bear the full costs of their injuries, when they too are not morally at fault. The question may be one for society as a whole: what is the most efficient or just way to distribute these costs?
Most advertising contains both an informational component and a persuasive component. Advertisements tell us something about a product, and try to persuade us to buy it. Both of these components can be subject to ethical evaluation.
Emphasizing its informational component, some writers stress the positive value of advertising. Markets function efficiently only when certain conditions are met. One of these conditions is perfect information. Minimally, consumers have to understand the features of the products for sale. While this condition will never be fully met, advertising can help to ensure that it is met to a greater degree (Heath 2014). Another value that can be promoted through advertising is autonomy. People have certain needs and desires—e.g., to eat healthy food, to drive a safe car—which their choices as consumers help them to satisfy. Their choices are more likely to satisfy their needs and desires if they have information about what is for sale, which advertising can provide (Goldman 1984).
These good effects depend, of course, on advertisements producing true beliefs, or at least not producing false beliefs, in consumers. Writers treat this as the issue of deception in advertising. The issue is not whether deceptive advertising is wrong (most would agree it is), but what counts as deceptive advertising, and what makes it wrong.
In the 1980s, Beech-Nut advertised as “100% apple juice” a drink that contained no juice of any kind. Beech-Nut was fined $2 million and two of its executives went to prison. As of this writing (in 2021), Red Bull is marketing its energy drinks with the slogan “Red Bull Gives You Wings,” but in fact Red Bull doesn’t give you wings. There is no problem with Red Bull’s marketing. What’s the difference? We might say that Red Bull’s slogan is not warranted as true (Carson 2010). It is an example of “puffery,” or over-the-top, exaggerated praise which no reasonable person takes seriously (Attas 1999). By contrast, Beech-Nut’s statement appeared to be a claim meant to be taken at face value, but in fact is false. As these examples illustrate, advertisements are deceptive not because of the truth-value of their claims, but what these claims cause reasonable consumers to believe. Questions can be raised, of course, about what it means to be reasonable (Scalet 2003); the answer may depend on who the consumers are.
Intention is usually taken to be irrelevant to deception in advertising. That is, an advertisement may be deemed deceptive even if the advertiser doesn’t intend to deceive anyone. Some philosophers would say that these advertisements are better described as misleading. (For discussion, see the entry on the definition of lying and deception.) Regulators of advertising blur this distinction, or perhaps they don’t care about it. Their goal is to protect consumers from acting on materially false beliefs, which may be caused either by deception or by blamelessly being misled.
Many reasons have been offered for why deceptive advertising is wrong. One is the Kantian claim that deceiving others is disrespectful to them, a use of them as a mere means. Deceptive advertising may also lead to harm, to consumers (who purchase suboptimal products, given their desires) and competitors (who lose out on sales). A final criticism of deceptive advertising is that it erodes trust in society (Attas 1999). When people do not trust each other, they will either not engage in economic transactions, or engage in them only with costly legal protections.
The persuasive component of advertising is also a fruitful subject of ethical inquiry. Galbraith (1958), an early critic, thinks that advertising, in general, does not inform people how to acquire what they want, but instead gives them new wants. He calls this the “dependence effect”: our desires depend on what is produced, not vice versa. Moreover, since we are inundated with advertising for consumer goods, we want too many of those goods and not enough public goods. Hayek (1961) rejects this claim, arguing that few if any of our desires are independent of our environment, and that anyway, desires produced in us through advertising are no less significant than desires produced in us in other ways.
Galbraith is concerned about the persuasive effects of advertisements. In contrast, recent writers focus on the techniques that advertisers use to persuade. Some of these are alleged to cross the line into manipulation (Aylsworth, 2020; Brenkert 2008; Sher 2011). It is difficult to define manipulation precisely, though attempts have been made (for extensive discussion, see the entry on the ethics of manipulation). For our purposes, manipulative advertising can be understood as advertising that attempts to persuade consumers, often (but not necessarily) using non-rational means, to make irrational or suboptimal choices, given their own needs and desires.
Associative advertising is often identified as a type of manipulative advertising. In associative advertising, the advertiser tries to associate a product with a positive belief, feeling, attitude, ideal, or activity which usually has little to do with the product itself. Thus many television commercials for trucks in the U.S. associate trucks with manliness. Commercials for body fragrances associate those products with sex between beautiful people. The suggestion is that if you are a certain sort of person (e.g., a manly one), then you will have a certain sort of product (e.g., a truck). In an important article, Crisp (1987) argues that this sort of advertising attempts to create desires in people by circumventing their faculties of conscious choice, and in so doing subverts their autonomy (cf. Arrington 1982; Phillips 1994). Lippke (1989) argues that it makes people desire the wrong things, encouraging us to try to satisfy our non-market desires (e.g., to be more manly) through market means (e.g., buying a truck) (cf. Aylsworth 2020). How seriously we should take these criticisms may depend on how effective associative and other forms of persuasive advertising are. To the extent that advertisers are unsuccessful at “going around” our faculty of conscious choice, we may be less worried and more amused by their attempts to do so (Bishop 2000; Goldman 1984).
Our judgments on this issue should be context-sensitive. While most people may be able to see through advertisers’ attempts to persuade them, some may not be (at least some of the time). Paine (Paine et al. 1984) argues that advertising is justified because it helps consumers make wise decisions in the marketplace. But children, she argues, lack the capacity for making wise consumer choices (see also E.S. Moore 2004). Thus advertising directed at children constitutes a form of objectionable exploitation. Other populations who may be similarly vulnerable are the senile, the ignorant, and the bereaved. Ethics may require not a total ban on marketing to them but special care in how they are marketed to (Brenkert 2008; cf. Palmer & Hedberg 2013).
Sales are central to business. Perhaps surprisingly, business ethicists have said relatively little about sales.
An emerging set of issues concerns refusals to sell. Normally businesses want to sell their goods and services to everyone. But not always. In 2012, Jack Phillips of Masterpiece Cakeshop declined to sell a wedding cake to a same-sex couple because he opposed same-sex marriage on religious grounds. In response, the couple filed a complaint with the Colorado Civil Rights Commission. Should Phillips have sold the wedding cake to the couple? We might say that a commercial transaction is a kind of association, and people—including business owners like Phillips—should be free to associate, or not, with whomever they choose. Or we might say, as Phillips did, that his actions were protected by freedom of religion, since they were an expression of his identity, which includes his religious commitments. Alternatively, we might claim that Phillips was discriminating against the couple, and his actions were wrong for the same reasons discrimination typically is, viz., it denies people opportunities and undermines their dignity (Corvino, Anderson, & Girgis 2017).
Questions can also be raised about the techniques advertisers use to sell. These questions are similar to the ones asked about advertising. Salespeople are, in a sense, the final advertisers of products to consumers. An early contribution to the ethics of sales is found in Holley (1986), who develops a set of obligations for salespeople derived from the point of market activity, which he says is to efficiently meet people’s needs and wants (cf. Heath 2014). In what is probably the most sophisticated treatment of the subject, Carson (2010) says salespeople have at least the following four pro tanto duties: (1) provide customers with safety warnings and precautions; (2) refrain from lying and deception; (3) fully answer customers’ questions about items; and (4) refrain from steering customers toward purchases that are unsuitable for them, given their stated needs and desires. Carson justifies (1)—(4) by appealing to the golden rule: treat others as you want to be treated. He identifies two other duties that salespeople might have (he is agnostic): (5) do not sell customers products that you (the salesperson) think are unsuitable for them, given their needs and desires, without telling customers why you think this; and (6) do not sell customers poor quality or defective products, without telling them why you think this. For the most part, (1)—(4) ask the salesperson not to harm the customer; (5) and (6) ask the salesperson to help the customer, in particular, help her not to make foolish mistakes. The broader issue is one of disclosure (Holley 1998). How much information we think salespeople are required to share with customers may depend on what kind of relationship we think they should have, e.g., to what extent it is adversarial.
For many products bought and sold in markets, sellers offer an item at a certain price, and buyers take or leave that price. But in some cases there is negotiation over price (and other aspects of the transaction). We see this in the sale of “big ticket” items such as cars and houses, and in salaries for jobs. While there are many ethical issues that arise in negotiation, one issue that has received special attention is “bluffing”, or deliberately misstating one’s bargaining position. The locus classicus for this discussion is Carr (1968). According to him, bluffing in negotiations is permissible because business has its own distinctive set of moral rules and bluffing is permissible according to those rules. Carson (2010) agrees that bluffing is permissible in business, though in a more limited range of cases. Carson’s argument appeals to self-defense. If you have good reason to believe that your adversary in a negotiation is misstating her bargaining position, then you are permitted to misstate yours. A requirement to tell the truth in these circumstances would put you at a significant disadvantage relative to your adversary, which you are not required to suffer. An implication of Carson’s view is that you are not permitted to misstate your bargaining position if you do not have good reason to believe that your adversary is misstating hers.
In simplified models of the market, individual buyers and sellers are “price-takers”, not “price-makers”. That is, the prices of goods and services are set by the aggregate forces of supply and demand; no individual buys or sells a good for anything other than the market price. In reality, things are different. Sellers of goods have some flexibility about how to price goods.
Most business ethicists would accept that, in most cases, the prices at which products should be sold is a matter for private individuals to decide. This view has been defended on grounds of property rights. Some claim that if I have a right to a thing, then I am free to transfer that thing to you on whatever terms that I propose and you accept (Boatright 2010). It has also been defended on grounds of welfare. Prices set by voluntary exchanges reveal valuable information about the relative demand for and supply of goods, allowing resources to flow to their most productive uses (Hayek 1945). Despite this, most business ethicists also recognize some limits on prices.
One issue that has received increasing attention is price discrimination. This is discrimination based on willingness to pay, or the practice of charging more to people who are willing to pay more. This might at first seem unfair or even exploitative, but in fact it is commonplace and usually unremarkable (Elegido 2011; Marcoux 2006a). Examples of price discrimination include senior and student discounts, bulk discounts, versioning, and the sort of bargaining one finds in car dealerships and flea markets. We might see price discrimination as an implication of freedom in pricing, and according to a familiar result in economics, price discrimination increases social welfare, provided that it enables producers to increase output (Varian 1985). But some instances of price discrimination have come in for criticism. Online retailers collect and purchase enormous amounts of information about consumers, and there is evidence that they are using this to personalize prices, or tailor prices to what they think are consumers’ reservation prices, i.e., the highest amounts they are willing to pay. Some believe that this practice is unfair (Steinberg 2020), though they problem may simply be that consumers don’t know what retailers are up to.
Another issue of pricing ethics is price gouging. Price gouging can be understood as a sharp increase in the price of a necessary good in the wake of an emergency which renders that good scarce (Hughes 2020; Zwolinski 2008). As the novel coronavirus spread around the world in early 2020, retailers began to charge extremely high prices for cleaning products and medical supplies. Many jurisdictions have laws against price gouging, and it is widely regarded as unethical (Snyder 2009). The reason is that it is a paradigm case of exploitation: A extracts an excessive benefit out of B in circumstances in which B cannot reasonably refuse A’s offer (Valdman 2009). But some theorists defend price gouging. While granting that sales of items in circumstances like these are exploitative, they note that they are mutually beneficial. Both the seller and buyer prefer to engage in the transaction rather than not engage in it. Moreover, when items are sold at inflated prices, this both limits hoarding and attracts more sellers into the market. Permitting price gouging may thus be the fastest way of eliminating it (Zwolinski 2008). (For further discussion, see the entry on exploitation.)
Most contemporary scholars believe that sellers have wide, though not unlimited, discretion in how much they charge for goods and services. But there is an older tradition in business ethics, found in Aquinas and other medieval scholars, according to which there is one price that sellers should charge: the “just price”. There is debate about what exactly medieval scholars meant by “just price”. According to a historically common interpretation, the just price is determined by the seller’s cost of production, i.e., the price that compensates the seller for the value of her labor and expenses. More recent interpretations understand the medieval just price at something closer to the market price, which may be more or less than the cost of production (Koehn & Wilbratte 2012).
6. Firms and workers
Business ethicists have written much about the relationship between employers and employees. Below we consider four issues at the employer/employee interface: (1) hiring and firing, (2) pay, (3) meaningful work, and (4) whistleblowing. Another important topic at this interface is privacy. For space reasons it will not be discussed, but see the entries on privacy and privacy and information technology.
6.1 Hiring and firing
Ethical issues in hiring and firing tend to focus on the question: What criteria should employers use, or not use, in employment decisions? The question of what criteria employers should not use is addressed in discussions of discrimination.
While there is some debate about whether discrimination in employment should be legally prohibited (see Epstein 1992), almost everyone agrees that it is morally wrong (Hellman 2008; Lippert-Rasmussen 2014). Discussion has focused on two questions. First, when does the use of a certain criterion in an employment decision count as discriminatory? It would seem wrong if Walmart were to exclude white applicants for a job in their marketing department, but not wrong if the Hovey Players (a theater troupe) were to exclude white applicants for the role of Walter Younger in A Raisin in the Sun. We might say that whether a hiring practice is discriminatory depends on whether the criterion used is job-relevant. But the concept of job-relevance is contested, as the case of “reaction qualifications” reveals. Suppose that white diners prefer to be served by white waiters rather than black waiters. In this case race seems job-relevant, but it seems wrong for employers to take race into account (Mason 2017). Another question that has received considerable attention is: What makes discrimination wrong? Some argue that discrimination is wrong because of its effects on those who are discriminated against (Lippert-Rasmussen 2014); others think that it is wrong because of what it expresses to them (Hellman 2008). (For extensive discussion, see the entry on discrimination.)
Some writers believe that employers’ obligations are not satisfied simply by avoiding using certain criteria in hiring decisions. According to them, employers have a duty to hire the most qualified applicant. Some justify this duty by appealing to considerations of desert (D. Miller 1999; Mulligan 2018); others justify it by appealing to equal opportunity (Mason 2006). We might object to this view by appealing to property rights. A job offer typically implies a promise to pay the job-taker a sum of your money for performing certain tasks. While we might think that excluding some ways you can dispose of your property (e.g., rules against discrimination in hiring) can be justified, we might think that excluding all ways but one (viz., a requirement to hire the most qualified applicant) is unjustified. In support of this, we might think that a small business owner does nothing wrong when she hires her daughter for a part-time job as opposed to a more qualified stranger.
The question of when employees may be fired is a staple of business ethics texts and was the subject of considerable debate in the business ethics literature in the 1980’s and 1990’s. There are two main views: those who think that employment should be “at will”, so that an employer can terminate an employee for any reason (Epstein 1984; Maitland 1989), and those who think that employers should be able to terminate employees only for “just cause” (e.g., poor performance or excessive absenteeism) (McCall & Werhane 2010). In fact, few writers hold the “pure” version of the “at will” view. Most would say, and the law agrees, that it is wrong for an employer to terminate an employee for certain reasons, e.g., a discovery that he is Muslim or his refusal to commit a crime for the employer. Thus the debate is between those who think that employers should be able to terminate employees for any reason with some exceptions, and those who think that employers should be able to terminate employees only for certain reasons. In the U.S., most employees are at will, while in Europe, most employees are covered, after a probationary period, by something analogous to just cause. Arguments for just cause appeal to the effects that termination has on individual employees, especially those who have worked for an employer for many years (McCall & Werhane 2010). Arguments for at will employment appeal to freedom or macroeconomic effects. It is claimed, in the former case, that just cause is an unwarranted restriction on employers’ and employees’ freedom of contract (Epstein 1984), and in the latter case, that it raises the unemployment rate (Maitland 1989). The more difficult it is for an employer to fire an employee, the more reluctant she will be to hire one in the first place.
Businesses generate revenue, and some of this revenue is distributed to employees in the form of compensation, or pay. Since the demand for pay typically exceeds the supply, the question of how pay should be distributed is naturally analyzed as a problem of justice.
Two theories of justice in pay have attracted attention. One may be called the “agreement view”. According to it, a just wage is whatever wage the employer and the employee agree to without force or fraud (Boatright 2010). This view is sometimes justified in terms of property rights. Employees own their labor, and employers own their capital, and they are free, within broad limits, to dispose of it as they please. In addition, we might think that wages should be should determined by voluntary agreement for the same reason prices generally should be, viz., it allocates resources to their most productive uses, as determined by people’s wants (Heath 2018; Hayek 1945). A “wage”, after all, is just a special name for the price of labor.
A second view of wages may be called the “contribution view”. According to it, the just wage for a worker is the wage that reflects her contribution to the firm. This view comes in two versions. On the absolute version, workers should receive an amount of pay that equals the value of their contributions to the firm (D. Miller 1999). On the comparative version, workers should receive an amount of pay that reflects the relative value of their contributions to the firm, given what others in the firm contribute and are paid (Sternberg 2000). The contribution view strikes some as normatively basic, a view for which no further argument can be given (D. Miller 1999). An analogy may be drawn with punishment. Just as it seems intuitively right for the severity of a criminal’s punishment to reflect the seriousness of her crime, so it may seem intuitively right for the value of a persons’s pay to reflect the value of her work (Moriarty 2016). In this way, pay might be understood as a reward for work.
Some argue that compensation should be evaluated not only as a problem of justice but as an incentive. The question here is what pay encourages employees to do, and how it encourages them to do it. Poorly structured compensation packages for traders in the financial services industry are thought to have contributed to the financial crisis of 2007-2009 (Kolb 2012). Traders were incentivized to take excessively risky bets, and when those bets went bad, their firms could not cover the losses, putting the firms and ultimately the whole financial system in peril. Bad incentives may also help to explain the recent account fraud scandal at Wells Fargo.
The pay of any employee can be evaluated from a moral point of view. But business ethicists have paid particular attention to the pay of certain employees, viz., CEOs and workers in factories in developing countries, often called “sweatshops.”
There has been significant debate about whether CEOs are paid too much (Boatright, 2010; Moriarty 2005), with scholars falling into two camps. Those in the “managerial power” camp believe that CEOs wield power over boards of directors, and use this power to extract above-market rents from their firms (Bebchuk & Fried 2004). Those in the “efficient contracting” camp believe that pay negotiations between CEOs and boards are usually carried out at arm’s-length, and that CEOs’ large compensation packages reflect their rare and valuable skills. (For a recent survey of relevant empirical issues, see Edmans, Gabaix, & Jenter 2017).
There has also been a robust debate about whether workers in sweatshops are paid too little. Some say ‘no’ (Powell & Zwolinski 2012; Zwolinski 2007). They say that sweatshops wages, while low by standards in developed countries, are not low by the standards of the countries in which the sweatshops are located. This explains why people choose to work in a sweatshop; it is the best offer they have. Efforts to increase artificially the wages of sweatshop workers, according to these writers, is misguided on two counts. First, it is an interference with the autonomous choices of employers and workers. Second, it is likely to make workers worse off, since employers will respond by either moving operations to a new location or employing fewer workers in that location (cf. Kates 2015). These writers sometimes appeal to a principle of “nonworseness,” according to which a consensual, mutually beneficial interaction (of the sort sweatshop owners and workers engage in) cannot be worse than its absence. Other writers challenge these claims. While granting that workers choose to work in sweatshops, they deny that their choices are truly voluntary (Arnold & Bowie 2003; Kates 2015). Given their low wages, this suggests that sweatshop workers are wrongfully exploited (Faraci 2019). Moreover, some argue, firms can and should do more for sweatshop workers, on grounds on fairness or beneficence (Snyder 2010). These writers invoke a principle of “interaction,” according to which people involved in a certain relationship (of the sort sweatshop owners and workers are engaged in) must live up to certain standards of conduct (which exploitation is alleged to fall below). In response to the claim that firms put themselves at a competitive disadvantage if they do, writers have pointed to actual cases where firms have been able to secure better treatment for sweatshop workers without suffering serious financial penalties (Hartman, Arnold, & Wokutch 2003). (For further discussion, see the entry on exploitation.)
6.3 Meaningful work
Smith (1776 ) famously observed that a detailed division of labor greatly increases the productivity of manufacturing processes. To use his example: if one worker performs all of the tasks required to make a pin himself—18, we are told—he can make just a few pins per day. However, if the worker specializes in one or two of these tasks, and combines his efforts with other workers who specialize in one or two of the other tasks, then together they can make thousands of pins per day. But according to Smith, there is human cost to the detailed division of labor. Performing one or two simple tasks all day makes a worker “as stupid and ignorant as it is possible for a human creature to become” (Smith 1776 : V.1.178).
To avoid this result, some call for work to be made more “meaningful”. In this sense, a call for meaningful work is not a call for work to be more “important”, i.e., to contribute to the production of a good or service that is objectively valuable, or that workers believe is valuable (cf. Michaelson 2021; Veltman 2016). Instead, it is a call for labor processes to be arranged so that work is interesting, requires skill, and gives workers substantial decision-making power (Arneson 1987; Roessler 2012; Schwartz 1982).
Smith’s insight that labor processes are more efficient when they are divided into meaningless segments leads some writers to believe that, in a competitive economy, firms will not provide as much meaningful work as workers want (Werhane 1985). In response, it has been argued that there is a market for labor, and if workers want meaningful work, then employers have an incentive to provide it (Maitland 1989; Nozick 1974). According to this argument, insofar as we see “too little” meaningful work on offer, this is because workers prefer not to have it—or more precisely, because workers are willing to trade meaningfulness for other benefits, such as higher wages.
The above argument treats meaningful work as a matter of preference, as a job amenity that employers can decline to offer or that workers can trade away (cf. Yeoman 2014). Others resist this understanding. According to Schwartz (1982), employers are required to offer employees meaningful work, and employees are required to perform it, out of respect for autonomy (see also Bowie 2017). The idea is that the autonomous person makes choices for herself; she does not mindlessly follow others’ directions. A difficulty for this argument is that respect for autonomy does not seem to require that we make all choices for ourselves. A person might, it seems, autonomously choose to allow important decisions to be made for her in certain spheres of her life, e.g., by a coach, a family member, a medical professional, or a military commander.
A potential problem for this response brings us back to Smith, and to “formative” arguments for meaningful work. The problem, according to some writers, is that if most of a person’s day is given over to meaningless tasks, then her capacity for autonomous choice, and perhaps her other intellectual faculties, may deteriorate. A call for meaningful work may be understood as a call for workplaces to be arranged so that this deterioration does not occur (Arneson 2009; Arnold 2012; Yeoman 2014). In addition to Smith, Marx (1844 ) was concerned about the effects of work on human flourishing.
Formative arguments face at least two difficulties, one empirical and one normative. The empirical difficulty is establishing the connection between meaningless work and autonomous choice (or another intellectual faculty). More evidence is needed. The normative difficulty is that formative arguments make certain assumptions about the nature of the good and the state’s role in promoting it. They assume that it is better for people to have fully developed faculties of autonomous choice (etc.) and that the state should help to develop them. These assumptions might be challenged, e.g., by liberal neutralists (Roessler 2012; Veltman 2016). Yeoman (2014) seeks to surmount this challenge—and make meaningful work safe for liberal political theory—by conceptualizing meaningful work as a fundamental human need, not a mere preference.
Suppose you discover, as Tyler Shultz did at Theranos in 2015, that your firm is deceiving regulators and investors about the efficacy of its products. To stop this, one thing you might do is “blow the whistle” by disclosing this information to a third party. While scholars give different definitions of whistleblowing (see, e.g., Brenkert 2010; Davis 2003; DeGeorge 2009; Delmas 2015), the following elements are usually present: (1) insider status, (2) non-public information, (3) illegal or immoral activity, (4) avoidance of the usual chain of command in the firm, (5) intention to solve the problem. In the above example, Shultz was a whistleblower because he was (1) a Theranos employee (2) who disclosed non-public information (3) about illegal activity in the firm (4) to a state regulator (5) in an effort to stop that activity.
Debate about whistleblowing tends to focus on the question of when whistleblowing is justified—in the sense of when it is permissible, or when it is required. This debate assumes that whistleblowing requires justification, or is wrong, other things equal. Many business ethicists make this assumption on the grounds that employees have a pro tanto duty of loyalty to their firms (Elegido 2013). Against this, some argue that the relationship between the firm and the employee is purely transactional—an exchange of money for labor (Duska 2000)—and so is not normatively robust enough to ground a duty of loyalty. (For a discussion of this issue, see the entry on loyalty.)
One prominent justification of whistleblowing is due to DeGeorge (2009). According to him, it is permissible for an employee to blow the whistle when his doing so will prevent harm to society. (In a similar account, Brenkert  says that the duty to blow the whistle derives from a duty to prevent wrongdoing.) The duty to prevent harm can have more weight, if the harm is great enough, than the duty of loyalty. To determine whether whistleblowing is not simply permissible but required, DeGeorge says, we must take into account the likely success of the whistleblowing and its effects on the whistleblower himself. Humans are tribal creatures, and whistleblowers are often treated badly by their colleagues. (Shultz and his family were hounded by Theranos’s powerful and well-connected lawyers, at a cost to them of hundreds of thousands of dollars.) So if whistleblowing is unlikely to succeed, then it need not be attempted. The lack of a moral requirement to blow the whistle in these cases can be seen as a specific instance of the rule that individuals need not make huge personal sacrifices to promote others’ interests, even when those interests are important.
Another account of whistleblowing is given by Davis (2003). Like Brenkert (and unlike DeGeorge), Davis focuses on the wrongdoing that the firm engages in (not the harm it causes). According to Davis, however, the point of whistleblowing is not so much to prevent the wrongdoing but to avoid one’s own complicity in it. He says that an employee is required to blow the whistle on her firm when she believes that it is engaged in seriously wrongful behavior, and her work for the firm “will contribute … to the wrong if … [she] [does] not publicly reveal what [she knows]” (2003: 550). Davis’s account limits whistleblowers to people who are currently firm insiders. Many find this counterintuitive, since it implies that people often described as whistleblowers, like Jeffrey Wigand (Brown & Williamson) and Edward Snowden (NSA), are not actually whistleblowers.
7. The firm in society
Business activity and business entities have an enormous impact on society. One way that businesses impact society, of course, is by producing goods and services and by providing jobs. But businesses can also impact society by trying to solve social problems and by using their resources to influence governments’ laws and regulations.
7.1 Corporate social responsibility
“Corporate social responsibility”, or CSR, is typically understood as actions by businesses that are (i) not legally required, and (ii) intended to benefit parties other than the corporation (where benefits to the corporation are understood in terms of return on equity, return on assets, or some other measure of financial performance). The parties who benefit may be more or less closely associated with the firm itself; they may be the firm’s own employees or people in distant lands.
A famous example of CSR involves the pharmaceutical company Merck. In the late 1970s, Merck was developing a drug to treat parasites in livestock, and it was discovered that a version of the drug might be used treat Onchocerciasis, or river blindness, a disease that causes debilitating itching, pain, and eventually blindness in people. The problem was that the drug would cost hundreds of millions of dollars to develop, and would generate little or no revenue for Merck, since the people usually afflicted with river blindness were too poor to afford it. Ultimately Merck decided to develop the drug. As expected, it was effective in treating river blindness, but Merck made no money from it. As of this writing in 2021, Merck, now in concert with several nongovernmental organizations, continues to manufacture and distribute the drug throughout the developing world for free.
The scholarly literature on CSR is dominated by social scientists. Their question is typically whether, when, and how socially responsible actions benefit firms financially. The conventional wisdom is that there is a slight positive correlation between corporate social performance and corporate financial performance, but it is unclear which way the causality goes (Vogel 2005; Zhao & Murrell 2021). That is, it is not clear whether prosocial behavior by firms causes them to be rewarded financially (e.g., by consumers who value their behavior), or whether financial success allows firms to engage in more prosocial behaviors (e.g., by freeing up resources that would otherwise be spent on core business functions).
Many writers connect the debate about CSR with the debate about the ends of corporate governance. Thus Friedman (1970) objects to CSR, saying that managers should be maximizing shareholder wealth instead. (Friedman also thinks that CSR is a usurpation of the democratic process and often wasteful, since managers aren’t experts in solving social problems.) Stakeholder theory (Freeman et al. 2010) is thought to be more accommodating of prosocial activity by firms, since it permits firms to do things other than increase shareholder wealth.
We do not need, however, to see the debate about CSR a debate about the proper ends of corporate governance. We can see it as a debate about the nature and scope of firms’ moral duties, i.e., what obligations (e.g., of rescue or beneficence) they must discharge, whatever their goals are (Hsieh 2004; Mejia 2020).
Many writers give broadly consequentialist reasons for CSR. The arguments tend to go as follows: (1) there are serious problems in the world, such as poverty, conflict, environmental degradation, and so on; (2) any agent with the resources and knowledge necessary to ameliorate these problems has a moral responsibility to do so, assuming the costs they incur on themselves are not excessively high; (3) firms have the resources and knowledge necessary to ameliorate these problems without incurring excessively high costs; therefore, (4) firms should ameliorate these problems (Dunfee 2006a).
The view that someone should do something about the world’s problems seems true to many people. Not only is there an opportunity to increase social welfare by alleviating suffering, suffering people may also have a right to assistance. The controversial issue is who should do something to help, and how much they should do. Thus defenders of the above argument focus most of their attention on establishing that firms have these duties, against those who say that these duties are properly assigned to states or individuals. O. O’Neill (2001) and Wettstein (2009) argue that firms are “agents of justice”, much like states and individuals, and have duties to aid the needy (see also Young 2011). Strudler (2017) legitimates altruistic behavior by firms by undermining the claim that shareholders own them, and so are owed their surplus wealth. Hsieh (2004) says that, even if we concede that firms do not have social obligations, individuals have them, and the best way for many individuals to discharge them is through the activities of firms (see also McMahon 2013; Mejia 2020).
Debates about CSR are not just debates about whether specific social ills should be addressed by specific corporations. They are also debates about what sort of society we want to live in. While acknowledging that firms benefit society through CSR, Brenkert (1992) thinks it is a mistake for people to encourage firms to engage in CSR as a practice. When we do so, he says, we cede a portion of the public sphere to private actors. Instead of deciding together how we want to ameliorate social ills affecting our fellow community members, we leave it up to private organizations to decide what to do. Instead of sharpening our skills of democracy through deliberation and collective decision-making, and reaffirming social bonds through mutual aid, we allow our skills and bonds to atrophy through disuse.
7.2 Corporate political activity
Many businesses are active participants in the political arena. They support candidates for election, defend positions in public debate, lobby government officials, and more. What should be said about these activities?
Social scientists have produced a substantial literature on corporate political activity (CPA) (for a review, see Lawton, McGuire, & Rajwani 2013). This research focuses on such questions as: What forms does CPA take? What are the antecedents of CPA? What are its consequences? CPA raises many normative questions as well.
We might begin by asking why corporations should be allowed to engage in political activity at all. In a democratic society, freedom of expression is both a right and a value (Stark 2010). People have a right to participate in the political process by supporting candidates for public office, defending positions in public debate, and so on. It is generally a good thing when they exercise this right, since they can introduce new facts and arguments into public discourse. People can engage in political activity individually, but in a large society, they may find it useful to do so in groups. The firm might be seen as one of these groups. Indeed, we might think it is especially important that firms engage in (at least some forms of) political activity. Society has an interest in knowing how proposed economic policies will affect firms; firms themselves are a good source of information.
But political activity by corporations has come in for criticism. One concern focuses on what corporations’ goals are. Some worry that firms engage in CPA in order to advance their own interests at the expense of their competitors’ or the public’s. This activity is sometimes described, and condemned, as “rent-seeking” (Jaworski 2014; Tullock 1989). Questions have been raised about the nature and value of rent-seeking. According to a common definition, rent-seeking is socially wasteful economic activity intended to secure benefits from the state rather than the market. But there is disagreement about what counts as waste. Lobbying for subsidies, or tariffs on foreign competitors, are classic cases of rent-seeking. But subsidies for (e.g.) corn might help to secure a nation’s food supply, and tariffs on (e.g.) foreign steel manufacturers might help a nation to protect itself in a time of war (Boatright 2009; Hindmoor 1999). One person’s private rent-seeking is another’s public benefit.
A second concern about CPA is that it can undermine the ideal of equality at the heart of democracy (Christiano 2010). Some corporations have a lot of money, and this can be translated into a lot of power. In 2010, the state of Indiana passed a law—the Religious Freedom Restoration Act (RFRA)—that appeared to give employers the freedom to discriminate against LGBTQ people on religious grounds. In response, Salesforce and Angie’s List cancelled plans to expand in the state, and threatened to leave it altogether. Indiana quickly convened a special session of its legislature and announced that the new law did not in fact give employers this freedom. By contrast, if the average Indianan told the legislature that they might leave the state because of the RFRA, the legislature would not have cared. This objection to CPA is also an objection to political activity by powerful groups like the National Rifle Association (NRA) or the American Civil Liberties Union (ACLU) and individuals like Charles Koch or Tom Steyer.
A third objection to CPA is more narrowly targeted. According to it, corporations are not the right type of entities to engage in political activity (Hussain & Moriarty 2018). The key issue is representation. Organizations like the NRA and ACLU are legitimate participants in the political arena because they represent their members in political debate, and people join or leave them based on political considerations. By contrast, business organizations have no recognized role to play in the political system, and people join or leave them for economic reasons, not political ones. On this criticism, corporate political activity should be conceptualized not as a collective effort by all of the corporation’s members to speak their minds about a shared concern, but as an effort by a small group of powerful owners or executives to use the corporation’s resources to advance their own personal ends.
Traditionally CPA goes “through” the formal political process, e.g., contributing to political campaigns or lobbying government officials. But increasingly firms are engaging in what appears to be political activity that goes “around” or “outside” of this process, especially in circumstances in which the state is weak, corrupt, or incompetent. They do this through the provision of public goods and infrastructure (Ruggie 2004) and the creation of systems of private regulation or “soft law” (Vogel 2010). For example, when the Rana Plaza collapsed in Bangladesh in 2013, killing more than 1100 garment industry workers, new building codes and systems of enforcement were put into place. But they were put into place by the multinational corporations that are supplied by factories in Bangladesh, not by the government of Bangladesh. This kind of activity is sometimes called “political CSR,” since it is a kind of CSR that produces a political outcome (Scherer & Palazzo 2011). We might call it CPA “on steroids”. Instead of influencing political outcomes, corporations bring them about almost single-handedly. This is a threat to democratic self-rule. Some writers have explored whether it can be ameliorated through multi-stakeholder initiatives (MSIs), or governance systems that bring together firms, non-governmental organizations, and members of local communities to deliberate and decide on policy matters. Prominent examples include the Forest Stewardship Council (FSC), the Roundtable on Sustainable Palm Oil (RSPO), and the Extractive Industries Transparency Initiative (EITI) (Scherer & Palazzo 2011). Critics have charged that MSIs, while effective in producing dialog among stakeholders, are ineffective at holding firms to account (Hussain & Moriarty 2018; Moog, Spicer, & Böhm 2015).
There is another kind of corporate political activity. This is political activity whose target is corporations, known as “ethical consumerism” (for a review see Schwartz 2017). Consumers typically make choices based on quality and price. Ethical consumers (also) appeal to moral considerations. They may purchase, or choose not to purchase, goods from retailers who make their products in certain countries or who support certain political causes. These can be described as political activities because consumers are using their economic power to achieve political ends. It is difficult for consumer actions against, or in support of, firms to succeed, since they require coordinating the actions of many individuals. But consuming ethically may be important for personal integrity. You might say that you cannot in good conscience shop at a retailer who is working, in another arena, against your deeply-held values. One concern about ethical consumerism is that it may be a form of vigilantism (Hussain 2012; cf. Barry & MacDonald 2018), or mob justice. Another is that it is yet another way that people can self-segregate by moral and political orientation as opposed to finding common ground.
7.3 International business
Many businesses operate across national boundaries. These are typically called “multinational” or “transnational” firms (MNCs or TNCs). Operating internationally heightens the salience of a number of the ethical issues discussed above, such as CSR, but it also raises new issues, such as relativism and divestment. Two issues often discussed in connection with international business are not treated in this section. One is wages and working conditions in sweatshops. This literature is briefly discussed in section 6.2. The second issue is corruption, which is not discussed in this entry, for space reasons. But see the entry on corruption.
A number of business ethicists have developed ethical codes for MNCs, including DeGeorge (1993) and Donaldson (1989). International agencies have also created codes of ethics for business. Perhaps the most famous of these is the United Nations Global Compact, membership in which requires organizations to adhere to a variety of rules in the areas of human rights, labor, environment, and anti-corruption. In his important work for that body, Ruggie (2004, 2013) developed a “protect, respect, and remedy” framework for MNCs and human rights, which assigns the state the primary duty to protect human rights and remedy abuses of them, and firms the duty to respect human rights (cf. Wettstein 2009). A striking fact about much of this research is that, while it is focused on international business, and sometimes promulgated by international agencies, the conclusions reached do not apply specifically to firms doing business across national boundaries. The duty to, e.g., respect human rights applies to firms doing business within national boundaries too. It is simply that the international context is the one in which this duty seems most important to discharge, and in which firms are some of the few agents who can do so.
There are issues, however, that arise specifically for firms doing business internationally. Every introductory ethics student learns that different cultures have different moral codes. This is typically an invitation to think about whether or not morality is relative to culture. For the businessperson, it presents a more immediate challenge: How should cultural differences in moral codes be managed? In particular, when operating in a “host” country, should the businessperson adopt host country standards, or should she apply her “home” country standards?
Donaldson is a leading voice on this question, in work done independently (1989, 1996) and with Dunfee (1999). Donaldson and Dunfee argue that there are certain “moral minima” that must be met in all contexts. These are given to us by “hypernorms”, or universal moral values and rules, which are themselves justified by a “convergence of religious, philosophical, and cultural” belief systems (1999: 57). Within the boundaries set by hypernorms, Donaldson and Dunfee say, firms have “free space” to select moral standards. They do not have the liberty to select any standards they want; rather, their choices must be guided by the host country’s traditions and its current level of economic development. Donaldson and Dunfee call their approach “integrative social contracts theory” (ISCT), since they seek to merge norms derived from hypothetical contracts with norms that people have actually agreed to in particular societies.
ISCT has attracted a great deal of attention and many critics. Much of this criticism has focused on hypernorms, the criteria for which are alleged to be ad hoc (Scherer 2015), ambiguous (Brenkert 2009), and incomplete (Mayer & Cava 1995). Dunfee (2006b) collects and analyzes a decade worth of critical commentary on ISCT. For a more recent elaboration and defense of the approach, see Scholz, de los Reyes, and Smith (2019).
A complication for the debate about whether to apply home country standards in host countries is that multinational corporations engage in business across national boundaries in different ways. Some MNCs directly employ workers in multiple countries, while others contract with suppliers. Nike, for example, does not directly employ workers to make shoes. Rather, Nike designs shoes, and hires firms in other countries to make them. Our views about whether an MNC should apply home country standards in a host country may depend on whether the MNC is applying them to its own workers or to those of other firms.
The same goes for responsibility. MNCs, especially in consumer-facing industries, are often held responsible for poor working conditions in their suppliers’ factories. Nike was subject to sharp criticism for the labor practices of its suppliers in the 1990s (Hartman et al. 2003). Initially Nike pushed back, saying that those weren’t their factories, and so wasn’t their problem. Under mounting pressure, it changed course and promulgated a set of labor standards that it required all of its suppliers to meet, and now spends significant resources ensuring that they meet them (Hsieh, Toffel, & Hull 2019; Wokutch 2001). This is increasingly the approach Western multinationals take. Here again the response to the Rana Plaza tragedy is illustrative. What lengths companies should go to ensure the safety of workers in their supply chains is a question meriting further study (see Young 2011).
A businessperson may find that a host country’s standards are not just different than her home country’s standards, but morally intolerable. She may decide that the right course of action is not to do business in the country at all, and if she is invested in the country, to divest from it. The issue of divestment received substantial attention in the 1980s as MNCs were deciding whether or not to divest from South Africa under its Apartheid regime. It may attract renewed attention in the coming years as firms and other organizations contemplate divesting from the fossil fuel industry. Common reasons to divest from a morally problematic society or industry are to avoid complicity in immoral practices, and to put pressure on the society or industry to change its practices. Critics of divestment worry about the effects of divestment on innocent third parties (Donaldson 1989) and about the efficacy of divestment in forcing social change (Hudson 2005). Some believe that it is better for firms to stay engaged with the society or industry and try to bring about change from within—a policy of “constructive engagement”.
8. The status of business ethics
It is not hard to see why philosophers might be interested in business. Business activity raises a host of interesting philosophical issues: of agency, responsibility, truth, manipulation, exploitation, justice, beneficence, and more. After a surge of activity 40 years ago, however, philosophers seem to be gradually retreating from the field.
One explanation appeals to demand. Many of the philosophers who developed the field were hired into business schools, but after they retired, they were not replaced with other philosophers. Business schools have hired psychologists to understand why people engage in unethical behavior and strategists to explore whether ethics pays. These scholars fit better into the business school environment, which is dominated by social scientists. What social scientists do to advance our understanding of descriptive ethics is important, to be sure, but it is no substitute for normative reflection on what is ethical or unethical in business.
Another explanation for the retreat of philosophers from business ethics appeals to supply. There are hardly any philosophy Ph.D. programs that have faculty specializing in business ethics and, as a result, few new Ph.D.’s are produced in this area. Those who work in the area are typically “converts” from mainstream ethical theory and political philosophy. Some good news on this front is the recent increase in the number of normative theorists working on issues at the intersection of philosophy, politics, and economics (PPE). Many of the topics these scholars address—the value and limits of markets, the nature of the employment relationship, and the role of government in regulating commerce—are issues business ethicists care about. But PPE-style philosophers hardly cover the whole field of business ethics. There remain many urgent issues to address.
I hope this entry helps to inform philosophers and others about the richness and value of business ethics, and in doing so, generate greater interest in the field.
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How to cite this entry. Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society. Look up topics and thinkers related to this entry at the Internet Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO). Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.
Other Internet Resources
- Marcoux, Alexei, “Business Ethics”, The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Fall 2016 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.), URL = <https://plato.stanford.edu/archives/fall2016/entries/ethics-business/>. [This was the previous entry on business ethics in the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy — see the version history.]
- A History of Business Ethics, by Richard T. De George (University of Kansas), an important early contributor to the field.
- Society for Business Ethics, the main professional society for business ethicists, especially of the normative variety.
For helpful suggestions on this entry (and the previous version), I thank Dorothea Baur, George Brenkert, Jason Brennan, Matt Caulfield, David Dick, Anca Gheaus, Keith Hankins, Edwin Hartman, Laura Hartman, Lisa Herzog, David Jacobs, Woon Hyuk Jay Jang, Peter Jaworski, Xavier Landes, Chris MacDonald, Emilio Marti, Dominic Martin, Pierre-Yves Néron, Eric Orts, Katinka Quintelier, Sareh Pouryousefi, Amy Sepinwall, Kenneth Silver, Abraham Singer, Alejo José G. Sison, Cindy Stark, Chris Surprenant, Kevin Vallier, and Hasko von Kriegstein.