Feminist Bioethics

First published Wed Aug 16, 2023

[Editor’s Note: The following new entry by Jackie Leach Scully replaces the former entry on this topic by the previous authors.]

In the last two decades, feminist bioethics has emerged as a leading subfield in the scholarly examination of ethical issues in medicine and the life sciences. This article traces the development of feminist bioethics that emerged from feminist critiques of mainstream thinking, detailing the foundational concepts of feminist ontology and epistemology that distinguish feminist philosophical approaches to medicine and healthcare. With this background, feminist analyses of bioethical problems share some characteristic features. The early sections in the article examine feminist contributions to bioethical theory, notably care ethics and relational models of autonomy, and discuss how these theoretical commitments have made distinctive contributions to important thematic areas. Later sections consider feminist bioethics’ continuing evolution in response to new technological developments in medicine and healthcare, to the widening circle of bioethical interest, and to conceptual work in feminist thought and philosophy, in each case with an eye to feminist bioethics’ academic and activist future.

1. The Development of Feminist Bioethics

1.1 Introduction

Bioethics is the hybrid discipline that attends to the ethical implications of developments in the life sciences, especially biomedical research and practice, public health, the delivery of healthcare services, and the socio-ethical impacts of technology. Since it first emerged as a distinct approach in applied philosophy, bioethics has blossomed into a substantial interdisciplinary field, drawing on a highly diverse range of scholarship, including philosophy, theology, law, medicine, and the biological sciences, and increasingly turning to the social sciences and humanities.

Chronicles of bioethics tend to argue that it originated as a response to two main factors. First, medical developments in the mid-twentieth century raised issues beyond the limits of conventional medical ethics’ focus on intraprofessional conduct and the physician-patient dyad. Second, this period also saw growing recognition of historical atrocities in medical research (such as the experimentation on inmates of concentration and extermination camps during the Nazi Third Reich that led directly to the Nuremberg Doctors’ Trial and, indirectly, to the first set of research ethics guidelines in the Nuremberg Code of 1947). But this narrative, while not wrong, omits the broader political and intellectual context of the milieu within which bioethics developed. The 1960s saw social transformation in many parts of the world, and in its early days at least, bioethics’ focus on those who might be harmed by medical practice reflected these social and cultural changes. Like many young disciplines, it has also been open to a wide range of theoretical and methodological approaches. This may be one reason why feminist bioethics was able to develop rapidly and strongly as a distinctive sub-field within it.

1.2 Emergence and early days

The roots of feminist bioethics can be found in both feminist activism and feminist theory. In the early years of second wave feminism, the women’s healthcare movement identified many areas where women’s interests were severely neglected. While feminist activism identified problematic areas and mobilized protest, the academic critique provided a theoretical framework to show that mainstream biomedicine and bioethics are fundamentally gendered in ways that affect both how the life sciences are researched and implemented and how this research and practice are ethically analyzed. In other words, feminists were saying that not only does bioethics give too little attention to gender-specific disparities in healthcare research and treatment, but that the gendered perspective from which mainstream bioethics identifies morally troubling issues and their ethically salient features makes it unable (or much less likely) to account adequately for certain injustices, biases or harms in any given scenario (Tong 1997; Sherwin 2008; Scully et al. 2010).

In its earliest phase, feminist bioethics focused on topics that were patently being neglected by the mainstream. Inevitably, these were areas that could traditionally be seen as “women’s issues”: anything to do with reproduction, including abortion and the assisted reproductive technologies (ARTs) emerging at that time, but also the exclusion of women from medical research, the role of psychiatry and its treatment of women, and the increasing medicalization and commodification of women’s bodies. These perspectives cast new light on even well-examined terrain. For example, although ethical issues within clinical research have been exhaustively mapped out, it took feminist analyses to highlight that the routine exclusion of women from clinical research, on the grounds that the “anomalies” of female physiology generate unreliable data, was ethically problematic (Sherwin 1994; Baylis & Halperin 2012; Baylis & Ballantyne 2016).

Pioneering work included a ground-breaking anthology, Feminist Perspectives in Medical Ethics (Holmes & Purdy 1992), and the first monograph treatment of feminist bioethical theory, Susan Sherwin’s No Longer Patient: Feminist Ethics and Health Care, (Sherwin 1992). A major milestone was the publication of Rosemary Tong’s, Feminist Approaches to Bioethics: Theoretical Reflections and Practical Applications (Tong 1997). In 1993, the International Network on Feminist Approaches to Bioethics (FAB) was founded and since 1996 has held its own biennial Congress in association with the World Congress on Bioethics. To further the development of feminist bioethics, in 2007 FAB established its own journal, the International Journal of Feminist Approaches to Bioethics (IJFAB). From the outset, IJFAB has been committed to expanding the field of bioethics to include a wide range of areas relevant to women’s healthcare and related research.

However, it is important to realize that feminist bioethics is characterized less by the areas that it addresses or ethical theories that it draws on, than by its particular approach to ethical analysis. The combination of attention to practical issues, distinctive conceptual commitments, and the explicit ethical-political goal of achieving equality and justice for women is the hallmark of feminist bioethics. The following sections will first identify the feminist perspectives on ontology and epistemology that are foundational to this approach; show how these commitments shape feminist approaches to bioethical analyses; and then outline two areas of theory, care ethics and relational autonomy, that have been developed within feminist bioethics and have also enriched theoretical bioethics more generally. Finally, this entry considers the future of feminist bioethics in the twenty-first century.

2. Foundational Feminist Perspectives

2.1 Ontology

Feminist philosophy favors a moral ontology that contrasts sharply with that of traditional moral philosophy. In a now well-rehearsed critique, feminists argue that the model of the agential subject used in mainstream moral and political thought reflects rather too closely the gendered social and political environment in which it was first devised (Mackenzie & Stoljar 2000). This model identifies the self as a singular, isolated locus of consciousness, with little account given to either the particularities of the body or the familial and community contexts within which moral agents operate except where embodiment and social embeddedness are thought to compromise moral agency. Feminist moral theory has long argued that this picture is flawed, and in the end, ethically treacherous, because it leaves out many features of human life that are essential to genuine moral selfhood and agency. Mainstream theory was (and often still is) devised by the most privileged members of societies in which privilege is distributed according to sex and class. Feminist theory notes that this has resulted in the perspectives and experiences of men being mistaken for universals, and the perspectives and experiences of women (shaped by the biological fact of female embodiment and the social fact of subordinate status) being dismissed. In the nonideal world, moral subjects are embodied beings, and the particularities of their bodies are morally relevant; they are also linked to known and unknown others through dependencies and responsibilities that are often unchosen; and these connections to other persons are asymmetric as a rule rather than exceptionally. This moral ontology gives a more accurate depiction of reality and is therefore a more theoretically useful model.

It is only fair to acknowledge that contemporary moral and political philosophy has engaged to some extent with these critiques from feminists and others, and as a result some would now consider this to be a caricature of its views. Nevertheless, it is still relatively rare to see nonfeminist applied ethics, including bioethics, describing moral subjects and agents in explicitly socially embedded and embodied terms.

2.2 Epistemology

The dominant form of epistemology within feminist bioethics is similarly social. The knowledge to which individuals have access is collectively generated, maintained, circulated and conveyed, and the moral subject of feminist bioethics therefore has epistemic resources that differ markedly from those available to the traditional singular self. Moreover, gendered social identities have the effect of shaping the epistemic resources that are available to the inhabitants of those identities (Harding 1991; Wylie 2003). The situated epistemic resources of marginalized social identities will differ from those of more powerful groups, and vice versa. Beyond an awareness of the situated nature of knowledge, feminist standpoint epistemology presents the stronger claim that marginalized identities have a unique epistemic insight into the specific effects of power maldistribution (Hartsock 1983; Grasswick 2004; Harding 2009; Intemann 2010; see also SEP entries by Anderson on feminist epistemology and Grasswick on feminist social epistemology).

Social positioning also determines whether the knowledge a person has is considered credible by members of her own or other groups. Gendered or otherwise biased social and political structures generate skewed distributions of epistemic authority, leading to a variety of forms of epistemic injustice—an idea that has been developed in many theoretical directions and widely disseminated through moral and political philosophy (Fricker 2007; Code 2014; Dotson 2014; Pohlhaus 2017; Grasswick 2018). In summary, where traditional epistemology looks at how individuals acquire and use information, from a feminist perspective the center of attention shifts to the social and political structures within which knowledge is created and maintained, and epistemic injustice can occur. Epistemic injustice refers to the unfair ways in which the knowledge of individuals who belong to socially marginalized and stigmatized groups is treated. The most commonly described forms or families of epistemic injustice are testimonial and hermeneutical. Testimonial injustice describes those situations where a person’s identity results in their statements being ignored or disbelieved: a relevant example would be the vaginal mesh scandal, in which women’s claims of pain and injury were disregarded (O’Neill 2021). Hermeneutical injustice on the other hand occurs when a person’s or group’s knowledge is excluded from the collective epistemic resources (the things “everyone knows”) because their knowledge is dismissed as unimportant or irrelevant. An example here would be the overall lack of data about pregnant women’s responses to common medication because of their historical exclusion from clinical research. This exclusion was justified on ethical grounds (the protection of the supposedly vulnerable woman and foetus), but the ethical evaluation was based on unjustified sexist assumptions.

Feminist epistemology therefore drives a re-examination of how ethical issues are perceived and described, whose experiences are afforded credibility, how (and by whom) an issue is defined as “moral” in the first place, and how consensus on what constitutes a robust ethical evaluation is shaped by the social organization of epistemic authority.

3. Feminist Approaches to Bioethical Analysis

These foundational feminist perspectives on ontology and epistemology provide the key theoretical orientations for feminist bioethics. Ethical analyses need to account for how real moral agents are formed and behave, combined with a more critical understanding of the social, political, and other forces that shape the experiences, knowledge, and judgments of differently situated people. These priorities lie behind the critique of mainstream bioethics’ tendency to favor ideal theory and to work from a set of highly abstract principles, its isolation of moral problems from their context, and its neglect of, or lack of interest in, the perspectives of subordinated social groups.

This background means that feminist approaches to bioethical analyses tend to share characteristic features. These include attention to power dynamics and social context; the use of empirical data to inform theory; the weight given to relationality and care, and to the moral significance of embodiment and materiality; and greater openness to and incorporation of marginalized perspectives.

3.1 Power dynamics and social context

In all societies we know of, human relationships are shaped by arrangements of social and political power that favor men and enable the oppression of women in a variety of ways, both covert and overt. Feminist bioethics looks at the micro-, meso-, and macro-level organizations of power in the moral difficulties that are encountered within healthcare and research. The examination of these power relations not only provides a gendered reframing of bioethics’ traditional clinical focus, for example by considering how paternalism in the doctor-patient dyad works differently according to the sex of each, but also provides a broader insight into the structural underpinnings of seemingly isolated instances of moral wrong. In doing so, feminist bioethics extends in two dimensions beyond what is conventionally considered to fall within the confines of healthcare: to the previously unnoticed small-scale microaggressions (Freeman & Stewart 2019), and at the other end of the scale to the global economic structures that maintain entrenched patterns of social and political domination over women’s lives. Feminist bioethicists also go beyond the analysis of sex and gender to consider how the distribution of power plays out across other categories of race, sexual orientation, disability, age, and so on.

These broader analyses were a key factor in feminist bioethics’ interest in the social determinants of health and in their understanding that structural social inequities are fundamental to generating differentials in people’s health, anticipating by some years the concerns of public health ethics articulated since the mid-2000s. Feminist authors, for example, have highlighted that the distribution of political and economic power is visible in the way that public health processes focus on the effects of social marginalization and exclusion but pay less attention to the underlying causes (Rogers 2006; Baylis, Kenny, & Sherwin 2008).

3.2 Use of situated empirical and experiential knowledge

Feminism is based on the observation that a person’s experience is sexed and gendered and will differ in important ways depending on whether that person is biologically male or female, or lives as a man or a woman. And because the organization of power is also gendered, the issue of whose perspectives matter (or are noticed at all) will reflect the needs and demands of the most powerful. Feminist analyses are therefore sensitive to the stratifications that make it unlikely that we (whoever we are) have an overarching view of even the most familiar situations. For bioethics, this limitation is compounded by its focus on life science and biomedical innovation, and on technologies and practices that have yet to establish themselves in everyday life. As an example, the growth of assisted reproductive technologies very obviously demanded new forms of health policy and governance. Less obviously, it also generated new professional and private identities and behaviors linked to being a parent, child, or sibling, novel forms of families (such as same-sex couples with genetically related children), and rapidly evolving relationships between legislation and private life (Baylis & McLeod 2014).

The experiential basis of feminism and the novelty of the practices that bioethics deals with both lead to the conclusion that normative judgments should be based in what Margaret Walker famously referred to as “the actual moral and social orders”, i.e., knowledge of what is actually going on rather than assumptions about how we think things might be (Walker 1998). Where that knowledge is not available it must be acquired. So, although much of bioethics took an empirical turn in the early 2000s, feminist bioethics has a particularly strong orientation towards the use of empirical methods to anchor any descriptive and normative claims in the realities of natural, social, political, and institutional worlds. There is also a leaning towards qualitative methods of inquiry to capture morally salient differences that track not only with sex and gender, but also with class, ethnicity, sexuality, and so on. As a result, some feminist bioethicists are involved in developing empirical methodologies to provide appropriate material for normative reasoning, while others work on clarifying the always problematic relationship between empirical data and normative conclusions (Scully 2016).

3.3 Importance of the body and embodiment

Women’s lives are shaped by the materiality of having/being a body that deviates from the male norm. Feminist theory recognizes the political and moral importance of the body, and part of feminist bioethics’ central criticism of mainstream bioethics is that as well as being abstract and decontextualized, it also reflects a disembodied view of moral life. This in turn creates an obliviousness to the moral significance of embodied particularity. Medical science has a long history of dismissing the female body as “anomalous”, and because it also tends to equate anomaly with pathology, it has an equally long history of pathologizing women’s bodies. Early feminist bioethicists, including Susan Bordo (1993) and Mary Mahowald (1993), published work examining medical and cultural attitudes toward women’s bodies. Subsequently, an influential strand of work within feminist bioethics has moved from the moral consideration of the normatively sexed and gendered body to reflecting more generally on what is means to have/be an anomalous body, including raced and disabled bodies, intersex bodies, or bodies that are of nonstandard shape or size (Reiheld 2015; Dolezal 2015; MacKay 2017). Some of the most interesting work in this area takes a phenomenological approach to the experiences of pregnancy, lesbian or transgender embodiment, and disability or illness. Susan Wendell’s The Rejected Body (1996) was an early instance of a large body of feminist bioethical writing that relates to disability.

3.4 Listening to marginalized voices

Feminist bioethics is distinctive in the emphasis it places on recognizing the historical and continuing exclusion of minority viewpoints as a form of epistemic injustice in which the knowledge of marginalized groups is kept out of mainstream bioethics. From early on, feminist bioethics looked beyond the marginalization of sex and gender to other forms of exclusion, and sought to identify how power relations interacting with minority statuses can perpetuate moral harms in research, clinical care, and public health. The dismissal of the experiences and perspectives of women, Black, or disabled people is now increasingly acknowledged in bioethics. However, feminist analyses also illuminate relevant examples of damaging exclusions that fall outside the boundaries of familiar minority categories or protected characteristics. These include the suppression of “anomalous” knowledge that is assumed to be distorted by mental illness (Bluhm 2011; Thachuk 2011) and the silence within mainstream bioethics about the role of low-paid care workers in healthcare. They have also drawn connections between epistemic injustice and feminist work on microaggressions experienced by patients in clinical settings (Buchman et al. 2017; Freeman & Stewart 2019).

3.5 Political commitment/activism

A final characteristic of feminist bioethics that draws together all the other distinctive features is its political commitment. While feminist bioethics, like feminist ethics more broadly, is an academic discipline, it originated in and alongside a social-political movement with the aims of global justice and equality for women. Feminist theory has always attempted to connect the personal with the political. In the context of ethics, this means something more than just expanding the ethical frame of reference beyond person to person interactions to the institutional or societal scale; it means an understanding that individual and interpersonal issues are fundamentally shaped by broader socio-political forces. Hence, feminist bioethics always has a perspective that pushes beyond the straightforward characterization of a moral concern in medicine or life sciences, and even beyond examining why it has arisen. A feminist approach to bioethics pushes towards identifying and catalyzing social and political change to create better lives for women.

4. Feminist Contributions to Bioethics Theory

The distinctive analytic toolkit of feminist bioethics has made significant theoretical contributions to bioethical thinking. Its close relationship with feminism as a political movement has made feminist bioethics highly critical of philosophical bioethics’ usual privileging of ideal theory (in the sense of being based around the kind of world we would like to have) and of the search for universalizable principles. Both these approaches tend to increase the appeal of abstraction more, making it harder to see the world as it is, with persisting inequality and discrimination, and so obscure the need for radical change and especially for realistic ways to achieve it. Feminist ethics has responded through the production of its own conceptual contributions to broader ethical theory. The most significant and best known of these are the ethics of care/care ethics[1] and the concept of relational autonomy.

4.1 Ethic of care/care ethics

The idea that care could form the basis of a distinct approach to ethical theory took shape after the publication of psychologist Carol Gilligan’s now-famous work on gender-based differences in moral evaluation, In a Different Voice (1982). Drawing on empirical data Gilligan attempted to show that patterns of moral reasoning that prioritize care practices, chosen and unchosen relationships, and the acknowledgment of mutual responsibilities are more characteristic of women, while alternative modes focusing on justice, rights, and the elaboration of overarching moral principles are more likely to be used by men. Subsequent commentators, including some feminist bioethics, have been highly critical of Gilligan’s conclusions. Some, for example, have complained about her own use of stereotypical gendered norms in her work. Others are skeptical of the supposedly rigidly gendered distribution of care versus justice-based ethics, suggesting that the difference is linked not to gender per se but to the experience of being socially and politically marginalized, and therefore more likely to turn to the relational networks of community for support than to institutional justice-based systems (see, e.g., Cortese 1990). Other areas of continuing debate are whether the ethic of care counts as a form of virtue ethics, or whether conversely it only appears so because it cannot be neatly slotted within the traditional taxonomies of ethical theory (Halwani 2003; Groenhout 2014; Sander-Staudt 2006).

Nevertheless, the basic idea of the importance of care has given rise to an extraordinarily rich body of work within feminist thought (Held 2006; Gary 2022) and has had considerable influence beyond. By differentiating between various understandings of care and by paying attention to the moral subtleties of relational bonds, the ethics of care exposes problems and suggests approaches that are overlooked by justice-oriented frameworks. Unsurprisingly, the ethics of care has proven to be especially appealing in biomedicine and public health, fields where the notion of “caring for” is central (although often unexamined). In many ways, however, the value of the ethic of care lies less in the centrality of care as a practice than in its ability to challenge the conventional understanding that dependence relationships are restricted to specific circumstances (such as infancy or illness) rather than something in which all of us are embedded at all points of our lives. In particular, care ethicists highlight the fact that relationships involving care are often unchosen and always unbalanced. Moreover, by reframing care as dependency work, ethicists such as Kittay (1999) and Kittay and Feder (2003) demonstrate the ubiquity of dependency in the form of dependent interactions in communities that do not involve obvious care practices. Positioning unbalanced relations as the norm rather than the exception contrasts starkly with the view of ethical theories in which normal social and moral life consists mainly of reciprocal, negotiated relationships between equals and dependence is invariably undesirable if not outright pathological.

A longstanding criticism of the ethic of care is its potential naivety about those care relationships that are themselves exploitative or unjust. Further, it has been attacked for lacking a robust political perspective that can adequately account for and unsettle larger-scale patterns of domination and oppression affecting women. In response, some authors have visibly extended the ethic of care’s reach to include structural, systemic, and global issues (Carse & Lindemann Nelson 1996; Ruddick 1989; Noddings 2002; Held 2006). Joan Tronto’s Moral Boundaries: A Political Argument for an Ethic of Care (1993) was an early attempt to craft a political theory integrating the practice of care into the organization of life in a democratic and pluralistic society, as was the anthology Socializing Care edited by Hamington and Miller (2006).

Others have teased out the connections between care and associated moral concepts such as dependence, agency, and autonomy. An example is a growing body of recent work on vulnerability as a useful moral concept (Hurst 2008; Mackenzie, Rogers, & Dodds 2014; Luna 2014, 2019; Miller 2020). The terminology of “vulnerable groups”, to denote people who are collectively more likely to suffer disadvantage, harm, or exploitation in research or other contexts, is key to many aspects of research ethics especially informed consent, and increasingly appears in public health ethics too. However, this use of vulnerability tends not to examine the forces that lead to the existence of vulnerable groups in the first place. By contrast, feminist authors pay close attention to the way that social and political circumstances can generate or exacerbate vulnerabilities. One example is provided by the intrinsic biological vulnerability of extreme old age: the extent to which it is experienced as problematic is heavily influenced by other factors such as poverty, lack of secure housing and healthcare, and social isolation. Furthermore, a population’s vulnerability to famine may be the result of climate change (Macklin 2012; Reiheld 2016).

4.2 Relationality and relational autonomy

Feminist bioethics’ approach to care is grounded in its relational ontology, that is the claim that the self is constituted through relationships, as discussed earlier. As Annette Baier wrote,

A person, perhaps, is best seen as one who was long enough dependent upon other persons to acquire the essential arts of personhood. Persons essentially are second persons, who grow up with other persons. (Baier 1985: 84)

This theoretical basis in turn underpins the moral significance of relationality, and the responsibilities and obligations of relationships, particularly in the context of healthcare. These relationships arise between patient and healthcare providers, patients and families, and include more novel forms such as those between a gamete or embryo donor, and the children that result (Sherwin & Stockdale 2017).

A relational model of the self sees individuals as inextricably connected in an enduring network of familial, community, and wider connections that create and sustain them as persons. Feminism’s relational view of the self provides the basis for a distinctive view of the autonomous self, called relational autonomy, in which autonomy is not a property of a person but is effected through the networks of interaction that make up social life (Donchin 2000; Mackenzie & Stoljar 2000). Relational autonomy considers a person’s capacity for self-determination to be dependent on the connections—personal and institutional—that come into play, and whether these foster or constrain autonomous action depends on the detail of precisely how they operate in the given situation. This view is in stark contrast to moral philosophy’s traditional formulation of personal autonomy as the individual’s capacity to act as an independent decision-maker, uncontaminated by any influence from or concerns about other agents. Ethical analyses based on this ideal generally omit as irrelevant the particularities of intrafamilial relationships, as well as the wider context of institutional power relationships and social dynamics that influence patient options, and the medical research priorities that shape them.

Relational autonomy is not simply a statement about practicalities (that we need others in order to realize our choices), but a claim that the internal capacity to be self-determining is itself a result of early experiences in family and community that provide us with the tools to reflect on how we want our lives to go and how to make that happen. According to relational autonomy theorists, autonomy is not a property possessed by all competent adults, but a developmental achievement that requires social cooperation and supportive institutions. The crucial point is that feminism’s critique is not that the traditional concept of autonomy is unachievable because people are constrained from exercising authentic autonomy due to their social entanglements. Rather, it is that this model is just fundamentally wrong, because it is exactly that network of relationships that provides the conditions of possibility for self-determination and self-actualization in the first place. Autonomy is inherently produced through relationships, not compromised by them.

Respect for the autonomy of the individual patient or research subject is a core principle of bioethics, underpinning informed consent and patient choice. Indeed, mainstream bioethics and medical ethics have sometimes been accused of effectively reducing autonomy to informed consent and the ability of a patient to select between a limited set of clinical options. From a feminist point of view, a more adequate conceptualization of autonomy must take into account the entirety of the relational context. Combined with feminist theory’s focus on the power structures of systems and institutions, relational autonomy pushes beyond the analysis of interpersonal constraints on patient autonomy (e.g., the authority differential between patient and healthcare provider) to consider the effects of larger scale structures and environments, and of social norms and pressures. For example, Carolyn Ells uses a Foucauldian analysis to argue that the standard depiction of patient choice relies on a false model that treats them as if they existed outside the relations of power that in fact are diffused throughout society, and to consider the implications of a relational model of autonomy for the practice of patient-centered care (Ells 2003; Ells et al. 2011).

While accepting that the principle of respect for autonomy has been essential to the protection of individual liberty, including the liberty of women, feminist bioethics has considerable reservations about its relevance to socially disempowered groups for whom the possibilities of self-determination are always constrained by material, social, and political factors (Gibson 2019). Serene Khader (2020) has expressed concern that relational autonomy theorists implicitly hold that autonomy can only be achieved in ideal conditions, which in reality means never. Other feminists have examined how autonomy can be constrained by features that are less obviously a product of power relationships or oppressive social environments. McLeod (2002) has used examples from reproductive medicine to show that encounters with healthcare providers can undermine a woman’s self-trust, thereby threatening her autonomy. Meanwhile, feminist attention to the moral relevance of embodied experience has identified trauma, abuse, inexperience, impairment or illness, and relational responses to these states, as potentially compromising autonomy (Donchin 2000; Brison 2001; Goering 2009; Scully 2010; McDonald 2018).

5. Feminist Contributions to Thematic Areas

5.1 Reproduction, reproductive medicine, and assisted reproductive technologies

Many people assume that bioethics is feminist when it addresses “women’s issues”, such as pregnancy or menopause. The roots of this misperception can be traced both to the discipline’s origins in women’s health activism, and the fact that many feminists were drawn into the field by their interest in the burgeoning technologies of assisted reproduction in the 1990s and 2000s. Reproductive issues are seen as “feminist” simply because both biologically and socially they tend to affect women more than men. And in practice, the first decades of feminist bioethics were dominated by writing on contraception and abortion, and the medicalization of pregnancy and childbirth. There was a particular focus on how societies in general and healthcare in particular should respond to the industrialized growth of assisted reproductive technologies (ARTs) (in vitro fertilization, surrogate pregnancy, egg and embryo donation, artificial insemination by donor). This has been extended to more recent techniques such as mitochondrial transfer, techniques of selective reproduction (prenatal testing, diagnosis, and screening; preimplantation genetic diagnosis; preconception testing; and genome editing), and the ability to generate, test, and manipulate embryos ex vivo (e.g., Wolf 1996; Gupta 2000; Rapp 2000; Shanley 2001; Kukla 2005; Mullin 2005; Harwood 2007; McLeod 2009; Baylis 2013; Baylis & McLeod 2014).

This work on reproduction is identifiably feminist not simply because it addresses issues that are of greater salience to women, but because it reflects the characteristic features of feminist bioethical approaches discussed earlier. It starts from the experiential perspective of women, and it consciously examines the systemic and interpersonal power differentials that determine how these technologies were developed, delivered, and experienced. A feminist framework enables a different kind of ethical evaluation of the practices of reproductive medicine and ARTs than mainstream bioethics can provide. A key insight is that because women bear a disproportionate share of the associated risks and burdens, new reproductive technologies are not gender neutral, a fact frequently ignored in debates about the ethics of assisted reproduction. Thus, feminist work highlights the potential that research into and use of these technologies holds for issues such as the exploitation of women’s bodies and body tissues (Turkmendag 2022), the unequal distribution of the physical and psychological burdens of fertility treatments between women and men, the impact of ARTs on women’s career plans, and many others (Dickenson 2013; Ballantyne 2014).

Some feminist ethicists have also attempted to place reproductive ethics in the wider context of both social expectations of maternity and parenthood, and the accepted norms of the human body. There are concerns that the fertility industry has a vested interest in reinforcing a set of social expectations that women will do (and pay) anything to have children and will turn to whatever technology is on offer if they have difficulty conceiving due to a medical condition or simply because of their age (Warren 1988; Parks 1999). Similarly, the availability of testing and screening technologies, and potentially of genomic editing, exerts pressure on women (and men) to produce only “perfect” children (Rothman 1986 [1993]; Rapp 2000; Mills 2015; de Melo-Martín 2017). Alongside the health benefits they may offer, these technologies may increase the stigma experienced by disabled children and their families and exacerbate social inequalities. Many of these issues overlap with others known to disproportionately affect women, such as the impact of caregiving responsibilities and the effect of particular economic policies on socially marginalized groups, while some feminist bioethicists draw parallels between the ways that both the female body and the disabled body are seen as deviations from the (nondisabled, male) norm of human embodiment (Scully 2022).

Feminist bioethics has also contributed to the ethical analysis of the use of reproductive tissues for research or to circumvent infertility. Insight into the routes through which eggs, embryos, and other reproductive material flow into and circulate in contemporary medicine and research raises questions about the potential exploitation of women and women’s bodily tissue. Examples of this include groundbreaking work by Donna Dickenson (2007) on property and ownership of the body and body parts, and by Catherine Waldby, Robert Mitchell and Melinda Cooper on the global economy of reproductive tissues (Waldby & Mitchell 2006; Cooper & Waldby 2014). One of the key issues raised by these discussions is how to recognize when women (and others) are being exploited as producers of bodily material for research in the increasingly common situations where the research takes place in the context of medical treatment, such as for infertility.

5.2 Practices of care

Feminist ethics’ theoretical contribution to the ethic of care was discussed in section 4. This section considers feminist bioethics’ critical examination of the practices of health and other forms of care. Mainstream bioethics rarely focuses on care as a core ethical practice, and when it does, it generally fails to distinguish between the different types of care performed by nurses, personal care assistants, care workers and others, and fails to highlight the economic and political invisibility of the unpaid care work provided by family members (Parks 2003).

For bioethics, care ethics focuses primarily on relationships in the clinical setting or the home, and on the micro level of interactions between individual caregiver or healthcare professional and care recipient. Feminist care ethics notes that the mundane labor of care is low status and poorly paid, and (not unrelatedly) strongly gendered, and justifications for the limits to medical and social care services provided by state or by commercial providers often assume that the primary responsibility for the care of dependent family members is most naturally shouldered by women. Not least because of this, the caring aspect of medicine is often dismissed as “housekeeping” and compared unfavorably to heroic biomedical interventions or the “crisis issues” that dominate bioethical discussion.

Fresh interest in the moral structure of caregiving has been generated by two particular developments—one technical, the other social. First, novel assisted reproductive technologies including egg and embryo donation and mitochondrial transfer have led to the emergence of new family forms and structures (Cutas & Chan 2012; Hudson 2020). Relatedly, other authors note that the increasing technologization of medicine, combined with changes in work patterns and expectations, makes it harder to integrate care for family members with the demands of modern workplaces and practices. They critically examine the ambiguous consequences for women, and for the recipients of care, of the replacement of traditional care practices by technology, for example by care robots (Parks 2010; Gary 2021) or other forms of artificial intelligence (Vallor 2011).

Second, demographic changes mean that nations of the Global North are experiencing the aging of their populations with a concomitant increased demand for both medical and social care (Holstein 2013). Combined with the economic and political forces shrinking health and welfare public services, these demographic changes in many parts of the world mean that care responsibilities are shifting away from state provision and back onto families, thereby reinforcing traditional family structures in which women are the main providers of care (Noddings 2002). A significant amount of feminist work examines the organization of familial versus societal care responsibilities. In this vein feminist bioethicists such as Rosemarie Tong (2009) and Monique Lanoix (2013) have written on the discriminatory impact on women of long-term care work, including the ethics of the national and international arrangements of care for children, elderly, and chronically ill people. Globalization has fostered an explosion in international migrant care work, in which women move from poorer to richer countries to provide care for children and elderly or disabled and chronically ill people. Such transnational displacement of care provision mainly affects women from socially marginalized groups and has enduring and complex consequences for them, their families, and their countries of origin (Weir 2008; Eckenwiler 2011, 2013).

Moving beyond practices that are readily identifiable in conventional terms as care, there is also a focus of work within feminist bioethics on the broader role of the family in decision-making about individuals in clinical and public health contexts (Lindemann et al. 2019). Conflict or ambiguities in care responsibilities become most visible in high profile cases about end-of-life care, but there is growing awareness of the need for an overall more robust theoretical framework to encompass a broader understanding of the moral significance of families. Finally, other recent work illustrates the expansion in scope and scale of the application of care ethics, including care in global pandemics (Gary & Berlinger 2020), the concept of caring institutions (Bourgault 2020), care on a geopolitical scale (Robinson 2011; Vaittinen et al. 2019), and care as environmental responsibility (Laugier 2015).

5.3 Disability and other non-standard embodiments

Biomedicine’s view of the female body as a troublesome deviation from a standard male norm has rarely been questioned by mainstream scholars. Not surprisingly, feminist bioethics has taken a more skeptical approach to the categorization of normal and abnormal bodies, and has developed a rich exploration of what it means bioethically to have or to be a “non-standard” body, whether by virtue of sex, gender, age, race, class, or disability. Engaging with the work of disability scholars, for example, feminist bioethicists have critically examined the way the impaired body is construed. They have gone beyond some well-trodden bioethical issues in the regulation of technologies to prevent, cure, or ameliorate disability, producing a body of theoretical work on, for example, the social and cultural expectations of normality and the norms of dependency and vulnerability (Fine & Asch 1988; Kittay 1999; Wong 2002; Tremain 2005; Scully 2008, 2014; Hall 2011; Ho 2011; Reynolds & Silvers 2017).

Other feminist bioethicists have reflected on the more general classification of non-standard embodiments as pathologies, and the questions of autonomy and choice that such medicalization raises (Purdy 2001, 2006; Garry 2001; Zeiler & Käll 2014). The pathologization of the obese body and fat stigma have been extensively discussed (Reiheld 2015, 2020; Guidry-Grimes & Victor 2012; Strings 2015; MacKay 2017). There is also a growing body of work on related issues concerning transgendered (Draper & Evans 2006; Nelson 2016) and intersex embodiment (Holmes 2008; Feder 2014); see also below.

5.4 Mental health and illness

Given that women who voice unorthodox opinions have frequently been called “mad”, it is not surprising that feminist bioethics has also given considerable attention to women’s experiences of mental illness and psychiatry (Martin 2001; Chesler 1972 [2005]). Feminist analyses have examined the way that gender stereotypes of women as hysterical or overemotional contribute to the women’s own accounts of symptoms, distress, or unusual perceptions being dismissed (Potter 2019). These examples are more complex than they appear. There is compelling evidence that gender stereotyping contributes to women being disproportionately diagnosed with mental disorders such as depression, but it is also true that the oppression experienced by women (and other marginalized groups) can in fact generate higher levels of mental distress (Stoppard 2000; Bluhm 2011; Nicki 2016; Shaw & Proctor 2005; Ussher 2018; McDonald 2018). The operations of epistemic and institutional power help to explain how sexist bias can lead to women’s accounts of their experience, including mental states, being either dismissed as trivial or pathologized as symptoms of mental illness (see Martin 2001; Hansen et al. 2011; also Harbin 2022). The impact of such epistemic injustice on women in mental health and psychiatric contexts can be severe (e.g., Bueter 2019; Crichton et al. 2017), in the extreme leading to involuntary psychiatric treatment (Tseris et al. 2022).

6. Continuing Evolution

As new themes in bioethics arise, feminist bioethics continues to offer distinctive approaches and insights, by responding to technical developments, expanding into topics traditionally excluded from mainstream bioethics, and incorporating conceptual work originating elsewhere in feminist thought.

6.1 Responding to new biomedical technologies and practices

A recent development in reproductive medicine is mitochondrial replacement, the replacing of “faulty” with “healthy” mitochondria (the subcellular structures responsible for energy production) to prevent the transmission of genetic disease. Alongside the issues raised by mainstream ethical analysis, feminist bioethicists have noted the potential exploitation of women as providers of eggs (and therefore mitochondria) for research and treatment, just as they have for the global economy of other reproductive tissues (Baylis 2013; Dickenson 2013). Similar concerns are raised about the fact that research into emerging reproductive technologies, such as genome editing and epigenetics, and any treatments to which such research ultimately leads, have a much greater impact on women than on men (Scott 2022). The development of uterus transplants for infertility raises important moral questions about the safety and efficacy of an experimental technique that affects only women (Flynn & Ramji 2019; Lotz 2021). Meanwhile, authors such as Ruby Catsanos and colleagues (2013) highlight the often neglected point that the development of uterus transplantation, as of many other reproductive technologies, inevitably uses women’s bodies as means to the end of perfecting the procedure.

A growing number of bioethicists are now publishing on what are broadly referred to as data ethics, digital ethics, or AI ethics. All areas of healthcare are rapidly adopting a variety of technologies that make use of artificial intelligence (AI), machine learning (ML), and/or some form of automated decision-making. The technologies are promoted on the basis that they are faster, more accurate, and bring greater consistency and objectivity to medical practices and services, as well as possibly offering more cost-effective ways to provide these services to remote or under-resourced areas, thereby increasing global equality. AI applications in healthcare include those that specifically target women’s health, such as AI systems that analyze radiological imagery in diagnosing breast and cervical cancer or predict disease progression from clinical data. Meanwhile a growing market of direct to consumer AI-based products and apps claim to empower users, such as pregnant women, through the provision of health information (Gross et al. 2021; Paton 2022). These claims have been challenged by some feminist bioethicists who see instead just another instance of the control and surveillance of women’s bodies.

Furthermore there are serious concerns about the overhyping of AI on the basis of poor quality data, shaky evidence, and oversimplification of the real-life settings in which AI-powered devices will be applied (Wang et al. 2019; Carter et al. 2020). More specifically of interest to a feminist critique, against the claims that computer-driven processes are better and fairer because they are “uncontaminated” by human fallibilities, it is becoming clear that AI has a tendency to build existing injustices into novel digital systems (D’Ignazio & Klein 2020; Wellner & Rothman 2020). This may be due to the biased nature of the data on which systems are trained. One obvious way in which this can happen is if AI healthcare technologies use data derived largely or exclusively from men (Larrazabal et al. 2020). Health data are heavily affected by long-standing social, cultural, and institutional biases, which means that algorithms based on these data will perpetuate or even exacerbate existing gender and health disparities—for example, the lack of data on women’s physiology inevitably means that AI-based predictions of pharmaceutical side effects are potentially very inaccurate. The problem may also lie with the algorithm itself (i.e., the data may be adequate but what the algorithm does with the data is not), or more fundamentally, it might flow from the social or political assumptions around which the entire process has been constructed, such as beliefs about the lifestyles and behavior of the women taking a particular medication (Ho 2022).

Feminist critics have long pointed out that for any technology, the specifically gendered distribution of practices and obligations can turn what appears to be superficially beneficial into something more ambiguous. For example, the expansion of AI health monitoring in the home has been presented as means of reducing the burden on caregivers (who are often women) and enhancing the autonomy of disabled or older people. Nevertheless, the expectation that family members will adopt AI-supported care may simply set up new burdens of cost or complexity in the management of care, place emotional or other pressures on family members (for example, if employers expect their employees to put surveillance in place instead of offering flexible working hours), and disrupt familial care relationships (Entwistle et al. 2014; Ho 2019).

From a feminist perspective, creating a genuinely ethical AI requires thinking beyond the issues of a particular technological application or abstract notions of “algorithmic fairness”, in order to take into account the context within which AI is being developed and deployed in real-life healthcare. A global contextualization should also ensure that AI healthcare solutions do not draw data solely from, or use algorithms designed to focus on, the concerns of richer and more powerful sectors of the community, neglecting the needs of poorer sectors and exacerbating health disparities.

6.2 Expanding the limits of disciplinary interest

A second evolutionary pathway has continued feminist bioethics’ history of pushing at the boundaries of what is considered “proper” bioethics. For example, since the early 2000s, public health ethics have become a recognized part of mainstream bioethics, yet many of the concerns of public health ethics were anticipated by feminist health care movements at least a couple of decades earlier. Feminist approaches are centrally concerned with justice and equality, and the role of power relations—primarily, but not solely, gendered power relations—in the generation of inequity. In the context of public health, feminist analyses are attentive to the connections between gender, health, and population health inequities overall, but also look at how the social and political distortions of power affect all the processes of public health (Rogers 2006: 351), from policy making through to program delivery (Baylis, Kenny, & Sherwin 2008).

In addition, a growing number of feminist bioethicists are moving towards topics that have not been associated conventionally with biomedicine but that nevertheless have powerful indirect effects on human health. Some authors have developed a specifically feminist bioethics of food consumption and production (Rawlinson & Ward 2016; Rawlinson 2019) in relation to ideas about vulnerability, ecological dependence, and global justice (Gilson 2015; Reiheld 2016), and have analyzed changes in agricultural and food production practices through the lens of power and gender dynamics (Di Chiro 2017; Gilson & Kenehan 2019; Littig 2017; Wichterich 2015).

Some recent feminist work has taken these concerns beyond an exclusively human focus. It understands “bio” to encompass all aspects of the living world, in line with a longstanding ecofeminist view that environmental damage reflects patriarchy and male domination (Agarwal 1992; Plumwood 1993; see Elmhirst 2018 for a recent overview of the field). There is a growing emphasis on the consequences of environmental damage and climate change for humans and the biosphere overall (Dwyer 2013; Whyte & Cuomo 2016; Zoloth 2017; Buckingham & Le Masson 2017; Bee & Park 2022). Some of these areas have benefited from strong cross-fertilization between feminist bioethics and feminist science and technology studies (STS), with scholars working productively around the borders between the two.

6.3 Incorporating theoretical developments

Feminist bioethics continues to change under the influence of ongoing conceptual work in feminist and mainstream philosophy. One notable development over the last quarter century is the rise of intersectionality. First formally articulated by Kimberlé Crenshaw in 1989, intersectionality suggests that when identities or social groupings intersect, they do so in ways that generate novel experiences that are not reducible to the sum of individual categories (Crenshaw 1989; Hill Collins & Bilge 2016). A disabled woman, for example, will face some unique barriers to adequate healthcare that would not be encountered by either a disabled man or a non-disabled woman; these would be barriers that do not track neatly according to sex and disability, but reflect the interaction of both. For any theorists of justice and equality, including bioethicists, the intersectionalities of sex, gender, race, class, sexual orientation, and so on, should be illuminating. Although not yet widely disseminated throughout mainstream bioethics, intersectionality has been taken up with enthusiasm by feminist bioethics for its ability to generate powerful analyses of the ways in which social identities—the particularities of who one is and how one is positioned in society—affect health and healthcare.

Feminist bioethics is also responding to developments in the conceptualization of sex and gender. Thinking about the meaning of being a woman has always been of interest to feminism, for obvious reasons, but this engagement has been given new life by contemporary activity in the areas of gender identification and reassignment. Given the role that biomedicine and the pharmaceutical industry continue to play here, it is unsurprising that bioethicists are exploring the controversies around clinical interventions in the management of intersex persons and in gender reassignment, for example. Feminist bioethicists have described the barriers to effective healthcare encountered by both transwomen and transmen, including practical issues such as lack of privacy in healthcare settings, as well as lack of knowledge and discriminatory attitudes on the part of healthcare providers (Harbin et al. 2012; Freeman 2018; Drouillard 2021). Intersex individuals encounter related issues (Feder 2014). The social and biological nature of women’s identity is currently a highly fraught area of feminist theory and activism, with some concerned to ensure that any framework of rights that takes account of gender self-definition and reassignment continues to protect the rights and needs of cis or natal women (Nelson 2016).

Feminist bioethics has always had an international feel to it, reflecting not just the commonality of women’s shared experience but also an awareness of the global economic and political systems that generate locally specific instances of injustice to women and other marginalized groups. In this vein, feminist bioethicists have considered the health needs of people living in economically disadvantaged areas, the skewed distribution of health research and care resources across societies and the world, and the global dominance of western, highly technologized medicine that often diverts resources from more basic healthcare services. Other authors examine the impact on women of international health policy, including formal instruments such as the UNESCO Declaration on Universal Norms on Bioethics (Rawlinson & Donchin 2005).

However, during the final decade of the twentieth century it became clear throughout the women’s movement that the sense of global commonality through shared experience might be thinner than it seemed. Black women and women of color, Indigenous women, and others protested the exclusion of their own histories and perspectives from feminist thinking and activism – including feminist bioethics (Mohanty 2003). Most recently, bioethicists have responded to calls for the decolonization of bioethical research and teaching (Obasogie & Darnovsky 2018; Richardson 2019; Shahvisi 2019). Decolonization describes the awareness that the past 500 or so years of human history have been shaped by colonial power and that coloniality continues to structure our systems of knowledge to this day. Arianne Shahvisi describes decolonization as

the systematic uncovering, announcing and destabilizing of coloniality in the topics of study, methodologies, training and culture …. (Shahvisi 2022, 351).

She argues that as a normative discipline, feminist bioethics has a particular obligation not just to note and examine the gendered, racialized, and geographical patterns of suffering that result from coloniality, but also to end them (Shahvisi 2022). Feminist approaches that take into account the particularity of women’s experience and that are sensitive to the effects of local and global power dynamics are therefore well-placed to lead bioethics beyond treating the concerns of the global South as a set of distant issues (Diniz & Vélez 2001; De Castro 2001; Khader 2013; Ganguli-Mitra 2021). While decolonization generates deep tensions within the academy as a whole, the willingness to face the theoretical, professional, and political tensions that result is part of the critical and avowedly self-critical nature of feminist bioethics.

7. The Future of Feminist Bioethics

Feminist bioethics arose originally out of women’s responses to the inadequacies of mainstream bioethics, one of which was perceived to be its lack of radical edge, or perhaps better, its political timidity. Like any movement with progressive goals, feminist bioethics in some sense aims to put itself out of business: it wants to see the criticisms it presents to the mainstream acknowledged and the defects remedied. Feminist approaches work to transform the bioethical labor going on at the heart of the discipline, and indeed many of its insights have been absorbed into the mainstream. Examples include the so-called empirical turn in bioethics and a recognition of structural inequities in healthcare. But this kind of success is always double-edged, and many feminist bioethicists will have felt irritation at the amnesia (or willful ignorance) of mainstream bioethics about the source of these vital insights. More seriously, there is a danger that the power and perceptiveness of feminist critique will dissipate as (or if) it loses its outsider status.

Nevertheless, while the incorporation of feminist ideas may have smudged the line between mainstream and feminist bioethics, any assimilation of feminist ideas into mainstream bioethics is restricted to its theoretical and methodological approaches and largely excludes the specific goals of fostering gender and social justice. Beyond the academy, recent social and political developments, ranging from the erosion of reproductive autonomy in the overturning of Roe v. Wade in June 2022, to the gendered impact of the global COVID-19 pandemic, have been salutary lessons in the precarity of feminist gains in the wider world.

Feminist bioethics continues to develop in response to medical and life science research on the one hand, and developments in philosophy and social theory on the other. It also reflects the establishment of new fields of inquiry, such as AI ethics, and the disruption of old disciplinary boundaries. In this respect it is not so different from mainstream bioethics overall. What makes it distinctively feminist is the underlying commitment to the political goal of identifying practices that harm and disadvantage women, grounded in the conviction that this will produce a better and fairer world not just for women, but for everyone.


Several recent handbooks or encyclopedias of bioethics or feminist philosophy have contained chapters on feminist bioethics. These include the entry by Wendy Rogers in the Routledge Companion to Feminist Philosophy (edited by Ann Garry, Serene J. Khader, and Alison Stone, 2017) and the chapter by Jackie Leach Scully in the Oxford Handbook of Feminist Philosophy (2021, edited by Kim Q. Hall and Ásta). The first Handbook dedicated to feminist bioethics, The Routledge Handbook of Feminist Bioethics, edited by Wendy Rogers, Jackie Leach Scully, Stacy Carter, Catherine Mills and Vikki Entwistle, was published in 2022.

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Other Internet Resources


Jackie Leach Scully would like to extend gratitude and remembrance to Anne Donchin, author of the original SEP entry, for her invitation to revise and update her article shortly before her death in 2014.

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Jackie Leach Scully <jackie.leach.scully@unsw.edu.au>

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