The Ethics of Manipulation
Consider this case: Tonya plans to do Y, but Irving wants her to do X instead. Irving has tried unsuccessfully to provide Tonya with reasons for doing X rather than Y. If Irving is unwilling to resort to coercion or force, he might deploy any of the following tactics to try to influence Tonya’s choice. For example, Irving might …
- Charm Tonya into wanting to please Irving by doing X.
- Exaggerate the advantages of doing X and the disadvantages of doing Y, and/or understate the disadvantages of doing X and the advantages of doing Y.
- Make Tonya feel guilty for preferring to do Y.
- Induce Tonya into an emotional state that makes doing X seem more appropriate than it really is.
- Point out that doing Y will make Tonya seem less worthy and appealing to her friends.
- Make Tonya feel badly about herself and portray Y as a choice that will confirm or exacerbate this feeling, and/or portray X as a choice that will disconfirm or combat it.
- Do a small favor for Tonya before asking her to do X, so that she feels obligated to comply.
- Make Tonya doubt her own judgment so that she will rely on Irving’s advice to do X.
- Make it clear to Tonya that if she does Y rather than X, Irving will withdraw his friendship, sulk, or become irritable and generally unpleasant.
- Focus Tonya’s attention on some aspect of doing Y that Tonya fears and ramp up that fear to get her to change her mind about doing Y.
Each of these tactics could reasonably be called manipulation. Many also have more specific, commonplace names, such as “guilt trip” (tactic 3), “gaslighting” (tactic 8), “peer pressure” (tactic 5), “negging” (tactic 6), and “emotional blackmail” (tactic 9). Perhaps not everyone will agree that every tactic on this list is properly described as manipulation. And in some cases, whether the tactic seems manipulative may depend on various details not specified in the case as described. For example, if Y is seriously immoral, then perhaps it is not manipulative for Irving to induce Tonya to feel guilty about planning to do Y. It is also possible that we might revise our judgments about some of these tactics in light of a fully worked out and well supported theory of manipulation—if we had one. Nevertheless, this list should provide a reasonably good sense of what we mean by “manipulation” in ordinary discourse. It should also serve to illustrate the wide variety of tactics commonly described as manipulation.
Manipulation is often characterized as a form of influence that is neither coercion nor rational persuasion. But this characterization immediately raises the question: Is every form of influence that is neither coercion nor rational persuasion a form of manipulation? If manipulation does not occupy the entire logical space of influences that are neither rational persuasion nor coercion, then what distinguishes it from other forms of influence that are neither coercion nor rational persuasion?
The term “manipulation” is commonly thought to include an element of moral disapprobation: To say that Irving manipulated Tonya is commonly taken to be a moral criticism of Irving’s behavior. Is manipulation always immoral? Why is manipulation immoral (when it is immoral)? If manipulation is not always immoral, then what determines when it is immoral?
- 1. Preliminaries
- 2. Answering the Identification Question
- 3. Answering the Evaluation Question
- 4. Further Issues
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- Related Entries
1.1 Ordinary versus Global Manipulation
Forms of influence like those listed above are commonplace in ordinary life. This distinguishes them from forms of influence described as “manipulation” in the free will literature. There, the term “manipulation” typically refers to radical programming or reprogramming of all or most of an agent’s beliefs, desires, and other mental states. Such global manipulation (as we might call it) is also typically imagined as happening via decidedly extra-ordinary methods, such as supernatural intervention, direct neurological engineering, or radical programs of indoctrination and psychological conditioning. Global manipulation is typically thought to deprive its victim of free will. This common intuition drives the “manipulation argument”, which seeks to defend incompatibilism by claiming that living in a deterministic universe is analogous to having been the victim of global manipulation. (For a detailed discussion of this argument, see the discussion of manipulation arguments in the entry on arguments for incompatibilism.)
Despite the differences between what we might call “ordinary manipulation” and the forms of manipulation in the free will literature, it is still worth wondering about the relationship between them. If global manipulation completely deprives its victim of free will or autonomy, might more ordinary forms of manipulation do something similar, but on a more limited scale? If Tonya succumbs to one of Irving’s tactics, should we regard her as being less free—and perhaps less responsible—for doing X? So far, few people have explored the connections between ordinary manipulation and the forms of global manipulation discussed in the free will literature. (Two exceptions are Long 2014 and Todd 2013).
1.2 Applications of a Theory of Ordinary Manipulation
Until recently, ordinary manipulation has seldom been the subject of philosophical inquiry in its own right. However, the fact that it is commonly thought to undermine the validity of consent has led to its frequent mention in areas where the validity of consent is at issue.
One such area is medical ethics, where proposed conditions for autonomous informed consent often reference the need to ensure that consent is not manipulated. In fact, one of the earliest sustained philosophical discussions of manipulation appears in Ruth Faden, Tom Beauchamp, and Nancy King’s influential book, A History and Theory of Informed Consent (1986). The view that manipulation undermines the validity of consent is widely held among medical ethicists. However, there is far less agreement about how to determine whether a given form of influence is manipulative. Nowhere is this lack of agreement more apparent than in recent discussions of “nudges”.
The concept of a nudge was introduced by Cass Sunstein and Richard Thaler to refer to the deliberate introduction of subtle, non-coercive influences into people’s decision-making to get them to make more optimal choices (Thaler & Sunstein 2009; Sunstein 2014). Some nudges merely provide better and more comprehensible information; these nudges might seem best characterized as influences that improve the quality of rational deliberation. However, even with “purely” informational nudges, one might worry that the selection of which information is presented could be manipulative; perhaps providing nutrition information on food packaging nudges people to make food choices based on health considerations rather than taste, for instance. More pressing concerns arise with nudges that operate by psychological mechanisms whose relationship to rational deliberation is questionable at best. Many of these nudges exploit heuristics, reasoning and decision-making biases, and other psychological processes that operate outside of conscious awareness. For example, some evidence suggests that patients are more likely to choose an operation if they are told that it has a 90% survival rate rather than a 10% fatality rate. Would it be manipulative for a surgeon to exploit this framing effect to nudge the patient into making the decision that the surgeon thinks best? Is it manipulative for a cafeteria manager to place healthier food items at eye level to nudge customers into choosing them? The question of whether and when nudges manipulate has sparked a lively debate.
Some defenders of nudges suggest that because it is often impossible to frame a decision without pointing the decision-maker in some direction, there is nothing manipulative about framing such decisions in one way rather than another. For example, physicians must provide outcome information either in terms of fatality rate or survival rate (and if they give both, they must give one first), and cafeteria managers must choose something to put at eye level in the displays. This being the case, why think that deliberately choosing one way of framing the decision over another is manipulative? Some defenders of nudges suggest that in cases where it is inevitable to introduce a non-rational influence into decision-making, deliberately doing so is not manipulative. But there are reasons to be wary of this line of thought. Suppose that Jones is traveling to a job interview on a subway car so crowded that it is inevitable that he will bump up against his fellow passengers. Suppose that he capitalizes on this fact to deliberately bump his rival job candidate (who is on the same subway car) out the door just as it closes, thus ensuring that he will be late for his interview. Clearly the fact that it was inevitable that Jones’s rival would be subjected to some bumping does not excuse Jones for intentionally bumping his rival out the door. Similarly, even if we inevitably introduce non-rational influences into each other’s decision-making, that fact seems insufficient to prove that such influences can never be manipulative. No doubt this analogy is imperfect, but it should suffice to call into question the assumption that a deliberate nudge is not manipulative simply because some nudging is inevitable. (For a similar argument, see Douglass 2022.)
More nuanced discussions of whether nudges manipulate tend to focus less on the inevitability of nudging in some direction or another, and more on the mechanisms by which the nudging occurs, and the direction in which it pushes the person being nudged. Although there is wide agreement that some nudges can be manipulative, so far no consensus has emerged about which nudges are manipulative or how to distinguish manipulative from non-manipulative nudges. (For a sample of approaches to the question of whether and when nudges manipulate, see Blumenthal-Barby 2012; Blumenthal-Barby & Burroughs 2012; Saghai 2013; Wilkinson 2013; Hanna 2015; Moles 2015; and Nys & Engelen 2017. For arguments that nudges can be sometimes morally justified even when they are manipulative, see Wilkinson 2017 and Nys & Engelen 2017).
Questions about the legitimacy of nudges go beyond the medical context. Thaler and Sunstein advocate their use by government, employers, and other institutions besides the health care industry. The use of nudges by government raises additional concerns, especially about the paternalism behind them (Arneson 2015; White 2013). Questions about other forms of manipulation in the political sphere have also been raised by philosophers and political theorists. The idea that political leaders might gain, retain, or consolidate political power by means that we would now call manipulative can be traced back at least as far back as ancient Greek figures like Callicles and Thrasymachus. Niccolo Machiavelli not only details but recommends political tactics that we would likely regard as manipulative. More recent philosophical work on political manipulation includes Robert Goodin’s 1980 book on Manipulatory Politics and Claudia Mills’s important paper, “Politics and Manipulation” (1995), as well as Dowding (2016), Riker (1986), Ware (1981), Gorton (2016), Whitfield (2020), and the papers collected in (Le Cheminant and Parrish 2011); for an overview of this literature, see Noggle (2021).
In the field of business ethics, much philosophical attention has been focused on the question of whether advertising is manipulative. The economist John Kenneth Galbraith famously called advertising “the manipulation of consumer desire” and compared being the target of advertising with being
assailed by demons which instilled in him a passion sometimes for silk shirts, sometimes for kitchenware, sometimes for chamber pots, and sometimes for orange squash. (Galbraith 1958)
Several philosophers have made similar criticisms of advertising. Often, these criticisms are limited to forms of advertising that do not simply convey accurate factual information. As is the case with purely informational nudges, the presentation of accurate information in advertising might not be manipulative in and of itself, though perhaps the selection of which information is presented might be manipulative. Be that as it may, most advertising attempts to influence consumer behavior by means other than or in addition to purely providing accurate information. Such non-informational advertising is the most apt target for worries about manipulation. Tom Beauchamp and Roger Crisp have made influential arguments that such advertising can be manipulative (Beauchamp 1984; Crisp 1987). Similar criticisms claim that non-informational advertising can subvert autonomy or improperly tamper with consumers’ desires (e.g., Santilli 1983). Such critiques are either versions of or close relatives to critiques of advertising as manipulation. On the other side, Robert Arrington argues that, as a matter of fact, advertising very seldom manipulates its audience or undermines its audience’s autonomy (Arrington 1982). Michael Phillips has marshalled a large body of empirical evidence to argue that while some advertising is manipulative, its critics vastly overestimate its power to influence consumers (Phillips 1997).
1.3 Two Questions about Manipulation
As will be apparent from our discussion so far, two main questions need to be answered by any satisfactory theory of manipulation.
One question—call it the identification question—concerns definition and identification: How can we identify which forms of influence are manipulative and which are not? A satisfactory answer would presumably involve a general definition of manipulation, which explains what the diverse forms of manipulative influence have in common. In addition to illuminating how the various instances of manipulation are manifestations of a single more basic phenomenon, an answer to the identification question should also provide criteria for determining whether a given instance of influence is manipulative. Such an analysis might, of course, show that some of the phenomena that we were pre-theoretically inclined to count as manipulation are relevantly different from clear cases of manipulation, so that we might be led to revise our usage of the term “manipulation.”
A second question—call it the evaluation question—concerns morality: How should we evaluate the moral status of manipulation? A satisfactory answer to this question should tell us whether manipulation is always immoral. And if manipulation is not always immoral, it should tell us how to determine when manipulation is immoral. But more importantly, a satisfactory answer to the evaluation question should explain why manipulation is immoral when it is immoral. What feature of manipulation makes it immoral in those situations when it is immoral?
Although the identification and evaluation questions are distinct, they are not entirely independent. Any analysis of why manipulation is immoral (when it is immoral) will presuppose some account of what manipulation is. Thus, our answer to the identification question will constrain our answer to the evaluation question. But an answer to the identification question might do more than constrain our answer to the evaluation question: it might also guide it. If an account of manipulation identifies its underlying characteristic as being relevantly similar to some other thing that we have independent grounds for regarding as morally wrong, then we would likely want to argue that manipulation is wrong for similar reasons. Finally, we might need to adjust our answers to one or both questions if they together imply implausible consequences. For example, if we define manipulation as every form of influence besides rational persuasion or coercion, and then claim that the wrongness of manipulation is absolute, we will be forced to conclude that no form of influence besides rational persuasion is ever morally legitimate. This is a radical conclusion that few would be willing to accept, but it is a conclusion that results from combining a certain answer to the identification question with a certain answer to the evaluation question.
2. Answering the Identification Question
A number of accounts of manipulation have been put forward. They can be grouped roughly into three main categories: those that characterize manipulation as an influence that bypasses reason; those that treat it as a form of trickery, and those that treat it as a form of pressure. These are rough categories, and a single theory might fit into more than one of them. But they are useful groupings nonetheless.
2.1 Manipulation as Bypassing Reason
Manipulation is often said to “bypass” the target’s rational deliberation. It is not always clear, however, whether this claim is meant as a definition of manipulation or merely as a statement about manipulation (perhaps one that partly explains its moral status). But let us consider whether the idea that manipulation bypasses reason can serve as a definition of manipulation.
The thought that manipulative influences bypass the target’s capacity for rational deliberation is appealing for at least two reasons. First, it seems reasonable to think that because manipulation differs from rational persuasion, it must influence behavior by means that do not engage the target’s rational capacities. Second, it seems intuitive to describe forms of influence that do clearly bypass the target’s capacity for rational deliberation as manipulative. For example, suppose that subliminal advertising worked in the way that it is commonly—though probably inaccurately—portrayed, so that being exposed to a subliminal message urging you to “Drink Coke” could influence your behavior without engaging your mechanisms of rational deliberation. Intuitively such an influence would seem to be a clear case of manipulation.
Subliminal advertising tactics—along with hypnosis and behavioral conditioning—are commonly portrayed as effective methods to influence others without their knowledge and thus without engaging their capacities for rational deliberation. The effectiveness of such tactics is almost certainly wildly exaggerated in the popular (and sometimes philosophical) imagination. However, if we imagine them working as well as they are sometimes portrayed, then they would constitute clear examples of what it might mean to say that manipulation bypasses reason. Thus, we might understand manipulation in terms of bypassing rational deliberation, and understand “bypassing rational deliberation” in terms of exploiting psychological mechanisms or techniques that can generate behavior without any input from rational deliberation.
Another way that manipulation might bypass rational deliberation would be for it to appeal to non-conscious motivations. Eric Cave explores this idea in a pair of papers (Cave 2007, 2014) on what he calls “motive manipulation.” Cave distinguishes between “concerns,” which are conscious pro-attitudes, and unconscious “non-concern motives.” He then defines motive manipulation as influence that operates by engaging unconscious non-concern motives. This theory clearly implies that appeals to non-conscious motives, as well as influences that operate via “quasi-hypnotic techniques” and “crude behavioral conditioning” are manipulative (Cave 2014: 188). Although Cave himself does not claim that all forms of manipulation are of this sort (Cave 2007: 130), would such a claim be plausible? Or could we add the appeal to non-conscious motives to the list of psychological mechanisms that bypass reason, and define manipulation in terms of exploiting such mechanisms?
Unfortunately, this approach faces a serious problem. If we define manipulation in terms of bypassing rational deliberation, and then use the appeal to unconscious motives and exaggerated portrayals of hypnosis and subliminal advertising to illustrate what it means to bypass rational deliberation, we will set a very high bar for something to count as manipulation. This bar would be too high to count any of Irving’s tactics as manipulation, since none of them completely bypasses Tonya’s capacity for rational deliberation in the way that subliminal advertising, hypnosis, conditioning, or the appeal to unconscious motives would appear to do.
Perhaps a more promising account of what it might mean for manipulation to bypass reason would construe manipulation as an influence that is covert in a way that allows it to bypass reason. Certainly, if an influence is covert and thus escapes one’s notice, then it would also seem to escape any conscious reasoning process. An early version of the idea that manipulation is best characterized as covert influence was suggested by the political theorist Alan Ware (1981). Ware characterizes manipulation as an influence on the target which is covert in the sense that the target lacks knowledge or understanding of how she is being influenced.
A more recent version of this view was put forward by Daniel Susser, Beate Roessler, and Helen Nissenbaum, who write that: “manipulation is hidden influence. … Covertly influencing someone—imposing a hidden influence—means influencing them in a way they aren’t consciously aware of, and in a way they couldn’t easily become aware of” (Susser et al., 2019: 4). Alan Strudler suggests that “a sufficient even though not exhaustive characterization of manipulation” is that it involves changing a person’s behavior “through a chain of events that has the desired effect only because the person is unaware of that chain” (Strudler 2005: 459).
This sort of view works well with influences like subliminal advertising. But it would also appear to apply to other sorts of psychological influences that bypass conscious attention, such as priming effects and the decision-making biases and other processes that involve unconscious, fast processing made famous by the work of Daniel Kahneman, Amos Tversky, and colleagues (see Kahneman 2013 for an overview). However, it faces obstacles in dealing with other clear cases of manipulation. Many manipulative influences, such as peer pressure, nagging, emotional appeals, guilt trips, do not appear to be hidden influences. Indeed, it is difficult not to be aware of an attempted influence when that influence takes the form of nagging, peer pressure, or a guilt trip.
Perhaps, though, it is not the influence itself that must be covert in order for it to bypass reason in the relevant sense. Perhaps it is sufficient that the intent behind it must be covert. On this view, the influence itself may not bypass conscious attention. Yet it might still be the case that the covertness of the intent behind it renders it less likely to trigger rational scrutiny by the target. Even if I am aware of the attempt to influence me, if I am unaware of your true intentions, I might fail to engage in rational deliberation about whether I should try to resist your influence.
Such a view is defended by Radim Belohrad (2019), who claims that
In manipulation, the influencer is keen to create an impression that her motives are very different from what she projects. … The manipulator always projects intentions that differ from her real intentions. (2019: 457–459)
Along similar lines, Gregory Whitfield (2020) claims that
An act of manipulation is any intentional attempt by an agent (A) to cause another agent (B) to will/prefer/intend/act other than what A takes B’s will, preference or intention to be, where A does so utilizing methods that obscure and render deniable A’s intentions vis-à-vis B (2020: 11).
It is certainly true that manipulators often keep their true intentions hidden. Iago wants Othello to think that he intends to be his friend, rather than the agent of his destruction. Exaggerating the benefits of doing what the manipulator wants, while understating the advantages of other options (tactic 2 on our list) probably works best, if at all, if the target falsely believes that the manipulator intends to provide objective advice. However, there are other examples of manipulation where the intent does not seem to be hidden. The intent of a teenager nagging for a new cellphone is quite transparent—to get the parent to provide the new phone. Similarly, when adolescents engage in peer pressure to get a fellow to smoke, their intention—to get the target to smoke—is quite transparent. Targets of guilt trips often—perhaps typically—know exactly what the guilt tripper intends to get the target to do. Perhaps anticipating these worries, Whitfield allows manipulation to occur when the manipulator has merely achieved “plausible deniability” about his true intentions. It is not entirely clear, though, whether this feature allows the theory to escape the problem of forms of manipulation like nagging and peer pressure. It is certainly not obvious that such tactics only work, or only count as manipulation, if their users can plausibly deny their intentions.
Perhaps we might characterize manipulation not in terms of bypassing deliberation altogether, but in terms of bypassing rational deliberation, that is, by introducing non-rational influences into the deliberative process. Thus, we might follow Joseph Raz in claiming that
manipulation, unlike coercion, does not interfere with a person’s options. Instead it perverts the way that person reaches decisions, forms preference, or adopts goals. (Raz 1988: 377)
Treating manipulation as bypassing rational deliberation, and then characterizing “bypassing rational deliberation” in terms of introducing non-rational influences into deliberation, would cohere nicely with the observation that manipulation is a contrary of rational persuasion.
Despite its appeal, this approach faces a significant challenge: Many forms of non-rational influence do not seem to be manipulative. For example, graphic portrayals of the dangers of smoking or texting while driving are not obviously manipulative even when they impart no new information to the target (Blumenthal-Barby 2012). In addition, moral persuasion often involves non-rational influence. Appeals to the Golden Rule invite the interlocutor to imagine how it would feel to be on the receiving end of the action under consideration. It is difficult to believe that all such appeals are inherently manipulative, even when they appeal more to the feelings than to facts (of which the interlocutor may already be aware). Finally, consider something as innocuous as dressing up before going on a date or an interview. Presumably, the purpose of such “impression management” is to convey a certain impression to the audience. Yet dressing up on a single occasion provides little if any rational basis for conclusions about what the well-dressed person is really like day in and day out. Thus, impression management of this sort seems to be an attempt at non-rational influence. Yet it seems odd to count it as manipulation—especially if we treat “manipulation” as having a connotation of being immoral. Of course, we might avoid this problem by defining “manipulation” in a morally neutral way, and then claiming that these forms of manipulation are not immoral, while others are. But this would merely move the problem without solving it, for now we would want to know what distinguishes immoral forms of manipulation from those that are not immoral.
Perhaps we could address this problem by defining reason more broadly, so that appeals to emotions could count as forms of rational persuasion. Such a move might be independently motivated by the rejection of what some critics regard as the hyper-cognitivist radical separation of reason from emotion. However, it is not clear that allowing emotional appeals to count as rational persuasion will get us very far in defining manipulation in terms of bypassing reason. For while we will have avoided the implausible implication that all appeals to emotion are ipso facto manipulative, we now face the question of which appeals to emotion are manipulative and which are not. And that is close to the very question that the idea of bypassing reason was supposed to help us answer.
Thus, despite the plausibility of the claim that manipulation bypasses the target’s capacities for rational deliberation, using this claim to define manipulation faces serious challenges: If we take “bypassing” very literally, then the account seems to miss many examples of genuine manipulation. But if we loosen our understanding of “bypassing reason” so that it applies to any non-rational form of influence, then it seems to count as manipulative many forms of influence that do not seem manipulative. And if we fix that problem by adopting a conception of reason according to which appeals to the emotions are not ipso facto non-rational, then we are left with the original problem of determining which appeals to the emotions are manipulative and which are not. Perhaps there is a way to characterize “bypassing reason” that can undergird a plausible definition of manipulation in terms of bypassing reason. But the most obvious ways to define “bypassing reason” face serious problems.
Nevertheless, even if defining manipulation in terms of bypassing reason turns out to be a dead end, it is still possible that manipulation really does bypass reason in some sense. But it may turn out that we need an independent definition of manipulation before we can determine in what sense manipulation bypasses reason. Some writers, such as Cass Sunstein and Jason Hanna, seem to have such an approach in mind when they initially characterize manipulation in terms of bypassing or subverting reason, but then go on to gloss “bypassing or subverting” in terms of some other account of manipulation (Sunstein 2016: 82–89; Hanna 2015).
However, a recent argument by Moti Gorin raises questions for the claim that manipulation bypasses reason—even when that claim is not being used to define what manipulation is (Gorin 2014a). Gorin argues that manipulation can occur even when the target is offered only good reasons. His argument turns largely on examples like this: James wishes for Jacques’s death, since this would enable James to inherit a large fortune. James knows that Jacques believes that (1) God exists, and that (2) if God did not exist, life would be meaningless, and he would have no reason to go on living. James provides Jacques with rational arguments against the existence of God. These arguments fully engage Jacques’s rational faculties, and consequently Jacques concludes that God does not exist. Jacques promptly commits suicide—just as Jack had hoped he would. As Gorin notes, James’s activities do not appear to have bypassed, subverted, or otherwise been detrimental to Jacques’s capacity for reason—indeed, James depended on Jacques’s ability to employ his rational faculties to draw (what James regarded as) the correct conclusion from his arguments. If we accept Gorin’s characterization of James’s actions as manipulative, then his example poses a significant challenge to the claim that manipulation always bypasses the target’s capacity for rational deliberation.
2.2 Manipulation as Trickery
A second approach to manipulation treats it as a form of trickery, and ties it conceptually to deception. The connection between manipulation and deception is a common theme in both non-philosophical and philosophical discussions of manipulation. In his 1980 book Manipulatory Politics, Robert Goodin argues that manipulation is inherently deceptive, and offers this test for whether an influence is manipulative: “1. Is the interference deceptive? 2. Is the interference contrary to the putative will of those subject to it?” (Goodin, 1980: 35). In the literature on advertising, the charge that (at least some) advertising is manipulative often rests on the claim that it creates false beliefs or misleading associations (e.g., linking the vitality of the Marlboro man to a product which causes lung cancer). Similarly, in his discussion of promises, T. M. Scanlon condemns manipulation as a means of inducing false beliefs and expectations (Scanlon 1998: 298–322). Shlomo Cohen offers a somewhat different account of the relationship between manipulation and deception, according to which the distinction lies in the methods by which the target is induced to adopt a false belief (Cohen 2018). But even on this more nuanced view, there is still a strong connection between manipulation and deception.
Other views in this family treat manipulation as a broader category of which deception is a special case. Whereas deception is the deliberate attempt to trick someone into adopting a faulty belief, these versions of the trickery account see manipulation as the deliberate attempt to trick someone into adopting any faulty mental state—belief, desire, emotion, etc.
An early example of this version of the trickery approach to manipulation can be found in a 1980 paper by Vance Kasten, who writes that
manipulation occurs when there is a difference in kind between what one intends to do and what one actually does, when that difference is traceable to another in such a way that the victim may be said to have been misled. (Kasten 1980: 54)
Although many of Kasten’s examples of misleading involve deception, he also includes examples in which manipulation involves inducing the target to have inappropriate emotions like guilt. More recently, Robert Noggle has defended a version of this more expansive approach, writing that
There are certain norms or ideals that govern beliefs, desires, and emotions. Manipulative action is the attempt to get someone’s beliefs, desires, or emotions to violate these norms, to fall short of these ideals. (Noggle 1996: 44)
The norms or ideals in question will vary by mental state: a belief falls short of its ideal if it is false; a pattern of attention falls short of its ideal if excessive attention is being paid to something less relevant for choice at hand; an emotion falls short of its ideal if it is not appropriate to the situation (Noggle 1996: 44–47).
In a similar vein, Anne Barnhill writes that
manipulation is directly influencing someone’s beliefs, desires, or emotions such that she falls short of ideals for belief, desire, or emotion in ways typically not in her self-interest or likely not in her self-interest in the present context. (Barnhill 2014: 73, emphasis original; for a similar view, see Hanna 2015)
Claudia Mills offers a theory that can be considered as either a version of, or a close relative to, the trickery account:
We might say, then, that manipulation in some way purports to be offering good reasons, when in fact it does not. A manipulator tries to change another’s beliefs and desires by offering her bad reasons, disguised as good, or faulty arguments, disguised as sound—where the manipulator himself knows these to be bad reasons and faulty arguments (Mills 1995: 100; see Benn 1967 and Gorin 2014b for somewhat similar ideas).
A similar picture of manipulation emerges from the work of the political theorist Keith Dowding (2016, 2018). Dowding does not attempt to characterize manipulation directly. Rather, he proposes ideal conditions for persuasion in a deliberative democracy—conditions that would exclude manipulation. These conditions prohibit appealing to reasons that the persuader does not accept, and appealing to emotions that the persuader does not share. These prohibitions seem to suggest a characterization of manipulation as the attempt to influence the target by appealing to what the manipulator sees as bad reasons or inappropriate emotions. This picture of manipulation is either a version of, or a close cousin to, the picture of the manipulator as trying to trick the target into making choices based on faulty beliefs or inappropriate emotions.
Thus, while all versions of the trickery view retain the connection between manipulation and deception, some extend it to include tricking the target into adopting any faulty mental state, including beliefs, desires, emotions, etc. This view might be further expanded by adopting Michael Cholbi’s observation that the phenomenon of ego depletion might induce targets of manipulation to form faulty intentions (that is, intentions that do not reflect their considered values) because their resistance to temptation has been worn down (Cholbi 2014).
The trickery view can be motivated by appeal to various examples, one especially fruitful set of which is Shakespeare’s Othello. It seems natural to describe Shakespeare’s character Iago as a manipulator. The activities in virtue of which he merits this label seem to involve various forms of trickery. For example, through insinuation, innuendo and cleverly arranging circumstances (like a strategically placed handkerchief) he tricks Othello into suspecting—and then believing—that his new bride Desdemona has been unfaithful. He then plays on Othello’s insecurities and other emotions to lead him into an irrational jealousy and rage that both overshadow his love for Desdemona and cloud his judgment about how to react. The trickery view accounts for our sense that Iago manipulates Othello by noting that Iago tricks him into adopting various faulty mental states—false beliefs, unwarranted suspicions, irrational emotions, and so on.
Proponents of the trickery view disagree over several details, most notably how to define a faulty mental state. Some proponents of the trickery view argue that manipulation occurs when the influencer attempts to induce what the influencer regards as a faulty mental state into the target’s deliberations (Mills 1995; Noggle 1996; this idea is built into Dowding’s account). Others argue that we should define manipulation in terms of the attempt to introduce an objectively faulty mental state into the target’s deliberations (Hanna 2015: 634; see also Sunstein 2016: 89). Anne Barnhill suggests that our usage of the term “manipulation” is inconsistent on the question of whose standards determine whether the influencer attempts to induce the target to adopt a faulty mental state (Barnhill 2014).
Although the trickery account has considerable appeal, it faces an important challenge: It apparently fails to count as manipulative a whole class of tactics that seem, intuitively, to be manipulative. Tactics like charm, peer pressure, and emotional blackmail (tactics 1, 5, and 9) do not seem to involve trickery. Yet it seems quite natural to regard them as examples of manipulation.
2.3 Manipulation as Pressure
A third way to characterize manipulation is to treat it as a kind of pressure to do as the influencer wishes. On this account, tactics like emotional blackmail and peer pressure are paradigm cases of manipulation, since they exert pressure on the target by imposing costs for failing to do what the manipulator wishes. One rationale for treating manipulation as a form of pressure is the observation that manipulation is neither rational persuasion nor coercion. It seems plausible, then, to suppose that there is a continuum between rational persuasion and coercion with regard to the level of pressure being exerted, with rational persuasion exerting no pressure, coercion exerting maximum pressure, and the middle region, manipulation, exerting pressure that falls short of being coercive. In this way, we might arrive at the idea that manipulation is a form of pressure that does not rise to the level of coercion.
One of the earliest philosophical accounts of manipulation, by Ruth Faden, Tom Beauchamp, and Nancy King, has this structure. They begin by contrasting using rational persuasion to convince a patient to take a medically necessary drug with simply coercing him to take it. Then they observe that
There are many in-between cases: For example, suppose the physician has made clear that he or she will be upset with the patient if the patient does not take the drug, and the patient is intimidated. Although the patient is not convinced that it is the best course to take the medication, … the patient agrees to take the drug because it appears that acceptance will foster a better relationship with the doctor… Here the patient performs the action … under a heavy measure of control by the physician’s role, authority, and indeed prescription. Unlike the first case, the patient does not find it overwhelmingly difficult to resist the physician’s proposal, but, unlike the second case, it is nonetheless awkward and difficult to resist this rather “controlling” physician. (Faden, Beauchamp, & King 1986: 258)
They claim that such “in between” cases constitute manipulation. However, they do not claim that all forms of manipulation fall into the middle region of this continuum; they also count forms of deception, indoctrination, and seduction as manipulative, and claim that
some manipulative strategies can be as controlling as coercion or as noncontrolling as persuasion; other manipulations fall somewhere between these endpoints. (Faden, Beauchamp, & King 1986: 259)
Nevertheless, the idea that at least some forms of manipulation involve pressure has been very influential.
Joel Feinberg offers a similar account of manipulation. He writes that many techniques for getting someone to act in a certain way
can be placed on a spectrum of force running from compulsion proper, at one extreme, through compulsive pressure, coercion proper, and coercive pressure, to manipulation, persuasion, enticement, and simple requests at the other extreme. The line between forcing to act and merely getting to act is drawn somewhere in the manipulation or persuasion part of the scale. (Feinberg 1989: 189)
Michael Kligman and Charles Culver offer a similar account:
The attempt to influence B’s behavior takes on a manipulative character when … A’s primary intent is no longer to convince B, in a good faith manner, that acting as desired by A would be in keeping with B’s rational assessments of outcome; [but rather] to procure or engineer the needed assent by bringing pressure to bear, in a deliberate and calculated way, on what he presume to be the manipulable features of B’s motivational system. (Kligman & Culver 1992: 186–187)
Kligman and Culver go on to distinguish this manipulative pressure from coercion by claiming that the latter, unlike the former, involves “sufficiently strong incentives … that it would be unreasonable to expect any rational person not to so act” (Kligman & Culver 1992: 187). More recently, Marcia Baron and Allen Wood have also discussed forms of manipulation that seem best characterized as forms of pressure (Baron 2003; Wood 2014).
Although we can treat the idea that manipulation consists of a form of pressure as a full-fledged theory of manipulation, most of the authors just cited hold only that some forms of manipulation consist of pressure. In particular, most agree with Faden, Beauchamp, and King, that other forms of manipulation are more akin to deception. Thus, it is somewhat artificial to speak of the pressure model as a theory meant to cover all forms of manipulation. It is more accurate to regard the pressure model as claiming that exerting non-coercive pressure is sufficient (but perhaps not necessary) for an influence to count as manipulative.
2.4 Disjunctive, Hybrid, and Other Views
Our discussion of the trickery and pressure accounts highlights a rather striking fact: If we survey the tactics that seem intuitively to be examples of manipulation, we find tactics that seem best described as forms of trickery as well as tactics that seem best described as forms of pressure. This is puzzling, since, on the face of it, trickery and pressure seem rather dissimilar. What should we make of the fact that we use the same concept—manipulation—to refer to methods of influence that seem to operate by such dissimilar mechanisms?
Several responses are possible. First, it is possible that the common usage of term “manipulation” refers to such a diverse set of phenomena that no single analysis will capture every form of influence to which the term is commonly applied. Felicia Ackerman argues that the term “manipulation” exhibits “combinatorial vagueness”: while it is connected to features like inhibition of rational deliberation, unethicalness, deceptiveness, playing upon non-rational impulses, shrewdness, pressure, etc., “no condition on the list is sufficient, … and no single condition … is even necessary” for an instance of influence to be manipulative (Ackerman 1995: 337–38).
Second, we might hold that the concept of manipulation is not vague but rather disjunctive, so that manipulation consists of either trickery or pressure. Indeed, in one of the earliest philosophical analyses of manipulation, Joel Rudinow takes this approach. Rudinow begins with the following thesis:
A attempts to manipulate S iff A attempts to influence S’s behavior by means of deception or pressure or by playing on a supposed weakness of S. (Rudinow 1978: 343)
He goes on to claim that that the use of pressure is manipulative only if the would-be manipulator directs it at some supposed weakness in his target that will render the target unable to resist it; this leads him to finalize his definition in terms of “deception or by playing upon a supposed weakness” of the target, with the second disjunct meant to cover pressure-based tactics (Rudinow 1978: 346). Several other philosophers have followed Rudinow’s disjunctive approach to defining manipulation (Tomlinson 1986; Sher 2011; Mandava & Millum 2013). Indeed, as we have noted, it is common for people who discuss manipulative pressure to claim that manipulation comes in other forms as well.
A somewhat different version of the disjunctive strategy might begin with the pressure account’s continuum pressure of between rational persuasion and coercion, but go on to add a second dimension consisting of a continuum between rational persuasion and outright lying. We might then define manipulation in terms of a two-dimensional space bounded by rational persuasion, outright lying, and coercion. A strategy like this is suggested by Sapir Handelman, although he adds a third dimension that measures the level of “control” that a given form of influence exerts (Handelman 2009).
Patricia Greenspan suggests that manipulation is a sort of hybrid between coercion and deception. She writes that
cases of manipulation seem to have a foot in both of the usual categories of intentional interference with another agent’s autonomy, coercion and deception, but partly as a result, they do not fit squarely in either category. (Greenspan 2003: 157)
Thus, we might characterize her view as a “conjunctive” theory of manipulation, according to which it contains elements of both pressure and deception. It certainly seems true that manipulators often use both pressure and deception. For example, a manipulator who employs peer pressure might also exaggerate the extent to which the target’s peers will disapprove of her if she chooses the option that the manipulator wants her not to choose. However, we can also point to relatively pure cases of manipulative pressure or manipulative trickery: Indeed, all of the items on the list above can be imagined as involving either pure pressure or pure trickery. The apparent existence of cases of manipulation that involve only deception or only pressure seems to be a problem for Greenspan’s hybrid view.
Strategies for characterizing manipulation that combine the trickery and pressure accounts are appealing because they seem to do a better job than either the trickery or pressure account alone in accounting for the wide variety of tactics that seem intuitively to count as manipulation. However, this wider coverage comes at a price. If the disjunctive approach simply puts an “or” between the trickery and pressure accounts, then it will leave unanswered the question of what, if anything, makes all forms of manipulation manifestations of the same phenomenon. Of course, it is possible that this question cannot be answered because, as a matter of fact, there are two irreducibly different forms of manipulation. But this seems like a conclusion that we should accept only reluctantly, after having made a good faith effort to determine whether there really is anything in common between pressure-based manipulation and trickery-based manipulation. (For a recent attempt to locate a common feature of manipulative pressure and manipulative trickery, see Noggle 2020).
One possible answer to this challenge might be drawn from Marcia Baron’s important paper on “Manipulativeness”, which diagnoses the underlying moral wrong in manipulation in terms of an Aristotelian vice. She suggests treating manipulativeness as the vice of excess with regard to “to what extent—and how and when and to whom and for what sorts of ends—to seek to influence others’ conduct” (Baron 2003: 48). On her view, manipulativeness is at the opposite extreme from the vice of
refraining from offering potentially helpful counsel; or refraining from trying to stop someone from doing something very dangerous, for example, from driving home from one’s house while drunk. (Baron 2003: 48)
Perhaps, then, we can understand the underlying similarity between trickery- and pressure-based manipulation as manifestations of a common vice, as different ways of going wrong with regard to how and how much we should try to influence those around us.
Although Baron’s remarks about the mind-set of the manipulator are insightful and instructive, it is unclear whether they suffice to answer the characterization question. For it is unclear whether, by themselves, they can distinguish manipulation from other forms of excess with regard to influence, such as coercion.
The idea that manipulation should be characterized at least in part by reference to the mindset of the manipulator also appears in recent work by Michael Klenk (2022). According to Klenk, the manipulator influences negligently: manipulation involves influencing someone by some method while disregarding whether that method reveals reasons for the target to do, think, or feel as the manipulator wishes (Klenk 2022: 97). While this view requires a certain mindset from the manipulator, it also has some affinities for the trickery view, inasmuch as the negligence required is negligence with regard to whether the influence tricks the target into changing how he feels, acts, or thinks for a bad reason or no reason at all. A hybrid view along these lines might allow us to integrate some of Baron’s insights about the manipulator’s mindset with a more specific characterization of the sort of influence to which that mindset leads.
3. Answering the Evaluation Question
A complete answer to the evaluation question should tell us about the sort of wrongfulness that manipulation possesses: Is it absolutely immoral, pro tanto immoral, prima facie immoral, etc.? It should also tell us when manipulation is immoral if it is not always immoral. Finally, a satisfactory answer to the evaluation question should tell us why it is immoral in cases when it is immoral.
3.1 Is Manipulation Always Wrong?
Suppose that Tonya is a captured terrorist who has hidden a bomb in the city and that her preferred course of action is to keep its location secret until it explodes. And suppose that Irving is an FBI interrogator who wants Tonya to reveal the bomb’s location before it explodes. How would this way filling in the details of the case change our moral assessment of the various ways that Irving might induce Tonya to change her mind?
One rather extreme answer would be: “not at all”. This hardline view would hold that manipulation is always morally wrong, no matter what the consequences. Inasmuch as this hardline view resembles Kant’s notorious hardline position that lying is always wrong, one might look to Kant’s ethics for considerations to support it. But just as hardly anyone accepts Kant’s hardline position against lying, the hardline view against manipulation also seems short on defenders.
A less extreme position would be that while manipulation is always pro tanto wrong, other moral considerations can sometimes outweigh the pro tanto wrongness of manipulation. Thus, we might think that manipulation is always wrong to some extent, but that countervailing moral factors might sometimes suffice to make manipulation justified on balance. What might such factors include? One obvious candidate would be consequences—for example, the fact that Irving’s successful manipulation of Tonya would save many innocent lives. Non-consequentialist factors might also be thought to be countervailing considerations: Perhaps the immorality of Tonya’s character, or the fact that she is acting on an evil desire or intention, is a countervailing factor that can outweigh the pro tanto wrongness of Irving’s manipulation. It is important to note that, on this view, the fact that an action involves manipulation is always a moral reason to avoid it, even if stronger countervailing considerations render it not wrong on balance. For example, even if Irving’s manipulation of Terrorist Tonya is not wrong on balance (e.g., because of the innocent lives that will be saved), if Irving can get Tonya to reveal the bomb’s location without manipulation (or anything else that is comparably immoral), then it would be morally better to avoid manipulating her.
By contrast, we might hold that manipulation is merely prima facie immoral. On this view, there is a presumption that manipulation is immoral, but this presumption can be defeated in some situations. When the presumption is defeated, manipulation is not wrong at all (i.e., not even pro tanto wrong). On this view, we might say that while manipulation is usually wrong, it is not wrong at all in the terrorist scenario. On this view, not only is Irving’s manipulation of Terrorist Tonya not wrong on balance, but there is not even any moral reason for him to choose a non-manipulative method of getting Tonya to reveal the bomb’s location if one is available.
A more complex—but, perhaps, ultimately more plausible—view would combine the prima facie and pro tanto approaches. Such a view would hold that manipulation is prima facie immoral, but that when it is wrong, the wrongness is pro tanto rather than absolute. On this view, there are situations in which the presumption against manipulation is defeated and manipulation is not even pro tanto wrong. Perhaps bluffing in poker is like this. But where the presumption is not defeated, the wrongness of manipulation is only pro tanto, and thus able to be outweighed by sufficiently weighty countervailing moral considerations. In such cases, even if it is not wrong on balance to manipulate, it would still be morally preferable to avoid manipulation in favor of some other, morally legitimate, form of influence. Manipulating a friend into refraining from sending a text to rekindle an abusive relationship might be an example where the pro tanto wrongness of manipulation is outweighed by other considerations. In such a case, it seems plausible to maintain that it would be morally preferable to use reason rather than manipulation to get one’s friend to see that sending the text would be a mistake, even if the facts of the situation would justify resorting to manipulation. A view along these lines has been defended by Marcia Baron (2014: 116–17). Although this view is far less absolute than the hardline view, it retains the claim that manipulation is prima facie wrong, so that there is always a presumption that it is immoral, though this presumption is sometimes defeated. It is also compatible with the idea that the term “manipulation” has built into it a connotation of moral dis-approbation.
However, the claim that manipulation is presumptively wrong might be challenged. One might argue that “manipulation” is, or at least should be, a morally neutral term without even the presumption of immorality. On this view, whether a given instance of manipulation is immoral will always depend on the facts of the situation, and the term itself includes (or should include) no presumption one way or the other. Clearly there are non-moralized notions of manipulation. When we speak of a scientist manipulating variables in an experiment, or a pilot manipulating the plane’s controls, our use of the term is devoid of any hint of moral opprobrium. In the social sciences, we can find cases of the term “manipulation” being used in a morally neutral way even when another person is the target of manipulation. For example, several papers by the evolutionary psychologist David M. Buss and colleagues use the term “manipulation” more or less as a synonym for “influence” in their discussions of how humans influence the behavior of other humans (D.M. Buss 1992; D.M. Buss et al. 1987). Of course, pointing out morally neutral usages of “manipulation” does not really settle the question of whether we should prefer a moralized or a non-moralized notion of manipulation. An argument for preferring a non-moralized notion of manipulation is provided by Allen Wood, who writes that
If we think that moral argument should proceed not merely by invoking our pro- or con- sentiments, or appealing to our unargued intuitions, but instead by identifying objective facts about a situation that give us good reasons for condemning or approving certain things, then we would generally do much better to use a non-moralized sense of words like “coercion”, “manipulation”, and “exploitation”—a sense in which these words can be used to refer to such objective facts. (Wood 2014: 19–20)
No matter how we answer the question of whether manipulation in general is absolutely immoral, prima facie immoral, pro tanto immoral, or not even presumptively immoral, there are clearly situations in which manipulation is immoral. Any complete answer to the evaluation question must explain why manipulation is immoral in those cases where it is immoral. In addition, any view that holds that manipulation is only pro tanto and/or prima facie immoral should tell us what sorts of considerations can defeat the presumption that it is immoral and/or outweigh its pro tanto immorality. Several accounts have been offered to identify the source of the moral wrongfulness of manipulation (when it is wrong).
3.2 Manipulation and Harm
Perhaps the most straightforward way to explain the wrongfulness of manipulation (when it is wrong) would point to the harm done to its targets. Manipulation is commonly used aggressively, as a way to harm the manipulator’s target, or at least to benefit the manipulator at the target’s expense. The harmfulness of manipulation seems especially salient in manipulative relationships, where manipulation may lead to subordination and even abuse. The more minor economic harm of the extraction of money from consumers might be cited as a wrong-making feature of manipulative advertising, and there has been some discussion of how manipulation might lead targets to enter into exploitative contracts. Systematic political manipulation may weaken democratic institutions and perhaps even lead to tyranny.
But not all instances of manipulation harm their victims. In fact, manipulation sometimes benefits its target. If the harm to the victim is the only wrong-making feature of manipulation, then paternalistic or beneficent manipulation could never be even pro tanto wrong. But this claim strikes most people as implausible. To see this, consider that the debate about whether paternalistic nudges are wrongfully manipulative is not settled simply by pointing out that they benefit their targets. The fact that it seems possible for an act to be wrongfully manipulative, even though it benefits (and is intended to benefit) the target, presumably explains why there are few, if any, defenses of the claim that manipulation is wrong only when and because it harms the target. Nevertheless, it seems plausible to hold that when manipulation does harm its target, this harm adds to the wrongness of the manipulative behavior.
3.3 Manipulation and Autonomy
Another natural way to account for the wrongness of manipulation would be to claim that it violates, undermines, or is otherwise antithetical to the target’s personal autonomy. Manipulation, by definition, influences decision-making by means that—unlike rational persuasion—do not seem to be autonomy-preserving. Thus, it is natural to regard it as interfering with autonomous decision-making. The idea that manipulation is wrong because it undermines autonomous choice is implicit in discussions of manipulation as a potential invalidator of consent. But even outside of discussions of autonomous consent, the claim that manipulation is immoral because it undermines autonomy is commonly made (and perhaps even more commonly assumed).
However, there are reasons for caution about tying the moral status of manipulation too tightly to its effects on autonomy. One can imagine cases where it is not obvious that manipulation undermines autonomy. One can even imagine cases where manipulation might enhance the target’s overall autonomy. For example, a teacher might manipulate a student into taking a class which ultimately enhances her autonomy by opening new career options, improving her skills of critical self-reflection, etc. We might also imagine cases where manipulation is used to support the target’s autonomous choice. Suppose that Tonya has autonomously decided to leave an abusive partner, but that she is now tempted to go back. If Irving resorts to a manipulative tactic designed to keep her from backsliding on her autonomous choice to leave her abuser, then his action might seem less like undermining Tonya’s autonomy and more like supporting it.
One might respond that these examples do not undermine the claim that manipulation is wrong when and because it undermines autonomy because these autonomy-enhancing instances of manipulation are not wrong. However, this response faces a complication: Consider the case where Irving manipulates Tonya into resisting the temptation to backslide on her resolution to leave her abusive partner. It seems plausible to say that Irving’s manipulation in this case is not wrong on balance. But it also seems plausible to say that it was nevertheless pro tanto wrong, since it seems plausible to think that it would have been morally preferable for Irving to find some non-manipulative way to help Tonya avoid backsliding. But this judgment seems inconsistent with the claim that manipulation is wrong when and because it undermines autonomy. Of course, it is open to defenders of the autonomy account of the wrongness of manipulation to bite the bullet here and deny that autonomy-enhancing manipulation is even pro tanto immoral.
Alternatively—and perhaps more plausibly—the defender of the autonomy account of the wrongness of manipulation might concede that Irving’s autonomy-enhancing manipulation of Tonya is pro tanto wrong. But she might explain this by claiming that while the manipulation is autonomy-enhancing overall, it nevertheless undermines Tonya’s autonomy in the short term. The fact that Irving’s manipulation undermines Tonya’s autonomy temporarily explains why it is pro tanto immoral—and why it would be morally better for Irving to find a non-manipulative way to help Tonya avoid backsliding. But the fact that the manipulation enhances Tonya’s autonomy overall explains why it is not immoral on balance. Of course, this strategy will not appeal to those who hold that it is wrong to undermine a person’s autonomy even when doing so enhances that same person’s overall autonomy.
A more significant threat to the link between manipulation and autonomy appears in an influential paper by Sarah Buss. She argues that “when we are obligated to refrain from manipulation or deceiving one another, this has relatively little to do with the value of autonomy” (S. Buss 2005: 208). Buss’s argument has two parts. First, she claims that manipulation does not, in fact, deprive its victim of the ability to make choices; indeed, it typically presupposes that the target will make her own choice. But if the manipulation does not take away the target’s choice, Buss maintains, it does not undermine her autonomy. (For a similar argument, see Long 2014). Second, Buss argues that it is false to claim that an autonomous agent would rationally reject being subjected to manipulative influences. To support this claim, Buss argues that manipulation and deception are “pervasive forms of human interaction which are often quite benign and even valuable” (S. Buss 2005: 224). Her most notable example is the cultivation of romantic love, which often involves—and may even require—significant amounts of behavior that is aptly described as manipulation.
Defenders of the link between autonomy and the wrongness of manipulation are not without potential replies to Buss’s intriguing argument. For one thing, it seems possible to craft a notion of autonomy according to which having false information (or other faulty mental states) or being subjected to pressure (even when it does not rise to the level of coercion) compromise a person’s autonomy. Even though false beliefs about how to achieve one’s ends may not compromise one’s authentic values or one’s powers of practical reasoning, they do seem to compromise one’s ability to achieve one’s autonomously-chosen ends, and it is plausible to regard this as a diminishment of (some form of) autonomy. Moreover, the defender of the link between autonomy and the wrongness of manipulation might simply deny that the forms of manipulation to which an autonomous agent would consent (for example, those required by romantic love) are wrongful cases of manipulation.
3.4 Manipulation and Treating Persons as Things
Several accounts of manipulation tie its moral status to the fact that it influences behavior by methods that seem analogous to how one might operate a tool or a device. On this view, manipulation involves treating the target as a device to be operated rather than an agent to be reasoned with. As Claudia Mills puts it,
a manipulator is interested in reasons not as logical justifiers but as causal levers. For the manipulator, reasons are tools, and bad reasons can work as well as, or better than, a good one. (Mills 1995: 100–101)
The point here is that a manipulator treats his target not as a fellow rational agent, for that would require giving good reasons for doing as the manipulator proposes. Instead, the manipulator treats his target as a being whose behavior is to be elicited by pressing the most effective “causal levers”.
Of course, the idea that treating a person as a mere object is immoral is a prominent feature of Kant’s account of respect for persons (see the entry on respect). Thus, it would be natural to appeal to Kantian ideas to help elaborate the idea that manipulation is wrong because of the way that it treats its target. As Thomas E. Hill writes,
The idea that one should try to reason with others rather than to manipulate them by nonrational techniques is manifest in Kant’s discussion of the duty to respect others. (Hill 1980: 96)
Although Kant’s moral philosophy is a natural place to look for the idea that the wrongfulness of manipulation derives from a failure to treat the target as a person, there are potential drawbacks to tying the account too tightly to Kant. For Kant’s notion of rational agency appears to be of the hyper-cognitive, hyper-intellectual variety. Hence, if it is unethical to fail to treat someone as that kind of rational agent, we might be pushed toward the conclusion that the only acceptable basis for human interaction is the kind of coldly intellectual rational persuasion that excludes any appeal to emotions. But as we saw earlier, there are good reasons for regarding such a conclusion as implausible.
These considerations certainly do not entail that it is hopeless to look to some notion of treating persons as things for an account of the wrongfulness of manipulation. But they do suggest that more work must be done before the claim that manipulation is wrong because it treats a person as a mere thing can be regarded as much more than a platitude.
3.5 Other Suggestions
Although harm, autonomy, and treating persons as things are the most prominent suggestions about what makes manipulation wrong when it is wrong, one can find other suggestions in the literature. For example, Marcia Baron’s virtue-theoretic account of manipulativeness suggests that we might account for what is wrong about manipulation in terms of the character of the manipulator (Baron 2003). Patricia Greenspan suggests that when manipulation is immoral, it is because it violates the terms of the relationship between the manipulator and his target—terms that will vary according to the nature of the relationship between them (Greenspan 2003). Such a view suggests—plausibly—that the moral status of a given instance of manipulation will depend at least in part on the nature of the relationship between the influencer and the target of the influence.
4. Further Issues
In addition to answering the identification and evaluation questions, a complete theory of manipulation should address several further issues.
4.1 Manipulating Persons versus Manipulating Situations
Discussions of manipulation often distinguish between cases where the manipulator influences his target directly, and cases where the manipulator influences the target’s behavior by arranging the target’s environment in ways that induce her to act one way rather than another. Consider Joel Rudinow’s example of a malingerer who manipulates a psychiatrist into admitting him to the psychiatric ward (Rudinow 1978). He does this by fooling a police officer into thinking he is about to commit suicide. The police officer brings him to the ward, reports that he is suicidal, and requests that he be admitted. Although the psychiatrist is not fooled, her hospital’s rules force her to admit the malingerer at the police officer’s request. It seems clear that the malingerer has manipulated the police officer by tricking him into adopting a faulty belief. But the psychiatrist, while not falling for the feigned suicide attempt and thus not adopting any faulty beliefs, is nevertheless induced to do what she did not want to do. Although it seems correct to say that the psychiatrist was manipulated, this form of manipulation seems different from what was done to the police officer. By feigning a suicide attempt, the malingerer has tampered with the police officer’s beliefs. But he has maneuvered the psychiatrist into admitting him, not by tampering with her psychological states, but rather by “gaming the system”, as we might say.
In his book, The Art of Political Manipulation (Riker 1986) the political scientist William Riker calls the latter form of manipulation “heresthetic,” and characterizes it as “structuring the world so you can win” (1986: ix). His focus is on political tactics like gerrymandering, poison pill amendments, and strategic voting, all of which are often described as manipulation, and all of which seem more like what Rudinow’s malingerer does to the psychiatrist than what he does to the police officer.
In a similar way, the sociologists Donald Warwick and Herbert Kelman distinguish between “environmental” and “psychic” manipulation (Warwick & Kelman 1973). Their work influenced Faden, Beauchamp, and King’s seminal philosophical account of manipulation, which makes a similar distinction (Faden, Beauchamp, & King 1986: 355–68). Anne Barnhill distinguishes between manipulation that “changes the options available to the person or changes the situation she’s in, and thereby changes her attitudes” on the one hand, and manipulation that “changes a person’s attitudes directly without changing the options available to her or the surrounding situation” on the other (Barnhill 2014: 53). Drawing a similar distinction, Claudia Mills writes
If A wants to get B to do act x, there are two general strategies that A might undertake. A might change, or propose to change, the external or objective features of B’s choice situation; or alternatively, A might try to alter certain internal or subjective features of B’s choice situation. While some writers might call both strategies manipulative, at least in certain circumstances, I prefer to reserve the label manipulation for a subset of morally problematic actions falling in the second category. (Mills 1995: 97)
Although Rudinow’s case provides a clear contrast between what we might call psychological manipulation and situational manipulation, this distinction—or at least its importance—is not always so clear. Consider tactic 9 above, where Irving threatens to withdraw his friendship if Tonya does not do as Irving wishes. Is this direct psychological manipulation, or situational manipulation? The criterion offered by Barnhill and others counts it as situational manipulation, since Irving changes Tonya’s choice situation so that doing Y and retaining Irving’s friendship is no longer an option. But how is this tactic any less of a direct interference with Tonya’s decision than if Irving had engaged in some form of deception? Why would it be more like what the malingerer does to the police officer than what he does to the psychiatrist?
This is not to deny that there is a difference between psychological and situational manipulation. Instead, it is to ask what that difference is, and why it might matter. Presumably, the distinction is meant to differentiate between tactics that affect a target’s behavior by directly tampering with her psychology and those that do not. But if this is the distinction, then it seems plausible to think that Irving’s use of emotional blackmail is at least as direct a tampering with Tonya’s psychology as, say, Iago’s dropping of the handkerchief in a location where it will trick Othello into becoming inappropriately suspicious. Yet criteria like those proposed by Mills and Barnhill seem to imply that these two forms of manipulation are on opposite sides of that distinction.
Nevertheless, there does seem something importantly different between what the malingerer in Rudinow’s example does to the police officer and what he does to the psychiatrist. But much work remains to be done to provide a well-motivated account of that difference. Such an account should not only get the intuitively right answers in cases of direct pressure (like emotional blackmail) and indirect deception (like Iago’s dropping the handkerchief), but it should also explain whether and why the distinction makes a moral difference.
4.2 Manipulation and Intent
Some views of manipulation seem to suggest, if not require, that manipulators have fairly complex intentions—such as the intention to lead the target astray—for manipulation to occur. Marcia Baron and Kate Manne offer compelling reasons to think that such requirements are too strong. Baron argues that manipulation can occur even if the manipulator only has
a combination of intent and recklessness: the aim of getting the other person do what one wants, together with recklessness in the way that one goes about reaching that goal. (Baron 2014: 103)
She goes on to argue that the manipulator need not be aware that she has that intention (Baron 2014, 101). Manne agrees; to support this claim, she offers the example of Joan, who gives extravagant gifts to relatives who pay her less attention than (she thinks) they should (Manne 2014, 225). Manne tells Joan’s story in such a way that it seems plausible to say both that Joan’s gift-giving is a manipulative attempt to make her relatives feel guilty, and that Joan does not consciously intend to make her relatives feel guilty. If Manne’s description of her example is correct, then it seems that Joan can manipulate her relatives into feeling guilty without having any conscious intention of making them feel guilty. (Later, Manne [2014, 235] goes even farther, suggesting that “people can even behave manipulatively despite consciously intending not to.”) Of course, those who hold that manipulation requires more conscious intention than Manne allows might simply deny that Joan’s behavior is manipulative. Nevertheless, the arguments offered by Baron and Manne raise important questions about the level of conscious intentionality required for an action to be manipulative.
The question of what sort of intention is required for an act to count as manipulative has practical implications for assessing the behavior of children, who sometimes behave in ways that seem aptly described as manipulative even when they are too young to have the complicated intentions that some theories of manipulation might require. Similar worries arise for assessing the behavior of people for whom manipulativeness has become a habit, or a part of their personalities. Indeed, certain personality disorders—such as borderline personality disorder and antisocial personality disorder—are often characterized by manipulativeness, as is the so-called Machiavellian personality type (Christie & Geis 1970). As professor of psychiatric nursing Len Bowers writes,
the manipulative behaviour of some personality-disordered (PD) patients is consistent and frequent. It is an integral part of their interpersonal style, a part of the very disorder itself. (Bowers 2003: 329; see also Potter 2006)
In such cases, one wonders what level of intentionality lies behind behavior that we would otherwise think of as manipulative. Even if we are inclined to regard childhood or certain personality disorders as factors that mitigate the blameworthiness of manipulative behavior, it would seem counterintuitive for a theory of manipulation to say that children and persons with personality disorders are incapable of acting manipulatively.
4.3 Manipulation, Vulnerability, and Oppression
The idea that manipulation can be a tool for the powerful to oppress the less powerful is not new, even if the term “manipulation” has not always been used to express it. Marxian notions of ideology and false consciousness as mechanisms that facilitate the exploitation of workers by capital clearly resemble the concept of manipulation as it is being used here. (Allen Wood explores some of these connections in Wood 2014.) More recently, the concept of “gas lighting” has become a common feature of feminist theorizing about how the patriarchy manipulates women into doubting their own judgments about reality. On a smaller scale, a bevy of self-help books focus on how manipulative tactics can be used to create and maintain subordination within relationships (Braiker 2004; Simon 2010; Kole 2016).
A relative lack of socio-political power is almost certainly one source of vulnerability to manipulation. But there are likely others as well. The trickery model of manipulation suggests that people who are less intellectually sophisticated are especially vulnerable to trickery and therefore to manipulation. The pressure model suggests that financial, social, and emotional desperation may make one especially vulnerable to pressures created by threats to worsen an already tenuous situation. Moreover, some forms of manipulation, like so-called “negging” (tactic 6) and gaslighting (tactic 8) may work to increase the target’s vulnerability to further manipulation.
However, it may also be true that manipulation is a tempting tool for use by the vulnerable against the powerful. As Patricia Greenspan notes,
manipulation is often recommended as a strategy particularly for women, or simply is treated as characteristic of women, at least in a world where women cannot act openly to achieve their ends. A further argument for manipulation in these cases appeals to the limits on what is possible in a position of subordination. (Greenspan 2003: 156)
Similarly, Len Bowers observes that
it is possible to interpret manipulation as a normal response to incarceration, rather than as being a pathological style of behavior,
manipulative strategies may be viewed as a low-key way of fighting back at a system which has deprived the prisoner of normal freedom. (Bowers 2003: 330)
Finally, it seems likely that one reason why children often resort to manipulative tactics is that they often lack any other (or any other equally effective) way to get what they want.
It is also worth noting that the idea that the idea that manipulation undermines autonomous choice might itself be used, somewhat paradoxically, to undermine autonomous choice, especially among the non-elite. This point is comes out forcefully in a comment by Sarah Skwire (2015, Other Internet Resources) on George Akerlof and Robert Shiller’s book, Phishing for Phools (Akerlof & Shiller 2015). Akerlof and Shiller discuss a number of advertising, sales, and marketing practices that they deem manipulative. Skwire suggests that the reason why Akerlof and Shiller call these practices manipulative is that consumers subjected to them make choices that Akerlof and Shiller think are sufficiently irrational that they would only be made under the influence of manipulation. Skwire writes that this approach to detecting manipulation demonstrates “contempt for the decisions made by people who are poorer and from a lower social class than the authors” (Skwire 2015, Other Internet Resources). In short, she suggests that Akerlof and Shiller are too quick to suspect manipulation in cases where people make different decisions from the ones they think best. Whether or not we agree with Skwire’s criticisms of Akerlof and Shiller, her point serves as a cautionary one: Even if we accept that manipulation undermines autonomous choice, we must be careful not to use that as a reason to suspect that people who make different choices from what we think are best must therefore be victims of manipulation. It would be ironic—and unjust—to use the idea that manipulation is a wrongful interference with autonomy as a weapon to delegitimize the autonomous choices of people with whom we disagree or whose situations, needs, and values we do not understand.
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Other Internet Resources
- Skwire, Sarah, 2015, “Cinnabon, Caskets, Catfood, and the Tyranny of Experts”, Bleeding Heart Libertarians (blog), November 3, 2015, accessed November 15, 2017.