The Ethics of Cultural Heritage

First published Thu Jul 12, 2018

Do members of cultural groups have special claims to own or control the products of the cultures to which they belong? Is there something morally wrong with employing artistic styles that are distinctive of a culture to which you do not belong? What is the relationship between cultural heritage and group identity? Is there a coherent and morally acceptable sense of cultural group membership in the first place? Is there a universal human heritage to which everyone has a claim? Questions such as these concern the ethics of cultural heritage (or heritage ethics, for short). This entry seeks to provide an overview of the philosophical work on topics in heritage ethics, as well as introduce readers to some of the most philosophically relevant literature from other disciplines.

Running through the specific topics discussed below is a set of common themes. One theme concerns a tension between universalism and cultural specificity. On the one hand, there is a pull towards conceiving of cultural heritage as universally valuable, grounding consequent rights or permissions for all concerning its use and ownership. On the other hand, there is a push for culturally specific rights and restrictions that recognize the special claims of particular cultural groups. A related theme concerns the distribution of power among cultural groups and the role that colonial dynamics have played in establishing current patterns of access to, and control over, cultural heritage. A third theme concerns how we understand the composition and boundaries of cultural groups, and whether any such account can avoid charges of essentialism (the idea that there is a necessary “essence” to cultural group membership). As we will see, specific controversies over cultural property, repatriation, cultural appropriation, and heritage preservation, are each shaped by these recurrent themes.

On the one hand, cultural heritage is about the past, as suggested by the ubiquitous framing of heritage ethics topics in terms of the question “Who owns the past?” But on the other hand, cultural heritage is just as much about the present and the future: about how culture is embroiled in contemporary moral controversies, and about what our cultural legacy will be.

1. What is Cultural Heritage?

Cultural heritage is a broad and nebulous concept, and discussions often assume an understanding meant to capture its heterogeneity. For instance, a representative definition reads as follows:

Heritage encompasses a broad and overarching term: “it” is something that someone or a collective considers to be worthy of being valued, preserved, catalogued, exhibited, restored, admired. (Kersel & Luke 2015: 71)

However, although a commonplace understanding of cultural heritage is assumed in many discussions, attention to these conceptual assumptions can also yield criticisms with moral and political implications. The following subsections cover some of the conceptual questions that are raised about what precisely cultural heritage is.

1.1 What is Culture?

Discussions in the literature generally assume a broad understanding of culture that is often not explicitly defined (e.g., Thompson 2003; Young 2007), but those definitions that do appear typically take the form of open-ended lists: culture is the product of human activity, particularly those things that are socially transmitted, including beliefs, practices, objects, etc. (Appiah 1994: 111–112; Scheffler 2007: 107). Culture is thus generally taken to be a descriptive term that does not carry with it the evaluative and often elitist connotations of culture as implying a certain kind of “civilization” (Appiah 1994: 111–114). This “anthropological” definition of culture is sometimes criticized as overly broad, failing to discriminate between those practices (e.g.) that are worthwhile and those that are not (Logan 2007: 37), but it remains the general touchstone in the literature. Indeed, culture is often treated as a “good” thing in the context of the cultural heritage literature, despite the fact that some cultural practices are subject to serious moral objections (Okin 1997; Brown 2005: 50–51). In any event, though this anodyne definition of culture in general may be readily accepted, defining any particular culture tends to be difficult and contentious (Scheffler 2007; Appiah 2006; Narayan 1998). Proponents of cultural preservation or integrity are often accused of making misguided assumptions about cultures as static, bounded wholes that are empirically and normatively flawed (e.g., Benhabib 2002; Mezey 2007). Indeed, these criticisms surface in many arguments concerning heritage ethics, as will be discussed in subsequent sections (see in particular 4.2.3).

1.2 What is Heritage?

At its core, the concept of ‘heritage’ is typically taken to mean the inheritance of something from the past (in the case of cultural heritage, culture; Harrison 2009: 9; Prott & O’Keefe 1992: 311). Increasing attention to the range of ways that heritage is employed and interpreted in contemporary contexts has led to an emphasis on the use of the past for present purposes as an integral aspect of the definition of heritage itself (Harrison 2013: 14; Smith 2006: 44; Ashworth, Graham, & Tunbridge 2007: 3). Recognition of this facet of heritage has opened up avenues for critique and reinterpretation of the concept of heritage (Lowenthal 1998). By making manifest how heritage is used for present purposes, we can identify tacit evaluative assumptions that may have gone unremarked upon in the past. In particular, scholars have come to distinguish between “official” and “unofficial” heritage (Harrison 2013: 14–15).

The idea of “official heritage” has been shaped in particular by Laurajane Smith’s analysis of what she calls the Authorized Heritage Discourse (Smith 2006). This is the presentation of heritage familiar to us from museums, national monuments, and other institutionally endorsed understandings of heritage, such as the UNESCO World Heritage List. “Official heritage” is thus often used by governments and cultural institutions to cultivate a sense of national or cosmopolitan identity around some aspect of the past. As Smith summarizes:

This dominant Western discourse stresses materiality, monumentality, grandiosity, time depth, aesthetics and all that is ‘good’ in history and culture. (Smith 2010: 63)

Official heritage on the global scale of UNESCO is typically presented as having a universal value that transcends local attachments (Cleere 1996; Omland 2006; Matthes 2015). According to Smith’s critique, the material focus of official heritage impedes recognition of the fact that heritage is best understood as a process of interpretation that is ongoing, in contrast with the pre-digested lists and museum displays presented by the official line.

Heritage… is a cultural process that engages with acts of remembering that work to create ways to understand and engage with the present, and the sites themselves are cultural tools that can facilitate, but are not necessarily vital for, this process. (Smith 2006: 44)

Thus, in contrast with the “top-down” nature of “official heritage”, “unofficial heritage” is characterized by the “bottom-up” ways in which individuals sort out their relationship to, and uses of, the past, which may be in tension with, or at least unrecognized by, official characterizations of heritage (Harrison 2009: 8).

Examples include local festivals that are not recognised as of interest to the state, or the heritage of migrant groups or the working class. (Harrison 2013: 16)

This critique also draws our attention to “intangible” forms of heritage, in contrast with the material focus of the traditional line, discussed further in section 2.5.

Though the distinction between official and unofficial heritage is useful both for drawing attention to how heritage is subject to constant reinterpretation and for challenging dominant historical narratives, some might be hesitant about the extent to which certain understandings of heritage that emphasize process do so at the expense of the traditional material concerns of official heritage. For instance, one might think there is something significant (aesthetically, ethically, etc.) about the kinds of old material values that official heritage tends to endorse (e.g., Korsmeyer 2016; James 2013; Saito 2007), even if these values should also be challenged and supplemented from other cultural perspectives.

As noted above, heritage (and official heritage in particular) tends to be associated with positive evaluations of the past (Harrison 2013; Weiss 2007), though not universally so (Smith 2017). Indeed, “the word for ‘heritage’ in many language has an overwhelmingly positive public connotation” (Macdonald 2009: 9). This makes the identification of sites of injustice and atrocity as heritage a particularly fraught affair (often referred to as negative, difficult, or dissonant heritage) raising questions about how to reconcile the positive associations of the heritage concept with sites that people experience as traumatic (Meskell 2002; Macdonald 2009, 2016; Tunbridge & Ashworth 1996; Sandis 2014a). These tensions can bring to the fore competing conceptions of national identity or historical narrative, especially in the context of regime change or civil war.

1.3 Cultural Heritage vs. National Heritage

It is important to note a distinction between cultural heritage and national heritage. As the discussions of official heritage and difficult heritage reveal, heritage can play an influential role in cultivating a sense of national identity around a national culture (Ireland & Schofield 2015: 2; Weiss 2007). However, it is important not to conflate the idea of a national culture with the empirically false claim that nations are culturally homogeneous: indeed, the intranational diversity of cultures is the fact from which the political problem of multiculturalism arises (see entry on multiculturalism). There is of course significant cultural diversity in cultural groupings of many kinds, nationalistic or not. This topic is discussed further in section 2.2.

1.4 Heritage vs. History

Consonant with the idea that heritage is inherently concerned with the use of the past for present purposes, some commentators are at pains to point out the difference between a more political understanding of heritage in contrast with a more scholarly understanding of history (e.g., Lowenthal 1985). They emphasize in particular heritage’s lax relationship with the truth:

History seeks to convince by truth and succumbs to falsehood. Heritage exaggerates and omits, candidly inverts and frankly forgets, and thrives on ignorance and terror. (Lowenthal 1998: 121)

However, one might worry that this statement contrasts an ideal of historical scholarship with a caricature of heritage at its worst. Historians, too, are subject to concerns about how their narratives portray and map onto the record of past events (Trouillot 1995; entry on philosophy of history). We might think that heritage, too, should be constrained by the truth, even when it operates in the service of nationalism (Abizadeh 2004).

1.5 Cultural Heritage vs. Natural Heritage

Culture has historically been distinguished from nature, but that dichotomy has come under attack in many disciplines: the study of heritage is no exception (Harrison 2015). A sharp distinction between the two seems particularly ill-placed in cultural contexts where nature figures prominently, as is the case in many indigenous and aboriginal cultural contexts. For instance, if relationships with the land (Figueroa & Waitt 2010) or particular plant and animal species (Whyte 2017) are of particular cultural significance, then a dichotomy between natural and cultural heritage can fail to accurately represent the beliefs and practices of these cultures. Moreover, some endeavor to illuminate theoretical approaches to the value of cultural heritage via conceptual tools from work on the value of nature, arguing that we should treat heritage conservation like nature conservation, importing common thinking about the intrinsic value of nature into our thinking about cultural heritage (Harding 1999). However, dissolution of the contrast between natural and cultural heritage is also subject to objections. For instance, discourse surrounding nature can bring with it methods and understandings that reintroduce problems into discussion of cultural heritage, such as the elevation of cultural heritage to a “universal” value (discussed further in section 2.2) that can disenfranchise or displace local cultural communities (O’Neill 2002), or as a non-renewable resource on par with common thinking about the value of nature, leading to state intervention (Meskell 2011). As a consequence of the collapse between these two domains, some argue

that the legacies of enclosure, eviction and salvage that developed around sites of natural value have indelibly informed our understanding and management of cultural places. (Meskell 2011: 23)

2. Cultural Property

2.1 What is Cultural Property?

At a basic level, the concept of “cultural property” captures the idea that something (an artifact, artwork, style, place, etc.) can be the property of a cultural group (Appiah 2006: 118; Thompson 2003: 252), and thus entail some set of collective rights concerning ownership, access, and use, even if title to the property is held by a particular individual. The concept thus raises a number of difficult philosophical questions concerning cultural groups, the nature of property, and the relation between them.

2.2 The Scope of Cultural Property Value

One fundamental question about cultural property concerns who has a reasonable interest in it. Only members of a particular culture? Members of a nation that many cultural members call home? All of humanity? Insofar as legal institutions of property are meant to protect our moral property interests, an answer to this question has the potential to in turn shape legal norms governing cultural property (see entry on property and ownership). An influential approach in the cultural property literature is to distinguish between cultural nationalist and cultural internationalist positions concerning how broadly a reasonable interest in cultural property should be construed (Merryman 1986).

According to cultural internationalists, each particular culture contributes to an overarching human culture, and thus everyone has an interest in cultural property (Merryman 1986; this view is often labeled “cosmopolitan” as well (Appiah 2006)). Proponents of cultural internationalism typically uses claims about the universal value of cultural heritage to argue against nationalist restrictions on its export and sale, as well as against many repatriation claims (discussed further in section 3; Merryman 1986, 1994; Appiah 2006). This position finds support in various aspects of international law and policy, including the Hague Convention of 1954 (Merryman 1986) and the criterion of “outstanding universal value” in the 1972 UNESCO World Heritage Convention (Cleere 1996; Omland 2006). These claims about the universal evaluative scope of cultural property are often predicated on a metaphysical claim about the constitutive relationship between particular cultures and Human Culture: that it is precisely because each culture is a component of Human Culture that each individual culture therefore has a universal value in which everyone has a reasonable interest. However, even independently of the strength of this claim, one might think that individual cultures can secure a universal value in other ways. For instance, according to one line of argument, there are a diversity of grounds for valuing a particular culture (such as ancestry, citizenship, geography, study, etc.) such that most everyone could have a reasonable interest in a particular culture (Matthes 2015).

According to the cultural nationalist position, on the other hand, nations have a “special interest” in their cultural property that “implies the attribution of national character to objects” (Merryman 1986: 832). This position also has support in international law and policy, in particular, the 1970 UNESCO Convention on the Means of Prohibiting and Preventing the Illicit Import, Export and Transfer of Ownership of Cultural Property (Merryman 1986). Proponents of cultural nationalism typically use claims about the special national character of cultural heritage to argue in favor of nationalist retention policies that restrict or limit the export or sale of cultural heritage (discussed further in section 3.1.1; Moustakas 1989). It is worth noting that the dichotomy between cultural nationalists and internationalists faces a significant limitation in that it does not leave an obvious place for the claims of intra-national cultural groups such as Native American tribes (Watkins 2005). Although cultural nationalism might in principle account for the claims of sovereign indigenous nations, it has in practice focused on the interests of independent nation-states. Moreover, although indigenous cultural property claims have received increasing attention in both policy and scholarship (discussed further in sections 2.3 and 3), appeals to nationalist and internationalist claims remain common in practice, and indeed, the interests and claims of intra-national groups can be in tension with the nationalist identity-building that nation-states often promote through cultural heritage (Watkins 2005).

One way to read the dispute between cultural nationalists and internationalists is as a dispute over which kind of value-claim should be prioritized: a proponent of each position could recognize the value claims made by both camps, but think that their own should trump the other (Thompson 2003: 258). Alternatively, one might think that claims about universal human value call into question the applicability of some of the traditional bundle of property rights. For instance, one might argue that the universal value of cultural heritage entails that it should not be excludable in the manner that property typically is (Thompson 2004: 545–546). Or, in a similar vein, one might argue that we should prioritize the preservation of such objects to the exclusion of any claims to holding them as property (Warren 1989: 22). This is a move toward a “stewardship” as opposed to “ownership” model for thinking about cultural property, which is subject to its own set of objections, and will be discussed below in section 2.4.

2.3 The Problem of Cultural Continuity

If cultural property belongs to a cultural group, then this seems to require some grasp on who constitute the members of the group (Young 2007: 112). However, defining cultural group membership is a notoriously difficult task (Killmister 2011). For one, it confronts problems concerning cultural essentialism (discussed in section 4.2.3 below). But moreover (and relatedly), it presents questions concerning cultural continuity over time (Appiah 2006: 119). On what basis, for instance, can the contemporary nation of Egypt claim the art and cultural artifacts of ancient Egypt as their cultural property, given the profound cultural differences between contemporary and ancient Egyptians? The same question can be raised for many of the cultural property claims made by contemporary nations. However, although there may not be strict cultural identity (in the sense of sameness) between cultural groups over time, due in part to the dynamic nature of culture, one might question why this kind of strict identity should be thought so important. For instance, we might instead appeal to cultural lineages, analogous to the links of psychological connectedness that some think can secure a relevant understanding of personal identity over time (Parfit 1984; entry on personal identity). For instance, an overlapping chain of practices, traditions, norms, and beliefs could be used to justify the claim that a culture at t1 is “the same culture” as the culture at t0, even if it has undergone significant changes. Indeed, one might think that a degree of change is in fact essential for the preservation of cultural identity over time (Coleman 2006: 167). Granted, this may lead to a plurality of cultural descendants that would make cultural property claims difficult to adjudicate in practice, but it is worth noting that the assumption in favor of a strong understanding of cultural identity over time as a necessary condition for cultural property remains largely undefended in the literature.

That being said, there are additional moral objections to nations in particular making cultural property claims. Nations need not be culturally homogeneous, and thus nationalist cultural property claims might objectionably run roughshod over strong intra-national cultural property claims, for instance, those made by colonized indigenous cultural groups (Thompson 2003: 252; Watkins 2005). From the opposite direction, one might worry about how nationalist cultural property claims would restrict the exchange of cultural property around the world, an objectionable consequence if one embraces the influential idea (mentioned in 2.2 above) that cultural property has value for all of humanity (Merryman 1986, 1994).

Moreover, there is a worry that the competing natures of “culture” and “property” generate a paradoxical relationship when they are combined in the purported concept of cultural property.

Property is fixed, possessed, controlled by its owner, and alienable. Culture is none of these things. Thus cultural property claims tend to fix culture, which if anything is unfixed, dynamic, and unstable. (Mezey 2007: 2005)

So, not only does the dynamic nature of culture raise metaphysical and epistemological questions about the grounds for cultural property claims, it is moreover inherently at odds with the bonds and boundaries with which the concept of property attempts to saddle it. Thus, cultural property tends to offer a version of fixed cultures attached to bounded groups that is more amenable to the concept of property, but consequently offers a distorted and “anemic” picture of culture (Mezey 2007: 2005–6).

One way to resolve the paradox is to challenge the interpretations of the core concepts that appear to set them at odds. For instance, one might argue that the paradox is generated by reading property in a strict “ownership” sense that prioritizes rights of excludability (the right to prevent others from use and access) and alienability (the right to transfer property); see entry on property and ownership). In contrast, an analysis of property in terms of “stewardship”, which recognizes a broader range of rights and responsibilities for non-title holders, may relax the perceived emphasis on property as fixed and bounded, allowing for an understanding of property that could plausibly avoid the same tensions with the dynamic nature of culture (Carpenter, Katyal, & Riley 2009: 1022).

2.4 Stewardship

As introduced in the previous two sections, one might think that the concept of cultural property places an emphasis on ownership where what is really required is stewardship. For instance, one might think that “cultural property does not really belong to anyone…that all of us have a duty towards cultural property because of its relative scarcity and profound significance” (Harding 1997: 760). This kind of view might be shared by those who aim to prioritize the preservation of cultural property (Warren 1989; Merryman 1994) or those who think we have special duties to cultural heritage grounded either in the virtues (James 2013) or an inter-generational social contract (Thompson 2000a; though stewardship should not necessarily be equated with preservation (Harding 1997: 771)).

While the concept of stewardship might solve certain problems concerning cultural property by uniting contestants over ownership around a common aim, it is also liable to inherit transposed versions of some of the same problems. For instance, advocates of stewardship must contend with what and whose values will guide stewardship efforts. What exactly should be stewarded, why, and for the sake of whom? If, for instance, scientific or world heritage values take the lead, stewardship models can invite the same kinds of objections as universalist notions of cultural property that leave inadequate room for the purportedly special relationship between particular cultural groups and objects, or crowd out alternative value systems or sources of knowledge (Wylie 2005). These concerns can perhaps be avoided through a non-monolithic understanding of stewardship that acknowledges rights and duties for multiple parties with respect to single objects (Carpenter, Katyal, & Riley 2009), but they remain concerns that advocates of stewardship models will need to address if stewardship is to serve as a viable substitute for an ownership model of cultural property.

2.5 Intangible Cultural Property

While the cultural property discourse began with a focus on material heritage (buildings, artifacts, etc.), it has expanded, particularly in response to increasing recognition of diverse indigenous cultures, to include discussion of stories, songs, styles, motifs, practices, and traditional knowledge (Carpenter, Katyal, & Riley 2009: 1097). These additional elements, typically referred to as “intangible heritage”, present a further set of puzzles and questions for the concept of cultural property (Brown 2005).

Centrally, while we have a straightforward grasp on what it means to own an artwork or artifact, the idea of owning a story or style can seem relatively obscure, at least in a broadly Western context. Just as intellectual property law has developed to better account for ownership of intangibles, the introduction of intangible heritage into discussion of cultural property has seemed to require appeal to the category of intellectual property to account for the ownership of cultural heritage that takes the form of such entities as songs or styles (Nicholas & Bannister 2004; entry on intellectual property). However, the application of an intellectual property framework to intangible cultural property has also generated objections. First, one might object that the intellectual property framework functions to commodify intangible cultural heritage, which can have a “tendency to freeze social life in time”, and thus offer an artificial and inappropriate approach to traditions and practices that are constantly changing (Brown 2005: 45). Second, general objections to the suitability of legal property protections for cultural heritage, whether tangible or intangible (discussed in 2.3), will carry over to the use of an intellectual property framework for dealing with intangible heritage, either based on the idea that “culture” and “property” are inherently in tension with one another (Mezey 2007), or because the category of property (focused primarily on rights) is inadequate to capturing the breadth of cultural heritage and our duties with respect to it (Prott & O’Keefe 1992). Third, the pull towards thinking of cultural heritage as universally valuable (discussed in 2.2) is arguably stronger in the case of intangible heritage than in the case of material heritage. For example, if knowledge aspires to be free to all, then is it acceptable to restrict its flow, even for the sake of guarding against the exploitation of vulnerable indigenous communities (Brown 2005)? As discussed in section 2.3, one might again counter that indigenous claims are more often for participation than outright control or rights of excludability, and thus such tensions are resolved if one adopts an alternative model of property that does not rely on possession of all the rights that comprise the “bundle” of classic property rights (Carpenter, Katyal, & Riley 2009: 1111–1112). Indeed, many objections to the use of intangible heritage move beyond the discourse of cultural property altogether, as discussed in section 4 on cultural appropriation.

A further puzzle is that it can be less clear what counts as a particular group’s intangible cultural property than it is in the case of material heritage. For instance, when a museum displays the cultural artifacts of a particular group, the cultural origins of the artifacts are often not controversial (though they of course can be): rather, controversy might surround ownership of the artifact predicated on a clear understanding of the culture of origin. In contrast, it can be relatively harder to trace the lineages of practices and stories, and superficial similarities in cultural traditions may lead to claims of intangible cultural property that are more difficult to justify (Brown 2005: 51).

3. Repatriation

Repatriation concerns the return of material heritage or human remains from museums, universities, or other institutions to their culture, nation, or owner of origin. If an object was clearly stolen or otherwise unjustly acquired from an identifiable group, then repatriation can seem uncontroversial (at least from a moral perspective) on the basis of standard norms of reparative justice, as would apply to any other stolen item. However, claims for repatriation can become controversial in cases where 1) the justice of acquisition is unclear, 2) the source cultural group is unclear or not clearly contiguous with a contemporary group, or 3) the value of institutional retention of disputed objects is thought to outweigh competing claims, especially if these are weakened by the aforementioned concerns. Arguments that aim to overcome these potential objections are generally couched in terms of either cultural property (3.1) or reparations for historical injustices (3.2).

3.1 Arguments Based on Cultural Property

The general tenor of this approach is to claim that certain objects qualify as cultural property, and then to argue based on a particular feature of cultural property that the relevant object should be returned to a designated group. Given the basic notion that cultural property is just the property of a cultural group (Thompson 2003: 252; Appiah 2006: 118), the concept is not necessarily incompatible with the alienation of particular items under appropriately authorized conditions of sale or transfer. However, one might appeal to cultural property as the basis for a repatriation claim if one thinks that the very concept of cultural property in fact precludes such transfers (3.1.1), or, rather, if the conditions under which such a transfer occurred are unclear (3.1.2). For further discussion of the concept of cultural property, see section 2.

3.1.1 Collective identity and the inalienability of cultural property

According to some understandings of cultural property, the tight link between cultural property and cultural identity renders such property inalienable. Closer to the idea of what is sometimes called “cultural patrimony” such property might be described as “not something owned by a people, but something of them, a part of their defining collective identity” (Cuno 2001: 85). This is one of the categories of objects, for instance, subject to the U.S. Native American Graves Protection and Repatriation Act of 1990, a federal law meant to facilitate the return of Native American remains and artifacts from federally funded institutions to Native tribes (Coleman 2010; Lackey 2006; Trope & Echo-Hawk 1992; Harjo 1996). If cultural property is inalienable, then holdings in cultural property by those outside the cultural group are ipso facto illegitimate.

The idea of inalienable property is familiar from the individual context, and the link between external objects and identity often arises in discussion of moral limits on the market distribution of things such as body parts or surrogacy (Harding 1997: 749; Satz 2010; Anderson 1995; Sandel 2012). Indeed, the distinction between alienable and inalienable property is recognized in many languages and does not divide across “Western” and “non-Western” cultures (Coleman 2010: 83). The claim of inalienable cultural property simply extends this concept from individuals to groups (Harding 1997: 751).

As a basis for repatriation, however, the concept of inalienable cultural property faces a series of objections. For one, we lack objective standards for assessing claims that a particular item is fundamental to group identity (Harding 1997: 751). Second, the relationship between an object and group identity need not obviously require possession of the object (Harding 1997: 751; Coleman 2010: 89). Third, we might worry about claims concerning the necessity of possessing objects for group identity if a group has been separated from the object for a long time, which is especially common in repatriation cases (Harding 1997: 752). Such circumstances seem to present us with a dilemma: either the cultural group has persisted without the object, in which case the claim for the necessity of its return is undermined; or the object is essential to group identity, in which case the claim to be the same cultural group in its absence is weakened (cf. Waldron 1992). Finally, the idea that cultural identity might truly be linked with an object inalienably and in perpetuity can suggest a troublingly static notion of cultural group identity, especially if such relationships are codified into law (Harding 1997: 752; Coleman 2010).

3.1.2 The inheritance of cultural property

One might claim that a cultural group can inherit cultural property, and thus use this to ground claims for repatriation, even where the justice of acquisition is uncertain: by being denied ownership of the objects, the group is being denied their rightful inheritance. The success of this approach will depend in part on whether the inheritance of property is morally justifiable in the first place. The right to inheritance seems incompatible with a number of theories of domestic justice (e.g., consequentialism, egalitarianism, desert theory (Thompson 2002: 109)), though is perhaps more easily justifiable if one thinks that principles of distributive justice do not apply internationally: this appears to remove distributive justice based rationales for denying the right to inheritance that might apply in the domestic context (Butt 2009: 141–145). Given that many repatriation claims are often international, this leaves more room for the applicability of inheritance-based repatriation claims than might be thought to apply in domestic cases.

However, one might insist that a necessary condition for inheritance is the existence of testamentary wishes concerning that inheritance, based on the presupposition “that respect for testamentary wishes lies at the core of the concept of inheritance (Young 2007: 115). Because it is rarely the case that demonstrable testamentary wishes regarding cultural property can be identified, one might think that inheritance is therefore unlikely to provide a basis for cultural property claims (Young 2007: 113–15; 2006: 18–20). However, an alternative approach starts by noting that it is generally assumed that children and spouses should inherit holdings even in the absence of testamentary wishes (Thompson 2002: 125; Butt 2009: 165). Thus, one might think that a parallel assumption should be made in the case of cultural property, especially if the alternative is the continued possession of the property by a community that unjustly acquired it from one’s own (Butt 2009: 166). In cases where an object is not already regarded as cultural property, inheritance might therefore also explain how the property of an individual can become the property of the state (Butt 2009: 166), or perhaps of a non-state cultural group.

Moreover, it is worth noting that the assumption that inheritance must be based on testamentary wishes is in tension with the point (noted in section 1.2) that inheritance is commonly taken to be the core notion of the concept of cultural heritage (for further discussion, see Shelby 2007: 172–176). Thus, skepticism about the possibility of inheritance would seem to undermine the very possibility of cultural heritage, a conclusion that might seem absurd. Of course, one might counter that cultural heritage relies on a different notion of inheritance than the jurisprudential understanding of inheritance most appropriate to cultural property. However, as with the discussion of the “paradox of cultural property” above (2.3), this claim appears to rest on assuming a particularly strong understanding of ownership that the concept of cultural property may not require (Carpenter, Katyal, & Riley 2009).

3.1.3 Cultural property and cultural significance

According to some commentators, the significance of an object for a cultural group is a necessary condition for it to qualify as cultural property: an insignificant object would not qualify merely because it was produced by a group member (Thompson 2003: 253). Moreover, though, the value of an object for a particular culture might be thought to constitute the strongest basis for a moral cultural property claim. For instance, according to the “cultural significance principle” a cultural group’s claim on an object “will be proportional to the value the property has for members of the culture” (Young 2007: 122) and mitigated by other competing considerations, including the range of other values possessed by such objects (including economic, scholarly, etc.; Young 2013). However, the fact that the ownership of cultural property is often disputed by multiple cultural groups, seems to present this approach with a serious practical hurdle: insofar as these disputes tend to arise precisely when objects are highly valued by multiple cultural groups, the cultural significance principle will have limited value in resolving these competing claims (Thompson 2013: 89). Moreover, it may not be sufficiently sensitive to the legitimacy of other kinds of moral and legal property claims. If the cultural significance principle is indeed treated as the strongest basis for a cultural property claim, this suggests that a cultural group simply valuing an object highly could override the legal claims of legitimate acquisitions and holdings (Thompson 2013: 89). Granted, the cultural significance principle is intended as just one principle that must also be weighed against “the rights of purchasers, finders and makers” (Young 2007: 122), and it is acknowledged this will often be a difficult task. But independently of this difficulty, the principle might facilitate claims by cultural groups that acquired an object unjustly and/or are themselves culturally distant from its original maker and cultural context, provided that they value it highly enough (Thompson 2013: 89). It is in this way friendly to arguments about how historical injustices can be superseded based on the role and value that unjustly acquired objects can come to have in the lives of their current owners (Waldron 1992; entry on intergenerational justice). Whether or not such outcomes are objectionable will no doubt depend on further consideration, but might at least be criticized for upholding the status quo of unjust colonial acquisitions.

3.2 Arguments Based on Reparations

Instead of resting claims for repatriation on appeals to cultural property, one might instead argue that repatriation is required as a component of reparations for historical injustices: in particular, for the unjust acquisition of cultural property, and for the unjust campaigns of colonial occupation and genocide in which such acquisitions were embedded. Because many repatriation claims concern objects that changed hands during previous generations, reparations for unjust acquisition or the unjust treatment of the former owners can seem to provide a suitable framework for justifying repatriation. Moreover, because humans remains are typically not considered subject to private ownership (Björnberg 2014: 464), reparations might be thought to offer a more fitting framework for repatriation cases concerning remains than a cultural property framework. Interestingly, however, many of the objections that can be raised against the cultural property approach apply to the reparations approach as well. This section will focus only on reparative issues that are especially pertinent to repatriation (for further discussion of reparations, see entries on reconciliation, intergenerational justice, and black reparations). For a general argumentative framework for repatriation as reparations to be successful, it needs to demonstrate that some entity has an obligation to correct an historical injustice, that reparations are an appropriate form of correction, and that repatriation is an appropriate means of reparations (Björnberg 2014: 463).

3.2.1 Unjust acquisition

It appears that the first step in a reparative argument will be to establish that an object was unjustly acquired. Failure to do so would seem to undermine the reparative basis for a repatriation claim of such an object: if an object was not unjustly acquired, then a repatriation claim based on the reparation of an historical injustice does not appear to apply (Björnberg 2014: 464). This might be thought of as an additional burden faced in reparation-based repatriation cases in particular: more general arguments for reparation often involve compensation as opposed to restitution (Perez 2011; though notably not in the case of land claims (Simmons 1995)), since what is being compensated for is typically pain, suffering, and loss of economic opportunity. However, one might alternatively think that repatriation could be justified as part of a reparative obligation to a cultural group even if there is no justifiable claim to ownership of a particular object, but simply as a form of compensation for historical injustices against the group in general, especially given the inextricable relationship between these broader injustice and the more specific case of cultural property acquisition (Harding 1997: 739; Ypi 2013: 187; Thompson 2013: 90–91; Ypi 2017; Matthes 2017: 946–950). If this is correct, then the reparative approach has an important advantage over appeals to cultural property: it can avoid the problem of establishing unjust acquisition of a particular object.

3.2.2 “Legitimate descendants” and cultural continuity

A successful case for repatriation as reparations requires a justifiable account of to whom an object should be returned. In the context of reparations, this requires identifying the “legitimate descendants” of the original victims of the past injustice of wrongful acquisition (Björnberg 2014: 465; drawing on Boxill 2003). Although repatriation cases sometimes involve individuals or families (as in cases concerning the return of items seized by the Nazis), most repatriation claims addressed in the literature concern wrongs against, and return to, nations or cultural groups. Identifying the legitimate descendants of the original victims might depend on tracing a causal chain of harms from the original victims (Boxill’s “harm argument”) or based on the inheritance of compensation that was owed but never made (Boxill’s “inheritance argument”). One route to employing the inheritance argument in this context is to appeal to bonds of common culture in order to identify the relevant inheritors (Björnberg 2014: 466). However, this approach raises the same cultural group problems of cultural continuity (2.3) and cultural essentialism (4.2.3) that confront other topics in heritage ethics. Using the harm argument, on the other hand, or an alternative application of the inheritance argument, would require appeal to some variety of continuity, but this would not necessarily be equivalent to cultural continuity (Matthes 2017: 937). For instance, one might be able to trace a chain of harms between an original victim group and a later group, even if the later group has undergone radical cultural changes.

3.2.3 Value for humanity

Even if the rightful recipients in repatriation claims can be established, a further objection to reparation-based repatriation may still be pressed. This is the objection that repatriation is not justified all things considered because countervailing considerations (Young 2007: 122), particularly concerning the value of retaining objects in public and/or academic settings, outweigh the reasons in favor of it (Thompson 2004). This kind of objection often appeals to the purportedly universal value of cultural heritage discussed in section 2.2. In the case of artifacts, this may be construed as an aesthetic, cultural, or historical value that renders such objects inherently public (Lindsay 2012). Assuming, for instance, that encyclopedic museums have an important value, some worry that repatriation would lead to the gutting of these collections, though whether or not such a worry is justified, particularly on the basis of slippery slope arguments, remains questionable (Joyce 2003). In the case of human remains, this universal value claim often takes the form of scientific value, as in the much-discussed dispute over the “The Ancient One” (or “Kennewick Man”; Thompson 2013: 95; Whittaker 1997; Brown 2003; TallBear 2013). Disputes over human remains, particularly of indigenous peoples, are thus often framed in terms of a conflict between religion and science, where it is often thought that the former should give way to the latter (Thompson 2013: 95–6). However, an alternative framing of the dispute notes that burials possess a wide range of legal protections, and so Native American repatriation claims are not based so much on religious grounds as on pursuit of equality of treatment (Harding 1997: 765). One might also argue that precisely because many museums are committed to serving as trustees of universally valuable collections for all humankind, they should be more concerned with achieving a just distribution of such cultural resources, in contrast with the retentionist position that they often take such commitments to support (Thompson 2004: 558–559; Matthes 2017).

4. Cultural Appropriation

4.1 What is Cultural Appropriation?

Cultural appropriation is generally understood as the taking or use of the cultural products of “cultural insiders” by “cultural outsiders” (Young 2005: 136). Cultural products can range widely, including stories, styles, motifs, artifacts, artworks, traditional knowledge, as well as representations of the members of a particular culture (Young 2008: 4; 2005: 136; Scafidi 2005). Questions about cultural appropriation thus often arise in a broad array of artistic contexts (in particular, but not limited to, music and fashion) as well as other non-artistic contexts, such as costumes, hairstyles, cuisine, and traditional knowledge (Young & Brunk 2012).

The concept of cultural appropriation can be used in either a descriptive or normative sense, and so it is important to be attentive to how it is being employed in a particular context. By comparison, consider how “exploitation” can have a descriptive or normative sense (Valdman 2009: 2): you can exploit an opportunity to get a snack when the food truck unexpectedly arrives without this implying wrongfulness. Likewise, some writers invoke cultural appropriation in a descriptive sense that leaves open whether a particular act of appropriation is wrongful (Young 2008: 18), whereas others employ the normative sense in order to pick out a particular kind of wrongful action (Todd 1990: 24).

Disputes over cultural appropriation often have an important racial dimension, as in discussions surrounding the blues or hip hop (Rudinow 1994; Taylor 1995; Taylor 2005). However, this need not be the case. For instance, cultural appropriation (whether wrongful or not) could be thought to arise with respect to cultural groups that cut across multiple racialized groups, such as cultures surrounding disability, sexual orientation, gender identity, and religion, as well as arising within the diverse cultural groups that are circumscribed by a single racialized category (Matthes 2016a: 356). In whatever context it arises, it is generally recognized that an essential ingredient in wrongful appropriation is a background of social inequality between cultural insiders and cultural outsiders (Ziff & Rao 1997: 5; Hurka 1999: 184; Hladki 1994). Indeed, given the way in which dominant cultural groups tend to assimilate minority cultures, it may even be a category mistake to speak of members of marginalized cultural groups “appropriating” from dominant ones (Rogers 2006: 480–1). That being said, some commentators argue in favor of leaving conceptual space for the appropriation of objects or practices by marginalized groups, though construed in a beneficial as opposed to harmful light (Walsh & Lopes 2012).

A substantial catalyst for academic and popular discussion of cultural appropriation (particularly in Canada) was the recommendation in 1992 of an ad hoc committee of the Canada Council to take cultural appropriation into account in its decisions about the award of arts grants (Rowell 1995: 138). Concerns about government funding for work about culturally marginalized peoples made by non-group members are theoretically consistent with finding cultural appropriation unobjectionable if it succeeds in the marketplace of its own merits (Rowell 1995: 141). However, in more recent years, public and scholarly discussion has shifted beyond this narrower question about government funding towards more general discussion of whether cultural appropriation is wrongful.

4.2 What Might be Wrong with Cultural Appropriation?

4.2.1 Offense

One potential source of the wrongfulness of cultural appropriation is that it can be offensive to cultural group members. If this is the sole explanation of wrongful cultural appropriation, then the case is relatively weak: the prima facie reason for thinking that appropriation is wrong could be easily defeated by any number of morally significant countervailing factors. While there may be a general presumption against needlessly offending others, the fact that someone might be offended by most anything makes run-of-the-mill offense seem relatively easy to justify.

The prima facie wrongfulness of cultural appropriation becomes weightier if we think that beyond causing mere offense, it can cause what Joel Feinberg terms profound offense: “an offense to one’s moral sensibilities…[that] strikes at a person’s core values or sense of self” (Young 2005: 135). Nevertheless, even if cultural appropriation is profoundly offensive, and thus there is a prima facie reason for thinking it is wrongful, one might still think that it can be morally permissible all things considered because of other morally relevant features of the act, such as its social value, the value of freedom of expression, the time and place of the act, the extent to which it is tolerated by group members, and how reasonable the offense is (Young 2005). Given the diversity of values and sensibilities, the potential for profound offense is substantial across many domains of social life. While it will be debatable under what circumstances the aforementioned features defeat the prima facie reasons for thinking that profoundly offensive appropriation is wrong, the range of cases in which it is often thought that profound offense is outweighed by other values suggests that cultural appropriation will often be morally permissible, all things considered (Young 2005: 138). Indeed, one might think that cultural appropriation is an essential aspect of cultural development, and in fact a beneficial aspect of cultural creativity and exchange (Young 2008; Rogers 2006; Heyd 2003).

4.2.2 Harm

In contrast with (or complementary to) the explanation in terms of offense, one might also think that cultural appropriation can be wrongful because it can cause harm. Analogously to debates about harmful vs. offensive speech, if cultural appropriation is harmful, this would raise the bar for countervailing considerations that would be sufficient to render it morally permissible: while harm can be morally justified, there is a strong presumption against causing harm (see entry on freedom of speech).

So what might make cultural appropriation harmful? For one, it might be thought to be wrongfully exploitative, defined, for instance, as

the appropriation of elements of a subordinated culture by a dominant culture without substantive reciprocity, permission, and/or compensation. (Rogers 2006: 477)

For instance, one might think that when cultural outsiders profit from the cultural achievements of insiders who are themselves excluded from such opportunities due to cultural marginalization and socio-economic inequality, they do so unfairly (Keeshig-Tobias 1990; Root 1996; Brown 2005). Whether or not cultural appropriation is economically harmful to cultural group members is a difficult empirical question, and certain cases may suggest that it could be an economic boon (Young 2008: 114–18; Cowen 2002; Shelby 2007: 194). However, even if we assume for the sake of argument that cultural appropriation increases economic opportunity for group members, it might still be thought of as a form of mutually advantageous exploitation: the features of exploitation identified above could persist even in the presence of a net gain in economic opportunity. For instance, one common argument is that cultural appropriation is an instance and extension of colonialism, sharing in its exploitative extraction of labor and resources from those with less relative power, and thus does not treat cultural group members in a way that recognizes their equality and autonomy: culture can be appropriated in the same way that land was appropriated by European colonists (Todd 1992, 1990; Coombe 1993; Rogers 2006; though against the similarity with land and natural resources, see Shelby 2007: 193–4; for more on explaining the wrong of colonialism, see Ypi 2013; see also entry on colonialism). Moreover, given the ways in which colonial powers often mandated the eradication of cultural practices, especially for indigenous people, through, for example, outlawing ceremonies and languages and forcing assimilation through residential schools, the prospect of simultaneously benefiting from these same cultural products can seem particularly perverse (Coleman, Coombe, & MacArailt 2012: 178; Child 1998).

Now, one might think that whether cultural appropriation qualifies as exploitative in these ways will hinge on the viability of a concept of cultural property, which, as we saw in section 3, remains contentious. The thinking is that cultural group members do not have a right to cultural products (nor to an audience for them, along with whatever economic boons it might hold) absent a claim to such products as their cultural property (Young 2008: Ch. 4). It would thus be no more exploitative to use or profit off of cultural products than it is to use or profit off of math: no one has an exclusive right to it. On the other hand, one might think the claim of exploitation is fitting even in the absence of claims about cultural property. Building on the colonial narrative, if Urban Outfitters, for instance, profits off the sale of clothes with Navajo patterns while the people of the Navajo nation grapple with poverty and its related injustices (an ongoing case that came to a head in 2012), then we might characterize this relationship as exploitative even absent a cultural property claim (though note that, in fact, the Navajo name is trademarked). This is because the relationship seems to have two features that are commonly invoked as jointly sufficient for wrongful exploitation: deriving an unfair or opportunistic gain from a vulnerable group who cannot reasonably consent (Liberto 2014; Valdman 2009). Granted, questions remain about the application of the exploitation framework. For instance, we might wonder about the conditions under which a group could reasonably consent to the use of cultural products (though see Lackey 2017), or whether the case above is correctly construed as the kind of transaction to which charges of exploitation apply (one might claim that Urban Outfitters is not correctly described as transacting with the Navajo people at all).

A further set of harms often invoked in discussions of cultural appropriation are the harms of misrepresentation and silencing. Misrepresentation can take many forms. For instance, it can present a culture in a false or misleading light. It can traffic in prejudices and stereotypes. It can also present a small aspect of a culture (even if accurate) as representative of the whole, creating a caricature, or present a cultural practice in a context that perverts its meaning (Coleman, Coombe, & MacArailt 2012). Cultural appropriation can also silence members of marginalized cultural groups by skewing public understanding of cultural expertise away from group members and denying group members opportunities and platforms for cultural expression (Keeshig-Tobias 1990; Todd 1990; Hladki 1994; Coombe 1993). These effects can cumulatively lead to the erosion of cultural forms and cultural assimilation of group members (Coleman 2001). Indeed, in light of these effects, some argue that cultural group members may have a political obligation to engage in cultural practices for the sake of cultural preservation (Jeffers 2015).

The related harms of misrepresentation and silencing can be fruitfully couched in terms of philosophical work on epistemic injustice and epistemic violence (Fricker 2007; Dotson 2011; Matthes 2016a; Nicholas & Wylie 2013). Operating against a broader backdrop of social marginalization, cultural appropriation can inhibit or deny the ability of group members to speak for and represent themselves, offering further support for Loretta Dodd’s definition of cultural appropriation as the opposite of cultural autonomy (Todd 1990). For instance, on this understanding, the disability rights slogan “nothing about us without us” can be construed as an objection against appropriation through representation.

However, these accounts of harmful appropriation are subject to philosophical objections. For instance, we might grant that misrepresentation can be harmful, but deny that such a harm has anything to do with appropriation per se: misrepresentations promulgated by cultural insiders can be harmful, too (Young 2008: Ch. 4). Thus the argument that misrepresentation is harmful does not establish that cultural appropriation itself is harmful. In reply, one might note that while misrepresenting oneself and being misrepresented by others could be equally harmful, that does not entail that they constitute the same kind or degree of wrong. Moreover, we might question whether it is important to demonstrate that cultural appropriation is a sui generis kind of wrong: indeed, given that harmful cultural appropriation seems to depend on background conditions of social inequality, we might think it would be unsurprising if a fitting explanation of its wrongfulness overlaps substantially with the explanation of other wrongs that depend on social inequality (Matthes 2016a).

4.2.3 The problem of cultural essentialism

A further persistent objection to the aforementioned accounts of wrongful cultural appropriation concerns the problem of cultural essentialism, the idea that cultural group membership can be defined in terms of a specific set of necessary and sufficient conditions (Young 2005). The problem arises because the very concept of cultural appropriation seems to be predicated on distinguishing cultural group members from non-members:

The need to describe a community of insiders and outsiders is implicit in most of what has been said about the practice of appropriation…some test of group belonging seems required in discussions about cultural appropriation. (Ziff & Rao 1997: 3)

The objection to essentialism can take both an epistemic/metaphysical form and a moral form in the context of cultural appropriation.

First, one might contend that essentialist definitions of culture are empirically false: cultures do not have rigid boundaries (Patten 2014: Ch. 2). Even if we granted for the sake of argument that cultural groups could be carved at the joint, we might doubt our ability to know what the correct cultural group boundaries are (Young 2005: 136–7). If either of these objections holds, it seems as if the idea of cultural appropriation is at best inapplicable in practice, and at worst, conceptually confused.

On the moral front, one might worry that objections to cultural appropriation reify cultural group boundaries in a way that can exclude precarious or marginalized group members, or construct caricatures or even oppressive conceptions of cultural authenticity (Killmister 2011; Rogers 2006; Shelby 2002: 249–54). This can generate the same kind of harmful cultural misrecognition as cultural appropriation itself (Matthes 2016a: 355–358).

These two sets of objections are aptly encapsulated in Alan Patten’s “dilemma of essentialism” for multiculturalism:

Either culture is understood in an ‘essentialist’ way, in which case multiculturalism is empirically and morally flawed; or culture is understood in a nonessentialist way, but the concept no longer supplies multiculturalism with the means of making the empirical judgments and normative claims that matter to it. (Patten 2014: 39)

Cultural essentialism generates a similar dilemma for cultural appropriation. How best to solve this dilemma remains an open question. The answer will depend in part on how best to address more general questions about cultural essentialism, and essentialism about conceptual categories more broadly (see entry on essential vs. accidental properties). Moreover, given the use of cultural categories in many everyday contexts, we should be hesitant about inferring from worries about essentialism that cultural categories do not exist, or should not be employed, just as objections to racial essentialism should not necessarily lead us to dismiss all talk of racialized categories, especially as a tool for accurately characterizing the effects of racism (see entry on race). Indeed, such assumptions can generate their own harms, for instance, by dismissing claims to cultural identity and autonomy on the basis that they are “essentializing” (Todd 1992). But it can seem that some theoretically viable understanding of cultural group membership that can survive the metaphysical, epistemological, and moral objections mentioned above is essential to a robust defense of the concept of cultural appropriation. One possible alternative is to eschew the problem of cultural group membership by shifting our attention away from determining who counts as a cultural outsider and toward the background conditions of social marginalization and inequality that make cultural appropriation harmful (Matthes 2016a: 362–366). However, this approach may be inadequate in certain cases where identifying specific acts of cultural appropriation is itself morally important.

5. Heritage and Environmental Preservation

Whether or not one favors a distinction between cultural and natural heritage (see section 1.5 above), the idea of heritage plays an important role in recent thinking about environmental preservation.

Among the many reasons that one might think that nature is valuable include the idea that natural things have a certain kind of history, in particular, a history independent of human intervention (Elliot 1982). This belief leads to the conclusion that, at least with respect to this particular kind of natural value, environmental restoration is impossible: one cannot restore a history free of human intervention through human intervention. Thus, if we want to retain this kind of value, we need to pursue policies of environmental preservation that will protect the natural spaces that bear it (Elliot 1982).

The sharp distinction between nature and culture represented in this view has been criticized from many fronts, for reasons ranging from an overly narrow perspective on environmental value to minimizing the actual history, and present extent, of human influence on the environment (Cronon 1995; O’Neill 2002; Scoville 2013; Heyd 2005). That being said, we might grant that Elliot identifies an important environmental value, provided that we do not make the mistake of thinking it is the only one (Matthes 2016b). This will of course significantly temper the power of Elliot’s normative conclusions about the promise of environmental restoration. But a more nuanced understanding of the distinction between nature and culture, one that recognizes a broader spectrum rather than a strict dichotomy, can still provide reasons for cultivating a respect for nature’s self-directedness or “spontaneity” as well as reason to preserve and protect this natural heritage (Heyd 2005: 345). Other approaches to environmental preservation also leverage the heritage value of the environment, though emphasizing the cultural dimensions of this heritage as well as the “natural” ones.

For instance, one might think that recognizing that the environment is part of our cultural heritage can ground distinctive reasons or obligations to preserve it (Thompson 2000a). For instance, viewing aspects of the environment as part of a cultural inheritance from our ancestors might offer reason to preserve the environment as part of an intergenerational social contract (Thompson 2000a,b); or, because “particular places matter to both individuals and communities in virtue of embodying their history and cultural identities” (O’Neill, Holland, & Light 2008: 2–3) we might think our approach to environmental preservation and decision-making should be guided in part by the question: “What would make the most appropriate trajectory from what has gone before?” (O’Neill, Holland, & Light 2008: 156); or, we might recognize that

indigenous peoples have long advocated that the conservation and restoration of native species, the cultivation of first foods, and the maintenance of spiritual practices require the existence of plants and animals of particular genetic parentage whose lives are woven with ecologically, economically and culturally significant stories, knowledges and memories. (Whyte 2017)

On views like these, despite their differences, to recognize the heritage-dimension of the environment is to see its value as consisting, at least in part, in its narrative significance, its role in stories that connect us to the past and contribute a distinctive meaning to our lives (Holland 2011; Thompson 2000a; Scoville 2013). To see environmental preservation as guided by the preservation of narrative value can thus have significant implications: for instance, preserving narrative value might in fact entail changes to the physical landscape required for preserving meaning rather than material continuity or authenticity (O’Neill, Holland, & Light 2008: 157; Arntzen 2008).

How best to capture that narrative value in practice is a difficult question. For instance, in places that have a history of varied use (what some have called “layered landscapes”) how do we adjudicate among competing narratives (Hourdequin & Havlick 2011, 2016)? Rather than the traditional “baseline problem” for ecological restoration, according to which any particular historical benchmark for returning a space to its “natural” state appears arbitrary (Lee, Hermans, & Hale 2014), we are faced with the problem of deciding how a plurality of historical values ought to shape restoration and preservation efforts. Thus, in order to understand how best to preserve narrative value, it seems we will need independent standards for adjudicating among the value of competing narratives (McShane 2012). This is particularly important given the unequal distribution of power in crafting and promulgating historical narratives, which is liable to leave many place-narratives untold or unheard (McShane 2012: 60; Palmer 2011: 355–6).

6. Other Topics in Heritage Ethics

The previous sections discussed topics in heritage ethics that have seen the most engagement to date from philosophers. The following subsections offer a brief overview of some other topics in heritage ethics that have been discussed in the literature.

6.1 The Ethics of Display

Beyond issues concerning the repatriation of art and artifacts, further ethical questions arise about how cultural heritage that is retained in museums should be displayed. These questions play out against the backdrop of how non-Western artworks have been regarded in the context of Western art institutions, vacillating between relegation to anthropological museums that challenged their art-status to de-contextual display in modern art museums that deprived them of relevant cultural context (Eaton & Gaskell 2012). Analogous to debates about cultural appropriation discussed in section 4, museums are sometimes challenged for misrepresenting non-Western cultures, or lacking relevant participation from cultural group members (Brown 2009). Thus questions arise about the relative value of different kinds of knowledge, how they are prioritized by institutions claiming to steward the past, respectful display, and to whom these institutions are accountable (Wylie 2005; Pantazatos 2016, 2017; Gaskell 2008).

6.2 Further Issues in Archaeological Ethics

Some dimensions of the issues discussed above could be considered part of the field of archaeological ethics (Scarre & Scarre 2006; Vitelli & Colwell-Chanthaphonh 2006; Scarre & Coningham 2013), including aspects of the literature concerning cultural property, repatriation, and cultural appropriation. However, further ethical issues arise concerning, for instance, the ethics of digging for recreational, financial, or subsistence purposes (Hollowell 2006; Wylie 1996), the professional responsibilities of archaeologists (Scarre 2014), and respect for the dead (Scarre 2003).

6.3 The Ethics of Cultural Heritage Protection in War

Some central aspects of the literature on cultural property have arisen from discussion and policy surrounding the protection of cultural heritage in war, such as the Hague Convention and the Lieber Code (Merryman 1986). But further questions concerning the ethics of cultural heritage protection in war, such as the permissibility of causing or allowing causalities in order to protect cultural heritage, or the obligations (or permissibility) of humanitarian intervention to protect cultural heritage have received only a little philosophical attention to date (Thompson 2010; Matthes 2018).


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Thanks to Fani Ntavelou Baum for research assistance, and to two anonymous reviewers for helpful feedback.

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Erich Hatala Matthes <>

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